18th Century French Aesthetics

First published Sun Feb 29, 2004; substantive revision Mon Nov 13, 2023

French philosophers of the Ancien Régime wrote treatises on beauty or taste; the term “aesthetics”, coined in Latin as “aesthetica” by German philosopher Alexander Baumgarten in 1735 (§116), was not in popular usage in France and appeared only in rare instances at the end of the eighteenth century. Philosophers described taste (“goût” or “goust”) as a sentiment that allowed both creators and consumers to discern the beauty of an object. At times, authors focused more on the object, such as a painting; at other times, they examined what was happening inside the mind of the person who created it or of the person who looked at it.

Eighteenth-century theories of beauty were in many ways a continuation of debates that took place during the previous century. The changes that were introduced during the Enlightenment included an increased focus on the mind’s inner workings when perceiving beauty and attempts at finding universal standards that could be applied to all objects. These two features are what twentieth-century philosopher Ernst Cassirer called “empirical” and “Cartesian” tendencies in eighteenth-century aesthetics. In the second part of the century, major Enlightenment philosophers such as Voltaire and Diderot claimed that the authority to judge was no longer in the hands of worldly amateurs or of little-known academics but in those of professional critics such as themselves.

Debates about artistic matters were greatly influenced by the new spaces and means of communication that emerged in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries. Critics expressed their judgments in published treatises and in periodicals such as Le Mercure galant; philosophical ideas were also developed in oral conversations between members of the newly founded royal academies, within elite coteries in private salons, and among men in public cafés. Discussions sometimes even became rowdy in spaces such as the opera house or the theater, which were accessible to people of all genders and social classes. The increasingly literate public called for the right to make artistic judgments, while intellectuals were only beginning to distinguish themselves as professionals with institutional credentials, so it is impossible to discuss philosophy in isolation from milieu or means of communication in the eighteenth century.

Many artistic debates, recorded for posterity as a succession of querelles or quarrels—were highly polemical and often devolved into ad hominem satirical attacks. Among the most famous, one can list the quarrel over the play Le Cid and the Quarrel of the Ancients and the Moderns, both of which originated in the seventeenth century but which had implications for the next century. In painting, one could cite the quarrel between fans of Poussin, who privileged line, and fans of Rubens, who favored color. In opera, the Querelle des Bouffons pitted most Enlightenment philosophers, who preferred melody and a populist Italian style, against the fans of composer Rameau, who represented a more erudite approach to French harmony.

In the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries, discussions of beauty and taste dealt with a variety of objects, including visual arts, literature, music, human bodies, food, and manners. This article will concentrate on the areas that received the most attention from writers: literature and the visual arts. Questions at stake included: How can one define beauty—via the senses, reason, or conventional rules? How does the human mind perceive a beautiful object? Who has the right to judge? None of these questions were definitively answered, but Enlightenment ideas of beauty shaped the legacy of classical French culture, not only for France to this day, but for the whole Western world that it dominated during the eighteenth century.

1. The Classical Legacy

French thinkers considered their country as the heir to the Greek and Roman empires. Whether they strictly followed ancient models or not, they saw their work as a continuation of the classical tradition. Aristotle, Horace, and Plutarch, to name just a few writers, were major influences on the literature of seventeenth and eighteenth century France. This self-image of the French explains not only their discomfort with artistic innovation, but also their disparagement of other European countries, their anxieties about what to include in their national literary canon, and their efforts to impose a masculine, patriotic aesthetic on the painting of the era.

This loyalty to the Greco-Roman tradition came into conflict with some new ideas in the mid-seventeenth century during the Quarrel of the Ancients and the Moderns. The quarrel had several phases that focused on different problems and it spanned approximately seven decades. The earliest phase began in the 1650s when a handful of authors attempted to renew the genre of epic poetry, since everyone acknowledged that the French had never created their own equivalent to the Aeneid, as the Italians had done (Tasso’s Jerusalem Delivered, 1581) and as the English would soon do (Milton’s Paradise Lost, 1667). To name just two examples, Desmarets de Saint-Sorlin and Jean Chapelain wrote poems following epic conventions but with Christian subjects: the conversion of the first French king Clovis and the story of Joan of Arc, respectively. These poems were publicly mocked by partisans of the Ancient camp, most notably by Nicolas Boileau, a poet with powerful support at court. Whether these Christian epics failed because of their literary qualities or because Boileau’s satires were so successful in swaying public opinion, they have now been largely forgotten.

After these attempts at modernizing the epic, the next phase of the Quarrel of the Ancients and the Moderns focused on other aspects of modern life. This time, Boileau faced a new opponent, Charles Perrault, now best known as a compiler of fairy tales. In fact, fairy tales were significant because they celebrated the European oral tradition that did not have Greco-Roman roots, in contrast to the fables of La Fontaine, who was a partisan of the Ancients. Perrault took a stand for the Modern side by writing Parallel of the Ancients and the Moderns (1688–97), a series of dialogues between three interlocutors: an abbot who represents the Modern camp, a président or high-level administrator who represents the Ancient camp, and a cavalier who tries to reconcile the two points of view. At stake was the view of human history as one of degeneration or of progress: the Ancients beheld Antiquity as the Golden Age, so subsequent history could only represent a deterioration—in the arts, in morals, and in other aspects of life. The Moderns saw new inventions and scientific discoveries as signs of an upward trend. Even in terms of manners, the Moderns claimed that the newly developed French courtly politeness was an improvement on the rough, though heroic, behavior of the Ancient Romans and Greeks. For example, in Perrault’s dialogue, the Modern partisan objects to the mention in the Iliad that Zeus could beat his wife Hera, whereas that behavior was considered taboo among the upper classes of Ancien Régime France. The abbot even compares Zeus’ behavior to that of a French peasant. This contrast between ancient Greek and Early Modern French codes of conduct would reappear in the next phase of the Quarrel.

The final phase of the Quarrel, in the 1710s, mainly centered on how Homer’s Iliad should be translated. The two most prominent players were Anne Dacier and the abbé Houdar de la Motte. Dacier, a distinguished Hellenic scholar, produced her prose translation of the Iliad in 1711; based on this work, Houdar, who knew little Greek, published a radically shortened poetic version in 1714. In his preface, Houdar represented the Modern camp by daring to criticize Homer, and in the main text, he not only cut out parts of the Iliad that he considered too repetitive or long-winded, such as the description of Achilles’s shield, but he also removed the sections in which the manners of the Ancients appeared too uncouth for his taste. In contrast, Anne Dacier advocated for a more faithful translation and showed less regard for the French sense of politeness. She struck against the Moderns in her polemic On the Corruption of Taste (1714), deploring the effeminate morals and literature of her contemporaries, in contrast to the heroic ones of Antiquity.

In all phases of the quarrel, all parties agreed that Antiquity should be admired and at no time was the Greco-Roman canon put into question. Ancient literature was the core of boys’ education in Ancien Régime France and it remained the standard for French intellectuals until the end of the eighteenth century, in spite of popular new developments in the novel and theater. After the Quarrel of the Ancients and the Moderns, Enlightenment writers reconciled both sides by recognizing scientific innovations and improvements in lifestyle without losing their desire to imitate ancient literary forms or admire the grandeur of ancient heroes.

This long quarrel had largely concerned whether writers had properly applied literary rules. This ancient method for evaluating literature, which we can observe as early as in Aristotle’s Poetics, aimed to determine whether literary works correctly followed the conventions of, say, genre, diction, or the decorum that was based on characters’ social category. While some French thinkers were still approaching literature this way, others were developing new ways of judging beauty—artistic and otherwise—at the cognitive level. The sides they took in debates not only reflected the way they reasoned, but their social milieu and their institutional status.

2. Salon Culture and Sensibility

Early in the Ancien Régime, in 1635, the government of Louis XIII, controlled by Cardinal de Richelieu, established the Académie Française, with the mission of standardizing the French language. Before this institution came into being, there had been literary circles, which later scholars called salons, run by upper-class women and men for their select guests, that had fostered the production of new writings and held debates about how to refine the French language. The Académie Française brought some of this activity under national authority, granted it royal patronage, and controlled the membership, limiting it to exactly 40 men. Nevertheless, salons continued their work for the next centuries; they continued to patronize emerging talents and exerted a great influence on public reception of the arts.

Seventeenth-century salon culture developed concepts of taste that were closely aligned with an aristocratic view of politeness and sensibility. Cassirer calls this approach “empiricist” and, indeed, these ideas were dependent on the senses and the stimuli they received, more than on reason or on conventions of genre.

An early influential thinker was Dominique Bouhours, a Jesuit and frequent guest at salons who wrote Entretiens d’Ariste et d’Eugène, a series of dialogues about good taste. In this work, he deals with the arts, particularly eloquence, but also manners. Bouhours is best known for coining the term je ne sais quoi or “I don’t know what”—a special, undefinable quality that transcends any rules. His interlocutors evoke the possibility that a work of art could follow all the rules yet fail to please, if it lacks that special something. They compare the je ne sais quoi in the arts to the ineffable in the contemplation of nature or in Catholic theology. In another part of his Entretiens, Bouhours denounces exaggeration or excessive ornamentation in language: a common trope in works about rhetoric since Antiquity. His interlocutors apply this idea to seventeenth-century Europe when they agree that, with its simplicity and modesty, the French language is superior to bombastic Spanish and effeminate Italian. These linguistic prejudices indicate to us that Bouhours was trying to establish the status of France as the cultural heir to the Roman empire, in opposition to the two most dominant cultures in Europe in his era.

In Bouhours’ text, politeness and artistic taste are closely tied, since it takes a special sense of discernment to perceive literary beauty as well as the right thing to say in a social setting. Both supposedly emanate from the acute sensibility of a refined person who is accustomed to being surrounded by beauty and good manners. The class implications of his ideas about taste are clear to see: only those members of an elite had the instinct for both exquisite politeness and exquisite artistic taste. It denies the possibility that just anyone could receive enough training to reach this level of refinement, an idea that would be shared by later theorists that emerged from this salon culture.

The abbé Dubos, the marquise de Lambert, and Montesquieu, among others, continued this line of thought in the early eighteenth century. They belonged to a group of acquaintances that frequented the same social circles, including Lambert’s own salon. Because their reflections on taste were closely tied to their sense of worldly politeness, they shared a disdain for professional critics and any semblance of pedantry. They were less concerned with defining beauty and more intent on examining what happens in the mind and body of the viewer when she contemplates a pleasing object. Their emphasis on pleasure and sentiment was sensualist, based on input from the senses; in Montesquieu’s case, sensualism becomes frankly hedonistic.

Jean-Baptiste Dubos, in his Critical Reflections on Poetry, Painting, and Music (1719), presents the faculty of taste as a sentiment that he calls a sixth sense, disregarding the role of reason or of morality, which his contemporary Jean-Pierre Crousaz had considered important aspects of taste. His work precedes Scottish philosopher Francis Hutcheson’s aesthetic treatise of 1725, in which he also discusses a sixth sense that perceives beauty. According to Dubos, the reception of artistic works happens in the body: we tremble, cry, or feel a jolt of surprise when we see a play, for example. He describes how the arts affect our emotions positively, while admitting that the effect of seeing death depicted in painting or theater, for example, is different than if we were to witness a death in real life. He also goes into great detail to describe how climate affects nations and consequently how it fosters or impedes the proliferation of good artists in certain parts of the world. This type of thinking began as far back as Hippocrates’s reflections on the effects of climate on national character and extends to Juan Huarte’s thoughts on the influence of body temperature on eloquence and later to Montesquieu’s claims about the way climate determines human behavior and consequently each nation’s political system. This climate theory is part of Dubos’s idea that artistic perception happens in the body, both for the viewer and for the creator. For him, art is ultimately a means of communication from body to body.

One misunderstanding that has arisen about Dubos is the assumption that he democratizes taste, because in some passages of the Reflections, he states that the “public” and “tout le monde” can be susceptible to the proper reception of artworks. However, in other passages he explains what he means by these terms: “tout le monde” does not mean “everyone”, as it is usually translated: he in fact uses “le monde” to mean high society, also called “le beau monde” in the eighteenth century. As for the general public, he explicitly excludes “the lower class of people” from “the public capable of passing judgment on poems or pictures” (Dubos, Critical Reflections, II:245).

Like Dubos, the marquise de Lambert writes about good taste as a sentiment of pleasure, or agrément, in her Reflections on Taste. A person’s correct judgment depends on her degree of sensibility, and Lambert claims it cannot be learned; instead,

Nature gives us what we have of it, we never can acquire it, and the more refined Part of the World alone are acquainted with it in any Degree of Perfection. (Lambert 1748: 217 [1790: 183])

She disregards definitions of beauty that are based on rules, perhaps because these can be learned. In fact, she dismisses the concept of beauty from her thoughts on taste and privileges the “agréable”, which can be translated as “agreeable” or “pleasant”:

though Beauty has Rules, Agreeableness has none. The [beautiful] without the Agreeable can never give us a delicate Pleasure; the Agreeable is the native Subject of Taste, and ’tis thence that it pleases us infinitely beyond the [beautiful]; and it is as arbitrary and variable, even as the Taste itself. (Lambert 1748: 217 [1790: 184])

The impossibility of establishing definitive parameters for taste is a continuation of Bouhours’ “je ne sais quoi”, which relies on a sensitive person’s instinctive ability to recognize an appropriately pleasing object.

The marquise de Lambert’s views were echoed in the works of other writers of her circle, such as the abbé Trublet and Cartaud de la Vilate (she also hosted both Anne Dacier and Houdar de la Motte). Cartaud de la Vilate places particular emphasis on delicacy, which is

an exquisite discernment that nature has placed in certain organs for sorting out the different virtues of the objects that pertain to sentiment. (Cartaud de la Vilate 1726: 235 [translation by J. Tsien])

These ideas of inborn sensibility to pleasing artistic objects refute the possibility that taste can be learned.

Montesquieu also examines taste as a function of the viewer’s mind, through the filter of the same milieu of worldly refinement. The examples to which he applies his aesthetic ideas are not exclusively artistic: he includes activities like flirting, gambling, and social dancing, alongside more conventional topics such as architecture, to describe how the mind perceives pleasure. He explains these ideas in his Essay on Taste, which appears in Diderot and d’Alembert’s Encyclopédie under the entry “Goût” (1757), an entry which also includes treatises on the same subject by Voltaire and d’Alembert. To describe what objects please our minds, Montesquieu lists six qualities: order, variety, symmetry, contrasts, the ability to provoke curiosity, and the ability to provoke surprise. Each of these qualities in excess has a bad effect, he claims, such as a Gothic cathedral that offers too much variety and confuses us. On the other hand, too much order and symmetry, for example in a long colonnade or in a beautiful woman’s face, can bore the onlooker. Like Lambert, Montesquieu states that he is more interested in pleasure than beauty; as an example, he claims to prefer a woman with irregular features who can surprise him to a perfectly beautiful woman. To the six qualities of pleasing objects above, he adds three ways in which our minds experience these objects: sensibility, delicacy, and the je ne sais quoi. These terms remind us of his allegiance to the Bouhours-Dubos-salon line of thought about taste as a quality inherent in certain refined, worldly people.

3. Cartesian Beauty

Although this turn towards subjectivism and sensualism represented a major innovation in aesthetics, Descartes was still a dominant influence on French thought of the eighteenth century, and his philosophy was applied to theories of beauty, even though he wrote little on the topic. Scholars such as Crousaz and André proposed objective measures of beauty, as Descartes did with truth, that could be applied to any object. This standard would ideally transcend the vicissitudes of fashion, personal biases, or cultural differences.

Jean-Pierre de Crousaz, a professor of logic and mathematics in Lausanne, Switzerland, published his Treatise on Beauty in 1715. He does not offer original ideas on the nature of the beautiful; he takes up the old dictum that it is a mix of unity and diversity, so as to preserve order and proportion from both caprice and monotony. But he approaches it with a new awareness of the constraints and prejudices that obstruct the way:

Everyone possesses [an idea of the beautiful], but since it hardly ever appears alone we do not reflect upon it and fail to distinguish it from the tangle of other ideas which appear alongside it. (1715 [AT: 390])

The root of this difficulty lies in the duality of human faculties:

Sometimes ideas and feelings are in agreement with each other and an object merits the qualification “beautiful” on both counts. Sometimes, however, reason and feelings are at war with each other and then an object pleases and at the same time does not: from one perspective it is beautiful, while from another it lacks beauty. (1715 [AT: 392])

Crousaz is not satisfied with this duality; on the contrary, he believes we have a responsibility to discover

which principles regulate our approbation when we judge something from ideas only [or, as he likes to say, “coolly”] and find it beautiful independently of feeling. (1715 [AT: 393])

Taste is a forerunner of what reason would have approved, had it time enough to weigh everything relevant to a judgment. Crousaz finally reconciles knowledge with sensations, a fact that appears to testify in favor of God’s wisdom. Similar ideas are also to be found in minor authors such as Frain du Tremblay, Brumoy, or Trublet.

Yves-Marie André’s Essay on Beauty (1741) covers the same territory, but with a strong influence from Malebranche. In accordance with the Cartesian distinction between ideas (innate, adventitious, and fictitious), André suggests several notions of beauty. Essential beauty is “independent of any institution, even divine” and so is identified with what is universal, immutable, and recognizable by divine Reason. Natural beauty concerns the whole range of created things; it is “independent of any human opinion” but follows from God’s will; it is present in the harmony and finality of nature. The lowest degree of beauty is the product of human activity and is partly arbitrary, because it combines intellectual as well as sensual ingredients. This arbitrary beauty that speaks to the eye and ear is itself organized into three levels: genius, taste, and caprice (in descending order). Only genius is recognizable by our reason, when the latter is adequately supported by other faculties. André summarizes:

I call beautiful not what pleases to imagination’s first sight—but what has a right to please reason and reflection by its own excellence. (Essay on Beauty quoted in Becq 1994: 419 [translation by J. Morizot])

For him, there is no distinction between beauty and truth, and this is the very definition of the aesthetics of perfection. But aesthetic feeling is a normal affective accompaniment of any act of creation or reception, and the distinguishing feature of humankind as a species.

Charles Batteux had somewhat different goals. When he published The Fine Arts Reduced to a Single Principle in 1746, he took up a challenge: to establish Aristotelian ideas firmly as the general basis for a unified system of the arts. The main concept on which he focuses is mimesis, but generalized to any kind of art (thus going beyond Aristotle or Horace). To achieve this generalization, he distinguishes the liberal arts, of which the object is pleasure (i.e., music, poetry, painting, sculpture, and dance), from the mechanical ones, and he proposes an interpretation of what amounts to the “imitation of the beautiful nature” (Batteux 1746). He insists that imitation is not a matter of slavishly copying the given, but a sensible and enlightened process that struggles its way forward to the best result. Recalling the famous anecdote of Zeuxis who composed his Helen out of parts taken from Crotone’s most perfect women, he concludes that the artist has the responsibility to imitate what reason decides is nature’s essence. That is why Batteux praises artifice so much: “art is made for fooling” (Batteux 1746), not because it is inherently duplicitous but because truth is a complex construction that hides its structure and development. Of course, the problem of taste remains unresolved when we ask how the artist selects the parts that he will assemble in his imitation of “beautiful nature”: by what standard does he determine that a certain part of nature is beautiful?

It is also important to mention composer Jean-Philippe Rameau, who passionately adhered to Cartesian thought. In his Treatise on Harmony (1722), he attempted to lay the scientific foundations of music, and codifies many of the ideas that are the basis of our analysis of music to this day (e.g., tonality, major vs. minor keys, principles of composition and accompaniment). For Rameau, harmony is more fundamental to music than melody. Nonetheless, from the Demonstration of the principle of harmony (1750) on, and after the so-called Querelle des bouffons or “Quarrel of Buffoons”, where Rousseau took him to task (in his Letter about French Music 1753, a libel in favor of the Italian opera), Rameau retreated to the certainty that music is the universal “key” to any subject whatsoever, including geometry.

4. The Enlightenment Philosophes

After Montesquieu, the other philosophers of the Enlightenment borrowed from the theories mentioned above to come up with their descriptions of taste as a combination of three elements: sentiment, reason, and a knowledge of rules. Simultaneously, they distanced themselves from both the refined world of salons that had promoted their careers and the academics who had developed theories of beauty. Even Montesquieu criticized salons as having a feminizing influence that discouraged serious scholarship. Meanwhile, Voltaire describes scholars as myopic and dust-covered in his poem The Temple of Taste (1733). The majority of Enlightenment philosophers saw themselves as erudite, serious thinkers who also lived in society. In terms of taste, they set themselves off as a caste of professional critics who claimed the right to make artistic judgments that were more authoritative than the potentially wayward preferences of the general public.

Voltaire describes good taste as a combination of sentiment and erudition. In his article “Taste” in the Encyclopédie, he gives the example of a young man who cries at a theatrical performance. Voltaire demands that this spontaneous reaction eventually be backed up by an understanding of the reasons why the play had this effect on him—namely, rules such as the Aristotelean unities. The experience is similar to that described by Crousaz, except that the latter describes the ideal artistic reception as an immediate sentiment that is later confirmed by reason rather than rules. As for more extensive thoughts on beauty, however, Voltaire scholars affirm in their works devoted to his role as critic that he did not have an all-encompassing aesthetic theory. Instead, he made pronouncements on taste in the arts on a case-by-case basis, with a clear preference for Greco-Roman conventions, but still willing to make exceptions for certain passages by great writers who broke these rules, such as Shakespeare.

Jean-Jacques Rousseau wrote little about taste and beauty, only diatribes about the corrupting influence of the arts in general and a few pieces about musical composition. It was Marmontel, his fellow philosophe, who attempted to create a theory of taste extrapolated from Rousseau’s philosophy. In his Essai sur le goût, which prefaces his Éléments de littérature (1787), Marmontel determines, like Batteux and many others, that good taste is based on nature. He then recounts a series of stages in which man passes from good taste to bad taste and then back to good. First there are the “savage men” who express themselves with eloquence but no “excessive hyperbole” or “superfluous epithet”. In Marmontel’s system, the second stage is that of the “uncultured” or “barbaric” man, who prefers artificial and convoluted language. Alienated from nature, he has been corrupted by luxury, vanity, and the whims of fashion. This bad taste can be compared to André’s lowest type of taste, which he calls arbitrary, because it is capricious and constantly changing. Finally, in Marmontel’s model, the “civilized man” emerges in the third stage, when he returns to a modified nature. This trajectory is clearly based on Rousseau’s schema, as he recounts it in his political works, of the noble savage who becomes corrupted by society, and who finally, in some unspecified future, will see society self-destruct and, in a way, come full circle to the beginning again. Aside from these ideas, Marmontel’s poetics were a return to a conventional system of classification of figures of style, compatible with his contemporary Dumarsais’ listing of tropes.

Diderot’s monumental article “Beau” of the Encyclopédie contains one of the best summaries of French aesthetic thought in the eighteenth century, as well as some new ideas for artistic judgment. Early in the article, he exposes the circular reasoning inherent to theories of beauty: according to Saint Augustine, unity is the defining characteristic of beauty—a symmetrical building would be an example. “But why is symmetry necessary?” asks Diderot, who answers himself, “Because it pleases”. “Why does it please?” he continues, “Because it is beautiful”. “Why is it beautiful? Because it is unified”. Unable to resolve this problem, he then goes on to summarize the theories of beauty by André and Crousaz, as well as by Hutcheson and German philosopher Christian Wolff. While Diderot claims to consider André’s treatise the most profound and coherent, he still objects to the necessity of innate ideas about what is beautiful. Instead, Diderot argues that all conceptions of symmetry, proportion, and beauty come from our observations.

His own definition of taste depends on what he calls “rapports”, or connections between various aspects of a work. An artist creates these rapports and the most refined, the most erudite, and the most sensitive viewer is the one who can discern the largest number of them. His prime example is a line from Horace, a 1640 tragedy by Corneille: “qu’il mourût” or “that he had died”. Diderot explains that these words in isolation are neither beautiful nor ugly. But if one knows the context within the plot of the play, that this is the answer that a father gives when asked what he would have his son do in battle, the listener finds more interest in the line. Diderot adds several other circumstances from the play, for instance, that this is the only surviving son, that he is alone against three enemies, and that he is fighting for the honor of his country, that create more rapports in the mind of the listener, until this ultra-concise line becomes an object of great beauty. The rapports described here involve understanding more and more of the plot and of the human relationships depicted, which add layers of meaning to certain lines. In his Lettre sur les sourds et muets, translated as Letter on the Deaf and Dumb (1751b), Diderot explains something similar, using the term “hieroglyphics” rather than “rapports”. He gives the example of a poem in which men of taste can see a much larger number of “hieroglyphs” or elements of prosody, than ordinary people; in other words, they can do what literary scholars call a close reading. What is not clear, however, is how people can reach the stage of refinement where they are able to discern more rapports or “hieroglyphs”.

5. Painting: of Amateurs and Professionals

As debates about taste in literature and music were taking place, other debates arose in the world of visual arts. Artists felt a new authority to theorize publicly about their work, even though in 1719 Dubos still referred to them as “artisans”, harking back to an era in which artists had no more prestige than other skilled manual laborers. However, Louis XIV had established the Royal Academy of Painting and Sculpture in 1648 and thus gave these former artisans a special status. He named Charles Le Brun, who occupied the role of First Painter to the King, as the founding director of this Academy. Its leaders created a set of apprenticeships and tests that the aspirants had to pass in order to be formally accepted. Painters, depending on how they wished to be received, could present a master work in the “grand genre”: that is, a historic, mythological, or religious scene. Otherwise, they could undertake some of the minor genres, which were, in descending hierarchical order, portraits, landscapes, “genre” scenes that represented daily life, and lastly, still lifes.

One major querelle occurred in the seventeenth century between proponents of line and those of color, or between the Poussinists and Rubenists. For a long time, color had been disregarded, for at least three reasons: it is, in Charles Le Brun’s words, “but an accident produced by the reflection of light and that varies according to circumstances” (1672 [AT: 183]); it appeals to sensuality whereas “we must not judge by our senses alone but by reason” as Poussin puts it in a letter to Chantelou dated 24 November 1647 (AT: 69); and it proves unable to serve as a foundation for painting, unlike drawing, which is related to the mind (the original sense of disegno = drawing or design).

The painter Gabriel Blanchard cautiously started to endorse the use of color in the Academy in 1671. He did not want to “diminish the importance of design” but to

establish three things in defense of color: first, that color is just as necessary to the art of painting as design; secondly, that if we diminish the worth of color, we thereby also diminish the worth of painters; and thirdly, that color merited the praise of the Ancients, and that it merits it again in our own age. (1671 [AT: 178–179])

Design is a necessary foundation, certainly, but if the aim of the painter is “both to deceive the eyes and to imitate nature”, it is reasonable to conclude that color serves that goal best, because “herein lies the difference that distinguishes painting from all the other arts and which gives painting its own specific end” (AT: 180). This was clearly an attempt to turn to his advantage Poussin’s phrase that the aim of painting is delectation—but insufficient indeed to convince Le Brun.

Two men were going to play a special role in the color crusade. It may seem odd to mention royal historiographer André Félibien first because he is generally and rightly considered as a supporter of Poussin. But he was also liberal-minded, respectful of differing opinions (it was to cost him his position!) and anxious to find a fair balance between the gifts of the mind and the talents of the hand. For him, “beauty is a result of the proportion and symmetry between corporeal and material parts” (1725 [AT: 220]), so that color cannot be discarded since

everything should appear so artfully connected that the whole painting seems to have been painted at one and the same time, and, as it were, from the same palette. (1725 [AT: 568], quoted by Louis-Guillaume Baillet de Saint-Julien, 1748, Lettre sur la peinture, sculpture et architecture, Avec un examen des principaux Ouvrages exposés au Louvre au mois d’Août, Paris: [n.p.])

When he translates Du Fresnoy’s De Arte Graphica (1668) and publishes his Dialogue upon Coloring (1673), art critic Roger de Piles may appear to hold stronger views; however, by transferring emphasis from color to coloring, he too stresses the importance of harmony and the way it presupposes mastery of local color and chiaroscuro. When de Piles entered the Academy three decades later, he would produce a synthesis under the title Principles of Painting (1708), in which he insists that

true painting is such as not only surprises, but as it were, calls to us; and has so powerful an effect, that we cannot help coming near it, as if it had something to tell us. (1708 [AT: 309])

In a word,

the spectator is not obliged to seek for truth in a painting; but truth, by its effect, must call to the spectator, and force his attention. (1708 [AT: 310])

That points to what he called “the whole together”, that is “a general subordination of objects one to another, as makes them all concur to constitute but one”, for the utmost satisfaction of the eye (1708 [AT: 312]). The same lesson can be drawn from Antoine Coypel’s writings, where “the excellence of painting” is no longer separate from “the aesthetic of the painter”. His nomination as Academy’s Director in 1714 was the sign that a page had been turned.

After Louis XIV, patronage of the arts was heavily influenced by the stylistic preferences of Louis XV’s official mistress the Marquise de Pompadour, who selected the artists and architects who would receive royal pensions, commissioned works that defined the legacy of this era, and sponsored the porcelain works of Sèvres. She also introduced her brother, later ennobled as the Marquis de Marigny, to the court; she arranged for the painter Antoine Coypel and the architect Jacques-Germain Soufflot (later responsible for the Pantheon in Paris) to undertake his education. Wielding her political influence, she then had Marigny named Director General of the King’s Buildings, which made him an important decision-maker in giving royal commissions to artists.

Aside from royal patronage, there were also roles for the “amateurs” or “connoisseurs”, individuals who played an increasingly important role in shaping the arts during the Ancien Régime. In the words of art historian Charlotte Guichard,

The amateur constituted an intermediate figure between the patron, characteristic of court society in early modern times, and the collector, who emerged as the art market developed. (Guichard 2012: 521)

Among the most famous of these connoisseurs were the financier Pierre Crozat and the Comte de Caylus. It was not enough for them to collect thousands of works; they were also involved with indexing and reproducing them through printmaking. The Recueil Crozat (1729 and 1742) is the true ancestor of art books and dictionaries devoted to fine arts, which began to multiply (see, e.g., Pernéty’s Dictionnaire portatif [1757], Watelet and Lévesque’s Dictionnaire des arts [1792], and especially Mariette’s Abecedario, posthumously published from 1851–1860). Catalogs began to proliferate and the first monographs appeared, among the most important being Recueil Julienne, Jean de Julienne’s collection of 271 engravings after Watteau’s paintings. Caylus and Dezallier d’Argenville also wrote about artists, sketched biographies and established rules for discerning the delicacy of style or the lightness of execution. All this took place in the larger context in which the cosmopolitan amateurs of different countries were able to easily travel abroad. (Such travels evolved into the ritual of the Grand Tour.)

In an era before formal museums existed, the public had little access to art, until the Royal Academy began displaying paintings in what is known as the Salon in 1737. The Salon began as a political and social event that was inaugurated in the Louvre’s Salon Carré on 25 August—St. Louis’ day—to pay homage to the king and it was to last one month. Over the years, it became a valuable guide for tracing the major trends in style and aesthetic ideas, for lists of works as well as evolutionary trends in pictorial genres were taken into account. But the most significant consequence of the rise of the Salon was the birth of a new literary genre, namely, the salon review, which flourished until the twentieth century and has been an incomparable mirror of aesthetic thought. Originally, such reviews were just a blend of descriptive reports and theoretical asides, often controversial. The “salon” is for the benefit of a larger public—that is, those not necessarily affiliated with some artistic institution. As La Font de Saint-Yenne wrote in 1747:

an exhibited picture is the same as a book on the day of publication, and as a play performed in the theater: everyone has the right to make his own judgment. We have gathered together the judgments of the public which showed the greatest amount of agreement and fairness, and we now present them, and not at all our own judgment, to the artists, in the belief that this same public [whose] judgments are so often bizarre and unjustly damning or hasty rarely errs when all its voices unite on the merit or weakness of any particular work. (1747 [AT: 555])

With Caylus, Baillet de Saint-Julien, and then above all Diderot, the aesthetic importance of painting is increasingly emphasized, opening the way to a long tradition of writers keen on painting.

Diderot’s efforts as an art writer were based on two complementary beliefs, namely, that the techniques used by a painter to produce various effects are difficult for the ordinary viewer to understand and articulate, and that it is a difficult but vital challenge to capture, through literary language, the significant aspects of a painting. That the painter’s alchemy eludes the viewer’s understanding is something often repeated by Diderot, notably with respect to Jean-Baptiste Chardin:

It’s magic, one can’t understand how it’s done: thick layers of colour, applied one on top of the other, each one filtering through from underneath to create the effect. At times, it looks as though the canvas has misted over from someone breathing on it; at others, as though a thin film of water has landed on it…. Close up, everything blurs, goes flat and disappears. From a distance, everything comes back to life and reappears. (1763 [AT: 604])

At the same time, Diderot is aware that the painter’s power makes it extremely hard for the writer to give his reader a deep grasp of a painting. Despite the difficulty, the writer must somehow express the essence of a masterpiece, thereby achieving a kind of ekphrasis, in which the art of writing attempts to capture in words the essence and form of the visual art of painting. The critic must not only provide the reader with a short description of the work in question, but must attempt to make his words somehow equivalent to the sentiment expressed by the painting in question.

Aside from the exceptional painters that Diderot admired, such as Greuze and Chardin, the eighteenth century saw a rivalry between two predominant styles, rococo and neoclassicism. Rococo artists such as François Boucher tended to depict scenes of flirtation in rich interiors or pastoral settings, which detractors scorned as effeminate. Rococo artists sometimes chose mythological subjects and neoclassical painters did as well, but the latter inserted overtly didactic messages. Philosophers such as Diderot praised this latter style because they claimed it would instill more of a virile sense of patriotism among the populace. One could see the works of Jacques-Louis David, during the Revolution, as the ultimate conflation of classical subjects, images of traditionally manly virtue, and messages of national pride. French interest in Antiquity had been constant throughout the Ancien Régime, but it was further enriched by the dissemination of printed images of archaeological sites in Athens, Pompeii, and other cities in which new discoveries had been made.

The end of the eighteenth century saw the birth of the museum. Previously, people could see works of art only in private homes or in religious institutions, even though during this period, certain collectors began making their “cabinets of curiosities” available to the public. The British Museum had opened in 1759 and the Uffizi in 1765, but France was behind its neighbors, even if royal collections were more accessible than before. The first suggestion for creating a gallery in the unoccupied Louvre goes back to 1747 and was reiterated in 1765 in the eponymous entry in the Encyclopédie (Jaucourt 1765). The Louvre museum finally opened in 1793.

The new accessibility of art to the masses, as well as the increasing literacy and proliferation of printed works, transformed society in the eighteenth century. The worldly judges of taste in the seventeenth century gave way to the professional critics, i.e. the Enlightenment philosophes. The new world created by the French Revolution would soon expand—and further complicate—the connection between the production of art and its reception by both critics and the public.


Many of the quotes in the text can be found in the following anthology:

  • Harrison, Charles, Paul Wood, and Jason Gaiger (eds.), 2000, Art in Theory, 1648–1815: An Anthology of Changing Ideas, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers

This is cited as [AT] in the text. In Section 3, the translations of the quotes from J.-P. de Crousaz 1715 (Traité du beau) are by Katerina Deligiorgi.

Other useful anthologies include:

  • Elledge, Scott and Donald Schier (eds.), 1970, The Continental Model: Selected French Essays of the Seventeenth Century, revised edition, Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press; original edition 1960.
  • Lecoq, Anne-Marie, 2001, La Querelle des Anciens et des Modernes, Paris: Gallimard Folio.
  • Lichtenstein, Jacqueline and Christian Michel, 2007–2015, Conférences de l’Académie royale de Peinture et de Sculpture, 1648–1793, Paris: Beaux-Arts de Paris éditions. [Conférences 1648–1793 available online]
  • Saint-Girons, Baldine, 1990, Esthétiques du XVIIIe siècle: le modèle français, Paris: Sers.

Primary Literature

  • André, Yves Marie, 1741, Essai sur le beau, où l’on examine en quoi consiste précisément le beau dans le physique, dans le moral, dans les ouvrages d’esprit et dans la musique, Paris: Guérin.
  • Batteux, Charles, 1746 [2015], Les Beaux-arts réduits à un même principe, Paris: Durand. Translated as, The Fine Arts Reduced to a Single Principle, James O. Young (trans.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2015. doi:10.1093/actrade/9780198747116.book.1
  • –––, 1753, Cours de belles-lettres, ou Principes de la littérature (Principles of Literature), Paris: Durand.
  • Baumgarten, Alexander Gottlieb, 1735, Meditationes philosophicae de Nonnullis ad poema pertinentibus, [Baumgarten 1735 available online]
  • Blanchard, Louis-Gabriel, 1671, “Sur le mérite de la couleur”, in A. Fontaine, Conférences inédites de l’Académie royale de Peinture et de Sculpture, Paris: Minerva, 1903; translation in [AT] by Katerina Deligiorgi.
  • Bouhours, Dominque, 1671 [1705], Entretiens d’Ariste et Eugène, Paris: Mabre-Cramois. Translated as The Art of Criticism, 1705; reprinted Delmar, NY: Scholar’s Facsimiles & Reprints, 1981.
  • Cartaud de la Vilate, François, 1726, Essai historique et philosophique sur le goût, Paris: Chez Maudouyt.
  • Cochin, Charles Nicolas and Jérôme Charles Bellicard, 1753, Observations upon the Antiquities of the Town of Herculaneum, London: D. Wilson and T. Durham. [Cochin and Bellicard 1753 available online]
  • Crousaz, Jean-Pierre de, 1715, Traité du beau, Où l’on montre en quoi consiste ce que l’on nomme ainsi, par des exemples tirez de la plûpart des arts & des sciences, Amsterdam: Chez François L’Honoré. Part translated as “Treatise on Beauty” in AT: ch. 70.
  • Dacier, Anne Le Fèvre, 1711, L’Iliade d’Homère Traduite en François, Paris.
  • –––, 1714, Des Causes de la Corruption du Goust (On the Causes of the Corruption of Taste), Paris: Rigaud.
  • De Piles, Roger (trans.), 1668, L’art de peinture, de Charles-Alphonse Du Fresnoy, Paris. [De Piles 1668 available online]
  • –––, 1673, Dialoque sur le coloris (Dialogue upon Coloring), Paris: N. Langlois. [De Piles 1673 available online]
  • –––, 1708, Cours de peinture par principes avec un balance de peintres, Paris: J. Estienne; translated as The Principles of Painting, anonymous translator, London: J. Osborn, 1743. [De Piles 1708 available online]
  • Diderot, Denis, 1751a, “Beau”, in Encyclopédie, ou dictionnaire raisonné des sciences, des arts et des métiers, Diderot and d’Alembert (eds), 1751–1765, Paris: Briasson, vol. 1: 169–181. [Diderot 1751a available online]
  • –––, 1751b, Lettre sur les sourds et muets a l’usage de ceux qui entendent et qui parlent (Letter on the Deaf and Dumb, for the use of those who hear and speak), published anonymously. [Diderot 1751b available online]
  • –––, Diderot on Art I: The Salon of 1765 and Notes on Painting (“Essais sur la peinture”, 1766), John Goodman (trans.), New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1995.
  • –––, Diderot on Art II: The Salon of 1767, John Goodman (trans.), New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1995.
  • –––, 1763, Œuvres, Laurent Versini (ed.), volume 4 of 5, Paris: Laffont, 1996; translation in [AT] by Kate Tunstall.
  • DuBos, Jean-Baptiste, 1719, Réflexions critiques sur la poésie et sur la peinture, Paris: Mariette, 1733. Translated as Critical Reflections on Poetry, Painting and Music, Thomas Nugent (trans.), London: John Nourse, 1748.
  • Félibien, André, 1667, Conferences de l’Academie royale de peinture et de sculpture, pendant l’année 1667, Paris: Frederic Leonard. Translated as Seven Conferences Held in the King of France’s Cabinet of Paintings, Henri Testelin (trans.). London: T. Cooper, 1740.
  • –––, 1725, Entretiens sur les vies et les ouvrages des plus excellents peintres anciens et modernes, Trévoux: Imprimerie de S. A. S.; translation in [AT] by Jonathan Murphy. [Félibien died in 1695 and this work was published posthumously.]
  • Hutcheson, Francis, 1725, Inquiry into the Original of our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue in Two Treatises, London.
  • Jaucourt, Louis de, 1765, “Louvre, Le”, in Encyclopédie, ou dictionnaire raisonné des sciences, des arts et des métiers, Diderot and d’Alembert (eds), 1751–1765, Paris: Briasson,vol. 9: 706–707.
  • La Font de Saint-Yenne, Étienne, 1747, Réflexions sur quelques causes de l’état présent de la peinture en France, The Hague: Jean Neaulme.
  • La Motte, Houdar de, 1714, L’Iliade, avec Discours sur Homère, Paris: Dupuis. [La Motte 1714 available online]
  • Lambert, Anne-Thérèse, Marquise de, 1748, “Reflexions sur le Goût”, in Œuvres, Paris: Ganeau, 214–218. Translated as “Some Thoughts on Taste”, in The Works of the Marchioness de Lambert, Dublin: J. Potts, 1770, 181–184.
  • Le Brun, Charles, 1672, “Sentiments sur le discours du mérite de la couleur par M. Blanchard”, in André Fontaine, Conférences inédites de l’Académie royale de Peinture et de Sculpture, Paris: Minerva, 1903, pp. 35–43; translation in AT by Katerina Deligiorgi.
  • Mariette, Pierre-Jean, 1851–60, Abecedario de P.J. Mariette, 6 volumes, Paris.
  • Marmontel, Jean François, 1787, Eléments de littérature, Paris: Desjonquères, 2005.
  • Montesquieu, C., Voltaire, and Jean Le Rond d’Alembert, 1757, “Goût”, in Encyclopédie, ou dictionnaire raisonné des sciences, des arts et des métiers, Diderot and d’Alembert (eds), 1751–1765, Paris: Briasson, vol. 7: 758–770. Translated as an annex to Alexander Gerard, 1759, Essay on Taste, with Three Dissertations on the Same Subject by Mr de Voltaire, Mr d’Alembert, Mr de Montesquieu, London: A. Millar. [Goût 1759 available online]
  • Pernéty, Antoine-Joseph, 1757, Dictionnaire portatif de peinture, sculpture et gravure, Paris: Bauche. [Pernéty 1757 available online]
  • Perrault, Charles, 1688–1697, Parallèle des Anciens et des Modernes, Paris: Coignard.
  • Poussin, Nicolas, 1647, “Letter to Chantelou”, in Anthony Blunt, Nicolas Poussin, London: Phaidon, 1967, pp. 367, A. Blunt (trans.).
  • Rameau, Jean-Philippe, 1722, Traité de L’Harmonie: Reduite à ses Principes naturels (Treatise on Harmony), Paris: Ballard.
  • –––, 1750, Démonstration du principe de l’harmonie, Paris: Durand.
  • Rousseau, Jean-Jacques, 1753, Lettre sur la musique français, (Letter on French Music). [Rousseau 1753 available online]
  • Voltaire, 1733, Le Temple du goût (The Temple of Taste), Amsterdam: Jaques Desbordes. [Voltaire 1733 available online]
  • Watelet, Claude-Henri and Pierre-Charles Lévesque, 1792, Dictionnaire des arts de peinture, sculpture et gravure, 5 volumes, Paris: Prault.

Secondary Literature

  • Barbafieri, Carine, 2021, Anatomie du “mauvais goût” (1628–1730), Paris: Classiques Garnier.
  • Becq, Annie, 1994, Genèse de l’esthétique française moderne, 1680–1814, Paris: Albin Michel.
  • Cassirer, Ernst, 1932, Die Philosophie der Aufkärung, Tübingen: J.C.B. Mohr. Translated as The Philosophy of the Enlightenment, Fritz C.A. Koelln and James P. Pettegrove (trans.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1951.
  • Chambers, Frank Pentland, 1932, The History of Taste: An Account of the Revolution of Art Criticism and Theory in Europe, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Chantalat, Claude, 1992, A la recherche du goût classique, Paris: Klincksieck.
  • Chouillet, Jacques, 1974, L’esthétique des Lumières, Paris: PUF.
  • Crow, Thomas E., 1985, Painters and Public Life in Eighteenth-Century Paris, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • Ehrard, Jean, 1970, L’idée de nature en France à l’aube des Lumières, Paris: Flammarion.
  • Ferry, Luc, 1990, Homo aestheticus: L’invention du goût à l’âge classique, Paris: Grasset.
  • Folkierski, Władysław, 1925, Entre le Classicisme et le romantisme, étude sur l’esthétique et les esthéticiens du XVIIIe siècle, Paris: Honoré Champion, 1969.
  • Fontaine, André, 1909, Les doctrines d’art en France: Peintres, amateurs, critiques, de Poussin à Diderot, Paris: Laurens. [Fontaine 1909 available online]
  • Guichard, Charlotte, 2012, “Taste Communities: The Rise of the ‘Amateur’ in Eighteenth-Century Paris”, Eighteenth-Century Studies, 45(4): 519–547. doi:10.1353/ecs.2012.0055
  • Harpe, Jacqueline E. de la, 1955, Jean-Pierre de Crousaz et le conflit des idées au siècle des Lumières, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Hobson, Marian, 1982, The Object of Art, The Theory of Illusion in Eighteenth Century France, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kintzler, Catherine, 1991, Poétique de l’opéra français de Corneille à Rousseau, Paris: Minerve.
  • Lichtenstein, Jacqueline, 2003, La couleur éloquente: rhétorique et peinture à l’âge classique, Paris: Flammarion.
  • Lombart, A., 1913, L’Abbé du Bos, un initiateur de la pensée moderne, 1670–1742, Paris: Hachette. [Lombart 1913 available online]
  • Masseau, Didier, 2014, Une Histoire du bon goût, Paris: Perrin éditions.
  • Puttfarken, Thomas, 1986, Roger de Piles’ Theory of Art, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • Saisselin, Rémy Gilbert, 1965, Taste in Eighteenth Century France: Critical reflections of the origins of aesthetics; or, An apology for amateurs, Syracuse, NY: Syracuse University Press.
  • Scholar, Richard, 2005, The Je-Ne-Sais-Quoi in Early Modern Europe, Encounters with a Certain Something, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199274406.001.0001
  • Tsien, Jennifer, 2011, The Bad Taste of Others: Judging Literary Value in Eighteenth-Century France, Philadelphia: University Press.

Other Internet Resources

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Jacques Morizot

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