Hume’s Aesthetics

First published Wed Dec 17, 2003; substantive revision Tue Apr 21, 2020

David Hume’s views on aesthetic theory and the philosophy of art are to be found in his work on moral theory and in several essays. Although there is a tendency to emphasize the two essays devoted to art, “Of the Standard of Taste” and “Of Tragedy,” his views on art and aesthetic judgment are intimately connected to his moral philosophy and theories of human thought and emotion. His theory of taste and beauty is not entirely original, but his arguments generally display the keen analysis typical of his best work. Hume’s archaic terminology is occasionally an obstacle to appreciating his analysis, inviting conflicting readings of his position.

1. Context

Hume’s aesthetic theory received limited attention until the second half of the Twentieth Century, when interest in the full range of Hume’s thought was enlivened by the gradual recognition of his importance among philosophers writing in English. Unfortunately, many discussions of Hume’s aesthetics concentrate on a single late essay, “Of the Standard of Taste” (1757). This emphasis misrepresents the degree to which Hume’s aesthetic theory is integrated into his philosophical system. This misrepresentation has been countered by recent monographs on Hume’s general aesthetic theory by Dabney Townsend (2001) and Timothy Costelloe (2007).

The “Advertisement” to his first publication, A Treatise of Human Nature, promises that if the first two volumes find suitable “approbation,” the project will conclude with “the examination of morals, politics, and criticism; which will compleat this Treatise of human nature” (T, Adv, xii). Sadly, the Treatise was not a success and Hume limited the third and final volume to the topic “Of Morals.” He never produced his systematic treatment of politics and criticism and so never completed his new “science” of human nature. Those topics would be handled piecemeal in several collections of short essays, the “polite” writing that brought him the publishing success he desired.

Hume’s concept of criticism is not interchangeable with either aesthetics or philosophy of art. These now-familiar labels were not available to Hume when he published his Treatise in 1739 and 1740. The Abbé Charles Batteux did not defend the idea of grouping the arts together in an investigation of fine art until 1746. However, Hume knew and drew from the French tradition leading to Batteux’s work. Under this general influence, his essays occasionally refer to the “finer arts” of painting, music, sculpture, and poetry (CL, 158; SOT 278; OT, 264; C, 289). There is no direct evidence that Hume read Batteux, but they agree in identifying the fine arts as mimetic “arts of luxury” that exist primarily for the sake of our enjoyment (C, 289). Although contemporaries such as Alexander Gerard and Lord Kames (Henry Home) both use the phrase “fine art,” Hume’s books and letters never use that expression. Hume was probably not aware of Alexander Baumgarten’s Reflections on Poetry of 1735, the work that introduced the term “aesthetics.” The thesis that aesthetic judgments are completely distinct from moral judgments would not receive its modern formulation until Immanuel Kant’s Critique of Judgment (1790), after Hume’s death in 1776. So Hume’s reflections on aesthetics occupy a pivotal niche between the appearance of fine art theory and Kant’s defense of an independent aesthetic judgment in the Critique of Judgment – a defense clearly influenced by Kant’s reading of Hume’s essays and An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals.

Hume’s theory is most firmly rooted in the work of Joseph Addison, Francis Hutcheson, and, to a lesser extent, Shaftesbury (Anthony Ashley Cooper). The specific connections are detailed in Kivy (2003), Townsend (2001), and Costelloe (2007). From the older tradition, elegantly expounded by Addison in numerous essays written between 1709 and 1715, Hume retains the idea that the values within the scope of criticism are essentially pleasures of the human imagination. Although Hume acknowledges cases where beauty seems a merely sensory pleasure, he emphasizes beauty’s status as a cognitive pleasure. Taking beauty as his paradigm case of such a value, Hume combines Addison’s theory of taste as an operation of imagination with Hutcheson’s proposal that emotions are the foundation of moral judgment. Elaborating on the “inner sense” theory, Hume endorses Hutcheson’s stance on the general question of the nature of both moral and aesthetic value. Value judgments are expressions of taste rather than reasoned analysis. Values cannot be addressed except in the context of a general theory about our shared human nature. Although recognition of aesthetic and moral beauty is a manifestation of taste (and perhaps they cannot ultimately be distinguished from one another), taste must not be dismissed as subjective, idiosyncratic preference.

Granted, Hume has many other influences. He drew on classical sources, including Cicero. His celebrated essay on taste draws heavily on French thought, particularly on that of the Abbé Jean-Baptiste Dubos(1748). (See Section 4 below.) So does the essay on tragedy. (See Section 5 below.) Detailed accounts of Hume’s debt to Dubos are provided in Jones (2009) and Townsend (2011, pp. 76–85).

Within this framework of concerns and influences, Hume is neither interested in working out a theory of art (in contributing to philosophy of art) nor in analyzing aesthetic properties (in doing aesthetics). Although he is aware of debates about the nature of the sublime and recognizes it as a category of artistic achievement (SOT, 281), he offers no theory of the sublime. An attempt to pull together a Humean account is made by Hipple (1967, pp. 42–44). Due to the seamless connection Hume posits between moral and aesthetic value, much of his technical discussion of aesthetics appears only as an illustration of his moral theory. Other details of Hume’s aesthetics emerge in contexts where he expounds his theory of imaginative association (EHUa, 102–7), elaborates on the value of delicacy of taste (DOT), and denies that his appeal to sentiment leads to skepticism about value distinctions (S, 217–19). Consequently, a reading that emphasizes “Of the Standard of Taste” at the expense of the Treatise and Enquiries shortchanges the theory’s complexity.

Thus, the two essays that appear to summarize Hume’s aesthetics are best understood as applications of a larger philosophical account of human nature, including our social nature. The construction of each essay suggests a purpose of working out details of the larger project in the face of an obvious counterexample. Those counterexamples are the relativity of taste (SOT) and the pleasure we take in tragic fiction (OT). Yet their limited purpose does not detract from their continuing importance. They provide insight into perennial problems and so serve as the historical foundation for subsequent attempts to defend a subjectivist aesthetic theory.

Unfortunately, numerous interpretative challenges arise from Hume’s scattered presentation, his range of references, and his eighteenth-century assumptions about art. Like many of his contemporaries, Hume regards “poetry and the polite authors” as the most important arts (PW 3, 19). Timothy Costelloe (2018, chap. 4) consequently constructs an excellent survey of Humean aesthetics by canvassing the full range of Hume’s comments on poets and poetry. However, poetry differs from the more practical arts in being designed for the primary purpose of giving pleasure (SOT, 277). When using the terms “art” and “artist,” Hume sometimes means any human artifice and any skilled designer (in one context, an “artist” is someone who repairs a clock (EHU, 87)). In contexts where he can only be taken to be interested in the narrower category of fine art, Hume variously mentions painting, statuary, architecture, dance, poetry, and music. But he places poetry among the arts of eloquent public discourse. Eloquence includes sermons, essays, argumentative discourse, and other categories that we today would regard as too overtly didactic to be fine art (E).

Hume assumes that every product of human labor has some definite purpose, with only a limited subset of art being produced for the sake of pleasure alone. (He is skeptical about appeals to teleological or final causes in nature.) Houses will be designed and built apart from any need to satisfy our taste for beauty, and representational art will be produced in order to provide visual information. The interesting questions are why houses and visual representations also appeal to taste, and what this appeal tells us about the relative contributions of human nature and education as conditions for appropriate responses to our surroundings.

So what label best summarizes Hume’s theory of moral and aesthetic taste? It may be easier to specify which labels do not fit his theory than to attach one to it. He rejects normative realism. (There is considerable controversy on the question of whether Hume is a realist regarding matters of fact. Putting that issue to one side, he clearly denies that normative judgments have the same degree of objectivity that holds for matters of fact.) Hume is equally at pains to deny that reason provides an adequate foundation for judgments of taste. Is he therefore a subjectivist? Not if subjectivism implies that such judgments are arbitrary. He is not a relativist, for the main point of the essay on taste is that some judgments of taste are superior to others. Nor, in his own terms, is he a skeptic regarding aesthetic properties and value judgments. Despite his philosophical view that beauty is not a real property of things, Hume never questions the meaningfulness of general practice of making aesthetic judgments. Because the verdicts of taste are sentiments, devoid of truth-value, there is no opportunity for the conflicts and failures of reason that give rise to philosophical skepticism.

Hume is an inner sense theorist who treats aesthetic pleasure as an instinctive and natural human response. Successful art exploits our natural sentiments by employing appropriate composition and design. Only empirical inquiry can establish reliable ways to elicit the approval of taste.

2. Hume’s Terminology

Hume regards the natural capacity of taste as fundamental to the human ability to make moral and aesthetic judgments. Like his predecessors, Hume sees an analogy between an “inner sense” for beauty and the sense of taste for food and drink. Natural, general laws guide both. Both permit of education and refinement and thus better and worse responses. Both produce sentiments or feelings of approval and disapproval. But only the “mental” taste, the exercise of which is involved in moral and aesthetic judgment, admits of refinement through “the interposition” of ideas (T, 275).

Hume’s eighteenth-century terminology includes a pair of terms no longer in general use. In his basic nomenclature, “taste in morals, eloquence, or beauty” assigns either “approbation” or “disapprobation” (or some combination of both) to objects of taste (T, 547n). Approbation is “a peculiar delight” (T, 298) and a “particular kind of pleasure” (T, 472). It feels different from other pleasures. He variously characterizes approbation as a feeling of approval, liking, or affection. A beautiful object or action strikes us as amiable, agreeable, and desirable. Yet moral and aesthetic responses are not identical, for “the satisfaction is different, [which] keeps our sentiments concerning them from being confounded” (T, 472). Hume describes the feeling of disapprobation as one of disapproving, disliking, and contempt. An ugly object or vicious action feels odious, disagreeable, and undesirable.

In the eighteenth-century context of moral theory, “sentiment” is a generic label for emotions. (Hume’s theory is sometimes identified as “sentimentalism,” but that term has unfortunate modern connotations—though see the entry on moral sentimentalism.) In Hume’s technical vocabulary, all emotions are impressions, not ideas. The sentiments associated with beauty and ugliness are reflective impressions. They are not “impressions of the senses.” Instead, they are responses to sensory impressions (T, 276).

Beauty is a feeling of approbation, and an original, simple impression of the mind. Impressions are contrasted with ideas, which he alternatively calls “thoughts.” Ideas are “copies” of impressions, and seldom have the force or clarity of the experiences they copy. For Hume, experiencing a particular kind of approbation is a necessary condition for thinking about the idea of beauty. An individual cannot construct the idea of beauty out of other ideas, which is equivalent to saying that the idea derives from the proper sentiment of approbation (T, 469). In the complete absence of the operations of taste, thoughts about beauty would not occur.

Taste is the capacity to respond with approbation and disapprobation. But how does taste relate to Hume’s various remarks about “perceptions” and “discernments” of beauty, of our “judging” a work, and of critics who “give judgment” and who “give” or “pronounce” a “verdict” or “recommendation” (SOT, passim)? Hume seems to equate perception of beauty with the experience of the sentiment. (This equation underlies the problem of whether all tastes are equal). Does he distinguish between the critic’s experience of the sentiment and the judgment or verdict? If a verbal pronouncement that an object is beautiful is nothing more than an expression or report of the speaker’s sentiment, then Hume faces the difficulty that a critic’s verdict is not really a recommendation of the object. If your pronouncement that a piece of music is beautiful means no more than that you have felt a certain pleasure upon hearing it, then your verdict expresses your pleasure without saying anything about the music’s capacity to please others. So although critics issue judgments of taste based on their own sentiments, a judgment of taste must involve something more than a pleasing or displeasing sentiment. 

Hume observes that there is a difference between expressing one’s own sentiments and making a moral distinction. When someone speaks of another’s behavior as “vicious or odious or depraved, he then speaks another language, and expresses sentiments, in which he expects all his audience to concur with him” (EPM, 272). Moral and aesthetic judgment requires “steady and general points of view” (T, 581–82; see also SOT, 276), common to others (EPM, 272). Hume’s various descriptions of this point of view invite conflicting interpretations. However, it clearly requires the critic to reflect upon the relationship between the sentiment and its object.

Whether we call them “aesthetic judgments” or “judgments of taste,” aesthetic verdicts are unlike ordinary judgments about matters of fact. Matters of fact are relevant states of affairs, which render complex ideas either true or false. The same cannot be said about verdicts arising from the operations of taste. Sentiment, and sentiment alone, determines that a particular object is or is not beautiful.

Truth is disputable; not taste: what exists in the nature of things is the standard of our judgement; what each man feels within himself is the standard of sentiment. Propositions in geometry may be proved, systems in physics may be controverted; but the harmony of verse, the tenderness of passion, the brilliancy of wit, must give immediate pleasure (EPM, 171).

We do not infer that a sunset is beautiful and so deserving of approbation. We see the sunset, and the visual impressions please us. If we have the proper point of view, we are justified in saying that the sunset is beautiful. This verdict is more than a report or expression of the sentiment, yet the sentiment is an irreplaceable element of the judgment. A parallel claim is made of moral discrimination. “Pleasure and pain,” he insists, are the “essence” of beauty and deformity (T, 299). But how does a literary work “give immediate pleasure”?

One of Hume’s most puzzling claims is that taste is an “immediate” response. In his extended treatment of the passions and emotions in the Treatise, Hume says that “immediate” feelings are ones that do not involve the “interposition” of ideas (T, 275). Some pleasures and pains are “immediate” in the sense that they are impressions that immediately accompany other impressions (e.g., the experience of a very hot flame is accompanied by an experience of pain). How does a literary work “give immediate pleasure”? Taken literally, the Treatise appears to commit Hume to the view that literary works are beautiful independent of the audience’s ability to assign ideas or meanings to the words. As noted by James Grant (2014, p. 368), the Treatise sometimes posits a distinction between beauty, which is the quality of the object that acts upon us, and the pleasure it arouses. But these proposals are not repeated in Hume’s later writings and a commitment to observer-independent beauty is certainly not Hume’s mature position. His official theory is that there is “mental, as well as bodily taste” (SOT, 274), and both moral and aesthetic discrimination depend on mental taste. The requisite sentiments are spontaneous products of the mind, but they are not uninformed responses.

Mental taste normally requires some intervening thought process. So the pleasures and pains of aesthetic judgment are not immediate in being direct responses to other impressions.

Some species of beauty, especially the natural kinds, on their first appearance, command our affection and approbation; and where they fail of this effect, it is impossible for any reasoning to redress their influence, or adapt them better to our taste and sentiment. But in many orders of beauty, particularly those of the finer arts, it is requisite to employ much reasoning, in order to feel the proper sentiment; and a false relish may frequently be corrected by argument and reflection. There are just grounds to conclude, that moral beauty partakes much of this latter species, and demands the assistance of our intellectual faculties, in order to give it a suitable influence on the human mind (EPM, 173).

Mental taste arises in response to ideas that arise in response to impressions (e.g., viewing a photograph occasions thoughts about the place pictured, leading to thoughts about experiences one had or might have there, and the thoughts arising in this imaginative process are pleasurable or painful). Hume regards this “immediacy” of taste as entirely compatible with the influence of intellectual and imaginative faculties.

Taste is immediate and spontaneous, yet the application of “good sense” and “reason” improves it (SOT, 277). Taste is not improved by reasoning from a priori normative principles. Moral and aesthetic discriminations “are not conclusions of reason” (T, 457). Neither results from a mere “comparing of ideas” (T, 463). However, taste can be influenced by consultation of “general rules of art” or “rules” that “are founded only on experience and observation” (SOT, 270). For different views on the content of these rules or principles, see Hester (1979), Dickie (1996, pp. 126–131), Shelley (2002), Dickie (2003), and Shelley (2004). Mental taste involves reason in the sense of “sound understanding,” which ultimately depends on imaginative associations of ideas. So taste involves imaginative pleasure, as Addison proposed. This doctrine of imaginative pleasure has no special connection with creativity or with the capacity to produce art.

To summarize Hume on taste, aesthetic and moral response is “immediate” in the sense that the feeling occurs spontaneously in anyone who makes customary imaginative associations. Hume wants to emphasize that a critic does not infer the presence of beauty. Yet he also acknowledges the relevance of sound understanding to taste. This combination of doctrines has implications for the practice of justifying judgments of taste, and becomes the focus of the essay “Of the Standard of Taste.” Knowing that a sonnet has the same form as a second, beautiful sonnet will not offer any reason to think that they are equally fine poems. Only a reading of the sonnet can support claims about its beauty. However, Hume’s theory should be interpreted with caution, against the backdrop of his other claims about moral and aesthetic distinctions. The general, natural principles of taste are supplemented by learned rules, so that knowledge of other sonnets contributes to a more accurate or refined evaluation of the merits and flaws of a particular sonnet. His subjectivism does not lead to relativism. Not every sentiment is equally good.

3. Beauty and Taste in Hume’s Moral Theory

3.1 Subjectivism

Hume proposes that feeling, not thought, informs us that an object is beautiful or ugly, or that an action exhibits virtue or vice: “The very feeling constitutes our praise or admiration” (T, 471). The feeling or sentiment is itself an aesthetic or moral discrimination. It is prior to, and the basis of, any subsequent expression of praise or admiration. The sentiment is the beauty of the object and it is the virtue of desirable human action. Sentiment is the sole source of values governing human activity. Taste is a “productive faculty, and gilding or staining all natural objects with the colours, borrowed from internal sentiment, raises, in a manner, a new creation.” That new creation is “beauty and deformity, virtue and vice” (EPM, 294). However, the sentiment is calm rather than violent, so an unphilosophical perspective treats it as a property “of the object” (S, 218).

This moral and aesthetic subjectivism attracts Hume for the same reason that it attracts Hutcheson. The appeal to sentiment offers a middle position between the two prevailing theories within English letters, Hobbesian egoism and ethical rationalism. Hutcheson holds that virtue and beauty are not qualities of the people and things to which they are attributed. We may speak as if objects and people have moral and aesthetic properties, but the relevant property is merely an “idea raised in us.” Hume alters Hutcheson’s theory by imposing his own philosophical vocabulary, making beauty an impression rather than an idea. But they agree that to describe a person as virtuous or an object as beautiful is to make a claim about their tendency to cause a certain response. Is it imprudent and “too strong,” Hume asks Hutcheson, to summarize the thesis in the following terms (HL, I, 39–40)? “[W]hen you pronounce any action or character to be vicious, you mean nothing, but that from the constitution of your nature you have a feeling or sentiment of blame from the contemplation of it. Vice and virtue, therefore, may be compared to sounds, colours, heat and cold, which, according to modern philosophy, are not qualities in objects, but perceptions in the mind” (T, 469). Emphasizing Hume’s debt to Hutcheson, Kivy (2003, pp. 307–310), argues that Hume understands beauty very much on the model of colors. Although they are secondary qualities and so do not directly reveal the properties of the occasioning object, some color perception is “true and real” (SOT, 272), and so it is for Hume likewise with beauty. However, virtue and beauty are not strictly analogous to secondary qualities, such as heat and cold, because a critic’s claim that a work is beautiful involves an element of endorsement that does not arise in the observation that ice is cold. The case against reading Humean beauty on the model of ideas of secondary qualities is provided by Shiner (1996) and Taylor (2011).

Hume defends the centrality of sentiment with the following reasoning. Recognitions of virtue and beauty require particular sentiments in human observers. If the discriminations of taste took place without these sentiments, we would lack any motivation to do what we regard as moral. Moral and aesthetic judgments have practical consequences that mere reason lacks. So taste differs from the assent that characterizes understanding or reason (T, 458; EPM, 172; S, 219). Although taste responds to real qualities of objects, we cannot replace the exercise of taste with the assent of reason. In many cases, beauty and gracefulness (both aesthetic and moral) are inexplicable; they resist our efforts at explication, and we must trust the “sure testimony of taste and sentiment” (EPM, 267).

Epistemically, taste is nonetheless a fallible indicator of beauty and deformity. The underlying sentiments never “refer” to anything in their cause (SOT, 268). Feelings do not represent any aspect of their occasioning objects, and they are easily attached to objects other than their cause (T, 280). (As with any causal relationship, such as the causal link between smoke and fire, an isolated effect does not refer back to its cause, nor does it provide us with information about the nature of the object or event that causes it. If we experience smoke but have never experienced fire, the smoke will tell us nothing about the nature of fire.) As effects of our interaction with the world, sentiments cannot reliably inform us about the nature of their causes. It will not always be clear, prior to careful attention and reflection, which features of a work of art are responsible for our sentiments of approbation and disapprobation. On Hume’s analysis, the chain running from cause to effect turns out to be extremely complex, for the relationship is indirect and “the human body is a mighty complicated machine” with many “secret powers” (EHU, 87; see also SOT, 270). Knowing this, good critics pronounce their verdicts only after they clarify how their own sentiments relate to the object that is being evaluated (SOT, 270–71).

However, some of Hume’s critics see a fundamental contradiction between his subjectivism and his distinction between better and worse critics or the possession of better and worse taste. The criticism is most often formulated against Hume’s parallel discussion of ethical evaluation. A particularly forceful statement of the objection is provided by Philippa Foot (1966). Hume was acutely aware of the general problem and it is the starting point of the essay “Of the Standard of Taste.” (See Section 4 below.)

3.2 The Dispositional Analysis

Our sentiments obey general principles governing our species. Yet we must be able to make judgments of taste immediately, without having to be aware of the laws governing them.

Hume’s acknowledgment of regular, predictable causes of the moral and aesthetic sentiment is sometimes taken as an indication that Hume is not a genuine subjectivist. On this reading, he equates beauty and virtue with dispositional properties of external objects. Attributions of moral and aesthetic properties to objects indicate a speaker’s acknowledgment of the object’s tendency to produce the sentiment. There are passages that suggest such a reading: “beauty is such an order and constitution of parts, as … is fitted to give a pleasure and satisfaction to the soul” (T, 299; see SOT, 273). The dispositional analysis of beauty is attributed to Hume by Savile (1982, p. 161), Mothersill (1984, pp. 205–206), and Levinson (2002). Reasons to think it is mistaken are provided by Baxter (1990). The dispositional analysis should not be confused with the position that features of objects cause the requisite sentiment. The case for attributing a causal theory of taste to Hume is provided by Shiner (1996)

Despite such passages, it is questionable whether Hume really offers a dispositional analysis. A dispositional analysis tells us which properties would exist if certain conditions were satisfied. A simplified dispositional analysis treats “Cork is buoyant” as equivalent in meaning to “If a piece of cork is placed in water, it floats.” A simplified dispositional analysis of beauty treats “This object is beautiful” as equivalent in meaning to “If anyone perceives this object under ideal conditions, a sentiment of approbation accompanies the perception.”  On this account, beauty is distinct from the sentiment of approbation. The sentiment is incorporated into the analysis, but the sentiment is not itself a dispositional property.

Suppose that Hume regards beauty as a dispositional property. Like the dispositional terms “buoyant” and “brittle,” “beauty” could be predicated of objects, generating judgments that are true or false for different objects. Statements attributing dispositional properties to objects are true even if the appropriate conditions are never satisfied (e.g., “This vase is brittle” can be true despite the fact that the vase never gets broken). Yet Hume clearly denies that judgments of taste are truth-valued, and he denies that it makes sense to make inferences about an object’s beauty in advance of the requisite sentiment (S, 219).

Hume famously argues that, in order to clarify any idea, “we need but enquire, from what impression is that supposed idea derived” (EHU, 22). If beauty is a dispositional property, then one arrives at the idea of beauty by associating particular causes with particular effects under specific conditions. In Hume’s terminology, a dispositional idea of beauty would be the idea of a complex relation of cause and effect. It would be a causal principle, and we could not employ the idea prior to formulating such a principle. Yet, once again, Hume denies an implication of the dispositional analysis. The sentiment of approbation is our only source for our idea of beauty, and there are cases where we recognize beauty in advance of any reasoning about the beautiful object (EPM, 173).

Furthermore, if Hume regards beauty as a dispositional property, he has a model close at hand in Hutcheson’s analysis. But Hume avoids offering any such account. Aside from a willingness to identify several ways that works of art must fail to please refined taste, Hume does very little to advance the traditional and familiar project of criticism, the stipulation of rules for successful art. Granted, he endorses the existence of such rules (SOT, 269–273) and provisionally suggests (SOT, 273) that they serve as our standard of taste, a point explored by Brown (1938), Jones (1976, 2009), Shelley (1994), and Costelloe (2007, pp. 3–17). However, he does not provide an organized or dedicated presentation of the properties of objects that regularly cause the sentiment of approbation. Costelloe (2018, pp. 161–170) has nonetheless extracted three such principles from Hume’s discussions of poetry. First, artistic depictions must be grounded in what is familiar or, at the very least, plausible. Second, artworks must be constrained by coherence in their imaginative associations. Third, simplicity is preferable to “excessive ornamentation and artifice” (Costelloe 2018, 167). At the same time, Hume recognizes that any established correlation between sentiment and objective properties might be defeated by the next example that we encounter (SOT, 270). Despite the existence of “general principles of approbation or blame,” taste depends on too many variables (“incidents and situations”) to offer a detailed dispositional analysis (SOT, 271).

Passages endorsing a dispositional account might be slips of the pen. Or, more likely, Hume does not believe that it is possible to define evaluative terms. They are indefinable, primitive terms. Hume emphasizes that “certain qualities in objects” are the occasions for our sentiments of approbation and disapprobation (SOT, 273). Formal design is one such quality (SOT 271; T, 299, 364). The existence of occasioning qualities provides theoretical support for the possibility of a convergence of refined taste. So our primitive evaluative terms are not arbitrarily applied. Nonetheless, it is irresponsible to endorse any particular thing or action in advance of the verdict of unprejudiced taste.

3.3 Imagination and Point of View 

Informed understanding makes a vital contribution to most aesthetic and moral judgment (EPM, 173; SOT, 277). For Hume, taste is improved by practice in making “comparisons” among objects (SOT, 275) and by the employment of “good sense” (SOT, 277).

Hume blurs traditional distinctions between thinking and imagining. Thoughts would not extend beyond our actual experiences were it not for the imaginative associations established by the force of repetition or “custom” (T, 170; EHU, 43). Learned associations encourage us to rearrange our ideas in intelligible patterns, permitting us to create ideas of things never actually experienced (e.g., fictitious creatures or distant places). Imagination also creates chains of associated ideas, encouraging thoughts to move rapidly from one idea to another.

Good taste therefore presupposes an active imagination. Suppose one wakes in the morning and smells the distinctive aroma of coffee, and the experience is pleasurable. This appreciation depends on a learned, imaginative association: the smell brings to mind its cause, the brewing coffee, and its purpose, the consumption of the coffee. The agreeable sentiment is a response to this complex association of impressions and ideas, not to the smell alone. Critical evaluation is therefore highly contextual: “The passion, in pronouncing its verdict, considers not the object simply, as it is in itself, but surveys it with all the circumstances, which attend it” (S, 224).

It is important to recognize that Humean imagination is not a free and unrestrained activity. It is constrained by a relatively small set of permanent principles of imaginative association (T, 10, 225; EHU, 24). Although poets may “profess to follow implicitly the suggestions of their fancy” (T, 225), their poetry has little chance of pleasing others if their “fancy” or imagination employs irregular associations. The universal principles of imaginative association allow artists to predict how their representational and narrative designs will move audiences. With artworks, the intentions of the artist must be considered, a point emphasized by Jones (1976, pp. 55–56), and Jones (2009).

Hume recognizes a very small class of cases for which imaginative association is not needed to recognize beauty. In these cases, initial impressions of the mere “form” of a material object generate approbation (T, 364). Such cases are more typical of natural beauty than art (EPM, 173). So imagination is not always necessary for discovering beauty. Pleasing form is sometimes sufficient. However, “’tis seldom we rest there” (T, 363).

So Hume does not advocate a simple causal relationship between form and sentiment. In most cases, our beliefs about the object alter our sentiments. Forms are generally most pleasing when “the order and construction of parts” (T, 299) suggests a corresponding utility for humans or expresses agreeable emotions. These suggestions need not be accurate in order to trigger approbation and disapprobation. A particular object might appear balanced, graceful, and beautiful despite our knowledge of its limited utility (T, 584). Objects may displease taste despite their genuine utility.

A house may displease me by being ill-contrived for the convenience of the owner; and yet I may refuse to give a shilling towards the rebuilding of it. Sentiments must touch the heart, to make them controul our passions: But they need not extend beyond the imagination, to make them influence our taste. When a building seems clumsy and tottering to the eye, it is ugly and disagreeable; though we be fully assured of the solidity of the workmanship. ‘Tis a kind of fear, which causes this sentiment of disapprobation; but the passion is not the same with that which we feel, when obliged to stand under a wall, that we really think tottering and insecure. The seeming tendencies of objects affect the mind: And the emotions they excite are of a like species with those, which proceed from the real consequences of objects, but their feeling is different. Nay, these emotions are so different in their feeling, that they may often be contrary, without destroying each other; as when the fortifications of a city belonging to an enemy are esteemed beautiful upon account of their strength, though we could wish that they were entirely destroyed. The imagination adheres to the general views of things, and distinguishes the feelings they produce, from those which arise from our particular and momentary situation (T, 586–87).

Hume’s views on the aesthetic relevance of form and utility are explored by Carolyn Korsmeyer (1976), while utility is emphasized by Taylor (2011). Given Hume’s debt to Hutcheson, Korsmeyer notes that it is tempting to read such passages as foreshadowing the subsequent theory of aesthetic response as “disinterested” pleasure. However, we should be careful here. Hume uses the term “disinterest” as the contrary of “self-love” (EPM, 296), but he does not use the term in relation to aesthetic sentiment. Hume’s “common,” “universal,” or “general view of things” is a simpler proposal. He wants to remind us that we cannot expect the agreement of others if we judge things from a limited and prejudiced perspective (EPM, 272).

Relations of form and function can operate at an extremely abstract level: “A building, whose doors and windows were exact squares, would hurt the eye by that very proportion: as ill adapted to the figure of a human creature, for whose service the fabric was intended” (EPM, 212–13). Those who respond with sentiment are moved by “imaginary” and general consequences, not simply utility for the person passing judgment (EPM, 217–18). Furthermore, formal design itself can convey emotions which influence aesthetic response: “There is no rule in painting or statuary more indispensable than that of balancing the figures, and placing them with the greatest exactness on their proper centre of gravity. A figure, which is not justly balanced, is ugly; because it conveys the disagreeable ideas of fall, harm, and pain” (EPM, 245).

Thus, Hume blocks the conclusion that all taste is equal by distinguishing between two points of view that we can adopt toward any person, object, or action. We can respond from the point of view of our own self-interest. But this response is prejudiced and often produces “a false relish” (EPM, 173). Or we can respond from the general point of view, a reflective evaluation that is not motivated by self-interest. The general point of view is influenced by myriad beliefs about the object and its context. For example, believing that something is rare greatly magnifies our pleasure (S, 224). Where self-interest might make me jealous of your new home and will interfere with the sentiment of beauty, a reflective response will allow me to appreciate its construction and design.

For Hume, normative conflicts can only be resolved by moving to a properly informed general perspective, with “just conclusions drawn, distant comparisons formed, complicated relations examined, and general facts fixed and ascertained” (EPM, 173). The essay on taste defends this position and outlines a theory of how critics can place themselves in such a position:

when any work is addressed to the public, though I should have a friendship or enmity with the author, I must depart from this situation; and considering myself as a man in general, forget, if possible, my individual being and my peculiar circumstances. A person influenced by prejudice, complies not with this condition; but obstinately maintains his natural position, without placing himself in that point of view, which the performance supposes (SOT, 276–77).

Hume also invokes the operation of a sympathetic sentiment. Since sympathy plays an important role in his moral theory (T, 577; EPM, 225), he must include it in his aesthetic theory if he is to sustain the close ties he posits between morals and aesthetics. The general point of view takes notice of pleasure that the object is fitted to bring to other people. The idea of their benefit generates sympathetic pleasure, increasing the sentiment of approbation (T, 364–65).

However, Hume’s claim that most judgments of beauty require some element of sympathy (T, 363) becomes harder to maintain in cases of fine art. It is not clear how the appreciation of a sonnet or melody involves an idea of the value it has for others. Hume occasionally talks as if artistic beauty is entirely a question of formal design. And he seems to think that the utility and therefore value of some art is the pleasure it affords (e.g., with poetry), as if he advocates an early art-for-art’s-sake position. This interpretation is an obvious consequence of any interpretation that takes Hume to say that an object’s capacity to provide pleasure exhausts its aesthetic value. (This reading is endorsed by Levinson (2002) and challenged by Shelley (2011, 2013.) But the fact that a poem pleases someone else, or even large numbers of people, does not encourage sympathetic approbation for the poem.

A careful reading suggests that Hume neither separates the fine arts from the other arts nor places sympathy at the center of aesthetic response. From the start, he recognizes multiple reasons for approbation. He hypothesizes a general but not universal connection between artificial and natural forms and the appearance of utility (T, 195). He offers examples of basic design in painting (T, 364–65) and of “unharmonious” literature (EPM, 224). Poetry has an obvious formal element. Reading begins with impressions of dark shapes arranged in lines on white pages. Readers silently associate the printed text with aural ideas (the voice of a human speaker). Through imaginative association, literary forms have expressive human characters that elicit sympathetic pleasure and pain. Yet a reader who is not engaged by the subject matter may still find value in the “style and ingenuity of the composition” (T, 98). Because Hume does not operate with assumptions about the uniqueness of fine art, his theory cuts across the distinction between fine art and rhetoric. Good design and eloquence are beautiful and desirable in all artifacts and speech, not merely in fine art (E).

Where appropriate, the refined taste of a good critic will weigh the relative contributions of all aspects of the object of taste. Formal design is a contributing excellence and not the sole focus of aesthetic discrimination. To arrive at a proper moral judgment, “all the circumstances and relations must be previously known; and the mind, from the contemplation of the whole, feels some new impression of affection or disgust, esteem or contempt, approbation or blame” (EPM, 290). Aesthetic discrimination works in the same way (EPM, 291). In some situations, a single inharmonious element can upset the beauty of the whole. Hume discusses such cases in “Of the Standard of Taste.” But then what of tragic literature, in which sympathy produces ongoing unease? How can there be an impression of approbation for a tragic play? Hume addresses this problem in “Of Tragedy.”

In the wake of reader-response criticism, Hume is frequently challenged for not making enough allowances for the legitimate differences that readers bring to the same piece of writing. No two readers will respond with the same associations of ideas. So how can Hume hypothesize a convergence of critical response? As a criticism of Hume, this reply backfires. Hume concedes, “each mind perceives a different beauty” (SOT, 268). But he recognizes an even more radical problem. He admits that every stable object is really a “fiction” posited by the operations of imagination and sentiment. We always “bestow on the objects a greater regularity than what is observed in our mere perceptions” (T, 197). However, this philosophical grasp of the situation has no practical effect in making anyone skeptical of the existence of houses, trees, and books. It does not detract from the truth and falsity of what we ordinarily say about them. Novels and plays and paintings are not special cases. Admitting that they call for complex operations of imagination does not differentiate them from other objects and should not count against the possibility of critical judgment.

The crux of the problem is the difference between saying that Hamlet is a play by William Shakespeare and saying that Hamlet is a flawed play. The former claim expresses a matter of fact; the latter expresses a normative judgment. Both judgements stem from complex imaginative associations. The presence of imaginative thought poses no special problem for the convergence of evaluative discrimination. Hume’s primary problem is to explain how sentiment, as the essential source of value judgments, is subject to principled dispute. Hume directly confronts this problem in “Of the Standard of Taste.”

4. Hume’s Essay on Taste 

Hume tells us that “Of the Standard of Taste” was written in some haste and exists only to permit publication of other essays (HL 2, 253). On the advice of Philip Stanhope, Hume removed “Of the Immortality of the Soul” and “Of Suicide” from a planned volume of new essays. His publisher informed him that the resulting volume was too slim to print, bind, and sell. Hume then brought the book to an acceptable length by penning a new essay, “Of the Standard of Taste.” Hume made nearly two hundred editorial corrections over the subsequent twenty years and multiple editions, the majority of which involve punctuation. He never altered his argument. The essay is his last word on any topic in “criticism.” In addition to its importance as an elaboration of Hume’s views, Kant read the essay in translation and it stands to Kant’s mature aesthetic theory in much the way that Hume’s account of cause and effect stands to the Critique of Pure Reason. Succinct analyses of their contrasting positions are provided by Kulenkampff (1990), Savile (1993, pp. 81–84), and Costelloe (2007, pp. 45–52).

Hume reminds us of the radical difference in kind between matters of fact and the pronouncements of sentiment. Verdicts of sentiment lack a truth-value. So it is surprising to find him endorsing the position that many judgments of taste are “absurd and ridiculous” (SOT, 269). Small differences affect taste, yet most people notice only “the grosser and more palpable qualities of the object” (SOT, 278). Only judges with a more refined taste will respond to the “universal” appeal of superior art. Because refinement demands considerable practice, such critics are few in numbers.

It is tempting to read Hume’s argument as a move away from his signature subjectivism and toward some brand of normative realism. But a careful reading of the text reveals that nothing is said to deny his earlier support for subjectivism and there are no direct endorsements of realism. The standard of taste should provide rules for “confirming one sentiment, and condemning another” (SOT, 268). On this topic, see Brown (1938), Jones (1976, 1984), Shelley (1994), and Costelloe (2007, pp. 3–17). However, the standard is normative: it must explain why the sentiments of some critics are better and worse. It does not follow that sentiments are true and false in any absolute sense. These reflections lead Hume to postulate five criteria for identifying good or “true” critics: “Strong sense, united to delicate sentiment, improved by practice, perfected by comparison, and cleared of all prejudice, can alone entitle critics to this valuable character” (SOT, 278).

After several stabs at identifying the standard of taste, Hume identifies it as the consensus or “joint verdict” of “true critics” (SOT, 278–79). However, such critics are “rare” (SOT, 280) and “few are qualified to give judgment on any work of art” (SOT, 278). Consequently, it is not the verdict of contemporary critics that constitutes the standard, but rather the consensus of qualified judges over time and from multiple cultures (SOT, 271; SOT, 280). The importance of the so-called “test of time” is emphasized by Savile (1982) and Levinson (2002). Either way, the proposal has been criticized on the grounds that it posits a viciously circular analysis of aesthetic value: aesthetically superior artworks are those endorsed by true critics, but true critics are identified by their endorsement of the best art. Where earlier commentators tend to see circularity, as with Brown (1938) and Noxon (1961), more recent interpretations follow Kivy (1967) and see a regress problem. Circularity is avoided by identifying good critics who satisfy the five criteria, but this generates new evaluative questions, for we must determine if their responses are sufficiently delicate, grounded in the right comparisons, and so on. For further discussion, see Carroll (1984, pp. 189–191), Gracyk (1994, pp. 175–177), and Baceski (2013). Based on these problems, some readings of the essay reject the joint verdict of critics as Hume’s standard. For example, Costelloe (2007, pp. 2–14) argues that the “general rules of art” are his actual standard.

Furthermore, there is disagreement on the question of whether Hume holds that these true critics will be uniform in their verdicts. Interpretation of Hume’s position is complicated by the way that he consistently affirms his motivating insight, borrowed from Hutcheson, that sentiment is the essence of evaluation. Even the worst critic says nothing false in foolishly saying that one work is better than another, however misguided their sentiment. Passages where even the best critics will diverge in their evaluations are emphasized by Wieand (1984), Savile (1993, pp. 70–71), and Mothersill (1997). Most notably, all critics have “innocent and unavoidable” preferences (SOT, 281) and so they are better or worse at evaluating different categories of art. Furthermore, these preferences change during the lifetime of each critic. Consequently, the critical judgments of some critics will diverge from those of other highly qualified critics. But when critics’ differences arise from unavoidable and “blameless,” preferences, there is no interference of prejudice (SOT, 280). In short, the problem of finding a standard of taste leads Hume to the problem of deciding which disagreements are blameless, in order to distinguish them from prejudices that disqualify a sentiment as a public recommendation.

This reading of Hume is challenged by an interpretation that identifies the standard of taste with ideal critics. (The phrase does not appear in Hume.) That is, instead of real people who can guide us despite their unavoidable and intransigent biases, Hume’s true critics are ideal or perfect evaluators. The case that Hume’s critics are ideal critics who never disagree is made by Shelley (1994, 2003) and Costelloe (2007, pp. 17–18), and disputed in various ways by Guyer (2005), Ross (2008), Galgut (2012), and Durà-Vilà (2015).

Hume highlights only two sources that contribute to “blameless,” differences of sentiment among qualified critics: basic dispositions of character, and moral differences arising from cultural differences (SOT, 280). Today, we are more likely to notice a third source of disagreement, Hume’s recognition that different objects reflect distinct species of beauty. Becoming a qualified judge of epic poetry does not contribute to being a qualified judge of architecture. Addison is a better writer than John Locke, but the comparison assumes that they are both writing philosophy (EHU, 7). We can compare John Milton and John Ogilby, and only a false critic would rank Ogilby above Milton (SOT, 269). But it makes no sense to compare Milton and Addison, for Milton is a poet, not a philosopher.

Furthermore, different cultures employ different customs when handling the same artistic medium. “You will never convince a man, who is not accustomed to Italian music, and has not an ear to follow its intricacies, that a Scotch tune is not preferable” (S, 217). So the good critic must overcome the challenge of cultural prejudice. “A critic of a different age or nation, who should peruse this discourse, must have all these circumstances in his eye, and must place himself in the same situation as the audience, in order to form a true judgment of the oration” (SOT, 276). Hume emphasizes the great difficulties involved in overcoming the prejudices of one’s time and place (SOT, 281–82).

In the wake of a post-Kantian tradition that endorses art’s autonomy, many readers balk at Hume’s strong endorsement of the relevance moral judgment upon aesthetic evaluation (SOT, 283–84). Hume discusses the moral failing of several plays (SOT, 284) and of the Koran, considered as a literary “performance” (SOT, 267). How can Hume reconcile this position with his endorsement of Batteux’s influential thesis, in which the mechanical arts are distinguished from fine art by the fact that the latter exists only to provide pleasure? (“Of Tragedy” proceeds as if literature exists solely to provide the pleasure of the experience.) But there is also a side of Hume that refuses to distinguish between literature and other, “practical” writing. Every work of art is evaluated according to its distinctive purpose, with poetry alone singled out as having the purpose of “pleasing” the imagination (SOT, 277). Ultimately, there is very little art that Hume might treat as art-for-art’s-sake.

There should be no great surprise that Hume insists that moral judgments must sometimes enter into our aesthetic evaluations. (Good introductions to Hume’s view are provided by Mason (2001), Dadlez (2002), and Winegar (2011).) Hume does not offer a sharp distinction between moral and aesthetic taste. Evaluations that subsequent aesthetic theories regard as a purely aesthetic are, for Hume, concluding sentiments following numerous observations of contributing strengths and weaknesses. When a work of art represents human activity, then Hume’s account of moral evaluation requires that moral sentiment accompany apprehension of the action. The fictional status of the work weakens our sympathetic response, but the mere sequence of ideas will be sufficient to produce weaker versions of the sentiments that one would have if one were faced with the actual events. Given Hume’s moral theory, there is no possibility of suspending our moral response. Moral sentiments are natural and immediate. At best, one can gain a better understanding of the cultural context responsible for the work, so that one’s moral sentiments will not be negative through mere prejudice. Hume’s theory of sentiments requires that if we are going to have an aesthetic evaluation of a play’s plotting and language, then we are also going to have a moral response to its display of virtue and vice. Both must enter into our final sentiment of approbation or disapprobation.

Although Hume emphasizes the variety of responses that different groups and individuals have with the same works, some sources of preference are “blameless” (SOT, 280) and “innocent” (SOT, 281). Despite myriad differences, there are two basic types of taste: vulgar taste and refined taste. Given his thorough anti-realism about values, Hume cannot dismiss vulgar taste as subjective and mistaken. Hume has a different strategy for recommending refined taste as the more objective of the pair. Vulgar taste is more idiosyncratic and capricious. Refined taste is more properly rule-governed and stable. The two are equally subject to “rules,” but the person of refined taste is better informed about the material.

Hume’s contrast of vulgar and refined taste parallels his general treatment of the doxastic positions of the vulgar and the wise (T, 150; EHU, 110). Vulgar thinking is dominated by “the first influence of general rules” upon the mind. Such rules are instinctively but “rashly formed” to regulate the imagination. If these rules are allowed to govern thought in the absence of further reflection and refinement, the result is prejudice instead of wisdom. (T, 146,150) The wise, in contrast, take care to survey the broadest possible range of experience, allowing a “second influence of general rules” to supplant the first. In this manner, the “capricious and uncertain” ideas of the vulgar give way to “the more general and authentic operations of the understanding” and the superior judgments of the wise (T, 150). As for the normative question of why the refined judgments of the wise are preferable to the rash prejudices of the vulgar, Hume is content that moral sense assigns approbation to the “original instincts” underlying moral and aesthetic taste (T, 619).

Having argued that we can overcome prejudice and make superior assessments of ordinary matters of fact, Hume imports his contrast of vulgarity and wisdom into his aesthetic theory. Sound understanding makes inferences and arrives at a belief. Beliefs influence taste. Although a judgment of taste terminates in a reflective passion, rather than in a belief with a truth-value, taste employs operations of the imagination subject to rules internalized by the judging subject. Consequently, the contrast between first and second influences of general rules applies as much to taste as to “wisdom.” Vulgar taste should betray the same degree of capriciousness and prejudice as vulgar reasoning. Good taste, in contrast, should be more stable, for it will display “a certain point of view” appropriate to its object (SOT, 276). Refined taste reflects what Hume elsewhere calls the “more general” view. As with moral response, good taste meets with approbation while a prejudiced taste “loses all credit and authority” (SOT, 277). However, as a matter of interpretation, Hume’s references to a requisite “delicacy of imagination” (SOT, 272) complicate and obscure the account, for it is not clear what this delicacy is, nor how it contributes to a more settled, general view. Recent explorations of this problem include Townsend (2001, pp. 204–206), and Gracyk (2011).

So what are the rules of taste, over and above any rules or principles involved in sound judgment about the object of taste? Surprisingly, Hume never offers a clear case of one. At least two proposals about such rules can be extracted from Hume’s example of Sancho’s kin and the hogshead of wine, Hume’s “evidence” that there are general rules of taste (SOT, 272–73). On the one hand, it is tempting to read the rules as strictly parallel with the empirical laws discussed in the Treatise and first Enquiry. If so, they are causal laws specifying which properties and combinations of properties cause what kind and degree of pleasure. An example might be, “An aftertaste of iron or leather reduces the pleasure taken in an otherwise good wine.” Unfortunately, such rules seem suitable only for arriving at some probability about the likely effect of drinking such wine. Applying such a rule may result in a belief about the wine, but knowing the rule would not encourage the requisite sentiment. Where we can find them, rules of this sort are useful for separating true from pretend critics, if only in allowing us to point out inconsistencies in critical response (SOT 273–74).

But general rules of taste have a second function. Even if rules “had never been methodized” (SOT, 273), their existence supports the view that practice and comparison improves taste (SOT, 275). Those with adequate experience of a particular art form will perceive cases with greater accuracy. The existence of rules gives reason to agree that practice heightens the subject’s awareness of disruptive impressions (the taste of iron) and missing impressions (no fruity bouquet), resulting in a more reflective adjudication of the whole experience. They will also direct the imagination to expect various combinations of properties in light of one’s recognition that it is a thing of a specific kind. Properly amended to reflect mental rather than bodily taste, the story of Sancho’s kinsmen underlies the whole argument of “The Standard of Taste.” Even if the rule has not been formalized, the wine taster will operate as if reasoning from a rule (e.g., “since this is red wine, it will have a fruity bouquet but no hint of leather or iron”). The experienced reader or viewer will approach art with “the same excellence of faculties which contributes to the improvement of reason” (SOT, 278), discovering the true character of the object within “the disorder, in which they are presented” (SOT, 273).

5. Hume’s Essay on Tragedy

“Of Tragedy” grapples with a very different set of problems than “Of the Standard of Taste.” The motivating issue in “Of Tragedy” is that of unpleasant emotion as a positive feature of a work. Hume proposes to explain how “a well-written tragedy” is pleasing when that pleasure appears to depend on “sorrow, terror, anxiety,” and other naturally disagreeable emotions (OT, 258). Hume had visited this topic before, in the Treatise, where his account of the pleasure of tragedy invokes pity and sympathy (T, 369). “Of Tragedy” replaces this earlier account with a complex proposal about the mental workings of imagination in relation to our negative passions.

Originally published beside “Of the Standard of Taste” in Four Dissertations, “Of Tragedy” is a peculiar essay. Its direct engagement with Bernard de Fontenelle and the Abbé Jean-Baptiste Dubos confirms Hume’s acquaintance with French aesthetics. Hume makes passing reference to catharsis in his mention of spectator cries and sobs that “give vent to their sorrow” (OT, 258), but there is no evidence of familiarity with Aristotle’s Poetics. On the whole, the essay says surprisingly little about the nature of tragedy, and what it says is combined with discussions of melodramas and historical writing. Its real topic is the experience of conflicting emotions directed simultaneously at a single object, a topic treated in the Treatise. Because the pleasure offered by tragedy and melodrama depends on and is proportionate with their capacity to arouse grief, fear, and other unpleasant passions, Hume uses literature and theater as an occasion to elaborate on his theory of mixed emotions. As Hume formulates it, the problem is to explain the nature of the relationship between our approbation, which is pleasurable, and the presence of “sorrow, terror, anxiety,” and other naturally disagreeable emotions (OT, 258). The solution, Hume claims, is that any emotion “which attends a passion, is easily converted into it, though in their natures they be originally different from, and even contrary to each other” (T, 419).

Although published side by side, “Of Tragedy” and “Of the Standard of Taste” may offer conflicting doctrines. In the essay on taste, the unchallenged appearance of vice is treated as a flaw, and unpleasant emotion is a defect. But when “Of Tragedy” identifies a flaw in Nicholas Rowe’s The Ambitious Stepmother, the play’s defect is not the endorsement of vice. Instead, its flaw is the staging of action that is “too bloody and atrocious” (OT, 264). But why is “shocking” spectacle a flaw that leads to general disapprobation? Is it simply a question of the degree of shock? But why should that prevent the audiences from “converting” the shock into a “contrary” and pleasurable experience, as Hume claims happens with terror and anxiety? The obstacle does not seem to be moral in nature, of the sort explored in “Of the Standard of Taste” where Hume discusses a work’s failure to direct proper disapprobation at vicious manners. The essay on taste suggests that the same content would not be a flaw if proper adjustments were made. But “Of Tragedy” does not call attention to the moral dimension of Rowe’s play. So “Of Tragedy” is a discourse on an interesting puzzle about human psychology, namely the fact that unpleasant elements can be either strengths or ruinous defects. “Of Tragedy” says nothing about moralism and art.

Hume’s account of tragic pleasure has two components. First, different features of the work must generate the viewer’s agreeable and disagreeable responses. Disagreeable aspects contribute to our general approbation because those properties are balanced by naturally agreeable properties. Second, a general psychological principle explains how it is possible for competing emotions to produce a complex, pleasing sentiment. Borrowed from the Treatise (T, 419), that principle holds that when the same object produces different passions, even those “of a contrary nature,” then the subordinate passion can be “converted” into the predominant (OT, 262). “Of Tragedy” combines these two ideas. Our natural delight in “imitation” provides a strong and predominant passion. The naturally disagreeable emotions aroused by the plot provide a subordinate and contrary emotion, the “movement” of which “fortifies” the predominant passion. Unless the negative emotion becomes predominant, the overall effect of a well-written tragedy will be an audience “pleased in proportion as they are afflicted” (OT 258). The details of Hume’s theory are explored by Cohen (1962), Budd (1991), Neill (1992, 1999), and Dadlez (2004, 2016).

Although Hume illustrates his general principle with numerous examples, few of his contemporaries or modern interpreters endorse his theory. A rare exception is Galgut (2001). Famously, the theory faces multiple objections. It offers no working definition of tragedy and its examples are not, for the most part, genuine tragedies, points noted by Neill (1999). The details of Hume’s examples raise further issues. For example, Hume thinks it is obvious that Rowe’s play fails due to its gory and shocking spectacle, which tips the balance in the wrong direction. But the obvious reply is that many viewers enjoy the spectacle of violence. Hume basically says so: “The English theatre abounds too much with such shocking images” (OT, 265). How can Hume contend that the play is ruined when so many viewers enjoy it? For there is no appeal except to sentiment.

Perhaps Hume thinks that shocking spectacle satisfies vulgar taste but not refined taste. “Of the Standard of Taste” posits differences in audience members to account for different responses. Hume’s sketchy theory in “Of Tragedy” is compatible with most people enjoying aesthetically uninteresting works, for routine design readily delights most people (SOT, 276). But a refined taste is equally sensitive to all facets of the work, including formal design. Just as the wine tasted funny to Sancho’s kinsmen (SOT, 272–73), a run-of-the-mill work “gives pain” to true critics (SOT, 276). Only the best critics worry about the absence of genius.

The rules of taste endorsed in “Of the Standard of Taste” facilitate habituated expectations based on previous experiences with similar art. Aesthetic pleasure frequently depends on “custom” (T, 299) and on associations and expectations developed by the life experiences of the intended audience. If audience expectations are violated by excessive violence, and if there is no compensating reward for its inclusion, then the work has been improperly staged for its intended audience. But works that merely satisfy expectations will please the less discerning critics. Hence “shocking images” that are routine in English theater will please the audience. The same gory spectacle and “dismal” stories, insufficiently “softened” by genius and eloquence, will displease a refined taste (OT, 265).

Unfortunately, this interpretation merely heightens the problem. What is it that rewards vulgar taste? Why does violent spectacle attract anyone to routine, predictable potboilers? Natural sympathy should arouse uneasiness at the gory spectacle, yet the vulgar have no compensating reward. Brilliant language is surely an attraction of Shakespeare’s Othello, but no such achievement is to be found in most of the popular fiction that reliably delights its audience. Hume even implies that the vulgar do not attend to “eloquence” and similar formal achievement. However, the mere fact of “imitation” seems insufficient to explain the predominant pleasure in the face of this material. Is it the spectacle’s “exactness of imitation” (SOT, 276)? But that would seem to be a compensating pleasure in all but the most inept production, and would lead us to expect that vulgar audiences would respond with equal pleasure to almost any inferior work that meets their expectations. But this is simply not the case. “Of Tragedy” does not meet the standards of argument and insight set by Hume’s other contributions to aesthetics.


Hume’s Works

The abbreviations and texts cited above are as follows:

[T] A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 2nd ed. revised by P.H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975. [Page references above are to this edition.]
A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
[EHU] An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, in Enquiries concerning Human Understanding and concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 3rd edition revised by P. H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
[EHUa] An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 1999.
[EPM] An Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, in Enquiries concerning Human Understanding and concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 3rd edition revised by P. H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.[Page references above are to this edition.]
Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 1998.
[HL] The Letters of David Hume, edited by J.Y.T. Greig, 2 volumes, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1932.
[PW] The Philosophical Works of David Hume, edited by T. H. Green and T. H. Grose. 4 volumes, London: Longman, Green, 1874–75. [Page references below to individual essays are to volume 3 of this edition.]
[C] “Of Commerce,” in PW, Volume 3.
[CL] “Of Civil Liberty,” in PW, Volume 3.
[DOT] “Of the Delicacy of Taste and Passion,” in PW, Volume 3.
[E] “Of Eloquence,” in PW, Volume 3.
[OT] “Of Tragedy,” in PW, Volume 3.
[S] “The Sceptic,” in PW, Volume 3.
[SOT] “Of the Standard of Taste,” in PW, Volume 3.
[SRW] “Of Simplicity and Refinement in Writing,” in PW, Volume 3.

Works on Hume’s Aesthetics

  • Baceski, Tina, 2013. “Hume on Art Critics, Wise Men, and the Virtues of Taste,” Hume Studies, 39: 233–56.
  • Baxter, Donald L. M., 1990. “Hume on Virtue, Beauty, Composites, and Secondary Qualities,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 71: 103–18.
  • Brown, Stuart Gerry, 1938. “Observations on Hume’s Theory of Taste,” English Studies, 20: 193–98.
  • Budd, Malcolm, 1991. “Hume’s Tragic Emotions,” Hume Studies, 17: 93–106.
  • Carroll, Noël, 1984. “Hume’s Standard of Taste,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 43: 181–94.
  • Cohen, Ralph, 1962. “The Transformation of Passion: A Study of Hume’s Theories of Tragedy,‘Antinomy of Taste’,” Philological Quarterly, 41: 450–64.
  • Cohen, Ted, 1994. “Partial Enchantment in Hume’s Essay on Taste,” in Robert Yanal (ed.), Institutions of Art: Reconsiderations of George Dickie’s Philosophy, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 145–56.
  • Costelloe, Timothy M., 2003. “Hume, Kant, and the ‘Antinomy of Taste’,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 41: 165–85.
  • –––, 2007. Aesthetics and Morals in the Philosophy of David Hume (Routledge Studies in Eighteenth Century Philosophy), London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2018. Imagination in Hume’s Philosophy: The Canvas of the Mind, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • Dadlez, Eva M., 2002. “The Vicious Habits of Entirely Fictitious People: Hume on the Moral Evaluation of Art,” Philosophy and Literature, 26: 143–56.
  • –––, 2004. “Pleased and Afflicted: Hume on the Paradox of Tragic Pleasure,” Hume Studies, 30: 213–36.
  • –––, 2016. “A Humean Approach to the Problem of Disgust and Aesthetic Appreciation,” Essays in Philosophy, 17(1): Article 4.
  • –––, 2017. “Hume, Halos, and Rough Heroes: Moral and Aesthetic Defects in Works of Fiction,” Philosophy and Literature, 41: 91–102.
  • Dickie, George, 2003. “James Shelley on Critical Principles,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 43: 57–64.
  • Durà-Vilà, Víctor, 2014. “Courage in Art Appreciation: A Humean Perspective,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 54 (1): 77–95.
  • –––, 2015. “Shelley on Hume’s Standard of Taste and the Impossibility of Sound Disagreement among the Ideal Critics,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 73 (3): 341–45.
  • Foot, Philippa, 1966. “Hume on Moral Judgment,” in David F. Pears (ed.), David Hume: A Symposium, London: Macmillan, 67–76.
  • Galgut, Elisa, 2001. “The Poetry and the Pity: Hume’s Account of Tragic Pleasure,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 41: 411–24.
  • –––, 2012. “Hume’s Aesthetic Standard,” Hume Studies, 38: 183–200.
  • Gracyk, Theodore, 1994. “Rethinking Hume’s Standard of Taste,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 52: 168–82.
  • –––, 2011. “Delicacy in Hume’s Aesthetic Theory,” Journal of Scottish Philosophy, 9: 1–16.
  • Grant, James, 2014. “Hume, David. Theory of Beauty,” in Michael Kelly (ed.), The Encyclopedia of Aesthetics, 2nd ed., Oxford: Oxford University Press, Volume 3: 368–72.
  • Guyer, Paul, 2005. “Beauty and Utility in Eighteenth-Century Aesthetics,” in Paul Guyer, Values of Beauty: Historical Essays in Aesthetics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press: 110–28.
  • –––, 2005. “The Standard of Taste and the ‘Most Ardent Desire of Society’,” in Paul Guyer, Values of Beauty: Historical Essays in Aesthetics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press: 37–74.
  • Hester, Marcus, 1979. “Hume on Principles and Perceptual Ability,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 37: 295–302.
  • Jones, Peter, 1976. “Hume’s Aesthetics Reassessed,” Philosophical Quarterly, 26: 48–62.
  • –––, 2009. “Hume on the Arts and ‘The Standard of Taste’: Texts and Contexts,” in David Fate Norton and Jacqueline Tylor (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Hume, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press: 414–46.
  • Kivy, Peter, 1967. “Hume’s Standard of Taste: Breaking the Circle,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 7: 57–66.
  • –––, 1983. “Hume’s Neighbor’s Wife: An Essay in the Evolution of Hume’s Aesthetics,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 23: 195–208.
  • –––, 2011. “Remarks on the Varieties of Prejudice in Hume’s Essay on Taste,” Journal of Scottish Philosophy, 9: 111–15.
  • Korsmeyer, Carolyn, 1976. “Hume and the Foundations of Taste,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 35: 201–15.
  • –––, 1995. “Gendered Concepts and Hume’s Standard of Taste,” in P. Z. Brand and Carolyn Korsmeyer (eds.), Feminism and Tradition in Aesthetics, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, pp. 49–65.
  • Kulenkampff, Jens, 1990. “The Objectivity of Taste: Hume and Kant,” Noûs, 24: 93–100.
  • Levinson, Jerrold, 2002. “Hume’s Standard of Taste: The Real Problem,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 60: 227–238.
  • –––, 2003. “The Real Problem Sustained: Reply to Wieand”, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 61: 398–99.
  • MacLachlan, Christopher, 1986. “Hume and the Standard of Taste”, Hume Studies, 12: 18–38.
  • MacMillan, Claude, 1986. “Hume, Points of View and Aesthetic Judgments”, The Journal of Value Inquiry, 20: 109–23.
  • Marshall, David, 1995. “Arguing by Analogy: Hume’s Standard of Taste,” Eighteenth-Century Studies, 28: 323–43.
  • Mason, Michelle, 2001. “Moral Prejudice and Aesthetic Deformity: Rereading Hume’s ‘Of the Standard of Taste’,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 59: 59–71.
  • Mothersill, Mary, 1997. “In Defense of Hume and the Causal Theory of Taste,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 55: 312–17.
  • –––, 1984. “Hume: ‘Of the Standard of Taste’,” in Beauty Restored, Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 177–208.
  • –––, 2014. “Hume, David. ‘Of the Standard of Taste,’” in Michael Kelly (ed.), The Encyclopedia of Aesthetics, 2nd ed., Oxford: Oxford University Press, Volume 3: 364–68.
  • Neill, Alex, 1998. “‘An Unaccountable Pleasure’: Hume on Tragedy and the Passions,” Hume Studies, 24: 335–354.
  • –––, 1992. “Yanal and Others on Hume on Tragedy,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 50: 151–154.
  • –––, 1999. “Hume’s ‘Singular Phænomenon’,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 39: 112–125.
  • Noxon, James, 1961. “Hume’s Opinion of Critics,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 20: 157–62.
  • Osborne, Harold, 1967. “Hume’s Standard and the Diversity of Aesthetic Taste,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 7: 50–56.
  • Perricone, Christopher, 1995. “The Body and Hume’s Standard of Taste,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 53: 371–8.
  • Ribeiro, Brian, 2007. “Hume’s Standard of Taste and the de gustibus Sceptic,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 47: 16–28.
  • Rose, Mary Carman, 1976. “The Importance of Hume in the History of Western Aesthetics,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 16: 218–29.
  • Ross, Stephanie, 2008. “Humean Critics: Real or Ideal?,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 48: 20–28.
  • Saccamano, Neil, 2011. “Aesthetically Non-Dwelling: Sympathy, Property, and the House of Beauty in Hume’s Treatise,” Journal of Scottish Philosophy, 9: 37–58.
  • Sayre-McCord, Geoffrey, 1994. “On Why Hume’s ‘General Point of View’ isn’t Ideal – and Shouldn’t Be,” Social Philosophy and Policy, 11: 202–28.
  • Schier, Flint, 1986–87. “Hume and the Aesthetics of Agency,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 87: 121–35.
  • Shelley, James, 1994. “Hume’s Double Standard of Taste,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 52: 437–45.
  • –––, 1998. “Hume and the Nature of ‘Taste’,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 56: 29–38.
  • –––, 2002. “The Character and Role of Principles in the Evaluation of Art,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 42; 37–51.
  • –––, 2004. “Hume’s Principles of Taste: A Reply to Dickie,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 44: 84–89.
  • –––, 2011. “Hume and the Value of the Beautiful,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 51: 213–22.
  • –––, 2013. “Hume and the Verdict of True Judges,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 71 (2): 145–53.
  • –––, 2015. “When True Judges Differ: Reply to Durà-Vilà,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 73 (3): 345–48.
  • Shiner, Roger A., 1996. “Hume and the Causal Theory of Taste,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 54: 237–49.
  • Shusterman, Richard, 1989. “Of the Scandal of Taste: Social Privilege as Nature in the Aesthetic Theories of Hume and Kant,” Philosophical Forum, 20: 211–29.
  • Siebert, Donald T., 1989. “The Sentimental Sublime in Hume’s History of England,” Review of English Studies New Series, 40: 352–72.
  • Stradella, Alessandra, 2012. “The Fiction of the Standard of Taste: David Hume on the Social Constitution of Beauty,” The Journal of Aesthetic Education, 46 (4): 32–47.
  • Sverdlik, Steven, 1986. “Hume’s Key and Aesthetic Rationality,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 45: 69–76.
  • Taylor, Jacqueline, 2008. “Hume on Beauty and Virtue,” in Elisabeth Radcliffe (ed.), A Companion to Hume, Oxford: Blackwell, 273–92.
  • Townsend, Dabney, 2001. Hume’s Aesthetic Theory: Taste and Sentiment, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2013. “Hume’s Aesthetic Move: The Legitimization of Sentiment.” The European Legacy: Toward New Paradigms, 18 (5): 552–562.
  • Wieand, Jeffrey, 1984. “Hume’s Two Standards of Taste,” Philosophical Quarterly, 34: 129–42.
  • –––, 2003. “Hume’s Real Problem,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 61: 395–98.
  • Williams, Christopher, 2007. “Some Questions in Hume’s Aesthetics,” Philosophy Compass, 2: 157–69.
  • Winegar, Reed, 2011. “Good Sense, Art, and Morality in Hume’s ‘Standard of Taste,’” Journal of Scottish Philosophy, 9: 17–35.
  • Yanal, Robert J., 1991. “Hume and Others on the Paradox of Tragedy,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 49: 75–76.
  • Zangwill, Nick, 2001. “Hume, Taste, and Teleology,” in The Metaphysics of Beauty, Ithaca: Cornell University Press: 149–65.

Related Works on Hume and His Context

  • Addison, Joseph, and Steele, Richard, 1879. The Spectator, Alexander Chalmers (ed.), New York: D. Appleton.
  • Brunius, Teddy, 1952. David Hume on Criticism, Stockholm: Almqvist & Wiksell.
  • Coleman, Francis X. J., 1971. The Aesthetic Thought of the French Enlightenment, Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press.
  • Costelloe, Timothy, 2013. The British Aesthetic Tradition: From Shaftesbury to Wittgenstein, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dickie, George, 1996. The Century of Taste, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • DuBos, Jean Baptiste, 1748. Critical Reflections on Poetry, Painting, and Music, 3 vols. Translated by Thomas Nugent. London: John Nourse. Reprint, New York: AMS Press, 1978.
  • Duncan, Elmer H., 1970. “The Ideal Aesthetic Observer: a Second Look”, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 29: 47–52.
  • Guyer, Paul, 2014. A History of Modern Aesthetics (Vol. 1: The Eighteenth Century), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hipple, Walter John Jr., 1967. The Beautiful, the Sublime, and the Picturesque in Eighteenth Century Aesthetic Theory, Carbondale, IL: The Southern Illinois University Press.
  • Jones, Peter, 1982. Hume’s Sentiments: Their Ciceronian and French Context, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • Kivy, Peter, 2003. The Seventh Sense: Francis Hutcheson & Eighteenth-Century British Aesthetics, 2nd ed., Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 2016. “Hume’s Taste and the Rationalist Critique,” in Paul Russell (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Hume, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 531–545.
  • Savile, Anthony, 1982. The Test of Time: An Essay in Philosophical Aesthetics, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1988. Aesthetic Reconstructions: The Seminal Writings of Lessing, Kant, and Schiller, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Shaftesbury (Anthony Ashley-Cooper, Third Earl of Shaftesbury), 1999. Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times (2 volumes), Philip Ayres (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Shelley, James, 2001. “Empiricism: Hutcheson and Hume,” in Berys Gaut and Dominic M. Lopes (eds.), Routledge Companion to Aesthetics, 3rd edition, London and New York: Routledge: 36–45.
  • Townsend, Dabney, 1987. “From Shaftesbury to Kant: The Development of the Concept of Aesthetic Experience,” Journal of the History of Ideas, 48: 287–305.
  • –––, 2003. “Art and the Aesthetic: Hume, Kant, and the Essence of Art,” in Stephen Davies and Ananta Ch. Sukla (eds.), Art and Essences, Westport, CT: Praeger, 75–93.

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