Alain LeRoy Locke

First published Fri Mar 23, 2012; substantive revision Mon Jun 27, 2022

Alain LeRoy Locke is heralded as the “Father of the Harlem Renaissance” for his publication in 1925 of The New Negro—an anthology of poetry, essays, plays, music and portraiture by white and black artists. Locke is best known as a theorist, critic, and interpreter of African-American literature and art. He was also a creative and systematic philosopher who developed theories of value, pluralism and cultural relativism that informed and were reinforced by his work on aesthetics. Locke saw black aesthetics quite differently than some of the leading Negro intellectuals of his day; most notably W. E. B. Du Bois, with whom he disagreed about the appropriate social function of Negro artistic pursuits. Du Bois thought it was a role and responsibility of the Negro artist to offer a representation of the Negro and black experience which might help in the quest for social uplift. Locke criticized this as “propaganda” (AOP 12) and argued that the primary responsibility and function of the artist is to express his own individuality, and in doing that to communicate something of universal human appeal.

Locke was a distinguished scholar and educator and during his lifetime an important philosopher of race and culture. Principal among his contributions in these areas was the development of the notion of “ethnic race”, Locke's conception of race as primarily a matter of social and cultural, rather than biological, heredity. Locke was in contemporary parlance a racial revisionist, and held the somewhat controversial and paradoxical view that it was often in the interests of groups to think and act as members of a “race” even while they consciously worked for the destruction or alteration of pernicious racial categories. Racial designations were for Locke incomprehensible apart from an understanding of the specific cultural and historical contexts in which they grew up. A great deal of Locke's philosophical thinking and writing in the areas of pluralism, relativism and democracy are aimed at offering a more lucid understanding of cultural or racial differences and prospects for more functional methods of navigating contacts between different races and cultures.

Locke, like Du Bois, is often affiliated with the pragmatist philosophical tradition though somewhat surprisingly—surprising because Locke's actual views are closer substantively to pragmatist thinkers Like Dewey, James, and Royce than are Du Bois's—he does not receive as much attention in the writings of contemporary pragmatist philosophers as does Du Bois. Regardless, he is most strongly identified with the pragmatist tradition, but his “critical pragmatism”, and most specifically his value theory, is also influenced by Hugo Münsterberg, F.S.C. Schiller, Alexius Meinong, Frantz Brentano, and Christian von Erhenfels. From early on in his education at Harvard University, Locke had an affinity for the pragmatist tradition in philosophy. Locked developed his mature views on axiology well in advance of many leading pragmatists—e.g., Dewey and James. Among pragmatists, Locke has arguably the most developed and systematic philosophy of value, and offers many critical insights concerning democracy.

1. Chronology

1885  Born Arthur Locke September 13 to Pliny Ishmael Locke and Mary Hawkins Locke in Philadelphia, PA.
1902  Graduated from Central High School in Philadelphia during that same year Locke was afflicted by rheumatic fever, which did permanent damage to his heart.
1904  Graduates with Bachelor of Arts degree from Philadelphia School of Pedagogy first in his class. Publishes “Moral Training in Elementary Schools,” his first known publication.
1904–07  Locke attends Harvard University, earning his second Bachelor of Arts degree and graduating magna cum laude. During his time at Harvard Locke was elected to the Phi Beta Kappa Honor Society and studied under Josiah Royce, George Herbert Palmer, Hugo Münsterberg, and Ralph Barton Perry. Though he was a member of the faculty at the time Locke never actually studied with William James. While at Harvard Locke received the Bowdoin Prize in English for an essay composed on Tennyson entitled “The Prometheus Myth: A Study in Literary Tradition.” It was while at Harvard that Locke first met Horace Kallen, who worked as an instructor.
1907–09  In 1907 Locke was chosen as the first-ever African-American Rhodes Scholar. Even though he held a right to admittance to an Oxford college as a Rhodes Scholar he encountered some difficulty in this regard until he was finally admitted to Hertford College. While at Oxford Locke studied philosophy, Greek, and literature. It was while at Oxford as a Rhodes Scholar that Locke first met and became friends with Pixley Ka Isasha Seme. In 1907 and 1908, Horace Kallen was also at Oxford as a Sheldon Scholar.
1910–11  Following his studies at Oxford University and before returning to Harvard University to complete his PhD, Locke studied at the University of Berlin under the German sociologist Georg Simmel, where he was reacquainted with his Harvard professor Hugo Münsterberg. While at the University of Berlin Locke deepened his interest in value theory, particularly in the work of theorists such as Alexius Meinong, Christian Freiherr von Ehrenfels, and Frantz Brentano.
1912–14  Appointed as assistant professor of English, philosophy, and education to Teachers College at Howard University.
1915  Gives a series of lectures to the Howard chapter of the NAACP on the scientific study of race and race relations entitled “Race Contacts and Interracial Relations: Lectures on the Theory and Practice of Race.”
1917  Doctoral dissertation entitled The Problem of Classification in Theory of Value submitted to adviser Ralph Barton Perry September 17, 1917.
1918  Receives PhD in philosophy from Harvard University.
1925  Fired from Howard University following efforts to achieve pay equity between black and white faculty. December of that year Locke publishes The New Negro: An Interpretation perhaps his most famous work and earns himself recognition as a leading African-American literary critic and aesthete.
1928  Returns to Howard University following the appointment of Mordecai W. Johnson, the university's first African-American president.
1935  Reportedly it was in this year that Locke renewed his interest in writing philosophy as signaled by the publication of “Values and Imperatives,” in American Philosophy, Today and Tomorrow edited by Horace M. Kallen and Sidney Hook.
1942  Publishes two edited volumes and an article: When Peoples Meet: A Study in Race and Culture edited with Bernhard J. Stern, Color: The Unfinished Business of Democracy special volume of Survey Graphic and “Who, and What, Is Negro?”.
1943  Delivers a series of lectures entitled “The Contribution of the Negro to the Culture of the Americas,” under the auspices of the Haitian Ministry of Public Instruction as the Exchange Professor for the Committee for Inter-American Artistic and Intellectual Relations.
1953  Retired from Howard University and moved to New York.
1954  Died June 9 in Mount Sinai Hospital, New York from persistent heart trouble.

2. Axiology/Value Theory

Locke's seminal essay in value theory, “Values and Imperatives” is as ambitious in its aims as it is pioneering. In it Locke states what he takes to be the central problem for axiology; details the reasons for the failure of American philosophy, particularly pragmatism, to make anything more than a minimal contribution to the development of the philosophical study of values; argues that values are primarily rooted in human attitudes; and provides an elaborate theoretical account of value formation and the functional role of values. A value, according to Locke, is “an emotionally mediated form of experience.” Locke issues the following warning:

[i]n dethroning our absolutes, we must take care not to exile our imperatives, for after all, we live by them. We must realize more fully that values create these imperatives as well as the more formally super-imposed absolutes, and that norms guide our behavior as well as guide our reasoning. (VI 34)

Values are an important and necessary part of human experience. Values are an essential part of human existence as all human persons are inherently valuing beings. He writes:

[t]he common man, in both his individual and group behavior, perpetuates the problem in a very practical way. He sets up personal and private and group norms as standards and principles, and rightly or wrongly hypothesizes them as universals for all conditions, all times and all men. (VI 35)

Valuations of multiple kinds pervade nearly every aspect of our lives; our aesthetic, moral and religious evaluations and judgments.

On Locke's estimation,

the gravest problem of contemporary philosophy is how to ground some normative principle or criterion of objective validity for values without resort to dogmatism and absolutism on the intellectual plane, and without falling into their corollaries, on the plane of social behavior and action, of intolerance and mass coercion. (VI 36)

This is the central and driving question of Locke's axiology and as such it points to some of the crucial aspects of his overall philosophical view, but his theory of value specifically, and importantly his social and political philosophy. On the axiological plane the question is reformulated as whether or not the fundamental value modes automatically or dispositionally set up their end values prior to evaluative judgment. If value modes automatically or dispositionally set up their own ends, then there would exist a more direct approach to the apprehension of values. Moreover, if a connection can be discovered between certain psychological states and particular valuations then that might yield at least one avenue for an objective assessment of values and valuations. On the social and political plane—the practical plane where persons actually form valuations and act on them in myriad ways—the question is formulated in terms of how best to avoid a theory of value that is static, arbitrary and overly formulaic in ways that impede the theory's ability to provide an adequate understanding of value phenomena. To do this, a functional analysis of value norms is required, and normative principles must be the result of the immediate context of valuation. This we will see in the following sections is the major thrust of Locke's value pluralism and relativism.

2.1 Value-Feelings and Value-Modes

Locke begins by considering what he takes to be the most basic feature of values; their emotional character. He writes

the value-mode establishes for itself, directly through feeling, a qualitative category which, as discriminated by its appropriate feeling-quality, constitutes an emotionally mediated form of experience. (VI 38)

There is a particular feeling or feeling-quality associated with each value-mode. In fact, Locke contends that value-modes differ in virtue of differences in feeling-qualities. The value-mode, or perhaps better, the mode of valuing, refers to the qualitative character of a particular way of experiencing as mediated by a given emotion or attitude which Locke terms the feeling-quality. This has several important implications for the general theory of value: predicating a value to a subject depends on the feeling-quality associated with it; values are immediately recognized through an apprehension of their emotional quality; value-predicates are determined by the affective and volitional influence of the feeling-quality; and the imperatives of a given value are given immediately once the primary feeling-quality has been established.

Locke claims that there is a necessary connection between the feeling-quality and the value-mode with the former determining the later. The value-mode is normally established as the value is being apprehended. If this were not the case, the value-mode would be indeterminate even while its immediate quality is being felt. The basic categories of value are not rational: one cannot simply reason one's way to an understanding of them. In developing and articulating his axiology, Locke looks for the categories of value in the actual valuations of human beings. Rather than predetermining the categories of valuation and attempting to cram experiences of values into them, his theory begins with our concrete valuations and determines which if any features they have in common. It is then on the basis of the commonalities observed to obtain between particular experiences of values that they are classed together as members of the same class. Locke writes,

[f]lesh and blood values may not be as universal or objective as logical truth or schematized judgments, but they are not thereby deprived of some relative objectivity and universality of their own. The basic qualities of values…pertain to psychological categories. They are not grounded in types of realms of value, but are rooted in modes or kinds of valuing. (VI 38)

Locke is aware that it is not easy to demonstrate that the fundamental identity and unity of a value-mode depends on a feeling-quality. It may be that the position thus far articulated is merely hypothetical and speculative and requires an experimental methodology to prove it. Locke notes that the main objections to the position have been addresses by developments in the Gestalt psychology insofar as it has established an empirical basis for a comprehensive perceptual scheme functioning in recognition, comparison and choice. Further circumstantial evidence is offered for the position by the phenomenon of transvaluation (see section 2.3 below).

2.2 A Functional View of Values

On Locke's view, though the value-mode is determined immediately by the affective character of the value, this is not the final determination of the value. Even after the value-mode has been ascertained, the legitimacy of the value may still be in question, its place in the overall value scheme may be unclear, and particular aspects of the context of valuation may be uncertain. This leads Locke to conclude that the primary normative character of value norms is best sought in their functional role as stereotypes of feeling attitudes and as habitual impulses toward certain choices of actions. This would make them culturally specific, as well as temporally and geographically contingent as values can only be habituated and function with any degree of reliability in specific contexts. Moreover, as in the case of apprehending value-modes, the functionality of a given value is to be discovered experientially; rather than, postulated a priori. Values, then, would only become absolutes—should they become absolute at all—because reason and judgment secondarily re-enforce them as such. In their immediate character and quality values are affective, but they are further mediated by reason and judgment. Value predication depends on reason and judgment; but the predicates themselves are determined by the modal quality of the value. So, the judgment that an object is beautiful or ugly involves reason and judgment, but that the object is experienced as aesthetic depends on its affective apprehension; its being experienced aesthetically.

Commenting on his own preference for a functional theory of value Locke writes:

I confess at the outset to a preference for a functional theory of value, but my brief for a functional analysis of value norms is not completely parti pris, but is made rather because a functional approach, even should it lead to a non-functionalist theory of value, of necessity treats the value varieties in terms of their interrelationships, guaranteeing a comparative approach and a more realistic type of value analysis. (FVVU 81)

Moreover, a functional account of value has the theoretical advantages of being able to account for parallels between values, value interchangeability, and transvaluation. It is perhaps in taking a functional view of values and their associated imperatives where Locke's theory of value is most pragmatic. A functional view of values emphasizes the fact that values are an essential feature of our lived-experiences. At its most basic level value functionality aims to provide a way of understanding how particular values operate as coordinating mechanisms for individual and collective action. Some values have a specific social role; a societal aim or goal that they have been modified and adapted over time to help achieve or maintain. Such values are often codified in the customs and traditions of a culture and can sometimes remain ritualized long after their functional role is obsolete. The importance and usefulness of a functional view of values in Locke's social and political philosophy is further explored in section 3.2 below.

2.3 Transvaluation

Transvaluation is a central tenet of Locke's axiology. He writes:

[t]he further we investigate, the more we discover that there is no fixity of content to values, and the more we are bound, then, to infer that their identity as groups must rest on other elements. (VI 40)

The feeling-quality of a given value necessarily establishes the mode of valuation, i.e., the type of value in question (for example, aesthetic, religious, moral etc.) as well as the appropriate value-predicates. However, there is no necessary connection between a given object that serves as the content of a value and any particular emotional response to that object. One and the same object may affect the same person differently at different times, or may at the same time elicit from multiple people different emotional reactions. Transvaluation, then is most simply valuing something in a different way, which requires, at first, having an atypical emotional association with the object of value. There are multifarious potential causes of such transformations in one's affective responses to an object, and those causes can be immediate or unfold over time. “The changed feeling-attitude creates a new value” says Locke “and the type-form of the attitude brings with it its appropriate value category. These modes co-assert their own relevant norms; each sets up a categorical imperative of its own” (VI 41).

Locke treats transvaluation as inevitable; values are dependent upon social and cultural forces that are always in a state of flux and subject to myriad transformative influences at any given time, hence static values are implausible. Value transformation can take place on the individual level or on the level of widespread social or cultural values. Locke's hope is that this analysis will bring us closer to a practical understanding of value and the mechanism of valuation, which he hopes will bring us closer to understanding the grounds for both agreements among values and value conflict.

2.4 Taxonomy of Values

Locke offers a schematization of four traditional values—religious, moral, logical and aesthetic—to demonstrate how his theory classifies values into types according to their characteristic feeling-quality (see the table below) (VI 43). The schema also charts the value-predicates and the positive and negative poles associated with each value-type (type of value). Finally, the schema further divides each value according to its directionality; that is, whether the value is primarily introverted, functioning inwardly on the individual subject, or is extroverted, functioning externally in a social context.

Locke contends that his position has certain advantages over more logical theories of value. In particular, it is better able to explain certain value phenomena that are troubling for the latter type of theories. Phenomena such as transvaluation, value merging, and value conflict are able to be explained in terms of the basic doctrine that the mode of valuation is determined by the character of a subject's affective response in a value context. Locke claims that logical theories of value have historically had difficulty accounting for phenomena such as the aesthetic appraisal of a logical or mathematical proof; moral commitment to aesthetic production; or aesthetic appreciation of religious practice. In particular, logical theories have struggled to make sense of assigning predicates from one value-type to objects that are traditionally the content of a different value-type as when a proof in logic is deemed beautiful or ugly. Traditional theories treat such value predication as merely metaphorical or analogical.

Modal Quality Value Type Value Predicates Value Polarity
Positive Negative
Exaltation: (Awe Worship)
a. Introverted: Inner Ecstasy Religious Holy—Unholy Holiness Sin
b. Extroverted: Religious Zeal Good—Evil Salvation Damnation
Tension: (Conflict Choice)
a. Inner Tension of “Conscience” Ethical Good—Bad Conscience Temptation
b. Outer Tension of Duty Moral Right—Wrong Right Crime
Acceptance or Agreement: (Curiosity—Intellectual Satisfaction)
a. Inner Agreement in Thought Logical Truth Correct—Incorrect Consistency Contradiction
b. Outer Agreement in Experience Scientific Truth True—False Certainty Error
Repose and Equilibrium
a. Consummation in Contemplation Aesthetic Beautiful—Ugly Satisfaction Disgust
b. Consummation in Creativity Artistic Fine—Unsatisfactory Joy Distress

Locke explains value conflict in terms of a more fundamental psychological incompatibility. Not only does the value-feeling determine the qualitative character of a given value, it also establishes broader categories of value by grouping values according to their common affective quality. As he puts it “[c]hange the attitude, and, irrespective of content, you change the value-type; the appropriate new predicates automatically follow” (VI 44).

Value attitudes can be psychologically incompatible, and where they are Locke contends that a hierarchical ranking of values will not resolve the incompatibility. In fact, he suggests that people resolve the incommensurability of their various value attitudes by shifting from one mode of valuation to another. This is why a functional account of values that determines the various value-modes on the basis of underlying psychological states is desirable. Such a theory is better able to achieve a reflective equilibrium with our actual value practices. All values have associated with them a set of imperatives. Locke does not have a great deal to say about how imperatives are formed. Presumably, imperatives are determined, at least in part, by the qualitative character of the value in question. People begin by forming a value-attitude based on one's initial affective response to the object of valuation. As a mediating form of experience a value supplies motivational drives toward acting and refraining from acting in certain ways. Values provide normative direction not only for cognition and psychological drives, but also for action. Imperatives are partially in place as soon as the affective quality of the value is apprehended.

3. Pluralism

Locke's philosophical worldview is pervaded by a concern for diversity. Locke takes pluralism in all its form—religious, cultural, value etc.—as a basic feature of the world. His primary focus then becomes one of understanding the multiplicity of ways in which peoples meet, and providing some normative guidance concerning how best to act when they do. Values organize, coordinate, mediate and direct experience. In so doing, they serve both a valuable epistemic as well as existential function. Values direct and guide our activity, but more than that they color the nature of our encounters with other persons, and frequently function as a source of conflict between individual persons and groups of human beings. The common mistake among valuers that leads to a “totalizing” of values as “absolutes” or “ultimates” is to forget that any given value encompasses only an aspect of reality and ought not to be treated as transcendent or reducible to that reality. This is a fundamental insight of Locke's philosophy of value as it is applied to social theory. And Locke believes that if he is correct in asserting that “[a]s derivative aspects of the same basic reality, value orders cannot reasonably become competitive and rival realities” that he will have provided the necessary theoretical foundation for a more latitudinarian exchange between diverse human collectives (VI 47). Locke's presentation of his pluralist position proceeds as a response to three obstacles or barriers to pluralism: absolutism, (counter) uniformitarianism, and arbitrary dogmatism. If individual valuers or value groups are able to avoid these three pitfalls, then either may possibly develop a pluralistic value orientation.

3.1 Three Barriers to Pluralism

The first barrier to pluralism is absolutism. Values and their associated imperatives are absolute when they are thought to apply to all human beings, at all times irrespective of social or historical conditions. This is because absolutist conceptions of values are derived from, and ultimately justified by something other than the lived-experiences of human beings, be it God, or human rationality. Whereas pluralism is intended to accommodate a wide array of contending values, absolutism countenances one, and only one set of values universally applicable to all human beings. Locke claims that “absolutism has come forward again in new and formidable guise,” and he warns us to be on guard for “social and political forms of it, with their associated intellectual tyrannies of authoritarian dogmatism and uniformitarian universality” (PID 53). These newer forms of absolutism, Locke claimed, are the products of older ones. When values are held to be absolute there often results a tendency to discount the legitimacy of rival values. Pluralism avoids conceiving of values in absolutist terms. Setting various value conceptions on equal footing is the aim of Locke's pluralism.

Uniformitarianism, the second obstacle to pluralism, is the view that values ought to be uniform within a given community or group. The experiences of members of a given group are filtered through the same forms of mediation to produce value uniformity. Values are ascribed a single form for all members of a group; rather than allowing for a multiplicity of mediated experiences. Value uniformity can be achieved violently, coercively or peacefully, but in all instances it is an attempt to replace diversity with homogeneity. Locke suspects that it is the desire to defend one's own culture and to create consensus among competing value claims that is at the root of the quest for uniformity. Unfortunately, that motivation can easily lapse into an attempt to force one's own value system onto others without justification. Uniformitarianism is a refusal to accommodate the myriad value forms that are essential to pluralism.

Finally, Locke warns us to avoid the pitfalls of arbitrariness and dogmatism. Value commitments are arbitrary when one forms them—thereby rejecting viable alternatives—in the absence of any justification for choosing them over other available options. One holds her values dogmatically when she takes them to be indisputable and is closed-off to the possibility of taking a critical view of her value commitments that could possibly result in her altering or rejecting them.

3.2 Pluralism as a Functional Base

Locke describes pluralism as a functional base, one that can function as a foundation from which to achieve a rapprochement of conflicting values. Pluralism, as Locke envisions it, has the potential to create agreement among competing and conflicting values, through the recognition of common features of various values and value systems. A closer look at Locke's analysis of values; in particular, the three concepts of basic human values, basic equivalence, and functional constancy will illuminate what it means for pluralism to function in this way.

First, is the concept of basic human values, by which Locke means those values that are common to many, or all value systems; values such as belief in god, commitment to one's cultural community, respect for human life, etc. which though they may have multifarious manifestations, are in a more general way common to most, if not all groups. Of course, value communities differ, and no two value communities will be exactly alike, but there does exist substantial overlap of a subset of values across values communities. Basic human values then, are basic and human in virtue of their common expression in a plurality of value contexts and their pertaining to the lives of human beings, and not as a matter of their universal applicability across all of humanity.

The next two concepts—basic equivalence and functional constancy—are perhaps best understood as two sides of a distinction between formal and functional equivalence. Basic equivalence refers to a similarity of form and functional constancy refers to a similarity in function. Basic equivalence is a formal resemblance owing to a corresponding value-mode. It is a similarity in the type of value, or better, being particular values of the same type. This notion rests on drawing a distinction between the object of valuation and the way the object is valued. The object may differ where the value mode does not. As a consequence a single object can be valued multiple ways, and many different objects can be valued in the same way. Take for example the institution of marriage as the object of valuation. Marriage is valuable in least two senses, first, it may be valued as the religious union of a man and a woman, and secondly, the marriage ceremony itself could be valued as a ritualized aesthetic experience. In both cases one and the same phenomenon is the content of two different value modes. In the first instance, marriage is valued religiously; the characteristic quality of the value, its form, is spiritual. In the second instance, marriage could be valued because of the elegant décor, grandiose ceremony, and beautiful arrangements that characterize the event. The example goes to illustrate the fact that different ways of valuing can be applied to the same object by the same person or by different people. Valuation works the other way as well, that is, different objects can be valued the same way. As for example, a marriage, a baptism, or a christening can all be valued religiously or aesthetically. One can recognize a similarity in the form of competing values even though their objects may differ, or a difference in form where the object stays the same. Basic equivalence then speaks to an identity of form not of content. It is a conceptual tool that enables persons to recognize that their respective value expressions are species of the same genus. Locke speaks of the objective comparison of basic human values which leads one to think that his claim is that different groups may regard different sets of values as basic to human beings though these may not be identical, but rather, formally equivalent values.

The other side of the formal/functional equivalence distinction is the notion of functional constancy. By functional constancy is meant the ability of basic equivalent values to operate as stable features of value processes and activity within various value communities. Locke envisions that what will be found beneath potentially vast differences in content, and beyond a similarity of form, is a comparable utility of various values across contexts. Every value has an attendant function; a role that it plays within a given value community. Values that differ either in form or in content may still be equivalent as regards their function. These functional constants are discovered through comparison of fundamental values found across value groups.

Thus functional equivalence provides a constancy of two sorts: first, the function is constant within a given value community insofar as it plays the same role for different members of the same value group, and second, the function can be a common feature across value groups. Think here again of the example of marriage. Admittedly, there is a wide variety of particular manifestations of such a value, and there can be differences in the form as well as the content of such values. But it is still the case that such variation results in a similar function within a value community. Children are reared, networks of support are maintained, property is held in common and bequeathed to successive generations etc. and these social roles are served by a myriad of expressions of familial ties in the community. Moreover, family values function in this way across cultures. To be sure, there may not be an exact equivalence of function across value communities, or even within them for that matter, but to a large extent this equivalence of function is there to be observed. It may be the case that there exist social functions for a given value in one context that are absent in another: if so, there is no equivalence to be made. All values have a function, but as there is no necessary connection between a given value and a particular function, it does not follow from this that every value function can be found in every culture.

4. Relativism

Relativism, for Locke, begins as a systematic approach to the recognition of the sorts of value equivalence discussed earlier, and is then able to militate against the pernicious forms of valuing that often turn cultural exchanges into intractable problems. The view is termed relativist because it makes a comprehensive and accurate understanding of the values of a given culture dependent—at least in part—on that culture being viewed in relation to other cultures. Moreover, Locke claims that cultural relativism can serve as “a scientifically impartial interpreter of human values, and sometimes even as a referee and mediator among conflicting values” (CRIP 70).

4.1 The Principle of Cultural Equivalence

Relativism, on Locke's view, is not a negative skeptical position that is predicated upon the belief that one is unable to make a satisfactory determination about the relative worth of value communities. Instead, it is a positive and affirmative position concerning the relative worth of distinct value traditions and cultures. Locke formulates his relativism in terms of the three principles of cultural equivalence, cultural reciprocity, and cultural convertibility. He claims that the three principles are derivable from this larger relativist outlook and will enable “a more objective and scientific understanding of human cultures and…more reasonable control of their interrelationships” (CRIP 73).

The first of the three principles is:

The principle of cultural equivalence, under which we would more wisely press the search for functional similarity in our analyses and comparisons of human cultures; thus offsetting our traditional and excessive emphasis upon cultural differences. Such functional equivalences, which we might term ‘culture-cognates’ or ‘culture-correlates,’ discovered underneath deceptive but superficial institutional divergence, would provide objective but soundly neutral common denominators for intercultural understanding and cooperation. (CRIP 73)

The effect of the first principle is to lay bare the fact that the seemingly vast differences between cultures is more a matter of our selective preferences; that is, the habits of mind we have cultivated for being more keenly attuned to difference rather than similarity. The first stage of relativism, then, is to reorient our focus in favor of the similarity to be found across value communities. Cultural cognates and correlates are objective because they are discovered to be real features of multiple value systems. They are in an important sense “there” to be discovered both by internal and external observers of the value group. The reason that these value cognates count as neutral is that they do not, in virtue of their being objective, privilege any value-type or value-content over any other. At this stage they are taken as mere facts of the matter about the values that exist within communities.

4.2 The Principle of Cultural Reciprocity

The second principle of cultural relativism is:

The principle of cultural reciprocity, which, by a general recognition of the reciprocal character of all contacts between cultures and of the fact that all modern cultures are highly composite ones, would invalidate the lump estimating of cultures in terms of generalized, en bloc assumptions of superiority and inferiority, substituting scientific, point-by-point comparisons with their correspondingly limited, specific, and objectively verifiable superiorities or inferiorities. (CRIP 73)

This aspect of Locke's relativism requires a “beneficent neutrality between divergent positions” (CRIP 70–71). It begins by fostering a disposition toward cultural toleration in the hope that such toleration will lead to mutual respect, which would in turn serve as a foundation upon which to base reciprocal exchanges between cultures. In the most likely case, these initial exchanges will be centered around specific values that form narrowly defined communities of agreement. In the end, if cultural relativism is able to foster reciprocity between value communities to a sufficient degree, then cultural relativism may well establish a foundation of mutual understanding and appreciation to support active cooperation between value groups. The principle of cultural reciprocity restrains the inferences that we are able to make as a result of the principal of cultural equivalence in at least two ways: first, its emphasis on point-by-point comparisons limits the scope of the value cognates that are discovered, and second, it issues an injunction against identifying or connecting specific values with specific cultures or value communities. Relativism is to borrow from an idealized model of scientific practice; a point of view that does not prejudge the results of a given observation before it is carried out. Moreover, it points out that the discovery of cognates and correlates is not likely to be wholesale, but instead, specific and contextualized.

4.3 The Principle of Cultural Convertibility

Finally, we have the principle of cultural convertibility:

The principle of limited cultural convertibility, that, since culture elements, though widely interchangeable, are so separable, the institutional forms from their values and the values from their institutional forms, the organic selectivity and assimilative capacity of a borrowing culture becomes a limiting criterion for cultural exchange. Conversely, pressure acculturation and the mass transplanting of culture, the stock procedure of groups with traditions of culture ‘superiority’ and dominance, are counterindicated as against both the interests of cultural efficiency and the natural trends of culture selectivity. (CRIP 73)

All value-types are independent of any given value-content; any given value-type can be joined with any value-content. This fact of valuation is what grounds cross-cultural transformation. The extent to which cultures are modified by their interactions with other cultures, is in part a function of how stringently the cultures in question associate their own value-forms with specific value-content. At a higher level, Locke indicates that associations might even be made between a value and its institutional form, by which he seems to mean the manner in which the value is organized into the social structure of a value community. If specific values are correlated with particular institutional forms, a necessary connection may be assumed to exist between them where it does not.

5. Aesthetics

Locke is perhaps best known for his work in aesthetics, in particular, his role as both an intellectual purveyor of Negro art and literary critic. Locke managed to position himself at the forefront of one of the most significant and important artistic rebirths in American history. His seminal work, The New Negro, was ground-breaking in its presentation of Negro art as thoroughly self-expressive of the individual artist, and not as merely representative of aesthetic, cultural and social possibilities. Locke's publication of The New Negro was in many ways in direct defiance and contradiction of the black intellectual elite of his day, most notably W. E. B. Du Bois, as well as being the advance guard of the aesthetic sentiments of the average Negro of his day. There is evidence of his philosophical views, especially in the areas of axiology, culture, race and ethnicity throughout his writings on aesthetics. Major themes in Locke's aesthetics include: universal human appeal and the relationship of universal and particular; the transition from folk art to high art; the centrality of individual expressivity; and cross-cultural communicability through the aesthetic.

5.1 The New Negro

Prior to the period of individual expression characteristic of the Harlem Renaissance, Negro art in Locke's estimation had as its primary function representation of a Negro type that was socially acceptable and laudably ideal. The aim of much Negro art was to advance presentations of the Negro as civilized, cultured, and capable of making a worthwhile contribution to American society, or to portray blacks in America as a progressive people, needing only to be liberated from slavery or Jim Crow segregation to realize their true potential. In discharging this representative function, Negro art was consumed with the promulgation of stereotypes and counter-stereotypes. It had constantly to react against negative portrayals and stifling social pressures; to attempt to make out of Negro life and experience something worthy of respect, a fitting object of honor and emulation. As Locke put it,

for generations in the mind of America, the Negro has been more of a formula than a human being—a something to be argued about, condemned or defended, to be ‘kept down,’ or ‘in his place,’ or ‘helped up,’ to be worried with or worried over, harassed or patronized, a social bogey or a social burden. (NN 3–4)

The primary consequence of this social environment on black aesthetics in the United States according to Locke was its Ghettoization. In dealing with this specialized subject matter of social uplift Negro aesthetics segregates itself from the broader American social context and fails to achieve universal human appeal. “The thinking Negro,” by whom Locke seems to have Du Bois primarily in mind, “has been induced to share this same general attitude, to focus his attention on controversial issues, to see himself in the distorted perspective of a social problem” (NN 3–4).

Art at its best on Locke's view is not propaganda, and though there may be some initial phase in which art is forced to perform such a function that is not the ultimate goal. “Until recently,” Locke comments “lacking self-understanding, we have been almost as much of a problem to ourselves as we still are to others.” Yet as “the thinking few know” as that self-understanding is achieved and worked into artistic expression the result is “that in the reaction the vital inner grip of prejudice has been broken” (NN 4). This is the first significant change in the social environment that produces the “New Negro”; namely, the attitude of young Negro artist to racial segregation.

Another change in American society that had a profound impact on the aesthetic advancement of African-Americans at the time of Locke's publication of The New Negro was the Great Migration. One major consequence of “that shifting of the Negro population” was that it “made the Negro problem no longer exclusively or even predominantly Southern” (NN 5). Locke did not however regard the cause of the great migration as chiefly racial; that is, escape from the segregation of the South was not the major motivation behind the mass African-American exodus from the South to the North and Mid-West. Instead,

The tide of Negro migration, northward and city-ward, is not to be fully explained as a blind flood started by the demands of war industry coupled with the shutting off of foreign migration, or by the pressure of poor crops coupled with increased social terrorism in certain sections of the South and Southwest…The wash and rush of this human tide on the beach line of the northern city centers is to be explained primarily in terms of a new vision of opportunity, of social and economic freedom, of a spirit to seize, even in the face of an extortionate and heavy toll, a chance for the improvement of conditions. (NN 6)

The Great Migration brought with it a need for a plurality of social adjustments as the droves of African-Americans flooded into Northern cities. Principal among this was the realization that the Negro was

rapidly in process of class differentiation, [and] if it ever was warrantable to regard and treat the Negro en masse it is becoming with every day less possible, more unjust and more ridiculous. (NN 5–6)

Negro life in America according to Locke is comprised of many diverse elements. The plurality of groups that congregated in places like Detroit, Chicago, Philadelphia and Harlem all with varying motivations and group specific aims constituted some of the largest concentrations of diverse segments of the Negro population. These circumstances coupled with the oppressive effects of prejudice forced myriad sectors of the African-American population to discover and interact with one another. Prior to that Locke claims that

it must be admitted that the American Negroes have been a race more in name than in fact, or to be exact, more in sentiment than in experience. The chief bond between them has been that of a common condition rather than a common consciousness; a problem in common rather than a life in common. (NN 6–7)

Locke explains that in part the artistic endeavors of the Negro have failed to achieve universal resonance because the Negro himself has been so poorly understood. He readily admits that “[i]t does not follow that if the Negro were better known, he would be better liked or better treated[,]” and goes on to note that despite this fact “mutual understanding is basic for any subsequent cooperation and adjustment” predicated upon, or in pursuit of an understanding of the universality of Negro experiences as expressed in art. Moreover,

effort towards this will at least have the effect of remedying in large part what has been the most unsatisfactory feature of our present stage of race relations in America, namely the fact that the more intelligent and representative elements of the two race groups have at so many points got quite out of vital touch with one another (NN 8–9)

And in addressing that crucial fact, such efforts may go a long way towards facilitating an appreciation of Negro art as expressive both of the peculiar racial, ethnic, and cultural experiences of African-Americans, and as expressive of ubiquitous aspects of human experience. It is a mere “fiction…that the life of the races is separate,” and a dangerously divisive one at that, “[t]he fact is that they have touched too closely at the unfavorable and too lightly at the favorable levels” (NN 9). Hence, it is not simply a failure of contact, but a failure of the right sort of contact that accounts for the under appreciation of the aesthetic life of black peoples.

For his part, Locke argues, the “New Negro” in recognizing “the necessity for fuller, truer self-expression,…[and] the realization of the unwisdom of allowing discrimination to segregate him mentally, and a counter attitude to cramp and fetter his own living” has played a vital role in demolishing “the ‘spite-wall’ that the intellectuals built over the ‘color-line[.]’” (NN, 9–10). Life for the Negro in the early 1920's was steadily progressing toward the ideals of American democracy. The Negro of the time was also characterized by a new vein; one around which there was a growing consensus primarily of feeling and attitude; rather than opinion or program. As Locke has it:

Up to the present one may adequately describe the Negro's ‘inner objectives’ as an attempt to repair a damaged group psychology and reshape a warped social perspective. Their realization has acquired a new mentality for the American Negro. And as it matures we begin to see its effects; at first, negative, iconoclastic, and then positive and constructive. In this new group psychology we note the lapse of sentimental appeal, then the development of a more positive self-respect and self-reliance; the repudiation of social dependence, and then the gradual recovery from hyper-sensitiveness and ‘touchy’ nerves, the repudiation of the double standard of judgment with its special philanthropic allowances and in the sturdier desire for objective and scientific appraisal; and finally the rise from social disillusionment to race pride, from the sense of social debt to the responsibilities of social contribution, and offsetting the necessary working commonsense acceptance of restricted conditions, the belief in ultimate esteem and recognition. Therefore, the Negro today wishes to be known for what he is, even in his faults and shortcomings, and scorns a craven and precarious survival at the price of seeming to be what he is not (NN 11).

Locke ends his exposition of what is characteristic of the New Negro with the observation that the reception of black aesthetic products is an experiment in democracy. As African-American art resists ghettoization and increasingly makes its presence felt in the American artistic mainstream it seeks to establish itself as a subset of American art; rather than, the totality of Negro American art. And since, according to Locke,

[d]emocracy itself is obstructed and stagnated to the extent that any of its channels are closed…the choice is not between one way for the Negro and another way for the rest, but between American institutions frustrated on the one hand and American ideals progressively fulfilled and realized on the other. (NN 12)

The North American Negro artist in being ‘new’ is a living instantiation of the fact that no culture, people, race, or society is a static one. Such entities are always in process of transformation, and always a composite of myriad cultural, ethnic, racial, and social influences. The emergence of the new is at once a presentation of what has been and an indication of what the future may hold. This is a deeply pragmatic current running through Locke's aesthetic philosophy. Locke is later critical of the Harlem Renaissance because it failed to sustain a cyclical process of rebirth. In the years following the height of the Harlem Renaissance he remarked later that that a new Negro must be born every decade or two.

5.2 The Young Negro

Locke explains that the aesthetic renaissance that took place in Harlem and elsewhere was primarily a movement of young artists. The youth, Locke claims, speak in distinctive overtones, and “out of a unique experience and with particular representativeness” (NN 47). The experiences of young American Negroes is uniquely representative because

[a]ll classes of people under social pressure are permeated with a common experience; they are emotionally welded as others cannot be. With them, even ordinary living has epic depth and lyric intensity, and this, their material handicap, is their spiritual advantage. (NN 47)

Here we find an interesting problem in Lockean exegesis: How is it that the aesthetic contribution is at once characterized by a disavowal of representativeness, while at the same time being uniquely representative? Locke goes on to note that

[r]acial expression as a conscious motive, it is true, is fading out of our latest art, but just as surely the age of truer, finer group expression is coming in—for race expression does not need to be deliberate to be vital. Indeed, at its best it never is. (NN 47)

Locke's resolution of the seeming paradox comes by way of recognizing that “[o]ur poets have now stopped speaking for the Negro[;]” the sort of representativeness characteristic of past aesthetic pursuits and instead now “speak as Negroes” (NN 48). The main difference being that “[w]here formally they spoke to others and tried to interpret,” the experiences of African-Americans for white or other nonblack audiences “they now speak to their own and try to express.” “They have” he notes “stopped posing, being nearer the attainment of poise” (NN 48). With this change in the mind of the Negro artist the aim of art is no longer the presentation of an ideal type, or an effective counter-stereotype; instead, it is the expression of the universal truth contained in the particularity of Negro experiences.

This is a major theme that runs throughout all of Locke's aesthetic philosophy; the idea that within a particular manifestation of human experience can be found something of universal human significance. Indeed, this is the quintessential marker of “high art” or “classical art”. In the case of the young Negro artist Locke claims “[r]ace for them is but an idiom of experience, a sort of added enriching adventure and discipline, giving subtler overtones to life, making it more beautiful and interesting, even if more poignantly so. When viewed from this more objective attitude and “so experienced, it affords a deepening rather than narrowing of social vision” (NN 48).

The youth “constitute a new generation, not because of years only, but because of the new aesthetic and a new philosophy of life” (NN 49). Locke explicates this new aesthetic philosophy by way of comparison to “[t]he elder generation of Negro writers” who were resigned to expressing themselves in “cautious moralism and guarded idealizations” (NN 49). This generation of artists, with

the repercussions of prejudice…heavy on its heart…felt art must fight social battles and compensate social wrongs; “Be representative”: put the better foot foremost, was the underlying mood. (NN 50)

This hampered both the individual expressivity of the older generation of artists as well as their ability to communicate cross culturally the truth of black experiences. The artist was not free to speak his heart or mind, but had to remain cognizant of the way he presented the Negro yet again. With the youth of the Harlem Renaissance there came a “newer motive,” for the younger generation of American Negro artists the aim “in being racial is to be so purely for the sake of art.” (NN 51) The new artist does not take folksy racial types to be emblematic of anything but the individual artist. Locke sees this manifested in the artist's ability to make of “the racial substance something technically distinctive,” a method of giving expression to a specific type of experience that allows for full expression of that experience across cultural, racial, or ethnic boundaries. In this way techniques that exist as “an idiom of style may become a contribution to general resources of art”; (NN 51) available in the end, not only to those who created, cultivated and refined them, but to any artist who wished to deal with that particular idiom.

5.3 The Negro Spirituals

In Locke's estimation, the spirituals are the quintessential Negro contribution to American art and culture; manifesting as they do so much, not only about the North American Negro and his aesthetic and cultural heritage and evolution, but also in standing as a paragon of processes of aesthetic transition and development.

The spirituals are really the most characteristic product of the race genius as yet in America. But the very elements which make them uniquely expressive of the Negro make them at the same time deeply representative of the soil that produced them. Thus, as unique spiritual products of American life, they become nationally as well as racially characteristic. It may not be readily conceded now that the song of the Negro is America's folksong; but if the spirituals are what we think them to be, a classical folk expression, then this is their ultimate destiny. Already they give evidence of this classic quality. Through their immediate and compelling universality of appeal, through their untarnishable beauty, they seem assured of the immortality of those great folk expressions that survive not so much through being typical of a group or representative of a period as by virtue of being fundamentally and everlastingly human. (NN 199)

The best evidence, Locke seems to think, in support of the spirituals' claim to universality is that they have withstood the test of time. As an art form they have outlived not only the generations that produced them but the peculiar social environment that enlivened them. Beyond this the spirituals have survived

the contempt of the slave owners, the conventionalizations of formal religion, the repressions of Puritanism, the corruptions of sentimental balladry, and the neglect and disdain of second-generation respectability. (NN 199)

In short, they have successfully made the transition from folk art to formal music.

The spirituals at once exemplify all of the three major themes of Locke's aesthetic philosophy: they are expressive of the individuality of a given artist—think of the distinctiveness of Paul Robeson's baritone renderings of “Swing Low, Sweet Chariot”; they have universal human appeal; and they epitomize the process of transition from a folk art to high or classical art. “In its disingenuous simplicity, folk art is always despised and rejected at first; but generations after, it flowers again and transcends the level of its origin” (NN 199).

Negro folk music or spirituals contain the raw material for myriad new musical developments. That material was at the time of the publication of The New Negro to Locke's mind underdeveloped, but as Negro artists grew in sophistication and craft Locke saw the potential for them to complete the conversion of so fundamentally American and pedestrian an art form into an avenue for insight into some of the most deeply emotional aspects of humanity.

Locke credits Du Bois with being among the first to give the spirituals “a serious and proper social interpretation,” with his chapter in The Souls of Black Folks on the Sorrow Songs. “But underneath the broken words, childish imagery, peasant simplicity, lies” Locke notes

as Dr. Du Bois pointed out, and epic intensity and a tragic profundity of emotional experience, for which the only historical analogy is the spiritual experience of the Jews and the only analogue, the Psalms. (NN 200)

But whatever they may lack in terms of poetic form, they more than compensate for in their ability to embody the religious mood. This North American Negro folk form is replete with the spirit of exaltation. The spirituals are remarkable for their ability to transcend the profound tragedy that gives birth to them and offer up a model of enduring hopefulness in this world or the next. “Their words are colloquial,” Locke notes, being the products of unlettered folk “but their mood is epic” giving emotive expression to experiences that exemplify the possibilities of humanity at its best (NN 201). The spirituals “are primitive, but their emotional artistry is perfect” (NN 201).

Historically, Negro colleges were the mechanism through which the spirituals were popularized. The travelling choirs of Negro institutions such as Hampton University, Wilberforce University, Fisk University and Tuskegee University performed the spirituals across the country as a means of raising funds for their respective institutions, all the while bringing to black and white audiences in the United States knowledge and appreciation of this indigenous musical form. Many of these university choirs also recorded compilations of Negro spirituals and published them. It was thus, as Locke has it, that the spirituals were able to avoid simply falling out of fashion and failing to survive “that critical period of disfavor in which any folk product is likely to be snuffed out by the false pride of the second-generation” (NN 202). This, by Locke's lights, is not an uncommon situation for folk arts to face, finding it necessary as they often do to resist being disavowed by subsequent generations wishing to distance themselves from the supposedly deficient quality of the folk expression.

Emotions and attitudes form the very foundation of Locke's philosophy of value: undoubtedly, one reason that Locke was so enamored with the spirituals was that as he understood them their primary artistic virtue was their deeply emotive character. “Emotionally,” he points out, “these songs are far from simple” (NN 205). There is to be found in the spiritual folk music of the American Negro the entire range of human moods and emotions, and within a given spiritual there can be a drastic change in mood from the deepest sorrow to glorious praise, as each and every song is infused with religious sentiment. Surprisingly, when it comes to the problem of classification of the spirituals, Locke does not insist upon the primary mode of classification being the feeling-quality of the song as his value theory might suggest. In fact, Locke argues that

[i]nteresting and intriguing as was Dr. Du Bois's analysis of their emotional themes, modern interpretation must break with that mode of analysis, and relate these songs to the folk activity that they motivated, classifying them by their respective song-types. (NN 205)

In the case of the spirituals Locke is in favor of a different method of classification because contemporary interpreters of the Negro's music tend to mischaracterize, or characterize in a way that is not true to the folk that produced it, the music of the Negro. Locke laments the fact that “at present many a half secularized ballad is mistaken for a ‘spiritual,’ and many a camp-meeting shout for a folk hymn” (NN 205). He believed the folk music of the Negro is best categorized according to the sort of activity they inspired. “From this point of view” Locke claims

we have essentially four classes, the almost ritualistic prayer songs for pure spirituals, the freer and more unrestrained evangelical shouts or Meeting songs, the folk ballad so overlaid with the tradition of the spirituals proper that the distinctive type quality has almost been unnoticed until late, and the work and labor songs of strictly secular character. (NN 205)

However, discriminating Negro folk music into types on the basis of the folk activity that underlies them is not necessarily to exclude the emotive content of the song. In fact, it seems that what is really being discriminated is the active expression of the underlying emotional content, i.e., the activity that is most commonly associated with a particular emotion or mood. And here we see perhaps the most direct effect that Locke's axiology has on his assessment of spirituals discriminating them as he does into types in terms of their feeling-quality, but also linking each form with a set of imperatives in this case, a practical imperative understood by the type of activity that each song is used to motivate.

Locke sees as a major problem with the scholarship on Negro folk music in his day the tendency to overemphasize one of the various distinctive elements of the music over the others. The result was a jaundiced view of Negro music. “Strain out and emphasize the melodic element” Locke informs

and you get only the sentimental ballad; emphasize the harmonic idiom, and you get a cloying sentimental glee; overemphasize the rhythmic idiom and instantly you secularize the product into syncopated dance elements. (NN 206)

5.4 Who, and What, is “Negro”?

Lurking in the background of all of this talk of the “New Negro” is the assumption that there is something distinctively Negro about at least some American art. As to what that is, or could be, answers are sometimes extremely hard to come by. But, Locke warns

[s]ooner or later the critic must face the basic issues involved in his use of risky and perhaps untenable terms like ‘Negro art’ and ‘Negro literature’ and answer the much-evaded question unequivocally,—who and what is Negro? (WWN 209)

Beyond this Locke thinks it a meaningful query to ask whether the racial concept has any place in art at all. Perhaps it would be better to understand art as a cultural or social mode of production that cuts across racial and ethnic divisions.

5.4.1 Who is Negro?

In answering the question “Who is Negro?” Locke begins by exposing a common misguided assumption in such queries:

[t]he fallacy of the ‘new’ as of the ‘older’ thinking is that there is a type Negro who, either qualitatively or quantitatively, is the type symbol of the entire group. (WWN 210)

Locke sees this as the unfortunate consequence of the past need to proffer counter-stereotypes to combat demeaning stereotypes of Negro persons. Counter-stereotypes may well contain some element of truth, but they fail to convey the whole truth about as diverse a population of human beings as Negroes in the United States, let alone the Americas or Negroes the World over. There is no distinctive singular Negro type. The answer then to the question posed “who is Negro?” is no Negro in particular. The Negro is a dynamic and multifaceted population admitting of myriad cultural and social forms characterized as those are by variegated linguistic, religious and artistic elements. This is important for Locke to note as the Negro of his day was thought to be classless, undifferentiated, and ethnically homogeneous. In fact, Locke himself thought it possible (and actual) for human beings biologically similar in the way that American race thinking presupposes to be members of different races. A full and accurate artistic portrayal of who is Negro would, Locke argued, have to picture the many diverse Negro strands in their own right, weaving together from these diverse threads a multifaceted presentation of Negro experiences.

5.4.2 What is Negro?

“Turning to the other basic question,—what is Negro,” Locke begins by narrowing the question to “what makes a work of art Negro, if indeed any such nomenclature is proper,—its authorship, its theme or its idiom?” (WWN 211). In other words, what gives a particular work of art its distinctive, if any, racial character: the racial identity of its author, its treatment of themes characteristic of a particular racial experience in a particular place, or its use of styles and modes of expression peculiar to a given people? Of these three candidates for the foundation of Negro art Locke claims each has had its day depending on the social environment that was prevalent at the time. Locke dismisses nearly out of hand the first option remarking that many a Negro artist has produced the most amateurish works of art due primarily to their poor mastery of Negro idioms, and inadequate treatment of Negro themes. What is more, some white (or at least non-Negro) artist have been quite adept in either their use of characteristically Negro styles, or their dealings with Negro motifs. Of course, it stands to reason that artist steeped in the cultural, ethnic and racial environments that give rise to these idioms and themes are most likely to master their use and expression, and that persons who do so are most likely to be members of these communities, having the same racial, ethnic or cultural identities as other members. However, such communal membership is not a necessary condition for the work of a particular artist to count amongst the works that comprise a racially distinctive body of art such as might be called “Negro art.”

6. Philosophy of Race

Locke understood race as primarily a product of social culture. Locke denies as do nearly all contemporary race theorists that races are biologically distinct categories of human beings. Locke maintained that culture and race were distinct, but often overlapping categories. There is no tight causal or otherwise necessary connection between race and culture. The two are mutually exclusive even though they do sometimes vary together or otherwise correspond. Race, for Locke, is not determinative of culture or civilization. Locke's position on race does not deny, as some of his contemporaries concerned with the notion of race and culture did, that there ever is a significant connection between racial and cultural factors, nor does it deny that “race stands for significant social characters and culture-traits or represents in given historical contexts characteristic differentiations of culture-type” (CRASC 188). This is primarily a cautionary observation on Locke's part seeing as how

[i]t is too early to assume that there is no significant relationship between race and culture because of the manifestly false and arbitrary linkage which has previously been asserted. (CRASC 189)

Locke has some hesitation about the prudence and possibility of completely eradicating racial categories. He states,

[i]n some revised and reconstructed form, we may anticipate the continued even if restricted use of these terms as more or less necessary and basic concepts that cannot be eliminated altogether, but that must nevertheless be so safe-guarded in this continued use as not to give further currency to the invalidated assumption concerning them. (CRASC 189)

Locke attributes the original idea that race is a primary determining factor in culture to the work of Arthur de Gobineau, though he thinks the main scientific justification for the view has been offered by those who seek to interpret culture in evolutionary terms such as the social evolutionism of Herbert Spencer. Positing a fixed link between race and culture was useful for such theorists in developing a step-by-step account of the development of cultures. But even in Locke's day, the supposed scientific foundations of such theoretical positions faced challenges. In light of that Locke thinks it understandable for some to want to correct this misinterpretation of the facts by insisting that there is no connection at all between race and culture. We see here again perhaps some of the influence that pragmatist thinkers, in this case Dewey, may have had on Locke, as Dewey was apt to point out on numerous occasions the shortcomings of Spencer's social Darwinism, and chiefly its attempt to offer a universal account of all aspects of human development. Locke worried that extreme cultural relativism

leaves an open question as to the association of certain ethnic groups with definite culture traits and culture types under circumstances where there is evidently a greater persistence of certain strains and characteristics in their culture than of other factors.

It is “[t]he stability of such factors and their resistance to direct historical modification” Locke thought, which

marks out the province of that aspect of the problem of race which is distinctly ethnological and which the revised notion of ethnic race must cover. (CRASC 190)

6.1 Theoretical and Scientific Conceptions of Race

Locke postulates three conceptions of race: theoretical or scientific, political, and social or cultural. Scientific conceptions posit race as natural biological kinds. The existence of race and racial differentiation are explained in terms of biological or ethnological features of human populations. Scientific theories frequently assert a natural biological hierarchy between races and aim to explain divergent cultural characteristics of groups though biological factors. Locke argues that genetic inheritance varies both within and between human populations and cannot be the basis for the sociological concept of race. The factors that create genetic subdivisions of the human species such as physical and social reproductive isolation produce various consequences (Locke, 1989, 190 – 92 see also Locke, 1992, 4–6) that may not vary conterminously with the group’s social history. Genetic subdivisions produce population variances that may not track the social distinctions that a given society deems salient in terms of group identity.

Locke argues that biological race is an ethnic fiction. (Locke, 1992, 11 – 12). Putative biological races do not necessarily correspond with the racialized social identities operative in a given society. One way race can be an ethnic fiction is when non-biologically determined ethnic or cultural groups are presumed to be real biological populations, when in fact they are not. Locke does not seem to think that this fictitious conception of race undermines the social reality of the phenomenon. On Locke’s view race amounts to something significant even if many common conceptions of it are mistaken. Racialized populations can be comprised from various genetic, cultural and ethnic intermixtures throughout its history. Isolating any one of the plurality of factors around which a population is racialized as the single factor constituting the race can cause a significant divergence between one’s conception of racial groups and any underlying reality. Such divergence can inform a whole host of mistaken beliefs and misguided racial practices. Locke writes: “[a]s I pointed out, these groups, from the point of view of anthropology, are ethnic fictions. This does not mean that they do not exist, but it can be shown [that these groups do] not have as [permanent] designations those very factors upon which they pride themselves. (Locke, 1992, 11)

Locke’s understanding of race is influenced by the ethnology of his time. The notion that racial types are not permanent he derives from Frantz Boas. (Locke, 1992, 75–76) Locke’s belief that race and culture vary independently of each and are thus not causally linked stems from the work of R. H. Lowie. (Locke, 1989, 189–90) Locke agreed with Sapir that unique cultural or ethnic traits are best explained historically; rather than, biologically or psychologically. (Locke, 1989, 190) His reading of Flinders-Petrie’s account of assimilative processes initially informed his view of social race, and racial differentiation, though these are latter most influenced by his concept of cultural pluralism. (Locke, 1989, 191–92) Finally, he derives the view that race practices are deeply rooted in imperialism from Lord Cromer. (Locke, 1992, 64)

6.2 Political Conceptions of Race

Political conceptions of race reject two basic assumptions of scientific theories, they reject that races are distinct biologically determined populations, and secondarily reject that biological differences of race account for cultural variation, or establish the relative inferiority or superiority of putative race groups. Political conceptions of race contend that racism is constitutive of races. Racial groups result from political, economic, and social mechanisms that create relative group advantage or disadvantage. Racial differentiation and hierarchy are the consequences of group exercise of political power.

Political race, for Locke, is merely favorable or unfavorable social inheritance masquerading as genetic ethnic inheritance. Racial differences and inequalities are caused by these factors, and so, will not account for the duration or amelioration of inequalities and differentiations. The permanence of racial groups, if it is to be promoted, must be based on something other than metaphysical realist notions of race. Conversely, if racial inequalities are to be eradicated, that too will likely require attention to, and control of, factors and elements of putatively racial groups other than their supposed biological or anthropological similarity.

Characteristically racial modes of living are wrongly regarded as biologically, rather than, socially inherited. This social inheritance can be either favorable or unfavorable. Locke observes that cultures are often racially diverse. Multiple races may share some larger cultural elements. (Locke, 1989, 193–94) Races are regarded as “concrete culture-types,” according to Locke, which are “composite racially speaking, and have only an artificial ethnic unity, of historical derivation and manufacture.” (Locke, 1989, 194) Race is a learned epistemic mode of being. A sense of race membership is enculturated and socialized, and once acquired, the race sense partly conditions how one perceives and understands the world.

6.3 Social or Cultural Conceptions of Race

Locke’s social conception of race is a proto-social constructionist account of race. Race, for him, is a cultural-historical phenomenon and not a natural kind distinction. Race, for Locke, is culture; or conversely, culture is race. The cultural conception views race as a learned socially inherited phenomenon. Culturally conceived, a race is a transactionally constituted, and inherently transformational, subcultural variant, not fixed by biological determinants. Race for Locke is the characteristic differentiation of culture-type perpetuated through social heredity. Locke states that “[r]ace in the vital and basic sense is simply and primarily the culture-heredity, and that in its blendings and differentiations is properly analyzed on the basis of conformity to or variance from culture-type.” (Locke, 1989, 192) Locke’s view of social race implies that there are further distinctions to make within current racial categories. Many groups commonly regarded as one race constitute several different races.

Locke held that race was in point of fact a social and cultural category rather than a biological one. For this reason he developed the notion of ethnic race or culture group. By ethnic race, I take Locke to mean a peculiar set of psychological and affective responsive dispositions, expressed or manifested as cultural traits, socially inherited and able to be attributed through historical contextualization to a specifiable group of people. The concept of ethnic race is a way of preserving the demonstrated distinctiveness of various groupings of human beings in terms of characteristic traits, lifestyles, forms of expression; without resulting to the scientifically invalidated notion of biological race. “Race,” Locke argues “would have been regarded as primarily a matter of social [as opposed to biological] heredity,” if only the science of his day had reached a more tenable understanding of the relationship of race to culture which would likely have resulted from focusing more on the ethnic; rather than, anthropological factors. The distinctiveness of a given race would be understood as the result of “the selective psychological “set” of established cultural reactions” (CRASC 191).

The notion of ethnic race is better able to capture the myriad differences between culture groups in terms of the actual social, cultural and historical conditions that give rise to such variation, and without the scientifically indefensible reliance on biological factors. On this view, race is no longer thought to be the progenitor of culture; instead race is understood to be a cultural product. Locke held that the more objective analysis of culture he advocated would likely result in the development over time of distinctive culture-types for which it may prove possible to work out some principle of development or evolution. This he thought might eventually make it possible to develop “a standard of value for relative culture grading” (CRASC 194).

Nearly every culture is highly composite; consisting as most due in the union of various social and historical influences; moreover, every ethnic group in the unique outcome of a specific social history. A more scientific understanding of man replaces the abstract artifice of biological race, and requires that we deal with concrete culture-types which are frequently complex amalgamations of supposed races united principally by entrenchment of customary reactions, standardized practices, traditional forms of expression and interaction, in sum, the specific history of a given people in a particular place. It is noteworthy and perhaps illuminating of Locke's conception of ethnic or social race that the groupings of human persons formerly thought to constitute “races” in the biological sense such as “Negro,” “Caucasian,” or “Asian” are in fact each composed of several different social or ethnic races. On Locke's view there are many so-called “Negro,” “Caucasian,” or “Asian” races. This revised understanding of culture constitutes in Locke's estimation a fundamental paradigm shift in the study of human cultures ”[s]o considerable…[in] emphasis and meaning that at times it does seem that the best procedure would be to substitute the term race the term culture group“ (CRASC 194).

Locke quickly notes while the notion of race has been invalidated as an explanation of culture groups understood as totalities, race does help to explain various cultural components within a given culture. “Race operates as tradition,” Locke noted, “as preferred traits and values,” changes in these aspects of culture in a distinctive way by a subset of a culture group constitutes “ethnic remoulding” (CRASC 195). Race becomes a term that designates the specific outcome of the “peculiar selective preferences” in favor of some, and against other, culture-traits of a given group. “Such facts” Locke observed

nullify two of the most prevalent popular and scientific fallacies, the ascription of a total culture to any one ethnic strain, and the interpretation of culture in terms of the intrinsic rather than the fusion of its various constituent elements. (CRASC 195)

To illustrate Locke’s view consider African Americans, they share a common culture with white Americans in terms of language, religion, aesthetic sense, and many other cultural elements. Even with these cultural elements in common there are characteristic, qualitatively distinct, and phenomenologically unique forms that common language, religion, and aesthetic sense have among African Americans that are not characteristic of white Americans. Characteristic differences such as have produced the musical styles, literary techniques, humor, oratorical idioms, mannerisms, forms of worship and religious expression, hair styles etc. and many other elements of culture that are the frequent objects of appropriation.

A sense of kinship among members of a subcultural group which yields an understanding that “different practices [operate in] their society from those which [operate in other societies and therefore] determine their treatment of other groups,” Locke argues is a key element in racial differentiation. (Locke, 1992, 20) Racial consciousness is not itself pernicious, but a group’s sense of itself and its difference from other social races can be based on the domination and oppression of other groups. (Locke, 1992, 20)

A social group’s sense of itself as a distinctive subculture yields the formation of peculiar values and beliefs, alongside specific practices and forms of living. These produce over time distinguishing qualities of the subculture in terms of elements that are noticeably present in one, or lacking from other groups. (Locke, 1989, 194–96) Culture-traits—ways of acting, speaking, interrelating, worshipping, eating, expressing etc.—establishes a dominant and characteristic pattern in a population. This pattern consists of social norms toward which members of the group conform. With sufficient conformity around those norms a culture-type is eventually established. (Locke, 1989, 194–95) Some people self-identify in racial terms, but the core elements with which they identify may be illusory. Such identification can benefit a racialized group. Observing that some racial conceptions are ethnic fictions does not lead Locke to deny the practical utility of racial identification.

6.4 Race Creeds, Race Practices, Racial Difference and Prejudice

Political and social conceptions of race are more useful in explaining racial domination and cultural assimilation and pluralism than scientific theories of race, which have been thoroughly undermined as the cause of cultural variation. Moreover, the distinctions made, the very populations designated by, anthropological race, rarely if ever coincide with those of ethnic race. The three conceptions carve up the world differently, and of them, Locke finds the political analysis and social or ethnic conception of race more accurate historically and sociologically. This is a matter of some debate in recent work in the philosophy of race. Also, advances in recent decades have raised important questions about the viability and usefulness of treating genetically discernable populations of human beings as races. Locke provides us further reason to doubt the viability of such projects. Moreover, he was adept enough to envision that even in the light of such advances it is a separate question whether the genetic populations of evolutionary biologists track closely the social populations putatively taken to be races.

Putatively biological conceptions of race, Locke argues, are social fictions. This aligns his thinking with fictionalist, or antirealist accounts of race, and inclines him in the direction of racial eliminativism. He argues that theoretical and scientific conceptions of race are misguided and ought to be eliminated for metaphysical, epistemological and normative reasons. Despite this he regards race as a fundamental category for understanding human social interactions. This informs his view that political conceptions of race are useful for understanding the way a society’s race creeds can rest on false beliefs, race practices are misguided and effectuate oppression, and understanding of the role of race in advancing imperialism and colonialism. In good pragmatist fashion, Locke is careful not to interpret political conceptions of race as postulating race as a metaphysical reality. His political conception of race offers a model for interpreting and analyzing a society’s racial creeds and race practices, it does not establish that race is a real biological or cultural factor of human populations or of individual persons. Locke argues that the only viable meaning of race is social. The conception of social race is for Locke the only plausible meaning of race. This aligns him with contemporary social constructionist. Locke endorses a form of substitutionism by contending that metaphysically realist conceptions of race should be abandoned in favor of ethnic or social race. His view is reconstructionist in that it aims to correct classical racialist views as well as the prevailing metaphysically realist views of his day.

Locke distinguishes between racial conceptions and a society’s race practices. The social differentiations that produce various social groupings including races, result on his analysis from social, political, and economic causes. Locke does not deny that racial differences or racial prejudices exist. Racial differences, he thought, often parallel racial inequalities. (Locke, 1992, 1–14) Locke claims that “[w]e should expect naturally that race theory should be a philosophy of the dominant group.” (Locke, 1992, 3) As it was in the United States and other European colonial powers whose members proffered racial theories that privileged dominant groups. This leads Locke to argue that much of what has passed for race theory in Western civilizations is “bad science.” Specious justifications of exploitive and oppressive race practices abound, and such theories, Locke observes are resistant to correction by more accurate scientific investigation, or social scientific or historical facts.

Locke is doubtful of the prospects of a thorough-going racial eliminativism. He writes: “I believe that a word and an idea covering so indispensable, useful, and necessary a grouping in human society will never vanish, never be eradicated, and that the only possible way in which a change will come about will be through a substitution of better meanings for the meanings which are now so current under the term.” (Locke, 1992, 84–85) This is a clear articulation of Locke’s racial substitutionism. He rejects eliminativism as the appropriate response to problematic conceptions of race or pernicious race practices and creeds. But Locke, unlike Du Bois, is not clearly a racial conservationist. He argues that prevailing conceptions of race are illegitimate, present race practices are pernicious, and contemporary race creeds unjust.

Locke is arguably a qualified or partial eliminativist as he advocates a radical redefinition of race in terms of culture, the elimination of certain race practices, race creeds, and race prejudices. Race prejudices, Locke claims, are ultimately based on cultural differences and differences in the type of civilization. Racial difference is at base a difference in the social consciousness of groups. Race prejudice erroneously assigns that variation to biological and anthropological factors that are unrelated to racial groups. This leaves racial prejudice in the paradoxical situation of being “an almost instinctive aberration in favor of anthropological factors erected into social distinctions” without any scientific warrant for so doing. (Locke, 1992, 10)

Race prejudices, Locke claims, result from aberrant psychological predispositions and tendencies. These habits often function unconsciously, but are not exempt from control and amelioration. Moreover, race creeds are for Locke distorted conceptual schemes and at the root of our notions of racial superiority and inferiority. Race prejudice and race creeds can and should be eliminated as features of race practice. His racial eliminativism is partial or qualified because he advocates jettisoning the more pernicious forms of our race practice, and is adamant about substituting current racial conceptions for the view of race as social culture.


Abbreviations of Principal Works

“Art or Propaganda?”(1928)
“The Concept of Race as Applied to Social Culture” (1924)
“Cultural Relativism and Ideological Peace” (1944)
“A Functional View of Value Ultimates” (1945)
“Pluralism and Intellectual Democracy” (1942)
The New Negro (1925)
“Values and Imperatives” (1935)
“Who and What Is “Negro”?” (1944)

Primary Literature

  • Locke, A., 1989. The Philosophy of Alain Locke: Harlem Renaissance and Beyond, L. Harris (ed.), Philadelphia: Temple University Press.
  • –––, 1928, “Art or Propaganda?”Harlem, 1(1): 12–13.
  • –––, 1924, “The Concept of Race as Applied to Social Culture,” in The Philosophy of Alain Locke: Harlem Renaissance and Beyond, L. Harris (ed.), Philadelphia: Temple University Press, pp. 188–199.
  • –––, 1944, “Cultural Relativism and Ideological Peace,” in The Philosophy of Alain Locke: Harlem Renaissance and Beyond, L. Harris (ed.), Philadelphia: Temple University Press, pp. 69–78.
  • –––, 1945, “A Functional View of Value Ultimates,” in The Philosophy of Alain Locke: Harlem Renaissance and Beyond, L. Harris (ed.), Philadelphia: Temple University Press, pp. 81–93.
  • –––, 1942, “Pluralism and Intellectual Democracy,” in The Philosophy of Alain Locke: Harlem Renaissance and Beyond, L. Harris (ed.), Philadelphia: Temple University Press, pp. 53–66.
  • –––, 1935, “Values and Imperatives,” in The Philosophy of Alain Locke: Harlem Renaissance and Beyond, L. Harris (ed.), Philadelphia: Temple University Press, pp. 34–50.
  • –––, “Who and What Is “Negro”?” in The Philosophy of Alain Locke: Harlem Renaissance and Beyond, L. Harris (ed.), Philadelphia: Temple University Press, pp. 209–228.
  • –––, (ed.) The New Negro. New York: Simon & Schuster, 1997.
  • –––, Race Contacts and Interracial Relations. Edited by Jeffrey C. Stewart. Washington, D.C.: Howard University Press, 1992.
  • Locke, A. and Stern, B. J. (eds.), 1946, When Peoples Meet: A Study of Race and Culture Contacts. New York: Hinds, Hayden & Eldredge, Inc.
  • Locke, A. and Brown, S. A., 1930, “Folk Values in a New Medium,” in Folk-Say: A Regional Miscellany, 1930, Botkin, B. A. (ed.), Norman: University of Oklahoma Press, pp. 340–345.

Secondary Literature

  • Bernasconi, R., 2008, “Ethnic Race: Revisiting Alain Locke's Neglected Proposal,” in Race or Ethnicity?: On Black and Latino Identity, J. Gracia (ed.), Ithaca: Cornell University Press, pp. 123–136.
  • Cain, R. J., 1995, “Alain LeRoy Locke: Crusader and Advocate for the Education of African American Adults,” The Journal of Negro Education, 64 (1): 87–99.
  • Carter, J. A., and Harris, L. (eds.), 2010, Philosophic Values and World Citizenship: Locke to Obama and Beyond, Lanham: Lexington Books.
  • Eze, C., 2005. The Dilemma of Ethnic Identity: Alain Locke's Vision of Transcultural Societies, New York: Mellen Press.
  • Green, J., 1999, Deep Democracy, Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • –––, 1999, “Alain Locke's Multicultural Philosophy of Value,” in The Critical Pragmatism of Alain Locke: A Reader on Value Theory, Aesthetics, Community, Culture, Race and Education, Harris, L. (ed.), Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers.
  • Harris, L. (ed.), 1989, The Philosophy of Alain Locke: Harlem Renaissance and Beyond. Philadelphia: Temple University Press.
  • –––, 2004, “The Great Debate: W.E.B. Du Bois vs. Alain Locke on the Aesthetic.” PhilosophiaAfricana, 7 (1): 15–39.
  • –––, 2002, “Universal Human Liberation and Community: Pixley Kaisaka Seme and Alain Leroy Locke,” in Perspectives in African Philosophy, Sumner, C. and Yohannes, S.W. (eds.), Addis Ababa: Addis Ababa University.
  • –––, 1999, The Critical Pragmatism of Alain Locke: A Reader on Value Theory, Aesthetics, Community, Culture, Race, and Education, Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers.
  • –––, 1997, “Alain Locke: Community and Citizenship,” The Modern Schoolman LXXIV: 337–346.
  • Harris, L. and Molesworth, C., 2009, Alain L. Locke: The Biography of a Philosopher, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Kallen, H. M., 1957, “Alain Locke and Cultural Pluralism,” Journal of Philosophy, 54 (5): 119–127.
  • Linnemann, R. J., (ed.), 1982, Alain Locke: Reflections On A Modern Renaissance Man, Baton Rouge: Louisiana State University.
  • MacMullan, T., 2005, “Challenges to Cultural Diversity: Absolutism, Democracy, and Alain Locke's Value Relativism,” Journal of Speculative Philosophy, 19 (2): 129–139.
  • Seme, P. K., 1993, “Regeneration of Africa,” in Seme: Founder of the ANC, Rive, R. and Couzens, T. (eds.), New Jersey: Africa World Press.
  • Stewart, J. C. (ed.), 1983, The Critical Temper of Alain Locke: A Selection of His Essays on Art and Culture, New York: Garland.
  • Washington, J., 1986, Alain Locke and Philosophy: A Quest for Cultural Pluralism, Westport: Greenwood Press.
  • Watts, E. K., 2002, “African American Ethos and Hermeneutical Rhetoric: An Exploration of Alain Locke's The New Negro,” Quarterly Journal of Speech 88: 19–32.
  • Zoeller, J., 2007, “Alain Locke at Oxford: Race and the Rhodes Scholarships,” The American Oxonian XCIV (2): 183–224.

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