First published Sat Aug 16, 2008; substantive revision Tue Apr 6, 2021

Pragmatism is a philosophical tradition that – very broadly – understands knowing the world as inseparable from agency within it. This general idea has attracted a remarkably rich and at times contrary range of interpretations, including: that all philosophical concepts should be tested via scientific experimentation, that a claim is true if and only if it is useful (relatedly: if a philosophical theory does not contribute directly to social progress then it is not worth much), that experience consists in transacting with rather than representing nature, that articulate language rests on a deep bed of shared human practices that can never be fully ‘made explicit’.

Pragmatism originated in the United States around 1870, and now presents a growing third alternative to both analytic and ‘Continental’ philosophical traditions worldwide. Its first generation was initiated by the so-called ‘classical pragmatists’ Charles Sanders Peirce (1839–1914), who first defined and defended the view, and his close friend and colleague William James (1842–1910), who further developed and ably popularized it. James’ Harvard colleague Josiah Royce (1855–1916), although officially allied with absolute idealism, proved a valuable interlocutor for many of these ideas. A significant influence in those early years was the scientific revolution then taking place around evolutionary theory, of which first generation pragmatists were keen observers and sometime participants (Pearce 2020). These pragmatists focused significantly on theorising inquiry, meaning and the nature of truth, although James put these themes to work exploring truth in religion. A second (still termed ‘classical’) generation turned pragmatist philosophy more explicitly towards politics, education and other dimensions of social improvement, under the immense influence of John Dewey (1859–1952) and his friend Jane Addams (1860–1935) – who invented the profession of social work as an expression of pragmatist ideas (and was awarded the Nobel Peace Prize in 1931). Also of considerable importance at this time was George Herbert Mead (1863–1931), who contributed significantly to the social sciences, developing pragmatist perspectives upon the relations between the self and the community (Mead 1934), whilst philosophy of race was germinated by pioneering African-American philosophers W.E.B Du Bois (1868–1963) and Alain Locke (1885–1954), who also engaged in productive dialogue with one another. As the progressive Deweyan ‘New Deal’ era passed away and the US moved into the Cold War, pragmatism’s influence was challenged, as analytic philosophy blossomed and became the dominant methodological orientation in most Anglo-American philosophy departments. Transitional or ‘third generation’ figures included C.I. Lewis (1883–1964) and W.V.O. Quine (1908–2000); although these philosophers developed a number of pragmatist themes, their analytic allegiance may be seen in their significant focus on theory of knowledge as first philosophy (which Dewey deprecated as ‘the epistemological industry’).

Following this dip in popularity, since the 1970s the pragmatist tradition has undergone a significant revival. Richard Rorty (1931–2007) turned consciously to pragmatism to rectify what he saw as mainstream epistemology’s crucial mistake: naively conceiving of language and thought as ‘mirroring’ the world. Rorty’s bold and iconoclastic attacks on this ‘representationalism’ birthed a so-called neopragmatism to which a number of influential recent philosophers have contributed (e.g. Hilary Putnam, Robert Brandom and Huw Price). Other pragmatists have objected to Rorty’s blithe dismissal of truth as a topic better left undiscussed (Rorty 1982), and have sought to rehabilitate classical pragmatist ideals of objectivity (e.g. Susan Haack, Christopher Hookway and Cheryl Misak). These philosophers are now sometimes referred to as New Pragmatists. Yet others have worked to place pragmatist ideas in a broader Western philosophical context, for instance tracing Peirce’s significant debt to Kant (Apel 1974, Gava 2014), and connections between pragmatism and 19th century idealism (Margolis 2010, Stern 2009). Meanwhile, classical pragmatism’s progressive social ideals lived on in some quarters, with notable contributions to philosophy of race made by Cornel West, who advanced a prophetic pragmatism drawing on both Christian and Marxian thought, and showcasing the earlier contributions of Du Bois and Locke (e.g. West 1989). A number of other liberatory philosophical projects in areas such as feminism (Seigfried 1996), ecology (Alexander 2013), Native American philosophy (Pratt 2002) and Latin American philosophy (Pappas 1998) also currently look to the pragmatist tradition as their philosophical home.

Meanwhile, increasingly pragmatism’s intellectual centre of gravity is moving out of North America, with vibrant research networks appearing in South America, Scandinavia and more recently central Europe and China.

The core of pragmatism as Peirce originally conceived it was the Pragmatic Maxim, a rule for clarifying the meaning of hypotheses by tracing their ‘practical consequences’ – their implications for experience in specific situations. For Peirce and James, a key application of the Maxim was clarifying the concept of truth. This produced a distinctive epistemological outlook: a fallibilist, anti-Cartesian explication of the norms that govern inquiry. Within that broad outlook, though, early pragmatists split significantly over questions of realism broadly conceived – essentially, whether pragmatism should conceive itself as a scientific philosophy holding monism about truth (following Peirce), or a more broad-based alethic pluralism (following James and Dewey). This dispute was poignantly emblematized in arguments between Peirce and James which led Peirce to rename his view pragmaticism, presenting this clarified viewpoint to the world as his new ‘baby’ which was, he hoped, ‘ugly enough to be safe from kidnappers’ (EP2: 355).

The first part of this entry is devoted to the classical pragmatists’ distinctive methods, and how they give rise to an original a posteriori epistemology. After that we will briefly explore some of the many other areas of philosophy in which rich pragmatist contributions have been made.

1. The Meaning of Pragmatism: James

Pragmatism’s key ideas originated in discussions at a so-called ‘Metaphysical Club’ that met in Harvard around 1870. (For a popular history of this group, see Menand 1998.) Peirce and James participated in these discussions along with some other philosophers, psychologists and philosophically inclined lawyers. Peirce then developed these ideas in publications from the 1870s, and they achieved prominence through a series of public lectures given by James in 1898. Both James and Peirce used ‘pragmatism’ as the name of a method, principle, or ‘maxim’ for clarifying concepts and hypotheses and for identifying empty disputes, though we shall see significant differences in how they understood it.

When William James published a series of lectures on ‘Pragmatism: A New Name for Some Old Ways of Thinking’ in 1907, he began by identifying ‘The Present Dilemma in Philosophy’ (1907: 9ff), a fundamental and apparently irresoluble clash between two ways of thinking, which he promised pragmatism would overcome. James begins by observing that the history of philosophy is ‘to a great extent that of a certain clash of human temperaments’: the ‘tough-minded’ and the ‘tender-minded’. The tough-minded have an empiricist commitment to experience and going by ‘the facts’, while the tender-minded prefer a priori principles which appeal to ratiocination. The tender-minded tend to be idealistic, optimistic and religious, believing in free will, while the tough-minded are materialist, pessimistic, irreligious, dogmatic and fatalistic.

By the early twentieth century, James notes, ‘our children … are almost born scientific’ (1907: 14f). But this has not weakened religious belief. People need a philosophy that is both empiricist in its adherence to facts yet finds room for faith. But all that is on offer is ‘an empirical philosophy that is not religious enough and a religious philosophy that is not empirical enough…’ (1907: 15f). The challenge is to show how to reconcile ‘the scientific loyalty to facts’ with ‘the old confidence in human values and the resultant spontaneity, whether of the religious or of the romantic type.’ Pragmatism is presented as the ‘mediating philosophy’: we need to show how adherence to tough-minded epistemic standards does not prevent our adopting the kind of worldview to which the tender-minded aspire. Once we use what he introduced as the ‘pragmatic method’ to clarify our understanding of truth, of free will, or of religious belief the disputes—which we despaired of settling intellectually—begin to dissolve. William James thus presented pragmatism as a ‘method for settling metaphysical disputes that might otherwise be interminable.’ (1907: 28) Unless some ‘practical difference’ would follow from one or the other side’s being correct, the dispute is idle.

[T]he tangible fact at the root of all our thought-distinctions, however subtle, is that there is no one of them so fine as to consist in anything but a possible difference of practice. To attain perfect clearness in our thoughts of an object, then, we need only consider what conceivable effects of a practical kind the object may involve—what sensations we are to expect from it, and what reactions we must prepare. (1907: 29)

The lectures explained this with a memorable illustration. On a visit to the mountains, James’ friends engage in a ‘ferocious metaphysical dispute’ about a squirrel that was hanging on one side of a tree trunk while a human observer was standing on the other side:

This human witness tries to get sight of the squirrel by moving rapidly round the tree, but no matter how fast he goes, the squirrel moves as fast in the opposite direction, and always keeps the tree between himself and the man, so that never a glimpse of him is caught. The resultant metaphysical problem now is this: Does the man go round the squirrel or not? (1907: 27f)

James proposed that which answer is correct depends on what you ‘practically mean’ by ‘going round’. If you mean passing from north of the squirrel, east, south, then west, then the answer to the question is ‘yes’. If, on the other hand, you mean in front of him, to his right, behind him, to his left, and then in front of him again, then the answer is ‘no’. After pragmatic clarification disambiguates the question, all dispute comes to an end. So James offers his pragmatism as a technique for clarifying concepts and hypotheses so that metaphysical disputes that appear irresoluble will be dissolved. A good example is the dispute between free will and determinism: once we compare the practical consequences of both positions we find no conflict. As James admitted, he explained the pragmatic method through examples rather than a detailed analysis of what it involves. He did little to explain exactly what ‘practical consequences’ are. He also made no claim to originality: ‘Pragmatism represents a perfectly familiar attitude in philosophy, the empiricist attitude’, although he acknowledged that it did so ‘in a more radical and in a less objectionable form than it has ever yet assumed’ (1907: 31). It shared with other forms of empiricism an ‘anti-intellectualist tendency’ (ibid), and it recognized that theories (and presumably concepts) should be viewed as ‘instruments, not answers to enigmas’.

2. The Pragmatic Maxim: Peirce

Peirce made this canonical statement of his Pragmatic Maxim in ‘How to Make our Ideas Clear’:

Consider what effects, which might conceivably have practical bearings, we conceive the object of our conception to have. Then, our conception of those effects is the whole of our conception of the object. (EP1: 132)

This offers a distinctive method for becoming clear about the meaning of concepts and the hypotheses which contain them. We clarify a hypothesis by identifying the practical consequences we should expect if it is true. This raises some questions. First: what, exactly is the content of this maxim? What sort of thing does it recognize as a practical consequence? Second, what use does such a maxim have? Peirce’s first simple illustrative example urges that what we mean by calling something hard is that ‘it will not be scratched by many other substances.’ In this way, then, I can use the concept hard in certain contexts when I am wondering what to do, and absent such contexts, the concept is empty. The principle has something of a verificationist character: ‘our idea of anything is our idea of its sensible effects’ (EP1: 132). However the use of the phrase ‘practical consequences’ suggests that these are to be understood as having implications for what we will or should do. This is clear from Peirce’s later formulations, for example:

The entire intellectual purport of any symbol consists in the total of all general modes of rational conduct which, conditionally upon all the possible different circumstances and desires, would ensue upon the acceptance of the symbol. (EP2: 346).

So, for instance, if I want to break a window by throwing something through it, then I need an object which is hard, not soft. It is important that, as Peirce hints here, the consequences we are concerned with are general and intelligible: we are to look for laws that govern the behaviour of hard things and show how such modes of behaviour can make a difference to what is rational for us to do.

James never worked out his understanding of ‘practical consequences’ as fully as Peirce did, and he does not share Peirce’s restriction of these consequences to general patterns of behaviour. Sometimes he writes as if the practical consequences of a proposition can simply be effects upon the individual believer: if religious belief makes me feel better, then that contributes to the pragmatic clarification of ‘God exists’. James also hopes that the attempt to clarify metaphysical hypotheses will reveal that some propositions are empty or, more important, that, as in the squirrel example, some apparent disagreements are unreal. Peirce sees uses for his maxim beyond those James had in mind. He insisted that it was a logical principle, in a broad sense of logic which includes scientific methodology. So for instance he used it to clarify concepts central to scientific reasoning such as probability, truth, and reality. (We shall discuss his views on truth and reality further below.) Pragmatism, described by Peirce as a ‘laboratory philosophy’, shows us how we test theories by carrying out experiments in the expectation that if the hypothesis is not true, then the experiment will fail to have some predetermined sensible effect.

Peirce’s description of his maxim as a logical principle is reflected in passages where he presents it as a development of a distinction that had been a staple of traditional logic texts, and familiar to readers of Descartes, between ideas that are clear and distinct (EP1: 126f). Peirce understood the first grade of clarity about the meaning of a concept as being able to identify instances of it, without necessarily being able to say how. He then took his philosophical contemporaries to hold that the highest grade of clarity, distinctness, is obtained when we can analyze a concept into its elements by providing a verbal definition (or, in more recent terminology, necessary and sufficient conditions for its application). Peirce complained that ‘nothing new is ever learned by analyzing definitions’, unless we already have a clear understanding of the defining terms. He therefore announced that the Pragmatic Maxim enabled a higher (‘third’) grade of clarity, that supplemented the verbal definition with a description of how the concept is employed in practice.

As well as treating the Pragmatic Maxim as part of a constructive account of the norms that govern inquiry, Peirce, like James, gave it a negative role as a tool for demonstrating the emptiness of a priori metaphysics. In section 3.1 we shall see how pragmatic clarification of reality may be used to undermine a flawed ‘nominalistic’ conception of reality that led to the ‘copy theory of truth’, problematic Cartesian certainty-seeking strategies in epistemology, and Kant’s concept of a ‘thing in itself’. A more vivid non-logical example of using the maxim to undermine spurious metaphysical ideas was Peirce’s early argument that the Catholic understanding of transubstantiation was empty and incoherent. Since all we mean by wine is something that has certain distinctive effects upon the senses, ‘to talk of something as having all the sensible characters of wine, yet being in reality blood, is senseless jargon’ (EP1: 131f). It is important to note, however, that the maxim is in the end only a tool for clarifying meaning; not Peirce’s theory of meaning proper. This is to be found in his theory of signs or semiotic, which is discussed below (4.4).

3. Pragmatist Theories of Truth

Peirce and James differed in how they applied their respective pragmatisms to clarifying the concept of truth. Peirce’s account of truth is presented as a means to understanding a concept that he claimed was vital for the method of science: reality (3.1). James used his account to defend pluralism about truth (3.2).

3.1 Peirce on Truth and Reality

The final section of ‘How to Make our Ideas Clear’ promises to consider a fundamental logical conception, reality. This concept seems clear: ‘every child uses it with perfect confidence, never dreaming that he does not understand it.’ Thus it reaches Peirce’s first level of meaning-clarity. A (second-level) verbal definition of the concept is also readily forthcoming: ‘we may define the real as that whose characters are independent of what anybody may think them to be.’ But, Peirce announces, we shall need to apply the Pragmatic Maxim if our idea of reality is to be ‘perfectly clear’. At this stage the concept of truth enters the discussion: Peirce claims that the object represented in a true proposition is our best understanding of the real. So we have to turn to his remarks about truth to see how the mind-independence alleged in the abstract definition of reality is to be operationalized and thus properly understood from a pragmatist perspective.

His pragmatic clarification of truth is expressed as follows:

The opinion which is fated to be ultimately agreed to by all who investigate, is what we mean by the truth, and the object represented in this opinion is the real. That is the way I would explain reality. (EP1: 139)

Seven years earlier, in a review of a new edition of the writings of Berkeley, Peirce had described this way of thinking as the ‘realist conception of reality’ (EP1:88–9), in contrast with a ‘nominalist conception of reality’ which many early modern philosophers took for granted. Nominalists assume that the real can only be the antecedent cause of singular sensations which provide our evidence for beliefs about the external world. This naturally leads to a certain (age-old) solipsistic skepticism concerning whether a person can gain knowledge that transcends their own perceptions and epistemic perspective. Peirce’s pragmatist clarification of truth offers an alternative conceptualization of ‘being constrained by reality’, in terms of consequent convergence of opinion, through the process of inquiry, rather than as an antecedent cause of sensations.

All this has led Peirce’s account of truth to be expressed in the slogan: truth is the end of inquiry, where ‘end’ is to be understood not as a ‘finish’ (some point in time when all human questions will be settled) but as a goal, telos or final cause. This original understanding of truth has faced challenges that it is ‘too realist’ insofar as it takes for granted that inquiry will converge on just one answer to any given question. Here Bertrand Russell asked, ‘Is this an empirical generalization from the history of research? Or is it an optimistic belief in the perfectibility of man?’, concluding, ‘Whatever interpretation we adopt, we seem committed to some very rash assertion.’ (1939: 146). Similarly, Quine wrote, ‘…we have no reason to suppose that man’s surface irritations even unto eternity admit of any one systematization that is scientifically better or simpler than all possible others’ (1960: 23). However, later in life Peirce urged that the hypothesis of monistic convergence is best viewed as a regulative hope. In 1908, Peirce wrote to a friend, ‘I do not say that it is infallibly true that there is any belief to which a person would come if he were to carry his inquiries far enough. I only say that that alone is what I call Truth’ (cited Haack 1976: 246).

At the same time, others have criticised Peirce’s account of truth for not being realist enough, due to its ‘internal realist’ definition of truth in terms of belief and inquiry. Can there not be claims which no-one ever inquires into or believes, which are nonetheless true? What about ‘lost facts’, such as the number of cakes on a tray during a long-ago party (Johnston 2003: 91)? Here Peirce arguably doubles down on his fallibilism (Legg 2014: 211). How can we be sure that no amount of inquiry will settle such matters?

… it is unphilosophical to suppose that, with regard to any given question (which has any clear meaning), investigation would not bring forth a solution of it, if it were carried far enough… Who can be sure of what we shall not know in a few hundred years? (EP1: 140)

The objectivism of Peirce’s account of truth derives not from a world entirely external to our minds (a famously difficult thing to know), but from the potential infinity of the community of inquiry, which exposes all of our beliefs to future correction: ‘reality is independent, not necessarily of thought in general, but only of what you or I or any finite number of [persons] may think about it…’ (EP1: 139). By means of this mathematical analysis, Peirce deftly synthesises insights from traditional realisms and idealisms (Legg 2014: 212; Lane 2018).

3.2 James on Truth

James departed from Peirce in claiming that pragmatism was itself a theory of truth. And his writings on this topic rapidly became notorious. They are characteristically lively, offering contrasting formulations, engaging slogans, and intriguing claims which often seem to fly in the face of common sense. We can best summarize his view through his own words:

The true is the name of whatever proves itself to be good in the way of belief, and good, too, for definite assignable reasons. (1907: 42)

The true’, to put it very briefly, is only the expedient in the way of our thinking, just as ‘the right’ is only the expedient in the way of our behaving. Expedient in almost any fashion; and expedient in the long run and on the whole, of course. (1907: 106)

Other formulations fill this out by giving a central role to experience:

Ideas … become true just in so far as they help us to get into satisfactory relation with other parts of our experience. (1907: 34)

Any idea upon which we can ride …; any idea that will carry us prosperously from any one part of our experience to any other part, linking things satisfactorily, working securely, saving labor; is true for just so much, true in so far forth, true instrumentally. (1907: 34)

This might be taken to suggest that beliefs are made true by the fact that they enable us to make accurate predictions of the future run of experience, but other passages suggest that the ‘goodness of belief’ can take other forms. James assures us that it can contribute to the truth of a theological proposition that it has ‘a value for concrete life’ (1907: 40); and this can occur because the idea of God possesses a majesty which can ‘yield religious comfort to a most respectable class of minds’ (1907:40). This suggests that a belief can be made true by the fact that holding it contributes to our happiness and fulfilment.

The kind of passages just noted may seem to support Bertrand Russell’s famous objection that James is committed to the truth of “Santa Claus exists” (Russell 1946, p, 772). This is unfair; at best, James is committed to the claim that the happiness that belief in Santa Claus provides is truth-relevant. James could say that the belief was ‘good for so much’ but it would only be ‘wholly true’ if it did not ‘clash with other vital benefits’. It is easy to see that, unless it is somehow insulated from the broader effects of acting upon it, belief in Santa Claus could lead to a host of experiential surprises and disappointments.

4. Pragmatist Epistemology

The pragmatists saw their epistemology as providing a return to common sense and experience and thus as rejecting a flawed philosophical heritage which had distorted the work of earlier thinkers. The errors to be overcome include Cartesianism, Nominalism, and the ‘copy theory of truth’: these are all related.

4.1 Skepticism versus Fallibilism

The roots of pragmatism’s anti-skepticism can be found in Peirce’s early (1868) paper ‘Some Consequences of Four Incapacities’ (EP1: 28–30). Here he identifies ‘Cartesianism’ as a philosophical pathology that lost sight of certain insights that were fundamental to scholastic thought (for all its faults), and – he argued – more suited to the philosophical needs of his own time. The paper begins by identifying four problematic teachings of modern philosophy:

  1. One can and should try to doubt all of one’s beliefs at once.
  2. The ultimate test of certainty lies in individual consciousness.
  3. The ‘multiform argumentation’ characteristic of the Middle Ages is replaced by a single chain of inference.
  4. Where scholasticism consciously limited its explanatory capacity (purporting to explain only ‘all created things’), Cartesianism’s stated ambition to explain everything ironically renders its own presuppositions hidden, mysterious and philosophically dangerous.

The first, and in many ways most important of these Cartesian teachings was the method of universal doubt. We should retain beliefs only if they are absolutely certain and we are unable to doubt them. The test of this certainty, as Peirce next points out, lies in whether the individual consciousness is satisfied. Importantly, this self-examination includes reflection on hypothetical possibilities: we cannot trust our perceptual beliefs, for example, because we cannot rule out that they might be produced by a dream, or an evil demon. (See Hookway 2012, chapters 2,3.) The initial pragmatist response to this is that it is a strategy that in practice we cannot carry out effectively, and there is no reason to adopt it anyway. Peirce claims that any attempt to adopt the method of doubt will be an exercise in self-deception because we possess a variety of certainties which it does not occur to us can be questioned. So what is produced will not be ‘real doubt’; these beliefs will lurk in the background, influencing our reflection. Peirce urges us not to ‘pretend to doubt in philosophy what we do not doubt in our hearts’ (EP1: 29).

It is necessary to separate some different threads in his argument here. First, there is something unnatural about the Cartesian strategy. Inquiries normally occur within a context: we address particular questions or problems, relying on background certainties that it does not occur to us to doubt. The Cartesian suggestion that we should begin by trying to doubt everything appears to be an attempt to step outside of this. Second, the Cartesian strategy requires us to reflect upon each of our beliefs and ask what reason we have for holding it; skeptical challenges are then used to question the adequacy of these reasons. This is again at odds with normal practice. Many of our familiar certainties are such that we cannot offer any concrete or convincing reason for believing them. We tend to treat our established beliefs as innocent until ‘proven guilty’. The mere lack of a conclusive reason for belief does not itself provide us with a reason for doubt.

Descartes, of course, might have conceded this, but responded that the revision is required because once we allow error to enter our belief-corpus we may be unable to escape from its damaging effects. His was a time of methodological ferment, and he appreciated how many false beliefs he himself had acquired from his teachers. The pragmatist response here is to question some of Descartes’ assumptions about how we reason and form beliefs. First, his strategy is individualist and ‘to make single individuals absolute judges of truth is most pernicious’. Peirce noted that the natural sciences which were so conspicuously successful in Descartes’ day took a very different approach:

In sciences in which men come to agreement, when a theory has been broached, it is considered to be on probation until this agreement has been reached. After it is reached, the question of certainty becomes an idle one, because there is no one left who doubts it. We individually cannot reasonably hope to attain the ultimate philosophy which we pursue; we can only seek it, therefore, for the community of philosophers. (EP1: 29)

Peirce also questions Descartes’ understanding of reasoning in holding that we may rely on ‘a single thread of inference’ that is no stronger than its weakest link:

Philosophy ought to imitate the successful sciences in its methods, so far as to…trust rather to the multitude and variety of its arguments than to the conclusiveness of any one. Its reasoning should not form a chain which is no stronger than its weakest link, but a cable whose fibres may be ever so slender, provided they are sufficiently numerous and intimately connected. (EP1: 29)

Where the Cartesian holds that unless we begin from premises of which we can be absolutely certain we may never reach the truth, the pragmatist emphasises that, when we do go wrong, further discussion and investigation can identify and eliminate errors, which is our best hope for escaping their damaging effects. The possibility of error provides us with reason to be ‘contrite fallibilists’, rather than skeptics. The focus of epistemological inquiry should not be on showing how we can possess absolute certainty, but on how we can develop self-correcting methods of inquiry that make fallible progress.

William James makes similar observations. In ‘The Will to Believe’, he reminds us that we have two cognitive desiderata: to obtain truth, and to avoid error (James 1897: 30). The harder we try to avoid error, the more likely it is that we will miss out on truth; and the more strenuously we search for truth, the more likely we are to let in error. The method of doubt may make sense in special cases where enormous weight is given to avoiding error, even if that means loss of truth, but only there. Once we recognize that we are making a practical and forced decision about the relative importance of two goods, the Cartesian strategy no longer appears the only rational one. Later, Dewey in The Quest for Certainty similarly urged that a focus on eliminating all error from our beliefs is both doomed and destructive, with the added twist of a social diagnosis of the quest itself: the uncertainty, pain and fear of much early human life led to the erection of ‘priestly’ forms of knowledge which in promising to intercede with a Heavenly stability, sundered a priori theory from a posteriori practice, thereby enabling the knowing classes to insulate themselves from a more humble (and realistic) empiricism. The ‘quest’ continues, however, in many debates in contemporary mainstream epistemology.

4.2 Inquiry

Pragmatist epistemologies often explore how we can carry out inquiries in a self-controlled and fruitful way. (Where much analytic epistemology centres around the concept of knowledge, considered as an idealised end-point of human thought, pragmatist epistemology centres around the concept of inquiry, considered as the process of knowledge-seeking and how we can improve it.) So pragmatists often provide rich accounts of the capacities or virtues that we must possess in order to inquire well, and the rules or guiding principles that we should adopt. A canonical account is Peirce’s classic early paper “The Fixation of Belief”. Here Peirce states that inquiry is a struggle to replace doubt with ‘settled belief’, and that the only method of inquiry that can make sense of the fact that at least some of us are disturbed by inconsistent beliefs, and will subsequently reflect upon which methods of fixing belief are correct is the Method of Science, which draws on the Pragmatic Maxim described above. This contrasts with three other methods of fixing belief: i) refusing to consider evidence contrary to one’s favored beliefs (the Method of Tenacity), ii) accepting an institution’s dictates (the Method of Authority), iii) developing the most rationally coherent or elegant-seeming belief-set (the A Priori Method). Notable recent reinterpretations and defenses of Peircean pragmatist epistemology include (Haack 1993 and Cooke 2007). (See also Skagestad 1981.)

Dewey’s conception of inquiry, found in his Logic: the Theory of Inquiry is also rich, and arguably more radical than Peirce’s in its underlying ontology (ED2: 169–79). Dewey sees inquiry as beginning with a problem; it aims for ‘the controlled or directed transformation of an indeterminate situation into one that is so determinate in its constituent distinctions and relations as to convert the elements of the original situation into a unified whole’ (ED2: 171). As John E. Smith notes, where ‘Peirce aimed at “fixing” belief, Dewey aimed at “fixing” the situation’ (1978: 98). It is important to note that here the situation is objectively indeterminate, and is itself transformed by inquiry. The ‘pattern of inquiry’ that Dewey describes is common to the information-gathering of animals, practical problem solving, common sense investigations of our surroundings and scientific inquiry. He recognizes that when we face a problem, our first task is to understand it through describing its elements and identifying their relations. Identifying a concrete question that we need to answer is a sign that we are making progress. And the ‘logical forms’ we use in the course of inquiry are understood as ideal instruments, tools that help us to transform things and resolve our problem. The continuities Dewey finds between different kinds of inquiry are evidence of his naturalism and his recognition that forms of scientific investigation can guide us in all areas of our lives. All the pragmatists, but most of all Dewey, challenge the sharp dichotomy that other philosophers draw between theoretical beliefs and practical deliberations. In some sense, all inquiry is practical, concerned with transforming and evaluating the features of situations in which we find ourselves. Shared inquiry directed at resolving social and political problems or indeterminacies was also central to Dewey’s conception of the good life and, relatedly, the democratic ideal. (Recently other pragmatists, closer to Peirce than Dewey, have developed this idea: see for instance Talisse 2008; Misak 1999; Westbrook 1991.)

4.3 Pragmatist Conceptions of Experience

The Pragmatic Maxim suggests that pragmatism is a form of empiricism (an idea recently explored further in Wilson 2016). Our ability to think about so-called external things, and steadily improve our understanding of them, rests upon our experience. Yet most pragmatists adopted accounts of experience and perception radically different from the views of modern empiricists from John Locke and David Hume to Rudolf Carnap, as well as the ‘intuition’ posited by Kant. The established view interpreted experience as what is sometimes (following C.I. Lewis and Wilfrid Sellars) called ‘the given’: we are passive recipients of determinate and singular ‘sense-data’. Experience provides raw material for knowledge, but does not itself have content informed by concepts, practical needs, or anything else non-sensory. Our only contact with the external world is through receiving such experiences. So this way of thinking about experience can easily lead to skepticism about the so-called ‘external world’.

In different ways, Peirce, James, and Dewey all argued that experience is far richer than this, and that earlier philosophers were mistaken to claim that we could identify ‘experiences’ or ‘sense-data’ as antecedents to, or separable constituents of, cognition. We can begin with James’ radical empiricism, of which he said that ‘the establishment of the pragmatist theory of truth [was] a step of first-rate importance in making [it] prevail’ (1909: 6f). The connection with pragmatism is evident from the fundamental ‘postulate’ of radical empiricism: ‘the only things that shall be debatable among philosophers shall be things definable in terms drawn from experience’. But this requires that experience be newly understood. First, he announced that ‘the relations between things, conjunctive as well as disjunctive, are just as much matters of direct particular experience, neither more so nor less so, than the things themselves.’ And, second, he concludes that ‘the parts of experience hold together from next to next by relations that are themselves parts of experience. The directly apprehended universe needs, in short, no extraneous trans-empirical connective support, but possesses in its own right a concatenated or continuous structure.’

Peirce too emphasizes the continuous character of perceptual experience, and adds that we directly perceive external things as external, as ‘other’, that we can perceive necessary connections between events, and that experience contains elements of generality (citing a picture of a connected series of circles which can be seen as a stone wall, in the manner of Wittgenstein’s famous duck-rabbit dual diagram). Around 1902–3, Peirce developed a complex and original theory of perception which combines a percept, which is entirely non-cognitive, with a perceptual judgement, which is structured propositionally and lies in the space of reasons. In this way he seeks to capture how perception is both immediately felt and truth-evaluable. In contrast to standard British Empiricist analyses of the relation between impressions and ideas, Peirce does not claim that a perceptual judgment copies its percept. Rather, it indexes it, just as a weather-cock indicates the direction of the wind. Although percept and perceptual judgment are intrinsically dissimilar, over time certain habits of association between the two are reinforced, leading them to (literally) grow in our minds and link with other habits. This enables percepts and perceptual judgments to mutually inform one another, to the point where every perception is fallible and subject to reinterpretation in the light of future perceptions (Legg 2017). The end result is that, as Peirce puts it, in stark contrast to the accepted understanding of experience as ‘given’: ‘[n]othing at all…is absolutely confrontitional’, although, ‘the confrontitional is continually flowing in upon us’ (CP 7.653).

Dewey’s account of experience, which is central to his entire philosophy, contributes an additional twist. Like Peirce, he thought that experience was ‘full of inference’, but he arguably took the notion further from the mere contents of individual consciousness than any previous pragmatist. For Dewey, experience is a process through which we transact with our surroundings and meet our needs. He wrote:

Like its congeners life and history, [experience] includes what men do and suffer, what they strive for, love, believe and endure, and also how men act and are acted upon, the ways in which they do and suffer, desire and enjoy, see, believe, imagine, in short, processes of experiencing (LW1:18).

What we experience is shaped by our habits of expectation and there is no basis for extracting from this complex process the kind of ‘thin given’ beloved of sense datum theorists. We experience all sorts of objects, events and processes, and just as experience is inextricable from the ‘external’ world of things, Nature (its co-ordinate concept: what is experienced) is inextricable from the ‘internal’ world of concepts.

In sharp contrast to Dewey, neopragmatism no longer takes experience as an explicit philosophical theme. Rorty began his pre-pragmatist philosophical career as an eliminative materialist, and the view survives in Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature, newly bolstered by Sellarsian concerns about the ‘myth of the given’. On this basis, Rorty declares that ‘Dewey should have dropped the term “experience” rather than redefining it… He should have agreed with Peirce that a great gulf divides sensation and cognition, [and] decided that cognition was possible only for language users…’ (Rorty 1998: 297). Similarly, Brandom focusses his attention exclusively on linguistic meaning (albeit in this case qua rationalist), and has famously ruled that (as ‘blasphemy’ was to Oscar Wilde) ‘experience’ is ‘not one of his words’ (Brandom 2011: 197). This neopragmatist neglect of one of classical pragmatism’s central concepts has become a major point of contention on the part of many New Pragmatists (e.g. Koopman 2007; Levine 2010, 2012; Sachs 2015).

4.4 Representations

Having discussed pragmatists’ emphases upon the activity of inquiry and the thickness of experience, we turn to their views about the nature of thought. It has been common for philosophers to assume that the ‘content’ of a thought, judgment or proposition is a kind of intrinsic property that it possesses. Perhaps it offers a ‘picture’ or ‘idea’ of some state of affairs, and we can identify this content simply by reflecting upon the item itself, and its structural properties. All pragmatists have rejected this idea as a key driver of an antinaturalistic Cartesian dualism. Instead, they have held that the content of a thought, judgment or proposition is a matter of the role it fills in our activities of inquiry, and is to be explained by reference to how we interpret it or what we do with it. This shall be illustrated by considering three particular pragmatist views.

First, all of the classic pragmatists identified beliefs and other mental states as habits. According to Peirce, our beliefs ‘[g]uide our desires and shape our actions’ (EP1: 114). The content of a belief is determined by its role in determining our actions. This was reflected in Peirce’s formulations of his Pragmatic Maxim. In order to be clear about the content of a concept or hypothesis, we must reflect upon its role in determining what we should do in the light of our desires and our background knowledge. In Robert Brandom’s terminology, the philosopher ‘makes explicit’ aspects of our practice that are implicit in our habits and dispositions. The role of tacit habits of reasoning and acting in fixing our beliefs and guiding our actions is a theme that recurs in the work of the pragmatists, and is now finding strong echoes in recent empirically informed work on ‘4E’ cognition, which is embodied, embedded, enactive and extended. (For an accounts of this research area which explicitly engage classical pragmatism, see Menary 2007 and Gallagher 2017.)

The second illustration concerns a passage in which James defended his account of truth by urging that it was the concept used in successful science. He identified the ‘traditional view’ that, for early scientists, the ‘clearness, beauty and simplification’ provided by their theories led them to think that they had deciphered authentically the eternal thoughts of the Almighty. By contrast, contemporary scientists held that ‘no theory is absolutely a transcript of reality, but that any of them may from some point of view be useful …’. A scientific theory was to be understood as ‘an instrument: it is designed to achieve a purpose—to facilitate action or increase understanding’ (James 1907: 33). For James and Dewey, this holds of all our concepts and theories: we treat them as instruments to be judged by how well they achieve their intended purpose.

The third illustration comes from Peirce’s general theory of signs, or semiotics, which was developed entirely independently of the more well-known semiotics of Ferdinand de Saussure, and is one of the most original areas of his thought. Peirce’s semiotics offers an account of the contents of thoughts as well as language, visual media, music and any other item that can be said to have meaning (for introductions to this area of Peirce’s thought, see Liszka 1996; Short 2007). Unlike Saussure, Peirce insisted that the sign-relation was essentially triadic in structure, comprising a representation, an object and an interpretation. In other words: a sign is ‘about’ some object because it is understood, in subsequent thought, as a sign of that object. This subsequent thought Peirce calls the sign’s interpretant. In understanding or interpreting a sign, we may feel things about it (which at times Peirce called the emotional interpretant), undertake actions that are rational in the light of the sign and the other information we possess (the dynamic interpretant), or an indefinite number of inferences may be drawn from it (the logical interpretant) (Jappy 2016). Interpretation is generally a goal-directed activity and, once again, the content of a sign is determined by the ways in which we use it (or might do so).

A further triadic distinction deriving from Peirce’s theory of signs which has been influential in disciplines from Biology to Media Studies holds between three ways in which a sign may pick out its object:

  1. by resembling it (or more generally, by possessing the very properties that the sign aims to signify), e.g. a map
  2. by indicating it in some brute unmediated fashion, e.g. a weather-vane signifying the wind’s direction
  3. via some arbitrary convention that must be learned, e.g. words in English.

These three kinds of signs Peirce termed: icon, index and symbol respectively. Meanwhile, the three ways in which a sign may give rise to its interpretant were categorised by Peirce as:

  1. the rheme (essentially: a term)
  2. the proposition
  3. the argument

Peirce’s sign theory continued to richly evolve and clarify itself right to the end of his life (Jappy 2016; Bellucci 2017), albeit by means of some rather forbidding special-purpose technical terminology.

5. Further pragmatists

5.1 The Early Years

It would be wrong to conclude that pragmatism was restricted to the United States or that the only important pragmatist thinkers were Peirce, James and Dewey. As is documented by Thayer, there were pragmatists in Oxford, in France and, especially, in Italy in the early years of the twentieth century (Thayer 1968, part III, Baldwin 2003: 88–9). Moreover we can mention several other important American pragmatists, for example Josiah Royce. Commonly thought to be an idealist opponent of James and a critic of pragmatism, Royce increasingly came to be influenced by Peirce’s work on signs and on the community of inquirers and was acknowledged as a fellow pragmatist by Peirce himself. C.I. Lewis, the teacher of Quine and of several generations of Harvard philosophers developed a philosophy that was a sort of pragmatist Kantianism. Murray Murphey has identified him as ‘the last great pragmatist’ (Murphey 2005). In books such as Mind and the World Order (1929), he defended a pragmatist conception of the a priori, holding that our choices of laws of logic and systems of classification were to be determined by pragmatic criteria (Lewis 1923, 1929; Murphey 2005: chapters four and five). Of comparable importance was George Herbert Mead, whose contribution to the social sciences has been noted. The work of Frank Ramsey at Cambridge (Ramsey 1926) in the 1920s developed Peirce’s views on statistical reasoning and on inquiry in ways that provided fertile research programmes through much of the century, for example in the work of Isaac Levi at Columbia (Levi 2012). As a number of scholars have documented (Boncompagni 2016; Goodman 2002), Wittgenstein’s later thought acquired a pragmatist flavour through his reading of James’s Varieties of Religious Experience (1902).

5.2 Neopragmatism

Where Peirce and Dewey—and even perhaps James—were engaged in working out systematic philosophical visions, Rorty treated ‘pragmatism’ as a more critical or therapeutic philosophical project. What pragmatists teach us about truth, he tells us, is that there is nothing very systematic or constructive to be said about it. In particular, the concept does not capture any metaphysical relation between our beliefs and utterances, on the one hand, and reality on the other. We can describe what we do with the word ‘true’: we use it to express our endorsement of beliefs and sentences, and sometimes we might find it useful to express our fallibility by saying that some of our beliefs may not be true. (Rorty calls this the ‘cautionary’ use of the term.) But, beyond talking about the rather trivial formal properties of the concept, there is nothing more to be said. He also uses what he describes as a ‘pragmatist’ principle to show that truth cannot be our aim when we inquire. This principle holds that we can only adopt something as an aim when we are able to recognize that it has been achieved. And since we are fallible, we are never in a position to prove that one of our beliefs is actually true—all we can recognize is that it meets standards of acceptance that are endorsed, for the time being, in our community (Rorty 1991a: chapter one; 2000; Hookway 2007). This consequentialist reading of pragmatist ideas is also reflected in his account of how we can criticize and revise our view of the world. We should be free to propose new ‘vocabularies’—systems of classification and description. We do not test these vocabularies by seeing whether they enable us to discover truths or by showing that they can be read off the nature of reality. Instead, we evaluate them by seeing how they enable us to achieve our current goals, formulate better and more satisfying goals, and generally become better at being human (Rorty 1995).

Hilary Putnam has at times denied that he is a pragmatist because he does not think that a pragmatist account of truth can be sustained. Indeed, he shows little sympathy for the pragmatic maxim. However, he has written extensively on James, Peirce, and Dewey—often in collaboration with Ruth Anna Putnam—and has provided insightful accounts of what is distinctive about pragmatism, and what can be learned from it (See Putnam 1994a). He has identified four characteristics of pragmatism: the rejection of skepticism; the willingness to embrace fallibilism; the rejection of sharp dichotomies such as those between fact and value, thought and experience, mind and body, analytic and synthetic etc; and what he calls ‘the primacy of practice’ (1994c). With the turn of the twenty first century, he made ambitious claims for the prospects of a pragmatist epistemology. After surveying the apparent failures of the original enlightenment project, and attributing them to the fact that enlightenment philosophers were unable to overcome the fundamental dichotomies mentioned above, he expresses the hope that the future might contain a ‘pragmatist enlightenment’ (Putnam 2004:89–108). The rich understanding of experience and science offered by pragmatists may show us how to find an objective basis for the evaluation and criticism of institutions and practices. He is particularly struck by the suggestion that pragmatist epistemology, by emphasizing the communal character of inquiry and the need to take account of the experiences and contributions of other inquirers, provides a basis for a defence of democratic values (1993: 180–202). This may be related to Rorty’s suggestion that pragmatists insist upon the priority of democracy over philosophy (Rorty 1991b).

Another symptom of a pragmatist revival is found in the work of Robert Brandom. Brandom’s philosophical interests are rather different from those of the classical pragmatists, of whom he is quite critical (Brandom 2011), and who do not noticeably influence his work. His views owe more to philosophers such as Wilfrid Sellars and Quine, his teacher Richard Rorty, and historical readings in thinkers such as Kant and Hegel. As noted above, his concerns are mostly with semantics and the philosophy of language. By contrast to the representationalism deplored by many neopragmatists, he develops a version of inferentialist semantics in order to construct accounts of our use of words like ‘true’ and ‘refers to’ which are liberated from the idea that the function of thought and language is ‘to provide a transcript of reality’. The connection to pragmatism is that his approach to language is focused upon what we do with our practices of making assertions and challenging or evaluating the assertions of others. What constitutes an assertion is its normative pragmatics: it is the smallest unit of language for which we can take responsibility within a ‘game of giving and asking for reasons’. Logical relations are then explicated in terms of the entitlements to make further moves in this ‘language-game’, which flow from the commitments one has assumed through one’s previous assertions (Brandom 1994; Brandom 2000). Brandom also joins the pragmatists in denying that truth is a substantial metaphysical property that can be possessed by some propositions and not by others, and in seeking to reconstructing an account of reference which makes a difference in practice (his favored strategy is, broadly, explaining language-users’ capacity to perform anaphora). In (Brandom 2008) he goes further to discuss how different vocabularies understood pragmatically might be translated into— or reduced to— one another, thereby constructing an overall account of the relationship between ‘saying’ and ‘doing’ that he hopes will form a basis for reintegrating analytic and pragmatist philosophy.

Another notable recent foray into pragmatist-inspired normative pragmatics is found in the work of Jürgen Habermas, a philosopher from the Frankfurt School who has engaged with unparalleled breadth across the landscape of 20th century philosophy. He manages to combine analytic philosophers’ goal of systematically theorising language with a neo-Marxian and hermeneutic critique of modernity, whilst drawing on Mead’s pragmatist analysis of the self as irremediably social. His central concept of communicative action (Habermas 1981) is advocated as a foil to the instrumentalist rationality that he takes to be rampantly colonising the human ‘lifeworld’ in the West. The discourse ethics which he develops in order to scaffold an authentic communicative action that is free from the distortions of power and ideology owes much to pragmatism’s concept of the community of inquiry, although he is sceptical of Peirce’s inquiry-based analysis of truth as overly idealised (Habermas 2003). With major contributions in political philosophy, ethics, philosophy of law, aesthetics and philosophy of religion, amongst other areas, Habermas’ influence has reached far into the social sciences – something Dewey would likely have approved.

6. Pragmatism’s Contribution in Other Areas of Philosophy

6.1 Philosophy of Religion

We have noted that a strong motivation for James’ interest in pragmatism was exploring truth in religion. He drew on his dual training in philosophy and psychology for his famous book The Varieties of Religious Experience: a unique compendium of testimonies concerning matters such as prayer, worship and mystical experience. These rich personal observations present an extended example of the ‘radical empiricism’ introduced in 4.3. James thereby sought to trenchantly critique the intellectual methods of contemporary theology (‘the metaphysical monster which they offer to our worship is an absolutely worthless invention of the scholarly mind’ (James 1902: 447)). James also advanced a celebrated argument for religious faith in his paper “The Will to Believe”: that for questions that are living, forced and momentous (though only for those), ‘faith based on desire is certainly a lawful, and possibly an indispensable thing’. He thereby confronted his contemporary William Clifford’s evidentialist claim that, ‘It is wrong always, everywhere, and for anyone, to believe anything upon insufficient evidence’ (1877), generating a lively discussion which continues today (e.g. Bishop 2007; Aikin 2014).

Despite James’ efforts to tightly circumscribe his argument’s application, Peirce objected to such concessions in epistemology, calling the paper in a letter to James, ‘a very exaggerated utterance, such as injures a serious man very much’ (Misak 2013: 64). Peirce himself evolved from an early positivistic disdain for religious questions to producing his own theistic arguments in later life. In 1893, he published an essay entitled “Evolutionary Love”, which passionately contested the social Darwinism promulgated by many prominent thinkers in his era, most notably Herbert Spencer (Pearce 2020), which he called ‘The Gospel of Greed’. Here Peirce urges that amongst the three ways the Universe may unfold: (i) by chance, (ii) deterministically, (iii) through creative love, the third path is the highest and most likely to endure since ‘…growth comes only from love, from I will not say self-sacrifice, but from the ardent impulse to fulfill another’s highest impulse’ (CP 6.289). In his final years Peirce produced the remarkable essay “A Neglected Argument for the Reality of God”. Here he argued for God’s reality, not existence, to signal an ontological priority of intelligible principles over efficient causes. The piece is structured into three argumentative layers: (i) The Humble Argument (an invitation to a phenomenological experiment) which is enfolded by, (ii) The Neglected Argument (an original version of the Ontological Argument) which is enfolded by, (iii) The Scientific Argument (a prophecy of the fullness of future scientific inquiry). Work is ongoing to draw out this unique piece’s full meaning.

Dewey turned his hand to religious questions in his 1934 book A Common Faith. Here he argued that—contrary to what many believe—removing faith in supernatural entities will not destroy religion, but rather set it free from the many ‘creeds and cults’ reflecting outdated social structures that currently survive fossilised inside religious institutions. Rather than being embodied by any kind of entity, he argued, the sacred is a phase or quality of experience, namely, ‘some complex of conditions that have operated to affect an orientation in life…that brings with it a sense of security and peace’ (LW9:13). Such conditions might equally be found in a forest or art gallery as a church or temple. Despite its sophisticated argumentation and originality, as an explication of religious life Dewey’s approach has been considered abstract and somewhat anodyne.

6.2 Ethics

We’ve seen that philosophical pragmatism seeks to connect theory to practice. In ethics it can seem natural to interpret this as recommending that normative notions be reduced to practical utility. Thus James embraced utilitarian ethics as one of the branches of pragmatism (James 1907). Peirce, however, took a different view. Initially (around 1898) his naturalism led him to advocate a sentimentalism according to which ethical questions should be settled by instinct, as our conscious reasoning is too recently evolved and fallible to determine ‘vitally important matters’. But around 1902 he began to warm towards ethical theorising, as he developed a philosophical architectonic which placed ethics directly prior to logic, since ethics studies what is good in action, and logic studies what is good in thought, which is a species of action. He noted, though, that such a ‘normative science’ should be understood to study what goodness is, not whether particular actions are good (by contrast to much normative ethics today) since, ‘a science cannot have for its fundamental problem to distribute objects among categories of its own creation’ (CP 2.198). Recently scholars have turned with renewed interest to developing Peirce’s ethics (e.g. Massecar 2016; Atkins 2016).

A rich and systematic early contribution to pragmatist value theory was made by Alain Locke, who wrote, ‘the gravest problem of contemporary philosophy is how to ground some normative principle or criterion of objective validity for values without resort to dogmatism and absolutism on the intellectual plane, and without falling into their corollaries, on the plane of social behavior and action, of intolerance and mass coercion’ (Locke 1935: 336). Locke taught that the distinctive feeling-qualities that values give rise to in us are our ultimate guide in studying them, although function has an important secondary role to play. He held the resulting axiology to be pluralist, as well as culturally relativist.

Dewey also sought to steer ethics between the traditional poles of an objectivism derived from some kind of human-transcendent authority, and a subjectivism derived from individual preference. He believed that both views err in granting the moral agent an identity prior to interactions with others. For Dewey, we are more frail beings than this, embedded in a sociality that runs much deeper, and the purpose of moral theory is ultimately to provide constructive methods for addressing human problems of a particular kind: those in which we find ourselves unable to choose between equally valuable ends, with a dearth of salient habits with which to cross the breach. With regard to such questions, much effort is required to clear away traditional ethical theory’s pretensions to deliver a spurious settled certainty. Progress can be made by recognising the inherent uncertainty of moral problems and the complexities of moral experience (Hildebrand 2008: 73), and being willing to inquire anew in every moral context, drawing in data from a variety of scientific disciplines, in order to lay down new intelligent habits. The evolution of Dewey’s ethical thinking across his long career is richly explored in (Welchman 1995).

In recent decades, value theory has arguably been under-addressed by pragmatists, due to neopragmatism’s strong focus on philosophy of language and metaphilosophy. A notable recent attempt to develop a pragmatist metaethics drawing on classical pragmatism is (Heney 2016), which forms part of the so-called New Pragmatism.

6.3 Aesthetics

When (around 1902) Peirce defined ethics as a normative science directly prior to logic, he also defined aesthetics as a normative science directly prior to ethics (since aesthetics studies goodness in and of itself, which may then be used to understand good action). This focus on the intrinsically good or admirable broadens the purview of aesthetics, which Peirce claims ‘has been handicapped by the definition of it as the theory of beauty’ (CP 2.199, 1902). Aesthetics is one of the least well worked-out areas of Peirce’s philosophy; nevertheless he says some intriguing and suggestive things about it. For instance he argues that the so-called summum bonum (ultimate good) really consists in the growth of ‘concrete reasonableness’ (CP 1.602; 1.615; 2.34; 5.121; 5.433), as the only phenomenon ‘whose admirableness is not due to an ulterior reason’ must be the furthering of Reason itself (CP 1.615, 1903). Recent further development of this framework includes (Kaag 2014; Gava 2014).

James did not make sustained contributions to aesthetics, but Dewey did, particularly in his 1934 book Art as Experience. Dewey viewed aesthetic appreciation as a peak human experience and ‘the greatest intellectual achievement in the history of humanity’ (LW10:31, cited in Hildebrand 2008: 146). Consequently the most important question in this area of philosophy is not how to define necessary and sufficient conditions for Art, but how to enable ordinary people to enjoy more of it, so that their lives might be more meaningful. The way forward, Dewey suggested, is to learn to fetishize professionally-curated contexts and Art objects less, in order to open our eyes to consummatory experiences as they occur in the everyday experience of the ‘live creature’. Examples of such consummations include: ‘[a] piece of work is finished in a way that is satisfactory; a problem receives its solution; a game is played through…’ (LW10:42). In contrast to such integrated completions within experience, both hedonistic dissipation and rigid self-control count as ‘anesthetic’. True art alternates between doing and undergoing. Notable recent work building on Dewey’s aesthetics includes Richard Shusterman’s somaesthetics, which extends pragmatism’s defining interest in agency to exploring the complex role of the human body in aesthetic experience (Shusterman 1992; 2012).

6.4 Philosophy of Education

Peirce had some insightful things to say about pedagogy which anticipate today’s ‘inquiry-based learning’ and ‘research-led teaching’, but they are scattered across his writings (Strand 2005). The giant figure in philosophy of education is of course Dewey, who pioneered and established it as a separate sphere of study when he first assumed the chair in Philosophy at University of Chicago in 1894. Dewey’s career coincided with a period in which North America’s population was rapidly growing, industrializing and urbanizing, shifting education delivery out of the home into public institutions, and his ideas had enormous impact. Many of his suggestions derive from his vision of democracy as not merely a system of voting but the idea that every societal institution might be designed to foster maximum flourishing in every citizen. Viewed from this angle, traditional modes of schooling whereby teachers deliver an approved (often employer-sanctioned) set of facts for children to memorise count as despotic. Instead the emphasis should be on enabling children to grow from within, according to their present interests and capabilities, and become lifelong learners, although Dewey equally criticises certain romantic, ‘child-centred’ educational theorists of his day for neglecting to direct or guide the child’s interests in any particular direction (Hildebrand 2008: 127). It’s also worth noting that Dewey sees education as primarily a social not an individual process since, as noted above, he views human identity formation as irremediably social.

The result is a ‘problem-centred pedagogy’ which looks to pragmatist epistemology understood as the theory of inquiry for its structure. The teacher begins by facilitating contact with some phenomenon which proves genuinely puzzling to the students, then guides them through a cycle of inquiry which (if all goes well) resolves the problematic situation to the satisfaction of all present. This cycle of inquiry includes as stages: articulating the problem and questions which might need to be answered in its resolution, gathering data, suggesting hypotheses which might potentially resolve the problem, and testing or otherwise evaluating those hypotheses. Opening up the classroom to such ‘live’ thinking generates unpredictability which can be challenging for the teacher to manage, but if the genuine indeterminacy of the problematic situation can be successfully navigated, the reward will be students who have learned not just how to know, but how to think. In that regard, Dewey claimed that his writings on education summed up his entire philosophical position (Hildebrand 2008: 124). For Dewey, all philosophy was philosophy of education.


As well as identifying some of the primary texts of pragmatism and listing works referred to in the article, the bibliography also contains some books which can be studied to supplement the current article.

Primary Texts of the Classical Pragmatists

For both Peirce and Dewey, references are given to collections of their writings. This is because Peirce’s philosophical writings consist of a great number of papers and manuscripts and because Dewey wrote so many books that it would be impossible to list all of them.

  • Dewey, J., 1999. The Essential Dewey (two volumes edited by Hickman, L. and Alexander, T.), Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1999. (When possible, references to Dewey’s writings are given to this collection. They take the form ED n: m—to page m of volume n)
  • –––, 1981–91. John Dewey: The Later Works, Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press. (References to Dewey’s writings in this collection take the form LW n: m—to page m of volume n)
  • James, W., 1890. The Principles of Psychology, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1981.
  • –––, 1897. The Will to Believe and Other Popular Essays in Philosophy, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1979.
  • –––, 1902. The Varieties of Religious Experience, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1902.
  • –––, 1907. Pragmatism: A New Name for some Old Ways of Thinking, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1975.
  • –––, 1909. The Meaning of Truth, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1975.
  • Peirce, C.S., 1992 and 1999. The Essential Peirce (two volumes edited by the Peirce Edition Project), Bloomington: Indiana University Press. (References to Peirce’s writings in this collection take the form EPn: m—to page m of volume n)
  • –––, 1982–. Writings of Charles S. Peirce (a critical edition of Peirce’s entire oeuvre, arranged chronologically and edited by the Peirce Edition Project. So far 8 volumes have been released, covering the time-period up to 1892), Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • –––, 1976. New Elements of Mathematics ed. Eisele, C. (Peirce’s writings on mathematics and related topics: four volumes in five books), The Hague: Mouton, Humanities Press (reprinted in 2011 by De Gruyter).
  • –––, 1931–1958. Collected Papers, vol. 1–7 ed. Hartshorne, C., and Weiss, P., vol 8 ed. Burks, A.. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press. (References to Peirce’s writings in this collection take the form CPn.m—to paragraph m of volume n)

Collections of Papers by Classic and Contemporary Pragmatists.

  • Goodman, R. (ed.), 1995. Pragmatism, London: Routledge.
  • ––– (ed.), 2005. Pragmatism: Critical Concepts in Philosophy (four volumes covering: volume one: Pragmatism’s first decade; volume two: metaphysics and epistemology; volume three: moral and political issues; volume four: neopragmatism and aesthetics). London: Routledge.
  • Haack, S. and Lane, R. (eds.), 2006. Pragmatism, Old and New: Selected Writings, Amherst NY: Prometheus.
  • Menand, L. (ed.), 1998. Pragmatism, New York: Random House.
  • Stuhr, J.J. (ed.), 1999. Pragmatism and Classical American Philosophy: Essential Readings and Interpretive Essays, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Talisse, R. and Aikin, S. (eds.), 2011. The Pragmatism Reader: From Peirce through the Present, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Thayer, H.S. (ed.), 1982. Pragmatism: The Classic Writings, Hackett.

Other References and Supplementary Reading

  • Addams, J., 1990. Twenty Years at Hull-House, Chicago: University of Illinois Press.
  • –––, 2002. Democracy and Social Ethics, Chicago: University of Illinois Press.
  • Aikin, S., 2014. Evidentialism and the Will to Believe, London: Bloomsbury Publishing.
  • Alexander, T., 2013. The Human Eros: Eco-ontology and the Aesthetics of Existence, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Apel, K.O., 1974. “From Kant to Peirce: The Semiotical Transformation of Transcendental Logic”, in Kant’s Theory of Knowledge, L.W. Beck (ed.), Dordrecht: Springer, pp. 23–37.
  • Atkins, R.K., 2016. Peirce and the Conduct of Life: Sentiment and Instinct in Ethics and Religion, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bacon, M., 2012. Pragmatism, Oxford: Polity Press.
  • Baldwin, T., 2003. Cambridge History of Philosophy 1870–1945, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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