Autonomy in Moral and Political Philosophy

First published Mon Jul 28, 2003; substantive revision Mon Jun 29, 2020

Individual autonomy is an idea that is generally understood to refer to the capacity to be one’s own person, to live one’s life according to reasons and motives that are taken as one’s own and not the product of manipulative or distorting external forces, to be in this way independent. It is a central value in the Kantian tradition of moral philosophy but it is also given fundamental status in John Stuart Mill’s version of utilitarian liberalism (Kant 1785/1983, Mill 1859/1975, ch. III). Examination of the concept of autonomy also figures centrally in debates over education policy, biomedical ethics, various legal freedoms and rights (such as freedom of speech and the right to privacy), as well as moral and political theory more broadly. In the realm of moral theory, seeing autonomy as a central value can be contrasted with alternative frameworks such an ethic of care, utilitarianism of some kinds, and an ethic of virtue. Autonomy has traditionally been thought to connote independence and hence to reflect assumptions of individualism in both moral thinking and designations of political status. For this reason, certain philosophical movements, such as certain strains of feminism, have resisted seeing autonomy as a value (Jaggar 1983, chap. 3). However, in recent decades, theorists have increasingly tried to structure the concept so as to sever its ties to this brand of individualism.

In all such discussions the concept of autonomy is the focus of much controversy and debate, disputes which focus attention on the fundamentals of moral and political philosophy and the Enlightenment conception of the person more generally.

1. The Concept of Autonomy

In the western tradition, the view that individual autonomy is a basic moral and political value is very much a modern development. Putting moral weight on an individual’s ability to govern herself, independent of her place in a metaphysical order or her role in social structures and political institutions is very much the product of the modernist humanism of which much contemporary moral and political philosophy is an offshoot. (For historical discussions of autonomy, see Schneewind 1988, Swain 2016 and Rosich 2019). As such, it bears the weight of the controversies that this legacy has attracted. The idea that moral principles and obligations, as well as the legitimacy of political authority, should be grounded in the self-governing individual, considered apart from various contingencies of place, culture, and social relations, invites skeptics from several quarters. Autonomy, then, is very much at the vortex of the complex (re)consideration of modernity.

Put most simply, to be autonomous is to govern oneself, to be directed by considerations, desires, conditions, and characteristics that are not simply imposed externally upon one, but are part of what can somehow be considered one’s authentic self. Autonomy in this sense seems an irrefutable value, especially since its opposite — being guided by forces external to the self and which one cannot authentically embrace — seems to mark the height of oppression. But specifying more precisely the conditions of autonomy inevitably sparks controversy and invites skepticism about the claim that autonomy is an unqualified value for all people.

Autonomy plays various roles in theoretical accounts of persons, conceptions of moral obligation and responsibility, the justification of social policies and in numerous aspects of political theory. It forms the core of the Kantian conception of practical reason (see, e.g, Korsgaard 1996, Hill 1989) and, relatedly, connects to questions of moral responsibility (see Wolff 1970, 12–19). It is also seen as the aspect of persons that prevents or ought to prevent paternalistic interventions in their lives (Dworkin 1988, 121–29). It plays a role in education theory and policy, on some views specifying the core goal of liberal education generally (Gutmann 1987, Cuypers and Haji 2008; for discussion, see Brighouse 2000, 65–111). Also, despite many feminists’ reservations concerning the ideal of autonomy, it is sometimes seen as a valuable conceptual element in some feminist ideals, such as the identification and elimination of social conditions that victimize women and other (potentially) vulnerable people (Friedman 1997, Meyers 1987, Christman 1995. Veltman and Piper 2014)).

1.1 Basic Distinctions

Several distinctions must be made to zero in on the kind of autonomy that is of greatest interest to moral and political theory. “Moral autonomy” refers to the capacity to impose the (putatively objective) moral law on oneself, and, following Kant, it is claimed as a fundamental organizing principle of all morality (Hill 1989). On the other hand, what can be called “personal autonomy” is meant as a trait that individuals can exhibit relative to any aspects of their lives, not limited to questions of moral obligation (Dworkin 1988, 34–47).

Personal (or individual) autonomy should also be distinguished from freedom, although again, there are many renderings of these concepts, and certainly some conceptions of positive freedom will be equivalent to what is often meant by autonomy (Berlin 1969, 131–34). Generally, one can distinguish autonomy from freedom in that the latter concerns the ability to act, without external or internal constraints and also (on some conceptions) with sufficient resources and power to make one’s desires effective (Berlin 1969, Crocker 1980, MacCallum 1967). Autonomy concerns the independence and authenticity of the desires (values, emotions, etc.) that move one to act in the first place. Some distinguish autonomy from freedom by insisting that freedom concerns particular acts while autonomy is a more global notion, referring to states of a person (Dworkin 1988, 13–15, 19–20). But autonomy can be used to refer both to the global condition (autonomous personhood) and as a more local notion (autonomous relative to a particular trait, motive, value, or social condition). Addicted smokers for example are autonomous persons in a general sense but (for some) helplessly unable to control their behavior regarding this one activity (Christman 1989, 13–14; cf. Meyers 1987, 66–67).

In addition, we must keep separate the idea of basic autonomy, the minimal status of being responsible, independent and able to speak for oneself, from ideal autonomy, an achievement that serves as a goal to which we might aspire and according to which a person is maximally authentic and free of manipulative, self-distorting influences. Any plausible conceptualization of basic autonomy must, among other things, imply that most adults who are not suffering from debilitating pathologies or are under oppressive and constricting conditions count as autonomous. Autonomy as an ideal, on the other hand, may well be enjoyed by very few if any individuals, for it functions as a goal to be attained.

The reason to construe basic autonomy broadly enough to include most adults is that autonomy connects with other status designators which apply (or, it is claimed, should apply) in this sweeping manner. Autonomy is connected, for example, to moral and legal responsibility, on some views (e.g., Ripstein 1999); autonomous agency is seen as necessary (and for some sufficient) for the condition of equal political standing; moreover, being autonomous stands as a barrier to unchecked paternalism, both in the personal, informal spheres and in legal arenas (Feinberg 1986). Lacking autonomy, as young children do, is a condition which allows or invites sympathy, care, paternalism and possibly pity. Therefore, a guiding consideration in evaluating particular conceptions of autonomy (though hardly a hard and fast test) will be whether it connects properly to these ancillary judgments (for discussion of “formal conditions” of a concept of autonomy, see Dworkin 1988, 7–10).

1.2 Conceptual Variations

The variety of contexts in which the concept of autonomy functions has suggested to many that there are simply a number of different conceptions, and that the word simply refers to different elements in each of those contexts (Arpaly 2004). Others have claimed that while there may be a single over-arching concept of autonomy, we should think in terms of separable dimensions of it rather than an all or nothing idea (Mackenzei 2014 and Killmister 2017). Feinberg has claimed that there are at least four different meanings of “autonomy” in moral and political philosophy: the capacity to govern oneself, the actual condition of self-government, a personal ideal, and a set of rights expressive of one’s sovereignty over oneself (Feinberg 1989). One might argue that central to all of these uses is a conception of the person able to act, reflect, and choose on the basis of factors that are somehow her own (authentic in some sense). Nevertheless, it is clear that formulating a “theory” of the concept will involve more than merely uncovering the obscure details of the idea’s essence, for autonomy, like many concepts central to contentious moral or political debate is itself essentially contested. So a theory of autonomy is simply a conceptual model aimed at capturing the general sense of “self-rule” or “self-government” (ideas which obviously admit of their own vagaries) and which can be used to support principles or policies the theory attempts to justify.

The idea of self-rule contains two components: the independence of one’s deliberation and choice from manipulation by others, and the capacity to rule oneself (see Dworkin 1989, 61f and Arneson 1991). However, the ability to rule oneself will lie at the core of the concept, since a full account of that capability will surely entail the freedom from external manipulation characteristic of independence. Indeed, it could be claimed that independence per se has no fixed meaning or necessary connection with self-government unless we know what kinds of independence is required for self-rule (cf., however Raz 1986, 373–78).

Focusing, then, on the requirements of self rule, it can be claimed that to govern oneself one must be in a position to act competently based on desires (values, conditions, etc.) that are in some sense one’s own. This picks out the two families of conditions often proffered in conceptions of autonomy: competency conditions and authenticity conditions. Competency includes various capacities for rational thought, self-control, and freedom from debilitating pathologies, systematic self-deception, and so on. (Different accounts include different conditions: see, for example, Berofsky 1995, R. Young 1991, Haworth 1986, Meyers 1989.)

Authenticity conditions often include the capacity to reflect upon and endorse (or identify with) one’s desires, values, and so on. The most influential models of authenticity in this vein claim that autonomy requires second-order identification with first order desires. For Frankfurt, for instance, such second-order desires must actually have the structure of a volition: wanting that the first order desires issue in action, that they comprise one’s will. Moreover, such identification, on his view, must be “wholehearted” for the resulting action to count as free (autonomous).[1]

This overall approach to autonomy has been very influential, and several writers have developed variations of it and defended it against objections. The most prominent objections concern, on the one hand, the fatal ambiguities of the concept of “identification” and, on the other, the threat of an infinite regress of conditions. The first problem surrounds the different ways that one can be said to “identify” with a desire, each of which render the view conceptually suspect. Either one identifies with an aspect of oneself in the sense of simply acknowledging it (without judgment) or one identifies with a desire in an aspirational, approving sense of that term. In the first case, however, identification would clearly not be a consistent mark of autonomy, for one could easily identify as part of oneself any manner of addictive, constricting, or imposed aspects of one’s make-up. But approving of a trait is also problematic as a requirement of autonomy, for there are many perfectly authentic aspects of myself (ones for which I can and should be held fully responsible for example) which I do not fully approve of. I’m not perfect, but does that mean that I am thereby not autonomous? (Cf. Watson 1989, Berofsky 1995, 99–102).[2]

This model stresses internal self-reflection and procedural independence. However, the view includes no stipulations about the content of the desires, values, and so on, in virtue of which one is considered autonomous, specifically there is no requirement that one act from desires independently of others. Were there to be such a requirement, it would involve what is called “substantive independence”. Some writers have insisted that the autonomous person must enjoy substantive independence as well as procedural independence (e.g., Stoljar 2000, Benson 1987, 2005, Oshana 2006). The motivation for such a position is the idea a person under constrained life situations should not be considered autonomous no matter how “voluntary” (or autonomous) was the choice that put her in that position (cf. Meyers 2000). This claim, however, threatens to rob the attribution of autonomy of any claim to value neutrality it may otherwise carry, for if, conceptually, one is not autonomous when one (freely, rationally, without manipulation) chooses to enter conditions of severely limited choice, then the concept is reserved to only those lifestyles and value pursuits that are seen as acceptable from a particular political or theoretical point of view. I will return to this line of thought in a moment. In rejoinder, it has been claimed that such procedural neutrality could not capture the value autonomy has for people, and moreover, a “weakly substantive” view can be compatible with a political form of liberalism as long as the values inherent in the concept could be accepted by reasonable persons in an overlapping consensus (see Freyenhagen 2017).

One variation on the internal self-reflection model focuses on the importance of the personal history of the agent as an element of her autonomy (Christman 1991, Mele 1993; cf. Fisher & Ravizza 1998; cf. also Raz 1986, 371). On these views, the question of whether a person is autonomous at a time depends on the processes by which she came to be the way she is. It is not clear that such a focus will be able to avoid the problems raised about internal reflection models (see Mele 1991, Mackenzie & Stoljar 2000b, 16–17), but such a move attempts to embrace a conception of the self of self-government which is not only social but diachronically structured (see, e.g., Cuypers 2001).

For those who are wary of the postulate of reflective self endorsement, an alternative approach is to equate autonomy with simply a set of competences, such as the capacity to choose deliberatively, rationally, and, as Berofsky claims, “objectively” (see Berofsky 1995, Meyers 1989). This locates autonomy in the general capacity to respond to reasons, and not, for example, in acts of internal self-identification. However, even in these accounts, the capacity to think critically and reflectively is necessary for autonomy as one of the competences in question, even though the reflective thought required need not refer to external values or ideals (Berofsky 1995, ch. 5).

Further difficulties have been raised with the requirement of second order self-appraisal for autonomy. For it is unclear that such higher level judgments have any greater claim to authenticity than their first order cousins. Clearly if a person is manipulated or oppressed (and hence non-autonomous), it could well be that the reflective judgments she makes about herself are just as tainted by that oppression as are her ground-level decisions (Thalberg 1989, Friedman 1986, Meyers 1989, 25–41, Noggle 2005), and often our second order reflective voices are merely rationalizations and acts of self-deception rather than true and settled aspects of our character (for general discussion see the essays in Veltman and Piper 2014). This has led to the charge that models of autonomy which demand second-order endorsement merely introduce an infinite regress: for second-level judgments must be tested for their authenticity in the same way as first order desires are, but if that is so, then ever higher levels of endorsement would be called for. Various responses to this problem have been made, for the most part involving the addition of conditions concerning the manner in which such reflection must be made, for example that it must be free of certain distorting factors itself, it must reflect an adequate causal history, and the like (Christman 1991, Mele 1995).

Other aspects of the inner reflection model should be noted. As just mentioned, this view of autonomy is often stated as requiring critical self reflection (see, e.g., Haworth 1986). This has been understood as involving a rational appraisal of one’s desires, testing them for internal consistency, their relation to reliable beliefs, and the like. But an overly narrow concentration on rational assessment exposes such conceptions to charges of hyper intellectualism, painting a picture of the autonomous person as a cold, detached calculator (see Meyers 2004, 111–37). Connections to values, desires, and personal traits are often grounded in emotional and affective responses, ones connected with care, commitment, and relations to others (see Friedman 1998, MacKenzie & Stoljar 2000b, Meyers 1989, de Calleja, Mirja Perez 2019). For parallel reasons, some theorists have noted that concentration on only desires as the focal point of autonomy is overly narrow, as people can (fail to) exhibit self-government relative to a wide range of personal characteristics, such as values, physical traits, relations to others, and so on (see Double 1992, 66).

2. Autonomy in Moral Philosophy

Autonomy is central in certain moral frameworks, both as a model of the moral person — the feature of the person by virtue of which she is morally obligated — and as the aspect of persons which grounds others’ obligations to her or him. For Kant, the self-imposition of universal moral law is the ground of both moral obligation generally and the respect others owe to us (and we owe ourselves). In short, practical reason — our ability to use reasons to choose our own actions — presupposes that we understand ourselves as free. Freedom means lacking barriers to our action that are in any way external to our will, though it also requires that we utilize a law to guide our decisions, a law that can come to us only by an act of our own will (for further discussion see Hill 1989; for doubts about this reading, see Kleingeld and Willaschek 2019). This self-imposition of the moral law is autonomy. And since this law must have no content provided by sense or desire, or any other contingent aspect of our situation, it must be universal. Hence we have the (first formulation of the) Categorical Imperative, that by virtue of our being autonomous we must act only on those maxims that we can consistently will as a universal law.

The story continues, however: for the claim is that this capacity (to impose upon ourselves the moral law) is the ultimate source of all moral value — for to value anything (instrumentally or intrinsically) implies the ability to make value judgments generally, the most fundamental of which is the determination of what is morally valuable. Some theorists who are not (self-described) Kantians have made this inference central to their views of autonomy. Paul Benson, for example, has argued that being autonomous implies a measure of self-worth in that we must be in a position to trust our decision-making capacities to put ourselves in a position of responsibility (Benson 1994; cf. also Grovier 1993, Lehrer 1997, and Westlund 2014). But the Kantian position is that such self-regard is not a contingent psychological fact about us, but an unavoidable implication of the exercise of practical reason (cf. Taylor 2005).

So we owe to ourselves moral respect in virtue of our autonomy. But insofar as this capacity depends in no way on anything particular or contingent about ourselves, we owe similar respect to all other persons in virtue of their capacity. Hence (via the second formulation of the Categorical Imperative), we are obliged to act out of fundamental respect for other persons in virtue of their autonomy. In this way, autonomy serves as both a model of practical reason in the determination of moral obligation and as the feature of other persons deserving moral respect from us. (For further discussion, see Immanual Kant and moral philosophy.)

Recent discussions of Kantian autonomy have downplayed the transcendental nature of practical reason in this account (see, for example, Herman 1993 and Hill 1991). For example, Christine Korsgaard follows Kant in seeing our capacity for self-reflection as both the object of respect and the seat of normativity generally. On her view, we are all guided by what she calls a “practical identity”, a point of view which orients reflection on values and manifests an aspect of our self concept. But unlike Kant, Korsgaard argues that we have different practical identities that are the source of our normative commitments, and not all of them are of fundamental moral worth. But the most general of such identities — that which makes us members of a kingdom of ends — is our moral identity, which yields universal duties and obligations independent of contingent factors. Autonomy is the source of all obligations, whether moral or non-moral, since it is the capacity to impose upon ourselves, by virtue of our practical identities, obligations to act (Korsgaard 1996).

Traditional critiques of autonomy-based moral views, and Kant’s in particular, have been mounted along various lines. I mention two here, as they connect with issues concerning autonomy in social and political theory. The first concerns the way in which autonomy-based moral theory grounds obligation in our cognitive abilities rather than in our emotions and affective connections (see, e.g., Williams 1985, Stocker 1976). The claim is that Kantian morality leaves too little room for the kinds of emotional reactions that are constitutive of moral response in many situations: the obligations of parents for example concern not only what they do but the passions and care they bring forth in doing it. To view obligation as arising from autonomy but understanding autonomy in a purely cognitive manner makes such an account vulnerable to this kind of charge.

The difficulty this criticism points to resides in the ambiguities of the self-description that we might utilize in valuing our “humanity” — our capacity to obligate ourselves. For we can reflect upon our decision-making capacities and value this positively (and fundamentally) but regard that “self” engaging the capacity in different ways. The Kantian model of such a self is of a pure cognizer — a reflective agent engaged in practical reason. But also involved in decision-making are our passions — emotions, desires, felt commitments, senses of attraction and aversion, alienation and comfort. These are both the objects of our judgement and partly constitutive of them — to passionately embrace an option is different from cooly determining it to be best. Judgment is involved with all such passions when decisions are made. And it (judgment) need not be understood apart from them, but as an ability to engage in those actions whose passionate and reasoned support we muster up. So when the optimal decision for me is an impassioned one, I must value my ability to engage in the right passions, not merely in the ability to cold-heartedly reflect and choose. Putting the passions outside the scope of reasoned reflection, as merely an ancillary quality of the action — to consider how to do something not merely what we are doing — is to make one kind of decision. Putting passions inside that scope — saying that what it is right to do now is to act with a certain affect or passion — is another. When we generalize from our ability to make the latter sort of decisions, we must value not only the ability to weigh options and universalize them but also the ability to engage the right affect, emotion, etc. Therefore, we value ourselves and others as passionate reasoners not merely reasoners per se.

The implication of this observation is that in generalizing our judgments in the manner Korsgaard (following Kant) says we must, we need not commit ourselves to valuing only the cognitive capacities of humanity but also its (relatively) subjective elements.

A second question is this: since the reflection that is involved in autonomy (and which, according to this view, is the source of normativity) need only be hypothetical reflection upon one’s desires and mental capacities, then the question arises: under what conditions is this hypothetical reflection meant to take place? If the capacity for reflection is the seat of obligation, then we must ask if the conditions under which such hypothetical reflection takes place are idealized in any sense — if they are assumed to be reasonable for example. Are we considering merely the reflections the (actual) person would make were she to turn her attention to the question, no matter how unreasonable such reflections might be? If so, why should we think this grounds obligations? If we assume they are reasonable, then under some conditions moral obligations are not imposed by the actual self but rather by an idealized, more rational self. This implies that morality is not literally self-imposed if by “self” one means the actual set of judgments made by the agent in question. Indeed, a Platonist/realist about moral value could claim that the objective values which (according to the theory) apply to all agents independent of choice are in fact “self-imposed” in this idealized sense: they would be imposed were the person to reflect on the matter, acting as a perfectly reasonable agent. This shows the complex and potentially problematic implications of this ambiguity.

This points to the question of whether autonomy can be the seat of moral obligation and respect if autonomy is conceived in a purely procedural manner. If no substantive commitments or value orientations are included in the conceptual specification of autonomy, then it is unclear how this capacity grounds any particular substantive value commitments. On the other hand, if autonomy includes a specification of particular values in its conditions — that the autonomous person must value her own freedom for example — then it turns out that moral obligation (and respect) attaches only to those already committed in this way, and not more generally to all rational agents as such (as traditionally advertised by the view). This echoes, of course, Hegel’s critique of Kant.

These difficulties point to ambiguities in autonomy-based moral views, ones which may well be clarified in further developments of those theories. They also pick up on traditional problems with Kantian ethics (though there are many other such difficulties not mentioned here). Before leaving moral philosophy, we should consider ethical views which focus on autonomy but which do not depend directly on a Kantian framework.

2.1 Autonomy as an Object of Value

Autonomy can play a role in moral theory without that theory being fully Kantian in structure. For example, it is possible to argue that personal autonomy has intrinsic value independent of a fully worked out view of practical reason. Following John Stuart Mill, for example, one can claim that autonomy is “one of the elements of well-being” (Mill 1859/1975, ch. III). Viewing autonomy as an intrinsic value or as a constitutive element in personal well-being in this way opens the door to a generally consequentialist moral framework while paying heed to the importance of self-government to a fulfilling life (for discussion see Sumner 1996).

It may also be unclear why autonomy — viewed here as the capacity to reflect on and endorse one’s values, character and commitments — should have value independent of the results of exercising that capacity. Why is one person’s autonomy intrinsically valuable when she uses it to, say, harm herself or make rash or morally skewed choices? More generally, how can we take account of the systematic biases and distortions that plague typical human reasoning in valuing people’s capacity to make decisions for themselves (see, e.g., Conly 2013)? This question becomes more acute as we consider ways that autonomy can obtain in degrees, for then it is unclear why personal autonomy should be seen as equally valuable in persons who display different levels of it (or different levels of those abilities that are its conditions, such as rationality).

Indeed, autonomy is often cited as the ground of treating all individuals equally from a moral point of view. But if autonomy is not an all-or-nothing characteristic, this commitment to moral equality becomes problematic (Arneson 1999). It can be argued that insofar as the abilities required for autonomy, such as rational reflectiveness, competences in carrying out one’s decisions, and the like, vary across individuals (within or between species as well), then it is difficult to maintain that all autonomous beings have equal moral status or that their interests deserve the same weight in considering decisions that affect them.

The move that must be made here, I think, picks up on Korsgaard’s gloss on Kantianism and the argument that our reflective capacities ultimately ground our obligations to others and, in turn, others’ obligations to regard us as moral equals. Arneson argues, however, that people surely vary in this capacity as well — the ability to reflectively consider options and choose sensibly from among them. Recall what we said above concerning the ambiguities of Korsgaard’s account concerning the degree to which the self-reflection that grounds obligation is idealized at all. If it is, then it is not the everyday capacity to look within ourselves and make a choice that gives us moral status but the more rarified ability to do so rationally, in some full sense. But we surely vary in our ability to reach that ideal, so why should our autonomy be regarded as equally worthy?

The answer may be that our normative commitments do not arise from our actual capacities to reflect and to choose (though we must have such capacities to some minimal degree), but rather from the way in which we must view ourselves as having these capacities. We give special weight to our own present and past decisions, so that we continue on with projects and plans we make because (all other things being equal) we made them, they are ours, at least when we do them after some reflective deliberation. The pull that our own decisions have on our ongoing projects and actions can only be explained by the assumption that we confer status and value on decisions simply because we reflectively made them (perhaps, though, in light of external, objective considerations). This is an all-or-nothing capacity and hence may be enough to ground our equal status even if perhaps, in real life, we exercise this capacity to varying degrees.[3] Much has been written about conceptions of well being that rehearse these worries (see Sumner 1996, Griffin 1988). Such a view might be buttressed with the idea that the attribution of autonomous agency, and the respect that purportedly goes with it, is itself a normative stance, not a mere observation of how a person actually thinks and acts (for discussion of this position see Christman 2009, chap. 10 and Korsgaard 2014)

2.2 Autonomy and Paternalism

Autonomy is the aspect of persons that undue paternalism offends against. Paternalistic interventions can be both interpersonal (governed by social and moral norms) and a matter of policy (mediated by formal or legal rules). Such interventions are identified not by the kind of acts they involve but by the justification given for them, so that paternalism involves interference with a person’s actions or knowledge against that person’s will for the purpose of advancing that person’s good. Respect for autonomy is meant to prohibit such interventions because they involve a judgment that the person is not able to decide for herself how best to pursue her own good. Autonomy is the ability to so decide, so for the autonomous subject of such interventions paternalism involves a lack of respect for autonomy. See also Paternalism.

But as our discussion of the nature of autonomy indicated, it is often unclear exactly what that characteristic involves. Important in this context is whether autonomy can be manifested in degrees — whether the abilities and capacities that constitute autonomy obtain all at once or progressively, or I can enjoy sufficient autonomy in some areas of my life but not in others. If autonomy is a matter of degree in any of these ways, then it is unclear that a blanket prohibition against paternalism is warranted. Some people will be less able to judge for themselves what their own good is and hence be more susceptible to (justified) paternalistic intervention (Conly 2013; see also Killmister 2017, chap. 7).

Often such an obligation toward another person requires us to treat her as autonomous, independent of the extent to which she is so concerning the choice in question. At least this is the case when a person is autonomous above a certain threshold: she is an adult, not under the influence of debilitating factors, and so on. I might know that a person is to some degree under the sway of external pressures that are severely limiting her ability to govern her life and make independent choices. But as long as she has not lost the basic ability to reflectively consider her options and make choices, if I intervene against her will (for her own good), I show less respect for her as a person than if I allow her to make her own mistakes. (Which is not to say, of course, that intervention in such cases might not, in the end, be justified; only that something is lost when it is engaged in, and what is lost is a degree of interpersonal respect we owe each other.)

However, as we saw in the last section, this move depends on the determination of basic autonomy and an argument that such a threshold is non-arbitrary. Also relevant here is the question of procedural versus substantive autonomy as the ground of the prohibition of paternalism. For if by “autonomy” we mean the ability to govern oneself no matter how depraved or morally worthless are the options being exercised, it is unclear that the bar to paternalism (and respect for persons generally) retains its normative force. As I mentioned above, the response to this challenge must be that the decision making capacity itself is of non-derivative value, independent of the content of those decisions, at least if one wishes to avoid the difficulties of positing a substantive (and hence non-neutral) conception of autonomy as the basis for interpersonal respect.

This is merely a sampling of some of the central ways that the idea of autonomy figures in moral philosophy. Not discussed here are areas of applied ethics, for example in medical ethics, where respect for autonomy grounds such principles as that of informed consent. Such contexts illustrate the fundamental value that autonomy generally is thought to represent as expressive of one of the fundamentals of moral personhood.

3. Autonomy in Social and Political Philosophy

3.1 Autonomy and the Foundations of Liberalism

The conception of the autonomous person plays a variety of roles in various constructions of liberal political theory (for recent discussion, see, e.g., Coburn 2010, Christman 2015 and the essays in Christman and Anderson, eds. 2005). Principally, it serves as the model of the person whose perspective is used to formulate and justify political principles, as in social contract models of principles of justice (Rawls 1971). Also (and correspondingly) it serves as the model of the citizen whose basic interests are reflected in those principles, such as in the claim that basic liberties, opportunities, and other primary goods are fundamental to flourishing lives no matter what moral commitments, life plans, or other particulars of the person might obtain (Kymlicka 1989, 10–19, Waldron 1993: 155–6).[4] Moreover, autonomy is ascribed to persons (or projected as an ideal) in order to delineate and critique oppressive social conditions, liberation from which is considered a fundamental goal of justice (whether or not those critiques are described as within the liberal tradition or as a specific alternative to it) (cf. Keornahan 1999, Cornell 1998, Young 1990, Gould 1988; cf. also Hirschmann 2002, 1–29).

For our purposes here, liberalism refers generally to that approach to political power and social justice that determines principles of right (justice) prior to, and largely independent of, determination of conceptions of the good (though see Liberalism; see also Christman 2017, ch. 4). This implies that the liberal conception of justice, and the legitimation of political power more generally, can be specified and justified without crucial reference to controversial conceptions of value and moral principles (what Rawls calls “comprehensive moral conceptions” (Rawls 1993, 13–15). The fact of permanent pluralism of such moral conceptions is therefore central to liberalism.[5]

One manner in which debates concerning autonomy directly connect to controversies within and about liberalism concerns the role that state neutrality is to play in the justification and application of principles of justice. Neutrality is a controversial standard, of course, and the precise way in which liberal theory is committed to a requirement of neutrality is complex and controversial (see Raz 1986, 110–64, Waldron 1993, 143–67). The question to be asked here is whether the conception of autonomy utilized in liberal theories must itself attempt to be neutral concerning various conceptions of morality and value, or, alternatively, does the reliance on autonomy in the justification and specification of liberal theories of justice render them non-neutral simply because of this reliance (no matter how “neutral” the conception of autonomy utilized turns out to be) (Christman 2015).

Let us consider this first question and in so doing revisit the issue of whether the independence implicit in autonomy should best be conceived in a purely “procedural” manner or more substantively. Recall that some theorists view autonomy as requiring minimal competence (or rationality) along with authenticity, where the latter condition is fleshed out in terms of the capacity to reflectively accept motivational aspects of oneself. This view can be called “proceduralist” because it demands that the procedure by which a person comes to identify a desire (or trait) as her own is what is crucial in the determination of its authenticity and hence autonomy. This conception of autonomy is adopted, according to its defenders, because doing so is the only way to ensure that autonomy is neutral toward all conceptions of value and the good that reasonable adults may come to internalize (Dworkin 1989, Freyenhage 2017).

Critics of this view have pointed to cases where it is imagined that persons adopt what we all would call oppressive and overly restrictive life situations but in a way that meets the minimal conditions of autonomy on proceduralist accounts, so that on such accounts they count as autonomous because of the self-governing processes by which they entered such oppressive conditions. These critics argue that any conception of autonomy that ascribes that trait to such people is wrongly conceived (Benson 1987, MacKenzie & Stoljar 2001b and 2017, Waller 1993, and Oshana 1998). On the basis of such a judgment, they argue that normatively substantive conditions should be added to the requirements of autonomy, conditions such as the ability to recognize and follow certain moral or political norms (See Benson 1987, Wolf 1980; for criticism, see Berofsky 1995, ch. 7). This criticism suggests that considerations concerning the autonomous self cannot avoid questions of identity and hence whether the self of self-government can be understood independently of the (perhaps socially defined) values in terms of which people conceive of themselves; this is a subject to which we now turn.

3.2 Identity and Conceptions of the Self

Autonomy, as we have been describing it, certainly attaches paradigmatically to individual persons; it is not (in this usage) a property of groups or peoples. So the autonomy that grounds basic rights and which connects to moral responsibility, as this concept is thought to do, is assigned to persons without essential reference to other people, institutions, or traditions within which they may live and act. Critics claim, however, that such a view runs counter to the manner in which most of us (or all of us in some ways) define ourselves, and hence diverges problematically from the aspects of identity that motivate action, ground moral commitments, and by which people formulate life plans. Autonomy, it is argued, implies the ability to reflect wholly on oneself, to accept or reject one’s values, connections, and self-defining features, and change such elements of one’s life at will. But we are all not only deeply enmeshed in social relations and cultural patterns, we are also defined by such relations, some claim(Sandel 1982, 15–65). For example, we use language to engage in reflection but language is itself a social product and deeply tied to various cultural forms. In any number of ways we are constituted by factors that lie beyond our reflective control but which nonetheless structure our values, thoughts, and motivations (Taylor 1991, 33f; for discussion see Bell 1993, 24–54). To say that we are autonomous (and hence morally responsible, bear moral rights, etc.) only when we can step back from all such connections and critically appraise and possibly alter them flies in the face of these psychological and metaphysical realities.[6]

In a different manner, critics have claimed that the liberal conception of the person, reflected in standard models of autonomy, under-emphasizes the deep identity-constituting connections we have with gender, race, culture, and religion, among other things. Such “thick” identities are not central to the understanding of the self-governing person who, according to standard liberal models, is fully able to abstract from such elements of her self-concept and to either identify with or to reject such them. But such an ideal too narrowly valorizes the life of the cosmopolitan “man” — the world traveler who freely chooses whether to settle into this or that community, identify with this or that group, and so on (see Young 1991, Alcoff 2006 and Appiah 2010; for discussion, see Meyers, 2000b).

These challenges have also focused on the relation of the self to its culture (Margalit and Raz, 1990, Tamir 1993). What is at issue from a policy perspective is that emphasis on the individual’s self-government, with the cosmopolitan perspective that this entails, makes it difficult if not impossible to ground rights to the protection and internal self- government of traditional cultures themselves (Kymlicka, 1995). This is problematic in that it excludes from the direct protection of liberal policies those individuals and groups whose self-conceptions and value commitments are deeply constituted by cultural factors. Or, conversely, the assumption that the autonomous person is able to separate himself from all cultural commitments forestalls moves to provide state protection for cultural forms themselves, insofar as such state policies rest on the value of autonomy.

There have been many responses to these charges on behalf of a liberal outlook (e.g., Kymlicka, 1989, Gutman, 1985, Appiah 2005; for a general response to question of cultural identities see Kymlicka 1997). The most powerful response is that autonomy need not require that people be in a position to step away from all of their connections and values and to critically appraise them. Mere piecemeal reflection is all that is required. As Kymlicka puts it: “No particular task is set for us by society, and no particular cultural practice has authority that is beyond individual judgement and possible rejection” (Kymlicka, 1989:, 50).

There is a clarification that is needed in this exchange, however. For insofar as defenders of liberal principles (based on the value of autonomy) claim that all aspects of a person’s self-concept be subject to alteration in order to manifest autonomy, they needlessly exaggerate the commitments of the liberal position. For such a view is open to the charge that liberal conceptions fail to take seriously the permanent and unalterable aspects of the self and its social position (Young, 1990, 46). Our embodiment, for example, is often not something which we can alter other than marginally, and numerous other self-defining factors such as sexual orientation (for some), native language, culture and race, are not readily subject to our manipulation and transformation, even in a piecemeal manner. To say that we are heteronomous because of this is therefore deeply problematic. What must be claimed by the defender of autonomy-based liberalism is that the ability in question is to change those aspects of oneself from which one is deeply alienated (or with which one does not identify, etc.). For in those cases where, upon reflection, one experiences one’s body, culture, race, or sexuality as an external burden constricting one’s more settled and authentic nature, and still one cannot alter that factor, then one lacks autonomy relative to it (see Christman,2009 ch. 6). But if one feels fully at home within those unalterable parameters one does not lack autonomy because of that unalterability (for a different way of approach this issue see Mahmoud 2005 and Khader 2011).

3.3 Relational Autonomy

As we said, several writers have claimed that proceduralist accounts of autonomy would wrongly attribute autonomy to those whose restricted socialization and stultifying life conditions pressure them into internalizing oppressive values and norms, for example women who have internalized the belief in the social authority of husbands, or that only by having and raising children are their lives truly complete, and the like. If such women reflect on these values they may well endorse them, even if doing so is free of any specific reflection-inhibiting conditions. But such women surely lack autonomy, it is claimed; so only if autonomy includes a requirement that one be able to recognize basic value claims (such as the person’s own equal moral standing) will that concept be useful in describing the oppressive conditions of a patriarchal society (see, e.g., Oshana, 1998, Stoljar, 2000; for discussion see Christman 2009 chap. 8, Benson, 1990, Friedman, 2000, Meyers, 1987, 1989).[7]

These and related considerations have sparked some to develop an alternative conception of autonomy meant to replace allegedly overly individualistic notions. This replacement has been called “relational autonomy” (MacKenzie and Stoljar, 2000a). Spurred by feminist critiques of traditional conceptions of autonomy and rights (Nedelsky, 1989, Code, 1991), relational conceptions of autonomy stress the ineliminable role that relatedness plays in both persons’ self- conceptions, relative to which autonomy must be defined, and the dynamics of deliberation and reasoning. These views offer a provocative alternative to traditional models of the autonomous individual, but it must be made clear what position is being taken on the issue: on the one hand, relational accounts can be taken as resting on a non-individualist conception of the person and then claim that insofar as autonomy is self-government and the self is constituted by relations with others, then autonomy is relational; or these accounts may be understood as claiming that whatever selves turn out to be, autonomy fundamentally involves social relations rather than individual traits (Oshana, 2006). Some such views also waiver between claiming that social and personal relations play a crucial causal role in the development and enjoyment of autonomy and claiming that such relations constitute autonomy (for discussion see Mackenzie and Stoljar, 2000b, 21–26; for a recent overview, see Mackenzie 2014).

Another relational element to autonomy that has been developed connects social support and recognition of the person’s status to her capacities for self-trust, self-esteem, and self-respect. The core argument in these approaches is that autonomy requires the ability to act effectively on one’s own values (either as an individual or member of a social group), but that oppressive social conditions of various kinds threaten those abilities by removing one’s sense of self-confidence required for effective agency. Social recognition and/or support for this self-trusting status is required for the full enjoyment of these abilities (see Anderson and Honneth 2005, Grovier 1993, Benson 2005, McCleod and Sherwin 2005, and Westlund 2014).

These claims often are accompanied with a rejection of purportedly value-neutral, proceduralist accounts of autonomy, even those that attempt to accommodate a fully social conception of the self. One question that arises with relational views connected to self-trust in this way: why, exactly are such relations seen as conceptually constitutive of autonomy rather than contributory to it (and its development), where the self-confidence or self-trust in question is the core element to which these sorts of social relations are an important (albeit contingent) contributor. Another question to be considered arises from those cases where self-trust is established despite lack of social recognition, as when runaway slaves manage to heroically push on with their quest for freedom while facing violent denials from surrounding others (and surrounding social structures) that they enjoy the status of a full human being capable of authentic decision making. Finally, self-trust is not always merited: consider the brash teenager who insists on exercising social independence based on her unwarranted confidence in her abilities to make good judgments (see Mackenzie 2008, n. 36).

Nevertheless, these approaches have all importantly shifted philosophical attention concerning autonomy to the social and interpersonal dynamics that shape its enjoyment, connecting ideas about autonomy with broader issues of social justice, recognition, and social practices. This brings us back, then, to considerations of the liberal project and its potential limitations, where autonomy remains central.

3.4 Autonomy, Liberalism, and Perfectionism

As noted earlier, there are various versions of liberal political philosophy. All of them, however, are committed to a conception of political legitimacy in which political power and authority is justified only if such authority is acceptable to all citizens bound by it (see Rawls 1993, 144–50). This connects to a broader view of the foundations of value that at least some liberal theorists present as central to that tradition. That is the claim that values are valid for a person only if those values are or can be reasonably endorsed by the person in question. By extension, principles guiding the operation of institutions of social and political power — what Rawls calls the institutions of the basic structure (Rawls 1993, 258) — are legitimate only if they can be endorsed in this way by those subject to them. In this way, liberalism (in most of its forms) is committed to what some have called the “endorsement constraint” (Kymlicka 1989, 12f, R. Dworkin 2000, 216–18).

Models of autonomy considered above include a condition that mirrors this constraint, in that a person is autonomous relative to some action-guiding norm or value only if, upon critical reflection of that value, she identifies with it, approves of it, or does not feel deeply alienated from it. Combining this view with the endorsement constraint, liberalism carries the implication that autonomy is respected only when guiding values or principles in a society can be embraced in some way by those governed by them. This will connect directly to the liberal theory of legitimacy to be discussed below.

Perfectionists reject this set of claims. Perfectionism is the view that there are values valid for an individual or a population even when, from the subjective point of view of those agents or groups, that value is not endorsed or accepted (Wall 1998, Sumner 1996, 45–80, Hurka 1993, Sher 1997; see also Perfectionism). In short, it is the view that there are entirely objective values. While there are perfectionist liberals, this view generally resists the liberal claim that the autonomous acceptance of the central components of political principles is a necessary condition for the legitimacy of those principles. Moreover, perfectionists question the liberal commitment to neutrality in the formulation and application of political principles (Hurka 1993, 158–60).

Perfectionists specifically target the liberal connection between respect for autonomy and neutrality of political principles (Wall 1998, 125–204). For many, liberalism rests on the value of individual autonomy, but this reliance either assumes that respect for autonomy is merely one value among others in the liberal view, or autonomy has overriding value. In either case, however, neutrality is not supported. If autonomy is merely one value among others, for example, then there will clearly be times when state support of those other values will override respect for autonomy (paternalistic restrictions imposed to promote citizen safety, for example) (Sher 1997, 45–105, Hurka 1993, 158–60, Conly 2013). On the other hand, autonomy could be seen as an absolute constraint on the promotion of values, or, more plausibly, as a constitutive condition of the validity of all values for a person, as the endorsement constraint implies. Perfectionists reply, however, that this is itself a controversial value position, one that may not find unqualified general support (Hurka 1993, 148–52, Sher 1997, 58–60, Sumner 1996, 174–83; cf. Griffin 1986, 135– 36). To answer these objections, one must turn to consideration of the liberal principle of legitimacy. For the claim that liberals make concerning the limits of state promotion of the good — a limit set by respect for autonomy — depends heavily on their view about the ultimate ground of political power.

3.5 Autonomy and Political Liberalism

Liberalism is generally understood to arise historically out of the social contract tradition of political philosophy and hence rests on the idea of popular sovereignty. The concept of autonomy, then, figures centrally in at least one dominant strand in this tradition, the strand the runs through the work of Kant. The major alternative version of the liberal tradition sees popular sovereignty as basically a collective expression of rational choice and that the principles of the basic institutions of political power are merely instrumental in the maximization of aggregate citizen welfare (or, as with Mill, a constitutive element of welfare broadly considered).

But it is the Kantian brand of liberalism that places autonomy of persons at center stage. Rawls’s Theory of Justice was seen as the contemporary manifestation of this Kantian approach to justice, where justice was conceived as those principles that would be chosen under conditions of unbiased rational decision-making (from behind the veil of ignorance). The original position where such principles would be chosen was said by Rawls to mirror Kant’s Categorical Imperative. That is, it is a device in which persons can choose principles to impose upon themselves in a way which is independent of contingencies of social position, race, sex, or conception of the good (Rawls 1971, 221–27). But as is well known, the Kantian foundations of Rawls’s theory of justice rendered it vulnerable to the charge that it was inapplicable to those populations (all modern populations in fact) where deep moral pluralism abounds. For under such conditions, no theory of justice which rests on a metaphysically grounded conception of the person could claim full allegiance from members of a population whose deep diversity causes them to disagree about metaphysics itself, as well as about moral frameworks and conceptions of value related to it. For this reason, Rawls developed a new (or further developed) understanding of the foundations of his version of liberalism, a political conception (Rawls 1993).

Under political liberalism, autonomy of persons is postulated, not as a metaphysically grounded “fact” about moral personality or practical reason as such, but rather as one of several “device[s] of representation” under which diverse citizens can focus on the methods of derivation (such as the original position) for substantive principles of justice (Rawls 1999, 303–58). Justice is achieved only when an overlapping consensus among people moved by deeply divergent but reasonable comprehensive moral views can be attained, a consensus in which such citizens can affirm principles of justice from within those comprehensive views.

Political Liberalism shifts the focus from a philosophical conception of justice, formulated abstractly and meant to apply universally, to a practical conception of legitimacy where consensus is reached without pretension of deep metaphysical roots for the principles in question. More than merely a “modus vivendi” for the participating parties, justice must be affirmed in a way that finds a moral basis for all participating citizens, albeit from different frameworks of value and moral obligation. The operation of public reason, then, serves as the means by which such a consensus might be established, and hence public discussion and democratic institutions must be seen as a constitutive part of the justification of principles of justice rather than merely a mechanism for the collective determination of the social good.

But the role of autonomy in the specification of this picture should not be under- emphasized (or the controversies it invites ignored). For such a consensus counts as legitimate only when achieved under conditions of free and authentic affirmation of shared principles. Only if the citizens see themselves as fully able to reflectively endorse or reject such shared principles, and to do so competently and with adequate information and range of options, can the overlapping political consensus step beyond the purely strategic dynamics of a modus vivendi and ground legitimate institutions of political power.

Indeed, the assumption that all those subject to political authority enjoy the developed capacity to reflectively accept their life path and the values inherent in it invokes a level of idealization that belies the conditions of many victims of past and ongoing oppression. This virtually ensures that such structural conditions of society as racial domination, profound inequality of power, and patterns of exclusion of groups from equal standing in social space will be assumed away as irrelevant to the question of legitimacy (Mills 2005).

Therefore, social conditions that hamper the equal enjoyment of capacities to reflectively consider and (if necessary) reject principles of social justice, due, say, to extreme poverty, disability, ongoing injustice and inequality, or the like, restrict the establishment of just principles. Autonomy, then, insofar as that concept picks out the free reflective choice operating in the establishment of legitimacy, is basic to, and presupposed by, even such non-foundational (political) conceptions of justice.

Critics of political liberalism arise from several quarters. However, among the objections to it that focus on autonomy are those that question whether a political conception of legitimacy that rests on shared values can be sustained without the validity of those values being seen as somehow objective or fundamental, a position that clashes with the purported pluralism of political liberalism. Otherwise, citizens with deeply conflicting worldviews could not be expected to affirm the value of autonomy except as a mere modus vivendi (see, e.g., Wall 2009; cf. also Larmore 2008, 146–6). A line of response to this worry that could be pursued would be one that claimed that values that amount to autonomy (in some conceptualization of that idea) are already functional in the social structures and cultural practices of otherwise defensible democratic practices (as well as some critical projects that emphasize oppression and domination, as we saw above). This point raises the issue, to which we now turn, of the connection between autonomy, political liberalism, and democracy.

3.6 Autonomy, Justice and Democracy

In closing, we should add a word about the implications of political liberalism for the traditional division between liberal justice and democratic theory. I say “division” here, but different views of justice and democracy will convey very different conceptions of the relation between the two (see Christiano 1996, Lakoff 1996). But traditionally, liberal conceptions of justice have viewed democratic mechanisms of collective choice as essential but highly circumscribed by the constitutional provisions that principles of justice support. Individual rights and freedoms, equality before the law, and various privileges and protections associated with citizen autonomy are protected by principles of justice and hence not subject to democratic review, on this approach (Gutmann 1993).

However, liberal conceptions of justice have themselves evolved (in some strains at least) to include reference to collective discussion and debate (public reason) among the constitutive conditions of legitimacy. It could be claimed, then, that basic assumptions about citizens’ capacities for reflective deliberation and choice — autonomy — must be part of the background conditions against which an overlapping consensus or other sort of political agreement concerning principles of justice is to operate.

Some thinkers have made the connection between individual or “private” autonomy and collective or “public” legitimacy — prominent, most notably Habermas (Habermas 1994). On this view, legitimacy and justice cannot be established in advance through philosophical construction and argument, as was thought to be the case in natural law traditions in which classical social contract theory flourished and which is inherited (in different form) in contemporary perfectionist liberal views. Rather, justice amounts to that set of principles that are established in practice and rendered legitimate by the actual support of affected citizens (and their representatives) in a process of collective discourse and deliberation (see e.g., Fraser 1997, 11–40 and Young 2000). Systems of rights and protections (private, individual autonomy) will necessarily be protected in order to institutionalize frameworks of public deliberation (and, more specifically, legislation and constitutional interpretation) that render principles of social justice acceptable to all affected (in consultation with others) (Habermas 1994, 111).

This view of justice, if at all acceptable, provides an indirect defense of the protection of autonomy and, in particular, conceptualizing autonomy in a way that assumes reflective self- evaluation. For only if citizen participants in the public discourse that underlies justice are assumed to have (and provided the basic resources for having) capacities for competent self- reflection, can the public defense and discussion of competing conceptions of justice take place (cf. Gaus 1996, Parts II and III, Gaus 2011). Insofar as autonomy is necessary for a functioning democracy (considered very broadly), and the latter is a constitutive element of just political institutions, then autonomy must be seen as reflective self-appraisal (and, I would add, non-alienation from central aspects of one’s person) (see Cohen 2002, Richardson 2003, Christman 2015).

This approach to justice and autonomy, spelled out here in rough and general form, has certainly faced criticism. In particular, those theorists concerned with the multi-dimensional nature of social and cultural “difference” have stressed how the conception of the autonomous person assumed in such principles (as well as criteria for rational discourse and public deliberation) is a contestable ideal not internalized by all participants in contemporary political life (see, e.g., Brown 1995, Benhabib 1992). Others motivated by post-modern considerations concerning the nature of the self, rationality, language, and identity, are also suspicious of the manner in which the basic concepts operative in liberal theories of justice (“autonomy” for example) are understood as fixed, transparent, and without their own political presuppositions (see, e.g., Butler 1990; for general discussion see White 1990).

These charges are stated here much too generally to give an adequate response in this context. But the challenge remains for any theory of justice which rests on a presumption of the normative centrality of autonomy. To be plausible in a variously pluralistic social setting, one marked by ongoing histories of oppressive practices and institutions, such a view must avoid the twin evils of forcibly imposing a (reasonably) contested value on resistant citizens, on the one hand, and simply abandoning all normative conceptions of social order in favor of open ended struggle for power on the other. The view that individuals ought to be treated as, and given the resources to become, autonomous in one of the minimal senses outlined here will, I submit, be a central element in any political view that steers between the Scylla of oppressive forms of perfectionism and the Charybdis of interest-group power politics.


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Other Internet Resources

  • Autonomy, list of articles in the special issue (Vol. 20, No. 2, 2003) of Social Philosophy & Policy

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