Logic and Language in Early Chinese Philosophy

First published Tue Sep 13, 2016; substantive revision Mon Nov 14, 2022

While growing attention has been paid in recent years to the logical insights and contributions of philosophers of other major traditions of early China, particularly those of the School of Names, scholarship on early Chinese views on logic and language still tends to concentrate on the contributions of the school of Mohism, which played a central role in the debates of philosophers of all major schools of thought during China’s Warring States period (479–221 BCE). The Mohists helped to critically refine early Chinese conceptions of the content and function of logic and language in relation to their aspirations for developing a comprehensive ethical theory about the proper governance of the state and of the individual’s role within it. Arguably, much of the Mohists’ motivation for developing this theory should be credited to those whom the Mohists themselves identified as their philosophical adversaries or antagonists, and this point extends to the determination they exhibited in developing an explicit philosophical theory of logical reasoning. Among those adversaries were the followers of Confucius, whose appeals to authority and established traditions for the justification of ethical views the Mohists found objectionable, and the advocates of Daoism, whose views appeared to undermine the possibility of any invariable and objective standards for ethical conduct. But quite possibly a more compelling influence, at least in regards to the development of Mohist logic, sprang from the medley of thinkers and dialecticians who have traditionally been associated with the School of Names. While no explicit theory of logical reasoning is attributed to this school, the thinkers associated with it had a reputation for unexampled deftness in the practice of dialectics and argumentation, and are regarded by many scholars today as among early China’s most subtle practitioners of logic (Fung 2020a). On the other hand, these thinkers were also derided by their contemporaries, including by the Mohists, for their sophistry, for their dispositions to muddle and confuse, and for their apparent desire to obscure the proper use of language. Whether masters of logical reasoning or merely performers of fallacious dialectics, they were taken seriously enough by their opponents to be regarded as threats to the order, stability and harmony of society. The later Mohists, in particular, whose views on logic and language occupy the greater part of this entry, framed many of their own arguments in ways that are plausibly interpreted as responses to their views, and probably many of the later Mohists’ own logical and linguistic insights are owed to the very puzzles and frustrations they experienced in their efforts to supplant these views with the honest integrity of more rigorous and transpicuous ideas.

It is somewhat difficult to distinguish the Mohists’ logical insights from their views on language in part because they made no attempt at investigating formal logic independently of their interests in analyzing the semantics of the terms of language (ming, or “names”). They developed a clear theory of inference, and supported this theory with versions of basic principles we would recognize today as central to the study of logic, but argued that the rules governing inference are partly determined by the semantics of individual terms and terms in combination, as opposed to rules merely operating on an argument’s logical form. It is also difficult to distinguish the Mohists’ attempts at offering a descriptive account of the content and function of language from their normative views about the roles names should be expected to play if they are to contribute to the elevation of human character and proper conduct in society. These normative views were held more broadly in early China, and they are especially clear in the writings of Xunzi, a Confucian scholar of the late Warring States period who attempted to assimilate the key insights of the Mohists on language and logic into a general Confucian theory of ethics (Lin 2011). In Book 22 of the Xunzi (“Correct Naming”), he explains:

When with differences in expression and divergence in thought we communicate with each other, and different things are obscurely confounded in name or as objects, the noble and the base will not be clarified, the same and different will not be distinguished; in such cases intent will inevitably suffer from frustration and obstruction. Therefore the wise made for them apportionments and distinctions and instituted names to point out objects, in the first place in order to clarify noble and base, secondly to distinguish same and different. When noble and base are clarified, and same and different distinguished, intent is not hampered by failure to communicate and action does not suffer from frustration and obstruction. This is the purpose of having names. (tr. Graham 1989)

The presupposition here is that people cannot live together cooperatively or harmoniously if they cannot communicate with one another effectively—if they are inadvertently calling different things by the same names or the same things by different names. They will think they are agreeing or disagreeing with one another when they aren’t, and their intentions will be frustrated or blocked – notably, not by the conflict of wills that would result from ambition, greed or selfishness (which might be true apart from this), but by something more basic: the dumb incompetence of failing to use language properly. The solution, accordingly, is to determine the correct use of language, the proper conditions under which its terms are used. “Is this object a horse?” “Is this ruler a king?” As Xunzi indicates, part of the method here hinges on the descriptive program of comparing objects in question to others that are referred to by the same names and making judgments of similarity or difference. But Xunzi goes deeper. To make a judgment of similarity or difference, certain criteria must be used. But what, in turn, justifies these criteria? Xunzi insists that the analysis of language must also “clarify the noble and base,” and this seems intended as an answer to just this question; it explains why he identifies it as his first basic purpose in the analysis of terms. For only then is one in a position to undertake the second purpose of distinguishing the same and the different. That is, we know that a judgment of similarity or difference is correct when it distinguishes the noble from the base, the good from the bad. Xunzi’s prioritizing of these two basic purposes suggests that the ultimate aim of the investigation of language is to guide behavior, to serve the normative function of providing standards for clarifying communicative intentions in a way that establishes a justificatory framework for resolving ethical disputes. Such a view seems to have been held widely in early China; it is suggested in the Analects of Confucius in regards to the ordering of names, and it is clearly evident as a general orientation in the writings of the Mohists, who hoped that the analysis of language would help to reveal semantic distinctions relevant to proper ethical conduct. The result was an inevitable blending of disinterested analysis and definitional stipulation, insofar as it was held that language as a medium for human discourse must not be neutral with respect to ethical aims.

Given the great abundance of literature explicitly devoted to interpreting and reconstructing early Chinese views on language, it is impractical to attempt any exhaustive treatment here. To maintain common points of focus, attention will be restricted to those issues that appear to have obvious bearing on early Chinese philosophers’ interest in logic, specifically as it pertains to theories of reason and inference, generally construed. Our main questions are: How did early Chinese philosophers’ views about the content and function of language contribute to their understanding of logic as the study of valid or correct inference? Secondly, in what way did their logical investigations influence their views about language? Arguably, from the logician’s point of view, the greatest insights of early Chinese philosophers’ studies of logic and language are to be found in the later Mohists’ studies of intensionality, which appear to have influenced not only their specific theories on the efficacy of argumentation but also their core ideas about the nature and purpose of language. Further remarks address central points of disagreement the Mohists had with their Daoist critics, particularly as evident in the writings of Zhuangzi, and Xunzi’s reinterpretation of Mohist logic from the vantage point of his Confucian theory of ethics.

1. Background and General Considerations

It is generally recognized today that Chinese philosophy in its classical period was much more preoccupied with articulating and supporting philosophical positions through sustained rational discourse than was previously assumed. Part of the reason for this oversight in decades past was due to the loss or neglect of ancient texts critical to the understanding of early Chinese ideas on language and logic, particularly the writings of the later Mohists, who developed a sophisticated school of philosophical and scientific thought in the third century BCE, but whose writings were rediscovered by philologists only in the late Qing dynasty (1644–1912). In addition to meticulously developing scientific theories about geometry, mechanics, optics, and economics, the later Mohists also articulated detailed philosophical theories in areas we now recognize as logic, epistemology, metaphysics, and the philosophy of language. Their writings on language and logic are particularly noteworthy, since the later Mohists appeared to treat these disciplines as embodying a subject matter worthy of independent study, and they devoted more attention to issues about language and logic than any other school of thought of the same period. One finds in later Mohist writings, for instance, the only detailed exposition of bian (disputation), the style of argumentation or debate likely practiced in all major schools of thought in ancient China (Fraser 2013). The later Mohists aspired to become more proficient practitioners of bian by taking it more conscionably as an object of study, and carefully articulating, in the context of a general theory, the terms, rules, and methods for its practice.

A second reason for this oversight is in the fact that those writings of classical Chinese philosophers that did largely survive the vicissitudes of history—particularly the major works of Daoists like Zhuangzi and Laozi, but also those writings attributable to Confucius and his philosophical descendants—tend to embody what appear to be unfavorable appraisals of, or at least alternatives to, philosophical methods that rely heavily on suppositions about the power of discursive rationality at establishing true ethical, metaphysical, or scientific principles. Such methods take for granted the aptitude of the human intellect to logically deduce true, informative statements about particular objects, events, or states of affairs from general propositions, or establish correct generalizations by induction from particular instances, a practice less self-consciously avowed in most philosophical traditions in China that were (unlike Mohism) stimulated by centuries of well-established sociocultural practices. Arguably, much of the interest we see in the study of logic in early Western philosophy was stimulated by the supposition of a dichotomy between appearance and reality, which prompted philosophers to wonder whether judgments or theories about what appears to us do or do not correspond to the structure or content of a mind-independent, objective reality. The obvious case is Plato, whose analysis of Forms was inspired by the methods of Euclidean geometry with the intention that it be carried out in a realm of abstraction largely unimpeded by the diffuse and problematic content of sense experience. Aristotle lamented the fact that Plato’s methods suffered from limited applicability to the varieties of experiential phenomena, believing instead that the content of perception does not pose any special problems for the reliability of judgment, but he retained a fundamental interest in the theory of representation and hoped that his system of logic would provide proper normative standards for drawing inferences among the categories we use to identify things.

Most Chinese philosophers who lived after the unification of China in 221 BCE, which was largely dominated by Confucianism after a brief period of suppression initiated by the First Emperor Qin Shi Huang, do not appear to have had any special distrust of the content of the senses, or were not responding to those who did, and so were not compelled to view the veracity of representation as a problem of significance. Consequently, scholars have variously characterized Chinese philosophical thought in ways that contrast it with Western preoccupations with discursive rationality. It is common, for example, to view early Chinese philosophers as largely preoccupied with problems centering on the proper governance of society and how citizens ought to conduct themselves within it. As much as in any other major philosophical tradition, the early Chinese philosophers were concerned with questions about what kind of life is worth living and what things, circumstances, or actions are to be regarded as ultimately valuable. Their philosophical investigations led them to conceptualize ideals of right conduct, appropriate behavior, and social propriety (Hall and Ames 1987). But the methods they employed to establish these ideals tended to emphasize reasoning by example from the actions or conduct of key moral exemplars rather than deducing particular judgments of practical action from general principles. For this reason they were more preoccupied with identifying proper normative standards by which to judge the similarity or resemblance of a thing or action with that of a chosen standard. Arguably, this encouraged a conception of logic based mostly on methods of inductive, analogical reasoning, given their special concern with the problem of resemblance, and this view is borne out to a large extent in the Mohists’ more self-conscious appraisals of their own methodology and in the modes of reasoning they use to illustrate it (Yuan 2012; Fraser 2013).

Moreover, the Mohists’ term for reasoning or disputation, bian, appears in most other major philosophical texts of the Classical (or pre-Han) era, suggesting broad similarities in use. The term is generally understood to mean “distinguishing” or “drawing distinctions”, although in its more specific uses we find it variously understood as a process of conceptualizing similarities and differences, discriminating objects in acts of perception, appealing to normative linguistic standards for naming objects, and using the normative criteria of correct naming as a proper guide to action (Fraser 2013). At the heart of these uses there appears to be a basic preoccupation with the philosophical importance of identifying the similarities and differences of things and events, a process largely determined by cognitive skills associated with pattern recognition. Unlike Aristotle, however, whose methods of classifying things depended on assumptions about metaphysically real essences (independent of human agency), the early Chinese philosophers put the burden of correct discrimination at least partly on what they deemed to be appropriate normative standards, based on the efficacy with which they were thought to guide action. That is to say, which similarities and differences they thought were relevant depended on whether they were thought to guide action in a way that is consistent with general moral principles about right conduct. A central purpose of the ethical investigations of the Mohists, for example, was to identify general standards of judgment that would reliably and impartially guide action in a way that produces beneficial consequences, and they appealed to bian as the principal human faculty for determining how these standards would play out in specific cases. Practical reasoning was conceived as an ability to respond appropriately on the basis of inferences drawn by analogy from various preconceived exemplars or models of moral action. According to Book 4 of the Mozi:

Those in the world who perform tasks cannot do without models (fa) and standards. There is no one who can accomplish their task without models and standards. Even officers serving as generals or ministers, they all have models; even the hundred artisans performing their tasks, they too all have models.

On the other hand, the Mohists do not seem to have found any reason to doubt the assumption that this appeal to normative standards of discrimination (standards relevant to the efficacy of moral action) is still grounded in the identification of real similarities and differences among objects, patterns of experience or perception that could in principle be identified by any competent individual with dependable cognitive, perceptual, and linguistic capacities.

This way of summarizing the Mohist philosophical enterprise does leave unanswered important questions about the ultimate justification of ethical claims. Early Chinese thought does not provide an explicit distinction between fact and value, so it is a matter of controversy to determine which has epistemic priority in Mohist thought—the normative standards by which the correct uses of language guide behavior, or the evaluations of reason that are determined by our ability to ascertain real similarities and differences in perception and thought. This problem is perhaps less controversial in the interpretation of Confucian philosophy because the priority of normative standards in the Confucian program of ordering names is attested by clear examples. It is evident, for instance, in section 1B/8 of the Mencius, which acknowledges the admissibility of killing a wicked ruler in spite of the prohibition of regicide, on the premise that this ruler is not really a king (or does not warrant the name “king”). The Confucian view is that anyone who is a king ought to act like one; otherwise the name is unwarranted. Hence, correct naming is also a prescription for conduct.

One can appreciate, in this regard, why the Confucians insisted that the correct use of names is a matter for authority to decide, because only an appropriate authority can justify how one ought to act. This authority was assumed to be found in the forms of ritual propriety (li) that were the common ingredients of established traditions, or in the judgments or discretions of “virtuous gentlemen” or other exemplars of moral conduct, and in this regard was considered to be – if not universal – then at least constant, dependable and unifying. But the Mohists were skeptical, not hesitating to point out that tradition was not a strong enough criterion for proper action. They knew, for instance, that social practices vary and conflict dramatically across time and place; how can they all be “righteous”? Something independent of these practices had to decide to serve as an objective criterion of moral conduct. It is noteworthy that the Mohists themselves did appeal to an authority of sorts, in the abstract, quasi-godlike entity they referred to as Heaven (tian), which they deemed to be the most perfect moral agency. They referred to this agency as “Heaven’s intention” (tian zhi), believing that it could serve as the basis of an authority independent of the variable and opposing opinions and social practices of people. But in later Mohist writings, particularly the Mohist Canons, we find no mention of this agency, possibly because the Mohists found that their conception of it was not substantive enough to discriminate things at the level of philosophical precision that they sought to address. Whatever the case, they essentially divorced the justification of action from any authoritative individual or entity that would otherwise serve to establish it, and this raised new philosophical concerns about how the norms of conduct and language use were to be decided. Central to Mohist ethical thought are the principles of utility (an action is right depending on whether its consequences are useful) and universal love (the usefulness of an action is determined by the impartial beneficence it contributes to public welfare). So, according to the Mohists, the moral description of an action depends partly (indeed, largely) on whether it contributes to these ends, or whether these ends may be judged appropriately analogous to the consequences of the actions of a moral exemplar. But the judgment of similarity here may itself depend on preexisting normative standards of correct use independently of considerations of utility. Safe to say that since the Mohist Canons do not explicitly address the issue of convention in language, or its role in the justification of principles of naming, the Mohists were probably undecided on this point. Not until the philosophy of Xunzi do we find a clear consideration of this issue, but Xunzi avoids the hard questions it exposes by deferring to the more fastidious judgments of an intellectual elite.

It should be noted that those who rejected the Mohists’ views often concentrated their objections on the logical presuppositions of the Mohists’ methodology of disputation by pointing out counterexamples to the kinds of analogical inferences that the Mohists were inclined to take for granted. A.C. Graham, for instance, who did more than any other Western philosopher at reconstructing and analyzing Mohist philosophical doctrines about language and logic in the early decades following their rediscovery by Chinese philologists, nevertheless described the opposing Daoist philosophies (particularly as espoused in the Zhuangzi) as “anti-rational”, representative of an “assault on reason”, a “rejection”, and even “mockery”, of logic (Graham 1989). Yet some argue that a great many of the Daoist objections one finds in the Zhuangzi are motivated more by a general skepticism about the possibility of identifying invariable standards of discrimination in language than about ineradicable defects in the very human capacity for reason. One can be a skeptic, for instance, about the role of necessity in reference without having anything disparaging to say about our ability to evaluate the consistency of a theory on logical grounds or reject it by the method of reductio ad absurdum. A number of scholars have even claimed that Daoism, in particular, is not the anti-rational philosophy it has been taken to be, but in some ways an attempt at carrying the methods of reason to their ultimate limits, much as Wittgenstein in his Tractatus attempts to tease out the boundary of the sayable through sustained rational reflection. Zhuangzi, for all his skepticism about the utility of natural language as a medium for the representation of truth and inclinations towards mysticism, might nonetheless have still venerated reason, independently of language, as the principal mode of thought through which one is able to discern right conduct in accordance with the Dao (or Way). This view is controversial, but scholars have not been averse to it (cf. the general view of Wing-tsit Chan: “He is mystical, but at the same time he follows reason as the leading light”, 1963: 177), and there seems to be an increasing interest in its viability (e.g., Alt 1991). Evidence for it is considered in section 4 below.

It is clear that even if Daoism and other schools of thought positioned vis-à-vis Mohism in ancient China were in some sense “anti-rational” in orientation, their views were not developed in isolation but were in fact a consequence of prolonged social contact and interaction with Mohist philosophers, and so could not have developed without being amply informed by their opponents’ methods and views. This fact alone demands caution when making general statements about the logical and linguistic views of early Chinese philosophers working outside the Mohist tradition. One can easily discern an increasing sophistication in methods of disputation in traditions that did not exhibit a great interest in thematizing language and logic independently of other philosophical pursuits, and this should not surprise us given the tumultuous period in which these traditions developed and the contentious struggles of their adherents for varying positions of social status and privilege. Mengzi, for example, seeking to defend key ideas in Confucian thought, goes beyond his forebears in advancing views on the goodness of human nature by appealing to more sharply formulated premises about innate dispositions for feeling and moral judgment against those asserting that human nature is inherently neutral (2A6, and see Shun 1997 for an extensive analysis of argumentation in the Mencius text). By the time Xunzi enters the fray near the end of the Warring States period we find rebuttals to Mencian thought that dig deep into what it is to have a disposition, how dispositions inform the possibilities of human behavior, and how we ought to act in response to them (e.g., Xunzi, Book 23). Far from simply explaining his views, Xunzi marshals highly intelligible theories of semantics and reference in their defense, and he explicates these theories with punctilious definitions that are marked improvements over earlier formulations. According to Cua 1985, methods of disputation reach their highest point in the writings of Xunzi, who in no small way benefited from the standards of rigor that had emerged out of the ongoing disputes of his predecessors.

These developments notwithstanding, it is still important to recognize that the demise of Mohism following the Warring States period appears to have squelched philosophical interest in the study of language and logic mostly until modern times, when it was revived in 1894 the writings of Sun Yirang (Graham 2003 [1978]: 70–2). Matters are complicated by the fact that logic as a unique object of study or discipline disentangled from other philosophical pursuits was historically awakened in Chinese philosophical thought only after the introduction of Western philosophical notions and methods in the 16th and 17th centuries. The Jesuit scholar Matteo Ricci, who first arrived in China in 1583, brought more than Western science and literature; he introduced Euclid’s Elements to the Chinese and arranged a translation of it with the assistance of the Chinese scholar Xu Guangqi. For these reasons, considerable caution has to be exercised in any attempt to reconstruct the philosophical views of classical Chinese philosophers about language and logic, to avoid anachronistically imposing notions that were not part of their original philosophical programs (Garrett 1993). Debates surrounding these issues are very much alive today, with contemporary scholars of Chinese philosophy tending to fall on one or the other side of the general dispute about whether it is appropriate to utilize concepts, terms, distinctions, modes of expression, or methods of analysis that may have been of foreign origin to interpret the works of classical Chinese philosophers (see the entry comparative philosophy: Chinese and Western for further discussion).

It is indisputable that early Chinese philosophers of all major schools of thought were, at various points in their philosophical development, preoccupied to lesser and greater degrees with issues central to the philosophical studies of language and logic. However, whether they pursued these issues in ways that were similar to, or very different from, Western or other foreign orientations is a matter on which no general consensus has been reached. Common notions in the philosophical study of language include, for example, meaning, truth, reference, assertion, speech act, and propositional structure, notions that may or may not translate successfully into the vocabulary employed by early Chinese philosophers, given radical linguistic and cultural differences.

Likewise, logic, construed as the study of inference, may have to be conceived differently from traditional Western accounts, given early Chinese philosophers’ rather unique approach to reasoning about language as a normative guide to ethical judgment and action (for example, as based on the doctrine of the ordering of names). It is not at all clear that early Chinese philosophers had a conception of logic that involved the typical notions of truth, validity, entailment, consistency, and so forth. Normally, an inference is conceived as a rule-bound transition of some kind from one sentence-like structure—a proposition, statement, or sentence—to another, and is considered valid if it preserves truth. However, there is some dispute about whether early Chinese philosophers were preoccupied with truth as a semantic concept, and even whether they considered sentences to be units of linguistic significance. On the other hand, contemporary developments of logic have opened up new vistas in the study of ancient ideas. Our primary concern in logic need not be the preservation of truth, and different conceptions have been developed in which various conditions of satisfiability are employed, with “validity” appropriately redefined. Caveats such as these admonish us to be open to alternative accounts of logic when interpreting the views of early Chinese philosophers, and to exercise caution when representing these views in contemporary nomenclature.

Needless to say, any solution to this debate will have to remain open not only to research in the history of Chinese philosophy but also to advances in the general studies of language, logic, cognition and human nature. Given the universality of language and logic as human capacities or objects of use, can we assume that philosophers interested in these topics will invariably identify, uncover, or utilize analogous concepts, presuppositions, or methods, regardless of time, place, culture, or historical context, or that with conceptual advances in their understanding of these topics, their views will invariably converge? Answers to these questions will inform the methodologies involved in contemporary research on classical Chinese thought, by compelling us to interpret the writings of early Chinese philosophers from perspectives motivated by assumptions about either shared or divergent presuppositions, as the case may be.

2. Confucius and the Ordering of Names

The Mohists are generally credited with the first systematic study of language in ancient China, but the inspiration for putting language at the center of philosophical thought certainly comes from Confucius (551?–479? BCE). Against prevailing skepticism and apathy, Confucius insisted that the correct use of language is essential to the order and harmony of society, and that the conditions by which language is correctly used devolve upon determining how names (ming) designate objects, events, and actions. However, the correct use of names is not simply a matter of attaching labels to a preexisting domain of things independent of human affairs. That is, it is commonly recognized that Confucius viewed language as having not simply a descriptive function, but a fundamentally performative one as well. Attributing names to objects is not a matter of describing the world, but of influencing it in a way that causes certain modes of interaction and existence to be realized. One can do this poorly, contributing to the degradation of social relationships and one’s relationship with nature, or skillfully, in a way that contributes to social harmony and prosperity. The skillful use of language depends on the extent to which one’s use of it reflects a conscientious awareness of the meanings and values that are essential to acting effectively. This goes hand-in-hand with the realization that acting on behalf of these meanings and values is itself constitutive of the very relational efficacy one seeks to establish.

In understanding this performative aspect of language one can appreciate why Confucius held that the ordering of society must begin with the ordering of names. A famous exchange in the Analects explains:

“Were the Lord of Wey to turn the administration of his state over to you, what would be your first priority?” asked Zilu.

“Without question it would be to insure that names are used properly (zheng ming)”, replied the Master.

“Would you be as impractical as that?” responded Zilu. “What is it for names to be used properly anyway?”

“How you can be so dense!” replied Confucius. “An exemplary person (junzi) defers on matters he does not understand. When names are not used properly, language will not be used effectively; when language is not used effectively, matters will not be taken care of; when matters are not taken care of, the observance of ritual propriety (li) and the playing of music (yue) will not flourish; when the observance of ritual propriety and the playing of music do not flourish, the application of laws and punishment will not be on the mark; when the application of laws and punishments is not on the mark, the people will not know what to do with themselves. Thus, when the exemplary person puts a name to something, it can certainly be spoken, and when spoken it can certainly be acted upon. There is nothing careless in the attitude of the exemplary person toward what is said”. (Analects 13.3; tr. Ames and Rosemont 1998)

Scholars have often translated Confucius’ expression cheng ming as “rectification of names”, but this translation has been widely supplanted with “ordering of names” to more explicitly reflect the continuously dynamic and creative aspects of language use. Hall and Ames favor this latter translation, objecting to the former’s suggestion that the correct use of names is a matter of conforming to preexisting conventions of proper use, “rectifying” one’s behavior in light of these conventions. The moral dilemmas we face are context-dependent and continuously undergoing transformation, so effective moral action must be motivated by an awareness of these contexts and assume different courses where appropriate. Accordingly, while the Confucian ideal of moral conduct involves an unflagging respect for cultural institutions and the rituals embodied in them, it also requires “selectivity and creative synthesis”, and the recognition that “inherited wisdom and institutions must be constantly revamped to accommodate the shifting circumstances of an always unique world” (Hall and Ames 1987: 271–2).

Although this doctrine brought language to the forefront of philosophical inquiry, systematic debate on its function and proper use did not begin until the Mohists gained prominence as Confucianism’s chief adversary. Departing from Confucian orthodoxy, the Mohists endeavored to justify their ethical views independently of established customs on the basis of general principles, the articulation of which demanded a comprehensive theory of naming and reference.

3. Mohist Views on Logic and Language

The Later Mohist writings in which logic and language are provided the most extensive treatment are the entire four chapters of Book 10 and the first two chapters of Book 11 of the Mo Zi (chapters 40–5, collectively referred to as the Mohist Canons). The chapters of Book 10 are known by the titles Jing Shang (Canons I), Jing Xia (Canons II), Jing Shuo Shang (Expositions of the Canons I), and Jing Shuo Xia (Expositions of the Canons II). In Book 11, we have the Da Qu (Greater Selection) and the Xiao Qu (Lesser Selection). The text of the Canons leaves a great deal unsaid; there are missing segments and obvious textual errors, and interpretations of a number of critical passages have exhibited widespread disagreement. For convenience, this entry follows the widely recognized numbering system presented in Graham 2003 [1978], which pairs each Canon with its corresponding Exposition and identifies the passages from each pair by numbers prefixed with the letters A and B. (For instance, passage B40 of the Canons is from Canons II.) Graham’s work also reconstructs the Da Qu and the Xiao Qu into a single corpus entitled Names and Objects (NO) (Graham 2003 [1978]), although there is controversy in his reconstruction of the Da Qu as a single body of writing, given the fragmentary state of many of its key sections.

3.1 Basic Logical Notions

A great deal of scholarship on Mohist logic in the past 50 years has been devoted to explicating Mohist texts with the purpose of identifying basic similarities with Western logical notions or principles (e.g., Zong 2000), or arguing that among the Mohists’ basic aims was a program for developing a formal theoretical apparatus comparable to, say, Aristotle’s categorical logic or the elementary propositional logic of the Stoics (e.g, Zhang and Liu 2007). Alternatively, it has been claimed that embodied in the Mohists’ account of disputation (bian) was in fact a theory of logical analysis motivated by a desire to deduce particular, informative statements about the world from general propositions (Harbsmeier 1998). According to Harbsmeier, “The aim of logical analysis was to establish a correct description of the world”.

In spite of textual errors and incompleteness, there is no dearth of material in Mohist texts that is highly suggestive of these similarities. In developing their views on disputation from its logical roots, the Mohists appear to have made conscientious and regular use of logical operators that are commonly found in today’s propositional calculi, including conjunction (yu), disjunction (ruo), a variety of articles and verbs for negation (e.g., wu, fei, bu), and implication (variously indicated with ze, ran hou, and other devices). They gave special attention to quantificational notions, taking “no” or “none” (mo) as a primitive (or undefined) notion and in A43 defining “all” (jin) in terms of it: “All is none not being so” or, in modern notation, \(\forall x\varphi\ =_{\mathit{df}}\ \mathrm{N}x\mathord{\sim}\varphi\). Furthermore, in their Greater Selection (Da Qu), they use “all” to define “some”: “Some is not all” (NO5), quite possibly with the definition \(\exists x\varphi\ =_{\mathit{df}}\ \mathord{\sim}\forall x\mathord{\sim}\varphi \) in mind (although textual incompleteness warrants caution on this point; Robins 2010 translates it as “Some is not exhaustive”). They employed special terms for modality, using bi (necessity), for example, as an adverbial relation between two things, where one can be said to be the necessary complement of another (e.g., elder brother and younger brother). And some scholars have suggested that the Mohists took steps toward formalizing their logical views by conscientiously employing variables and other devices that are capable of functioning in the same grammatical role, such as indefinite and demonstrative pronouns (e.g., Liu and Zhang 2010). These views are plausible, but support for them is hampered by the fact that the texts do not present them in an organized fashion, but mention them variously in passing as other views more central to their theoretical program are developed.

3.2 Principles of Reason and Inference

Beyond these superficial similarities with the basic logical notions of contemporary formal-theoretical systems, there is a great deal of material in the Mohist Canons that is indisputably concerned with articulating logical principles, but whose interpretation is still highly debatable. Scholars have extrapolated from Mohists texts versions of principles common to Western systems of symbolic logic, such as basic rules of inference (modus ponens, modus tollens, hypothetical syllogism), necessary and sufficient conditions, the laws of non-contradiction and excluded middle, and reductio ad absurdum. Intriguingly, we also find what appears to be a formulation of the liar paradox, first attributed in the West to Eubulides in the 4th century BCE: “To claim that all saying contradicts itself is self-contradictory. Explained by: what he says himself” (B71). It is hard to believe that the Mohists had anything in mind here but a precise notion of logical inconsistency.

Observations such as these might encourage the view that the later Mohists were uncovering basic principles of reasoning that we all share, regardless of culture or history. For instance, using their stock examples of “ox” and “non-ox” for contrary terms, the Mohists assert of any general kind that

[o]ne calling it “ox” and the other “non-ox” is “contending over claims which are the converse of each other”,

and that

[s]uch being the case, they do not both fit the fact. (A74)

If these statements are really about converse claims, as Graham’s translation contends (e.g., “This is an ox”, and “This is a non-ox”), then the Mohists appear be to asserting something quite like a version of the principle of non-contradiction formulated in Aristotle’s Metaphysics, in which it is stated of any two contradictory propositions that they cannot both be true simultaneously (IV 6 1011b13–20, Kirwan 1993). Moreover, B35 appears to recognize that they cannot both be false (“To say that there is no winner in disputation necessarily does not fit the fact”), suggesting a version of the principle of excluded middle.

Still, it is hasty to assume any resemblance here amounts to an equivalence. Aristotle’s principles are grounded in a theory of predication that is anything but neutral with respect to the basic structure of a proposition. A categorical proposition has a subject-predicate structure that partly determines whether or not it is true, and this structure contributes to the explanation of the assertoric force of this proposition when asserted. There is no clear evidence that the Mohists were making a point here about truth, if truth is conceived as a semantic property of propositions that have a subject-predicate structure. Indeed, some scholars have rejected the idea that a subject-predicate structure is a necessary condition of sentences of even contemporary Chinese, let alone is classical forbear (e.g., Han 2009). Tiles and Yuan (2004) argue that the subject-predicate structure of Aristotle’s categorical propositions only makes sense against the backdrop of a classificatory system in which things are categorized in terms of genera and species, something absent in early Chinese philosophers’ emphasis on context-dependent relationships among things in varying fields of focus. That is, to assert “This is an ox” is not to identify a substance in terms of a species of things to which it belongs, but to make an association between one thing and other things with the same name according to a presupposed criterion or standard, which varies depending on the context in which the association is made. More fundamentally, A.C. Graham claims that the proposition was a philosophical discovery only of the later Mohists, with their earlier counterparts primarily interested in teasing out the philosophical implications of individual terms and their combinations in expressions (2003 [1978]). But in his view this discovery did not lead to an analysis of subject-predicate structure. Chad Hansen (1983) even rejects the view that early Chinese philosophers were concerned with articulating theories of truth, suggesting instead that their primary focus was on the pragmatic, behavior-guiding functions of language, and how these functions contribute to normative views about proper ethical discourse and conduct.

These important questions aside, it is clear that the Mohists had a primary interest in determining the conditions under which two or more objects may be regarded as the same (tong) or different (yi). Correlatively, they looked for conditions in which an object is admissibly characterized as of a certain kind. This prompted the Mohists to recognize names of different types, three in particular: unrestricted (da), classifying (lei), and private (si). In A78 the Mohists assert that “naming something ‘horse’ is classifying it”, and that “for ‘what is like the object’ we necessarily use this name”, indicating that the name ‘horse’ applies to a class of objects that are in some sense relevantly similar. By contrast, “naming someone ‘Zang’” (or, say, the proper name ‘Jack’) “is ‘private’”, a “name which stays confined to this object”. Names that are “private” refer to single individuals and no others. These two kinds of names are distinguished from the universal ‘thing’, of which the Mohists assert, “any object necessarily (bi) requires this name”.

With this, the Mohist art of disputation concentrates on pairs of complementary names (e.g., “ox” and “non-ox”) to determine which is admissibly applied to an object. Together, the two names in each pair partition all that exists into two mutually exclusive categories. Any given object is in one or the other category of each pair, but not both. Accordingly, the names of each pair cannot both “fit” the object, nor can it be the case that neither fits. It is in these terms that the Mohists recognized what we would identify as the principles of non-contradiction and excluded middle. Their primary interest is with naming and reference, and only consequentially are they drawn into reflections on meaning. In an act of reference, one’s utterance of “This is an ox” might be explained as the expression of a proposition in a speech act with assertoric force. But this explanation depends on a general theory about the relation between reference and meaning, something the Mohists did not explicitly investigate. Their increasing interest in how names combine into meaningful wholes may have put them on the verge of developing such a theory, but their focus remained mostly at the level of particular acts of naming and uses of words. This makes it an open question whether or to what extent the logical principles underwriting their specific views on reference, and their general theory of language, are adequately characterized in Aristotelian terms or in some other way.

Inference is commonly understood as a syntactic operation on the form of a sentence or assertion that preserves the semantic property of truth. Aristotle’s logic, in which validity is determined by an argument’s categorical form independently of the truth of its premises and the semantics of its terms, is an example. Like most other early Chinese philosophers, the Mohists do not appear to have conceived of valid inference in this way. Even as they gave increasing attention to matters of logical or grammatical form, they remained skeptical that different categories of form can be regarded as an invariable guide to meaning. In particular, they were consistently wary of assuming that the meaning of a sentence or complex is determined by the meanings of its constituent parts and their modes of combination. For this reason they maintained that valid inference is partly a semantic affair, hinging on our consideration of the idiosyncrasies of meanings in combination. So rather than developing a theory of inference strictly on the basis of appeals to logical or linguistic form, they instead sought to develop a viable classification of what they took to be valid inference patterns based on analogies in the semantics of terms in combination (see section 3.4 below).

This prioritizing of semantics over formal logic had the effect of encouraging a rather different conception of argumentation based mainly on patterns of analogical reasoning, which the Mohists referred to as bian. Fraser 2013 argues that bian is understood in classical Chinese texts with an assortment of meanings of different levels of generality. Broadly speaking, it refers to processes of reasoning and disputation, basic operations of cognition, and the means by which we acquire knowledge. But in its more specific use it involves correlating things based on their similarities and differences, and drawing conclusions from the distinctions thus established. Given that objects are found to resemble one another in different ways, we correlate them consistently only in virtue of a model or standard (fa), which the Mohists define in A70 of the Canons as “that in being like which something is so”. By ascertaining the resemblance relation between other objects and the standard, we apply the name consistently and identify a class. Thus, to answer the question of whether or not we should predicate of something x the name G, the Mohists would typically identify a model m (a particular object) for G, and then inquire whether x resembles the model. If it does, then they would assert “x is G” as a consequence.

The Mohist conception of valid inference may depart from many Western accounts in another way as well. Given their prevailing tendency to regard the action guiding significance of language as its principal function, the Mohists were likely compelled to think of the semantic property that is preserved in valid inference not simply in descriptive terms, but in normative ones as well. It is for this reason that scholars of early Chinese philosophy often prefer to translate the Chinese evaluative term ke as “admissibility”, as opposed to “truth”, since the Mohist conception of the correct use of a sentence was closely tied to presuppositions about proper social conduct. In this way, valid inference was construed as having complex justificatory import. For instance, in claiming that an action x is humane (ren) by its resemblance with the conduct of a sage, one is also providing justification for it as such, because one is asserting in the act of naming that it resembles the model for humane action, and resembling this model is the very condition that justifies calling it such. (Recall again that naming something is classifying it, such that for anything else that is like it one is obligated to use the same name.) Moreover, asserting that x is humane justifies the claim that it ought to be recognized as such, because the model which it resembles (in being a model) is the very justification for how the name ought to be used. Its resemblance carries with it the normative requirement that language users recognize it as such, for that is what would be expected of a language whose principal function is to guide behavior and encourage proper social conduct. Arguably, the English terms “admissible” and “inadmissible” come closer to capturing this notion than the more neutral terms “truth” and “falsehood”.

3.3 Methods of Application and Problems

Given this appeal to resemblance for valid inference, we can perhaps see why the Mohists’ semantical investigations took priority over the analysis of logical form. Determining whether x is G depends on whether it resembles the model m, but objects can resemble one another in different ways, and imperfectly. To use one of the Mohists’ own examples, a man may resemble the chosen standard of a “black man” because he has black hair, but we would not for that reason call him a black man. He would have to resemble the standard “in the appropriate way” (yi), as determined by a criterion (yin) (A95–7). Similarly, a square piece of wood resembles a carpenter’s T-square (taken as a model) in virtue of its squareness, not its being wood (B65). A horse is big not because its eyes are big, but because its body is, whereas it is blind because of its eyes, not its body (Xiao Qu [NO18]). The Mohists generally identify these criteria by appeal to discriminations directly evident in perception or based on ideas parasitic on acts of perception (such as the mental image of a square). But bian is more than just a term for the discriminatory acts of perception; it is about the business of naming objects in virtue of appropriate discriminations, and the application of a name cannot be regarded as correct without an appeal to its semantic content. This is less evident with simple terms like “horse” or “square”, whose practical applications are plain enough to preclude any conscious reflection on meanings. But it was surely at the forefront of the Mohists’ minds in their consideration of terms with abstract content and complex expressions, like “beneficence”, “utility”, and “universal love”.

For instance, a consequence of the Mohists’ doctrine of universal love is that “loving people” (ai ren) requires loving all people without exception, a criterion that is quantificationally different from that of “riding horses” (cheng ma), which requires only that a person ride at least one horse (Xiao Qu [NO17]). These expressions are similar grammatically, but the Mohists analyzed their quantificational content differently, something not given merely in the analysis of perception. So the Mohists’ research program was one of coordinating similarities and differences given in perception with divisions determined in the analyses of the semantics of terms. The result is the determination of criteria that fix the relations between objects and their chosen models (cf. A97). To be sure, questions abound in attempting to suitably refine these criteria to apply them consistently (the perceptual content of the world may be infinitely complex), but this is precisely what gave the Mohists’ philosophical research program its impetus. (For a fascinating essay on issues arising out of attempts at modeling in modern nomenclature Mohist conceptions of reasoning about yi, see Liu, Seligman, and van Benthem 2011.) For the Mohists, such practical concerns with the relations between names and objects superseded investigations into logical form.

On the other hand, while the analysis of logical form might not have been the Mohists’ primary theoretical concern, we should not take this to imply that their philosophical pursuits did not involve ample deductive reasoning. Lucas 2020 provides several examples of argumentative passages from Mohist texts that appear “almost ready made” for formalization and which are easily regimented in a way that demonstrates either their deductive validity or inductive soundness. Indeed, the Mohists seem to have presupposed as a paradigm of good reasoning a form of inference that is purely deductive. Note that the Mohists assert “x is G” as a consequence of x’s resemblance with the model m for G, but this only follows logically with the addition of a further general principle, something like “Anything x that resembles the model m for G is G”. This principle might not have been rendered explicit in their logical investigations, but their assertion that x is G does not follow without its presupposition or something logically equivalent to it, and they did make a distinguished place for quantifiers among their basic logical notions. So assuming that the model for G is m, the Mohists appear to have taken the following (or something equivalent to it) as a paradigmatic form of reasoning formally justifying the application of names to objects:

Anything resembling the model m for G is G.

Something x resembles m.

Therefore, something x is G.

This argument is deductively valid, and it seems highly improbable that the Mohists were not employing something like it in their assertions about the correct methodology for resolving disputes by bian. So, it would be highly misleading to say that the Mohists were simply not doing logic of the kind with which we are familiar today. That they were not formalizing a theory of logical form does not imply that they were not engaged in rigorously defending their views on the basis of principles that involve or presuppose valid deductive reasoning and other basic methods of logic. To be sure, that the Mohists did not articulate this pattern of reason explicitly could support the claim that their use of it was little more than a trivial exercise of our unconscious aptitude for deductive reason, and hence unwarranted as a distinctive feature of their philosophy. Even if this is true, however, its consistency with the text makes it not unlikely that they were on the verge of discovering it, for they did endeavor to provide analyses of linguistic form, which point in the direction of formalization, and with the apparent intention of testing theories about various patterns of inference (see section 3.4 below).

Going with this idea, it has been suggested that the Mohists did realize a distinction between predicates and singular terms in their classification of names: recall that in A78 lei refers to names that classify (they may be true or admissible of many things, like predicates), whereas si refers to names that are fixed to individual objects (like singular terms). When we add the Mohists’ third category, unrestricted (da), we have a set of names that Lucas (2020) identifies as corresponding to the three basic syntactic categories that are common to the notations of formal logic: individual variables (whose values may be unrestricted), predicates (whose values are determined extensionally by classes), and individual constants (or singular terms, whose values are fixed to individual objects). This gives us some liberty, at least, for thinking of simple Mohist statements in terms of the basic form of predication “\(F(a)\)”, and even for allowing for the use of quantifiers and variables, \(\forall x(\textit{F}x)\)and \(\exists x(\textit{F}x)\).

It was noted above that for the Mohists our capacity to correlate objects in various ways is exercised when we name particular objects and then apply these names to all objects that are analogous to them. We correlate objects consistently in virtue of a model fa (“that in being like which something is so”) (A70), and we identify a class from this model by ascertaining the resemblance relation between it and other objects. Indeed, according to Graham, by identifying an object as a “horse” based on its resemblance with the standard for horses, we are in effect treating the name ma (“horse”)

as an abbreviation of “something which is like the object”, the object being the particular for which the name is ordained. (2003 [1978]: 325)

Hence, on this interpretation, when the Mohists say you ma (“There is a horse”), or \(\exists x(\textit{Horse}(x))\), they are, in effect, making an assertion that the particular object to which they are referring is such that it correctly resembles the model for horses. (The term you would have been taken to imply existence.) That is to say,

There is an object x such that x resembles the model m for horses.

We can extend this idea to assertions of Classical Chinese of the form ‘F G ye’, which we gloss here as “All F are G”, or “F are G” (with F functioning as a generic quantifier). For example, taking the expression bai ma (“white horse”) to represent “any x that resembles the model \(m_1\) for white horse” and ma (“horse”) for “any x that resembles the model \(m_2\) for horse”, the basic form of the assertion “White horses are horses” would be:

Any x that resembles the model \(m_1\) for white horse resembles the model \(m_2\) for horse.

This seems to captures the Mohists’ view for basic nominal assertions, but there are problems with it, however. Resemblance is normally construed as a relation that is both reflexive and symmetric. Notice that the model \(m_1\) for white horse resembles itself, if \(\forall x(\textit{Resembles}(x,x))\) is assumed. In virtue of P2, the model \(m_1\) resembles the model \(m_2\). Since the color white is irrelevant to the criterion required for the resemblance to \(m_2\), it must be in virtue of its shape that \(m_1\) resembles \(m_2\). (Shape is a common example the Mohists use to distinguish horses when color is irrelevant.) But then, given symmetry,

\[ \forall x\forall y(\textit{Resembles}(x,y) \leftrightarrow \textit{Resembles}(y,x)), \]

\(m_2\) resembles \(m_1\), by the same criterion. This would warrant the conclusion that any model \(m_i\) that satisfies the requisite criterion of shape for “horse” would warrant the name “white horse”, regardless of its color. Hence, a model that is brown would warrant the name “white horse”.

These are undesirable consequences of this view, but they do follow on standard analyses of resemblance. Did the Mohists really intend it this way? More careful exegesis suggests probably not, but scholarship on Mohist thought has tended to gloss over semantic subtleties in failing to recognize that in Classical Chinese the term for resemblance (tong) is highly polysemous, with different meanings that the Mohists endeavored to distinguish (Fung 2020b). In A86–7 of the Canons the Mohists articulate four distinct senses of sameness or resemblance (tong), along with difference (yi), corresponding roughly to the notions of being identical, being the units of a whole or class, constituting the same object, and being of the same kind:

Sameness: Identical, as units, as together, as of a kind.

Note the inclusion of identity; the Mohists use tong variously much in the way the copula “is” functions in English. What is obvious from the explanations they provide of these terms is that, however much their stock illustrations appeal to acts of perception, the Mohists are using their technical term tong much more broadly than mere perceptual likeness. They include identity, as noted, as when two names refer to the same thing or have the same extension (gou “dog” and quan “canine” were typical examples). Moreover, not only may two horses appear alike perceptually (being of the same shape or having four legs), but a hand may be “the same as” Mozi (being a part of Mozi) or the same as another part of Mozi, the hardness and whiteness of a stone may be the same in partly constituting the same object (“as together”), and Mozi may be “the same as” a human (in that he is “of the kind” human). These examples make it evident, moreover, that tong was intended to cover both mereological and member-set relations (cf. Fraser 2007). Such relations are obviously not always symmetrical, and while there is no direct evidence that the Mohists were perplexed by the specific problem posed above, it is evident that their own definitions provided them with various means of response.

For purposes here, one way to do this is to adopt the generic notion of an admissible substitute, taking care to provide criteria of admissibility that is inclusive enough to capture the points in the analysis above. For instance, any white horse can stand as an admissible substitute for the model for “horse”, but it is not true that any horse can serve as an admissible substitute for “white horse”.

Any x that is an admissible substitute for the model \(m_1\) for F is an admissible substitute for the model \(m_2\) for G.

Why do some things count as admissible substitution instances but not others? More specifically, what is it in virtue of a thing that makes it “resemble” something else? The Mohists do give many illustrations of relevant criteria, making it evident that there are different kinds; shape, color, and function are common examples. As noted above, we judge the squareness of a piece of wood by the similarity of its shape with a carpenter’s T-square, and say that a horse is white because of its color, not its shape. We also judge that a horse is blind because its eyes are impaired in their function.

Indeed, given that the Mohists did not claim to provide an exhaustive list of these criteria, and that the text refers to them mainly by way of example (T-squares, blind horses), the door is open to the view that virtually anything can stand as a criterion of resemblance and may even be regarded as “appropriate” depending on the context of reference.

Mou (2016) argues that the Mohists identified these criteria through features of salience in variable fields of cognitive focus: an aspect of a thing can stand as a criterion of resemblance provided only that we, as language users, single it out either through an act of perception or through a mental act in which one’s attention is concentrated inward (such as on a mental image). Furthermore, this aspect may be used appropriately in that the judgments we make may be true or false depending on whether it is singled out in such an attentive act. For example, the judgment “A white horse is not a horse” may be deemed false if the salient aspect of our mental focus is on the “horse-ness” feature of each entity indicated (white horse and horse). But it may also be deemed true if the salient aspect is “whiteness”, since whiteness is a feature that may be true of some horses but not others.

Mou’s account situates this view in the context of an account of reference that requires two joint determinants in every referential act: (1) an undifferentiated semantic-whole that is referred to independently of any particular aspect or feature, and (2) a particular aspect or feature that is rendered salient by our faculties of attention. Mou argues that this dual-reference account provided the Mohists with the flexibility to determine the truth or falsehood of judgements variously by situating each determination in a context that arises out of the many – perhaps infinite – ways in which we can identify things. At the same time, this account was also intended to provide an objective ground for the determination of the truth of our judgments by requiring that reference (and correlatively our knowledge of the identities of objects) be determined in each act by a mind-independent whole from which any particular aspect is identified.

Whether or not the Mohists held anything like this dual-reference account, it is clear that which criteria the Mohists found relevant depended on what they found “appropriate” in comparisons of things, and the identification of these criteria was no doubt both a central part of the Mohists’ research program and a source of ongoing controversy in debates with their opponents. But given the subtlety with which the Mohists analyzed their key terms, they seem to have been increasingly sensitive to the worry that no exhaustive list is possible.

Moreover, they were aware that simple terms might have complex or polysemous meanings, and that the problems of analysis are compounded as terms are combined into larger expressions. As a result, it became increasingly evident that complex expressions of the same grammatical form can have different conditions of satisfaction. An example from the Lesser Selection (Xiao Qu) noted above comes from their analysis of the expressions “loving people” (ai ren) and “riding horses” (cheng ma):

Loving people requires loving all people without exception, only then is this called loving people. Not loving people does not require loving no people at all; it is (rather) not loving all people without exception, and by this it is called not loving people. Riding horses does not require riding all horses without exception; it is (rather) riding some horses, and by this it is called riding horses. But not riding horses does require riding no horses at all; only by this is it called not riding horses. These are cases in which something applies without exception in one case but not in the other. (Xiao Qu; tr. Graham 2003 [1978])

The Mohists are pointing out here that the predicate “loves people” is satisfied only by those who happen to love all people, whereas the predicate “rides horses” is satisfied by anyone who happens to ride at least one horse. By the same token, the predicate “does not love people” is satisfied by anyone who fails to love at least one person, whereas the predicate “does not ride horses” requires that one ride no horses at all. To take another example, the Mohists observe that the name for “both” (ju) works differently in combination with different names; we say “They both fight” (ju dou), but not “They both are two” (ju er). Again, while the name fu means “husband” on its own, its combination with yong yields the sense “brave man” (yong fu) without any reference to a husband, indicating that complex meanings are not necessarily mere products of their constituent parts (B3). Revelations such as these prompted what is aptly characterized as a linguistic turn in Mohist philosophy, as the Mohists concentrated their attention on language itself and the implications its grammatical forms have on the analysis of meaning.

3.4 The Mohist Linguistic Turn

The Mohist program was beset with two basic kinds of problems. First, in the domain of reference, the Mohists encountered difficulties in their method of “extending kinds”. This was the problem of identifying appropriate salience conditions in perception and thought to serve as criteria for naming the similar similarly and the different differently. Second, in the domain of meaning, they faced unexpected questions in their evaluations of the meanings of names in complex expressions, suggesting problems in extending their theory of reference from simple terms to complex expressions on the assumption that the latter are to be treated compositionally. One can see how the Mohists’ preference for reasoning by analogy, and the problems beleaguering their quest for certainty, would have encouraged them to adopt the same orientation with respect to the study of language itself, its grammatical forms and their implications for meaning. They turned their attention to the study of language in hopes that more sophisticated analyses of meaning would help resolve some of the problems afflicting their account of reference. But one would also expect the Mohists to remain apprehensive here about making general statements, just as they found was necessary in their analysis of reference, and this is exactly what we find in the later writings of the Canons, particularly in the Lesser Selection (Xiao Qu), the compilation most noteworthy for its novel insights in the study of language.

On the surface, the Mohist program for language is to put together an inventory of parallel linguistic constructions with the expectation that the logic implicated in their meanings will at least partly track their grammatical form. But the Mohists’ recognition that judgments about resemblance involve uncertainty convinced them that any method of disputation based on analogies in grammatical form is not inherently reliable. They explain:

Things have respects in which they are similar, yet it doesn’t follow that they are completely similar. Parallels between expressions are correct only up to a point. When things are “so”, there is that by which they are “so”. Their being “so” is the same, but that by which they are “so” isn’t necessarily the same. When people accept things, there is that by which they accept them. Their accepting them is the same, but that by which they accept them isn’t necessarily the same. Hence, expressions in analogies, parallelizing, “pulling”, and “pushing” become different as they proceed, become dangerous as they change direction, fail when taken too far, and separate from their root as they flow, and so one cannot be careless and cannot invariably use them. Thus statements have many methods, separate kinds of different reasons, and so one cannot look at only one side. (Lesser Selection [Xiao Qu])

The Mohists are crisscrossing here between reference and meaning, between the problems they observe in their analogical theory of naming and those they now identify in their theory of linguistic parallels. Presumably, the Mohist expression “being so” (ran) is a reference to “being of a certain kind”, and “that which makes it so” refers to the conditions under which a thing is admissibly considered to be of that kind. Recall the Mohist observation that objects may resemble one another but not be of the same kind, because they do not resemble one another “in the appropriate way”. Here the Mohists appear to be making the correlative point that two objects may be of the same kind (“their being ‘so’ is the same”), while the conditions that warrant their being treated as of the same kind are not necessarily the same. In the domain of meaning, the Mohists are making the same point: expressions in language may have the same grammatical form, but the conditions by which they are admissibly applied might be different.

The passage quoted above makes a passing reference to four techniques of disputation commonly recognized by the Mohists and their interlocutors. The four techniques are listed explicitly in the Lesser Selection with explanations:

Analogy (pi): “Bringing up other things and using them to clarify it”

Parallelizing (mou): “Comparing expressions and jointly proceeding”

Pulling (yuan): “Saying, ‘You are so. How is it that I alone cannot be so?’”

Pushing (tui): “On the grounds that what they don’t accept is the same as what they do accept, propose it”.

There is a great deal of controversy surrounding how these techniques are to be understood and what their relationship is. It has been argued that they comprise the steps of a single, complex inference procedure in which a claim is established. However, this view is difficult to justify because it requires supporting the claim that each step is somehow necessary, serving as an essential premise for the next. An easier and more commonly accepted view is that each technique may operate independently to establish a point. Yang (2020) argues that each serves to make an inference in its own right: the first two are used to infer in each case that a proposition is true, while the second two are used to infer in each case that a proposition is false. By contrast, Robins (2010) argues that each is an instance of the general method of reasoning by analogy that was common throughout most of early Chinese thought. The Mohists are clarifying four different ways in which this general method might be instantiated. The first two cover the domains of reference and meaning, as distinguished above. Analogy (pi) indicates the method of extending kinds, employing models of comparison in perception or thought by acts of reference to identify or explain what something is. Parallelizing (mou) is the Mohist extension of this idea into the world of linguistic forms. “Pushing” and “pulling” hint at the pragmatic circumstances in disputation in which one attempts to establish a claim on the basis of its analogy with claims the other side has already accepted.

Here we concentrate on the technique of parallelizing, arguably the Mohists’ most original contribution to early Chinese thought on disputation and logic. (For further discussion, see Yang 2020, Robins 2010 and 2012, and the entry Mohist Canons.) As their explanation suggests (“comparing expressions and jointly proceeding”, bi ci er ju xing), the Mohists treat parallelizing as a technique in which linguistic models of a certain grammatical form are utilized to make a comparative point about some other linguistic construction that is in doubt. For instance, the following statements have similar grammatical form:

White horses are horses; riding white horses is riding horses.

Black horses are horses; riding black horses is riding horses.

Jack is a person; loving Jack is loving a person.

Jill is a person; loving Jill is loving a person.

Each is a model that instantiates a common linguistic form. The Mohists do not give a symbolic representation of this form, but we can assume its recognition as a general kind in virtue of the parallelism in structure that the models collectively exhibit. Technically, each statement is a conjunction of two simpler statements (with no obvious conditional relationship indicated, which is sometimes assumed). So the general form seems to be:

(Form A)
(A is B) & (VA is VB),

where V is a verb combined with the noun phrases A and B to yield, in effect, two distinct nominalized infinitives. We call this “Form A” to represent a general kind, a kind of linguistic form commonly recognized in its instances. On the other hand, they are aware that instances of this form may fail as well. For example:

Robbers are people, [but] being without robbers is not being without people.

Robbers are people, [but] desiring to be without robbers is not desiring to be without people.

The Mohists put these latter examples in a different class, which we may identify as:

(Form B)
(A is B) & (VA is not VB)

The Mohist technique of parallelizing seeks to establish some other claim that might be doubted on the basis of its analogy with the proposed models. Consider the following statement constructed from the nominals “boat” and “wood”, and the verb “enter”:

A boat is wood, [but] entering a boat is not entering wood.

The Mohists treat this statement as admissible, thus classifying it under the general kind associated with Form B. This is “comparing expressions and jointly proceeding”, but the Mohists’ increasing sensitivity to semantic nuances led them to admonish caution about drawing inferences merely on the basis of form. Some inferences “proceed”, others don’t, regardless of obvious parallelisms. As a result, they appropriated individual cases in one way or another depending on how the semantics of their terms played out in combination. On the other hand, this careful attention to individual cases led them to a discovery of intensional contexts, arguably the most original contribution of the Mohists’ studies of language.

3.5 Investigations of Intensionality

The later Mohists may well have been the first in the world to attempt to furnish a systematic philosophical treatment of intensionality. An abundance of evidence suggests that they were aware of both the pervasiveness of intensional phenomena in natural language and the way in which these phenomena tend to frustrate the view that natural language meaning is essentially compositional in structure (Willman 2010). They were probably also aware not only of the distinction between intensions and extensions, but also of the way in which this distinction may be essential to the determination of the truth or admissibility of sentences involving intensional contexts. Moreover, they do not seem to have made any attempt to explain away these contexts in terms of basic semantic principles, by denying that they exist, or by asserting that they can be reduced to, or explained in terms of, other more philosophically admissible modes of expression. On the contrary, they not only embraced intensionality as a fundamental feature of language, but also attempted to exploit it for the purpose of advancing their philosophical views, particularly their views on ethics.

To be sure, the Mohists did not attempt to develop any rigorous notation for handling differences of logical form. But as noted in examples above, they were wary of assuming that sentences or expressions with the same grammatical form have analogous semantical representations. It is quite possibly from observations like these that the later Mohists were led to compare the satisfaction conditions of expressions obtained from the intersubstitution of co-referential terms and co-extensive predicates. They did so by utilizing what we would now identify as tests for intensionality. Many of these tests involved typical epistemic verbs, like “know”, “think of”, and “love”. For instance, in B40 of the Canons the Mohists claim that:

To assert the identity of knowing dogs and knowing canines is a mistake; to not do so is not a mistake.

This translation is but one of many that have variously interpreted the original text, and some scholars have claimed that the original is in need of textual emendation due to copyist errors in centuries past (e.g., He 1971 and Chen 1983; see also Zong 2000). However, it does make sense when we recognize that the Mohists spent a great deal of effort thinking about how the meanings of simple names vary in combination with others. According to A.C. Graham, the names gou (dog) and quan (canine) were the Mohists’ stock examples of terms that refer to the same thing, but which have slightly different senses, probably due to their individual etymologies. Contemporary philosophers of language might consider that the Mohists were on the verge of developing an ontology of mental states with these examples, thinking of the opacity of the context “knowing” as a consequence of potential failures of knowledge. Jack might know what a dog is, but he might not know what a canine is, regardless of the co-extension of “dog” and “canine”. But the Mohists were not likely thinking of language in any way as a window to the mind. There is no indication anywhere in Mohist literature suggesting that they were interested in developing a classification of mental states. Indeed, the Mohists weighed the consequences of comparing linguistic expressions involving not only those intensional verbs we usually associate with mental states, such as “know”, “think of”, “believe”, “love” and the like, but also apparently intensional contexts introduced by verbs having nothing obviously to do with the mind, and they provide no indications that they thought about distinguishing them.

In the Xiao Qu, for example, the Mohists give an intensional analysis of linguistic contexts involving the expressions “riding” (cheng), “entering” (ru), “abounding in” (duo), “being without” (wu), “serve” (shi), and even “killing” (sha). Their interest seems to have been primarily semantical, with the issue of compositionality at the forefront of their inquiries. They were concerned with whether or not ideographs in combination produced meaningful wholes that are properly analyzed as the sums of their constituent parts. Those not analyzable in this way were likely deemed idiomatic. Consider again the curious use of the phrase “entering wood” (ru mu) in the following line from NO15:

A boat is wood, but entering a boat is not entering wood.

The verb “entering” (ru) would not normally be considered to indicate an intensional context. Zhang and Liu (2007) analyze the complex expression ru mu (entering wood) as “going to die”, a meaning obviously surpassing the connotation of ru chuan (entering a boat), in this case signifying only the simple action of going into a boat. On the other hand, each of these expressions is identical in grammatical form, a fact again leading the Mohists to the conclusion that grammatical form can be deceptive and that any expression may be either an analyzable compound or an undifferentiable semantic whole.

It might be noted that the terms “boat” and “wood” are not co-extensive, and hence cannot be interchanged to test whether or not the context in which they occur is intensional. Yet while it is true that the Mohists recognized names of different scope (lei categorizes names that classify many things while si categorizes those that refer to just one), they were clearly not confined to conceiving expressions of the form “X is Y” as assertions of predication. As noted above, their concept of “sameness” (tong) was inclusive enough to accommodate a reading that in no way presupposes a failure of extension. For instance, a boat is wood in the sense that it is made up of wood, where “wood” is conceived not as a general kind, but as the very stuff of which the boat in question is made. This is likely what the Mohists had in mind with this example because the point they are making clearly turns on a comparison of the meanings of linguistic complexes (“entering a boat” and “entering wood”) and how the meanings of words change in virtue of the contexts in which they occur.

Moreover, intensionality is marked by tests other than the intersubstitution of co-referential terms, co-extensive predicates, or logically equivalent sentences. A context may be deemed intensional if it contains a phrase with a quantifier that allows for an “unspecific” reading (see the entry on intensional transitive verbs). For example, it may be true that Oedipus is seeking a member of his family, but not true that he is seeking Jocasta, in spite of the fact that Jocasta is a member of his family. For, there might be no family member in particular whom Oedipus is seeking. Something like this seems to be the point the Mohists are making with the following example:

Her younger brother is a handsome man, but loving her younger brother is not loving a handsome man.

The sparsity of grammatical marks for quantification in Classical Chinese does not require us to read the expression mei ren (“a handsome man”) in terms of the existentially quantified phrase “some x such that x is male and handsome”. But this only makes the Mohists’ point more glaring. If “loving a handsome man” (ai mei ren) may be taken to involve romantic attraction, and not just the kind of filial love that exists between family members, then we can see why the Mohists would consider this a failure of inference.

Similar points are made with regard to the remaining non-epistemic intensional transitive verbs. For example:

The father of huo is a human; and yet it does not follow from this that when huo serves his father, he is serving a human.

Evidence that the transitive verb shi (serve) is intensional comes from the expression “serving a human”, which was understood in terms of the behavior of a service worker, somebody who acts as a servant. Quite obviously this has nothing to do with states of mind (such as those involving failures of knowledge).

On the other hand, we feel rightly confused when the Mohists say:

Robbers are people … but killing robbers is not killing people.

The term “killing” is ordinarily thought of as an extensional verb. It is a matter of some controversy, but the Mohists apparently felt that the combination of the ideographs sha (killing) and dao ren (robbers) formed an idiom that was recognized as a distinct, unanalyzable unit of common speech, carrying with it connotations of justified execution. This was not discerned in the semantics of “killing people”, which probably more simply indicated an act of murder. Indeed, the Mohists explicitly prohibited the latter in connection with their espoused doctrine of universal love (cf. NO17 from Graham’s translation (2003 [1978])). Not unlike many Western philosophers, the Mohists seem to have felt that careful attention to semantical nuances can have an important bearing on moral issues.

That is to say, part of the Mohists’ interest in the analysis of language stems from a firm conviction that the semantical distinctions uncovered by careful analysis can help put to rest certain questions about the legitimacy of their basic moral beliefs. The Mohists insisted that proper conduct involves “loving all people without exception” (which implies opposing acts of murder), but they were also not opposed to the “justified execution” of those found guilty of serious crime. When questioned on grounds of inconsistency, they replied by pointing out that the endorsement of justified execution is not an inhumane act that compromises their stance on the value of loving all people. This might not have convinced many of their interlocutors that their doctrine of universal love is justified, but it would have put to rest the charge that they were being illogical, and in any case consistency would surely have been conceived as a mark of superiority over any of the views of their opponents incapable of withstanding comparable scrutiny.

4. Daoist Replies and Critique of Logic

While the kinds of semantic rules underlying the interpretation of our expressions in language might be heterogeneous, with no guarantee that assumptions about compositionality will hold, the Mohists nevertheless did not waver in their belief that the objects of experience exhibit real similarities and differences, and that the identification of these similarities and differences is what allows us to “distinguish the noble and the base” (ming gui jian, to use Xunzi’s phrase). Indeed, the central purpose of language is to guide behavior by clarifying how one should act, and this is done by distinguishing the noble and the base through the subtle analysis of similarities and differences. We take the actions of exemplary individuals as models, identify the criteria that distinguish them or their actions, and act accordingly in an analogous way. Sometimes these semantic analyses would reveal odd consequences; as noted above, “robbers are people, but killing robbers is not killing people”. But the Mohists were not in general averse to embracing such oddities, given their general conviction that the philosophical explication of meaning should follow normal conventions of use. In any case, they never abandoned the belief that an exhaustive analysis of semantic possibilities should render transparent real similarities and differences in the world in a way that provides a consistent, invariable guide for action. If the analysis of language can provide this, then confusion about how to act should be dispelled from society and people should be able to live together in harmony.

This claim that the analysis of language can provide a consistent guide for action is precisely what the Daoists targeted in their objections and the main focus of their philosophical skepticism. What is surprising is that Daoist skeptics like Zhuangzi do not reject the Mohists’ basic view that the world is populated by various kinds of objects with real similarities and differences. They agree, moreover, in their basic understanding of how objects undergo different forms of transformation in time; the Mohists even give us distinct terms to convey these differences. The difference is that, in Zhuangzi’s view, no matter how much analysis we undertake, or how finely we discriminate, our language will never secure enough traction in reality to provide us with a constant guide for action. Zhuangzi was so unsatisfied with the ongoing debates of his times that he was compelled to develop what he took to be a transcendent philosophical worldview not limited by the hope of resolving these debates through simple explications of semantic distinctions. Life is larger than what can be grasped by the human capacity for reason, and there are forms of intuitive knowledge or experience that cannot be explained by the crude implements of language.

There are stories in the Zhuangzi that attest to the perfected skills of wheelwrights, carpenters, and other artisans who lament the fact that they cannot express how they manage to perform their tasks so well. The self-description of wheelwright Pian is a good example:

I look at it from the point of view of my own work. When I chisel a wheel, if the blows of the mallet are too gentle, the chisel slides and won’t take hold. But if they’re too hard, it bites in and won’t budge. Not too gentle, not too hard—you can get it in your hand and feel it in your mind. You can’t put it into words, and yet there is a knack to it somehow. I can’t teach it to my son and he can’t learn it from me. So I’ve gone along for seventy years and at my age I am still chiseling wheels. When the men of old died they took with them the things that couldn’t be handed down. So what you are reading there must be nothing but the chaff and dregs of the men of old. (tr. Watson 1968: 152–3)

The reference to books at the end of this passage is striking. Zhuangzi claims to have an insight about the subtlety and facility of understanding that cannot be captured in written form, or even through oral discourse with appropriate demonstratives. The names of language discriminate meanings, but inevitably there is slippage in their coordination with objects.

This is most obviously apparent in Zhuangzi’s appeal to the indexical phenomena of language, which Zhuangzi used as a foil against the Mohists’ claim that the meanings of terms can reliably fix their designations. He seems to have in mind what we would understand by the term “indexical” today: a term whose designation is fixed not only by its meaning but also by facts about the conditions surrounding its utterance. Such facts are relevant to the determination of the shifting referents of pronouns (“I”, “you”), demonstratives (“this”, “that”), and spatial and temporal adverbs (“here”, “there”, “yesterday”, “now”, “before”), and Zhuangzi appeals to all of these in a variety of elliptical and argumentative contexts. His general view seems to be that different perspectives or standpoints involved in the utterances of terms have important bearings on how these terms are used and what they refer to. The so-called impure indexicals “this” (bi) and “that” (shi) (see the entry on indexicals), commonly used in Classical Chinese for naming objects (“This is a horse”, “That is an ox”), make the perspectivalism of Zhuangzi’s approach clear:

No thing is not that; no thing is not this. From that, it is not seen; from this it is known. Therefore it is said: That comes out of this; this goes along with that; which is to say, that and this are born simultaneously. (Zhuangzi 2/27–29; tr. Graham 1989)

Arguably, Zhuangzi is suggesting that reference is always keyed to a perspective that somehow rules out others. This would explain the conclusion that “that and this are born simultaneously”: the perspective one takes in calling an object “this” implies an alternative perspective in which another calls it “that”. “That” and “this” is a pair whose terms function in coordination. Zhuangzi is seeking a philosophical perspective that transcends all arbitrary dichotomies:

This too is that, that too is this. There they say “It’s this, it’s not” from one point of view, here we say “It’s this, it’s not” from another point of view. Are there really this and that? Or really no this and that? Where neither this nor that finds its opposite is called the axis of the Way. When once the axis is found at the center of the circle there is no limit to responding with either, on the one hand no limit to what is this, on the other no limit to what is not. Therefore I say, “The best means is illumination”. (Zhuangzi 2/29–31; tr. Graham 1989)

This point is made with demonstratives, which are among the most fickle of the indexicals of language, seemingly capable of referring to anything regardless of context. But we can appreciate the generalization Zhuangzi is hinting at when we consider again how the Mohists explained acts of reference. Recall that when the Mohists say “There is a horse” (you ma), they appear to be making a claim to the effect that a certain object x resembles the model m for horses. If they state this with the demonstrative bi (“this”), then they are making the further claim that some object x to which they stand in a certain relation (likely of perceptual acquaintance) resembles the model m for horses. Note also that the Mohists recognize that objects do not always resemble their standards exactly; sometimes it is only partial, in which case the object of reference must resemble it “in the appropriate way”, according to a criterion (yi). Presumably, this criterion identifies something salient in the comparison that remains consistent across linguistic contexts. Zhuangzi’s point would then amount to the claim that no salience conditions are ever invariable across linguistic contexts. The uniqueness of each act of reference undermines the possibility of identifying any contextually invariant rule, since the conditions of successful reference involve facts not only about the relations of names and objects but also about the relations of acquaintance one has with those objects. Indeed, given the great emphasis on indexicality in the Zhuangzi, some scholars have claimed that Zhuangzi holds the thesis that all language is indexical. This is a view that cannot be defended here; readers may consult Hansen 1992 for a lengthy treatment.

5. Xunzi’s Confucian Appropriation of Mohist Logic

Significantly more so than other major philosophers of the Warring States Period, the Mohists believed that proper ethical conduct, and the uses of language essential to its realization, could be determined by the ability of the common citizen to distinguish, independently of government authority and by rational means, real similarities and differences in the nuances of ethical action. Zhuangzi’s skeptical arguments called much of this belief into question, but left little in its place to placate the demands of effective governance and orderly rule. The Confucian philosopher Xunzi of the late Warring States Period sought to reestablish ethics on positive, constructive foundations, but without succumbing to the frustrating Daoist rejoinders that put so much of Mohism in doubt.

On the surface, Xunzi’s theories of logic and language resemble those of the Mohists, and he makes great use of the doctrines of the Mohist Canons to develop his own arguments. But underneath we find Confucian presuppositions that diverge radically from the Mohist paradigm. Zhuangzi seized on indexicality to make the case that names cannot be used invariably across linguistic contexts. Reacting to the problematic task of identifying impeccable salience conditions in perception or thought to determine how a name is to be used, Xunzi put Zhuangzi’s arguments to use to make the case that the correctness conditions of language, if there are to be any at all, must be determined by convention. Since these conventions are ultimately arbitrary, they cannot be established by the Mohists’ methods of discourse or argumentation. They have to be determined by authority, the rule of sage-kings who institute the conventions of language as they deem fit through the promotion of proper social conduct and the suppression of deviant behavior.

Xunzi thus reasserted the Confucian tradition of imposing order onto society through uncompromising but benevolent rule to ensure that the anarchy of moral discourse that abounds in its absence does not culminate in the deterioration of civil society. He held these views not merely because they offered a pragmatic solution to Zhuangzi’s radical skepticism, but also because they were consistent with his cynical view of human nature. Our nature is inherently corruptible and bad, incapable of sustaining civil order if left to itself, and therefore demands correction by the institutions of society. More generally, and quite against the convictions of his Daoist counterparts, Xunzi held that morality is an invention to control man’s nature, because nature itself, in its endless transformations and unpredictable spontaneity, cannot be relied on to constrain human passion sufficiently to maintain the requisites of social harmony.

In practice, Xunzi’s philosophical method follows much the same course as the Mohists’. He takes it upon himself to analyze the “purpose of having names”, the “evidence for assimilating and differentiating”, and the “basic requirements for instituting names” (Xunzi, Book 22). However, for Xunzi, reason must stop short of justifying what actions may serve as models for ethical conduct. The Mohists held that an action is admissible if it accords with general considerations of utility. This makes the justification of the action contingent on the circumstances surrounding the action’s consequences, whether they lead to the enrichment of society, and whether they contribute to the realization of the principle of universal love. Determining whether the action is justified thus prescribes the use of reason independently of judgments of authority. In Xunzi’s view, this appeal to utility implies a use of reason that his own ethics would forbid, because the actions of a sage are not to be justified by anything independently of their intrinsic moral authority. Since the customs instituted by the sage are essentially stipulated as models of appropriate conduct, reason plays no role in their identification as such to the common individual.

Notably, the hypostasization of the notion of a model of ethical conduct (fa) in early Chinese thought is largely a contribution of the Mohists, who used it liberally in place of the Confucian appeal to the authority of tradition. But Xunzi found little use for it except in reference to the very Confucian customs the Mohists attempted to supplant. Indeed, the reason of the common individual is out of place here because the ability to correctly identify these models is a talent requiring years of cultivation and mastery, which only the intellectual elites of society would be expected to attain. Proper conduct must be transmitted through education from these elites, ultimately from those in high office who have the benefit of a life of education in proper governance.

Such presuppositions have important ramifications in Xunzi’s theories of naming and reference. Acts of naming are decided not by reason, but by convention, and Xunzi attributes the authority to establish these conventions to the sage-kings of later antiquity:

As for the names established by the later kings, for names of punishments follow the Shang dynasty, for names of titles the Chou, for cultural names the ceremonies… (Xunzi, Book 22)

Common people are prohibited from questioning the mandates of linguistic conventions:

Hence hair-splitting wordings and invention of names on your own authority, to disorder correct names and put people in doubt and confusion, multiplying argument and litigation between persons, are to be pronounced the worst of subversions, to be condemned like the crime of falsifying tallies and measures. (Xunzi, Book 22)

Xunzi avoids one of his own subversions by restricting his task to figuring out how the conventions established by authority can serve as examples for the common citizen, and this requires (much as the Mohists thought) identifying the conditions by which one extends the names so designated to other objects or actions that are appropriately similar to them.

It is in this matter that our common reason plays its critical role, which Xunzi understands in terms of our capacity to use the evidence of perception to make appropriate discriminations. For example, one sees two shapes, one triangular, the other square. Nothing in this differentiation of patterns forces one to attribute the name “triangular” to the first and “square” to the second. A single name could just as well be used for all three and four sided polygons. However, the senses have the effect of encouraging a distinct name for each; they are “evidence” (yuan, causes, means) for assimilating and differentiating objects in language. For instance, one may regard the assertion “Mountains and abysses are level” as inadmissible (or false), because it is contradicted by our perception of the non-level relation of the two geographical objects. This is the case, for Xunzi, even though it is convention, in the final analysis, that determines how the terms “mountain” and “abyss” are to be used. Xunzi’s point is not that the analysis of meanings somehow fixes how the terms of language are to be used, but that when convention does “fix ahead” (qi) the meanings of these terms, one is to use the senses to determine whether the objects to which they refer are to be treated as the same or different.

Xunzi’s insistence that convention is at the bottom of all acts of naming gave him the liberty to favor simple, commonsense solutions to semantic puzzles that aroused such contention among the disputants of other schools. Recall that the Mohists argued that while robbers are people, it does not follow that “killing robbers is killing people”. Their aim, apparently, was to reconcile their utilitarian ethics with their doctrine of universal love. They regarded “loving all people” as compatible with the justified execution of criminals on the supposition that the phrase “killing robbers” (justified execution) was not “killing people” (murder), and hence not inconsistent with their ethics of “loving (all) people”. Xunzi, whose Confucian ethics were not challenged by this apparent inconsistency, remained unpersuaded by the Mohists’ odd appeal to the idiom. In his view, the assertion “Killing robbers is killing people” is analyzed compositionally in the same way as “Riding white horses is riding horses”, making it likewise admissible.

In rejecting the Mohists’ judgment on this point, Xunzi is not contesting the Mohists’ general theory of inference. He is only disputing its application in this case. While there is no evidence that Xunzi held that all complex meaning is strictly compositional, he was disinclined to take seriously the kinds of exceptions that the Mohists garnered for their ethical views. His preference seems to have been for a simpler theory that accommodates terms of whatever levels of generality are necessary for purposes of communicative clarity. The complex “killing people” is better analyzed compositionally if another simple term of appropriate generality (e.g., “murder”) is at hand to avoid the confusion:

If a single name is enough to communicate, make it single; if not, combine. (Xunzi, Book 22)

As a rule of thumb, single terms are more general than the complexes in which they occur:

If the single is nowhere in conflict with the combined, it is the more general; but general though it is, there is no harm in it. (Xunzi, Book 22)

No harm, that is, in terms of whatever levels of generality are necessary for communicative clarity (e.g., “bird”, “animal”), up to the broadest level of generality (“thing”). Like the Mohists, Xunzi’s theory of inference is based on the notion that a model must serve as a standard of resemblance: naming an object is like “measuring an unknown length by a footrule”. He was therefore inclined to draw inferences in much the same way. The assertion “x is an animal” is a valid inference from the claim “x resembles the model m for animal” on the assumption that anything resembling m is an animal.

Similarly, “A white horse is a horse” is a valid inference, in Xunzi’s view, from the claim:

The model \(m_1\) for “white horse” resembles the model \(m_2\) for “horse”.

Xunzi’s reference to this example in particular in Book 22 of the Xunzi is likely his response to the paradoxical statement “White horses are not horses”, famously asserted by the sophist Gongsun Long probably as a foil to the Mohists’ theories of naming and reference (Gongsun Long may himself have once been a Mohist; see the entry School of Names for further discussion). The inference works, presumably, because \(m_2\) serves as a model for “horse” irrespective of its color. Since color is not a relevant criterion of resemblance, “horse” functions as a term of greater generality.

In all of this, there is no disagreement with Mohist views. The disagreement arises in the analysis of particulars, which the Mohists felt could substantively determine the outcomes of ethical disputes. Given that convention lies at the bottom of all acts of naming, Xunzi abandons any supposition that semantics (or even reason, narrowly construed in the Mohists’ sense of disputation) can be the ground of ethics. On the other hand, Xunzi’s deference to authority leaves one to wonder what principles of reason an educated elite would use in determining why a given set of conventions in language are more appropriate than others. It can be assumed that their choices would not be completely arbitrary, but that they would be guided by the very faculties of discrimination in perception that the Mohists argued were at the foundations of our common reason. Indeed, much in spite of the admirable clarity with which he articulated his views on the role of language in ethical conduct, Xunzi leaves the reader with an unresolved tension between what he had hoped to accomplish in his own philosophical analyses and the mandates of those higher officials to whose authority he admonishes us to yield (see the entry Xunzi for further details).

6. Concluding Remarks

Among Chinese philosophical schools of the pre-Han era, it is the later Mohists who deserve the greatest credit for pioneering and systematizing the studies of language and logic. In the context of a general theoretical framework based on precisely formulated definitions, they developed a workable theory of analogical inference that was sensitive to the idiosyncratic semantic contributions of terms in combination. Awareness of the limitations of compositionality probably led them away from the development of a theory of logical forms, but it stimulated insights about intensional phenomena in language that prompted more sophisticated defenses of their ethical views, and encouraged a broad understanding of how language functions in communicative discourse that warrants ongoing consideration today. Xunzi may have reached a new height in the rigor and clarity with which he presented his logical and linguistic views, but he did not surpass his Mohist forebears in originality, seeking primarily to utilize their insights in support of a largely Confucian ethical agenda. While the Mohists were clearly aware of many of the limitations of their own methods of reasoning, they nevertheless retained the hope that a sophisticated analysis of language would reveal real similarities and differences in experience that would reliably guide ethical action. It is this general hope that was the focus of Daoist critics like Zhuangzi, who argued from radically perspectivalist assumptions that no language, however refined, is adequate to the task of providing consistent normative standards. Whether or not this claim is true is still a matter of debate, with scholars of Chinese philosophy today leaning one way or another on ancient conceptions of the roles of language and logic in human thought and action.


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  • Willman, Marshall D., 2010, “Logical Analysis and Later Mohist Logic: Some Comparative Reflections”, Comparative Philosophy, 1(1): 53–77. Reprinted in Mou, Bo (ed.), 2018, Chinese Philosophy: Critical Concepts in Philosophy, London: Routledge.
  • Yang, Wujin, 2020, “Reasoning: Pi, Mou, Yuan, Tui”, in Dao Companions to Chinese Philosophy (Volume 12: Dao Companion to Chinese Philosophy of Logic), Yiu-ming Fung (ed.), Cham: Springer Nature. doi.org/10.1007/978-3-030-29033-7_15
  • Yuan, Jinmei, 2012, “Analogical Propositions in Moist Texts”, Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 39(3): 404–423. doi:10.1111/j.1540-6253.2012.01730.x
  • Zhang, Chunpo and Jialong Zhang, 1997, “Logic and Language in Chinese Philosophy”, in Companion Encyclopedia of Asian Philosophy, Brian Carr (ed.), London: Routledge.
  • Zhang, Jialong and Fenrong Liu, 2007, “Some Thoughts on Mohist Logic”, in A Meeting of the Minds: Proceedings of the Workshop on Logic, Rationality and Interaction, Johan van Benthem, Shier Ju, and Frank Veltman (eds.), London: College Publications, 85–102.
  • Zong, Desheng, 2000, “Studies of Intensional Contexts in Mohist Writings”, Philosophy East and West, 50(2): 208–229.

General Surveys of Classical Chinese Thought

  • Feng, Yu-lan, 1952, A History of Chinese Philosophy, Vol. 1, Derk Bodde (trans.), Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Hansen, Chad, 1992, A Daoist Theory of Chinese Thought, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Nivison, David Shepherd, 1999, “The Classical Philosophical Writings”, in The Cambridge History of Ancient China, Michael Loewe and Edward L. Shaughnessy (eds.), New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Schwartz, Benjamin, 1985, The World of Thought in Ancient China, Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press.

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Marshall D. Willman <marshall.d.willman@outlook.com>

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