First published Wed Jan 10, 2001; substantive revision Thu May 18, 2023

Constitutionalism is the idea, often associated with the political theories of John Locke and the founders of the American republic, that government can and should be legally limited in its powers, and that its authority or legitimacy depends on its observing these limitations. This idea brings with it a host of vexing questions of interest not only to legal scholars, but to anyone keen to explore the legal and philosophical foundations of the state. How can a government be legally limited if law is the creation of government? Does this mean that a government can be ‘self-limiting’? Is this even possible? If not, then is there some way of avoiding this implication? If meaningful limitation is indeed to be possible, perhaps constitutional constraints must somehow be ‘entrenched’, that is, resistant to change or removal by those whose powers are constrained? Perhaps they must not only be entrenched, but enshrined in written rules. If so, how are these rules to be interpreted? In terms of their original, public meaning or the intentions of their authors, or in terms of the, possibly ever-developing, values and principles they express? How, in the end, one answers these questions depends crucially on how one conceives the nature, identity and authority of constitutions. Must a constitution establish a stable framework for the exercise of public power which is in some way fixed by factors like original public meaning or authorial intentions? Or can it be a living entity which grows and develops in tandem with changing political values and principles? These and other such questions are explored below.

1. Constitutionalism: a Minimal and a Rich Sense

In some minimal sense of the term, a constitution consists of a set of norms (rules, principles or values) creating, structuring, and possibly defining the limits of, government power or authority. Understood in this way, all states have constitutions and all states are constitutional states. Anything recognizable as a state must have some means of constituting and specifying the limits (or lack thereof) placed upon the three basic forms of government power: legislative power (making new laws), executive power (implementing laws) and judicial power (adjudicating disputes under laws).[1] Take the extreme case of an absolute sovereign, Rex, who combines unlimited power in all three domains. Suppose it is widely acknowledged that Rex has these powers, as well as the authority to exercise them at his pleasure. The constitution of this state might then be said to contain only one rule, which grants unlimited power to Rex. He is not legally answerable for the wisdom or morality of his decrees, nor is he bound by procedures, or any other kinds of limitations or requirements, in exercising his powers. Whatever Rex decrees is constitutionally valid.

When scholars talk of constitutionalism, however, they normally mean something that rules out Rex’s case. They mean not only that there are norms creating legislative, executive and judicial powers, but that these norms impose significant limits on those powers.[2] Often these limitations are in the form of civil rights against government, rights to things like free expression, association, equality and due process of law. But constitutional limits come in a variety of forms. They can concern such things as the scope of authority (e.g., in a federal system, provincial or state governments may have authority over health care and education while the federal government’s jurisdiction extends to national defence and transportation); the mechanisms used in exercising the relevant power (e.g., procedural requirements governing the form and manner of legislation); and of course civil rights (e.g., in a Charter or Bill of Rights). Constitutionalism in this richer sense of the term is the idea that government can/should be limited in its powers and that its authority depends on its observing these limitations. In this richer sense of the term, Rex’s society has not embraced constitutionalism because the rule conferring his powers impose no constitutional limits on them. Compare a second state in which Regina has all the powers possessed by Rex except that she lacks authority to legislate on matters concerning religion. Suppose further that Regina also lacks the power to implement, or to adjudicate on the basis of, any law which exceeds the scope of her legislative competence. We have here the seeds of constitutionalism as that notion has come to be understood in Western legal thought.

In discussing the history and nature of constitutionalism, a comparison is often drawn between Thomas Hobbes and John Locke who are thought to have defended, respectively, the notion of constitutionally unlimited sovereignty (e.g., Rex) versus that of sovereignty limited by the terms of a social contract containing substantive limitations (e.g., Regina).[3] But an equally good focal point is the English legal theorist John Austin who, like Hobbes, thought that the very notion of limited sovereignty is incoherent. For Austin, all law is the command of a sovereign person or body of persons, and so the notion that the sovereign could be limited by law requires a sovereign who is self-binding, who commands him/her/itself. But no one can command himself, except in some figurative sense, so the notion of limited sovereignty is, for Austin (and Hobbes), as incoherent as the idea of a square circle.[4] Though at one time this feature of Austin’s theory had some surface plausibility when applied to the British system of government, where Parliament was often said to be supreme and constitutionally unlimited,[5] it faces obvious difficulty when applied to most other constitutional democracies such as one finds in the United States, Canada, Mexico and Germany, where it is abundantly clear that the powers of government are legally limited by a constitution. Austin’s answer to this apparent weakness in his theory was to appeal to popular sovereignty, the idea that sovereign power ultimately resides in ‘the people’, that is, the population at large. Government bodies—e.g., Parliament, the President or the judiciary—can be limited by constitutional law, but the sovereign people remain unlimited in their powers to command. Whether this appeal to popular sovereignty provides Austin with an adequate means of dealing with constitutional democracies is questionable. For Austin’s sovereign is supposed to be a determinate individual or group of individuals whose commands to the bulk of the population constitute law. But if we identify the commanders with the people themselves, then we seem inexorably led to the paradoxical result identified by H.L.A. Hart—the commanders are commanding the commanders. In short, we lapse into incoherence (Hart 1994, 73–78; Austin 1995, Lecture VI).

2. Sovereign versus Government

Though there are serious difficulties inherent in Austin’s attempt to make sense of the people’s ultimate sovereignty, his account, with all its weaknesses, does reveal the need to distinguish between two different concepts: sovereignty and government. Roughly speaking, we might define sovereignty as the possession of supreme (and possibly unlimited) normative power and authority over some domain, and government as those persons or institutions through whom that sovereignty is exercised. Once some such distinction is drawn, we see immediately that sovereignty might lie somewhere other than with the government and those who exercise the powers of government. And once this implication is accepted, we can coherently go on to speak of limited government coupled with unlimited sovereignty. Arguably this is what one should say about constitutional democracies where the people’s sovereign authority is thought to be ultimate and unlimited but the government bodies—e.g., legislatures, Presidents and courts—through whom that sovereignty is exercised on the people’s behalf are constitutionally limited and subordinate. As Locke might have said, unlimited sovereignty remains with the people who have the normative power to void the authority of their government (or some part thereof) if it exceeds its constitutional limitations.

Though sovereignty and government are different notions, and normally apply to different entities, it nevertheless seems conceptually possible for them to apply to one and the same individual or institution. It is arguable that Hobbes insisted on the identification of sovereign and government insofar as he seemed to require a (virtually) complete transfer of all rights and powers from sovereign individuals to a political sovereign whose authority was to be absolute, thus rendering it possible to emerge from the wretched state of nature in which life is “solitary, poor, nasty, brutish and short.”[6] In Hobbes’ theory, ultimate, unlimited sovereignty must reside in the supreme governmental person or body who enjoys unlimited power and authority to rule the commonwealth. Anything less than such an ultimate, unlimited sovereign would, given human nature and the world we inhabit, destroy the potential for stable government and all that it makes possible. So even if ‘sovereignty’ and ‘government’ express different notions, this neither means nor implies that the two could not pertain to one and the same entity.

3. Entrenchment

According to most theorists, another important feature of constitutionalism is that the norms imposing limits upon government power must be in some way, and to some degree, be entrenched, either legally or by way of constitutional convention.[7] In other words, those whose powers are constitutionally limited—i.e., the institutions of government—must not be constitutionally at liberty to change or expunge those limits at their pleasure. Most written constitutions contain amending formulae which can be triggered by, and require the participation of, the government bodies whose powers they limit. But these formulae invariably require something more than a simple decision on the part of the present government, through e.g., Presidential fiat or simple majority vote in the legislature, to invoke a change. Sometimes constitutional assemblies are required, or super-majority votes, referendums, or the agreement of not only the central government in a federal system but also some number or percentage of the governments or regional units within the federal system.[8] Entrenchment not only facilitates a degree of stability and predictability over time (a characteristic aspiration of constitutional regimes), it is arguably a requirement of the very possibility of constitutionally limited government. Were a government institution entitled, at its pleasure, to change the very terms of its constitutional limitations, we might begin to question whether there would, in reality, be any such limitations. Consider Regina once again. Were she entitled, at her discretion, to remove (and perhaps later reinstate) the constitutional restriction preventing her from legislating on some religious matter on which she had strong views, then it is perhaps questionable whether Regina could sensibly be said to be bound by this requirement.[9] On the other hand, were there a constitutional rule or convention specifying that Regina is entitled to remove this restriction only if she succeeds in convincing two thirds of her subjects to vote for the change, then one might feel more comfortable speaking of constitutional limitation. Of course this constitutional meta-rule or convention is itself subject to change or elimination—a fact that raises a host of further puzzles. For example, does such an act require application of the very rule in question—i.e., two third’s majority vote—or are the sovereign people of Regina’s society at liberty to change or expunge it at their pleasure? If we accept (a) the distinction between government and sovereignty urged above; (b) that ultimate sovereignty resides in the people whom Regina governs; and (c) that sovereignty cannot be self-limiting, (X cannot limit X) then we might sensibly be led to conclude that the constitutional meta-rule—and hence the constitutional regime of which it is an integral part—both exist at the pleasure of the general population of Regina’s society. Entrenchment may be an essential element of constitutional regimes, but it would seem that constitutions neither can nor should be entrenched against the actions of a sovereign people.

4. Writtenness

Some scholars believe that constitutional norms do not exist unless they are in some way enshrined in a written document (e.g., Rubenfeld 1998). But most accept that constitutions (or elements of them) can be unwritten, and cite, as an obvious example of this possibility, the constitution of the United Kingdom. One must be careful here, however. Though the UK has nothing resembling the American Constitution and its Bill of Rights, it nevertheless contains a number of written instruments which have, for many centuries, formed central elements of its constitution. Magna Carta (1215 C.E.) is perhaps the earliest document of the British constitution, while others include The Petition of Right (1628) and the Bill of Rights (1689). Furthermore, constitutional limits are also said to be found in certain principles of the common law, explicitly cited in landmark cases concerning the limits of government power. The fact remains, however, that historically the constitution of the UK has largely taken unwritten form, suggesting strongly that writtenness is not a defining feature of constitutionalism.

Why, despite the existence of seemingly obvious counter-examples, might someone be led to think that constitutional norms must be written rules, as opposed to more informal conventions or social rules? One possible reason[10] is that unwritten rules and conventions are sometimes less precise and therefore more open to interpretation, gradual change, and ultimately avoidance, than written ones. If this were true, then one might question whether an unwritten rule could, at least as a practical matter, serve adequately to limit government power. But there is no reason to accept this line of argument. Long standing social rules and conventions are often clear and precise, as well as more rigid and entrenched than written ones, if only because their elimination, alteration or re-interpretation typically requires widespread changes in traditional attitudes, beliefs and behaviour. And these can be very difficult to bring about.

5. Montesquieu and the Separation of Powers

Does the idea of constitutionalism require, as a matter of conceptual or practical necessity, the division of government powers urged by Montesquieu and celebrated by Americans as a bulwark against abuse of state power? In Regina’s case, there is no such separation: legislative, executive and judicial power all reside in her person. But how, it might be asked, can she be the one (qua judge) who determines whether her legislation satisfies the prescribed constitutional limitation? Even if, in theory, Regina’s constitution prohibits her from removing her constitutional restriction at will (because she must observe the 2/3rds meta-rule) can she not always choose to ignore her restrictions, or to interpret them so as to escape their binding force? Perhaps Bishop Hoadly was right when he said (1717) in a sermon before the English King: “Whoever hath an ultimate authority to interpret any written or spoken laws, it is he who is truly the Law-giver to all intents and purposes, and not the person who first wrote or spoke them.” (quoted in Gray 1986, p.12). Although some constitutional limits, e.g., the one which restricts the Mexican President to a single term of office, seldom raise questions of interpretation, many others (particularly those that concern civil rights) are ripe for such questions. Regina might argue that a decree requiring all shops to close on Sundays (the common Sabbath) does not concern a religious matter because its aim is a common day of rest, not religious observance. Others might argue, with seemingly equal plausibility, that it does concern a religious matter and therefore lies outside Regina’s legislative competence.

That constitutions often raise such interpretive questions gives rise to an important question: Does the possibility of constitutional limitation on legislative and executive power require, as a matter of practical politics, that the judicial power by which such limitations are interpreted and enforced reside in some individual or group of individuals distinct from that in which these legislative and executive powers are vested? In modern terms, must constitutional limits on a legislative body like Parliament, the Duma or Congress, or an executive body like the President or her Cabinet, be subject to interpretation and enforcement by an independent judiciary? Marbury v Madison settled this question in the affirmative as a matter of American law, and most nations follow Marbury (and Montesquieu) in accepting the practical necessity of some such arrangement. But it is not clear that the arrangement truly is practically necessary, let alone conceptually so. Bishop Hoadly notwithstanding, there is nothing nonsensical in the suggestion that X might be bound by an entrenched rule, R, whose interpretation and implementation is left to X. This is, arguably, the situation in New Zealand where the courts are forbidden from striking down legislation on the ground that it exceeds constitutional limits. Observance and enforcement of these limits are left to the legislative bodies whose powers are nonetheless recognized as constitutionally limited (and subject to whatever pressures might be imposed politically when state actions are generally believed to violate the constitution). It is important to realize that what rule, R, actually requires is not necessarily identical with what X believes or says that it requires. Nor is it identical with whatever restrictions X actually observes in practice. This is so even when there is no superior institution with the power and authority to enforce compliance or to correct X’s judgment when it is, or appears to be, wrong.

That constitutional limits can sometimes be avoided or interpreted so as to avoid their effects, and no recourse be available to correct mistaken interpretations and abuses of power, does not, then, imply the absence of constitutional limitation. But does it imply the absence of effective limitation? Perhaps so, but even here there is reason to be cautious in drawing general conclusions. Once again, we should remember the long-standing traditions within British Parliamentary systems (including New Zealand’s) according to which Parliament alone possesses final authority to create, interpret and implement its own constitutional limits. And whatever their faults, there is little doubt that many Parliaments modeled on the British system typically act responsibly in observing their own constitutional limits.

So the notion of constitutionalism does not seem conceptually to require the separation of powers advocated by Montesquieu. Nor does that principle seem to be required as a matter of practical necessity in all possible cases. Does this mean that separation of powers has no place in a theory of constitutionalism? It could be suggested that, rather than seeing Montesquieu’s tripartite distinction of government functions assigned to different government branches as a necessary component of the very concept of separation of powers, we should instead understand that concept in a moralized, flexible and context-specific manner. On this view, separation of powers dictates more generally that distribution of powers be such that a) tasks are allocated to those institutions that are well-suited to carry them out and b) there are effective checks on the use of government power (Kyritsis 2017, ch 2). However, it does not necessarily prescribe certain institutional forms such as judicial review of primary legislation.

6. Constitutional Law versus Constitutional Convention

The idea of constitutionalism requires limitation on government power and authority established by constitutional law. But according to most constitutional scholars, there is more to a constitution than constitutional law. Many people will find this suggestion puzzling, believing their constitution to be nothing more (and nothing less) than (usually) a formal, written document, possibly adopted at a special constitutional assembly, which contains the nation’s supreme, fundamental law. But there is a long-standing tradition of conceiving of constitutions as containing much more than constitutional law. Dicey is famous for proposing that, in addition to constitutional law, the British constitutional system contains a number of constitutional conventions which effectively limit government in the absence of legal limitation. These are, in effect, social rules arising within the practices of the political community and which impose important, but non-legal, limits on government powers. An example of a British constitutional convention is the rule that the British Monarch may not refuse Royal Assent to any bill passed by both Houses of the UK Parliament. Perhaps another example lies in a convention that individuals chosen to represent the State of Florida in the American Electoral College (the body which actually chooses the American President by majority vote) must vote for the Presidential candidate for whom a plurality of Floridians voted on election night. Owing to the fact that they are political conventions, unenforceable in courts of law, constitutional conventions are said to be distinguishable from constitutional laws, which can indeed be legally enforced. If we accept Dicey’s distinction, we must not identify the constitution with constitutional law. It includes constitutional conventions as well. We must further recognize the possibility that a government, though legally within its power to embark upon a particular course of action, might nevertheless be constitutionally prohibited from doing so.[11] It is possible that, as a matter of constitutional law, Regina might enjoy unlimited legislative, executive and judicial powers which are nonetheless limited by constitutional conventions specifying how those powers are to be exercised. Should she violate one of these conventions, she would be acting legally, but unconstitutionally, and her subjects might well feel warranted in condemning her actions, perhaps even removing her from office—a puzzling result only if one thinks that all there is to a constitution is constitutional law.

7. Constitutional Interpretation

As we have just seen, there is often more to a constitution than constitutional law. As we have also seen, constitutional norms need not always be written rules. Despite these important observations, two facts must be acknowledged: (1) the vast majority of constitutional cases hinge on questions of constitutional law; and (2) modern constitutions consist primarily of written documents.[12] Consequently, constitutional cases often raise theoretical issues concerning the proper approach to the interpretation of written instruments—colored, of course, by the special role constitutions play – or ought to play – in defining and limiting the authority and powers of government. Differences of view on these matters come to light most forcefully when a case turns on the interpretation of a constitutional provision that deals with abstract civil rights (e.g., the right to due process of law, or to equality).[13] How such provisions are to be interpreted has been subject to intense controversy among legal practitioners and theorists, and it is upon such provisions that this entry will focus. As we shall see, stark differences of opinion on this issue are usually rooted in different views on the aspirations of constitutions or on the appropriate role of judges within constitutional democracies.

Although theories of constitutional interpretation are many and varied, they all seem, in one way or another, to ascribe importance to a number of key factors: textual or semantic meaning; political, social and legal history; intention; original understanding; and moral/political theory. The roles played by each of these factors in a theory of constitutional interpretation depend crucially on how the theorist conceives of a constitution and its role in limiting government power. For example, if a theorist conceives of a constitution as foundational law whose existence, meaning and authority derive from the determinate, historical acts of its authors and/or those they represented(ed), and whose principal point is to fix a long-standing, stable framework or set of ground rules within which legislative, executive and judicial powers are to be exercised by the various branches of government, she may be inclined towards an interpretive theory which accords pride of place to factors like authors’ intentions or the meanings they (and perhaps the general public at the time) would have ascribed to the terms chosen for inclusion in the constitution. On what we will call the fixed view of constitutions, it is natural to think that factors like these should govern whenever they are clear and consistent. And the reason is quite straight forward. On the fixed view, a constitution not only aspires to establish a stable framework within which government powers are to be exercised, it aspires to establish one which is above, or removed from, the deep disagreements and partisan controversies encountered in ordinary, day to day law and politics. It aspires, in short, to be both stable and morally and politically neutral on controversial issues such as whether there should be laws affirming a woman’s right to an abortion, or the right of workers to a minimum wage. To be clear, saying that a constitution aspires, on a fixed view, to be morally and politically neutral, is not meant to deny that those who take this stance believe that it expresses a particular political vision or a set of fundamental commitments to certain values and principles of political morality. Quite the contrary. All constitutional theorists will agree that constitutions typically enshrine, indeed entrench, a range of moral and political commitments to values like democracy, equality, free expression, and the rule of law. But two points need to be stressed.

First, fixed views attempt to transform questions about the moral and political soundness of these commitments into historical questions, principally concerning beliefs about their soundness. The task is not to ask: What do we now think about values like equality and freedom of expression? Rather, it is to ask: What did they—the authors of the constitution or those on whose authority they created the constitution—in fact think about those values? What was their original understanding of them, or the understanding among most members of the general population that existed at the time of the constitution’s creation (or amendment, if the provision in question was introduced at a later time)? So stability and neutrality are, on fixed views, served to the extent that a constitution is capable of transforming questions of political morality into historical ones.

Second, no proponent of the fixed view will deny that the abstract moral commitments expressed in a constitution tend to be widely, if not universally shared among members of the relevant political community. In that sense, then, the constitution, despite the moral commitments it embodies, is neutral as between citizens and their many more partisan differences of opinion on more particular moral questions. Not everyone in a modern, constitutional democracy like the US or Germany agrees on the extent to which the right to free expression demands the liberty to express opinions that display and promote hatred toward an identifiable religious or racial group. But virtually no one would deny the vital importance of expressive freedom in a truly free and democratic society. On fixed views, then, constitutions can be seen as analogous to the ground rules of a debating society. Each sets the mutually agreed, stable framework within which controversial debate (and action) is to take place. And just as a debating society could not function if its ground rules could be revised by a debater in order to win the debate, a constitution could not serve its role if its terms were constantly open to debate and revision by participants within the political and legal processes it aspires to govern in order to achieve a desired result. We avoid this possibility, according to those who espouse the fixed view, to the extent that we are able to replace controversial moral and political questions with historical questions about the intentions of constitutional authors in creating what they did, or about how the terms they chose to express constitutional requirements were publicly understood at the time they were chosen.

To sum up: the desire for stability and neutrality leads modern proponents of the fixed view to view constitutional interpretation as an exercise which, when undertaken properly, focuses on authors’ intentions or on original understandings of the meaning and import of the words chosen to express agreed limits on government power and authority. Those who endorse this fixed view generally espouse what has come to be known as originalism. Only if interpreters restrict themselves to original intentions and/or understandings, and do not attempt to insert their own contentious views under the guise of ‘interpretation’, can the role of a constitution be secured. Only then, originalists maintain, can it serve as the politically neutral, stable framework its nature demands.

But not all constitutional theorists believe that the foundational role of a constitution demands that its meaning and interpretation be somehow fixed, or that its interpretation be absolutely immune from considerations of moral and political theory and debate. On the contrary, many constitutional scholars and judges embrace living constitutionalism, an approach that sees a constitution as an evolving, living entity which, by its very nature, is capable of responding to changing social circumstances and new (and it is hoped better) moral and political beliefs. Along with this very different view of constitutions come very different theories regarding the nature and limits of legitimate constitutional interpretation. One strand within living constitutionalism, upon which we will be focus below, stresses the extent to which constitutional interpretation resembles the kind of reasoning that takes place in other areas of the law pertaining to common law legal systems, such as the law of contracts and torts. Just as the law of contributory negligence emerged and (continuously) evolves in common law countries in a case-by-case, incremental manner, over many decades and as the product of many judicial decisions, the law of equal protection, free expression, due process and the like (continuously) evolves in modern western democracies as constitutional cases are heard and decided.

Disputes between fixed-view originalists and living constitutionalists are among the liveliest and most contentious to have arisen in constitutional scholarship over the past several decades. Debates have tended to focus on abstract civil rights provisions of constitutions, such as the due process clause of the American Constitution, or Section 7 of the Canadian Charter of Rights and Freedoms, which ’guarantees the right to life, liberty and security of the person and the right not to be deprived thereof except in accordance with the principles of fundamental justice.[14] Given the fixed view to which they are committed, contemporary originalists view anything more than an attempt to discover, so as to preserve and apply, original understandings of, or the intentions behind, such provisions as constitutional revision or ‘construction,’ often masquerading as the interpretation of an unchanged original.[15] On the other side, we find the living constitutionalists who tend to view originalism as a reactionary, overly conservative theory serving only to tie a democratic community to the ‘dead hand of the past.’ Originalists, their opponents claim, render us incapable of responding rationally and responsibly to changing social circumstances and improved moral views concerning the requirements of the abstract values and principles articulated and endorsed in modern constitutions. Living constitutionalists, the originalist counters, recommend constitutional practices that threaten a number of cherished values, among them the rule of law and the separation of powers. They are, in effect, happy to place the constitution in the hands of contemporary judges who are permitted, under the guise of interpreting it, to change the constitution to suit their own political inclinations and moral preferences. And this, originalists claim, only serves to thwart cherished values secured by having a stable, politically neutral constitution, and may render all talk of genuine constitutional constraint meaningless.

8. Originalism

Originalism comes in a wide variety of forms (Bork 1990; Scalia 1997; Whittington 1999b; Barnett 2004; Solum 2008). An originalist might claim that her view follows necessarily from a more general theory of interpretation: to interpret is necessarily to retrieve something that existed at the time of authorship—an original object. Another might be happy to acknowledge that interpretation could, theoretically, take the form of an innovative or creative interpretation that evaluates or in some way changes an original, as might be the case with a revolutionary interpretation of a play or work of art. But such a theorist might go on to add that, for reasons of political morality having to do with, e.g., the principles of democracy, the rule of law, and values underlying the separation of powers, such innovative interpretations ought never be pursued by constitutional interpreters. The object of constitutional interpretation should, to the greatest extent possible, remain fixed by factors like original public understandings or authorial intentions. Yet another originalist might be content to leave a little leeway here, suggesting something like the following: though there is a presumption, perhaps a very heavy one, in favor of interpretation as retrieval of an original, it is one which can, on very rare occasions and for truly exceptional reasons, be overcome. For example, this originalist might say that the presumption in favor of retrieval can be defeated when there is a discernible and profound sea change in popular views on some important issue of political morality implicated by an abstract constitutional provision. This was arguably the case in the United States with respect to slavery and equal protection. Presumably ‘equal protection’ was originally understood, both by the authors of the 14th Amendment and by the people on whose behalf they acted, as fully consistent with segregation. This concrete understanding of equal protection is now, of course, widely condemned. Its wholesale rejection served as the main inspiration behind Brown v. Board of Education, whose innovative interpretation of the equal protection clause arguably changed or replaced the original understanding of the notion.[16] Yet another concession, in this case one that seems embraced by all originalists, concerns the force and effect of authoritative court interpretations of the constitution. Many originalists believe that Roe v. Wade[17] rested on a mistaken interpretation of the United States Constitution, one that flew in the face of original understandings and intentions; but virtually no originalist would have gone so far as to deny, before Roe was overturned by the US Supreme Court in Dobbs,[18] that any contemporary interpretation of the First, Fourth, Fifth, Ninth and Fourteenth Amendments could be justified only if it can be reconciled with that decision. In other words, virtually all originalists agree that established precedent can sometimes override original understanding. Whether this apparent concession is in the end consistent with the spirit of originalism is, perhaps, questionable. Such ‘faint-hearted originalism’ (Scalia 1989) may reduce, in the end, to a form of living constitutionalism.[19] Indeed, as we shall see in the next section, the role of judicial interpretations of abstract constitutional provisions is central to that prominent form of living constitutionalism which views constitutional interpretation as resting on a form of common-law reasoning.

Another way in which originalists have split is over the identity of the original object of interpretation. Walter Benn Michaels is among those who defend Original Intent Originalism, the view that “you can’t do textual interpretation without some appeal to authorial intention and, perhaps more controversially, you can’t (coherently and non-arbitrarily) think of yourself as still doing textual interpretation as soon as you appeal to something beyond authorial intention...” (Michaels, 2009, 21) Keith Whittington, Randy Barnett, and Larry Solum, on the other hand, defend Original Public Meaning Originalism, commonly referred to as New Originalism, which “emphasizes the meaning that the Constitution (or its amendments) would have had to the relevant audience at the time of its adoption.” (Solum 2021) Whatever its precise contours, an originalist theory is likely to rest on the fixed view of a constitution. The constitution’s rules and principles are fixed by original public meaning or its authors’ intentions and, (barring formal constitutional amendment) these must not be revisited and revised lest the authority and stability of the constitution be threatened. Original intentions or public meanings must always govern the interpretation of a constitution, not the new value judgements and decisions of contemporary judges (or other interpreters) asking the very same questions the author’s actions and decisions were supposed to have settled.

Originalism in all its many forms has undergone extensive critique. For example, original intentions and public meaning are often unclear, if not largely indeterminate, leaving the interpreter with the need to appeal to other factors. In addition, original intentions and understandings can vary from one person to the next. Sometimes the only things upon which joint authors or members of the relevant original audience can agree are the particular words to be included in the constitution. The intentions behind that choice can, however, vary significantly, as can original understandings of what those words mean. These can range from the very general to the highly specific. At one end of the spectrum are the various, and sometimes conflicting, goals and values the authors of a constitutional provision intended their creation to achieve and which an original interpreter might understand the provision to be all about. At the other end are the very specific applications the authors might have had in mind when they chose the particular words upon which they settled, and which would generally have been understood by the relevant audience to cover. Did the intended or understood applications of an equality provision encompass equal access to the legal system by all groups within society? Or only something more specific like equal access to fairness at trial. Did they perhaps include equal economic and social opportunities for all groups? Different authors might have intended all, none, or some of these applications when they agreed upon the equality provision, and similar things can be said about the corresponding understandings of members of the original audience. As with the general goals and values underlying a provision, there is room for inconsistence and conflict. In light of this fact, it can often be unhelpful, when interpreting a constitution, to rely exclusively on original intentions or public meanings.

Let’s suppose, however, that this is not the case: that there is a way for contemporary interpreters actually to determine, independently of their own moral and political views, either the original intentions of constitutional authors or what the earlier generation would have understood the relevant constitutional provision(s) to mean. Would a constitution, understood in one of these two ways, and serving the role ascribed to it by the fixed view, be a good thing for a democratic society to have? Not according to many constitutional scholars. As noted above, constitutions are intended to last a long time and to span many generations. This is one of the main reasons they tend to be entrenched. Suppose that an entrenched constitution has in fact been in existence for a very long time. In such a scenario, we should distinguish between two groups of people: the people-now and the people-then. According to originalism, it is the understandings and intentions of the people-then that will control the proper application by the people-now of constitutional provisions in contemporary settings. In other words, the people-now will in effect be shackled in their attempts to exercise political choice by the prior decisions of someone else — the people-then. It’s at the very least questionable whether this scenario is consistent with our understanding of democracy as a system of ongoing self-government. To be self-governing in an ongoing manner, one must be able to change one’s mind.

How might an originalist get round this apparent difficulty? One way is to note that the so-called dead hand of the past can always be removed through constitutional amendment, difficult as this process might be to engage successfully. A second way is the one generally pursued by new originalists, who draw a distinction between interpretation, on the one hand, and construction, on the other. The former is the process of discovering the communicative meaning or content of words in the text of the constitution, while the latter consists of putting that meaning or content into effect by applying it in particular cases. (Barnett 1999 & 2011; Whittington 1999) According to these new public meaning originalists, the dead hand of the past extends only to the communicative meaning or content of the relevant text and to the process of interpreting it. And importantly, though the communicative meaning or content of, e.g., ‘free expression’, ‘due process’ or ‘cruel and unusual punishment’ is the same now as it was when provisions incorporating these notion were first introduced in, e.g., the US Constitution, that unchanged communicative meaning is not the primary focus in most controversial constitutional cases where questions of construction take the leading role. Here contemporary interpreters must exercise fresh judgment in applying unchanged, but largely uncontentious, original meaning of a constitution’s terms to the complex, new and contentious situations constitutional rights cases being to the fore. They must construct an understanding of, e.g., the right to free expression that allows them to decide controversial cases involving such things as online bullying or attempts to unduly influence voters through the use of internet bots. Given the highly abstract nature of this constitutional right, it seems likely that judicial construction will play the leading role in the vast majority of cases involving its application. And if this is so, then whatever reach the dead hand of the past might have, it will end up being quite minimal.

9. Living Constitutionalism

Whatever else might be said of law, this much is undeniably true: where law exists, our conduct is subject to various forms of restriction. But in many instances, the relevant restrictions can be removed or changed with minimal effort, as when a problematic common-law precedent is overturned because of changing social circumstances, or a statute is repealed or amended because it no longer serves useful purposes. Not so with constitutions. As noted above, they tend to be heavily entrenched. Constitutions are also meant to be long lasting, so as to serve the values of continuity and stability in the basic framework within which the contentious affairs of law and politics are conducted. The entrenched nature of constitutions is largely unproblematic when we consider provisions dealing with such matters as the length of term of a senator or which branch of government is responsible for regulating public education. But things get much more complicated and contentious when we turn to the highly abstract, moral provisions of most modern constitutions which have the effect of limiting the powers of government bodies in significant ways. These special features of constitutions combine to give rise to a fundamental question, one that causes the originalist so much difficulty and to which living constitutionalism purports to provide a better answer: How can one group of people, the people-then, justifiably place entrenched constitutional impediments of a decidedly moral nature in the way of a second group of people, the people-now, who might live in radically different circumstances and perhaps with radically different moral views? How, in short, can one generation legitimately bind the moral choices of another? A satisfactory answer to this intergenerational problem, living constitutionalists contend, requires that we recognize that constitutions can grow and adapt to ever-changing circumstances without losing their identity or their legitimacy.

According to living constitutionalists, the meaning or content of an entrenched provision like section 3(1) of the German Basic Law, which proclaims that ‘All persons shall be equal before the law,’ consists in the rights or principles of political morality they express, not what those rights or principles were generally understood to require at the time of enactment or were believed or intended to require by those who chose to include them in the constitution. The choice to employ abstract moral terms (e.g., ‘cruel and unusual punishment’) instead of more concrete, non-moral terms (e.g., ‘public hanging’ or ‘drawing and quartering’), is presumably made in recognition of at least four crucial facts: (1) it’s important that governments not violate certain important rights of political morality; (2) constitutional authors do not always agree fully on what concretely is required in the many scenarios and cases in which those rights are, or will later be seen to be, relevant; (3) constitutional authors can anticipate neither the future nor the many scenarios and cases in which these important rights will be in some way relevant; and (4) even when they do agree on what those rights concretely require at the moment of adoption, and are comfortable binding themselves and their contemporaries to these concrete understandings, they are not particularly comfortable doing so in respect of future generations who will live in very different times and may think very differently. And so the decision is made to express constitutional commitments in very abstract terms—‘cruel and unusual punishment’ versus ‘drawing and quartering’—leaving it to later generations to substitute their possibly different concrete understandings for those of the authors or those who lived at the time of authorship. The result is that as concrete understandings of the entrenched constitutional-rights provisions evolve, the results warranted by these provisions can legitimately change right along with them. And importantly for the living constitutionalist who does not wish to surrender to the charge that she counsels infidelity to the constitution, these changes can occur without the constitution having changed, as would be true were a process of formal amendment successfully invoked and an abstract, rights provision removed from the constitution.

One version of living constitutionalism is common law constitutionalism, a view developed and defended by David Strauss and Wil Waluchow. (Strauss 2010; Waluchow 2007a) This view seeks to constrain and regulate the evolution of constitutional rights so that they can be both responsive to changing circumstances and yet stable enough to accommodate rule of law values such as stability and continuity. Common law constitutionalists assert that the evolution of a constitution is governed largely by a body of precedents. As precedents are set in constitutional rights cases, principles and doctrines emerge that are subject to revision as later cases arise. According to common law constitutionalism, these precedents, and the principles and doctrines they support, ultimately count as much as the written text. The former are as much a part of the constitution as the written document created by constitutional authors. David Strauss goes so far as to suggest, in reference to the US Constitution, that “when a case involves the [written] Constitution, the text routinely gets no attention. On a day-to-day basis, American constitutional law is about precedents...” (Strauss 2010, 34)

Despite its undoubted appeal, (at least to many) living constitutionalism is subject to a number of significant objections. Perhaps the most prominent ones are these: (a) the theory renders all talk of constitutional interpretation, properly understood as the retrieval of existing meaning, utterly senseless: constitutional interpretation becomes nothing more than unconstrained, constitutional creation or construction masquerading as interpretation; (b) living constitutionalism robs the constitution of its ability to serve its guidance function—how can individuals be guided by a constitution whose application to their conduct and choices will be determined by the unconstrained views of later so-called interpreters?; and (c) living constitutionalism violates the separation of powers doctrine—if the constitution and its limits become whatever contemporary interpreters take them to mean, and if those interpreters tend to be found almost exclusively in courts populated by individuals who were appointed not elected, then democratically unaccountable judges end up deciding what the proper limits of government power shall be, a task for which they are eminently unqualified and which ought to be reserved for individuals (e.g., the authors of the constitution) with the democratic authority to serve that function.

Living constitutionalists have a number of responses to these objections. For instance, it might be argued that the theory in no way results in the unconstrained, arbitrary exercise of judicial power its opponents often portray it to be. Living constitutionalists like Strauss (2010) and Waluchow (2007a) suggest that the ongoing interpretation of a constitution’s abstract rights provisions is a process much like the process by which judges develop equally abstract, common-law notions like ‘negligence’ and ‘the reasonable use of force.’ According to Strauss, the U.S. constitutional system

has become a common law system, one in which precedent and past practices are, in their own way as important as the written U.S. Constitution itself…[I]t is not one that judges (or anyone else) can simply manipulate to fit their own ideas. (Strauss 2010, 3)

On this view, constitutional interpretation must accommodate itself to previous attempts to interpret and apply the abstract rights provisions expressed in the constitution’s text. These prior interpretive decisions serve as constitutional precedents. And just as the traditional rules of precedent combine respect for the (albeit limited) wisdom and authority of previous decision makers (legislative and judicial) with an awareness of the need to allow adaptation in the face of changing views, and new or unforeseen circumstances, so too must constitutional interpreters respect the wisdom and authority of previous interpreters, while allowing the constitution to adapt so as to respond to changing views, and new or unforeseen circumstances. Living constitutional interpretation, though flexible and adaptive, is no less constrained and disciplined than reasoning under common law.

Another response open to living constitutionalists is to deny that their theory of interpretation ignores the special role played by a constitution’s text and its authors. The text plays a key role insofar as any constitutional interpretation, innovative as it may be, must be consistent with that text, until such time as it is formally changed via some acknowledged process of constitutional amendment. There is no reason to deny that original understandings of a constitution’s abstract provisions can also be highly relevant to later interpretations. This is especially so for interpretations that occur shortly after the constitution’s adoption, when worries about binding future generations is not in play. Original understandings simply cannot be dispositive, at least not in perpetuity. In the end, the relative importance of factors like textual meaning, original understandings, later interpretations, and intended purposes, may be, as Joseph Raz suggests (1996, 176–91), fundamentally a question of political morality which cannot be answered in the abstract and without considering what it is that justifies, at that particular moment of interpretation, having an entrenched constitution at all, let alone one with such and such particular content. Sometimes, retrieval of an existing concrete understanding will be required, especially when the constitution is in its infancy and was partly meant to settle a range of concrete moral questions as to the proper limits of government power, at least for a while. But if an interpreter has good reason to believe that this settlement function has been overtaken by other more pressing concerns, perhaps the need to adapt in light of dramatically changed circumstances or much better moral understanding, then a more innovative interpretation may be called for. And once again, to say that constitutional interpreters must sometimes be innovative is not to say that a constitution can be interpreted to mean whatever the interpreter wants it to mean.

Yet another response open to living constitutionalists is to note the special institutional structures that many jurisdictions have adopted to lessen democratic worries arising from the key role judges play in developing constitutional rights. These concerns are particularly acute in jurisdictions, such as the US, where the Supreme Court effectively has the final say on the meaning and import of constitutional rights provisions. But not all jurisdictions assign the final say to judges. The United Kingdom, for instance practices a version of what Mark Tushnet calls “weak-form-review.” (Tushnet 2003) It is the responsibility of the UK Supreme Court to rule on whether a provision of Parliament is compatible with (properly interpreted) provisions of the Human Rights Act. But neither the Court’s decision, nor its interpretation of the relevant right, is binding on Parliament. Despite the declared incompatibility, Parliament has the power to leave its legislation as is. The people-now, through their elected members of Parliament, retain the final say on the interpretation and application of the constitutional rights recognized in the Human Rights Act.

10. The Moral Reading

Among the most influential critics of originalism was Ronald Dworkin, for whom historical factors like original meanings and intentions, though often important, are in no way dispositive in constitutional rights cases. They in no way fix the limits of government power until such time as an amendment passes or the constitution is abandoned or replaced. On the contrary, constitutions set the terms of an ongoing debate about the moral principles and values it enshrines. And as the political community’s understanding of these principles develops, the very content of the constitution develops and improves along with it. The framers’ contribution to this process is that they enacted some ‘general principles’ which future interpreters must constructively interpret (Dworkin 1996, 8–9; see relatedly Greenberg and Littman 1998). This arguably renders Dworkin’s constitutional theory a version of living constitutionalism.

A crucial element in Dworkin’s constitutional theory is his general claim that the law of a community, including its constitutional law, includes more than any explicit text or decisions authoritatively adopted or made in accordance with accepted procedures. It does, of course, include many such elements and these can be found, paradigmatically, in statute books, judicial decisions and, of course, written constitutions. These are often termed ‘positive law.’ But the positive law in no way exhausts the law according to Dworkin. Most importantly, for our purposes here, it in no way exhausts that part of the law referred to as ‘the constitution’. In Dworkin’s view, a constitution includes the principles of political morality that provide the best explanation and moral justification – i.e., the best interpretation – of whatever limits have been expressed in positive law, including the constitution and any decisions taken in application of it. Hence, constitutional interpretation must always invoke a theory of political morality. One concerned to interpret the limits on government power and authority imposed by a constitution must construct an interpretive theory that provides the written constitution, and the many decisions taken under it, with their best explanation and moral justification.

There are, for our purposes here, three important implications of Dworkin’s theory of constitutional interpretation. First, original intentions and understandings at best set the stage for the ongoing debates of political morality that constitutional rights cases both require and license. They seldom, if every settle matters. Second, constitutional rights cases require the kind of decision-making which is, according to originalism, properly undertaken only by those with the authority to fix the limits on government power contained within a constitution – i.e., its authors or framers. The kind of morally and politically uncontroversial judicial decision-making, within a stable framework established by other responsible agents, to which originalism aspires, is simply impossible on Dworkin’s theory. Dworkin’s theory, like (or as a form of) living constitutionalism, requires wholesale rejection of the fixed view. The constitution is not a finished product, handed down in a form fixed till such time as its amending formula is invoked, or the constitution abandoned or replaced. Rather, it is a work in progress requiring continual revisiting and reworking as our moral and political theories concerning its limits are refined and, it is hoped, improved. It is, in short, a living thing.

A third, related implication of Dworkin’s theory, is that judges in constitutional cases do not simply implement decisions made by others – the constitution’s authors or framers. On the contrary, they are partners with the authors in an ongoing political project, one that requires participants, then and now, to engage in the kind of moral and political decision-making which, on the fixed view, settled matters when the constitution was first adopted (or amended). The limits to government power are, on Dworkin’s theory, continually and essentially contestable. Interpreting the contestable terms of a constitution is an ongoing task, requiring that each and every interpreter provide her own best, and undoubtedly imperfect, interpretation of the limits placed on government by her constitution and the various official decisions taken under it. The latter can never be fixed.

11. Liberal vs Common Good Constitutionalism

One’s understanding of how constitutions limit power and how they ought to be interpreted depends, as noted above, on one’s conception of their role. For some, that role must be set against the background of the value pluralism that is characteristic of many modern societies. In light of this pluralism, they say, constitutions should not be committed to a particular understanding of the good but should, rather, serve to guarantee those essentials of political justice adherence to which is necessary for legitimating government power to citizens who hold a variety of comprehensive doctrines, that is, conceptions of justice and the good life. This so-called ‘liberal principle of legitimacy’ is taken to issue in an austere list of ‘constitutional essentials’ (Rawls 1996, 227ff; Michelman 2022, 51ff; Sager 2004, ch 8). According to one suggestion, the liberal principle of legitimacy sits more comfortably with the fixed view of constitutions and their meaning. Arguably, it is better served when the interpretation of constitutional essentials track their ‘central range’ (Rawls 1996, 273), thus presumably eliciting broad convergence. However, for other authors such as Michelman, the liberal principle of legitimacy might in fact be satisfied by a certain mode of constitutional argument, one oriented towards reciprocity, even when its application to concrete constitutional issues is disputed (Michelman 2022, 105 ff). In this picture, reciprocity takes seriously the fact of value pluralism and the corresponding requirement that constitutional arrangements be acceptable to all. But its precise contours are sensitive to the suitably constrained moral judgment of citizens and officials.

Opposing this approach is common good constitutionalism, according to which constitutions, even of pluralistic societies like the United States, are geared towards advancing – and must be interpreted in light of – a robust, unitary vision of the common good of society. According to its foremost contemporary proponent, Adrian Vermeule, constitutions and constitutional interpretation “should be based on the principles that government helps direct persons, associations, and society generally toward the common good, and that strong rule in the interest of attaining the common good is entirely legitimate” (Vermeule 2020). More specifically:

[t]his approach should take as its starting point substantive moral principles that conduce to the common good, principles that officials (including, but by no means limited to, judges) should read into the majestic generalities and ambiguities of the written Constitution. These principles include … a candid willingness to ‘legislate morality’ – indeed, a recognition that all legislation is necessarily founded on some substantive conception of morality, and that the promotion of morality is a core and legitimate function of authority. Such principles promote the common good and make for a just and well-ordered society. (Vermeule 2020)

Vermeule’s constitutional theory, further developed in his Common Good Constitutionalism, arguably represents a new alternative to the constitutional theories discussed above. But perhaps not. Vermeule himself characterizes his view as ‘methodologically Dworkinian,’ noting that it “advocates a very different set of substantive moral commitments and priorities from Dworkin’s, which were of a conventionally left-liberal bent” (Vermeule 2020). This may lead one to wonder whether Vermeule’s theory truly is an alternative to Dworkin’s theory of constitutions and their interpretation, or instead an alternative account of the conclusions Dworkin’s ideal judge, Hercules, (a mythical judge who always gets things right and whose decisions set the standard fallible judges strive to meet) would draw were he to set out to offer a grand interpretation of US constitutional law. (On Hercules, see Dworkin 1986, 239 ff.) Whatever answer one provides to this question, it is nevertheless worth considering whether the moral vision underlying Vermeule’s common good constitutionalism is one that only religious conservatives who share his moral views can endorse. And if it is, then should it frame our understanding of the nature and role of the constitutions of western liberal democracies? There is also the concern that common good constitutionalism has the potential to untether constitutional interpretation from both constitutional text and constitutional precedent, thus providing judges with far too much power to use the law to further that particular moral vision. (See, e.g., Barnett 2020)

12. Critical Theories

Although constitutionalism has been widely embraced round the world, it is by no means without its detractors. This is especially true when we turn to those constitutions that not only create and regulate the offices of government but also purport to protect abstract rights of political morality. Some critics—we’ll call these the hard critics—assert that such apparently rights-protective constitutions cannot effectively and legitimately serve to protect individuals against the oppressive forces of governments.[20] On the contrary, they only serve to shroud legal and political practice in a false cloak of legitimacy. Other critics—we’ll call these the democratic critics—are not so utterly dismissive of rights-protecting constitutions. Rather, their main concern is to challenge the role that democratically unaccountable judges typically play in the interpretation and application of constitutional rights. This concern appears to arise most forcefully in relation to the interpretive theories of Dworkin, the moral judgments of common good constitutionalism and the judicial precedents of living constitutionalists. But the concern is no less acute when we consider new originalism and the ways in which it resorts to the constitutional constructions of judges.

According to hard critics, factors like original understandings and the supposed discipline of common law reasoning seldom, if ever, succeed in establishing meaningful limits upon government power. As a result, reliance on such factors in constitutional adjudication only serves: (a) to rationalize the purely political decisions of judges pursuing, consciously or not, their own political ideologies. Further consequences include: (b) a serious affront to democracy. In most constitutional democracies, the judges who ultimately decide constitutional cases are appointed, not elected. That is, they hold office not because they were selected to do so by the democratic community, but because of a decision on the part of a President, a Prime Minister, a small group of fellow judges, or a judicial committee of Parliament. Furthermore, these appointed judges tend to come from the privileged classes of society. The end result is a small group of unelected, elitist judges with the power to substitute their own, highly contentious views about the proper limits of government power for the considered judgments of the people’s representatives, e.g., those members of Congress or Parliament duly elected to exercise, on behalf of the people, the latter’s sovereign right to participate in political decisions affecting their basic rights. And possibly (c): suppression of those—women, minority racial groups, the poor, and so on—whose interests are not adequately recognized and protected by the dominant, mainstream ideologies to which these elite judges have an affinity. Instead of the curbing of rights-threatening government power for which the idea of constitutionalism is supposed to stand, we have political suppression disguised in a cloak of false constitutional legitimacy.

So hard critics are highly skeptical of constitutional practice and of those theories that applaud constitutionalism as a bulwark against oppression.[21] As noted at the outset of this entry, a key element in the idea of constitutionalism is that government can/should be limited in its powers and that its authority depends on observance of those limits. It was further noted that the authority of constitutions in constitutional democracies is generally thought to rest with ‘the people.’ One further claim of hard critical theories is: (d) that the concept of ‘the people’ is very much a fabrication. Instead of being composed of a group of individuals united in their concern for basic rights, western societies are comprised of various groups competing either for domination (e.g., white males and the wealthy) or for recognition and the elimination of oppression (e.g., the poor, women, and racial minorities). The law, including constitutional law, is a powerful tool which has, historically, been utilized by dominant groups to secure and maintain their superior status.

A particularly vivid example of this last consequence is arguably found in Lochner v New York, a notorious case in which the United States Supreme Court ruled that a New York State law requiring that bakery employees work no more than ten hours per day and sixty hours per week violated the Fourteenth Amendment, which asserts that no State may “deprive any person of life, liberty, or property, without due process of law.”.[22] The Fourteenth Amendment, the Court held, entails ‘the right and liberty of the individual to contract’ for a longer work week. The Lochner decision gave rise to what is commonly called ‘the Lochner era,’ a period stretching roughly from 1905 till 1937 in which the Supreme Court struck down numerous Federal and State statutes aimed at improving the working conditions of employees. As such, it may well have been a period during which the United States Constitution, in the hands of an elitist Court, served only to legitimize overt political suppression. According to hard critics, the Lochner era is but one small piece of a much larger picture.

To sum up, according to hard critics, a constitution is anything but the protection from unwarranted government power that its champions have heralded over the centuries. What is taken to be the obvious meaning of a key term like ‘equal before the law’ is what the dominant group understands or claims it to be. What is taken to be the obvious original understandings or historical intentions of the constitution’s authors are whatever understandings or intentions fit the ideologies of the dominant groups. What is taken to be the best articulation of the right to equality emerging from a fair and disciplined common-law analysis of that right, from a Dworkinian interpretive theory, or from an articulation of the common good is nothing but a rationalization of current social structures, all of which systematically oppress the interests of women, minorities and the poor.

As noted above, democratic critics tend not to be as utterly dismissive of constitutions and constitutional rights protections as their more hard-line cousins. Their principal objections revolve around a practice with which these aspects of modern constitutional regimes are typically associated: judicial or constitutional review. This is the practice whereby courts are sometimes called upon to review a law or some other official act of government (e.g., the decision of an administrative agency like the US Food and Drug Administration or the Canadian Radio-television and Telecommunications Commission) to determine its compatibility with the constitution.[23] Particular instances of this practice vary considerably. As noted above, in some jurisdictions, such as the United States, judicial review includes the power to ‘strike down’ or nullify a law duly passed by a legislature body or administrative body and the decision is final and irreversible. In other jurisdictions, the courts either do not have the power to strike down or nullify, or a decision to do so is reversible by some other body of government. As we saw, courts in the United Kingdom do not have the power to invalidate Parliament’s legislation, that is, declare it void and of no force and effect. But they do have the authority, under section 4 of the Human Rights Act 1998, officially to declare legislation incompatible with The Human Rights Act. Upon such a declaration, Parliament usually undertakes to amend or repeal the offending legislation. But should it chose not to do so, the legislation remains valid and the courts have no further legal recourse. In Canada, the Supreme Court has the power to strike down a law which it believes unjustifiably infringes a right guaranteed in Sections 2 or 7–15 of The Canadian Charter of Rights and Freedoms, but Section 33 of that same Charter grants Parliament or the legislature of a province the power to override that decision. This co-called ‘notwithstanding clause’ allows Parliament or a provincial legislature to declare that, notwithstanding its unjustifiable infringement of an enumerated right, the offending legislation will stand as constitutionally valid. Insofar as these two versions of weak-form review leave the final decision regarding the meaning and scope of a constitutional right and the limits it imposes on government powers in the hands of the legislature, it is touted by its defenders as consistent with democratic principle. According to critics of weak-form review, however, the practice strips the constitution of one of its most vital functions: the protection of individual and minority rights against what Mill, following de Tocqueville, famously called ‘the tyranny of the majority.’[24]

Among the most influential of contemporary democratic critics is Jeremy Waldron. Waldron is, to put it mildly, no fan of constitutional review. Nor is he enamored of the grandiose constitutional charters and bills of rights which serve as the most contentious ground in terms of which that power is often exercised by courts. According to Waldron and his fellow democratic critics, constitutional review under an entrenched charter or bill of rights is fraught with both theoretical and practical difficulty. It threatens democracy and is both fundamentally unfair and politically dangerous. It also relies on outmoded views about the nature of moral rights—that there are objective, universal rights of political morality to which charters or bills of rights make reference, upon which there is widespread agreement within democratic communities, and to which judges can sensibly and justifiably be asked to appeal in protecting citizens against recalcitrant exercises of government power. While it is true that constitutional review need not be based on an appeal to abstract rights of political morality (it could, for example, be restricted to questions such as whether Congress or a provincial legislature has followed proper procedure) and true that it need not include the ability actually to strike down legislation, the main focus of democratic critics has been on strong-form constitutional review which exemplifies these two features.

According to democratic critics it is difficult to underestimate the considerable power which constitutional review under an entrenched charter or bill of rights places in the hands of judges who are, in modern constitutional democracies, typically unelected and hence not directly accountable to the democratic community. Despite their lack of accountability, these judges are assigned the task of providing authoritative answers to the deeply controversial questions of political morality that arise under constitutional review and with respect to which there is so much deep disagreement. Examples can range from the permissibility of abortion or physician-assisted suicide, to the banning of hate speech or the publication of violent and degrading pornography on the internet. On the basis of these highly controversial answers they end up determining what shall be deemed lawful in the community. This is far too much political power for a small group of unelected people to wield over an entire democratic community, no matter how learned and wise they might happen to be. But perhaps more importantly, the granting of such power is fundamentally undemocratic in principle: individual citizens have, in effect, been disenfranchised by this arrangement. Each citizen of voting age should have an equal right, in a democratic society, to contribute to the creation of the laws by which she is governed. This she exercises directly via the ballot box and by whatever contributions to public discourse and debate about controversial issues she chooses to make. She also does so indirectly via the legislative votes of her elected representatives, whose task is to represent her interests and opinions. Yet with strong-form constitutional review all this has been replaced by subjection to the pronouncements of judges. The duly considered views of citizens and their representatives about the laws by which they are to be governed, arrived at (it is hoped) through fair processes of democratic decision-making, have, in effect, been set aside in favour of the contentious moral pronouncements of a handful of democratically unaccountable, elite judges. This unhappy situation is further exacerbated by the undeniable fact that judges on appeal courts often disagree vehemently among themselves about rights of political morality and must often, in the end, rely on majority voting to settle their own disagreements. It is not at all uncommon to see split votes when a court deals with a contentious issue of moral principle like affirmative action, abortion or pornography. And often these split votes follow patterns which are closely correlated with the all too discernible political leanings of judges.[25] Add to this the fact that judges render decisions which all too often appear to conflict not only with views widely shared in the community at large, but also with their own previous decisions in earlier cases, and what might seem like a marvelous idea in the abstract—constitutionally guaranteeing moral rights and fundamental interests against the abuse of government power—is transformed into a living nightmare. A nightmare in which democracy, fairness and the rule of law have, in effect, been abandoned and replaced by the rule of a few men and women, by a kind of ‘judicial oligarchy.’ And no matter the high esteem in which we tend to hold our judges in modern constitutional democracies, this is not a form of government to be eagerly embraced.

Critical theories, both hard and democratic, represent a serious challenge not only to conventional theories and established practices of constitutional interpretation, but to the very idea of constitutionalism itself—the idea that government can and should be limited in ways that serve to protect us from unwarranted state power. According to originalism, the constitution protects us from judges and other officials by restricting them (largely) to politically and morally uncontroversial, neutral decisions about historical intentions and understandings. According to one strand of living constitutionalism, our evolving constitution can do the same while at the same time allowing the constitution to grow and adapt to changing circumstances and (it is hoped) better moral understandings. It can effect this balancing act so long as the judges, in whom the power of constitutional interpretation and enforcement has largely been placed, are willing to subject their deliberations to the discipline of common law reasoning. Critics, however, remain highly skeptical. Ordinary judges are not, critical theorists will insist, Platonic kings and queens, dispensing justice in the light of objective moral truth. We must always remember, critics insist, that our judges are ordinary, flawed human beings with all the intellectual and moral shortcomings, weaknesses and biases of their fellow human beings. They are also, more often than not, members of a dominant group (e.g., wealthy, white males) who share the social background, education, perspective, and moral values of that group. But if constitutions are all at the mercy of dominant ideologies and the whims and convictions of elite judges, then the kind of protections heralded by the idea of constitutionalism may be a myth, and a harmful one at that.

So what is the solution according to critical theorists? The proffered solutions can vary considerably, depending on how hard-line the theorist tends to be. A theocrat might advocate the complete overthrow of constitutional, democratic government, while a liberal feminist critic might be content to work within existing constitutional systems to eradicate the vestiges of patriarchy which have survived recent feminist movements (MacKinnon, 1989; Strossen 1995). Waldron and his fellow democratic critics ague that we should abandon the practice of constitutional review of legislation under entrenched charters or bills of rights and leave political decisions where they belong: the people and their elected and accountable representatives (Waldron, 1992, 2006; Marmor, 2007). Yet another avenue of response is to highlight the extent to which the critics’ most powerful objections apply only to strong-form review, where judicial decisions are final and can have the effect of nullifying the efforts of democratically accounted legislatures. Having pointed this out, the next move is to recommend weaker forms of review which arguably reflect a healthier balance between respect for fundamental rights, on the one hand, and the importance of democratic procedure on the other (Gardbaum, 2013). Were an effective version of something like Canada’s Section 33 override included within a constitution, the courts might well be able to maintain their intended role as defenders of rights, while leaving the final word to the legislature in cases where intractable differences of opinion run deep.

In recent years another solution has been offered by populism. Although often seen as antithetical to constitutionalism (Müller 2016) because of its perceived tendency towards totalitarianism, populism could instead be viewed as a reaction to a specific form of constitutionalism and the type of constitutional practice to which it lends itself (Vergara 2020). Thus understood, populism targets constitutional constraints that take political power away from the people and place it in the hands of elites, most notably the judges who decide constitutional cases but also, to some extent, elected representatives. Conversely, it favors constitutional arrangements that allow for or encourage broad public participation and deliberation in respect of controversial issues of political morality, especially with a view to empowering and engaging in the political process the marginalised and excluded segments of society (Gargarella 2022). Although this solution is animated by egalitarianism, just like Waldron and other democratic critics, it insists that it is not enough to point to the legislature –even a reasonably well formed one– as the forum that vindicates political equality. Indeed, we may have to look beyond traditional institutional forms to reinvigorate the polity.

Whatever the preferred solution, all critics of constitutionalism seem to agree that progress can be made only if the myths surrounding constitutional protection—the constraining force of original understanding, intention, history, the discipline of common law, and so on— are all exposed, and that the true political forces at work in constitutional practice are acknowledged and dealt with openly. Whether the idea of constitutionalism can survive the lessons of such critical scrutiny is a very good question.


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A special word of thanks to Scott Shapiro for his very helpful comments on an earlier draft of this revised entry.

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