First published Sat May 31, 2003; substantive revision Mon Jun 22, 2020

Sovereignty, though its meanings have varied across history, also has a core meaning, supreme authority within a territory. It is a modern notion of political authority. Historical variants can be understood along three dimensions — the holder of sovereignty, the absoluteness of sovereignty, and the internal and external dimensions of sovereignty. The state is the political institution in which sovereignty is embodied. An assemblage of states forms a sovereign states system.

The history of sovereignty can be understood through two broad movements, manifested in both practical institutions and political thought. The first is the development of a system of sovereign states, culminating at the Peace of Westphalia in 1648. Contemporaneously, sovereignty became prominent in political thought through the writings of Machiavelli, Luther, Bodin, and Hobbes. The second movement is the circumscription of the sovereign state, which began in practice after World War II and has since continued through European integration and the growth and strengthening of laws and practices to protect human rights. The most prominent corresponding political thought occurs in the writings of critics of sovereignty like Bertrand de Jouvenel and Jacques Maritain.

1. A Definition of Sovereignty

In his classic, The King’s Two Bodies (1957), medievalist Ernst Kantorowicz describes a profound transformation in the concept of political authority over the course of the Middle Ages. The change began when the concept of the body of Christ evolved into a notion of two bodies — one, the corpus naturale, the consecrated host on the altar, the other, the corpus mysticum, the social body of the church with its attendant administrative structure. This latter notion — of a collective social organization having an enduring, mystical essence — would come to be transferred to political entities, the body politic. Kantorowicz then describes the emergence, in the late Middle Ages, of the concept of the king’s two bodies, vivified in Shakespeare’s Richard II and applicable to the early modern body politic. Whereas the king’s natural, mortal body would pass away with his death, he was also thought to have an enduring, supernatural one that could not be destroyed, even by assassination, for it represented the mystical dignity and justice of the body politic. The modern polity that emerged dominant in early modern Europe manifested the qualities of the collectivity that Kantorowicz described — a single, unified one, confined within territorial borders, possessing a single set of interests, ruled by an authority that was bundled into a single entity and held supremacy in advancing the interests of the polity. Though in early modern times, kings would hold this authority, later practitioners of it would include the people ruling through a constitution, nations, the Communist Party, dictators, juntas, and theocracies. The modern polity is known as the state, and the fundamental characteristic of authority within it, sovereignty.

The evolution that Kantorowicz described is formative, for sovereignty is a signature feature of modern politics. Some scholars have doubted whether a stable, essential notion of sovereignty exists. But there is in fact a definition that captures what sovereignty came to mean in early modern Europe and of which most subsequent definitions are a variant: supreme authority within a territory. This is the quality that early modern states possessed, but which popes, emperors, kings, bishops, and most nobles and vassals during the Middle Ages lacked.

Each component of this definition highlights an important aspect of the concept. First, a holder of sovereignty possesses authority. That is to say, the person or entity does not merely wield coercive power, defined as A’s ability to cause B to do what he would otherwise not do. Authority is rather what philosopher R.P. Wolff proposed: “the right to command and correlatively the right to be obeyed” (Wolff, 1990, 20). What is most important here is the term “right,” connoting legitimacy. A holder of sovereignty derives authority from some mutually acknowledged source of legitimacy — natural law, a divine mandate, hereditary law, a constitution, even international law. In the contemporary era, some body of law is ubiquitously the source of sovereignty.

But if sovereignty is a matter of authority, it is not a matter of mere authority, but of supreme authority. Supremacy is what makes the constitution of the United States superior to the government of Pennsylvania, or any holder of sovereignty different from a police chief or corporate executive. The holder of sovereignty is superior to all authorities under its purview. Supremacy, too, is endemic to modernity. During the Middle Ages, manifold authorities held some sort of legal warrant for their authority, whether feudal, canonical, or otherwise, but very rarely did such warrant confer supremacy.

A final ingredient of sovereignty is territoriality, also a feature of political authority in modernity. Territoriality is a principle by which members of a community are to be defined. It specifies that their membership derives from their residence within borders. It is a powerful principle, for it defines membership in a way that may not correspond with identity. The borders of a sovereign state may not at all circumscribe a “people” or a “nation,” and may in fact encompass several of these identities, as national self-determination and irredentist movements make evident. It is rather by simple virtue of their location within geographic borders that people belong to a state and fall under the authority of its ruler. It is within a geographic territory that modern sovereigns are supremely authoritative.

Territoriality is now deeply taken for granted. It is a feature of authority all across the globe. Even supranational and international institutions like the European Union and the United Nations are composed of states whose membership is in turn defined territorially. This universality of form is distinctive of modernity and underlines sovereignty’s connection with modernity. Though territoriality has existed in different eras and locales, other principles of membership like family kinship, religion, tribe, and feudal ties have also held great prestige. Most vividly contrasting with territoriality is a wandering tribe, whose authority structure is completely disassociated with a particular piece of land. Territoriality specifies by what quality citizens are subject to authority — their geographic location within a set of boundaries. International relations theorists have indeed pointed out the similarity between sovereignty and another institution in which lines demarcate land — private property. Indeed, the two prominently rose together in the thought of Thomas Hobbes.

Supreme authority within a territory — this is the general definition of sovereignty. Historical manifestations of sovereignty are almost always specific instances of this general definition. It is in fact the instances of which philosophers and the politically motivated have spoken most often, making their claim for the sovereignty of this person or that body of law. Understanding sovereignty, then, involves understanding claims to it, or at least some of the most important of these claims.

Over the past half millennium, these claims have taken extraordinarily diverse forms — nations asserting independence from mother states, communists seeking freedom from colonialists, the vox populi contending with ancien regimes, theocracies who reject the authority of secular states, and sundry others. It is indeed a mark of the resilience and flexibility of the sovereign state that it has accommodated such diverse sorts of authority. Though a catalog of these authorities is not possible here, three dimensions along which they may be understood will help to categorize them: the holders of sovereignty, the absolute or non-absolute nature of sovereignty, and the relationship between the internal and external dimensions of sovereignty.

As suggested, diverse authorities have held sovereignty — kings, dictators, peoples ruling through constitutions, and the like. The character of the holder of supreme authority within a territory is probably the most important dimension of sovereignty. In early modern times, French theorist Jean Bodin thought that sovereignty must reside in a single individual. Both he and English philosopher Thomas Hobbes conceived the sovereign as being above the law. Later thinkers differed, coming to envision new loci for sovereignty, but remaining committed to the principle.

Sovereignty can also be absolute or non-absolute. How is it possible that sovereignty might be non-absolute if it is also supreme? After all, scholars like Alan James argue that sovereignty can only be either present or absent, and cannot exist partially (James 1999, 462–4). But here, absoluteness refers not to the extent or character of sovereignty, which must always be supreme, but rather to the scope of matters over which a holder of authority is sovereign. Bodin and Hobbes envisioned sovereignty as absolute, extending to all matters within the territory, unconditionally. It is possible for an authority to be sovereign over some matters within a territory, but not all. Today, many European Union (EU) member states exhibit non-absoluteness. They are sovereign in governing defense, but not in governing their currencies, trade policies, and many social welfare policies, which they administer in cooperation with EU authorities as set forth in EU law. Absolute sovereignty is quintessential modern sovereignty. But in recent decades, it has begun to be circumscribed by institutions like the EU, the UN’s practices of sanctioning intervention, and the international criminal court.

A final pair of adjectives that define sovereignty is “internal” and “external.” In this case, the words do not describe exclusive sorts of sovereignty, but different aspects of sovereignty that are coexistent and omnipresent. Sovereign authority is exercised within borders, but also, by definition, with respect to outsiders, who may not interfere with the sovereign’s governance. The state has been the chief holder of external sovereignty since the Peace of Westphalia in 1648, after which interference in other states’ governing prerogatives became illegitimate. The concept of sovereignty in international law most often connotes external sovereignty. Alan James similarly conceives of external sovereignty as constitutional independence — a state’s freedom from outside influence upon its basic prerogatives (James 1999, 460–462). Significantly, external sovereignty depends on recognition by outsiders. To states, this recognition is what a no-trespassing law is to private property — a set of mutual understandings that give property, or the state, immunity from outside interference. It is also external sovereignty that establishes the basic condition of international relations — anarchy, meaning the lack of a higher authority that makes claims on lower authorities. An assemblage of states, both internally and externally sovereign, makes up an international system, where sovereign entities ally, trade, make war, and make peace.

2. The Rise of the Sovereign State: Theory and Practice

Supreme authority with a territory — within this definition, sovereignty can then be understood more precisely only through its history. This history can be told as one of two broad movements — the first, a centuries long evolution towards a European continent, then a globe, of sovereign states, the second, a circumscription of absolute sovereign prerogatives in the second half of the twentieth century.

It was at the Peace of Westphalia in 1648 that Europe consolidated its long transition from the Middle Ages to a world of sovereign states. According to historian J.R. Strayer, Britain and France looked a lot like sovereign states by around 1300, their kings possessing supremacy within bounded territories. But as late as the beginning of the Reformation in 1517, Europe remained distant from Westphalia. It was just around then that a great reversal in historical momentum occurred when Charles V of Spain ascended to the throne, uniting Castile, Aragon and the Netherlands, at the same time becoming Holy Roman Emperor, gaining prerogatives over lands in Central Europe, while taking on the role of enforcer of the Catholic Church’s still significant temporal prerogatives inside the Empire, especially its enforcement of ecclesiastical orthodoxy. But within the Empire, Charles V was not sovereign, either, for princes and nobles there retained prerogatives over which he exercised no control. In 1555, a system of sovereign states gained important ground in the Peace of Augsburg, whose formula cuius regio, eius religio, allowed German princes to enforce their own faith within their territory. But Augsburg was unstable. Manifold contests over the settlement’s provisions resulted in constant wars, culminating finally in the Thirty Years War, which did not end until 1648, at the Peace of Westphalia.

What features of Westphalia make it the origin of the sovereign states system? In fact, not all scholars agree that it deserves this status (see Krasner 1999). Nowhere in the settlement’s treaties is a sovereign states system or even the state as the reigning legitimate unit, prescribed. Certainly, Westphalia did not create a sovereign states system ex nihilo, for components of the system had been accumulating for centuries up to the settlement; afterwards, some medieval anomalies persisted. In two broad respects, though, in both legal prerogatives and practical powers, the system of sovereign states triumphed. First, states emerged as virtually the sole form of substantive constitutional authority in Europe, their authority no longer seriously challenged by the Holy Roman Empire. The Netherlands and Switzerland gained uncontested sovereignty, the German states of the Holy Roman Empire accrued the right to ally outside the empire, while both the diplomatic communications and foreign policy designs of contemporary great powers revealed a common understanding of a system of sovereign states. The temporal powers of the Church were also curtailed to the point that they no longer challenged any state’s sovereignty. In reaction, Pope Innocent X condemned the treaties of the peace as “null, void, invalid, iniquitous, unjust, damnable, reprobate, inane, empty of meaning and effect for all time” (quoted in Maland 1966, 16).

Second, Westphalia brought an end to a long era of intervention in matters of religion, up to then the most commonly practiced abridgment of sovereign prerogatives. After decades of armed contestation, the design of the Peace of Augsburg was finally consolidated, not in the exact form of 1555, but effectively establishing the authority of princes and kings over religion. Although intervention in matters of religion did not come to an absolute end, it became exceedingly rare, this in stark contrast to the previous 130 years, when wars of religion sundered Europe. As the sovereign states system became more generalized in ensuing decades, this proscription of intervention would become more generalized, too, evolving into a foundational norm of the international system.

Again, not all scholars agree that Westphalia deserves its ‘founding moment’ status. Daniel Philpott has argued for the orthodoxy in (Philpott, 2001). In recent years, though a number of scholars have come to argue that the Westphalia myth ought to be deconstructed and discarded (Krasner, 1999; Carvalho, Leira, and Hobson, 2011; Nexon, 2009; Osiander, 1994; Osiander, 2001; Teschke, 2009). Generally, these scholars stress that important elements of statehood were around long before Westphalia and that important elements of ‘hierarchy’, or circumscription of sovereignty from above, perdured long after Westphalia. Only the long-term consensus of scholars can determine how Westphalia will continue to be regarded.

Whether the sovereign states system was consolidated at Westphalia, took full shape at a later time, or always remained heterodox, its basic form nevertheless spread worldwide over the next three centuries, culminating in the decline of the European colonial empires in the mid-20th century, when the state became the only form of polity ever to cover the entire land surface of the globe. Today, norms of sovereignty are enshrined in the Charter of the United Nations, whose article 2(4) prohibits attacks on “political independence and territorial integrity,” and whose Article 2(7) sharply restricts intervention.

While the section that follows this one will detail the circumscription of sovereignty following World War II, this broad historical trend should not obscure respects in which sovereignty has persisted and even resurged in recent years. In an important article, international relations scholar Roland Paris (2020) makes the case that global politics is seeing the reemergence of pre-Westphalian notions of sovereignty, including “extralegal” and “organic” versions, which contrast with Westphalian sovereignty and its norms of the legal equality of state and non-interference in domestic affairs. Paris documents this reemergence in Russia under President Vladimir Putin, China under President Xi Jinping, and the United States under President Donald Trump.

As the sovereign state was occupying the European continent, piece by piece, in early modern times, eventually forming the system that came to occupy the globe, contemporary political philosophers embraced this form of polity and described what made it legitimate. They were not originators of the concept, for even during medieval times, philosophers like Dante and Marsilius of Padua advocated a separation of temporal and religious powers that would be achieved through a transfer of prerogatives into temporal ruler’s hands. Then, in early modern times, there were two roughly contemporary philosophers who did not write explicitly or consciously of sovereignty, yet whose ideas amounted in substance to important developments of the concept. Machiavelli observed the politics of city states in his Renaissance Italy and described what a prince had to do to promote a flourishing republic in terms that conferred on him supreme authority within his territory. Manifestly, he was not to be bound by natural law, canon law, Gospel precepts, or any of the norms or authorities that obligated members of Christendom. Rather, he would have to be prepared “not to be good,” and to be ready to perform evil, not because evil was no longer evil, but because it was sometimes necessary to further an end that was central for Machiavelli, an end that amounts to the unifying idea of his thought: the strength and well-ordering of the state. The obligation of the prince was raison d’état. He was supreme within the state’s territory and responsible for the well being of this singular, unitary body.

Purveying sovereignty from quite a different perspective was Martin Luther. His theology of the Reformation advocated stripping the Catholic Church of its many powers, not only its ecclesiastical powers, but powers that are, by any modern definition, temporal. Luther held that the Church should no longer be thought of as a visible, hierarchical institution, but was rather the invisibly united aggregate of local churches that adhered to right doctrine. Thus, the Catholic Church no longer legitimately held vast tracts of land that it taxed and defended, and whose justice it administered; it was no longer legitimate for its bishops to hold temporal offices under princes and kings; nor would the Pope be able to depose secular rulers through his power of excommunication; most importantly, the Holy Roman Emperor would no longer legitimately enforce Catholic uniformity. No longer would the Church and those who acted in its name exercise political or economic authority. Who, then, would take up such relinquished powers? Territorial princes. “By the destruction of the independence of the Church and its hold on an extra-territorial public opinion, the last obstacle to unity within the State was removed,” writes political philosopher J.N. Figgis (72). It was this vision that triumphed at Westphalia.

Luther’s political theology explained all of this. He taught that under God’s authority, two orders with two forms of government existed. “The realm of the spirit” was the order in which Christ was related to the soul of the believer. The realm of the world was the order of secular society, where civil authorities ran governmental institutions through law and coercion. Both realms furthered the good of believers, but in different senses; they were to be separately organized. Leaders of the church would perform spiritual duties; princes, kings and magistrates would perform temporal ones. Freed from the power of the pope and the Catholic Church, having appropriated temporal powers within their realm, princes were now effectively sovereign. In that era, princes even exercised considerable control over Protestant churches, often appointing their regional leaders, as described by the doctrine of “Erastianism.” Though neither Luther nor other Protestant reformers discussed the doctrine of sovereignty in any detail, they prescribed for princes all of its substance. Again, Figgis:

The unity and universality and essential rightness of the sovereign territorial State, and the denial of every extra-territorial or independent communal form of life, are Luther’s lasting contribution to politics. (91)

Other early modern philosophers, of course, espoused the doctrine of sovereignty explicitly, and are thus more familiarly associated with it. French philosopher Jean Bodin was the first European philosopher to treat the concept extensively. His concept of souveraineté featured as a central concept in his work, De la république, which he wrote in 1576, during a time when France was sundered by civil war between Calvinist Huguenots and the Catholic monarchy. He viewed the problem of order as central and did not think that it could be solved through outdated medieval notions of a segmented society, but only through a concept in which rulers and ruled were integrated into a single, unitary body politic that was above any other human law, and was in fact the source of human law. This concept was sovereignty. Only a supreme authority within a territory could strengthen a fractured community.

To be sure, Bodin thought that the body that exercised sovereignty was bound by natural and divine law, though no human law could judge or appeal to it. More curiously, he also thought that sovereignty rightly exercised would respect customary and property rights. It is not clear how such a restraint was to be reconciled with the supreme status of sovereign authority. Possibly, Bodin thought that such rights were to be features of a legal regime which was itself sovereign with respect to other authorities. Indeed, he also thought the form of government that exercised sovereign powers could legitimately vary among monarchy, aristocracy and democracy, though he preferred monarchy. Whatever the sovereign body looked like, though, it was not subject to any external human law or authority within its territory. F.H. Hinsley writes:

At a time when it had become imperative that the conflict between rulers and ruled should be terminated, [Bodin] realized — and it was an impressive intellectual feat — that the conflict would be solved only if it was possible both to establish the existence of a necessarily unrestricted ruling power and to distinguish this power from an absolutism that was free to disregard all laws and regulations. He did this by founding both the legality of this power and the wisdom of observing the limitations which hedged its proper use upon the nature of the body politic as a political society comprising both ruler and ruled — and his statement of sovereignty was the necessary, only possible, result (124–125).

Bodin’s “statement of sovereignty” is the first systematic one in modern European philosophy, and thus deserves a landmark status.

The English philosopher Thomas Hobbes also wrote during a time of civil war and also arrived at the notion of sovereignty as a solution. For Hobbes, the people established sovereign authority through a contract in which they transferred all of their rights to the Leviathan, which represented the abstract notion of the state. The will of the Leviathan reigned supreme and represented the will of all those who had alienated their rights to it. Like Bodin’s sovereign, Hobbes’ Leviathan was above the law, a mortal god unbound by any constitution or contractual obligations with any external party. Like Bodin, Hobbes also thought the sovereign to be accountable to God and most likely to the natural law in some form. Otherwise, though, law was the command of the sovereign ruler, emanating from his will, and the obligation to obey it absolute.

Both Bodin and Hobbes argued for sovereignty as supreme authority. The concept continues to prevail as the presumption of political rule in states throughout the globe today, including ones where the sovereign body of law institutes limited government and civil rights for individuals. Over the centuries, new notions of the holders of sovereignty have evolved. Rousseau, far different from Bodin or Hobbes, saw the collective people within a state as the sovereign, ruling through their general will. In constitutional government, it is the people ruling through a body of law that is sovereign. That is the version that commands legitimacy most commonly in the world today.

Yet versions of sovereignty evocative of Hobbes’ and Bodin’s have carried forth into the twentieth century. Explicitly invoking both of these philosophers was the early twentieth century German philosopher and jurist Carl Schmitt, for instance. His book of 1922 opens with the line, “Sovereign is he who decides on the exception” (trans. G. Schwab, 1985). Schmitt thought that the sovereign was above any constitutional law and ought to be able to “make a decision” on behalf of the good of the state during a time of emergency. He had little respect for liberal constitutionalism, which he thought wholly inadequate to contain the power struggle that politics involves. By and large, there is little indicating that, at least in this work, Schmitt thought the sovereign to be bound by divine law or natural law. The liberal constitutionalism of Weimar Germany was his chief piece of evidence for this conviction; during the 1930s he fervently supported the National Socialist regime, one whose emergency powers were just those that he thought necessary.

3. The Circumscription of the Sovereign State: Theory and Practice

The rise and global expansion of sovereignty, described and even lauded by political philosophers, amounts to one of the most formidable and successful political trends in modern times. But from its earliest days, sovereignty has also met with both doubters and qualified supporters, many of whom have regarded any body of law’s claim to sovereign status as a form of idolatry, sometimes as a carapace behind which rulers carry out cruelties and injustices free from legitimate outside scrutiny. It was indeed after the Holocaust that meaningful legal and institutional circumscriptions of sovereignty in fact arose, many of which have come to abridge the rights of sovereign states quite significantly. The two most prominent curtailments are conventions on human rights and European integration.

It was in 1948 that the vast majority of states signed the Universal Declaration of Human Rights, committing themselves to respect over 30 separate rights for individuals. As it was not a legally binding declaration and contained no enforcement provisions, the declaration left states’ sovereignty intact, but it was a first step towards tethering them to international, universal obligations regarding their internal affairs. Over decades, these human rights would come to enjoy ever stronger legal status. One of the most robust human rights conventions, one that indeed curtails sovereignty, even if mildly, through its arbitration mechanisms, is the European Convention for the Protection of Human Rights and Fundamental Freedoms, formed in 1950. Roughly contemporaneous, signed on December 9, 1948, was the Genocide Convention, committing signing states to refrain from and punish genocide. Then, in the mid-1960’s, two covenants — the Covenant on Civil and Political Rights and the Covenant on Economic, Social and Cultural Rights — legally bound most of the world’s states to respecting the human rights of their people. Again, the signatories’ constitutional authority remained largely intact, since they would not allow any of these commitments to infringe upon their sovereignty. Subsequent human rights covenants, also signed by the vast majority of the world’s states, contained similar reservations.

Only a practice of human rights backed up by military enforcement or robust judicial procedures would circumscribe sovereignty in a serious way. Progress in this direction began to occur after the Cold War through a historic revision of the Peace of Westphalia, one that curtails a norm strongly advanced by its treaties — non-intervention. In a series of several episodes beginning in 1990, the United Nations or another international organization has endorsed a political action, usually involving military force, that the broad consensus of states would have previously regarded as illegitimate interference in internal affairs. The episodes have involved the approval of military operations to remedy an injustice within the boundaries of a state or the outside administration of domestic matters like police operations. Unlike peacekeeping operations during the Cold War, the operations have usually lacked the consent of the government of the target state. They have occurred in Iraq, the former Yugoslavia, Bosnia, Kosovo, Somalia, Rwanda, Haiti, Cambodia, Liberia, Libya and elsewhere. Although the legitimacy and wisdom of individual interventions is often contested among states — the U.S. bombing of Iraq in December 1999 and NATO’s intervention in Kosovo, for instance, failed to elicit U.N. Security Council endorsement, as did the U.S. invasion of Iraq in 2003 — the broad practice of intervention is likely to continue to enjoy broad endorsement within the U.N. Security Council and other international organizations.

An explicit call to revise the concept of sovereignty so as to allow for internationally sanctioned intervention arose with The Responsibility to Protect, a document written and produced in 2001 by the International Commission on Intervention and State Sovereignty, a commission that the Government of Canada convened at the behest of U.N. Secretary General Kofi Annan. The document proposes a strong revision of the classical conception by which sovereignty involves a “responsibility to protect” on the part of a state towards its own citizens, a responsibility that outsiders may assume when a state perpetrates massive injustice or cannot protect its own citizens. Responsibility to Protect has garnered wide international attention and serves as a manifesto for a concept of sovereignty that is non-absolute and conditional upon outside obligations.

The other way in which sovereignty is being circumscribed is through European integration. This idea also arose in reaction to the Holocaust, a calamity that many European leaders attributed at least in part to the sovereign state’s lack of accountability. Historically, the most enthusiastic supporters of European integration have indeed come from Catholic Christian Democratic parties, whose ideals are rooted in medieval Christendom, where at least in theory, no leader was sovereign and all leaders were accountable to a universal set of values. In the modern language of human rights and democracy, they echo Pope Innocent X’s excoriation of the Peace of Westphalia.

European integration began in 1950, when six states formed the European Coal and Steel Community in the Treaty of Paris. The community established joint international authority over the coal and steel industries of these six countries, entailing executive control through a permanent bureaucracy and a decision-making Council of Ministers composed of foreign ministers of each state. This same model was expanded to a general economic zone in the Treaty of Rome in 1957. It was enhanced by a judicial body, the European Court of Justice, and a legislature, the European Parliament, a directly elected Europe-wide body. Over time, European integration has widened, as the institution now consists of twenty-seven members, and deepened, as it did in the 1991 Maastricht Treaty, which expanded the institution’s powers and reconfigured it as the European Union. Far from a replacement for states, the European Union rather “pools” important aspects of their sovereignty into a “supranational” institution in which their freedom of action is constrained (Keohane & Hoffman 1991). They are no longer absolutely sovereign. In recent years, European integration has continued to advance in important respects. On December 1, 2009, the Treaty of Lisbon came into full force, pooling sovereignty further by strengthening the Council of Ministers and the European Parliament, creating a High Representative of the Union for Foreign Affairs and Security Policy to represent a unified European Union position, and making the European Union’s Charter of Fundamental Human Rights legally binding. However, strains on European integration have emerged in recent years as well. A treaty establishing a Constitution for Europe was signed by the European Union’s member states in 2004, but referendums in France and the Netherlands in 2005 rejected it and prevented its ratification. Then, in 2016, a referendum in the United Kingdom resulted in a victory for the U.K.’s withdrawal from the European Union, popularly known as “Brexit.”

This circumscription of the sovereign state, through international norms and supranational institutions, finds a parallel in contemporary philosophers who attack the notion of absolute sovereignty. Their thought is not entirely new, for even in early modern times, philosophers like Hugo Grotius, Alberico Gentili, and Francisco Suarez, though they accepted the state as a legitimate institution, thought that its authority ought to be limited, not absolute. The cruel prince, for instance, could be subject to a disciplining action from neighboring princes that is much like contemporary notions of humanitarian intervention.

Two of the most prominent attacks on sovereignty by political philosophers since World War II came in the 1950s from Bertrand de Jouvenel and Jacques Maritain. In his prominent work of 1957, Sovereignty: An Inquiry Into the Political Good, Jouvenel acknowledges that sovereignty is an important attribute of modern political authority, needed to quell disputes within the state and to muster cooperation in defense against outsiders. But he roundly decries the modern concept of sovereignty, which creates a power who is above the rules, a power whose decrees are to be considered legitimate simply because they emanate from his will. To Jouvenel, sovereignty reached its peak in Hobbes, in whose “horrific conception everything comes back to means of constraint, which enable the sovereign to issue rights and dictate laws in any way he pleases. But these means of constraint are themselves but a fraction of the social forces concentrated in the hand of the sovereign” (197). Despite their differences over the locus and form of sovereignty, subsequent thinkers like Locke, Pufendorf, and Rousseau “were to feel the lure of this mechanically perfect construction” (198). This was “the hour of sovereignty in itself,” writes Jouvenel, the existence of which “hardly anyone would thenceforward have the hardihood to deny” (198).

As his description of Hobbes intimates, Jouvenel views early modern absolute sovereignty with great alarm. “[I]t is the idea itself which is dangerous,” he writes (198). But rather than calling for the concept to be abrogated, he holds that sovereignty must be channeled so that sovereign authority wills nothing but what is legitimate. Far from being defined by the sovereign, morality has an independent validity. Appealing to the perspective of “Christian thinkers,” he argues that “there are . . . wills which are just and wills which are unjust” (201). “Authority,” then, “carries with it the obligation to command the thing that should be commanded” (201). This was the understanding of authority held by the ancien regime, where effective advisers to the monarch could channel his efforts towards the common good. What can channel the sovereign will today? Jouvenel seems to doubt that judicial or constitutional design is alone enough. Rather, he places his hope in the shared moral concepts of the citizenry, which act as a constraint upon the choices of the sovereign.

In Chapter Two of his enduring work of 1951, Man and the State, Jacques Maritain shows little sympathy for sovereignty at all, not even the qualified sympathy of Jouvenel:

It is my contention that political philosophy must get rid of the word, as well as the concept, of Sovereignty:-not because it is an antiquated concept, or by virtue of a sociological-juridical theory of “objective law”; and not only because the concept of Sovereignty creates insuperable difficulties and theoretical entanglements in the field of international law; but because, considered in its genuine meaning, and in the perspective of the proper scientific realm to which it belongs — political philosophy — this concept is intrinsically wrong and bound to mislead us if we keep on using it — assuming that it has been too long and too largely accepted to be permissibly rejected, and unaware of the false connotations that are inherent in it (29–30).

Bodin’s and Hobbes’ mistake was in conceiving of sovereignty as authority that the people permanently transferred and alienated to an external entity, here the monarch. Rather than representing the people and being accountable to it, the sovereign became a transcendent entity, holding the supreme and inalienable right to rule over the people, independently of them, rather than representing the people, accountable to them. Like Jouvenel, Maritain rues the exaltation of the sovereign’s will such that what is just is what serves his interest. This is idolatry. Any transfer of the authority of the body politic either to some part of itself or to some outside entity — the apparatus of the state, a monarch, or even the people — is illegitimate, for the validity of a government is rooted in its relationship to natural law. Sovereignty gives rise to three dysfunctionalities. First, its external dimension renders inconceivable international law and a world state, to both of which Maritain is highly sympathetic. Second, the internal dimension of sovereignty, the absolute power of the state over the body politic, results in centralism, not pluralism. Third, the supreme power of the sovereign state is contrary to the democratic notion of accountability.

As a Catholic philosopher, Maritain’s arguments run similar to Christian philosophers of early modern Europe who criticized absolute sovereignty. Witnessing the rise of the formidable entity of the state, they sought to place limits on its power and authority. They are the ancestors of those who now demand limits on the state’s authority in the name of human rights, of the right to quell genocide and disaster and deliver relief from the outside, of an international criminal court, and of a supranational entity that assumes power of governance over economic, and now, maybe, military affairs.

The case for circumscribing sovereignty remains strong in the Catholic and other Christian traditions. Pope Benedict XVI made a case for the Responsibility to Protect, for instance, in his 2008 speech to the United Nations. In recent years, political philosophers in the liberal tradition have argued for the circumscription of sovereignty as well. Two examples are Thomas Pogge (1992, and 2008, 174–201) and Allen Buchanan (2004). Both accord sovereignty an important but not an absolute moral status, seeking to make room for possibilities such as humanitarian intervention approved by the United Nations and the more robust development of global institutions for fighting poverty.


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