Epistemic Contextualism

First published Fri Sep 7, 2007; substantive revision Tue Dec 15, 2020

Epistemic Contextualism (EC) is a recent and hotly debated position. EC is roughly the view that what is expressed by a knowledge attribution — a claim to the effect that S “knows” that p — depends partly on something in the context of the attributor, and hence the view is often called ‘attributor contextualism’. Because such an utterance is context-dependent, so too is whether the attribution is true. The typical EC view identifies the pivotal contextual features as the attributor’s practical stake in the truth of p, or the prominence in the attributor’s situation of skeptical doubts about knowledge. The typical EC view has it that as the stakes rise or the skeptical doubts become more serious, the contextual standard gets more demanding. It requires S to be in a better position if the attributor’s claim, “S knows that p”, is to express a truth. In contrast, Invariantists about knowledge hold that such factors in the attributor’s context do not affect the standards that must be met by a true “knowledge” attribution.

In addition to marking an important departure from traditional epistemological assumptions, EC is claimed to provide a novel resolution to certain puzzles about knowledge—not least, skeptical ones—as well as to best comport with our everyday “knowledge”-attributing practices. What follows describes the leading forms of EC, so understood, as well as the principal arguments for and major objections to EC. Along the way, EC is situated with respect to certain other views, both kindred and competing.

1. Some Recent History, By Way of Background[1]

EC is a relatively recent development. Nevertheless, in the latter half of the 20th century, several at-times overlapping strands emerged which, in one way or another, made contextual factors of central importance to certain epistemological questions, thereby setting the stage for EC.

One such strand was the entertaining of the possibility of pluralism concerning epistemic standards. In one instance, this took the form of the claim, in response to skepticism, that there are two senses of ‘know’—one strong or philosophical, the other weak or ordinary (see, e.g., Malcolm 1952). So too, some of Wittgenstein’s (1953, 1969) claims about the relation between meaning and use and the multiplicity of “language games” opened the way for a more thoroughgoing semantic pluralism with regard to epistemic concepts and/or terms. Further, in a move foreshadowing contemporary contextualists’ methodology, there was the argument for pluralism from cases: based in part on everyday examples, Hector-Neri Castañeda suggested that “what counts as knowing” might depend on the situation (1980, 217), and Gail Stine claimed that “[i]t is an essential characteristic of our concept of knowledge that tighter criteria are appropriate in different contexts” (Stine 1976, 254).

Second, there was the emergence of Relevant Alternatives (RA) approaches to knowledge. Although, in the hands of Fred Dretske (1970, 1981a,b) and Alvin Goldman (1976), the RA approach was intended as an alternative to justification-centered accounts of knowledge, it also, like the strategy of multiplying senses of ‘know’, promised a way of giving skepticism its due while limiting the threat it posed to our ordinary knowledge claims. The core RA notion is simply that knowing that p requires ruling out only the relevant not-p alternatives. This provides a way of limiting skeptical threats, because skeptical possibilities might not ordinarily be relevant (cf. Austin 1946, 113, 88).

Various specific RA theories differ as to just what ruling out amounts to and what the standard of relevance is—e.g., whether it has to do with “the kind of possibilities that actually exist in the objective situation” (Dretske 1981b, 63; cf. 1981a, 131), or facts about the subject’s psychological/conversational setting (Goldman 1976, 89; 1989, 147). But, insofar as there is some interesting variation in the set of relevant alternatives to a given proposition, we have the possibility of there being a corresponding variation in what it takes to know that p, and so a kind of pluralism here as well.

Third, among some philosophers there was an increasing emphasis on regarding epistemic subjects, activities, and/or accomplishments, as deeply social in previously under-appreciated ways. (For some discussion, see Goldman and O’Connor 2019.) Included here is Richard Rorty’s (1979) “epistemological behaviorism”, as well as perhaps the first explicit statement of a “contextualist” epistemic theory by David Annis. Annis’ theory concerns justification, not knowledge, and it appeals to the subject’s context rather than the attributor’s. According to Annis, while “man is a social animal…when it comes to the justification of beliefs philosophers have tended to ignore this fact” (1978, 215)—more specifically, they have tended to ignore the existence of “contextual parameters essential to justification” (ibid., 213): a person is justified in believing that p only if she can meet certain objections which express real doubts, where it makes a difference just who is expressing the latter (e.g., if the subject is being examined for an M.D. degree, it is important that the objector occupy the appropriate institutional role).

Finally, the potential relevance of social factors to epistemological questions also arose in discussion of Gettier cases. In particular, in response to cases involving evidence one does not possess, John Pollock (1986, 190–193)—citing Harman (1968, 1980), who in turn credits Sosa (1964) with the idea—suggested that there are certain things which we are “socially expected” to be aware of and that such expectations bear upon whether one knows. But if that’s so, and if there is some kind of variability in such expectations, there will be a similar, socially-based variation in the standards for knowledge.

On each of the views or movements just mentioned, context is of central importance in epistemology, in ways not reflected in more traditional analytic writings on the subject. Still, there are important differences among them. Thus, there are some views —such as Annis’, which he intends as an alternative to foundationalism and coherentism—which involve substantive claims about knowledge or justification. On the other hand, some proponents of ideas just mentioned are clearly concerned, not with knowledge or justification per se, but with the linguistic items we use in speaking about such things. For instance, among Castañeda’s goals is to elucidate “the contextual semantics of ‘know’” (1980, 209).

So too, there are clear differences among the views just sketched as to just what context is: sometimes it is conceived in terms of the subject of the “knowledge” attribution, including features of his/her environment; sometimes, the concern is with facts about those who are attributing “knowledge” rather than the subject to whom “knowledge” is attributed (unless it is a self-attribution).[2]

In terms of the views mentioned above, just where to locate a given theory or theorist along both of these dimensions—a substantive versus a semantic orientation; a subject versus attributor conception of context—is not always clear. In current work in epistemology, ‘contextualism’ is used to refer to either of these now more clearly distinguished threads, with the discussion of each going on largely in separation from the other. Thus, on the substantive side, we have Michael Williams (1991, 2001), whose concern is with providing an alternative to “epistemological realism”. According to the latter view, exemplars of knowledge and/or justified belief have some underlying “structural unity” that makes them all instances of a particular kind (1991, 108–109), independently of any “situational, disciplinary and other contextually variable factors” (ibid., 119; 2001, 159ff.). By contrast, as defended by Williams, contextualism—which he sees as present in Dewey, Popper, Austin, and Wittgenstein, for example—is the view that it is only in relation to the latter type of factors that a proposition has any epistemic status at all (ibid.), and that there is no need to suppose that the objects of epistemological inquiry have some underlying unity. Meanwhile, on the semantic side, we have a number of figures, all of whom emphasize moreover the importance of facts about the attributor of “knowledge”—such things as “the purposes, intentions, expectations, presuppositions, etc., of the speakers who utter these sentences” (Cohen, 1999, 187–188; cf. DeRose, 1992, 1995, 2009; Heller, 1999b, 117ff.)—in affecting what is expressed by a given utterance of a ‘knowledge’ sentence.

The relation between these general sorts of contextualism—the substantive and the semantic, as we might label them—is interesting and important. But, as already indicated, the present entry will focus on the semantic view: EC, then, is attributor contextualism.[3]

2. Further Clarification

Again, EC is a semantic thesis: it concerns the truth conditions of ‘knowledge’ sentences, and/or the propositions expressed by utterances thereof.[4] The thesis is that it is only relative to a contextually-determined standard that a ‘knowledge’ sentence expresses a complete proposition: change the standard, and you change what the sentence expresses; acontextually, however, no such proposition is expressed. In this respect, ‘knowledge’ utterances are supposed to resemble utterances involving uncontroversially context-sensitive terms. For instance, just what proposition is expressed by an utterance of

  1. ‘It is raining,’
  2. ‘I’m hungry,’ or
  3. ‘That’s red,’

depends upon such facts as the location or identity of the speaker, and/or the referent of the demonstrative. Similarly, it is plausible (though not universally accepted—see, e.g., Capellen and LePore, 2005a & b) that ‘tallness’ and ‘flatness’ are context-sensitive, insofar as there are varying standards that one might have mind in applying either predicate which affect what is thereby said. Note, though, that insofar as the truth value of such utterances depends on context, that is because their truth conditions—or, the propositions expressed thereby—are so dependent. That is, it is not that (1)-(3) each has fixed truth-evaluable content, the truth value of which depends on context. Rather, what propositions these sentences express depends on the location of the utterer of (1), the identity of the speaker (2), and so on. It is only relative to such facts that tokenings of such sentences have specific contents, and just what contents they do have depends on context. So too for EC. It is misleading to say that ‘knowledge’ sentences’ truth values are context-variable (e.g., Rieber 1998, 190, Cohen 1998, 289 and 2014, 70). According to EC, those truth values shift only because different propositions are expressed in different contexts.

Likewise, just because EC is a thesis about ‘knowledge’ sentences’ truth conditions, it is not a thesis about the nature of the attributed “knowledge”. In the same way: the token-reflexivity of ‘I’ has no metaphysical implications about the self, that ‘here’ is an indexical has no implications about who’s where or what it is to be at some location, etc. So it is misleading too when attributor contextualism is described as bearing on the nature of knowledge or as implying that whether one knows depends upon context (see Bach 2005, 55, n. 4 for some examples). EC concerns the standards, not for the “knowledge” attributed, but for the application of the term ‘knowledge’ and cognate expressions (Feldman 2004, 24; cf. Cohen 1999, 65; Bach 2005, 54–55).

EC, then, is an epistemological theory because, and only because, it concerns sentences using ‘knowledge’ and kindred expressions, as opposed to those employing non-epistemic terms; it is not a theory about any epistemic property or relation itself. Nonetheless, as we will see, when various proponents of EC flesh out their preferred version of the views, the differences among the resulting theories mirror some major lines of division among leading theories of knowledge.

Finally, EC should be distinguished from the general semantical-linguistic approach, or cluster of theses, called “contextualism,” which sees context as central in one or another way to certain fundamental linguistic issues, most centrally meaning itself. (See, e.g., Recanati (1989, 1994, 2005), Searle (1980).)

3. Support for EC: Apparently Inconsistent Knowledge Claims, Skeptical and Everyday

As its proponents generally admit, EC is something that one needs to be argued into: it takes work to come to think, for example, that there can be situations in which we have two subjects, exactly alike psychologically, possessing the very same history and the same evidence with regard to p, etc., with respect to only one of whom ‘S knows that p’ expresses a truth: we seem, if anything, to be intuitive Invariantists.[5] As one leading contextualist says, many resist the contextualist thesis, and “those who do accept [it] generally do so only as a result of being convinced by philosophical reflection” (Cohen 1999, 78).

But while EC strikes many as quite contentious, according to its proponents it has considerable merits. For although EC is not itself a substantive epistemological theory, it has been said to afford a resolution of certain apparent epistemological puzzles. More specifically, EC is said to give us a way of responding to certain cases in which we have apparently inconsistent “knowledge” claims, each of which enjoys some plausibility. Though these puzzles are not exclusively of the skeptical variety, it is EC’s offering a solution to skeptical problems that has figured most prominently in discussions. So that is the natural place to start.

3.1 A Skeptical Puzzle

Consider one form of skeptical argument upon which leading contextualists have focused (e.g., Cohen 1986, 1988, 2014; DeRose 1995; Neta 2003a & b; cf. Unger 1975). (We can call it ‘SA’, for ‘skeptical argument’.) Let ‘h’ stand for some skeptical hypothesis, e.g., that I am a mere brain in a vat of brain nutrients being stimulated to have just those experiences that I have had. Let ‘p’ stand for a mundane external world belief that I seem to know, e.g., that I have hands. Here is the argument:

P1. I don’t know that not-h.
P2. If I don’t know that not-h, then I don’t know that p.
C. So, I don’t know that p.

SA constitutes a puzzle because (a) each of the premises enjoys a fair amount of plausibility. As to P1, how could I know that I’m not a bodiless brain in a vat? By waving my arms around? Wouldn’t that just give me the evidence of some arm-waving experiences that a mere brain in a vat could have? As to P2, it is just an instance of the closure principle for knowledge,[6] which many regard as axiomatic. But (b) given our intuitive anti-skepticism, C seems immensely implausible, even though (c) SA appears to be valid.

On the face of it, then, we are confronted with a paradox—a set of independently plausible but seemingly mutually inconsistent propositions. Because that is the problem, a complete solution to SA will do two things (DeRose 1995): explain which of the ideas lying behind the seeming paradox should be rejected, and why; and explain too why the idea singled out for rejection struck us as plausible in the first place.

3.2 The General Form of the Contextualist Solution

At first blush, it might seem that there are just three possible responses to SA:

  1. we can accept the skeptical conclusion;
  2. we can reject P2 and the closure principle upon which it trades; or
  3. we can reject P1.

Essential to EC is the idea that these three options do not exhaust the possible responses to SA. And, according to proponents of EC, that is a good thing, since they generally hold that skepticism is unacceptable, that the closure principle is extremely plausible, but also that it is hard to see how P1 could be false.[7] But if none of (i)-(iii) make for an attractive response to SA, what is left to deny?

We could conclude (iv) that our concept of knowledge is deeply incoherent, and that epistemological paradoxes such as SA are for this reason irresolvable (Schiffer 1996, 2004). But that strikes many as no more satisfactory than embracing skepticism. Like (i), (iv) is a result to be avoided if at all possible.

Fortunately, according to EC, there is another way out: (v) we can deny that SA’s conclusion threatens our intuitive anti-skepticism. According to EC, recall, the proposition expressed by a tokened ‘knowledge’ sentence depends on context. Thus, if in general a utterance of ‘S knows that p’ is true just in case the subject has a true belief and is in a strong epistemic position, there are variable standards governing just how strong the subject’s epistemic position must be in order for the tokened sentence to express a truth.

In general form, the contextualist’s solution to SA involves claiming that there is something about SA which effects or reflects a change in context. During the course of the reasoning there is a dramatic upwards shift in the standards governing what it takes for a tokening of ‘S knows that p’ to express a truth. In this way, an utterance of SA’s conclusion expresses a truth only because, owing to the introduction of a high-standards context, what it expresses is that the subject does not stand in an extraordinarily strong epistemic position with regard to the proposition that she has hands. But that, of course, is compatible with her meeting less demanding standards, such as those in play in ordinary contexts. Thus, DeRose says:

…our ordinary claims to know [are] safeguarded from the apparently powerful attacks of the skeptic, while, at the same time, the persuasiveness of the skeptical arguments is explained. (DeRose 1992, 917)

Of course, the latter is explained only if we also have an explanation of why we thought that the skeptical argument threatened our ordinary claims to “know”. The contextualist seeks to explain this by claiming that competent speakers can fail to be aware of the context-sensitivity of sentences involving ‘know’:

This misleads them into thinking that certain knowledge ascriptions conflict, when they are in fact compatible. Contextualism thus combines a contextualist semantics for knowledge ascriptions with a kind of error theory—a claim that competent speakers are systematically misled by the contextualist semantics. (Cohen 1999, 77; see too: Cohen 2014, 72; DeRose 1995, 40–41; 1999, 194; 2004b, 37; 2009, 159).

3.3 Some Specific Forms of EC

While the general form of the preceding response to skeptical arguments is widely accepted among contextualists, different proponents of EC have proposed different specific versions of the view, and so explanations of what is going on in such arguments that differ in their details.

Thus, Robert Nozick (1981) is well-known for proposing that knowledge requires sensitive belief, where one’s belief that p (formed via a particular method, M) is sensitive just in case, if p were false, one would not believe (via M) that p. While he does not endorse sensitivity as a general condition on knowing, and is not concerned with giving an account of knowledge itself, Keith DeRose suggests that an utterance of ‘S knows that p’ will tend to express a truth only if S believes that p, p, and S’s epistemic position is such that his belief that p is sensitive (DeRose 1995, 36). And, in the case of SA, the mere uttering of P1 induces very high standards for knowledge, as the belief that I’m not a BIV is manifestly insensitive; and at those very high standards, P1 is true. As for P2, DeRose claims that it is true “regardless of what epistemic standard it is evaluated at” (ibid., 39). As it happens, though, in SA P2 is evaluated at the very high standards put into play by P1. But, then, the only reading on which SA’s conclusion is true is at the unusually inflated standards induced by P1. The truth of C thus allows that we correctly say we “know” that we have hands when lower standards are in play, as they usually are.

DeRose’s brand of EC is externalist, in the sense that it deploys a notion, sensitivity, that has figured in certain externalist theories of knowledge. Likewise externalist is Mark Heller’s brand of EC, which is both reliabilist in spirit and an instance of the RA approach. On Heller’s view (1995), just how reliable a belief-forming process must be for an attribution of “knowledge” to express a truth depends upon context, in the attributor sense introduced above; and the relevant alternatives are those such that, if the process in question is reliable to the contextually required degree, the subject will be able to discriminate between those alternatives and what is in fact the case.

By contrast, Stewart Cohen’s version of EC is internalist.[8] According to Cohen (1986, 1987, 1988, 1999, 2005, 2014) ‘know’ inherits its indexical nature (1988, 97) from that of ‘justified’. Justification comes in degrees; and what counts as justification simpliciter—i.e., justification to the level required for an attribution of “knowledge” to express a truth—is governed by a “rule of salience”(1998, 292, n. 11), whereby one’s evidence/reasons must be good enough to preclude salient possibilities of error. What the skeptic does is make salient certain extraordinary not-p possibilities, with the result that the standard of how good one’s evidence/reasons must be goes way up.

Similar to Cohen’s account is David Lewis’ (1996). According to Lewis:

Subject S knows proposition P iff P holds in every possibility left uneliminated by P’s evidence; equivalently, iff S’s evidence eliminates every possibility in which not-P. (1996, 551)

Why doesn’t this just amount to infallibilism, and so a dramatic shrinking of what we can be said truly to know? Because, according to Lewis, the extension of ‘every’ is restricted to a particular conversational domain (ibid., 553–554). Thus, Lewis thinks, certain not-p possibilities will be “properly ignored” in any given situation. As to what determines whether a given possibility is properly ignored, Lewis suggests a number of rules, including the Rule of Attention: “a possibility that is not ignored is ipso facto not properly ignored” (ibid., 559). And this is why the skeptic’s argument is so irresistible, Lewis thinks. For skepticism—indeed, epistemology generally—just is the making salient of certain possibilities of error. For example, to consider whether we know that we are not BIVs, as assessing the first premise of SA requires, is ipso facto not to ignore that possibility. One’s evidence definitely does not eliminate the possibility if it consists in one’s experiences. So we do in fact have lots of knowledge, according to Lewis, but it is “elusive”: “Examine it, and straightway it vanishes” (ibid., 560).

Michael Blome-Tillman (2009, 2014) has proposed a modification to Lewis’ view. Specifically, Blome-Tillman recommends that Lewis’s Rule of Attention be replaced by the following Rule of Presupposition:

If w is compatible with the speakers’ pragmatic presuppositions in C, then w cannot be properly ignored in C. (2009, 256; 2014, 20)

Here, ‘pragmatic presupposition’ is to be understood along the lines suggested by Stalnaker (1974, 2002). As stated by Blome-Tillman,

x pragmatically presupposes p in C [iff] x is disposed to behave, in her use of language, as if she believed p to be common ground in C. (Ibid.)

Blome-Tillman regards the resultant Presuppositional Epistemic Contextualism as superior to Lewis’s, not least because it allows that the mere mentioning or thinking of a skeptical possibility needn’t make a difference to the contents and truth-values of a given “knowledge” claim—whether it does so depends on whether it effects or reflects a shift in the pragmatic presuppositions of the parties involved.

Still other versions of EC takes the shifting standards to directly govern ascriptions of evidence. For Robert Hambourger, it is “the amount of evidence needed to know a proposition” which “varies with standards of caution” (1987, 260, emphasis added). For Ram Neta, it is not the quantity of evidence required for a truthful utterance of ‘S knows that p’ that is governed by context-sensitive standards, but rather whether certain mental states of the subject’s count as evidence at all. The relevant rule once again bears similarities to those proposed by Cohen and Lewis:

(R) When one raises an hypothesis H that is an uneliminated counterpossibility with respect to S’s knowing that p at t, one restricts what counts in one’s context of appraisal… as S’s body of evidence at t to just those mental states that S has, and would have, at t whether or not H is true. (2002, 674; 2003a, 23–4)

By exploiting this rule, the skeptic is able to disqualify certain mental states—e.g., those involved in my current experience (as) of seeing my hands—as constituting evidence. Although, once again, when the relevant skeptical possibilities are not raised, those experiences qualify as evidence sufficient for truthful ascriptions of “knowledge” that I have hands.

Finally, some theorists have suggested that the context-sensitivity of sentences involving ‘know’ is owing to a more general context-sensitivity in certain explanatory relations and claims. For example, Steven Rieber (1998) has proposed that, in general, S knows that P iff “the fact that P explains why S believes that P” (1998, 194). According to Rieber, however, explanations are always at least implicitly contrastive, and whether one thing explains another will depends upon which contrasts are salient.[9] As just presented, Rieber’s theory concerns the knowledge relation itself; so, in the terminology of Section 1, it would qualify as a substantive contextualist view. But Rieber’s is clearly better construed as a semantic theory, like the other views just sketched. For, as applied to SA, it would have the consequence that what the conclusion of that argument in effect says is something like:

(C′) It is not the case that my having hands rather than my being a handless BIV explains why I believe that I have hands rather than that I’m a handless BIV.[10]

Whereas, that I am a handless BIV is not ordinarily a salient counter-possibility to my having hands. So the truth of C′ is compatible with my ordinary claim to “know”, since the latter might strictly express the proposition that My having hands rather than my having had my hands amputated and replaced with prostheses is what explains why I believe that I have hands rather than that I’ve had my hands amputated and replaced with prostheses.

Another version of EC that features explanatory relations and claims is John Greco’s (2003, 2008, 2009). At the heart of Greco’s view is a certain picture of knowledge—that it is creditable true belief; when one knows, one believes the truth as a result of one’s own efforts and abilities. But when is the attainment of a true belief genuinely creditable to the agent? It is here that contextual matters enter in. For, in general, there can be different—though, importantly, non-competing—accounts of “the cause” of a given thing, event or phenomenon. And now we have an argument for EC: attributing “knowledge” involves giving credit; credit attributions involve a kind of causal explanation; but causal explanations require a contextualist semantics; so “knowledge” attributions require a contextualist semantics too (2009, 107).

As the discussion of this section reveals, there is plenty of room for variety among forms of EC—both about, in Jonathan Schaffer’s (2005, 115) phrase, “which epistemic gear the wheels of context turn,” and about the exact mechanism or rule governing such shifts. Once again, however, there is general consensus among the relevant theorists that context is to be understood in terms of such things as the interests, purposes, expectations, salient possibilities, and so forth, of the attributor. Further, there is consensus that, understood along such lines, context affects the truth-conditional content of ‘knowledge’ sentences—and, in fact, that this phenomenon is what underlies and explains the power of skeptical arguments, even though it also reveals why those arguments do not threaten our ordinary claims to “know”.

Of course, as some proponents of EC point out, contextualists are not forced to any view as to whether and/or under what circumstances, exactly, the skeptic does succeed in raising the standards (Cohen 2001, 92–93; 2014, 71–72; DeRose 2006, Section 6; 2004a; 2009, Chapter 4). Still, that EC promises to provide a plausible response to skeptical puzzles has been among its primary selling points. So the contextualist stands to lose something if it turns out that the skeptic is only very rarely or never able to raise the standards for a “knowledge”-ascribing sentence to express a truth. For then some other account would be required to explain the apparent power of arguments like SA.

3.4 Everyday Cases

While contextualists have claimed that their view promises a novel and appealing resolution of skeptical puzzles like SA, they have also emphasized what they regard as EC’s consonance with our ordinary “knowledge”-attributing practices. There too, they say, we find evidence of the same context-sensitivity which skeptical arguments exploit. As Hookway puts the general claim: “Whether I can correctly claim knowledge appears to be relative to the purposes underlying the conversations to which I am contributing” (1996, 1).

For a couple of reasons, it is very important not to overlook the appeal to everyday cases. First, as we will see, a number of philosophers have questioned how effective EC is in its response to skepticism. If they are right, it matters a great deal that the effectiveness of that response is not EC’s sole basis. Second, as Keith DeRose says, “the contextualist’s appeal to varying standards for knowledge in his solution to skepticism would rightly seem unmotivated and ad hoc if we didn’t have independent reason from non-philosophical talk to think such shifts in the content of knowledge attributions occur” (2002, 169). But in fact, DeRose says, “[t]he best grounds for accepting contextualism concerning knowledge attributions come from how knowledge-attributing (and knowledge-denying) sentences are used in ordinary, non-philosophical talk: What ordinary speakers will count as ‘knowledge’ in some non-philosophical contexts they will deny is such in others” (2005, 172; 2006, 316; 2009, 47). Likewise, Cohen claims that examples such as the following “strongly [suggest] that ascriptions of knowledge are context-sensitive” (1999, 59):[11]

Mary and John are at the L.A. airport contemplating taking a certain flight to New York. They want to know whether the flight has a layover in Chicago. They overhear someone ask a passenger Smith if he knows whether the flight stops in Chicago. Smith looks at the flight itinerary he got from the travel agent and respond, ‘Yes I know—it does stop in Chicago.’ It turns out that Mary and John have a very important business contact they have to make at the Chicago airport. Mary says, ‘How reliable is that itinerary? It could contain a misprint. They could have changed the schedule at the last minute.’ Mary and John agree that Smith doesn’t really know that the plane will stop in Chicago. They decide to check with the airline agent. (Ibid., 58)

Once again, contextualists claim that regarding the truth conditions of sentences using ‘know’ as context-dependent makes best sense of the flexibility in our “knowledge”-attributing behaviour. While, as we have seen, different specific versions of EC are possible, contextualists tend to agree that, in everyday cases, such as that just described, the increased practical importance of the subjects’ “getting it right” tends to raise the standards for the truth of a sentence of the form ‘S knows that p’. (Keep in mind, though, a point stressed in Section 2: namely, that just what an utterance of such a sentence expresses changes, in the ‘high stakes’ case, to some more demanding proposition—we do not have a fixed such proposition, with different standards for its truth applying in the more demanding context.) The result is that the “knowledge” denial (Mary and John’s claim) in the high-stakes situation may be true, without affecting the truth of the low stakes claim to “know” (by Smith himself). What reason is there, though, for adopting this way of resolving the apparent incompatibility between the two ‘knowledge’ utterances?

Well, it is important that the low-stakes claim be true, since that preserves our intuitive anti-skepticism: if you cannot know on the basis of ordinary, non-entailing evidence such as what is printed in the flight itinerary, we will have to deny very many of our ordinary claims to “know” (Ibid., 59). But, it is argued, the ‘high stakes’ denial seems right too—that is why the relevant (paired) cases constitute a puzzle. And EC allows us to preserve the sense that in such cases each of the two speakers is speaking ‘properly’, and “the presumption that what is properly said is true” (DeRose 2005, 181). Whereas, if we take John and Mary’s stricter standard to be too demanding—if their denial of “knowledge” to Smith is false—then, not only must we reject the feeling that what they are saying is in some sense correct, but it is “hard to see how Mary and John should describe their situation”:

Certainly they are being prudent in refusing to rely on the itinerary. They have a very important meeting in Chicago. Yet if Smith knows on the basis of the itinerary that the flight stops in Chicago, what should they have said? ‘Okay, Smith knows that the flight stops in Chicago, but still, we need to check further.’ To my ear, it is hard to make sense of that claim. (Cohen 1999, 58–9)

But we can avoid having to make sense of such claims, and having to explain why we mistakenly thought that what Mary and John were saying was correct, if we accept EC: in everyday no less than skeptical contexts, the sentences used by someone in a ‘high-stakes’ context and by his/her ‘low stakes’ counterpart can both be true, since they are made in different contexts, and (in some cases anyway[12]) the propositions they express are not really conflicting after all.

In short, contextualism promises to deliver up a nice symmetry between the flexibility in our (alleged) judgments as to the truth of a given “knowledge” claim/denial, and a parallel plasticity in the truth conditions (hence, the truth values) of the ‘knowledge’ sentences we are prepared to assert. On the assumption that speakers realize, however tacitly, that what is expressed by an utterance of ‘S knows (/doesn’t know) that p’ is a context-sensitive matter, this explains the aforementioned flexibility in our “knowledge”-attributing behavior.

3.5 Other Cases, Other Differences—the Lottery, Gettier, Closure

There are some knowledge claims (/denials) which, though they concern everyday matters, can seem to threaten skeptical consequences. As we saw, the perhaps-natural denial of knowledge to Smith, in the preceding example, is like this. Another example involves the lottery paradox. Thus, while the probability of holding the winning ticket in a fair lottery may be extremely small (assuming there are many tickets and only one winner), many balk at crediting any given ticket-holder with knowledge that their ticket is not the winner. But why should that be if, as fallibilism has it, one does not need evidence that guarantees the truth of a belief in order to know?

Several contextualists (e.g., Cohen 1988, 1998; Lewis 1996; Neta 2002; Rieber 1998) have suggested that we can resolve the lottery paradox by means of the same device(s) used to explain both skeptical paradoxes and seeming inconsistencies among everyday “knowledge” attributions:[13] in brief, we are reluctant to attribute “knowledge” to the subject in the lottery case just because the possibility of error has been made salient; but if we are, instead, focusing on the vast improbability of his ticket’s being the winner, that he does “know” that he will lose can seem like the right thing to say; and, as above, EC enables us regard both of the relevant claims as expressing truths, albeit in different contexts.

Some contextualists again—notably Lewis (1996) and Greco (2003, 2009)—have assayed extending EC to the Gettier problem. According to them, EC explains why certain cases of justified true belief are not correctly said to be “knowledge”, as Gettier showed. (On the Gettier problem, see Ichikawa and Steup 2018, Section 3). But this remains a much more controversial move among proponents of EC. (Cohen 1998 and Heller 1999b, e.g., criticize Lewis on this score.)

Further, there is some disagreement among contextualists as to the status of the closure principle for knowledge, mentioned in Section 3.1 above. While Mark Heller dissents (see note #7), the majority view is that closure should be preserved, but also that it should be seen as holding only within a given context, on pain of equivocation. As such disagreement illustrates, what one makes of closure and of EC are orthogonal issues. Each of EC, closure, and RA, then, may be endorsed/rejected without taking a stand on either of the remaining issues.

Finally, while the differences among particular versions of EC can be significant, they tend to recede into the background in critical discussions of the view. Objections to EC (a) deny that EC really has the advantages that have been claimed for it, (b) assert that EC has certain problematic features or consequences, and/or (c) allege that EC does not in fact constitute the best response to the data which are supposed to motivate it. And, to a very great extent, such objections to EC are directed towards the central contextualist thesis per se and so are independent of the details of any particular contextualist theory.

4. Critical Reactions, Contextualist Responses

4.1 Some Initial Objections

Among objections to EC which have been made, some are more easily dealt with than others. For instance, Fred Dretske objects to the contextualist’s response to skeptical problems as follows:

Skepticism, as a doctrine about what ordinary people know, cannot be made true by being put in the mouth of a skeptic. Treating knowledge as an indexical…[, however,] seems to have, or to come dangerously close to having, exactly this result. For this reason (among others) I reject it. (Dretske 1991, 192)

To this, however, the contextualist can reply that it is incorrect to say that EC, even where it allows the skeptic to successfully state some truth in uttering ‘You don’t know that p‘, thereby makes it easy for skepticism to be true. To suppose that it does requires denying the EC view that ‘knowledge’ sentences have context-sensitive contents—hence that skeptic’s denials are true at the expense of the truth of our ordinary claims to “know”. (As we will see presently, there is another way of construing Dretske’s objection, whereby it does not misfire in this way.)

For a second objection to EC that is not terribly effective, consider Palle Yourgrau’s contention that EC licenses bizarre dialogues, such as the following:

A: Is that a zebra?

B: Yes, it is a zebra.

A: But can you rule out its being merely a cleverly painted mule?

B: No, I cannot.

A: So, you admit you didn’t know it was a zebra?

B: No, I did know then that it was a zebra. But after your question, I no longer know. (1983, 183)

At least some versions of EC do not license such dialogues, however. According to them, the last reply by B is incorrect. Once the disguised zebra possibility is mentioned by A, B’s “knowing” that it is a zebra requires B’s being able to rule out that possibility and B cannot do that. According to these versions of EC, B would be speaking truly if B were then to admit that he did not “know” it was a zebra (DeRose 2000).

According to Keith DeRose (ibid., Section 6), what EC does license, in terms of legitimate ways for B to close out the dialogue, are only metalinguistic claims like:

I was previously such that an utterance of ‘B knows it is a zebra’ would have expressed a true proposition, but the different and more demanding proposition which such an utterance would now express would not be true.

Nikola Kompa (2002, 5) has observed that EC would also seemingly permit B to say,

Had I uttered ‘I know it is a zebra’ earlier, I would thereby have expressed a truth, but I do not know that it is a zebra.

Kompa calls this “an unpleasant consequence” of EC. And one might similarly regard claims in which there is explicit relativization of ‘know’ to the relevant standards, as in,

I knowS1 that it is a zebra, but I don’t knowS2 that it is a zebra.

As Kent Bach (2005, 58–61) says, there is nothing in EC that precludes the legitimacy of such claims. After all, they merely involve making explicit what are, according to EC, the propositions expressed by the relevant utterances. But the contextualist may reply that any unpleasantness or feeling of unfamiliarity attending such claims stems from our failing to be fully aware of the context-sensitivity of the expressions in question. (Compare how Cohen (2001, 89) responds to a certain objection of Feldman’s (2001, 77).) Whether this sort of error theory is problematic is a separate issue, discussed below.

That EC concerns ‘knowledge’, rather than knowledge, might help to defuse other concerns about EC. As noted above, Lewis says dramatic and apparently troubling things when discussing his contextualist theory. For example, he says that once certain skeptical possibilities are raised “[knowledge] vanishes” (1996, 560). But his theory implies this only because Lewis is using the word ‘knowledge’ in a context where skeptical possibilities are not properly ignored and not excluded by his evidence. A contextualist can contend that this is less troubling than it might seem. Lewis’s theory does not imply that this vanishing extends to ordinary claims to “knowledge” outside of skepticial contexts. They remain true. Because it suggests otherwise, Lewis’s speaking of knowledge “vanishing”, as opposed to the falsity of certain propositions expressed by ‘knowledge’ sentences, is misleading (see Bach 2005, 54–55, and DeRose 2000).

4.2 EC and Skepticism

While a reminder that EC is a semantic or metalinguistic thesis helps both to defuse certain objections and to expose as misleading Lewisian presentations of the view, it also sets the stage for a more difficult objection for contextualists to counter: namely, that it does not successfully respond to skepticism.

On one version of this complaint (e.g., Feldman 2001, Conee 2014), it is said that EC per se does not generate the results essential to the contextualist resolution of SA, for example. That the propositions expressed by utterances of ‘knowledge’ sentences in ordinary contexts are true, for example, is not secured by EC on its own; only a substantive theory of what is required for the truth of a ‘knowledge’ claim (in context) can deliver that result. On another version, the objection is simply that EC does not correctly characterize the skeptic’s position at all. As we have seen, EC has it that skeptical claims express truths only relative to extraordinarily high epistemic standards. But surely, the objection runs, what is at issue between skeptics and non-skeptics is the quality of the evidence we in fact have, and whether we satisfy even our ordinary epistemic standards (see Kornblith 2000, 27; Feldman 2004, 32; cf. Feldman 1999, 2001).

While he is prepared to grant the contextualist his/her semantic thesis, Ernest Sosa (2000) likewise takes it to have limited relevance to epistemology generally. For, just because it is restricted to certain metalinguistic claims, EC has only limited significance for skepticism: from the fact that, in non-skeptical contexts, we can use ‘S knows that p’ to express propositions which are true, nothing follows about whether we know anything—a question which we can and do wonder about in philosophical contexts. The proponent of EC might deny that whether an utterance of ‘S knows that p’ expresses a truth admits of any acontextual answer. But Sosa’s objection does not imply that those utterances have a truth value outside of any context. The objection specifies one or more contexts—namely, the context(s) of philosophical discourse about “knowledge”.

Several proponents of EC have offered replies to the charge that EC does not fairly characterize and/or engage with skepticism. While allowing that the complaint may apply to other forms of EC, Neta claims that, on his version, the skeptic “is not making the uninteresting claim that we do not meet unusually stringent standards of knowledge. Rather, she is claiming that we do not meet ordinary standards for knowledge” (2003b, 2). In reply, however, the objector may press that, as Neta says, and as we saw above, the skeptic is able to do this on his view only because she “disqualif[ies] certain mental states from counting as evidence” (ibid.). And one might think that that constitutes the imposition of unusually high epistemic standards.

Responding to Sosa (2000), Cohen (1999, 79–80) writes that, by his lights, what is troubling about skepticism is the idea that, in saying things of the form, “S knows that p”, we have all along been expressing falsehoods (cf. DeRose 2004b, 37). The point of EC is not to show that we know, or even that our ordinary “knowledge” claims express true propositions; it is, rather, to reconcile the presumed truth of such claims with the apparent truth of the premises of SA (Cohen 2001, 95–96; DeRose 1995 characterizes the problem posed by SA in very similar terms). And EC shows us how we might do so. But, Sosa counters, insofar as non-skeptics wish to preserve and defend a “Moorean stance”, the latter is not a metalinguistic claim to the effect that folks in ordinary situations who claim to “know” express truths. Rather, the latter “is a stance, adopted in a philosophical context, about what one then knows and, by extension, what people ordinarily know. At a minimum it is a stance about whether people are right in their ordinary claims to know, which is not quite the same as whether they are right in their ordinary utterances of the form ‘I know that p’.” So “[o]nce we abandon the object language and ascend to the metalanguage,” as a proper understanding of EC requires, “we abandon thereby the Moorean stance” (Sosa 2004, 281).

This last claim of Sosa’s brings us back to an earlier point. There seems to be a good sense in which, when epistemologists carefully consider the extent of our knowledge, the cogency (or not) of various skeptical arguments, and so on, they occupy a single, shared context (Conee 2014, 66). Within that context, some deny that we know very much, while their anti-skeptical counterparts insist that we do. But to hold, as EC’s proffered handling of SA implies, that in this context it is the skeptic’s claims that are true is not licensed by EC itself: the propositions expressed by knowledge sentences may be contextually variable, but that does not tell us, concerning some particular context such as a philosophical dispute, which specific such propositions are true, and which false. (It is possible to read Dretske’s objection to EC, mentioned in the previous Section, as intended to make essentially this point.)

In response, the contextualist may deny that there is, in fact, a single, shared context constituted by serious epistemological discussion. (DeRose’s 2004a, and Chapter 4 of his 2009, are an extended discussion of just this topic; see too Cohen 2014, 72–73.) So too, she may grant—which, as noted above (Section 3.3), some proponents of EC readily do—that contextualists are not forced to any view as to whether and/or under what circumstances the skeptic’s claims do express truths, while still insisting that EC provides the basis for an appealing resolution of puzzles like SA (Cohen 2014, 71–73). Of course, such moves may in turn give rise to further worries. For example, if there is no single, shared context constituted by serious epistemological discussion, perhaps that is true of all domains of specialized discourse. If so, one might worry that that threatens to dissolve all apparently substantive disagreements among specialists.[14]

Clearly, the effectiveness of EC in addressing and resolving skeptical problems is far from settled. It would appear, however, that one’s verdict on this matter will depend in no small part upon just what one takes the problem posed by skepticism to be, and also perhaps upon facts about particular contextualist views which go beyond an endorsement of EC per se.

4.3 EC’s Error Theory

One of the major attractions of EC is said to be that it enables the resolution of certain apparent conflicts among sets of individually plausible claims without forcing us to deny any of them.[15] As Crispin Wright puts it, a good part of the appeal of EC is that it seems to enable a “‘no-fault’ view of certain (potentially) intransigent disputes where we have to hand no ready conception of a further fact which would make one party right at the expense of the other” (2005, 240).

However, as we saw above, contextualists are committed to a certain error theory. After all, that EC is correct is supposed to be a quite recent discovery. Further, in those cases in which speakers’ claims about who does/doesn’t “know” are said by the contextualist not to conflict, there persists the sense that they are cannot both be speaking truly. For instance, our ordinary claims to “know” various things seem to be what the skeptic is denying—that is why skepticism has seemed to pose a problem to which EC is said to constitute a novel solution. The contextualist seeks to explain why we might think this—more generally, why we might think that what is said in a given ‘high stakes’ case is incompatible with what is said in its ‘low stakes’ counterpart—by suggesting that we fail to fully appreciate the contextualist semantics and/or to faithfully track shifts in context (see, e.g.: Cohen 1999, 77; 2001, 89; 2014, 73; cf. DeRose 1999, 194; 1995, 40–41; 2004b, 37).

According to another often-voiced objection to EC (in, e.g., Schiffer 1996, Hofweber 1999, Rysiew 2001, Hawthorne 2004, Conee 2014, Williamson 2005a, Egan et al. 2005), its error theory is problematic. As formulated by Stephen Schiffer, the objection is simply that it is implausible that we would get “bamboozled by our own words” (ibid., 329) in the way the contextualist alleges, since “speakers would know what they were saying if knowledge sentences were indexical in the way the Contextualist requires” (ibid.: 328).

Is this a good objection? On the face of it, it might seem not. With respect to SA above, for example, the two premises are individually quite plausible, the argument appears valid, yet the conclusion seems very implausible. So, “something plausible has to go” (DeRose 1995, 2; emphasis added). Thus, that EC is not an entirely no fault view might mean, as Timothy Williamson has argued (2005b, Section II), that considerations of charity per se do not favor it. But why think that the contextualist’s error theory is problematic? This is one of the ways in which Cohen has responded to concerns about EC’s error theory (2014, 82–83).[16] DeRose (2006; 2009, Chapter 5; see too Montminy 2009) replies along similar lines: if you present a group of subjects with SA, for instance, and ask them whether the conclusion contradicts an ordinary claim to “know” such a thing, some will say “yes”, and some will say “no”. If EC turns out to be true, then many are blind to that, and so on. So, whichever view turns out to be right, EC or Invariantism, a substantial portion of ordinary speakers are afflicted by “semantic blindness” (Hawthorne 2004, 107).

In assessing this type of response to the objection under consideration, it is important to separate out two questions: First, whether, considered on its own, the contextualist’s error theory is plausible. Second, whether that theory raises any problems internal to the contextualist view.

As to the first question, there are precedents for the type of error that the contextualist says is going on with respect to at least some of our “knowledge” attributions. For example, by implicitly raising the standards—drawing attention to previously disregarded bumps, etc.—you can get a competent speaker to take seriously “flatness skepticism”, the view that nothing’s really flat (Cohen 1999, 78–79; 2004, 193; 2014, 73, 82–83). But this can take place only because,

…although ascriptions of flatness are context-sensitive, competent speakers can fail to realize this. And because they can fail to realize this, they can mistakenly think that their reluctance to ascribe flatness, in a context where the standards are at the extreme, conflicts with their ascriptions of flatness in everyday contexts. (Cohen 2001, 91; 1999, 79)

However, when an apparent incompatibility between certain uttered sentences is actually due to their expressing different propositions in different contexts, once we see that this is so, any appearance that the sentences are incompatible tends to go away. Thus, we might ‘disagree’ over whether Kansas is flat, but once it is made clear that you mean relatively unmountainous and I mean devoid of any hills at all, we quickly agree that we were both right all along. But for many, this does not happen when they are presented with the proposed contextualist resolution to the problem cases which motivate it (Conee 2014, 68, 78; Feldman 2001, 73, 77–78; Rysiew 2001, 484–485).

Acknowledging this difference, Cohen notes that we already know that there are “varying degrees to which competent speakers are blind to the context-sensitivity in the language” (2014, 74). The context-sensitivity of indexicals like ‘I’ and ‘now’ are easy to spot, that of ‘flat’ somewhat harder. And for ‘know’, “it may be very difficult even after some amount of reflection for competent speakers to accept context-sensitivity. It may take subtle philosophical considerations concerning the best way to resolve a paradox in order to ‘see’ the context-sensitivity of ‘knows’” (ibid.).

Bolstering the latter suggestion are cases involving what Thomas Hofweber (1999, 98ff.) calls “hidden relativity”. For example, according to Hofweber, our claim, “August is a summer month,” presumes that we are in the Northern hemisphere.[17] A speaker may not be aware of this, however; and even those who are aware of it do not feel compelled to make that parameter explicit whenever they utter the relevant sort of sentence. So, when Schiffer says, “no ordinary person would dream of telling you that what he meant and was implicitly stating was that he knew that p relative to such-and-such standard” (1996, 326ff.), that in itself does not show that no such relativization is in play.

It is not clear, however, whether Hofweber’s hidden relativities provide a model for our supposed ignorance of the context-sensitivity of ‘knowledge’ sentences. For, while many competent speakers of English are unaware of the (alleged) relativity of ‘summer month’, once they are made aware of it, they do not actively resist its being made explicit. Whereas, when the alleged relativizations within knowledge sentences are made explicit—“Smith doesn’t knowS that the flight stops in Chicago,” etc. (Bach 2005, Section I)—they are often met with resistance and regarded as highlighting the controversial character of EC.[18]

Further, as Hofweber says (1999, 101–2), with regard to ‘summer month’, say, there is a plausible explanation of why the relativization in question can be hidden for many speakers and, even among those who are aware of it, rarely be made explicit—namely, that most of the people with whom we discuss such things are geographically close to us. Because of this, the relativity to a hemisphere very rarely makes a difference to uses of ‘summer’. Whereas, the evidence for contextualism requires that there be some interesting variation among the standards which determine a ‘knowledge’ sentence’s truth-conditions within this or that linguistic community, and it requires that we be guided in our everyday “knowledge”-attributing behavior by an awareness of just this fact.

This last point brings out the second question concerning the contextualist’s error theory mentioned above—namely, whether that theory raises any problems internal to the contextualist view. For, to the extent that the context-sensitivity of the relevant expressions can remain deeply hidden, even after careful reflection, it becomes less clear that in the cases of concern (SA, the airport example, etc.) what is driving our judgments as to whether what speakers say is ‘true and proper’ is, as the contextualist says, our awareness of that context-sensitivity (Rysiew 2007, 653; 2012a, 137). The contextualist must thus strike “a delicate balance” (Conee 2014, 67–68) between crediting us with a grasp of the context-sensitivity of ‘knowledge’ sentences, while at the same time attributing to us a failure to fully grasp it.

Finally, as Ram Neta observes, in Hofweber’s cases it is some worldly fact about the phenomenon in question of which people are ignorant. Whereas,

…the contextualist does not want to say that our semantic ignorance about our knowledge attributions results from our ignorance of the real nature of knowledge. Rather, it is supposed to result from our ignorance about the way in which the content of those attributions depends upon contextual factors. (2003a, 404)

And, as we have seen, far from referring to various worldly phenomena, ‘context’ is generally said by contextualists to refer to such things as the purposes, intentions, expectations, presuppositions, etc., of the speakers who utter those sentences. (The same sorts of things, plausibly, which are responsible for determining what is expressed by attributions of flatness, say.)

According to some (e.g., Rysiew 2001, 485, 507), this last point of dissimilarity between Hofweber’s hidden relativities and that which contextualists allege intensifies concerns about the latter’s error theory. For it seems to imply a quite specific deficit in “our powers of semantic self-knowledge” (Neta 2003a, 408): to say that we conflate contexts (Cohen 2014, 82) is to say that we are mixed up about what our intentions, purposes, etc., are when we utter ‘knowledge’ sentences. That sort of thing does sometimes happen. (Neta—ibid., 407–408—describes one such case.) Still, and whether or not it constitutes a deficit in “semantic self-knowledge,” exactly, it would be good if we had some explanation as to why many have such a hard time coming to terms with the truth of EC when the context-sensitivity of other terms is fairly easily accepted. Cohen has tentatively suggested that considerations of value might explain this:

We value justification and knowledge. But contextualist theories are deflationary. Contextualism about knowledge says that most of our everyday utterances of the form ‘S knows P’ are true, even though the strength of epistemic position in those instances does not meet our highest standards. In the same way, contextualism about flatness says that most of our everyday utterances of sentences of the form ‘X is flat’ are true, even though X’s surface may fall short of perfect flatness.

In other words, contextualism is a ‘good news, bad news’ theory. The good news is that we have lots of knowledge and many surfaces are flat; the bad news is that knowledge and flatness are not all they were cracked up to be. We find this much easier to accept in the case of flatness than knowledge, because ascriptions of flatness do not have the normative force that ascriptions of knowledge/justification do. (2005a, 61–2; cf. 2004, 193)

It is not clear whether this suggested explanation represents a step forward. At most, it seems, it would explain why we might be disappointed by what ‘knowledge’ typically designates; it would not explain why we have difficulty recognizing the alleged context-sensitivity in question. In any case, it should by now be clear that we have moved beyond considerations of the contextualist’s imputation of error to ordinary speakers per se. While we are not faultless in out tacit semantic understanding, the specific ignorance asserted in defense of EC is disputable.

4.4 Linguistic Issues

According to EC, ‘know’ is a context-sensitive term. Among proponents of EC, however, there has been relatively little discussion, and little agreement, about what linguistic model best captures this fact. Thus, Cohen (1988, 97) speaks of ‘knowledge’ as “an indexical”,[19] Hambourger (1987, 262) likens it to ‘large’, Heller (1999a, 206; 1999b, 121) says that it is a vague term, and DeRose, while at one point (1992, 920–921) using an analogy with the demonstrative ‘this’, tends to be noncommittal as to the appropriate model for ‘know’.

It has been objected, however, that regardless of which model is adopted, the linguistic data surrounding ‘know’ and cognate expressions is not what one would expect were the term genuinely context-sensitive. For example, Jason Stanley (2004) argues that, unlike terms like ‘flat’ and ‘tall’, ‘know’ is not clearly gradable. Thus, it makes sense to describe someone as “very tall”; but while I might say that someone knows something “very well,” ‘very’ does not appear here to be functioning as a degree modifier. And while ‘justified’ is obviously gradable, even if gradability were sufficient for context-sensitivity, from the fact that knowledge requires justification it would not follow that ‘know’ is context-sensitive as well (pace Cohen 1999, 60). Nor, Stanley argues, does ‘know’ behave like indexicals (‘I’, ‘here’) or relational terms (such as ‘enemy’).

In a related argument, John Hawthorne points out that with uncontroversially context-dependent terms, we naturally employ “the clarification technique”. An example from the previous Section illustrates the point: I balk at your claim that Kansas is flat, pointing out that there is a small rise just ahead. Rather than admitting to a mistake (‘concession’) or simply repeating your claim (‘sticking to one’s guns’), you clarify: “Well, what I meant was that there are very few mountains.” Hawthorne’s point is that we have very few techniques of clarification in the case of ‘know’; whereas, it “is through the clarification technique that sensitivity to context-dependence is manifested” (2004, 104-106).

Finally, Herman Capellen and Ernie Lepore (2003) argue that, according to certain tests for genuine context-sensitivity, ‘know’ just does not pass muster. (In their discussion, examples like the one illustrating the “unpleasant consequence” of EC mentioned in 4.1, above, loom large.)

Responses on behalf of EC to such arguments vary. Commenting on Stanley, Barbara Partee (2004) agrees that ‘know’ is indeed unlike expressions such as ‘tall’, but that perhaps better models are available. Nikola Kompa (2002) suggests that the context-sensitivity of ‘know’ is best understood as deriving from a sui generis sort of “unspecificity”. And Rob Stainton (2010), while sympathetic to the claim that ‘know’ is not itself context-sensitive, believes that the “spirit” of EC can be saved: if there are pragmatic determinants of what is stated/asserted, then what is stated (/etc.) in different uses of ‘knowledge’ sentences can vary in truth-conditional content, even if ‘know’ is not context-sensitive. (Here, there is a connection between EC and its philosophy-of-language namesake, mentioned in Section 2. On one formulation of the latter, as a quite general matter “what is said” is importantly determined by extra-semantic factors. A similar connection is evident in Charles Travis’ 2005 paper.)

Ceding less ground, Peter Ludlow argues that questions about gradability are too crude a standard by which to judge whether ‘know’ is context-sensitive. Ludlow disagrees with Hawthorne about the prevalence of clarificatory devices for ‘know’ and argues that there is good reason to think its semantics includes placeholder(s) for variable standards. Like DeRose (2005), Ludlow casts EC as a piece of ‘ordinary language’ philosophy, and in that spirit he presents the results of Google searches in which clauses like, “…by objective standards”, “…with some certainty”, “…doggone well…”, and so on, accompany uses of ‘know’. The latter are more data to be mulled over in considering possible linguistic bases for EC. In general, from the fact that different standards are employed, even explicitly adverted to, in making some evaluative judgments in different domains, it does not immediately follow that a contextualistic semantics for the relevant terms is correct (Conee 2014, 64). Some standards that we employ in making a statement, for example, are understood to be merely guidelines or rule of thumb, not direct applications of the statement’s truth conditions. Questions about the proper handling of such data as Ludlow cites—e.g., whether the relevant utterances involve the making-explicit of context-variable standards for “knowledge”, or the conveying of information over and above that encoded in the word itself—arise as much here as with the considerations initially used to motivate EC.

4.5 Further Issues—Epistemic Modals, Thought, Preservation and Transfer of Information, Practical Reasoning, Attitude Reports

Questions have been raised about EC’s ability to account for certain other data. Andy Egan et al. (2005) argue that Relativism, rather than EC, gets the semantics of epistemic modals right. According to Relativism (see Section 6), the truth values of knowledge sentences depend upon the standards in play in the contexts in which they are assessed, as opposed to the standards operative in either the subject’s or the attributor’s context. Bach (2005, 66) and Feldman (2004, 27) question whether the contextualist model might apply to one’s thoughts about whether various ‘knowledge’ sentences express truths. Timothy Williamson (2005a, 100–101) and John Hawthorne (2004, 109–110) raise related concerns about the preservation of information in memory and testimony: storing or conveying the information that ‘S knows that p [plus some date index]’ may lead to problems, since subsequent uses of that information may occur in contexts in which different standards are in effect. In addition, Williamson (ibid., 102ff.) argues that EC, because it privileges attributor over subject factors, does not respect the autonomy of the subject, qua agent, in settling the contents of questions involved in practical decision making. And Hawthorne (ibid., 98ff.) contends that EC has implausible consequences for reports of propositional attitudes in which ‘know’ occurs.

Whether such criticisms are effective against EC is controversial. (See DeRose 1995, 6–7 and Rieber 1998, 197, e.g., on the extension of EC to one’s thoughts; DeRose 2006, Section 4; 2009, 161–166; and Cohen 2005, 201–206 reply to Hawthorne’s arguments concerning belief reports.) However, whatever we make of these issues, not to mention the ones earlier raised, they could give us reason to reject EC only if there were some viable alternative explanation of the relevant data—in particular, of the apparently inconsistent “knowledge” claims described in Section 3. Whereas, if we could explain those data without introducing a novel view of the semantics of ‘know’, that would considerably weaken the case for EC.

4.6 Some Proposed Invariantist Treatments of the Data

Among critics of EC, at least three such purported explanations have emerged.[20] Since each is intended to preserve the thought that we do ordinarily know many things, the granting of knowledge in the relevant ‘low standards’ case is taken to express a truth. What needs explaining, then, is why denying knowledge to the same subject can seem correct once the standards are raised, even though none of what would normally be regarded as epistemically relevant features have changed. Though they are not obviously competing, each attempt to explain this in non-contextualist terms focuses on different factors. Framed in terms of the airport example described in Section 3.4 above, and in broad outline only, these sample non-contextualist proposals are as follows:

4.6.1 Pragmatic Factors

According to some (e.g., Blaauw 2003, Black, 2005, Brown 2006, Hazlitt 2007, Prades 2000, Pritchard 2010, Pynn 2015, Rysiew 2001, 2005, 2007),[21] pragmatic factors explain the relevant knowledge-attributing behavior. In the airport case, it is mutually obvious to John and Mary that they want to ensure that their epistemic position with respect to the flight plan is very strong—strong enough to rule out the possibility of a misprint, e.g. Being in an epistemic position of such strength may or may not be required for knowing. Either way, however, ‘S knows that p’ entails that S is in a good epistemic position—this is why granting someone knowledge involves representing them as entitled to their belief. But it would be odd of Mary and John to grant Smith such an entitlement (by saying “he knows”) and represent him as being in a good epistemic position if they thought that his evidence wasn’t so good as to put their concerns to rest. Whereas, by denying knowledge to Smith, they are able to express the thought, which seems not just relevant but true, that his epistemic position is not so good that they do not need to check further. And if they read what is conveyed by the relevant utterance onto the sentence uttered, the knowledge denial will strike them as expressing a truth.

4.6.2 Psychological Presuppositions of Attributing Knowledge

Several philosophers have suggested an essentially psychological explanation of why we would deny that the subject in the high standards case knows. Here is one such proposal:

Mary does not say ‘Smith knows that the plane will stop in Chicago’ and goes so far as to assert its negation because of her own doxastic situation. Because she is not sure Smith’s itinerary is reliable, she herself is not confident enough to believe that the plane will stop in Chicago. So she cannot coherently attribute knowledge of it to Smith, not if knowledge implies truth.…Not only that, she has to deny that she knows it, since she thinks that it is not yet established. And, since Smith has no evidence that she doesn’t have, she must deny that he knows it [too]. (Bach 2005, 76–77)

In a similar spirit, Adler (2006) suggests that such cases are best explained in terms of the subject’s diminished confidence as to p, where the latter does not imply a lack of belief. Meanwhile, Nagel (2008) notes that, when a person has much riding on some matter, we normally expect them to engage in more (/more diligent) evidence-seeking behavior before arriving at confident belief. For this reason, we naturally attribute to the subject in the high standards case either a lack of solid belief or compromised accuracy, either of which can lead to a judgment that the subject does not know. Further, even in cases where the subject does not share the evaluator’s concerns about certain possibilities of error, epistemic egocentrism — our natural tendency to overestimate the extent to which others share our beliefs and attitudes — can lead the evaluator to project those concerns onto the subject. If the subject is not then engaging in the expected extra evidence-seeking behavior, she will once again be judged hasty, and as not knowing (Nagel 2010a,b).

4.6.3 Salience, Conflicting Arguments, and Focusing Effects

When we find people seeming to disagree about some matter, that is often because there are considerations on either side of the issue, none of which can be easily dismissed. And which of these one focuses on can affect one’s view as to the truth of the proposition in question. So, for instance, if Mary and John focus on the various ways in which Smith might be mistaken (e.g., because of a misprint in the itinerary), this can get them thinking that he does not know, especially if focusing on a possibility tends to make one over-rate its probability. (See especially Feldman 2001, 74–78. For similar ideas, see Williamson 2005a, 112; 2005b, 226; Hawthorne 2004, 164-165; Conee 2014, 76–79; and Rysiew 2001, 502–505.) A related suggestion is made by Gerken, whose ‘epistemic focal bias’ account includes the following “principle of contextual salience”:

Normally, for an agent, A, q is a contextually salient alternative to S’s knowledge that p iff A processes q as an epistemically relevant alternative to S’s knowledge that p. (2013, 50)

The operative notion of salience is distinguished from ‘availability’, such as Hawthorne and Williamson appeal to, and the above principle is used to explain why we might naturally, though mistakenly, deny knowledge of someone in a high standards case (ibid., 54).

Still other psychological explanations of the data in question have been offered. For example, Dinges (2016) argues that the cases in question are underspecified, and that a plausible account of how their details are filled in by those who consider them has the consequence that those examples, and the intuitive reactions they elicit, don’t actually support EC. (As Dinges notes — 2016, 222, n. 3 — DeRose employs a similar sort of strategy in accounting for certain empirical results that appear to pose a problem for EC; see DeRose 2011 and Rysiew 2011 for references and discussion.)

Unsurprisingly, even among opponents of EC, each of the proposals described above, whether or not primarily psychological, is contentious. (Nagel 2010a, for instance, criticizes appeals to the availability heuristic.) And proponents of EC have raised specific doubts about their viability. For instance, according to Cohen (1999, 80–82; 2001, 94), merely citing the existence of conflicting arguments does not explain what needs explaining. And DeRose (1999, 2002, 2009) and Cohen (1999) argue that the prospects for explaining the relevant data via pragmatics are dim (arguments to which both Brown 2006 and Rysiew 2001, 2005, 2007, 2017 respond).

5. Further Arguments for EC, with some Non-Contextualist Responses

5.1 Fallibilism and Concessive Knowledge Attributions

It is plausible to suppose that, if knowing requires believing on the basis of evidence that entails what is believed, we have hardly any knowledge at all. Hence the near-universal acceptance of fallibilism (Cohen 1988, 91). Hence too the significance of ‘concessive knowledge attributions’ (CKAs) (Rysiew 2001)—i.e., sentences of the form ‘S knows that p, but it is possible that q’ (where q entails not-p). To many, utterances of such sentences sound very odd:

If you claim that S knows that P, and yet you grant that S cannot eliminate a certain possibility in which not-P, it certainly seems as if you have granted that S does not after all know that P. To speak of fallible knowledge, of knowledge despite uneliminated possibilities of error, just sounds contradictory. (Lewis 1996, 549)

If Lewis is correct in supposing that the relevant utterances are merely “overt, explicit” statements of fallibilism (ibid., 550), their seeming incoherence suggests that, contrary to our everyday epistemic pretensions, “knowledge must be by definition infallible” after all (ibid., 549).

Lewis’ own attempt “to thread a course between the rock of fallibilism and the whirlpool of skepticism” (ibid., 566) involves embracing EC: We may say with the infallibilist that S knows that p iff S’s evidence eliminates “every” possibility in which not-p (ibid., 551). But since ‘every’ is restricted to a particular conversational domain (ibid., 553–554), and since certain not-p possibilities will be “properly ignored” in a given situation, we preserve our intuitive non-skepticism.

Jason Stanley (2005a) attempts to block Lewis’ move to EC and defends fallibilism against the worry that concessive knowledge attributions are incoherent. According to Stanley, CKAs are not just odd-sounding: in most cases, they are simply false. But this does not impugn fallibilism. If the odd-sounding utterances Lewis cites stated the fallibilist idea, the latter portion thereof (‘S cannot eliminate a certain possibility in which not-p’, e.g.) would expresses the thought that the subject’s evidence does not entail that p—hence, the negation every proposition contrary to p.[22] According to Stanley, however, this is not the best reading of such statements of epistemic possibility. Stanley reads the cited part of CKAs—‘S cannot eliminate a certain possibility in which not-p’—as saying this: it is possible for S that not-p. And he reads that statement as saying: what S knows [versus, as per fallibilism, S’s evidence] does not, in a manner that is obvious to S, entail the denial of not-p. (Cf. DeRose 1991, 1999; and Hawthorne 2004, 24–28.) The latter claim does contradict the first part of CKAs, which says that p is known; for p does obviously entail the denial of not-p. So the sentences Lewis cites are self-contradictory. But they do not capture the fallibilist idea after all.

Dougherty and Rysiew (2009) offer a different strategy for accounting for CKAs’ oddity while both protecting fallibilism and avoiding EC. While they grant that the latter portion of CKAs express epistemic possibility, they recommend thinking of what is epistemically possible for a subject in terms of those things which his evidence, rather than what he knows, does not rule out. (Dougherty and Rysiew take a person’s evidence, roughly, to be their basic data. While wishing to stay neutral as to just what comprises this, they deny the Williamsonian thesis (2000) that one’s evidence just is one’s knowledge.) On this view, CKAs express, as Lewis assumes, precisely the fallibilist idea. According to Dougherty and Rysiew, however, their oddity poses no problem for fallibilism, and so does not motivate EC, as that oddity can be explained pragmatically.

Which, if either, of these responses to the problem Lewis sets is correct is a matter of dispute. (Other recent contributions on CKAs include Dodd 2010, Littlejohn 2011, Dougherty and Rysiew 2011, Hawthorne 2012, Worsnip 2015, and Colgrove and Dougherty 2016.) But there are at least these two ways in which a non-contextualist could counter Lewis’ argument.

5.2 Knowledge and Assertion

A number of philosophers have found very plausible the idea that, in asserting that p, one represents oneself as knowing that p.[23] Here, very quickly, is one route to this idea: If our talk is governed by ‘the Cooperative Principle’ (CP), then ‘saying’ itself presumes one’s striving to fulfill certain credal-epistemic conditions: chief among the Gricean maxims is that of Quality, ‘Try to make your contribution one that is true,’ along with its two more specific sub-maxims:

  1. ‘Do not say what you believe to be false;’ and
  2. ‘Do not say that for which you lack adequate evidence.’ (Grice 1989, 27)

Now notice that the properties addressed by Quality and its sub-maxims closely approximate what are generally taken to be the central conditions on knowing (so long as we are open-minded as to how to read ii—such that, e.g., ‘justification’ could be substituted for ‘evidence’). So it seems that, if one is striving to conform to CP, one will assert something only if one takes oneself to know it.

According to some, much the same idea can be expressed by saying that knowledge is “the norm of assertion”. Thus, Timothy Williamson (2000, Chapter 11) defends at length what is come to be known as ‘the knowledge account of assertion,’ whereby our linguistic practices are governed by the rule: “One must: assert p only if one knows p” (2000, 243)

Keith DeRose, taking the two ideas just expressed to be “just two sides of the same coin” (2002, 180; 2009, 93), argues that, if the knowledge account of assertion is correct, it furnishes a different sort of argument for EC, which is summarized as follows:

If the standards for when one is in a position to warrantedly assert that P are the same as those that constitute a truth condition for ‘I know that P,’ then if the former vary with context, so do the latter. In short: The knowledge account of assertion together with the context sensitivity of assertability… yields contextualism about knowledge. (2002, 187; see 2009, 106)

Several objections to this argument have been made. First, it is worth considering whether one couldn’t accept the idea, for reasons such as those outlined above, that in asserting one represents oneself as knowing, while not accepting the knowledge rule. According to Matt Weiner (2005), for instance, the knowledge rule is too strong, and the cases which motivate it can be handled by assuming the rule that proper assertions be true, along with conversational norms governing all speech acts. (Other accounts on which proper assertion requires something weaker than knowledge include Bach 2008, Douven 2006, Lackey 2007, and McKinnon 2015.) Second, Adam Leite (2007) argues that the direct argument for EC from the knowledge account of assertion rests on an equivocation on the notion of ‘warranted assertability’. (See too Bach 2005, 73–4, who also suggests that DeRose’s argument relies too heavily on first-person “knowledge” claims). In a similar spirit, John Turri’s “speech act contextualism” (2010) is expressly designed to show how the knowledge account of assertion is compatible with Epistemic Invariantism. Finally, Thomas Blackson (2004) argues, as Williamson (2005a, 111, n. 20) suggests, that DeRose’s argument does not favor EC over another recent view, Subject Sensitive Invariantism (see Section 6). Independently of EC, the relation between knowledge and assertion has been the subject of much recent discussion (see Pagin 2016, Section 6.2).

5.3 The Social Role of Knowledge Ascriptions

Much of the debate surrounding EC has concerned particular uses of ‘know’ in various contexts — specifically, their intuitive truth or falsity. Edward Craig, however, has urged that instead of focusing directly on ‘know’ and its cognates, we should ask “what knowledge does for us, what its role in our life might be, and then ask what a concept having that role would be like” (1990, 2, emphasis added). In large part thanks to Craig’s work, the social role of knowledge ascriptions has recently come in for focused investigation, with some seeing in that study new arguments for EC.

According to Craig, “the core of the concept of knowledge is an outcome of certain very general facts about the human situation” (1990, 10). The most conspicuous such general fact is that we must rely on others as sources of information (1990, 11), which in turn gives rise to the need for some way to pick out good informants. “[A]t its most subjective,” the need is for an informant who, among other things, is accessible to and recognizable by me here and now, and as likely to be right about p as my concerns require (ibid., 84–85). However, the high degree of purpose-relativity of the ‘subjectivized’ notion of the good informant makes it ill-suited to play an effective inter-personal role. According to Craig, for there to be useful sharing of information individuals must share a common point of view concerning the character and presence of good informants. Hence the pressure to form an ‘objectivized’ concept — one that retains the ‘common core’ of the notion without tying it to the needs, abilities, and circumstances of specific individuals “and so varying with them” (1990, 88). Craig’s proposal, in brief, is that the concept of the knower is the objectivized notion of a good informant (ibid., 90–91).[24]

A number of writers have suggested that broadly Craigian reflections on the social role of “knowledge” attributions provide a novel line of support for EC. Thus, while Craig’s process of objectivization was intended to minimize the context-relativity and -variability of judgments as to a potential informant’s reliability, Greco (2008, 432-435; 2010, 119-122) thinks that we should acknowledge and embrace the latter. Specifically, Greco suggests, the Craigian story “speaks in favor of a version of attributor contextualism that allows that the attributor context be sensitive to the interests and purposes operative in the subject’s practical environment” (2008, 433; 2010, 120). (Similar views have been presented by Hannon 2013 and McKenna 2013, 2014.)

David Henderson (2009, 2011) has also argued that, by reflecting on “the point or purpose of the concept of knowledge”, a form of EC “gets a kind of principled motivation” (2009, 125). Henderson also claims, however, that his ‘gate-keeping contextualism’ has the virtue of respecting the attractions and motivations of Invariantism. Like Craig and Greco, Henderson takes a central function of “knowledge” ascriptions to be the certification of agents as good sources of information. Those agents might belong to applied practical or general-purpose source communities. In the former, where “the attributor is engaged in gate keeping for a group focused on some practical project”, s/he “should be contextually invested in such interests” (2009, 126); and here, Henderson argues, we find a new rationale for EC. However, when an attributor is gate keeping for a general-source community, where the information may potentially be very widely shared and there is likely to be no “simple decisive understanding of just what counts as actionable information”, we get the much more Craigian recommendation that

to qualify as knowing that p (in a general purpose source community) an agent must be situated with respect to p so as to be able to distinguish p’s obtaining from all the alternatives that would be relevant across all the communities that might draw on it, including those for which the stakes are high. (2009, 127)

This yields “something like” (2009, 127) familiar Invariantism, albeit only within certain contexts:

The invariantist pull is honored by treating the invariantist’s favored semantic standard for knowledge [or, for the correct application of ‘knowledge’] as being just one, among various, kinds of semantic standards. Each standard is, in context, motivated by gatekeeping purposes. (Henderson and Horgan 2015, 99)

As Henderson notes (2009, 130–131), the envisaged combination of contexualist and invariantist ideas might prove unstable: actual attributors are members of multiple, overlapping communities; information is constantly being shared multilaterally; and so on. Factors such as these are among the considerations cited by Rysiew (2012) in arguing that its having a traditional invariantist semantics might make ‘know’ better suited to fulfilling certain central social roles. (For a reply, see Hannon 2015.) Such claims take us back to considerations of whether EC sits well with the transfer and storage of information (see Section 4.5). More generally, they serve to show that the bearing of certain data upon the semantics of ‘know’ is just as controversial when we’re considering the term’s (or concept’s) social role or function, as when we are considering particular uses of it.

6. Views Similar to EC

We have seen that the arrival of EC prompted non-contextualist epistemologists to give more attention to such matters as the psychology and pragmatics of knowledge attributions, and various other features of our actual knowledge-attributing practices. EC has also been instrumental in the development of other competing theories. These are said by their proponents to do a better job of accommodating the data which inspire EC. These views are:

  • Contrastivism, of which Jonathan Shaffer (e.g., 2004) is the leading proponent (but see too Karjalainen and Morton 2003).
  • Subject Sensitive Invariantism or Interest Relative Invariantism—defended, in various forms, by Jeremy Fantl and Matt McGrath (2002, 2007, 2009), John Hawthorne (2004), and Jason Stanley (2005b).
  • Relativism, of the sort defended by John MacFarlane (2005; 2014, Chapter 8).

According to Contrastivism, ‘knows’ denotes a three-place relation, with a contrast variable included among the relata. The identity of the contrasted propositions may be ‘shifty’ when not explicitly provided. Thus, in the same way that an utterance of ‘Jane prefers vanilla’ may express a true proposition when the contextually-provided contrast is strawberry but a false proposition when the contrast is chocolate, ‘Jane knows that she has hands’ may be true when the contrast is her having lost her hands in an accident, but false when the contrast is her being a handless BIV. (Some see contrastivism as a species of EC; for Schaffer on the differences between Contrastivism and canonical versions of EC, see his 2004.)

According to Subject Sensitive Invariantism, whether a subject knows depends upon facts about his/her practical interests (or, depending on the view, what the subject believes about such), especially the degree of practical importance of getting things right. As a rule, on this view, the more that’s at stake the harder it is to know.

According to Relativism about knowledge, the truth values of ‘knowledge’ sentences depend upon the standards in play in the contexts in which they are assessed, as opposed to the standards operative in either the context in which they are uttered or the context of the subject. (When the assessor is identical to the subject of the “knowledge” attribution these standards of course coincide.)

The various strengths and weakness of each of these views — considered both on their own and as compared with each other, with EC, and with traditional (insensitive) Invariantism—is the subject of much recent debate. And lively discussion of EC itself continues. (See, for example, the papers collected in Ichikawa 2017b.)


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