First published Sat Dec 8, 2001; substantive revision Thu Dec 5, 2019

Philosophical skepticism is interesting because there are intriguing arguments for it despite its initial implausibility. Many contemporary epistemological positions can be fruitfully presented as responding to some aspect of those arguments. For example, questions regarding principles of epistemic closure and transmission are closely related to the discussion of what we will call Cartesian Skepticism, as are views according to which we are entitled to dismiss skeptical hypotheses even though we do not have evidence against them. The traditional issue of the structure of knowledge and justification, engendering Foundationalism, Coherentism, and Infinitism, can be seen as resulting from one main argument for what we will call Pyrrhonian Skepticism. In what follows we present these two forms of skepticism and assess the main arguments for them.

1. Knowledge, Justification and Skepticism

Philosophically interesting forms of skepticism claim that we do not know propositions which we ordinarily think we do know. We should distinguish such skepticism from the ordinary kind, the claim that we do not know propositions which we would gladly grant not to know. Thus, it is a form of ordinary skepticism to say that we do not know that there are an even number of stars in the Milky Way, but it is a form of philosophical skepticism to say that we do not know that the sun will come out tomorrow. Even though our interest is in philosophical skepticism, we can start our inquiry by thinking about ordinary skepticism.

Why do we readily grant, then, that we don’t know that there are an even number of stars in the Milky Way? To begin with, the vast majority of us do not even believe that proposition, and it is widely acknowledged that knowledge requires belief.[1] But even those who believe it do not know it, even if they luck out and it is true. They do not know it because they are not justified in believing it, and knowledge requires justification.[2] Of course, they are not justified in disbelieving that proposition either. Belief and disbelief are two of the so-called doxastic attitudes that we can adopt towards a proposition. We can also, of course, not even consider a proposition, and thus not adopt any doxastic attitude towards it. But most philosophers would hold that in addition to belief and disbelief there is a third possible doxastic attitude that we can adopt towards a proposition: we can suspend judgment (or withhold assent) with respect to it. Suspension of judgment is thus a bona fide doxastic attitude alongside belief and disbelief, and is not to be equated with the failure to adopt any doxastic attitude.[3] Because it is a genuine doxastic attitude, suspension of judgment (just like belief and disbelief, and unlike the failure to form any doxastic attitude) can itself be justified or unjustified. For instance, we would ordinarily think that suspension of judgment is not justified with respect to the proposition that Paris is the Capital of France, but it is with respect to the proposition that there are an even number of stars in the Milky Way.

Some arguments for philosophical skepticism target knowledge directly, not concerning themselves with justification. For instance, some argue that we do not know certain propositions because our beliefs in them are not sensitive (in a sense to be explained below), and they claim that sensitivity is a condition on knowledge—but perhaps not on justified belief. We will examine the bearing of the sensitivity condition on skeptical arguments assuming that it applies to justification. But even if an argument for philosophical skepticism targets our knowledge in a certain area while remaining silent about whether we have justified beliefs in that area, that argument will still indirectly target our justification as well. For, if the argument succeeds, then it provides us with knowledge (or at least justified belief) that we do not know a certain proposition p. And it is plausible to hold that if we know (or justifiably believe) that we do not know a proposition p, then we are not even justified in believing p.

In what follows, then, we identify skepticism with respect to a field of propositions F as the claim that the only justified attitude with respect to propositions in F is suspension of judgment. Philosophical skepticism, then, differs from ordinary skepticism at least regarding the field of propositions to which it is claimed to apply. But even within the realm of philosophical skepticism we can make an interesting distinction by appealing to the scope of the thesis.

2. Two Basic Forms of Philosophical Skepticism

One interesting distinction between kinds of philosophical skepticism pertains to the question whether they iterate. Thus, consider skepticism about the future: the claim that the only justified attitude with respect to propositions about the future is suspension of judgment. That kind of philosophical skepticism overlaps partly with ordinary skepticism about the future. We should all grant, for instance, that we should suspend judgment with respect to the proposition that the flip of this fair coin in the next second will come up heads, but most of us think that we should believe, not suspend judgment with respect to, the proposition that the sun will come out tomorrow. Being a skeptic with respect to the first-order proposition that the sun will come out tomorrow (that is to say, holding that the only justified attitude with respect to that proposition is suspension of judgment) can be combined with any of the three doxastic attitudes with respect to the second-order proposition that the only justified attitude with respect to the proposition that the sun will come out tomorrow is to suspend judgment. Generalizing, whenever the skeptic holds that the only justified attitude with respect to a field of propositions F is to suspend judgment, we can ask them which attitude is justified with respect to the proposition that the only justified attitude with respect to any proposition in F is suspension of judgment. Perhaps the most straightforward answer here is that the only justified attitude with respect to that second-order proposition is belief. After all, isn’t skepticism with respect to F precisely the belief that we should suspend judgment with respect to any proposition in F? We will call this combination of views—the view that we should suspend judgment with respect to any proposition in F and believe the proposition that we should suspend judgment with respect to any proposition in F—“Cartesian Skepticism”, because of the skeptical arguments investigated by Descartes and his critics in the mid-seventeenth century. Other philosophers, following an ancient tradition, refer to this view as “Academic Skepticism” (see the entry on ancient skepticism).

But some skeptics are skeptics regarding second- (and higher-) order propositions as well as regarding first-order propositions. Following the same ancient tradition, we will call that kind of skepticism “Pyrrhonian Skepticism”. Without any claim to historical accuracy, we will take Pyrrhonian Skepticism to be absolute skepticism—the thesis that suspension of judgment is the only justified attitude with respect to any proposition p. Is Pyrrhonian Skepticism so understood self-refuting? It is certainly formally consistent: no contradiction follows just from the propositions that the only justified attitude with respect to the proposition that p is suspension of judgment and that the only justified attitude with respect to the proposition that the only justified attitude with respect to the proposition that p is suspension of judgment is suspension of judgment (say that three times fast!). But consider the principle that whenever someone is committed to a proposition p they are also (perhaps implicitly) committed to the proposition that belief is the (or at least a) justified attitude towards p. Call this the “Commitment Iteration Principle”. If the Commitment Iteration Principle holds, then Pyrrhonian Skepticism is indeed self-refuting. For Pyrrhonian skeptics are committed to the claim that suspension of judgment is the only justified attitude with respect to some proposition p. By the Commitment Iteration Principle, they are then committed to the claim that belief is a justified attitude with respect to the proposition that suspension of judgment is the only justified attitude with respect to p. Therefore, if they are in addition committed to the claim that suspension of judgment is the only justified attitude with respect to that very same proposition, they are committed to an inconsistent set of propositions. But Pyrrhonian skeptics need not hold the Commitment Iteration Principle. Indeed, they are committed to thinking that suspension of judgment is the only justified attitude with respect to the Commitment Iteration Principle itself (and also with respect to analogous principles which may make trouble for Pyrrhonian Skepticism). Of course, Pyrrhonian Skepticism will not be acceptable to anyone who does hold the Commitment Iteration Principle—but neither will Pyrrhonian Skepticism be acceptable to anyone who holds that we should not suspend judgment with respect to some proposition. It is not clear, then, that the charge of self-refutation represents an independent indictment of Pyrrhonian Skepticism. In any case, contemporary philosophers find Pyrrhonian Skepticism interesting not because they take seriously the possibility of its truth, but rather because there are interesting arguments in its favor, the responses to which shape the contours of many contemporary epistemological theories.

We have distinguished between Cartesian and Pyrrhonian Skepticism, but we have characterized both views in terms of a generic field of propositions F. In the case of Pyrrhonian Skepticism, F includes every proposition, but we can generate different versions of Cartesian Skepticism by varying F. A prominent version of Cartesian Skepticism is external-world skepticism—i.e., Cartesian Skepticism with respect to any proposition about the “external world” (not about the subject’s own mind).[4] In what follows, we concentrate on external world Cartesian Skepticism and Pyrrhonian Skepticism.

3. The Argument for Cartesian Skepticism Employing the Closure Principle

Many contemporary philosophers take the canonical argument for Cartesian Skepticism to involve skeptical hypotheses and a Closure Principle (CP).[5] A skeptical hypothesis (with respect to a proposition p and a subject S) is a proposition SH such that if SH were true, then: (a) S would not know p, and (b) S would not be able to distinguish SH from a situation where S knows p. The evil demon scenario that Descartes envisions at the end of his “First Meditation” functions as a near-universal skeptical hypothesis, for the demon has the power to deceive any subject regarding almost any proposition. One way in which a SH may satisfy (a) is by describing a situation where p is false, but this is not the only way. Descartes’ evil demon may induce in a disembodied subject’s mind an experience as of the subject’s own hands in front of her, as a result of which the subject believes that there are hands in front of her, while at the same time dangling some unattached hands in front of the subject (we are waiving here difficulties having to do with how to locate objects relative to disembodied subjects). The subject’s belief that there are hands in front of her is in that case true, but she still doesn’t know it. The connection between Closure principles and arguments for skepticism gets complicated if we countenance skeptical hypotheses which do not entail the falsehood of the proposition in question, and so in what follows we limit our discussion to those that do.

Letting “h” stand for any proposition about the external world we would ordinarily take ourselves to be justified in believing, for example, G. E. Moore’s famous “here’s a hand” (Moore 1939 [1993]), and re-using “SH” for a skeptical hypothesis relative to h (we leave the subject tacit), we can state the contemporary canonical CP-style argument for Cartesian Skepticism as follows:

  • CP1. If I am justified in believing that h, then I am justified in believing that \({\sim}\textit{SH}\).
  • CP2. I am not justified in believing that \({\sim}\textit{SH}\).
  • Therefore, I am not justified in believing that h.

CP1 follows from the following Closure Principle (letting “Jx” stand for the subject is justified in believing x):

Closure Principle [CP]: For all propositions x and y, if x entails y, and Jx, then Jy.

(In the argument above, \(x = h\) and \(y = {\sim}SH\).)

A crucial feature of CP is that it does not depend upon employing a stringent notion of justification. Suppose that (positive) justification comes in degrees, where the lowest degree is something like mere plausibility and the highest degree is absolute certainty. CP could be recast as follows:

CP*: For all propositions, x and y, if x entails y, and Jx to degree u, then Jy to degree v (where \(u \le v)\).

There appear to be only three ways that one can respond to the CP-style skeptical argument: deny at least one premise, deny that the argument is valid, or reluctantly accept the conclusion—if neither of the first two alternatives succeeds.

3.1 Consideration of CP1

Let us begin an examination of CP1 and the general closure principle, CP, of which CP1 is an instantiation. Closure certainly does hold for some properties, for example, truth. If p is true and implies q, then q is true. It just as clearly does not hold for other properties, for example being surprising. It might be surprising that Tomás is taller than his father, but it is certainly not surprising that Tomás is taller than someone, and yet the former entails the latter. What about justified belief? Does Closure hold for it?

It might be thought that the answer must be a clear “No”, for the following reasons. First, notice that every logical truth is entailed by every proposition. If Closure held for justification, then we would have to say that everybody is justified in believing every logical truth (provided that we are willing to grant that everybody is justified in believing at least one proposition). But this doesn’t seem plausible. Some logical truths are too complicated to even parse, let alone be justified in believing. If this is true, then Closure doesn’t hold for belief (that is to say, we may fail to believe propositions entailed by propositions we already believe). The existence of very complicated logical truths also underlies another worry for Closure. For to every logical entailment between propositions there corresponds a logical truth: the (material) conditional with the entailing proposition in the antecedent and the entailed proposition in the consequent. Some of these logically true conditionals will be examples of propositions that we are not justified in believing (if only because the consequent is too complicated for beings like us to even parse). In that case, we might well be justified in believing their antecedents without being justified in believing their consequents.

But it also appears that CP can easily be repaired. We can stipulate (i) that the domain of the propositions in the generalization of CP includes only contingent propositions that are within S’s capacity to grasp and (ii) that the entailment is “obvious” to S. The skeptic can agree to those restrictions because the skeptical scenarios are posited in such a way as to render it obvious that our ordinary beliefs are false in those scenarios, and it is taken to be a contingent claim that S is in the actual circumstances as described in the antecedent. (For a full discussion of the required repairs of CP, see David & Warfield 2008 and Hawthorne 2014.)

There is one other important, required clarification of the restricted version of CP. “Justified belief” is ambiguous. It could be used to refer to a species of actually held beliefs—namely, those actually held beliefs of S that are justified. Or it could refer to propositions that S is justified in believing—regardless of whether S does indeed believe them. Following Roderick Firth, the distinction between actually held justified beliefs and propositions one is justified in believing, regardless of whether they are actually believed, is often marked by distinguishing between doxastic and propositional justification (see Firth 1978). If CP is to be acceptable, “justified in believing” in the consequent must be used so as to refer to propositional justification for a reason already cited, i.e., that Closure does not hold for belief. In other words, one of S’s actual beliefs, p, might be justified and S still fail to believe some proposition that is entailed by p.[6]

We are now in a position to ask: Does the restricted form of closure hold? There are at least three types of argument against closure in the literature: alleged counterexamples, alleged unpalatable consequences, and incompatibility with allegedly plausible epistemological theories. In the remainder of this section we examine one exemplar of each of these.

Fred Dretske and others have produced cases in which they believe CP fails.[7] Dretske writes:

You take your son to the zoo, see several zebras, and, when questioned by your son, tell him they are zebras. Do you know they are zebras? Well, most of us would have little hesitation in saying that we did know this. We know what zebras look like, and, besides, this is the city zoo and the animals are in a pen clearly marked “Zebras.” Yet, something’s being a zebra implies that it is not a mule and, in particular, not a mule cleverly disguised by the zoo authorities to look like a zebra. Do you know that these animals are not mules cleverly disguised by the zoo authorities to look like zebras? If you are tempted to say “Yes” to this question, think a moment about what reasons you have, what evidence you can produce in favor of this claim. The evidence you had for thinking them zebras has been effectively neutralized, since it does not count toward their not being mules cleverly disguised to look like zebras. (Dretske 1970: 1015–1016)

Dretske is speaking of knowledge rather than justified beliefs, but that seems irrelevant since the issue concerns the supposed lack of a sufficient source of evidence or reasons for the claim that the animal is not a cleverly disguised mule.

The crucial thing to note about this proposed counterexample is that it works only if the Closure Principle entails that the very same source of evidence that justifies S in believing that the animals are zebras must justify S in believing that they are not cleverly disguised mules. Since the evidence for the former has been “effectively neutralized”, it is not available for the latter. Now, in response one could claim that once the question of whether the animals are disguised mules has been raised, the evidence is “effectively neutralized” for both the former and the latter, and S is no longer justified in believing that the animals are zebras. Thus, it could be held that this example could actually be used to support CP. Nevertheless, let us grant that the evidence for the claim that the animals are zebras cannot be used to show that they are not cleverly disguised mules. Still, it could be argued that this would not force giving up CP.

Such an argument could begin by recalling that CP claimed merely that whenever a subject is justified in believing p, then that subject is justified in believing q. CP does not require that the subject have the same evidence for p as she does for q. Dretske’s purported counterexample seems to require that CP implies that the adequate source of evidence is the same for both propositions.

No doubt this constraint sometimes correctly portrays the relevant evidential relationships when some proposition entails some other proposition. For example, suppose I have adequate evidence for the claim that Anne has two brothers. Then it would seem that the very same evidence would be adequate for believing that Anne has at least one brother. But the defender of CP, and more particularly the Cartesian Skeptic, could point out that closure does not require this to hold for every case.

There are two other possibilities. First, one may hold that when p entails q and there is some evidence e for p, it is p itself that is evidence for q. For example, it may be held that given that I have adequate evidence for believing that 2 is a prime number, I can use that very proposition (that 2 is a prime number) as an adequate reason for believing that there is at least one even prime. (See Klein 1981, 1995, and 2000, but see below for reasons for doubting that this is a genuine possibility.) Second, there are cases where the order is reversed because q serves as part of the evidence for p. For example, suppose that I am justified, ceteris paribus, in believing that (pure) water is present if I am justified in believing that there is present, at standard temperature and pressure, a clear, odorless, watery-tasting and watery-looking fluid that contains hydrogen and oxygen. This pattern is typical of abductive inferences, and is often referred to as “inference to the best explanation”. (See Vogel 1990, 2014b for a discussion of Cartesian Skepticism and inference to the best explanation.) In addition, there are cases in which it seems that some contraries of h need to be eliminated prior to h’s being justified. For example, reconsidering the zebra-in-the-zoo case, it seems to be true that if I had some good reason to think that the animals are cleverly disguised mules, such a contrary would need to be eliminated before I would be justified in believing that the animals were zebras.[8]

It could also be argued that CP has unacceptable consequences. Of course, one of those unacceptable consequences may well be Cartesian Skepticism itself, but to point that out in the present context would be dialectically unhelpful. It has been argued, however, that CP by itself has far-reaching skeptical consequences. Notice that the argument for Cartesian Skepticism under consideration contains CP2 as an essential premise. The present concern is that CP by itself (and therefore CP1, if justified on the basis of CP), without help from CP2, has skeptical consequences. If that were true, that would be a reason to be wary of CP, for it would be a much stronger principle than advertised.

The argument can be presented as a conflict between CP, on the one hand, and three other principles. Those three other principles are, allegedly, beyond reproach, and so CP is to be blamed for the conflict. The first principle in question may be thought of as enshrining the possibility of knowledge (and justification) by ampliative inference:

Ampliativity: It is possible for a subject S to be justified in believing h on the basis of evidence e even if S does not have independent justification (of at least the same degree of S’s justification for believing h) for believing a proposition p such that p and e together entail h.

Ampliativity would be true if, for example, we can be justified in believing the conclusion of an inductive argument (say, that all emeralds are green) on the basis of believing its premises (say, that a properly selected group of emeralds have been observed to be green), without in addition being independently justified in believing any other proposition which, together with those premises, entails the conclusion (such as, for example, the proposition that if a properly selected sample of emeralds have all been green, then all emeralds are green).

The next principle is in conflict with what we presented above as an alternative possibility to Dretske’s interpretation of the evidential structure of CP. Dretske’s counterexample works, we said, only if CP holds that whatever justifies the subject in believing p is also what justifies her in believing q. But there are two other possibilities. Maybe the evidential relation is reversed: whatever justifies us in believing q justifies us in believing p. Or maybe, we said, p itself, and not whatever justifies us in believing p, justifies us in believing q. The next principle goes directly against this possibility:

Mere Lemmas: If S is justified in believing p on the basis of some evidence e, then p itself can justify S in believing some other proposition q only if e justifies S in believing q.

We call the principle “Mere Lemmas” because the idea behind it is that if a proposition is a mere lemma, in the sense that it derives all of its justification from some prior evidence e, then it doesn’t have justificatory powers of its own, independent of the justificatory powers of e. Suppose, for instance, that you start out by knowing that Jim has a pet, but you don’t know what kind of pet it is (the example is from Pryor 2004). Then you come to know that it is a hairless pet. Now you become justified (perhaps to a small degree) in believing that Jim’s pet is a hairless dog. That is to say, whatever degree of justification you had before to believe that Jim’s pet is a hairless dog, you are now somewhat more justified in believing that same proposition. That Jim’s pet is a hairless dog of course entails that Jim’s pet is a dog. But your justification for believing that Jim’s pet is a hairless dog cannot in any way be transmuted into justification for believing that Jim’s pet is a dog. Whatever degree of justification you had before for believing that Jim’s pet is a dog, you are now less justified in believing that same proposition (because hairless dogs are a small minority of hairless pets).

But what about the example with which we introduced the idea that, sometimes, when e is evidence for p, then p itself can be evidence for q? The example was the following: we can have adequate evidence for believing that 2 is a prime number, and then that proposition itself (that 2 is a prime number) can justify us in believing that that there is at least one even prime number. But, when examined more closely, this is not an obvious counterexample to Mere Lemmas. For, what could our adequate evidence that 2 is a prime number be? Presumably, it would be that 2 is divisible only by 1 and 2. That just is the definition of what it means for 2 to be a prime number, however, so some may balk at the idea that it counts as evidence for the proposition in question (rather than being identical with it). In any case, it would not count as a counterexample to Mere Lemmas. For if we have no evidence for the proposition that 2 is a prime number, then the condition for the application of Mere Lemmas is not satisfied.[9] If, on the other hand, our evidence is that 2 is divisible only by 1 and 2, then that proposition itself is obviously evidence for the proposition that an even number is prime.

Our final principle is the following:

Entailment: If p entails q, then q cannot justify S in disbelieving p.

The idea behind this principle is that if p entails q, then should q turn out to be true then things are as p says they are, and so we can hardly use q as evidence against p. We return to Entailment below, but first we show how these three principles are in conflict with CP.

Assume, with Ampliativity, that a subject S is justified in believing a proposition h on the basis of some evidence e without having independent justification for believing any other proposition p such that p together with e entails h. Notice that h obviously entails h or not-e. Therefore, by CP, S is justified in believing h or not-e. But, of course, e together with h or not-e entails h. Therefore, if S is justified in believing h on the basis of e, then there is a proposition which S is justified in believing and which together with e entails h.

Notice that this is close to, but not quite, the negation of Ampliativity. For Ampliativity denies that there will be any such proposition which S is independently justified in believing, and for all we have said S’s justification for believing h or not-e is not independent. Independent of what? Of S’s justification for believing h itself. For all we have said so far, S might be justified in believing h or not-e on the basis of h, or on the basis of e itself.

But, given Mere Lemmas, h cannot justify S in believing any proposition unless e does. Therefore, the only option left open, short of denying Ampliativity, is to argue that e itself justifies S in believing h or not-e. But that is incompatible with Entailment. For notice that for e to justify S in believing h or not-e is for e to justify S in disbelieving its negation, i.e., e and not-h. But, of course, e and not-h entails e, and so the entailment principle has it that e cannot justify S in disbelieving e and not-h—i.e., e cannot justify S in believing h or not-e.

Although this particular reconstruction is our own (for more on it, see Comesaña forthcoming), some philosophers have taken arguments similar to it to count against CP (see, for example, Huemer 2001 and Sharon & Spectre 2017, and cf. Comesaña 2017). However, others have argued against Entailment (see, for example, Pryor 2014a,b and Vogel 2014b), and yet others have argued that denying Ampliativity itself is not as absurd as it might sound (Comesaña 2014a,b). The argument cannot, therefore, be taken to be a conclusive blow against CP.

Finally, some epistemological theories are in conflict with CP.[10] Robert Nozick’s account of knowledge is the best such example. Roughly his account is this (Nozick 1981: 172–187):

S knows that p iff:

  1. S believes p;
  2. p is true;
  3. if p were true, S would believe p;
  4. if p were not true, S would not believe p.

Nozick called his account a “tracking” account of knowledge because whenever S knows that \(p, S\)’s beliefs track p. Think of a guided missile tracking its target. If the target were to move left, the missile would move left. If the target were not to move left, the missile would not move left. According to the tracking account of knowledge our beliefs must track the truth if we are to have knowledge.

There is one important clarification of conditions 3 and 4 that is discussed by Nozick, namely, that the method by which S acquires the belief must be held constant from the actual world to the possible world. A doting grandmother might know that her grandchild is not a thief on the basis of sufficiently good evidence, but would still believe that he wasn’t a thief, even if he were, because she loves him. So, we must require that the grandmother use the same method in both the actual and the near possible worlds, for, otherwise, condition (4) would exclude some clear cases of knowledge. This is not the place to provide a full examination of Nozick’s account of knowledge.[11] What is crucial for our discussion is that it is easy to see that, if Nozick’s account is correct, closure will fail for knowledge in just the kind of case that the Cartesian Skeptic is putting forward because of condition (4). Suppose S knows that there is a chair before her. Would she know that she is not in a skeptical scenario in which it merely appears that there is a chair? If the fourth condition were a necessary condition of knowledge, she would not know that because if she were in such a scenario, she would be fooled into thinking that she wasn’t. Thus, either condition (4) is too strong or CP fails.

There are some reasons for thinking that condition (4) is too strong. Consider, for instance, this case in the literature: You put a glass of ice-cold lemonade on a picnic table in your backyard. You go inside and get a telephone call from a friend and talk for half an hour. When you hang up you remember that you had left the ice-cold lemonade outside exposed to the hot sun and come to believe that it isn’t ice-cold anymore. It would seem that you could know that. Indeed, if it were false, that could only be due to some bizarre circumstance. Thus, if the lemonade were still ice-cold, you would believe that it wasn’t (see Vogel 1987: 206). The moral of this (and similar) cases seems to be that sensitivity is not a correct condition on knowledge.

There is much more to say about CP and CP1, but we will move on to considering the argument’s other premise.

3.2 Consideration of CP2

CP2 claims that we are not justified in denying the skeptical hypothesis—in other words, that we are not justified in believing that we are not being deceived. What arguments can be given for CP2? It is tempting to suggest something like this: The skeptical scenarios are developed in such a way that it is assumed that we could not tell that we were being deceived. For example, we are asked to consider that there is an Evil Genius “so powerful” that it could (1) make me believe that there were hands when there were none and (2) make it such that I could not detect the illusion. But the skeptic must be very careful here. She cannot require that in order for S to know (or be justified in believing) something, say x, that if x were false, she would not still believe x. We have just seen (while examining Nozick’s account of knowledge) that this requirement is arguably too strong. So the mere fact that there could be skeptical scenarios in which S still believes that she is not in such a scenario cannot provide the skeptic with a basis for thinking that she fails to know that she is not (actually) in a skeptical scenario. But even more importantly, were that a requirement of knowledge (or justification), then we have seen that closure would fail and, consequently, the basis for the first premise in the CP-style argument for Cartesian Skepticism would be forfeited.[12]

Ernest Sosa has argued for three interrelated theses regarding CP2 and Nozick’s sensitivity condition: (i) that sensitivity can be easily confused with a different condition on knowledge (which Sosa calls safety); (ii) that while sensitivity is not a correct necessary condition on knowledge, safety is; (iii) finally, that our belief in the negation of skeptical hypotheses is safe despite being insensitive.[13]

Nozick’s sensitivity condition is a subjunctive conditional: if p were false, S would not believe it. The usual way in which such conditionals are evaluated is by assuming that there is an ordering of possible worlds according to how much they resemble the actual world. A subjunctive conditional \(A \rightarrow B\) is true if and only if B is true in the closest (or all the closest) possible worlds where A is true. According to this semantics, subjunctive conditionals do not contrapose (the contrapositive of a conditional if A, B is if not-B, not-A). Thus, suppose that we flip a coin to decide whether you or I will strike this match: heads you strike it, tails I do. The coin comes up head, you strike the match and it lights. In this situation, it is true that if I had struck the match, it would have lit. But it doesn’t seem to be true that if the match hadn’t lit then I wouldn’t have struck it. The match might have failed to lit because it was wet while either of us struck it. In the possible worlds terminology, the closest possible world where I strike the match is a world where it lights, but there are possible worlds where the match doesn’t light and I strike it that are as close to actuality as are worlds where the match doesn’t light and you strike it.

After noticing the failure of subjunctives to contrapose, Sosa proposed that we should replace Nozick’s sensitivity condition with its contrapositive, which Sosa calls a ‘safety’ condition. The following formulation seems to capture Sosa’s intent:

Safety: S’s belief that p based on e is safe if and only if S would not easily believe that p based on e without it being so that p (in symbols, S believes that p on basis \(e \rightarrow p\)). (Sosa 2002)[14]

Now, one initial worry about safety as a condition on knowledge is that, given that belief and truth are also necessary for knowledge, safety will always be (in this context) a true-true conditional (that is to say, both its antecedent and consequent will be true). This means that Sosa cannot accept the possible worlds semantics for subjunctive conditionals briefly sketched above, at least if we assume that every world is closer to itself than any other word. For when we have a true-true conditional, the closest world where the antecedent is true will be the actual world, and so every such conditional will be true (and, hence, any condition formulated by such conditionals will be trivially satisfied).[15] Rather, Sosa understands the truth-conditions for the relevant conditions as requiring that the consequent be true in all nearby possible worlds where the antecedent is true.

Sosa’s idea, then, is that we can explain away the temptation to think that CP2 is true by noticing that although safety and sensitivity are easily confused with one another, my belief that I am not the victim of a skeptical scenario is insensitive but safe, and that whereas sensitivity is not a condition on knowledge, safety is.

But is safety a condition on knowledge? Several authors have thought that, just as there are counterexamples to sensitivity, there are counterexamples to safety as well. Here is one (taken from Comesaña 2005b):

Halloween Party: There is a Halloween party at Andy’s house, and I am invited. Andy’s house is very difficult to find, so he hires Judy to stand at a crossroads and direct people towards the house (Judy’s job is to tell people that the party is at the house down the left road). Unbeknownst to me, Andy doesn’t want Michael to go to the party, so he also tells Judy that if she sees Michael she should tell him the same thing she tells everybody else (that the party is at the house down the left road), but she should immediately phone Andy so that the party can be moved to Adam’s house, which is down the right road. I seriously consider disguising myself as Michael, but at the last moment I don’t. When I get to the crossroads, I ask Judy where the party is, and she tells me that it is down the left road.

That case is a counterexample to safety insofar as we agree that I know that the party is at the house down the left road, and yet it could very easily have happened that I have that same belief on the same basis without it being so that the belief was true.

So far, we have argued that there are dangers in defending CP2 by appealing to the sensitivity condition, and that Sosa’s attack on CP2 might itself be subject to doubt. What else can be said for or against CP2?

Let’s go back to the rough idea that there is some kind of epistemic symmetry between what we take to be the actual case and a skeptical scenario. Of course, if we were the victims in a skeptical scenario, we wouldn’t know that we are not (if only because it would be false, but perhaps not only because of that). Given symmetry, even if we are not victims of a skeptical scenario, we do not know that we are not. Moreover, we know all of this. As we suggested in section 1, if we know that we don’t know that p, then we are not even justified in believing that p. Therefore, CP2. Every step in this argument can be challenged, but there is no doubt that many philosophers find something along these lines at least worth thinking about. Let us take a closer look at the first step, the claim that there is an epistemic symmetry between the good case and the skeptical scenario.

What can this alleged symmetry amount to? One idea is that we have the same evidence in both cases. According to a Cartesian account of this common evidence, it consists in mental states of the subject, such as her experiences. By construction, the subject has the same experiences in the skeptical scenario as she does in the good case. But some philosophers, most notably Williamson 2000, have denied that we have the same evidence in the good and the skeptical case. According to Williamson, our evidence is constituted not by our experiences, but by what we know. Given that in the good case we know more propositions that in the bad case, we have more evidence in the good case than we do in the skeptical case. In the good case, for instance, we know mundane propositions such as the proposition that we have hands. Given that knowledge entails justification, in the good case we are justified in believing that we have hands. Given CP, in the good case we are justified in believing that we are not in the skeptical case. This account of evidence entails that the relation of indiscriminability between the good case and the skeptical case is not symmetric: victims of a skeptical scenario cannot distinguish the skeptical scenario from the good case (for all they know, they are in the good case, and for all they know, they are in the skeptical case), but subjects in the good case can distinguish between the cases (they know that they are in the good case, and—again, given CP—they know that they are not in the skeptical case).[16]

But even those contemporary philosophers who grant that our epistemic position with respect to external world propositions is the same in the normal case as in the skeptical scenario can object to the symmetry thesis. For even granting (as we must) that in the skeptical scenario we do not know that we are not in the skeptical scenario, it doesn’t follow that in the ordinary case we do not know that we are not in the skeptical scenario, not even assuming that we have the same evidence in both cases. To begin with, an obvious difference between the normal case and the skeptical scenario is that in the skeptical scenario the proposition in question (that we are not in the skeptical scenario) is false, whereas in the normal case it is true. Given that knowledge requires truth, we can explain why we lack knowledge in the skeptical scenario by appealing to this truth condition on knowledge, rather than to the paucity of our evidence. In other words, our evidence for thinking that we are not in the skeptical scenario, this reply holds, is good enough to know that proposition, if only it were true. Now, the skeptic can then reply that not all skeptical scenarios are such that external worlds propositions are false in them. For instance, if I am right now dreaming that I have hands I do not thereby know that I have hands, even though I do have hands while dreaming. We noted above that the introduction of skeptical hypotheses which do not entail the falsity of external world propositions complicates the CP argument, but let us here bracket that issue. For, in addition to truth, knowledge plausibly requires other non-evidential conditions. In the wake of the Gettier problem, for instance, many philosophers have accepted that besides belief, justification and truth, the right kind of relation between the truth of the proposition and the belief must hold, and arguably it is this that fails in the dreaming scenario, rather than (again) the paucity of our evidence (see entry on the analysis of knowledge). Therefore, it can be held that there is an asymmetry between the good case and the skeptical scenario even if we grant that we have the same evidence in both cases.

The Cartesian skeptic can nevertheless raise an uncomfortable question at this point: what is this alleged evidence in favor of the proposition that we are not in a skeptical scenario? One tempting answer is that the evidence in question consists precisely of those external world propositions which are the target of the Cartesian argument. I know that I have hands, and, according to this view, that very proposition is my evidence for the proposition that I am not a handless brain in a vat. But recall our discussion of Dretske’s mule case. There we pointed out that Dretske is, in effect, assimilating Closure and Transmission principles—i.e., assuming that the only way in which Closure principles can hold is if some evidence e is evidence both for p and any q entailed by p. We noted then that there is at least another possibility: it might be that we must be antecedently justified in believing q in order to be justified in believing some p which entails it. And indeed, it seems plausible that this is the direction of the evidential relation between external world propositions and the negation of skeptical hypotheses: we cannot be justified in believing external world propositions unless we have antecedent justification for believing the negation of skeptical hypotheses (but cf. Pryor 2000).

Another alternative is to say that no evidence justifies us in believing the negations of skeptical hypotheses, but that we are nevertheless justified in believing them. On one version of this view, put forward by Crispin Wright 2004, our entitlement to accept that we are not in a skeptical scenario does not depend on our having any kind of evidence, either empirical or a priori (see also Coliva (2015) for a development of a view in this neighborhood). Indeed, we are entitled to accept those propositions because unless we were we would not be justified in believing any proposition. Notice two important terminological points in the statement of Wright’s view: he doesn’t think that we are justified in believing that we are not in a skeptical scenario, but that we are entitled to accept that proposition. What are the differences between justification and entitlement, on the one hand, and belief and acceptance, on the other? Roughly, what we are calling justification Wright calls “warrant”. He thinks that there are two kinds of warrant: we can be warranted in believing a proposition because we have an evidential justification for it (where the evidence consists of the propositions we are warranted in believing or accepting), or we can be entitled to accept it even in the absence of any justification for them. As for the difference between belief and acceptance, Wright is prepared to grant that to count as a belief an attitude must be evidence-based, and so entitlements cannot be entitlements to believe. To be entitled to accept a proposition, for Wright, is to be justified in behaving (where “behavior” is understood broadly, to include cognitive inferential behavior, for instance) approximately as one would if one believed the proposition.

On another version of the view, although we do not have empirical evidence for the proposition that we are not in a skeptical scenario, we do have a kind of justification for it which does not rest exclusively on the fact that if we didn’t then we wouldn’t be justified in believing anything. Stewart Cohen 2010 has argued that our justification for believing that we are not in a skeptical scenario derives from the rationality of certain inferential rules (see also Wedgwood 2013). One such rule justifies us in concluding (defeasibly) that there is something red in front of us if we have an experience with the content that there is something red in front of us. Now, we can use that rule “online”, when we do in fact have an experience with the content that there is something red in front of us, or “offline”, assuming for the sake of argument that we have an experience with the content that there is something red in front of us to see what follows from it. According to the rule in question, it follows (again, defeasibly) that there is something red in front of us. We can now cancel the assumption by concluding (defeasibly) with the following conditional: if I have an experience with the content that there is something red in front of me, then there is something red in front of me. Notice that this conditional is incompatible with one specific skeptical hypothesis: the hypothesis that (for whatever reason) I have an experience with the content that there is something red in front of me but there is nothing red in front of me.

4. Contextualism

So far, we have looked at reasons for and against the two premises of the CP argument for Cartesian Skepticism. A different kind of approach to the argument requires some setup. Philosophers routinely distinguish between sentences and the propositions expressed by some of them. Sentences are language-dependent entities whereas propositions are (something like) the informational content of some of those language-dependent entities (see entry on propositions). Thus, we distinguish between the proposition that it is raining and the English sentence It is raining. That very same proposition can be expressed by other sentences, such as the Spanish sentence Está lloviendo. Moreover, which proposition a given sentence expresses (if any) can depend on contextual factors—that is to say, the same sentence may express one proposition when produced in a given a context, and a different one when produced in a different context. Thus, when Tomás says that it is raining he expresses the proposition that it is raining in Tucson on May 14, 2019, whereas when Manolo said “Está lloviendo” last week, he expressed the proposition that it was raining in Mar del Plata on May 10, 2019.

The contextualist response to the argument for Cartesian Skepticism rests on the claim that which propositions the sentences used in that argument express is also a context-sensitive matter. Different contextualists would fill in the details in different ways—here we follow most closely the contextualism of Cohen 1987, 1988, 2000, 2005, 2014a,b, but see also Lewis 1996, DeRose 1992, 1995, 2002, 2004, 2005 and Stine 1976. Notice, to begin with, that justification comes in degrees: one can be more justified in believing one proposition than another. But there is also such a thing as being justified tout court. In this respect, it can be argued that “justified” is like “tall”, in that we can make sense both of comparative uses, such as when we say that Tomás is taller than his mother, and of non-comparative ones, such as when we say that Jordan is tall. Notice also that which proposition is expressed by a non-comparative use of “tall” does not float free from what would be appropriate comparative uses. Thus, when I say “Jordan is tall”, what I say is true provided that Jordan is taller than the average subject in the relevant contrast class. Thus, if Jordan is a fifth-grader, then what I said would be true if Jordan is taller than the average fifth-grader, whereas if Jordan is an NBA player, then what I said would be true if Jordan is taller than the average NBA player (who plays in Jordan’s position, perhaps). Similarly, the contextualist claims that when I say that I am justified in believing a proposition, what I say is true if and only if my degree of justification for believing the proposition is higher than a contextually set threshold. That threshold, moreover, can vary with the conversational context. Thus, if we are doing epistemology and thinking about the requirements for justification, the threshold required for an utterance of “I am justified in believing I have hands” goes up to the point where few (if any) of us would count as having said something true, whereas in an everyday context the threshold goes down to the point where most of us would count as having said something true.

According to contextualism, then, there is no single proposition expressed by the sentences used in the CP-based argument for Cartesian Skepticism. Rather, there are many such propositions. Two interesting ones are the propositions expressed in everyday contexts, where CP2 as well as the conclusion of the argument express false propositions, and those expressed in heightened-scrutiny contexts, where both CP2 as well as the conclusion of the argument express true propositions. CP1 (as well as CP itself) always expresses a true proposition, as long as we do not change contexts mid-sentence. Thus, the contextualist response to the CP-based argument is that it is at least two arguments: a sound one, when produced in heightened-scrutiny contexts, and one with a false premise (and a false conclusion) when produced in ordinary contexts. Contextualism is thus a more concessive response to the skeptic than the ones we have canvassed so far, for it concedes that the sentences used in the argument for Cartesian Skepticism can be used to express propositions which constitute a sound argument.

But even though Contextualism represents a concessive answer to skepticism, it is certainly not concessive enough in the eyes of the skeptic. For the contextualist simply asserts that, in ordinary contexts, we are justified in rejecting skeptical hypotheses. But recall that the skeptic’s idea was that CP2 is true even when we have in mind even minimally demanding standards for justification. In other words, the skeptic claims that we are not justified in believing the negation of skeptical hypotheses even a little bit, not just that we do not meet a very stringent standard for justification. Now, the skeptic might well be wrong about this, but the contextualist, qua contextualist, does not have any argument for his trademark claim that we do have some justification for believing the negation of skeptical hypotheses. In this respect, contextualism as a response to the skeptic is parasitic on some independent argument to the effect that we do have that kind of justification.

A related issue regarding Contextualism pertains to its relevance to skepticism. Grant, if only for the sake of argument, that Contextualism regarding knowledge and justification attributions is true. That is to say, grant that there are multiple properties that, say, “justified” could refer to. Couldn’t skeptics, and epistemologists more generally, be interested in a subset (perhaps just one) of them? If so, the interesting epistemological arguments would pertain to the conditions under which that property is instantiated, and Contextualism would fall by the wayside. For a debate regarding this and related issues, see Conee 2014a,b and Cohen 2014a,b.

A view which is related to, but crucially different from, Contextualism goes under various names in the literature: “Subject-Sensitive Invariantism”, “Interest Relative Invariantism” or views which admit of “pragmatic encroachment” (see Fantl and McGrath 2002, 2007, 2009; Hawthorne 2003; and Stanley 2005). Whereas the contextualist thinks that the same sentence attributing justification can express different propositions depending on the context in which it is produced, the subject-sensitive invariantist thinks that the proposition expressed is invariant, but its truth-value depends on features of the subject which can vary (such as how important it is to the subject that the belief in question be true). Very roughly, a version of subject-sensitive invariantism has it that a sentence of the form “S is justified in believing p” invariantly expresses a proposition which entails that S’s justification for believing p is at least high enough for S to be rational in acting as if p is true. Notice that whether it is rational for S to act as if p is traditionally thought to depend on two things: the degree of justification S has for believing that p (or, perhaps more commonly in the context of decision theory, which degree of belief, or credence, S is justified in assigning to p), and S’s preferences. Thus, the more sensitive S’s preferences are with respect to whether p is true, the more justified in believing p S must be for the proposition that S is justified (tout court) in believing p to be true. For instance, if nothing much hangs, for S, on whether there is orange juice in the house, a faint memory of having seen some in the fridge might be enough for it to be true that S is justified in believing that there is orange juice in the house. On the other hand, if S is diabetic and needs to ingest some sugar quickly, that same faint memory might not be enough for that same proposition to be true. Notice the difference between Contextualism and Subject-Sensitive Invariantism: the contextualist might say that the same sentence (that S is justified in believing that there is orange juice in the house) expresses two different propositions (one true, the other false) depending on whether the conversational context includes the information that S is diabetic and needs to ingest sugar; the subject-sensitive invariantist, on the other hand, holds that the sentence in question always expresses the same proposition, but that very proposition is true in the first case but false in the second.

Subject-Sensitive Invariantism has been subject to a number of criticisms (see McGrath 2004; DeRose 2002, 2004, 2005; Cohen 2005; Comesaña 2013; Anderson and Hawthorne, 2019a,b), but the general approach has also been ably defended (see the previously cited work by Fantl and McGrath). Nevertheless, the same issue that arose with respect to Contextualism seems to arise here. The Subject-Sensitive Invariantist needs an independent argument to the effect that we can be justified at least to a minimal degree in believing the negations of skeptical hypotheses, for otherwise his trademark claim that propositions attributing us justification for believing such claims are true is itself unjustified.

5. Pyrrhonian Skepticism

We turn now to Pyrrhonian Skepticism.[17] We remind the reader that our main interest here is not historical (for which see the entry on ancient skepticism), but rather systematic: we want to canvass the legacy of Pyrrhonian Skepticism for contemporary epistemology, and in so doing we set aside even the most cursory exegetical interest.

Recall that, according to Pyrrhonian Skepticism, suspension of judgment is the only justified attitude with respect to any proposition (yes, including the proposition that suspension of judgment is the only justified attitude with respect to any proposition). We are interested here in whether there are good arguments for such a view. We begin by recalling the tri-partite distinction between belief, disbelief and suspension of judgment. If we identify disbelief in a proposition with belief in its negation, then we are left with two attitudes within the realm of coarse-grained epistemology: belief and suspension of judgment. We assume also that the arguments to follow are addressed to someone who has an interest in, and has considered, the propositions in question. Otherwise, there is always the possibility of not taking any attitude whatsoever towards a proposition. Such lack of an attitude cannot itself be (epistemically) justified or not. But if the subject is to take an attitude, then the argument for Pyrrhonian Skepticism has it that suspension of judgment is the only justified one.

The Pyrrhonian skeptics sought suspension of judgment as a way of achieving calm (ataraxia) in the face of seemingly intractable disagreement. The Pyrrhonians had a number of ways, or “modes”, to induce suspension of judgment. The importance of Pyrrhonian Skepticism to contemporary epistemology derives primarily from these modes, and in particular from a subset of them referred to collectively as “the modes of Agrippa”. There are five modes associated with Agrippa, but three of them are the most important: the mode of hypothesis (or unsupported assertion), the mode of circularity (“reciprocal”), and the mode of regression to infinity. The three modes of Agrippa function together in the following way. Whenever the dogmatist (Sextus refers to those who are not skeptics as “dogmatists”, and we will follow him in this) asserts his belief in a proposition \(p_1\), the Pyrrhonian will challenge that assertion, asking the dogmatist to justify \(p_1\), to give reasons for thinking that it is true. The dogmatist will then either decline to answer the challenge or adduce another proposition \(p_2\) in support of \(p_1\). If the dogmatist refuses to answer the challenge, the Pyrrhonian will be satisfied that the only justified attitude to take with respect to \(p_1\) is to suspend judgment, because no reason for it has been given (thus appealing to the mode of hypothesis). If the dogmatist adduces another proposition \(p_2\) in support of \(p_1\), then either \(p_2\) will be identical to \(p_1\) or it will be a different proposition. If \(p_2\) is the same proposition as \(p_1\), then the Pyrrhonian will also suspend judgment with respect to \(p_1\), because no proposition can support itself (thus appealing to the mode of circularity). If, on the other hand, \(p_2\) is different from \(p_1\), then the Pyrrhonian will ask the dogmatist to justify his assertion of \(p_2\). And now either the dogmatist offers no reason in support of \(p_2\), or offers \(p_2\) itself or \(p_1\) as a reason, or adduces yet another proposition \(p_3\), different from both \(p_1\) and \(p_2\). If the dogmatist offers no reason for \(p_2\), then the Pyrrhonian will invoke the mode of hypothesis again and suspend judgment in accordance with it; if either \(p_2\) itself or \(p_1\) are offered as reasons to believe in \(p_1\), then the Pyrrhonian will invoke the mode of circularity and suspend judgment in accordance with it (because not only can no proposition be a reason for believing in itself, but also no genuine chain of reasons can loop); and, finally, if the dogmatist offers yet another proposition \(p_3\), different from both \(p_1\) and \(p_2\), as a reason to believe \(p_2\), then the same three possibilities that arose with respect to \(p_2\) will arise with respect to \(p_3\). The dogmatist will not be able to continue offering different propositions in response to the Pyrrhonian challenge forever—eventually, either no reason will be offered, or a proposition that has already made an appearance will be mentioned again. The Pyrrhonian refers to this impossibility of actually offering a different proposition each time a reason is needed as “the mode of infinite regression”. The three Pyrrhonian modes, then, work in tandem in order to induce suspension of judgment with respect to any proposition whatsoever.

The Pyrrhonian use of the three modes of Agrippa in order to induce suspension of judgment can be presented in the form of an argument, which has been called “Agrippa’s trilemma”. It is at least somewhat misleading to present the Pyrrhonian position in terms of an argument, because when someone presents an argument they are usually committed to the truth of its premises and its conclusion, whereas Pyrrhonian skeptics would suspend judgment with respect to them. Nevertheless, presenting an argument for Pyrrhonian Skepticism doesn’t do much violence to this skeptical position, because what is important is not whether the Pyrrhonians themselves accept the premises or the validity of the argument, but rather whether we do. If we do, then it seems that we ourselves should be Pyrrhonian skeptics (and if we do become Pyrrhonian skeptics as a result of this argument, we can then start worrying about what to do with respect to the fact that an argument whose premises we believed—and perhaps still believe—to be true convinced us that we are not justified in believing anything). If we do not think that the argument is sound, then we stand to learn something interesting about the structure of an epistemological theory—because each of the premises of the apparently valid argument looks plausible at first sight.

Before presenting a reconstruction of Agrippa’s trilemma we need to introduce some definitions. Let’s say that a belief is inferentially justified if and only if it is justified (at least in part) in virtue of its relations to other beliefs. A justified basic belief, by contrast, is a belief that is justified but not in virtue of its relations to other beliefs. An inferential chain is a set of beliefs such that every member of the set is allegedly related to at least one other member by the relation “is justified by”. Agrippa’s trilemma, then, can be presented thus:

  1. If a belief is justified, then it is either a basic justified belief or an inferentially justified belief.
  2. There are no basic justified beliefs.


  1. If a belief is justified, then it is justified in virtue of belonging to an inferential chain.
  2. All inferential chains are such that either (a) they contain an infinite number of beliefs; or (b) they contain circles; or (c) they contain beliefs that are not justified.
  3. No belief is justified in virtue of belonging to an infinite inferential chain.
  4. No belief is justified in virtue of belonging to a circular inferential chain.
  5. No belief is justified in virtue of belonging to an inferential chain that contains unjustified beliefs.


  1. There are no justified beliefs.

Premise 1 is beyond reproach, given our previous definitions. Premise 2 is justified by the mode of hypothesis. Step 3 of the argument follows from premises 1 and 2. Premise 4 is also beyond reproach—the only remaining possible structure for an inferential chain to have is to contain basic justified beliefs, but there are none of those according to premise 2. Premise 5 is justified by appeal to the mode of infinite regression, and premise 6 is justified by appeal to the mode of circularity. Premise 7 might seem to be a truism, but we will have to take a closer look at it.

It is interesting to note that Agrippa’s trilemma is perfectly general; in particular, it applies to philosophical positions as well as to ordinary propositions. In fact, when Agrippa’s trilemma is applied to epistemological theories themselves, the result is what has been called “the problem of the criterion” (see Chisholm 1973).

Many contemporary epistemological positions can be stated as a reaction to Agrippa’s trilemma. In fact, all of premises 2, 5, 6 and 7 have been rejected by different philosophers at one time or another. We examine those responses in what follows.

5.1 Rejecting Premise 2: Foundationalism

Foundationalists claim that there are basic justified beliefs—beliefs that are justified but not in virtue of their relations to other beliefs. In fact, according to foundationalism, all justified beliefs are either basic beliefs or are justified (at least in part) in virtue of being inferentially related to a justified belief (or to some justified beliefs). This is where foundationalism gets its name: the edifice of justified beliefs has its foundation in basic beliefs.

But how do foundationalists respond to the mode of hypothesis? If a belief is not justified by another belief, then isn’t it just a blind assertion? If basic beliefs are justified but not by other beliefs, then how are they justified? What else besides beliefs is there that can justify beliefs?

To this last question, many foundationalists reply: experience (we are talking here about empirical knowledge; a priori knowledge raises interesting problems of its own, and it is of course also subject to Agrippa’s trilemma). To a rough first approximation that glosses over many important philosophical issues, experiences are mental states that, like beliefs, aim to represent the world as it is, and, like beliefs too, can fail in achieving that aim—that is, experiences can misrepresent. Nevertheless, experiences are not to be identified with beliefs, for it is possible to have an experience as of, e.g., facing two lines that differ in length without having the belief that one is facing two lines that differ in length—a combination of mental states that anyone familiar with the Müller-Lyer illusion will recognize.

There are three important questions that any foundationalist has to answer. First, what kinds of beliefs do experiences justify? Second, how must inferentially acquired beliefs be related to basic beliefs in order for them to be justified? Third, in virtue of what do experiences justify beliefs?

With respect to the first question, we can distinguish between traditional foundationalism and moderate foundationalism. Traditional foundationalists think that basic beliefs are beliefs about experiences, whereas moderate foundationalists think that experience can justify beliefs about the external world. Take, for example, the experience that you typically have when looking at a tomato under good perceptual conditions—an experience that, remember, can be had even if no tomato is actually there.[18] A moderate foundationalist would say that that experience justifies you in believing that there is a tomato in front of you. The traditional foundationalist, on the other hand, would say that the experience justifies you only in believing that you have an experience as of a tomato in front of you. You may well be justified in believing that there is a tomato in front of you, but only inferentially.

A traditional argument in favor of traditional foundationalism relies on the fact that whereas you can be mistaken regarding whether there is a tomato in front of you when you have an experience as of facing a tomato, you cannot, in the same situation, be mistaken regarding whether you are undergoing such an experience. From the point of view of traditional foundationalism, this fact indicates that the moderate foundationalist is taking an unnecessary epistemic risk—the risk of having a foundation composed of false beliefs.

The moderate foundationalist can reply that the traditional foundationalist must undertake a similar risk. For, while it is true that if one is undergoing a certain experience then one cannot be mistaken in thinking that one is undergoing that experience, one can still be mistaken about one’s experiences—for instance, perhaps one can believe that one is in pain even if the experience that one is undergoing is actually one of feeling acutely uncomfortable. And if it were just as difficult to distinguish between the true and the false in the realm of beliefs about our own experiences as it is in the realm of beliefs about the external world, then we could be wrong about which of our own beliefs are basically justified and which are not. If this kind of meta-fallibilism is accepted, then why not accept the further kind according to which basic justified beliefs can be false? Of course, the resolution of this dispute depends on whether, as the moderate believes, we can be mistaken about our own experiences.

What about our second question: how must basic beliefs be related to inferentially justified beliefs? Here too there are two different kinds of foundationalism: deductivism and non-deductivism. According to the deductivist, the only way in which a (possibly one-membered) set of basic justified beliefs can justify another belief is by logically entailing that other belief. In other words, there has to be a valid argument at least some of whose premises are basic justified beliefs[19] and whose conclusion is the inferentially justified belief in question. Given that the argument is valid, the truth of the premises guarantees the truth of the conclusion—it is impossible for all the premises to be true while the conclusion is false. Non-deductivism allows relations other than logical entailment as possible justificatory relations. For instance, many foundationalists will claim that good inductive inferences from basic justified beliefs provide their conclusions with justification—even though inductive arguments are not valid, that is, even though it is possible for all the premises of a good inductive argument to be true while its conclusion is false. Although these are independent distinctions, traditional foundationalists tend to be deductivists, whereas moderate foundationalists tend to be non-deductivists. Notice that for a traditional, deductivist foundationalist, there cannot be false justified beliefs. Many contemporary epistemologists would shy away from this strong form of infallibilism, and take that consequence to be an argument against the conjunction of traditional foundationalism and deductivism.

The question that is most interesting from the point of view of Pyrrhonian Skepticism is our third one: what is it about the relation between an experience and a belief that, according to the foundationalist, allows the former to justify the latter? (Analogous questions apply to non-foundationalist positions too, and the discussion to follow is not restricted to the specific case of foundationalism.) There are three different proposals about how to answer this question that are the most prominent. Let’s call the principles that assert that a subject is justified in having a certain belief given that she is undergoing a certain experience, “epistemic principles”. Our third question can then be stated as follows: what makes epistemic principles true?

The first proposal, which we shall call “primitivism”, claims that the question cannot have an intelligible answer. There is no more basic fact in virtue of which epistemic principles obtain. They describe bedrock facts, not to be explained in terms of anything else, but are instead to be used to explain other facts. Epistemological theorizing, according to the primitivist, ends with the discovery of the correct epistemic principles (for views along these lines, see Chisholm 1966 [and also the second and third editions: 1977, 1989] and Feldman & Conee 1985).

The other two positions are non-primitivist. Internalist non-primitivism holds that epistemic principles are true in virtue of facts about ourselves—for instance, one prominent internalist view is that which epistemic principles are true for a given subject is determined by which epistemic principles that subject would accept under deep reflection (see Foley 1993).[20] Externalist non-primitivism holds that epistemic principles are true in virtue of facts that are not about ourselves—for instance, one prominent externalist view is that certain experiences provide justification for certain beliefs because the obtaining of those experiences is reliably connected to the truth of those beliefs (that is, it couldn’t easily happen that those experiences obtain without those beliefs being true; see Goldman 1979).

Both externalists and internalists think that primitivists are overlooking real facts, whereas primitivists think that there are fewer things in heaven and earth than are dreamt of in non-primitivist philosophy. Within the non-primitivist camp, externalists think that internalists have too subjective a conception of epistemology—to some extent, thinking it so, or being disposed to think it so under conditions of deep reflection, makes it so for the internalist. Internalists, for their part, are likely to think that externalists are no longer engaged in the same project that both skeptics and internalist epistemologists are engaged in, the project of determining “from the inside” whether one’s beliefs are justified or amount to knowledge, because the obtaining of a relation between a belief of his and the external world is something that the subject is in no position to ascertain “from the inside”.

5.2 Rejecting Premise 5: Infinitism

Infinitism, the claim that infinite evidential chains can provide justification to their members, is the answer to Agrippa’s trilemma that has received the least attention in the literature. This is due, at least in part, to the fact that infinitism has to deal with what might seem like formidable obstacles. For instance, it seems that no one actually has an infinite number of beliefs. To this objection, the infinitist is likely to reply that actually occurring beliefs are not needed, only implicit beliefs that are available to the subject in order to continue constructing his inferential chain if called upon to do so (by others or by himself). The plausibility of this reply depends on whether good sense can be made of the notion of implicit belief and the notion of an implicit belief’s being available for a subject. A second apparently formidable problem for infinitism has to do with the fact that the mere appeal to a new belief, regardless of its epistemic status, cannot provide justification to the belief we started out with. In other words, infinitism seems to run afoul of the following principle:

Principle of inferential justification: If S is justified in believing p on the basis of S’s belief that q, then S is justified in believing q.

The infinitist might reply that he does not run afoul of that principle, because the beliefs adduced in support of the initial beliefs are themselves justified by beliefs further down the chain. But what goes for the initial set of beliefs goes, it seems, for longer chains. If the appeal to a single unjustified belief cannot do any justificatory work of its own, why would appealing to a large number of unjustified beliefs do any better? Even leaving that problem aside, the infinitist, like the coherentist, maintains that justification can arise merely in virtue of relations among beliefs. Infinitists will then have to respond to many of the same objections that are leveled against coherentism—in particular, they would have to respond to the isolation objection mentioned in the next section. (See Aikin 2011 and Klein 1999, 2007 for defenses of infinitism; and see Turri & Klein 2014; Aikin & Peijnenburg 2014; and Peijnenburg & Wenmackers 2014 for collections of essays which defend or criticize various forms of infinitism.)

5.3 Rejecting Premise 3: Coherentism

Coherentists reject two related features of the picture of evidential reasons that underlies Agrippa’s trilemma. The first feature is the idea that justification is an asymmetrical relation: if a belief \(p_1\) justifies a different belief \(p_2\), then \(p_2\) does not justify \(p_1\). The second feature is the idea that the unit of justification is the individual belief. Putting these two rejections together, the coherentist believes that justification is a symmetrical and holistic matter. It is not individual beliefs that are justified in the primary sense of the word, but only complete systems of beliefs—individual beliefs are justified, when they are, in virtue of belonging to a justified system of beliefs. The central coherentist notion of justification is best taken to be a comparative one: a system of beliefs B1 is better justified than a system of beliefs B2 if and only if B1 has a greater degree of internal coherence than B2. One crucial question that coherentists have to answer, of course, is what it takes for one system of beliefs to have a greater degree of coherence than another. Many coherentists have thought that explanatory relations will be crucial in elucidating the notion of coherence: the more explanatorily integrated a system is, the more coherence it displays (see Quine & Ullian 1970 [1978] and BonJour 1978).

The main objection that coherentists have to answer has been called “the isolation objection”. The objection centers on the fact that, according to the coherentist, the justification of a system of beliefs is entirely a matter of relations among the beliefs constituting the system. But this runs against the strong intuition that experience has a very important role to play in the justification of beliefs. To illustrate the problem, suppose that you and I both have a highly coherent set of beliefs—your system, it is safe to assume, contains the belief that you are reading, whereas mine doesn’t, and it contains instead the belief that I am swimming (because, let us suppose, I am swimming right now). Suppose now that we switch systems of beliefs—somehow, you come to have my set of beliefs and I come to have yours. Given that coherence is entirely a matter of relations among beliefs, your system will be as coherent in my mind as it was in yours, and vice-versa. And yet, our beliefs are now completely unjustified—there you are, reading, believing that you are swimming, and here I am, swimming, believing that I am reading. In other words, certain transformations that preserve coherence in a system of beliefs do not seem to preserve justification.

In reply, coherentists have argued that it is possible to give experience a role without sacrificing the idea that coherence is entirely a matter of relations among beliefs—one idea is to require that any minimally acceptable system of beliefs contain beliefs about the experiences that the subject is undergoing (see BonJour 1985 and Lehrer 1990). It is fair to say that there is no agreement regarding whether this move can solve the problem.

5.4 Rejecting Premise 7: Positism

One position that can be traced back to some ideas in Wittgenstein’s On Certainty (Wittgenstein 1969)—and, perhaps, also to Ortega’s Ideas y Creencias (Ortega y Gasset 1940)—is that evidential chains have to terminate in beliefs that are not properly said to be either justified or unjustified. This position, which we shall call “Positism” (not to be confused with “positivism”), shares many features with Foundationalism: for instance, both positists and foundationalists agree that inferential chains have to be finite and non-circular. But, whereas the foundationalist thinks that the starting points of inferential chains are beliefs that are justified by something other than beliefs, the positist thinks that the starting points of inferential chains are beliefs that are not justified by anything—they are posits that we have to believe without justification. Despite this difference between the positist and the foundationalist, the positions are structurally similar enough that analogues of the questions posed to the foundationalist can be asked of the positist.[21]

First, then, which beliefs are such that they are not justified and yet are the starting points of every inferential chain—in other words, how do we identify which are the posits? One answer that can be gleamed from Wittgenstein’s On Certainty, which we will call “relativistic Positism”, is that this is a matter that is relative both to time and society, because what the posits are is determined by some function of the actual positing practices of the members of one’s society at a certain time. Thus, according to Wittgenstein, the proposition that no one has been to the moon was a posit for a certain long period of time—it was a proposition that no one felt the need to justify, and that was presupposed in many justificatory practices. For obvious reasons, though, that proposition can no longer appropriately function as a posit. Other epistemologists, “non-relativistic positists”, think that which beliefs are properly posited depends on some objective truth about which beliefs have to be presupposed in order to engage in the practice of justifying beliefs at all. One prime candidate for playing this role is the first-person belief that I am not being deceived by an evil demon into thinking that I am a normally embodied and situated human being (this is the view advocated by Wright 2004 that we already alluded to in section 3.2).

The second question, regarding how posits must be related to inferred beliefs in order to justify them, can receive answers that are completely analogous to the foundationalists’.

The third question, applied to positism, is the question why certain beliefs are properly posited. Relativistic positists answer that this is so because of a certain societal fact: because they are taken to be so by an appropriate sub-sector of a certain society at a certain time. Non-relativistic positists answer that a certain belief is properly taken as a posit just in case every justificatory act that we engage in presupposes that the belief in question is true.

One objection that positists of both sorts have to face is that they are transforming a doxastic necessity into an epistemic virtue—that is, they are concluding that certain beliefs can properly serve as the starting points of inferential chains because that is how in fact they are treated (relativistic Positism) or because otherwise it wouldn’t be possible to engage in inferential practices at all (non-relativistic Positism). The Pyrrhonian skeptic, of course, will reply that the mere fact that most members of a society accept a certain belief without justification, or even the fact that if we don’t do so then we cannot justify anything else, doesn’t mean that it should be accepted without justification.

5.5 Rejecting More than One Premise

Perhaps the most interesting recent development in relation to Pyrrhonian Skepticism is that more and more epistemologists are arguing that the proper way to reply to Agrippa’s trilemma is to combine some of the positions that, for ease of exposition, we have presented as mutually exclusive. Thus, for example, many contemporary epistemologists put forward theories that contain elements of both Foundationalism and Coherentism (see, for instance, Haack 1993). It is a testament to the endurance of Pyrrhonian Skepticism that philosophers continue in this way to grapple with it.


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