First published Sat Aug 30, 2003; substantive revision Fri Sep 21, 2018

At a broad level, a Creationist is someone who believes in a god who is absolute creator of heaven and earth, out of nothing, by an act of free will. Such a deity is generally thought to be “transcendent” meaning beyond human experience, and constantly involved (‘immanent’) in the creation, ready to intervene as necessary, and without whose constant concern the creation would cease or disappear. Christians, Jews, and Muslims are all Creationists in this sense. Generally they are known as ‘theists,’ distinguishing them from ‘deists,’ that is people who believe that there is a designer who might or might not have created the material on which he (or she or it) is working and who does not interfere once the designing act is finishing. The focus of this discussion is on a narrower sense of Creationism, the sense that one usually finds in popular writings (especially in America today, but expanding world-wide rapidly). Here, Creationism means the taking of the Bible, particularly the early chapters of Genesis, as literally true guides to the history of the universe and to the history of life, including us humans, down here on earth (Numbers 1992).

Creationism in this more restricted sense entails a number of beliefs. These include, first, that a short time has elapsed since the beginning of everything. ‘Young Earth Creationists’ think that Archbishop Ussher’s seventeenth-century calculation of about 6000 years is a good estimate. Second, that there are six days of creation – there is debate on the meaning of ‘day’ in this context, with some insisting on a literal twenty-four hours, and others more flexible. Third, that there was a miraculous creation of all life including Homo sapiens — with scope for debate about whether Adam and Eve came together or if Eve came afterwards to keep Adam company. Fourth, that there was a world-wide flood some time after the initial creation, through which only a limited number of humans and animals survived. Fifth, that there were other events such as the Tower of Babel and the turning of Lot’s wife into a pillar of salt. Creationists (in this narrow sense) have variously been known as Fundamentalists or biblical literalists, and sometimes – especially when they are pushing the scientific grounds for their beliefs – as Scientific Creationists. Today’s Creationists are often marked by enthusiasm for something that is known as Intelligent Design. Because the relationship between Creationism in the sense of literalism and Intelligent Design is somewhat complex, examination of this relationship will be left until later and, until stated otherwise, the following discussion focusses on literalists. (Because ‘literalist’ is the common term, we continue to use it. More accurately, such people are better known as ‘inerrantists,’ implying that the stress is less on the actual words and more on the interpretation, especially given the extent to which they interpret the Bible, especially when it comes to prophecies.)

With significant provisos to be noted below, Creationists are strongly opposed to a world created by evolution, particularly to a world as described by Charles Darwin in his Origin of Species. Creationists (certainly traditional Creationists) oppose the fact (pattern) of evolution, namely that all organisms living and dead are the end products of a natural process of development from a few forms, perhaps ultimately from inorganic materials (‘common descent’). Often this is known as ‘macroevolution’ as opposed to ‘microevolution,’ meaning apes to humans rather than merely one species of finch to another. Creationists also oppose claims about the total adequacy of the Darwinian version of the theory of evolution, namely that population pressures lead to a struggle for existence; that organisms differ in random ways brought on by errors in the material of heredity (‘mutations’ in the ‘genes’); that the struggle and variation leads to a natural form of selection, with some surviving and reproducing and others failing; and that the end consequence of all of this is evolution, in the direction of well-adapted organisms.

1. History of Creationism

Creationists present themselves as the true bearers and present-day representatives of authentic, traditional Christianity, but historically speaking this is simply not true (Ruse 1988 (ed.), 2005; Numbers 1992; McMullin 1985). The Bible has a major place in the life of any Christian, but it is not the case that the Bible taken literally has always had a major place in the lives or theology of Christians. For most, indeed, it has not (Turner 2002). Although, one should remember that most literalists are better known as inerrantists, because they often differ on the meaning of a literal reading! Tradition, the teachings and authority of the church, has always had main status for Catholics, and natural religion – approaching God through reason and argument – has long had an honored place for both Catholics and Protestants. Catholics, especially dating back to Saint Augustine around 400 AD, and even to earlier thinkers like Origen, have always recognized that at times the Bible needs to be taken metaphorically or allegorically. Augustine was particularly sensitive to this need, because for many years as a young man he was a Manichean and hence denied the authenticity and relevance of the Old Testament for salvation. When he became a Christian he knew full well the problems of Genesis and hence was eager to help his fellow believers from getting ensnared in the traps of literalism.

It was not until the Protestant Reformation that the Bible started to take on its unique central position, as the great Reformers – especially Luther and Calvin – stressed the need to go by scripture alone and not by what they took to be the overly rich traditions of the Catholic Church. But even they were doubtful about totally literalistic readings. For Luther, justification by faith was the keystone of his theology, and yet the Epistle of Saint James seems to put greater stress on the need for good works. He referred to the gospel as ‘right strawy stuff.’ (Wengert 2013). Calvin likewise spoke of the need for God to accommodate His writings to the untutored public – especially the ancient Jews – and hence of the dangers of taking the Bible too literally in an uncritical sense. The radical branch of the Reformation under Zwingli always put primacy on God’s speaking directly to us through the heart, and to this day one finds modern-day representatives like the Quakers uncomfortable with too-biblically centered an approach to religion.

It was after the religious revivals of the eighteenth and early nineteenth century in Britain and America – revivals that led to such sects as the Methodists – that a more full-blooded literalism became a major part of the religious scene. In America particularly literalism took hold, and especially after the Civil War, it took root in the evangelical sects – especially Baptists – of the South (Numbers 1998; Noll 2002). It became part of the defining culture of the South, having (as we shall see below) as much a role in opposing ideas and influences of the leaders and policy makers of the North as anything rooted in deeply thought-through theology. Note the important qualification, ‘leaders and policy makers’ of the North. Many – especially working and lower-middle-class people – living in the large cities of the North felt deeply threatened by the moves to industrialism, the weakening of traditional beliefs, and the large influx of immigrants from Europe. They provided very fertile material for the literalist preachers. (See the extended discussions of these happenings in Ruse 2013.) Thanks to a number of factors, Creationism started to grow dramatically in the early part of the twentieth century. First, there were the first systematic attempts to work out a position that would take account of modern science as well as just a literal reading of Genesis. Particularly important in this respect were the Seventh-day Adventists, especially the Canadian-born George McCready Price, who had theological reasons for wanting literalism, not the least being the belief that the Seventh Day – the day of rest – is literally twenty-four hours in length. Also important for the Adventists and for fellow travelers, that is people who think that Armageddon is on its way, is the balancing and complementary early phenomenon of a world-wide flood. (This, as we shall see, was to become a major theme in twentieth-century Cold War times.) Second, there was the released energy of evangelicals (referring generically to Protestants whose faith was tied to the Bible, taken rather literally) as they succeeded in their attempts to prohibit liquor in the United States. Flushed from one victory, they looked for other fields to conquer. Third there was the spread of public education, and more children being exposed to evolutionary ideas, bringing on a Creationist reaction. Fourth, there were new evangelical currents afloat, especially the tracts the Fundamentals – a series of evangelical publications, conceived in 1909 by California businessman Lyman Stewart, the founder of Union Oil and a devout Presbyterian – that gave the literalist movement its name. And fifth, there was the identification of evolution – Darwinism particularly – with the militaristic aspects of Social Darwinism, especially the Social Darwinism supposed embraced by the Germans in the First World War (Larson 1997; Ruse 2018a).

This battle between evolutionists and ‘Fundamentalists’ came to a head in the mid 1920s in Dayton Tennessee, when a young school teacher John Thomas Scopes was prosecuted for teaching evolution in class, in defiance of a state law prohibiting such teaching. Prosecuted by three-times presidential candidate William Jennings Bryan and defended by noted agnostic lawyer Clarence Darrow, the ‘Scopes Monkey Trial’ caught the attention of the world, especially thanks to the inflammatory reporting of Baltimore Sun journalist H. L. Mencken. Matters descended to the farcical when, denied the opportunity to introduce his own science witnesses, Darrow put on the stand the prosecutor Bryan. In the end, Scopes was found guilty and fined $100. This conviction was overturned on a technicality on appeal, but there were no more prosecutions, even though the Tennessee law remained on the books for another forty years. In the 1950s, the Scopes trial became the basis of a famous play and then movie, Inherit the Wind. This portrays the Bryan figure as a bigot, wedded to a crude picture of life’s past. In fact, Bryan in respects was an odd figure to be defending the Tennessee law. He thought that the days of Creation are long periods of time, and he had little sympathy for eschatological speculations about Armageddon and so forth. It is quite possible that, humans apart, he accepted some form of evolution. His objections to Darwinism were more social than theological. He hated what he thought were the militaristic implications that many drew from the struggle for existence at the center of Darwin’s thinking. The First World War, with many justifying violence in the name of evolutionary biology, confirmed his suspicions. (The Pulitzer Prize winning, Summer of the Gods, Larson 1997, is definitive on the Scopes trial. It is generally agreed that Inherit the Wind is using history as a vehicle to explore and condemn McCarthy-like attacks on uncomfortably new or dissenting-type figures in American society.)

2. Creation Science

After the Scopes Trial, general agreement is that the Creationism movement had peaked and declined quite dramatically and quickly. Yet, it (and related anti-evolution activity) did have its lasting effects. Text-book manufacturers increasingly took evolution – Darwinism especially – out of their books, so that schoolchildren got less and less exposure to the ideas anyway. Whatever battles the evolutionists may have thought they had won in the court of popular opinion, in the trenches of the classroom they were losing the war badly. Things started to move again in the late 1950s. It was then that, thanks to Sputnik, the Russians so effectively demonstrated their superiority in rocketry (with its implications for the arms race of the Cold War), and America realized with a shudder how ineffective was its science training of its young. Characteristically, the country did something immediate and effective about this, namely pouring money into the production of new science texts. In this way, with class adoption, the Federal Government could have a strong impact and yet get around the problem that education tends to be under the tight control of individual states. The new biology texts gave full scope to evolution – to Darwinism – and with this the Creationism controversy again flared right up. Children were learning these dreadful doctrines in schools, and something had to be done (Ruse (ed.) 1988; Gilkey 1985).

Fortunately for the literalist, help was at hand. A biblical scholar, John C. Whitcomb, and a hydraulic engineer, Henry M. Morris, combined to write what was to be the new Bible of the movement, Genesis Flood: The Biblical Record and its Scientific Implications (1961). Following in the tradition of earlier writers, especially those from Seventh-day Adventism, they argued that every bit of the Biblical story of creation given in the early chapters of Genesis is supported fully by the best of modern science. Six days of twenty-four hours, organisms arriving miraculously, humans last, and sometime thereafter a massive world-wide flood that wiped most organisms off the face of the earth – or rather, dumped their carcasses in the mud as the waters receded. At the same time, Whitcomb and Morris argued that the case for evolution fails dismally. They introduced (or revived) a number of arguments that have become standard parts of the Creationist repertoire against evolution. Let us look at a number of these arguments, together with the counter-arguments that evolutionists make in response.

First, the Creationists argue that at best evolution is only a theory and not a fact, and that theories should never be taken as gospel (if one might be permitted a metaphor). They claim that the very language of evolutionists themselves show that their ideas are on shaky grounds. To which charge evolutionists respond that this is to confuse two senses of the word ‘theory.’ Sometimes we use it to mean a body of scientific laws, as in ‘Einstein’s theory of relativity.’ Sometimes we use it to mean an ‘iffy hypothesis,’ as in ‘I have a theory about Kennedy’s assassination.’ These are two very different senses. There is nothing iffy about the Copernican heliocentric theory. It is true. It is a fact. Evolutionists argue that the same is the case with evolution. When talking about the theory of evolution, one is talking about a body of laws. In particular, if one is following the ideas of Charles Darwin, one is arguing that population pressures lead to a struggle for existence, this then entails a natural selection of favored forms, and evolution through shared descent is the end result. This is a body of general statements about life, since the 1930s given in a formal version using mathematics with deductive inferences between steps. In other words, we have a body of laws, and hence a theory in the first sense just given. There is no implication here that the theory is iffy, that is in the second sense just given. We are not necessarily talking about something inherently unreliable. Of course, there are going to be additions and revisions, for instance the possibility of much greater hybridization than someone like Darwin realized, but that is another matter (Quammen 2018).

Second, Creationists like Whitcomb and Morris claim that the central mechanism of modern evolutionary thought, Darwin’s natural selection, is bogus. They argue that it is not a genuine claim about the real world but merely a truism, what philosophers call a tautology – something true by the meaning of the words like ‘bachelors are unmarried.’ In the case of natural selection, the Creationists point out that an alternative name for the mechanism is ‘the survival of the fittest.’ But, they ask, who are the fittest? They reply: Those that survive! Hence, natural selection reduces to the tautology that those that survive are those that survive. Not a real claim of science at all. To which evolutionists respond that this is a sleight of hand, showing ignorance of what is genuinely at stake. Natural selection is truly real, for it talks about some organisms actually surviving and reproducing in life’s struggles and others failing to do so. Some of our would-be ancestors lived and had babies and others did not. There was a differential reproduction. This is certainly not a mere truism. It could be that everyone had the same number of children. It could also be that there is no difference overall between the successful and the unsuccessful. This too is denied by natural selection. To say that something is the fitter or fittest is to say that it has certain characteristics (what biologists call adaptations) that other organisms do not have, and that on average one expects the fitter to succeed. But there is no guarantee that this must be so or that it will always happen. An earthquake could wipe out everyone, fit and unfit.

Before discussing the third argument Creationists level against evolution, it is worth pausing over this second one. Most if not all professional evolutionists argue that sometimes natural selection is not a significant causal factor. In this sense, it is false that selection is something that by definition is and always is the reason for lasting change. The fittest do not always win. It cannot be a tautology. In the 1930s, the American population geneticist Sewall Wright devised his hypothesis of “genetic drift,” arguing that sometimes mere chance can lead to effects overriding the forces of selection (Wright 1931, 1932). Although, at first, this was embraced enthusiastically (Dobzhansky 1937), it soon became clear that at the gross physical (phenotypic) level it is at most minor (Coyne, Barton, and Turelli 1997). However at the level of the gene (genotype), it is still thought very important. Indeed, it is a powerful tool in discovering the exact dates of key evolutionary events, especially those involving speciation (Ayala 2009). Moreover, as we shall see in a moment, somewhat paradoxically, as Creationism has evolved (!), increasingly the virtues of selection working at the microevolutionary level have become apparent. Thus can one explain the diversity of life on earth – it evolved since leaving the Ark, which contained only generic kinds. For all its supposed faults, there is a better discussion of natural selection at the Creationist museum in Kentucky than in the Field Museum in Chicago, 300 miles north. The bar on macroevolution remains absolute.

Third, Creationists point out that modern evolutionary theory asserts that the raw building blocks of evolution, the genetic mutations, are random. But this means that there are minimal chances of evolution producing something that works as well and efficiently as an organism, with all of the functioning parts in place. A monkey typing letters does so randomly. It could never in a million years (in a billion, billion, billion… years) type the works of Shakespeare. The Creationists say that same is true of evolution and organisms, given the randomness of mutation. To which evolutionists reply that this may all be well and true of the monkey, but in the case of evolution things are rather different. If a mutation works, then it is kept and then built upon, until the next good mutation comes along. This shrinks considerably the odds of evolution producing organisms, even though the appearance of mutation is random. Suppose you take just one phrase from Shakespeare. ‘Friends, Romans, countrymen, lend me your ears.’ If you had to get every letter right straight off, you would be into a huge time-span. Twenty-six (the number of letters, more if you include capitals and gaps and punctuation) to the power of the number of spaces. But if you are allowed to keep the ‘F’ as soon as you get it, and then go on to try for a ‘r’, you are no longer going back to square one each time and suddenly the task becomes much more manageable. (Dawkins 1986 has a good discussion of these issues.) Incidentally, add evolutionists, one must take care in speaking of mutation as ‘random.’ There is no implication that mutation is uncaused or something else rather peculiar. Rather is meant that mutations do not occur according to need. Suppose a new disease appears. Evolutionary theory does not guarantee that a new, life-protecting mutation will occur to order.

Fourth in the litany of Creationist complaints, there is a perennial favourite based on paleontology. Creationists agree that the fossil record is sequential, fish to primates moving upwards, but argue that this is the result of the sorting effect of the Flood. Primates are above dinosaurs, for example, because primates are more agile and moved further up the mountain before being caught and drowning. They also argue, however, that the fossil record ought to be continuous if evolution occurred, but in real life there are many gaps between different form – jumps from one kind of organism to another. Apes to humans would be a case in point. This spells Creation not evolution. To which the response comes that on the one hand one expects such gaps. Fossilization is an uncommon occurrence – most dead bodies get eaten straight away or just rot – and the wonder is that we have what we do have. On the other hand argue evolutionists, the record is not that gappy. There are lots of good sequences – lines of fossils with little difference between adjacent forms, from the amphibians to the mammals for example, or (in more detail) the evolution of the horse from Eohippus on five toes to the modern horse on one toe. Moreover, in refutation of Creationism, we do not find fossils out of order as you might expect after a flood. For all that Creationists sometimes claim otherwise, humans are never found down with the dinosaurs. Those brutes of old expired long before we appeared on the scene and the fossil record confirms this.

Fifth, Creationists argue that physics disproves evolution. The second law of thermodynamics claims that things always run down – entropy increases, to use the technical language. Energy gets used and converted eventually into heat, and cannot be of further service. But organisms clearly keep going and seem to defy the law. This would be impossible simply given evolution. The second law rules out the blind evolution (meaning change without direct divine guidance) of organisms from the initial simple blobs up to the complex higher organisms like humans. There must therefore have been a non-natural, miraculous intervention to produce functioning life. To which argument the response of evolutionists is that the second law does indeed say that things are running down, but it does not deny that isolated pockets of the universe might reverse the trend for a short while by using energy from elsewhere. And this is what happens on planet Earth. We use the energy from the sun to keep evolving for a while. Eventually the sun will go out and life will become extinct. The second law will win eventually, but not just yet.

Sixth, and let us make this the final Creationist objection, it is said that humans simply cannot be explained by blind law (that is, unguided law), especially not by blind evolutionary laws. They must have been created. To which the response is that it is mere arbitrary supposition to believe that humans are that exceptional. In fact, today the fossil record for humans is strong – we evolved over the past four million years from small creatures of half our height, who had small brains and who walked upright but not as well as we. There is lots of fossil proof of these beings (known as Australopithecus afarensis). Recently, there are other pertinent discoveries, showing that (as one would expect) there is not only evolution towards modern humans, but branching and sidelines, for instance of the so-called “hobbit,” Homo floresiensis (Falk 2012). Perhaps it is true that we humans are special, in that (as Christians claim) we uniquely have immortal souls, but this is a religious claim. It is not a claim of science, and hence evolution should not be faulted for not explaining souls. There is of course a lot more to be found out about human evolution, but this is the nature of science. No branch of science has all of the answers. The real question is whether the branch of science keeps the answers coming in, and evolutionists claim that this is certainly true of their branch of science.

3. Understanding Creationism in its Cultural Context

Before moving on historically, it is worthwhile to stop for a moment and consider aspects of Creationism, in what one might term the cultural context. First, as a populist movement, driven as much by social factors – a sense of alienation from the modern world — one would expect to find that cultural changes in society would be reflected in Creationist beliefs. This is indeed so. Take, above all, the question of racial issues and relationships. In the middle of the nineteenth century in the South, biblical literalism was very popular because it was thought to justify slavery (Noll 2002). Even though one can read the Christian message as being strongly against slavery — the Sermon on the Mount hardly recommends making people into the property of others – the Bible elsewhere seems to endorse slavery. Remember, when the escaped slave came to Saint Paul, the apostle told him to return to his master and to obey him. Remnants of this kind of thinking persisted in Creationist circles well into the twentieth century. Price, for instance, was quite convinced that blacks are degenerate whites. By the time of Genesis Flood, however, the civil rights movement was in full flower, and Whitcomb and Morris trod very carefully. They explained in detail that the Bible gives no justification for treating blacks as inferior. The story of the son and grandson of Noah being banished to a dark-skinned future was not part of their reading of the Holy Scriptures. Literalism may be the unvarnished word of God, but literalism is as open to interpretation as scholarly readings of Plato or Aristotle. That is why many refer to Creationists as “inerrantists” rather than “literalists.”

Second, as noted above, both for internal and external reasons, Creationists realized that they needed to tread carefully in outright opposition to evolution of all kinds. Could it really be that Noah’s Ark carried all of the animals that we find on earth today? It would be much easier if the Ark carried only the basic “kinds” of Creation, and then after the Flood the animals dispersed and diversified. We find in fact then that although Creationists were (and are) adamantly opposed to unified common descent and to the idea of natural change being adequate for all the forms we see today, from early on they were accepting huge amounts of what can only truly be called evolution! This said, Creationists were convinced that this change occurs much more rapidly than most conventional evolutionists would allow. Although it took some time to formulate, gradually we see emerging the strategy of (what we have seen as) distinguishing between what is called “microevolution” and “macroevolution.” Supposedly, microevolution is the sort of thing that brought diversification to Darwin’s finches, and many Creationists – notwithstanding the fact that it is supposedly a tautology – are even prepared to put this down to natural selection. Macroevolution is what makes reptiles reptiles, and mammals mammals. This cannot be a natural process but required miracles during the days of Creation. Although he was a lifelong opponent of Creationism (see below), forever committed to common descent, and thought that all changes must be natural, Creationists seized with glee on paleontologist Stephen Jay Gould’s claims that microevolution must be selection-fueled and macroevolution might require other causal forces (Gould 1980).

Third, and perhaps most significant of all, never think that Creationism is purely an epistemological matter – a matter of facts and their understanding. Moral claims have always been absolutely fundamental. Nearly all Creationists (in the Christian camp) are what is known theologically as premillennialists, believing that Jesus will come soon and reign over the world before the Last Judgement. They are opposed to postmillennialists who think that Jesus will come later, and amillennialists who are inclined to think that perhaps we are already living in a Jesus-dominated era. Postmillennialists put a premium on our getting things ready for Jesus – hence, we should engage in social action and the like. Premillennialists think there is nothing we ourselves can do to better the world, so we had best get ourselves and others in a state ready for Jesus. This means individual behavior and conversion of others. For premillennialists therefore, and this includes almost all Creationists, the great moral drives are to things like family sanctity (which today encompasses anti-abortion), sexual orthodoxy (especially anti-homosexuality), biblically sanctioned punishments (very pro-capital punishment), strong support for Israel (because of claims in Revelation about the Jews returning to Israel before End Times), and so forth. It is absolutely vital to see how this moral agenda is an integral part of American Creationism, as much as Floods and Arks. (Ruse 2005 discusses these matters in much detail.)

4. Arkansas

Genesis Flood enjoyed massive popularity among the faithful, and led to a thriving Creation Science Movement, where Morris particularly and his coworkers and believers – notably Duane T. Gish, author of Evolution: The Fossils Say No! – pushed the literalist line. Particularly effective was their challenging of evolutionists to debate, where they would employ every rhetorical trick in the book, reducing the scientists to fury and impotence, with bold statements (provocatively made most often by Gish) about the supposed nature of the universe (Gilkey 1985; Ruse (ed.) 1988). This all culminated eventually in a court case in Arkansas. By the end of the 1970s, Creationists were passing around draft bills, intended for state legislatures, that would allow – insist on – the teaching of Creationism in state-supported public schools. In the biology classes of such schools, that is. By this time it was realized that, thanks to Supreme Court rulings on the First Amendment to the Constitution (that which prohibits the establishment of state religion), it was not possible to exclude the teaching of evolution from such schools. The trick was to get Creationism – something that prima facie rides straight through the separation of church and state – into such schools. The idea of Creation Science is to do this. The claim is that, although the science parallels Genesis, as a matter of scientific fact, it stands alone as good science. Hence, these draft bills proposed what was called: ‘Balanced treatment.’ If one were to teach the ‘evolution model,’ then one had also to teach the ‘Creation Science model.’ Sauce for the evolutionist goose is also sauce for the Creationist gander.

In 1981, these drafts found a taker in Arkansas, where such a bill was passed and signed into law – as it happens, by a legislature and governor that thought little of what they were doing until the consequences were drawn to their attention. (William Clinton was governor from 1978 to 1980, and again from 1982 to his winning of the presidency, in 1992. The law was passed during the interregnum.) At once the American Civil Liberties Union sprang into action, bringing suit on grounds of the law’s unconstitutionality. The theologian Langdon Gilkey, the geneticist Francisco Ayala, the paleontologist Stephen Jay Gould, and as the philosophical representative Michael Ruse appeared as expert witnesses, arguing that Creationism has no place in state supported biology classes. The state’s position was not exactly helped when one of its witnesses (Norman Geisler, a theologian) admitted under cross-examination to his belief in UFOs as a satanic manifestation. Hardly surprisingly, evolution won. The judge ruled firmly that Creation Science is not science, it is religion, and as such has no place in public classrooms. The judge (William Overton) ruled that the ‘essential characteristics’ of what makes something scientific are:

  1. It is guided by natural law;
  2. It has to be explanatory by reference to natural law;
  3. It is testable against the empirical world;
  4. Its conclusions are tentative, i.e. are not necessarily the final word; and
  5. It is falsifiable.

In the judge’s opinion, Creation Science fails on all counts, and that apparently was an end to matters. In 1987 this whole matter was decided decisively in the same way, by the Supreme Court, in a similar case involving Louisiana. (See Ruse (ed.) 1988, for an edited collection that reproduces many of the pertinent documents, including state bills, as well as witness testimony and the judge’s ruling.)

Of course, in real life nothing is ever that simple, and Arkansas was certainly not the end of matters. One of the key issues in the trial was less theological or scientific, but philosophical. (Paradoxically, the ACLU had significant doubts about using a philosophical witness and only decided at the last minute to bring Michael Ruse to the stand. As it happens, as the judge’s ruling shows, the philosophical testimony proved crucial.) Look again at the fifth of the judge’s criteria for what makes for good or genuine science. The Creationists had started to refer to the ideas of the eminent, Austrian-born, British-residing philosopher Karl Popper (1959). As is well known, Popper claimed that for something to be genuinely scientific it has to be falsifiable. By this, Popper meant that genuine science puts itself up to check against the real world. If the predictions of the science hold true, then it lives to fight another day. If the predictions fail, then the science must be rejected – or at least revised. Popper (1974) himself expressed doubts about whether evolutionary theory is genuinely falsifiable and he rather inclined to think that it is less a description of reality than a heuristic to further study, what he called a ‘metaphysical research programme’ (Ruse 1977). The Creationists seized on this and argued that they had the best authority to reject evolution, or at least to judge it no more of a science than Creationism. (To his credit, Popper revised his thinking on Darwinian evolutionary theory and grew to see and admit that it was a genuine scientific theory; see Popper 1978).

Part of the testimony in Arkansas was designed to refute this argument, and it was shown that in fact evolution does indeed make falsifiable claims. As we have already seen, natural selection is no tautology. If one could show that organisms did not exhibit differential reproduction – to take the example given above, that all proto-humans had the same number of offspring – then selection theory would certainly be false. Likewise, if one could show that human and dinosaur remains truly did occur in the same time strata of the fossil record, one would have powerful proof against the thinking of modern evolutionists. This argument succeeded in court – the judge accepted that evolutionary thinking is falsifiable. Conversely, he accepted that Creation Science is never truly open to check. On-the-spot, ad hoc hypotheses proliferate as soon as any of its claims are challenged. It is not falsifiable and hence not genuine science. However, after the case a number of prominent philosophers (most notably the American Larry Laudan) objected strongly to the very idea of using falsifiability as a ‘criterion of demarcation’ between science and non-science. They argued that in fact there is no hard and fast rule for distinguishing science from other forms of human activity, and that hence in this sense the Creationists might have a point (Ruse (ed.) 1988). Not that people like Laudan were themselves Creationists. They thought Creationism false. Their objection was rather to trying to find some way of making evolution and not Creationism into a genuine science.

Defenders of the anti-Creationism strategy taken in Arkansas argued, with reason and law, that the United States Constitution does not bar the teaching of false science. It bars the teaching of non-science, especially non-science which is religion by another name. Hence, if the objections of people like Laudan were taken seriously, the Creationists might have a case to make for the balanced treatment of evolution and Creationism. Popperian falsifiability may be a somewhat rough and ready way of separating science and religion, but it is good enough for the job at hand, and in law that is what counts.

5. The Naturalism Debate

Evolutionists were successful in court. Nevertheless, Laudan and fellow thinkers inspired the Creationists to new efforts, and since the Arkansas court case, the philosophical dimension to the evolution/Creationism controversy has been much increased. In particular, philosophical arguments are central to the thinking of the leader of today’s creationists, Berkeley law professor, Phillip Johnson, whose reputation was made with the anti-evolutionary tract Darwin on Trial (1991). (Johnson’s influence and importance is recognized by all and he has become leader emeritus. As we shall see, the task of leadership then got passed to younger people, especially the biochemist Michael Behe and the philosopher-mathematician William Dembski.) In respects, Johnson just repeated the arguments of the Creation Scientists (those given in an earlier section) – gaps in the fossil record and so forth — but at the same time he stressed that the Creation/evolution debate is not just one of science versus religion or good science versus bad science, but rather of conflicting philosophical positions. The implication was that one philosophy is much like another, or rather the implication was that one person’s philosophy is another person’s poison and that it is all a matter of personal opinion. Behind this one sees the lawyer’s mind at work that, if it is all a matter of philosophy, then there is nothing in the United States Constitution which bars the teaching of Creationism in schools. (For better or for worse, one sees the heavy hand of Thomas Kuhn here, and his claim in his The Structure of Scientific Revolutions that the change from one paradigm to another is akin to a political revolution, not ultimately fueled by logic but more by extra-scientific factors, like emotions and simple preferences. In the Arkansas trial, Kuhn was as oft mentioned by the prosecutors as was Popper.)

Crucial to Johnson’s position are a number of fine distinctions. He distinguishes between what he calls “methodological naturalism” and “metaphysical naturalism”. The former is the scientific stance of trying to explain by laws and by refusing to introduce miracles. A methodological naturalist would insist on explaining all phenomena, however strange, in natural terms. Elijah setting fire to the water-drenched sacrifice, for instance, would be explained in terms of lightning striking or some such thing. The latter is the philosophical stance that insists that there is nothing beyond the natural – no God, no supernatural, no nothing. ‘Naturalism is a metaphysical doctrine, which means simply that it states a particular view of what is ultimately real and unreal. According to naturalism, what is ultimately real is nature, which consists of the fundamental particles that make up what we call matter and energy, together with the natural laws that govern how those particles behave. Nature itself is ultimately all there is, at least as far as we are concerned’ (Johnson 1995, 37–38).

Then there is someone that Johnson calls a ‘theistic realist.’ This is someone who believes in a God, and that this God can and does intervene in the natural world. ‘God always has the option of working through regular secondary mechanisms, and we observe such mechanisms frequently. On the other hand, many important questions – including the origin of genetic information and human consciousness – may not be explicable in terms of unintelligent causes, just as a computer or a book cannot be explained that way’ (p. 209). Johnson thinks of himself as a theistic realist, and hence as such in opposition to metaphysical realism. Methodological realism, which he links with evolutionism, would seem to be distinct from metaphysical realism, but it is Johnson’s claim that the former slides into the latter. Hence, the evolutionist is the methodological realist, is the metaphysical realist, is the opponent of the theistic realist – and as far as Johnson is concerned, the genuine theistic realist is one who takes a pretty literalistic reading of the Bible. So ultimately, it is all less a matter of science and more a matter of attitudes and philosophy. Evolution and Creationism are different world pictures, and it is conceptually, socially, pedagogically, and with good luck in the future legally wrong to treat them differently. More than this, it is incorporated into Johnson’s argument that Creationism (a.k.a. Theistic Realism) is the only genuine form of Christianity.

But does any of this really follow? The evolutionist would claim not. The key notion in Johnson’s attack is clearly methodological naturalism. Metaphysical naturalism, having been defined as something which precludes theism, has been set up as a philosophy with a religion-like status. It necessarily perpetuates the conflict between religion and science. But as Johnson himself notes, many people think that they can be methodological naturalists and theists. Methodological naturalism is not a religion equivalent. Is this possible, at least in a consistent way with intellectual integrity? It is Johnson’s claim that it is not, for he wants the religion/science war to be absolute with no captives or compromises.

6. Can an Evolutionist Be a Christian?

To sort out this debate, let us agree (to what is surely the case) that if you are a methodological naturalist, today you are going to accept evolution and conversely to think that evolution supports your cause. Today, methodological naturalism and evolution are a package deal. Take one, and you take the other. Reject one, and you reject the other. Clearly then, if your theism is one which gets its knowledge of God’s actions and purposes from a literal reading of the Bible, you have got a conflict. You cannot accept Genesis literally and evolution. That is a fact. In other words, there can be no accommodation between Creationism and evolution. However, what if you think that theologically speaking there is much to be said for a nice shade of grey? What if you think that much of the Bible, although true, should be interpreted in a metaphorical manner? What if you think you can be an evolutionist, and yet take in the essential heart of the Bible? What price consistency and methodological naturalism then? The answer depends on what you take to be the “essential heart” of the Bible. At a minimum we can say that, to the Christian, this heart speaks of our sinful nature, of God’s sacrifice, and of the prospect of ultimate salvation. It speaks of the world as a meaningful creation of God (however caused) and of a foreground drama which takes place within this world. One refers particularly to the original sin, Jesus’ life and death, and his resurrection and anything which comes after it. And clearly at once we are plunged into the first of the big problems, namely that of miracles – those of Jesus himself (the turning of water into wine at the marriage at Cana), his return to life on the third day, and (especially if you are a Catholic) such ongoing miracles as transubstantiation and those associated, in response to prayer, with the intervention of saints.

There are a number of options here for the would-be methodological naturalist. You might simply say that such miracles occurred, that they did involve violations of law, but that they are outside your science. They are simply exceptions to the rule. End of argument. A little abrupt, but not flatly inconsistent with calling yourself a theist. You say normally God works through law but, for our salvation, miracles outside law were necessary. Or you might say that miracles occur but that they are compatible with science, or at least not incompatible. Jesus was in a trance and the cure for cancer after the prayers to Saint Bernadette was according to rare, unknown, but genuine laws. This position is less abrupt, although you might worry whether this strategy is truly Christian, in letter or in spirit. It seems a little bit of a cheat to say that the Jesus taken down from the cross was truly not dead, and the marriage at Cana starts to sound like outright fraud. Of course, you can start stripping away at more and more miracles, downgrading them to regular occurrences blown up and magnified by the Apostles, but in the end this rather defeats the whole purpose.

The third option is simply to refuse to get into the battle at all. You argue that the law/miracle dichotomy is a false one. Miracles are just not the sorts of things which conflict with or confirm natural laws. Traditional Christians have always argued this in some respects. Take the Catholic doctrine of transubstantiation. The turning of the bread and the wine into the body and blood of Christ is simply not something open to empirical check. You cannot disconfirm religion or prove science by doing an analysis of the host. Likewise even with the resurrection of Jesus. After the Crucifixion, his mortal body was irrelevant. The point was that the disciples felt Jesus in their hearts, and were thus emboldened to go forth and preach the gospel. Something real happened to them, but it was not a physical reality – nor, for instance, was Paul’s conversion a physical event, even though it changed his life and those of countless after him. Today’s miracles also are really more a matter of the spirit than the flesh. Does one simply go to Lourdes in hope of a lucky lottery ticket to health or for the comfort that one knows one will get, even if there is no physical cure? In the words of the philosophers, it is a category mistake to put miracles and laws in the same set. (Hume (1748, 1779) is the starting place for these discussions. Although somewhat dated, Flew and MacIntyre (1955) is still invaluable. Paradoxically, both of these then-atheist authors came to see the light and returned to the Christianity of their childhoods! Apparently, the “words of the philosophers” are not definitive.)

What has Johnson to say to all of this? Frustratingly, the answer is: “remarkably little”! In main part this stems from a refusal to spell out exactly what is meant by “theism”. What Johnson does say is more in the way of sneer or dismissal than argument.

Persons who are sufficiently motivated to do so can find ways to resist the easy pathway from M[ethodological] N[aturalism] to atheism, agnosticism or deism. For example, perhaps God actively directs the evolutionary process but (for some inscrutable reason) does so in a way that is empirically imperceptible. No one can disprove that sort of possibility, but not many people seem to regard it as intellectually impressive either. That they seem to rely on “faith” — in the sense of belief without evidence – is why theists are a marginalized minority in the academic world and always on the defensive. Usually they protect their reputation for good judgment by restricting their theism to private life and assuming for professional purposes a position that is indistinguishable from naturalism. (Johnson 1995, 211)

He adds:

Makeshift compromises between supernaturalism in religion and naturalism in science may satisfy individuals, but they have little standing in the intellectual world because they are recognized as a forced accommodation of conflicting lines of thought (p. 212).

At this point, the evolutionist will probably throw up his or her hands in despair. Where did the idea of ‘makeshift compromise’ come from except from Johnson’s imagination? In actual fact, many significant theologians of our age think that, with respect to miracles, science and religion have no conflict (Barth 1949; Gilkey 1985). They would add that faith without difficulty and opposition is not true faith, either. “As the Danish philosopher Søren Kierkegaard … taught us, too much objective certainty deadens the very soul of faith. Genuine piety is possible only in the face of radical uncertainty” (Haught 1995, 59). Such thinkers, often conservative theologically, are inspired by Martin Buber to find God in the center of personal relationships, I-Thou, rather in science, I-It. For them there is something degrading in the thought of Jesus as a miracle man, a sort of fugitive from the Ed Sullivan Show. What happened with the five thousand? Some hokey-pokey over a few loaves and fishes? Or did Jesus fill the multitude’s heart with love, so there was a spontaneous outpouring of generosity and sharing, as every one in the crowd was fed by the food brought by a few? These theologians would agree fully with the first part of Johnson’s characterization of “theism”. Things were very different thanks to Jesus’ presence and actions. What they deny, here or elsewhere, is the need to search for exception to law.

Johnson’s Creationism and evolution/naturalism are indeed in conflict. But Johnson’s Creationism is not all that there is to religion, to Christianity in particular. There are those who call themselves theists, who think that one can be a methodological naturalist, where today this would imply evolution (Ruse 2010). Johnson has not argued against them.

7. Intelligent Design

Let us move on now from the more philosophical sorts of issues. Building on the more critical approach of Johnson, who is taken to have cleared the foundations as it were, there is a group of people who are trying to offer an alternative to evolution. These are the enthusiasts for so-called ‘Intelligent Design.’ Supporters of this position think that Darwinism is ineffective, at least inasmuch as it claims to make superfluous or unnecessary a direct appeal to a designer of some sort. These are people who think that a full understanding of the organic world demands the invocation of some force beyond nature, a force which is purposeful or at least purpose creating. Often the phrase which is used is “organized complexity,” a term much used by the German Romantic philosopher Friedrich Schelling, and which by invoking the intentional predicate “organized” rather gives the game away (Richards 2003). For the moment, continue to defer questions about the relationship between Intelligent Design Theory and more traditional forms of Creationism.

There are two parts to this approach: an empirical and a philosophical. Let us take them in turn, beginning with he who has most fully articulated the empirical case for a designer, the already-mentioned, Lehigh University biochemist Michael Behe. Focusing on something which he calls ‘irreducible complexity,’ Behe writes:

By irreducibly complex I mean a single system composed of several well-matched, interacting parts that contribute to the basic function, wherein the removal of any one of the parts causes the system to effectively cease functioning. An irreducibly complex system cannot be produced directly (that is, by continuously improving the initial function, which continues to work by the same mechanism) by slight, successive modifications of a precursor system, because any precursor to an irreducibly complex system that is missing a part is by definition nonfunctional. (Behe 1996, 39)

Behe adds, surely truly, that any

irreducibly complex biological system, if there is such a thing, would be a powerful challenge to Darwinian evolution. Since natural selection can only choose systems that are already working, then if a biological system cannot be produced gradually it would have to arise as an integrated unit, in one fell swoop, for natural selection to have anything to act on (p. 39).

Now turn to the world of biology, and in particular turn to the micro-world of the cell and of mechanisms that we find at that level. Take bacteria which use a flagellum, driven by a kind of rotary motor, to move around. Every part is incredibly complex, and so are the various parts, combined. The external filament of the flagellum (called ‘flagellin’), for instance, is a single protein that makes a kind of paddle surface contacting the liquid during swimming. Near the surface of the cell, just as needed is a thickening, so that the filament can be connected to the rotor drive. This naturally requires a connector, known as a ‘hook protein.’ There is no motor in the filament, so that has to be somewhere else. ‘Experiments have demonstrated that it is located at the base of the flagellum, where electron microscopy shows several ring structures occur’ (p. 70). All, way too complex to have come into being in a gradual fashion. Only a one-step process will do, and this one-step process must involve some sort of designing cause. Behe is careful not to identify this designer with the Christian God, but the implication is that it is a force from without the normal course of nature. Irreducible complexity spells design.

8. Is Complexity Irreducible?

Irreducible complexity is supposedly something which could not have come through unbroken law (meaning law that has no special divine guidance), and especially not through the agency of natural selection. Critics claim that Behe shows a misunderstanding of the very nature and workings of natural selection. No one is denying that in natural processes there may well be parts which, if removed, would lead at once to the non-functioning of the systems in which they occur. The point however is not whether the parts now in place could not be removed without collapse, but whether they could have been put in place by natural selection. Consider an arched bridge, made from cut stone, without cement, held in place only by the force of the stones against each other. If you tried to build the bridge from scratch, upwards and then inwards, you would fail – the stones would keep falling to the ground, as indeed the whole bridge now would collapse were you to remove the center keystone or any surrounding it. Rather, what you must do is first build a supporting structure (possibly an earthen embankment), on which you will lay the stones of the bridge, until they are all in place. At which point you can remove the structure for it is no longer needed, and in fact is in the way. Likewise, one can imagine a biochemical sequential process with several stages, on the parts of which other processes piggyback as it were. Then the hitherto non-sequential parasitic processes link up and start functioning independently, the original sequence finally being removed by natural selection as redundant or inconveniently draining of resources.

Of course, this is all pretend. But Darwinian evolutionists have hardly ignored the matter of complex processes. Indeed, it is discussed in detail by Darwin in the Origin, where he refers to that most puzzling of all adaptations, the eye. At the biochemical level, today’s Darwinians have many examples of the most complex of processes that have been put in place by selection. Take that staple of the body’s biochemistry, the process where energy from food is converted into a form which can be used by the cells. Rightly does a standard textbook refer to this vital organic system, the so-called ‘Krebs cycle,’ as something which ‘undergoes a very complicated series of reactions’ (Hollum 1987, 408). This process, which occurs in the cell parts known as mitochondria, involves the production of ATP (adenosine triphosphate): a complex molecule which is energy rich and which is degraded by the body as needed (say in muscle action) into another less rich molecule ADP (adenosine diphosphate). The Krebs cycle remakes ATP from other energy sources – an adult human male needs to make nearly 200 Kg a day — and by any measure, the cycle is enormously involved and intricate. For a start, nearly a dozen enzymes (substances which facilitate chemical processes) are required, as one sub-process leads on to another.

Yet the cycle did not come out of nowhere. It was cobbled together out of other cellular processes which do other things. It was a ‘bricolage’, that is to say it was something put together in a haphazard fashion. Each one of the bits and pieces of the cycle exists for other purposes and has been coopted for the new end. The scientists who have made this connection could not have made a stronger case against Behe’s irreducible complexity than if they had had him in mind from the first. In fact, they set up the problem virtually in Behe’s terms: ‘The Krebs cycle has been frequently quoted as a key problem in the evolution of living cells, hard to explain by Darwin’s natural selection: How could natural selection explain the building of a complicated structure in toto, when the intermediate stages have no obvious fitness functionality?’ (Meléndez-Hervia et al 1996, 302). (Readers who want to dig more deeply into some of the technical issues should start with the entry on fitness.)

What these workers do not offer is a Behe-type answer. First, they brush away a false lead. Could it be that we have something like the evolution of the mammalian eye, where primitive existent eyes in other organisms suggest that selection can and does work on proto models (as it were), refining features which have the same function if not as efficient as more sophisticated models? Probably not, for there is no evidence of anything like this. But then we are put on a more promising track.

In the Krebs cycle problem the intermediary stages were also useful, but for different purposes, and, therefore, its complete design was a very clear case of opportunism. The building of the eye was really a creative process in order to make a new thing specifically, but the Krebs cycle was built through the process that Jacob (1977) called ‘evolution by molecular tinkering,’ stating that evolution does not produce novelties from scratch: It works on what already exists. The most novel result of our analysis is seeing how, with minimal new material, evolution created the most important pathway of metabolism, achieving the best chemically possible design. In this case, a chemical engineer who was looking for the best design of the process could not have found a better design than the cycle which works in living cells. (p. 302)

Rounding off the response to Behe, let us note that, if his arguments are well-taken, then in respects we are into a bigger set of problems than otherwise! His position seems simply not viable given what we know of the nature of mutation and the stability of biological systems over time. When exactly is the intelligent designer supposed to strike and to do its work? In his major work, Darwin’s Black Box, Behe suggests that everything might have been done long ago and then left to its own devices. ‘The irreducibly complex biochemical systems that I have discussed… did not have to be produced recently. It is entirely possible, based simply on an examination of the systems themselves, that they were designed billions of years ago and that they have been passed down to the present by the normal processes of cellular reproduction’ (Behe 1996, 227–8).

This is not a satisfactory response. We cannot ignore the history of the genes from the point between their origin (when they would not have been needed) and today when they are in full use. In the words of Brown biochemist Kenneth Miller: ‘As any student of biology will tell you, because those genes are not expressed, natural selection would not be able to weed out genetic mistakes. Mutations would accumulate in these genes at breathtaking rates, rendering them hopelessly changed and inoperative hundreds of millions of years before Behe says that they will be needed.’ There is much experimental evidence showing that this is the case. Behe’s idea of designer doing everything back then and then leaving matters to their natural fate is ‘pure and simple fantasy’ (Miller 1999, 162–3).

What is the alternative strategy that Behe must take? Presumably that the designer is at work all of the time, producing mechanisms as and when needed. So, if we are lucky, we might expect to see some produced in our lifetime. Indeed, there must be a sense of disappointment among biologists that no such creative acts have so far been reported. More than this, as we turn from science towards theology, there even greater disappointments. Most obviously, what about bad mutations (in the sense of mutations that lead to consequences very non-helpful to their possessors)? If the designer is needed and available for complex engineering problems, why could not the designer take some time on the simple matters, specifically those simple matters which if unfixed lead to absolutely horrendous problems. Some of the worst genetic diseases are caused by one little alteration in one little part of the DNA. If the designer is able and willing to do the very complex because it is very good, why does it not do the very simple because the alternative is very bad? Behe speaks of this as being part of the problem of evil, which is true, but not very helpful. Given that the opportunity and ability to do good was so obvious and yet not taken, we need to know the reason why. (A comprehensive collection, edited by an Intelligent Design Theorist and an avid Darwinian evolutionist, contains arguments from both sides, by biologists and philosophers; see Dembski and Ruse (eds.) 2004.)

9. The Explanatory Filter

Behe is in need of help. This supposedly comes from a conceptual argument in favor of Intelligent Design due to the also-mentioned, philosopher-mathematician William Dembski (1998a, b). Let us first look at his argument, and then see how it helps Behe.

Dembski’s aim is two-fold. First, to give us the criteria by which we distinguish something that we would label ‘designed’ rather than otherwise. Second, to put this into context, and show how we distinguish design from something produced naturally by law or something we would put down to chance. As far as inferring design is concerned, there are three notions of importance: contingency, complexity, and specification. Design has to be something which is not contingent. The example that Dembski uses is the message from outer space received in the movie Contact. The series of dots and dashes, zeros and ones, could not be deduced from the laws of physics. But do they show evidence of design? Suppose we can interpret the series in a binary fashion, and the initial yield is the number group, 2, 3, 5. As it happens, these are the beginning of the prime-number series, but with so small a yield no one is going to get very excited. It could just be chance. So no one is going to insist on design yet. But suppose now you keep going on the series, and it turns out that it yields in exact and precise order the prime numbers up to 101. Now you will start to think that something is up, because the situation seems just too complex to be mere chance. It is highly improbable. ‘Complexity as I am describing it here is a form of probability….’ (Dembski 2000, 27).

But although you are probably happy now to conclude (on the basis of the prime-number sequence) that there are extraterrestrials out there, in fact there is another thing needed. ‘If I flip a coin 1000 times, I will participate in a highly complex (that is, highly improbable) event…. This sequence of coin tosses will not, however, trigger a design inference. Though complex, this sequence will not exhibit a suitable pattern.’ Here, we have a contrast with the prime-number sequence from 2 to 101. ‘Not only is this sequence complex, but it also embodies a suitable pattern. The SETI researcher who in the movie Contact discovered this sequence put it this way: “This isn’t noise, this has structure”’ (pp. 27–8). What is going on here? You recognize in design something which is not just arbitrary or chance or which is given status only after the experiment or discovery, but rather something that was or could be in some way specified, insisted upon, before you set out. You know or could work out the sequence of prime numbers at any time before or after the contact from space. The random sequence of penny tosses will come only after the event. ‘The key concept is that of “independence”. I define a specification as a match between an event and an independently given pattern. Events that are both highly complex and specified (that is, that match an independently given pattern) indicate design.’

Dembski is now in a position to move on to the second part of his argument where we actually detect design. Here we have what he calls an ‘Explanatory Filter’ (Dembski 1998a, b). We have a particular phenomenon. The question is, what caused it? Is it something which might not have happened, given the laws of nature? Is it contingent? Or was it necessitated? The moon goes endlessly round the earth. We know that it does this because of (the updated version of) Newton’s laws. End of discussion. No design here. However, now we have some rather strange new phenomenon, the causal origin of which is a puzzle. Suppose we have a mutation, where although we can quantify over large numbers we cannot predict at an individual level. There is no immediate subsumption beneath law, and therefore there is no reason to think that at this level it was necessary. Let us say, as supposedly happened in the extended royal family of Europe, there was a mutation to a gene responsible for hemophilia. Is it complex? Obviously not, for it leads to breakdown rather than otherwise. Hence it is appropriate to talk now of chance. There is no design. The hemophilia mutation was just an accident.

Suppose now that we do have complexity. A rather intricate mineral pattern in the rocks might qualify here. Suppose we have veins of precious metals set in other materials, the whole being intricate and varied – certainly not a pattern you could simply deduce from the laws of physics or chemistry or geology or whatever. Nor would one think of it as being a breakdown mess, as one might a bad mutation. Is this now design? Almost certainly not, for there is no way that one might pre-specify such a pattern. It is all a bit ad hoc, and not something which comes across as the result of conscious intention. And then finally there are phenomena which are complex and specified. One presumes that the microscopical biological apparatuses and processes discussed by Behe would qualify here. They are not contingent, for they are irreducibly complex. They are design-like for they do what is needed for the organism in which they are to be found. That is to say they are of pre-specified form. And so, having survived the explanatory filter, they are properly considered the product of real design.

Now, with the conceptual argument laid out in full, we are in a position to turn back to Behe and to see how Dembski’s explanatory filter is supposed to let Behe’s god off the hook with respect to the problem of evil. Given the explanatory filter, a bad mutation would surely get caught by the filter half-way down. It would be siphoned off to the side as chance, if not indeed simply put down as necessity. It certainly would not pass the specification test. This would mean that a dreadful genetic disease would not be the fault of the designer, whereas successful complex mechanisms would be to the designer’s credit. Dembski stresses that these are mutually exclusive alternatives. ‘To attribute an event to design is to say that it cannot plausibly be referred to either law or chance. In characterizing design as the set-theoretic complement of the disjunction law-or-chance, one therefore guarantees that these three modes of explanation will be mutually exclusive and exhaustive’ (Dembski 1998b, 98).

10. Mutually Exclusive?

The key assumption being made by Dembski is that design and law and chance are mutually exclusive. This is the very essence of the explanatory filter. But in real life does one want to make this assumption? Suppose that something is put down to chance. Does this mean that law is ruled out? Surely not! If one argues that a Mendelian mutation is chance, what one means is with respect to that particular theory it is chance, but one may well believe that the mutation came about by normal regular causes and that if these were all known, then it would not longer be chance at all but necessity. The point is that chance in this case is a confession of ignorance not, as one might well think the case in the quantum world, an assertion about the way that things are. That is, claims about chance are not ontological assertions, as presumably claims about designers must be.

More than this, one might well argue that the designer always works through law. This may be deism and hence no true Christianity – some Christians would insist that God does sometimes intervene in the Creation. But truly Christian or not, a deity who always works through law is certainly not inconsistent with the hypothesis of a designing intelligence. The designer may prefer to have things put in motion in such a way that his/her/its intentions unfurl and reveal themselves as time goes by. The pattern in a piece of cloth made by machine is as much an object of design as the pattern from cloth produced by a hand loom. In other words, in a sense that would conform to the normal usage of the terms, one might want to say of something that it is produced by laws, is chance with respect to our knowledge or theory, and fits into an overall context of design by the great orderer or creator of things. In short, Dembski’s filter does not let Behe’s designer off the hook.

If the designer can make – and rightfully takes credit for — the very complex and good, then the designer could prevent — and by its failure is properly criticized for – the very simple and awful. The problems in theology are as grim as are those in science. (The intelligent design theorists have provided work for many philosophers eager to refute them. Pennock 1988 and Sober 2000 are good places to start. See the entry on teleological notions in biology.)

11. Intelligent Design and Traditional Creationism

Let us now try to tackle the somewhat complex issue of the relationship between Intelligent Design Theory and traditional Creationism, as discussed earlier in this essay. In significant respects, they are clearly not the same. Most Intelligent Design Theorists believe in a long earth history (even the scientific estimation of a universe of about 15 billion years in age) and most accept overall common descent. In a recent book, The Edge of Evolution , Michael Behe has made this point very clear indeed. However, there are major overlaps, sufficient to encourage some critics (myself included) to refer to Intelligent Design Theory as ‘Creationism-lite’ (Ruse 2017, 114).

First, politically, the Creationists are more than willing at the moment to let the ID theorists do the blocking. Openly they support the ID movement, believing in taking one step at a time. If ID is successful, then is the time to ask for more. A major funding and emotional support for the ID movement is the Discovery Institute, a privately-supported think tank in Seattle. One of its prominent members is University of Chicago educated philosopher Paul Nelson, who is a young-earth creationist and a strong believer in the eschatological significance of Israel.

Second, do note that both Creationists and ID enthusiasts are committed to some form of non-naturalist account of origins. The ties of course are stronger. ID enthusiasts pretend to be neutral about the Intelligent Designer, but they clearly do not think that he or she is natural. No one pretends that the earth and its denizens are a lab experiment being run by a grad student on Andromeda. In fact, in their own correspondence and works written for followers, they make it very clear that the Designer is the Christian God of the Gospels. They are always quoting the first chapter of John – “In the beginning was the Word, and the Word was with God, and the Word was God.” So in both cases we have an evangelical Christian motive setting the agenda on origins. Some ID enthusiasts are quite strong literalists. Johnson for instance thinks that Genesis Chapter Six might be right about their beings giants in early times – a point made much of in Genesis Flood. (Forrest and Gross 2004 do a superb job of ferreting out much of the unstated biblical foundations of Intelligent Design Theory.)

Third there is the moral factor. There is a very strong streak of anti-postmillennialism in the writings of ID theorists. They share the same concern about the moral values of the Creationists – anti-abortion, anti-homosexuality, pro-capital punishment, pro-Israel (for eschatological reasons) and so forth. Phillip Johnson feels very strongly that the tendency to cross-dress, including apparently women who wear jeans, is a sign of the degenerate state of our society (Johnson 2002).

In short, while there are certainly important differences between the position of most literalists and most ID supporters, the strong overlap should not be ignored or downplayed.

12. Recent Developments

Creationism in the sense used in this discussion is still very much a live phenomenon in American culture today – and in other parts of the world, like the Canadian West, to which it has been exported. Popularity does not imply truth. Scientifically Creationism is worthless, philosophically it is confused, and theologically it is blinkered beyond repair. The same is true of its offspring, Intelligent Design Theory. But do not underestimate its social and political power. As we move through the second decade of the new millennium, thanks to Johnson and his fellows, there are ongoing pressures to introduce non-evolutionary ideas into science curricula, especially into the science curricula of publicly funded schools in the United States of America. In 2004, in Dover, Pennsylvania, there was an attempt by the school board to introduce Intelligent Design Theory into the biology classrooms of the publicly funded schools. As it happens, this was rejected strongly by the federal judge trying the case – a man who was appointed by President George W. Bush no less – and the costs of the case will surely deter others from rushing to follow the example of this board (who were incidentally then promptly dropped by the voters.) (A lively account of this trial is by Lauri Lebo, The Devil in Dover: An Insider’s Story of Dogma v. Darwin in Small-Town America. Philosopher Robert Pennock argued that IDT is not genuine science, and taking somewhat of a post-modernist stance, philosopher Steven Fuller argued that it as good science as any other. Pennock and Ruse (eds.) 2008 is an updated version of Ruse (ed.) 1988, and includes full discussion of Dover as well as Arkansas.) The battle is not yet over and things could get a lot worse before they get better, if indeed they will get better. Already, there are members of the United States Supreme Court who have made it clear that they would receive sympathetically calls to push evolution from a preeminent place in science teaching, and with its turn to the right it would be foolish to assume that if a case came its way that Creationism or ID theory would be rejected as unsuitable for public school classroom use. If additions are made, with present appointments, we could find that — nearly a century after the Scopes Trial, when the Fundamentalists were perceived as figures of fun – Creationism in one form or another finally takes its place in the classroom.

Unfortunately at the moment, those opposed to Creationism are spending more of their energies quarreling among themselves than fighting the opposition. There is a crop of “new atheists”, including the biologist and popular writer Richard Dawkins (2006) and the philosopher Daniel Dennett (2005) who are not only against religion but also against those – including non-believers – who do not share their hostility. At least since the time of the Arkansas trial, many fighting Creationism (including Gould 1999, 2002; Ruse 2001) have argued that true religion and science do not conflict. Hence, evolutionists (including non-believers) should make common cause with liberal Christians, who share their hatred of dogmatic Christian fundamentalism. Prominent among those so arguing include the author of this piece, as well as Eugenie Scott of the National Center for Science Education. They argue that in their hostility to religion, the new atheists get close to making their own views quasi-religious – certainly they argue that Darwinism is incompatible with religion – and hence ripe for the Creationists’ complaint that if Creationism is not to be taught in schools (because it violates the U.S. Constitution’s separation of Church and State), then neither should evolution be so taught. It is to be hoped that this quarrel will soon subside.

We conclude by noting four recent developments in the Creationism debate. First, a number of well-known philosophers have started to make encouraging sounds about Intelligent Design Theory. Calvinist philosopher Alvin Plantinga has long been a critic of naturalism and now (in a work based on his 2005 Gifford Lectures at St Andrew’s University in Scotland) he extends this critique to Darwinian evolutionary theory, arguing that the evidence in its favor is scanty (Plantinga 2011). He hedges somewhat on alternatives, but gives a very sympathetic reading of the thinking of Michael Behe and clearly finds much in such a position that meshes nicely with his own theological concerns. Coming from a very different perspective, as he is openly atheistic, Thomas Nagel (2008) likewise finds much in modern biology that worries and disappoints him—he makes special reference to what seems to him to be a total inability to give a naturalistic explanation of the origin of life—and although obviously he does not want to endorse Intelligent Design Theory, given the supposition that it is God who is doing the designing, nevertheless he argues that Intelligent Design Theory should be taught as an alternative in state-supported schools in the USA. Recently, in a full-length work, Mind and Cosmos, he has continued this attack, arguing (2011, 7) that “the idea that we have in our possession the basic tools needed to understand [the world] is no more credible now than it was in Aristotle’s day”, thereby implying that the work of Copernicus, Galileo, Newton, and Einstein and Darwin has not led to any new tools needed to understand the world. Backing Nagel, at least in his visceral dislike of Darwinism, is another prominent American philosopher Jerry Fodor, whose recent, co-authored book is titled What Darwin Got Wrong. Even if (with reason) Fodor might argue that he is no Creationist, his position is grist for their mill. A more thoughtful critique of Darwinism might allay this worry.

It is difficult to know how seriously one is expected to take these criticisms. Let it be said that one would have a great deal more respect for the arguments and conclusions put forward if they had been informed by contemporary writings on evolutionary theory, for instance, the brilliant and painstaking work of the husband and wife team of Peter and Rosemary Grant (2007), who have spent decades studying the evolution and speciation of finches in the Galapagos Archipelago. Or the groundbreaking work of people like Francisco Ayala (2009) as they study the molecular factors involved in ongoing development and change. Not to mention the seminal studies of Brian Hall (1999) and Sean Carroll (2005) on the ways in which individual development can get reflected in long-term changes (so-called “evo-devo”). Though Richard Dawkins can put people off when he holds forth on matters philosophical or theological, that is no good reason simply to dismiss without argument his scientific claims, as Plantinga often does. Likewise, it is true indeed that no one yet has been able to spell out the full story of the origin of life, but this doesn’t justify Nagel’s failure to mention that a huge amount now is known about life’s origins, most especially about the crucial role played by the secondary ribonucleic acid RNA (rather than the more familiar DNA) (Ruse and Travis (eds.) 2009). Until the criticisms put forward by Nagel, Plantinga, Fodor, etc. do start to take seriously modern science, we might justifiably continue to take them less than seriously.

One observation to make about these criticisms is that they are put forward by philosophers in the analytic tradition, which in its early days involved some opposition to Darwinism (Cunningham 1996). This goes back to Bertrand Russell and Ludwig Wittgenstein, neither of whom had much time for the theory and (in Russell’s case at least) was mirrored by a strong dislike of American Pragmatism, a school of thought that did take Darwin very seriously (Ruse 2009). In both the case of Russell and Wittgenstein this opposition is based primarily on a mistaken identification of the thinking of Charles Darwin with that of Herbert Spencer. It was the latter who was much given to seeing evolutionary processes as justifying extraneous claims about the necessity of struggle and so forth, views that both Russell and Wittgenstein viewed with as little enthusiasm as did William Jennings Bryan. Russell learnt his dislike of evolution as applied to philosophy from his teacher Henry Sidgwick and Wittgenstein (like other European-born philosophers like Karl Popper) from the general culture of their youth. Significantly, those philosophers of the English-speaking tradition of the twentieth century who have had kind words for Darwin – W.V.O. Quine, Richard Rorty, and Thomas Kuhn to name three – have all been sympathetic to Pragmatism in one form or another (Ruse 2018b, 2018c; see also, the entry on pragmatism).

Second among new or revived discussions of Creationism and its various aspects, one question often asked is why evolution in particular raises such ire in evangelicals and related religionists. The Bible states that the sun stopped for Joshua and yet no one today worries about the theological implications of the Copernican Revolution. Michael Ruse particularly, has argued strongly that the main reason for the conflict is that often evolutionists – Darwinian evolutionists – turn their secular science into a religion, with moral imperatives and much more (Ruse forthcoming). The argument is that, as opposed to the Christian notion of Providence, where we are entirely in the hands of God, such evolutionists are progressionists, thinking that change is in our hands and can be for the better. In theological terms, Creationists tend to be premillennialists, believing that Jesus will return and rule for a thousand years and all we can do is get ready for this for instance through converting others, as opposed to evolutionists who are postmillennialists, thinking (metaphorically) that paradise is to be made down here by us, before there is any appropriate talk of a Second Coming.

Thomas Henry Huxley, his grandson Julian S. Huxley, and today’s most eminent Darwinian evolutionist, Edward O. Wilson of Harvard, have been or are open in their secular religion building. Against the Creationist urge to save souls, they want to improve science education (THH), support public mega-works (JSH), and promote biodiversity (EOW). There is a strong odor of this secular religion building around the New Atheists, like Richard Dawkins (2006), despite denials. Expectedly, this thesis has not gone down well with many evolutionists, and conversely has been welcomed by Creationists who have long made this claim. It should be noted that the arguments do not and are not intended to give comfort to Creationism as such. The claim by Ruse and others (for instance Miller 1999 and Pennock 1998) is that there is a good, scientific theory of evolution, based on Darwin’s mechanism of natural selection. They are not offering a thesis about the science, but more one almost sociological in trying to understand the tension. If the thesis proves true, then evolutionists themselves are in a better position to defend themselves and to defend their science.

Third among developments in Creationist thinking, especially since the failure at Dover, we find somewhat of a shift in strategy by religious critics of Darwinism. Now it is the moral issues that are brought to the fore. For instance, Richard Weikart (2004) claims that “no matter how crooked the road was from Darwin to Hitler, clearly Darwinism and eugenics smoothed the path for Nazi ideology, especially from the Nazi stress on expansion, war, racial struggle, and racial extermination.” In a similar vein, in the 2008 film Expelled—a work very favorable to Intelligent Design Theory—the link is drawn explicitly. Philosopher David Berlinski is blunt: “if you open Mein Kampf and read it, especially if you can read it in German, the correspondence between Darwinian ideas and Nazi ideas just leaps from the page.” In other words, if you are into Darwin, you are into National Socialism.

As always, as soon as one starts to look at things a little more closely, the story becomes more complex (Richards 2013). Let us agree that something had to lead to Hitler and that given the racism that infects huge amounts of nineteenth century thinking about humankind—including Darwin’s Descent of Man—one should not give evolutionary theory a knee-jerk absolution. In fact, some early twentieth century writers on war and strife, clearly inspired in some fashion by Darwin, give one great pause for reflection. Listen to the sometime member of the German High Command, General Friedrich von Bernhardi. Darwinism endorses war endorses that which is morally good or acceptable. “Struggle is therefore a universal law of Nature, and the instinct of self-preservation which leads to struggle is acknowledged to be a natural condition of existence. ‘Man is a fighter’” (von Bernhardi 1912, 13). And “might gives the right to occupy or to conquer. Might is at once the supreme right, and the dispute as to what is right is decided by the arbitration of war. War gives a biologically just decision, since its decisions rest on the very nature of things” (ibid., p. 15). Hence “It may be that a growing people cannot win colonies from uncivilized races, and yet the State wishes to retain the surplus population which the mother-country can no longer feed. Then the only course left is to acquire the necessary territory by war.”

Yet when one turns to Hitler himself, one soon sees that any similarities are superficial. One doubts very much that the (to be generous) ill-educated Fuhrer had ever read Darwin, and his concerns are not that of the old English evolutionist.

All great cultures of the past perished only because the originally creative race died out from blood poisoning. The ultimate cause of such a decline was their forgetting that all culture depends on men and not conversely; hence that to preserve a certain culture the man who creates it must be preserved. This preservation is bound up with the rigid law of necessity and the right to victory of the best and stronger in this world. Those who want to live, let them fight, and those who do not want to fight in this world of eternal struggle do not deserve to live. (Hitler 1925, 1, chapter 11)

“Blood poisoning”! The worry here is about the Jews and their supposed ill-effects on pure races. The Jews do not get a mention in the Descent of Man (1871), and although Darwin supposes that white races tend to wipe out others, it is not from any mental or physical superiority, but because we can tolerate their diseases but they cannot tolerate ours! And this is all because whites have had a bigger pool of variants to draw on than have others.

A final brief (fourth) comment is that increasingly the struggle against Creationism and its various offspring is rapidly becoming a world-wide struggle. Leading historian of the Creationism movement, Ronald Numbers (2006), is particularly concerned about this fact. Not only do we find Creationism on the rise in countries like the Netherlands (where, with its large conservative Protestant population, such a rise is not altogether unexpected) but we find enthusiasm in non-Christian cultures, especially in cultures where Islam is a major factor. The exact reasons for such a rise have, as yet, been barely explored, but Numbers is surely right in thinking that theology probably plays but a minor role, and more sociological factors—dislike of the hegemony of the West and the role that science and technology play in such dominance—are probably very significant.

The fact is that, for whatever reason, if anything Creationism is on the rise. And with that somber point, this is perhaps a good place to draw this discussion to a close. If this essay persuades even one person to take up the fight against so awful an outcome, then it will have served its purpose.


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Copyright © 2018 by
Michael Ruse

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