Wilhelm Dilthey

First published Wed Jan 16, 2008; substantive revision Tue Sep 29, 2020

Wilhelm Dilthey was a German philosopher who lived from 1833–1911. Dilthey is best known for the way he distinguished between the natural and human sciences. He defined the human sciences broadly to include both the humanities and the social sciences. Whereas the main task of the natural sciences as Dilthey found them was to arrive at law-based causal explanations, he projected the core task of the human sciences to be that of providing an understanding of the organizational structures and dynamic forces of human and historical life. It will be shown that this distinction is not so sharp as to rule out causal explanations in particular human sciences such as psychology, political theory, and economics; it mostly delimits the scope of explanations in these fields. Dilthey’s aim was to expand Kant’s primarily nature-oriented Critique of Pure Reason into a Critique of Historical Reason that can also do justice to the social and cultural dimensions of human experience. Understanding the meaning of human historical events requires being able to organize them in their proper contexts and to articulate the structural uniformities that can be found in this way. Dilthey’s reflections on the human sciences, historical contextualization, and hermeneutics influenced many subsequent thinkers such as Husserl, Heidegger, Cassirer, Gadamer and Ricoeur. Recently, there has been some attention given to the ways in which Dilthey’s empirical approach to experience influenced Carnap in his early attempts to overcome metaphysics in favor of more analytical methods.

1. Dilthey’s Life and Thought

1.1 Brief Overview of Dilthey’s Philosophical Development

Wilhelm Dilthey was born in Biebrich on the Rhine in 1833, two years after Hegel had died. Dilthey’s ambivalent attitude towards Hegel can provide some initial clues about his own philosophical approach. He admired Hegel’s recognition of the historical dimension of philosophical thought, but rejected the speculative and metaphysical ways he developed this relation. Like the Neo-Kantians, Dilthey proposed a return to the more focused viewpoint of Kant, but not without also taking account of the higher emancipatory aspirations and broader perspectives of later thinkers such as Fichte, Herder, and Hegel.

Dilthey characterized his own expansive view of philosophy as one of establishing integral relations to all the theoretical disciplines and historical practices that attempt to make sense of the world. Instead of demarcating the boundaries that set philosophy apart from other ways of engaging life, Dilthey conceives its critical task as articulating the overall structures that define the human spirit in general. Relatively early in his career, philosophy is defined as “an experiential science of spiritual phenomena” that seeks to “cognize the laws governing social, intellectual and moral phenomena” (1867/GS.V, 27). Philosophy should aim to preserve the scope that idealists such as Fichte, Schelling and Hegel had given it, but it must do so by recapturing the Kantian rigor that had been lost and by proceeding empirically.

These goals, as formulated in the inaugural lecture that Dilthey gave in 1867 on assuming his first professorship in Basel, were already prefigured in his early journals. Thus in 1859 Dilthey wrote that a new Critique of Reason must proceed on the basis of the psychological laws and impulses from which art, religion and science all derive. All intellectual systems are mere crystallizations of more generic schemata rooted in life (JD, 80).

The early Dilthey conceived his goal as a broadening of the critical project that would ground the human sciences as Kant had grounded the natural sciences. His hope then was that the human sciences would be able to arrive at lawful explanations just like the natural sciences. Up until at least 1887, when he published his Poetics, Dilthey was confident that inner explanations of human creativity could be arrived at. He himself formulated three laws of the imaginative metamorphosis to account for the uplifting effect that poets can have on us. Dilthey summarizes them as the laws of exclusion, intensification, and completion. Even in ordinary experience images are transformed by excluding what is no longer of interest and intensifying what remains based on our present interests. But what distinguishes poetic imagery is that it is also completed by the overall life-concerns of a powerful psyche.

Through his efforts to work out a kind of gestaltist psychology that could frame this third law of imaginative completion, Dilthey came to modify some of his basic assumptions. He came to realize that the overall psychic nexus of an individual was not a sufficient contextual frame to explain human experience. Our experience can only be understood by describing it as it as a continuum that is gradually acquired over time. What he calls the “acquired psychic nexus” is itself historically embedded in a social world. This means that our access to history is much more direct than our access to nature. We feel ourselves as part of history whereas nature has come to increasingly stand apart from us. Although Dilthey is still willing to accept that objects of outer experience are phenomenal, he no longer accepts the Kantian thesis that the contents of inner experience are phenomenal as well. Inner experience is reconceived as lived experience (Erlebnis) that is real and the time that relates us to history is not merely the ideal form that Kant had exposited for nature.


This second phase of Dilthey’s thought is characterized by a stress on the reality of lived experience and on the immediate understanding of human life that this makes possible. It is in the “Ideas for a Descriptive and Analytic Psychology” of 1894 that Dilthey works out his explanation-understanding distinction. “We explain through purely intellectual processes, but we understand through the cooperation of all the powers of the mind activated by apprehension” (1894/SW.II, 147). The human sciences will henceforth be conceived as primarily concerned with understanding the meaning of human action and interaction. Also central to this second phase of Dilthey’s thought is the essay “The Origin of Our Belief in the Reality of the External World and Its Justification” of 1890. Our initial access to the external world is not inferential, but is felt as resistance to the will. The world of lived experience is not merely a theoretical representation, but is directly present to us as embodying values that are relevant to our purposes. The stress on feeling and immediacy in this second phase amounts to a rejection of Hegel’s dialectical approach.

If the first phase was characterized by a search for inner explanations and the second phase by direct understanding, the third phase can be characterized by the need for interpretation. This final phase can be said to span the last decade of Dilthey’s life until his death in 1911. It begins with the realization in the essay “The Rise of Hermeneutics” of 1900 that the inner intelligibility of lived experience does not yet constitute full understanding. Self-understanding must also be mediated from without. The way we express ourselves, whether in communication or in action, is a crucial intermediary in defining ourselves. Understanding can only be reliable if it proceeds through the interpretation of human objectifications. Thus we properly understand ourselves not through introspection but through historical contextualization. It is in this last phase of his thought that Dilthey, who now occupied the chair that Hegel had once held in Berlin, revives his predecessor’s theory of objective spirit as the medium relating us to the past. In 1906 Dilthey published a seminal work on the young Hegel – Die Jugendgeschichte Hegels – that made use of recently discovered theological and political fragments. These unknown early fragments disclosed Hegel’s historical geniality before it became constrained by the dialectical systematization that Dilthey had always objected to. Dilthey’s student Herman Nohl was helpful in deciphering some of these fragments and went on to publish them. Nohl also edited a volume of Dilthey’s writings on the history of German Idealism going back to Kant, Beck and Fichte and leading up to such contemporaries of Hegel as Schelling, Schleiermacher, Schopenhauer and Fries.

1.2 The Religious Background of Dilthey’s Philosophy

Dilthey followed family tradition by starting his university studies at Heidelberg in theology. There he was also introduced to the philosophical systems of the idealists by Kuno Fischer. Because Fischer was accused of being a pantheist, his right to teach was withdrawn in 1853. Dilthey then moved to the University of Berlin, where he came under the influence of two of Friedrich Schleiermacher’s students, Friedrich Adolf Trendelenburg and August Boeckh. Increasingly, Schleiermacher became the focus of Dilthey’s interests. In 1859 he was asked to complete the editing of Schleiermacher’s letters. That year the Schleiermacher Society also organized an essay competition. Dilthey’s submission entitled “Schleiermacher’s Hermeneutical System in Relation to Earlier Protestant Hermeneutics” (1860, SW.IV, 33–227), was awarded the first prize and led to a second commission, namely, to write Schleiermacher’s biography. The first volume of this biography was published in 1870. It places Schleiermacher not only in his theological setting but also in the context of the literary and philosophical movements astir in Berlin from 1796 to 1807. The work displays Dilthey’s own expanding interests in aesthetical and philosophical issues. He also wrote his dissertation on Schleiermacher’s ethics.

As a theology student, Dilthey had begun a study of many early formulations of the Christian worldview, which though never completed, continued to influence his subsequent writings. In 1860 Dilthey writes that

it is my calling to apprehend the innermost nature of religious life in history and to bring this to the attention of our times which are moved exclusively by matters of state and science. (JD, 140)

This means looking for religiosity not so much in its institutional practices and its theological doctrines as in the recesses of human experience. In a similar vein, he asserts that it is necessary to recover the “religious-philosophical worldview that is buried under the ruins of our theology and philosophy” (JD, 140).

Dilthey conceives religious experience as an extension of Schleiermacher’s feeling of absolute dependence. It is a total experience that interweaves a feeling of dependence with an awareness of a capacity to uplift ourselves. Religious experience is regarded as an enduring background and accompaniment of human intellectual life. Religion has manifested itself in many forms such as mythical representations, mystical ideas of revelation and human redemption, theological doctrines, and metaphysical theories. Because of its emphasis on meteorological events (1883/ SW I, 450), Dilthey saw myth as a primitive scientific theory that compromised the genuine religiosity of mystical feelings.

Later as he reflected on the nature of worldviews, Dilthey would occasionally return to the problem of religion. What distinguishes the religious worldview from artistic and philosophical worldviews is that it relates the visible to what is invisible, life to our awareness of death. In a striking late passage, Dilthey writes that when life is experienced religiously and

according to its true nature—full of hardships and a singular blend of suffering and happiness throughout—<we are> pointed to something strange and unfamiliar, as if it were coming from invisible sources, something <pressing in> on life from outside, yet coming from its own depths. (ca. 1910/SW.III, 285)

The same non-transcendent perspective on religion is to be found in Dilthey’s last essay, written during the final days of his life in 1911 while he was on vacation in the Dolomites. This essay on “The Problem of Religion” points to the fact that the Enlightenment has made it increasingly difficult to acknowledge the mystical aspects of religious experience. Enlightenment thinkers regarded mystical experience as irrational. But according to Dilthey, Schleiermacher was able to avoid this charge of irrationalism by relating core aspects of religious experience to the insights of transcendental philosophy. Instead of interpreting the mystical feeling of communion as an esoteric union with a transcendent God, Schleiermacher explicates it as a general awareness that is attuned to the invisible coherence of things down here (1911/SW.VI,304–05). He gives a transcendental reading of what is intuited and felt in the religious mood by transforming it into a creative life-principle. Whereas traditionally mysticism tended to devalue our life in this world, Schleiermacher’s mysticism is seen as affirming it.

2. Dilthey’s Main Philosophical Works

2.1 The 1880s: Broadening the Critical Framework

Dilthey’s first major theoretical work is the Introduction to the Human Sciences of 1883. The human sciences (Geisteswissenschaften) encompass both the humanities and the social sciences. They range from disciplines like philology, literary and cultural studies, religion and psychology, to political science and economics. Dilthey insists that the human sciences be related not by some logical construct on the order of August Comte or J.S. Mill, but by means of reflective considerations that take their historical genesis into account. Dilthey writes that

the human sciences as they exist and as they are practiced according to the reason of things that were active in their history … contain three classes of assertions. (1883/SW.I, 78)

These are 1) descriptive and historical statements, 2) theoretical generalizations about partial contents and 3) evaluative judgments and practical rules. The human sciences are more obviously normative in nature than the natural sciences for which formal norms related to objective inquiry suffice. The fact that the human sciences are forced to confront substantive normative issues puts a limit on the kind of theoretical regularities that can be established in the human sciences. Given the core role that human beings play in the socio-historical world, the understanding of individuality is as important in the human sciences as are the explanations to be found through generalizations.

But the human science of psychology that deals with individual human beings cannot examine them apart from interactions with society. “Man as a fact prior to history and society is a fiction” (1883/SW.I, 83). This means that psychology can be a foundational human science only if it is conceived as being primarily descriptive. Psychological explanations may still be possible, but only by starting with a non-hypothetical base that describes how our experience assimilates social and cultural features. Many human character traits are not purely psychological. Thus when we speak of a person as thrifty we are combining economic and psychological features.

Individual human beings are important for the understanding of history, but instead of making them the monadic building blocks of history, they are to be considered as points of intersection of many forces. Only a multidisciplinary approach to human history can do it justice. Qua conscious living beings, individuals are the carriers of history, but they are just as much the products of history. Individuals are not self-sufficient atoms. But neither are they to be regarded as swallowed up by encompassing communities like nations or peoples. Concepts that posit the soul of a people “are no more usable in history than is the concept of life-force in physiology” (1883/SW.I, 92). Suspicion of those who posit overriding self-sufficient entities like nations and peoples led Dilthey to distance himself from the nationalism of his contemporary Heinrich von Treitschke and to ally himself with a political reformism reminiscent of Kant and Wilhelm von Humboldt.

Dilthey conceives of most of the human sciences as analyzing human interactions at a level that can mediate between individual initiative and communal tradition. These sciences deal with what he calls “cultural systems” and “external organizations of society”. Cultural systems are associations that individuals join voluntarily for certain purposes that they can only achieve through cooperation. These systems are cultural in the widest possible sense and include all aspects of our social life. They can be political, economic, artistic, scientific or religious in nature and are not normally bound by national or other overarching interests. External organizations of society by contrast are those more controlling institutional structures like a family and a state that we are born into. Here “enduring causes bind the wills of many into a single whole” (1883/SW.I, 94) within which relations of power, dependence and property can be established. It is important to cross-reference cultural systems and institutional organizations. Enlightenment thinkers had focused on cultural systems such as scientific academies and their potential universal scope while overlooking how most educational institutions are controlled by local authorities. Although Dilthey received his training from members of the Historical School, he recognized that many of them had been equally one-sided by stressing the distinctive institutional organizations that separate different peoples while ignoring the role of generalizations made possible through the analysis of cultural systems.

Dilthey aims to combine these two approaches to liberalize the historicist perspective and give it a methodological rigor. To understand the role of the law in historical life we must consider it both as a cultural system that frames legal issues in universal terms and as an external organization of society that examines them in terms of the positive laws of particular institutions. The Historical School was wrong to regard individuals as completely subordinate to the bonds of family and state and to think that the positive laws of institutions define the full reality of life. The authority of the state “encompasses only a certain portion … of the collective power of the populace” and even when state power exerts a certain preponderance it can do so only “through the cooperation of psychological impulses” (1883/SW.I, 132).

In the preface to the Introduction to the Human Sciences, Dilthey refers to his project as a Critique of Historical Reason. We can now see that this is first of all a critique of the metaphysical thesis that there can be an overarching “universal explanatory framework for all historical facts” (1883/SW.I, 141). If universal explanations are to be possible for history as well as for nature, then we must recognize that they are only possible for correlating partial contents of reality. The reason that the natural sciences have been so successful in discovering causal laws of nature is that they abstract from the full scope of the external world.

The conditions sought by the mechanistic explanation of nature explain only part of the contents of external reality. This intelligible world of atoms, ether, vibrations, is only a calculated and highly artificial abstraction from what is given in outer and lived experience. (1883/SW.I, 203)

The human sciences cannot similarly construct an abstract phenomenal world that focuses on physical and chemical processes and appeals to hypothetical atomic or even subatomic elements. It is incumbent on the human sciences to deal with the more complex networks of the historical world and the actual givens of human beings. Explanations that are adequate for the historical world will require an analysis of the multiple partial contents that are relevant in a particular context. According to Dilthey the human sciences must replace the abstract methodology of the natural sciences with an analytic counterpart.

Abstraction is distinguished from analysis in that the former singles out one fact and disregards the others, whereas the latter seeks to apprehend the majority of the facts that make up the factors of a complex whole. (ca. 1880–1893/SW.I, 433)

The more facts that explanations seek to correlate, the more limited their scope must be. Thus the laws to be discovered in the human sciences will apply not to history in general, but only to specific cultural systems or institutional organizations. It may be possible to arrive at causal laws of economic growth, of scientific progress or of literary development, but not at overarching historical laws of human progress.

So far Dilthey has argued for a relative independence of the human sciences vis-à-vis the better established natural sciences. However, from the transcendental perspective that considers the conditions our consciousness brings to experience, the human sciences must claim a reflective priority. The realization that the human sciences not only ascertain what is—as do the natural sciences—but also make value judgments, establish goals and prescribe rules, discloses that they are much more directly related to the full reality of lived experience. The Kantian I-think that is the basis of the conceptual cognition (Erkenntnis) of the natural sciences really derives from a direct knowing (Wissen) rooted in Dilthey’s more inclusive thinking-feeling-willing of lived experience (see 1883/SW.I, 228, and ca. 1880–93/SW.I, 263–68). The natural sciences merely construct a phenomenal or ideal world that abstracts from the real nexus of lived experience. The world that is formed by the human sciences is the historical-social reality in which human beings participate. It is a real world that is directly possessed or present in what Dilthey calls Innewerden. This term has sometimes been translated as “inner awareness,” but is is better to translate it as “reflexive awareness” to indicate how things are there-for-us. Reflexive awareness is a pre-reflective, indexical mode of consciousness that “does not place a content over against the subject of consciousness (it does not re-present it)” (ca. 1880–93/SW.I, 253). It is the direct know-how that reality is present-for-me prior to any of the reflective act-content, inner-outer, or subject-object distinctions that characterize the representational world of conceptual cognition.

The human sciences must hold on to the original presence of this directly known reality even as they proceed to use the intellectual tools of conceptual cognition in their analysis of partial contents. The way the historical world is represented and analyzed must in some way still reflect the way history has been lived. The final understanding (Verstehen) aimed at by Dilthey’s human sciences must draw on all our capacities and is to be distinguished from the mere intellectual and abstract understanding (Verstand) of Kant’s natural sciences.

In attempting to convey the richness and depth of lived experience, the human sciences must also consider the contribution of the arts. Aesthetics constitutes an important cultural system in that it can provide a sense of how the arts can contribute to human understanding in general. Dilthey’s Poetics of 1887 represents an effort to develop certain psychological concepts to explicate the workings of the poetic imagination. Even in ordinary life, the images we extract from experience are subject to metamorphosis. With time all our images are transformed, for “the same image can no more return than the same leaf can grow back on a tree the following spring” (1887/SW.V, 102). The first law of metamorphosis involves the exclusion of those constituents of images that are not valuable to us. Not every apprehended constituent is worth remembering. According to Dilthey we do not just passively absorb every impression that comes our way. We filter out what is not worth perceiving by a process of apperception. This apperception is guided by what is called an “acquired nexus of psychic life”. Because this gradually acquired nexus differs for each subject, the process of exclusion never has the same outcome.

Some of what has not been excluded by the first law of imaginative metamorphosis can then become the focus of special attention. According to Dilthey’s second law of imaginative metamorphosis “Images are transformed when they expand or contract, when the intensity of the sensations of which they are composed is increased or decreased” (1887/SW.V, 102). Such a change in intensity can apply to either the reproductive imagination of ordinary memory or the productive imagination of poets or novelists. In the former case of memory an increase of intensity tends to be as much a function of a present practical interest as of acquired experience. In the latter case of the imagination of poets an increase of intensity is more likely to be primarily regulated by their overall acquired psychic nexus. What distinguishes the imagination of great poets according to Dilthey is their capacity to ignore the constant distractions and mundane interests of daily life. Only they can unfold imagery in a way that reflects our overall human values.

The third law of imaginative metamorphosis involves their completion, by which Dilthey means a process “by which something outer is enlivened by something inner or something inner is made visible and intuitable by something outer” (1887/SW.V, 104). In completion there is an interpenetration between inner feeling and outer perception so that the very nucleus of an image can symbolize the overall acquired psychic nexus. Dilthey writes,

Only when the whole acquired psychic nexus becomes active can images be transformed on the basis of it: innumerable, immeasurable, almost imperceptible changes occur in their nucleus. And in this way, the completion of the particular originates from the fullness of psychic life. (1887/SW.V, 104)

This last law of imaginative completion applies only to artists and allows them to articulate the essential meaning of life-situations—through them we come to see what is typical in life. These laws of metamorphosis are conceived as explanative to the extent that they appeal to an overall acquired psychic nexus as their ultimate context. But a more comprehensive descriptive account shows these laws to be rather schematic and unable to capture all the qualitative changes that result for our understanding of the world more generally. And for that reason Dilthey backs away from pure psychological explanations after 1887. In the essay “Three Epochs of Modern Aesthetics” of 1892 he redescribes imaginative metamorphosis more structurally. A portrait painter is said to order the structure of what is objectively perceived

around one especially noticeable point, which I will call the aesthetic point of impression. Every carefully observed face is understood on the basis of such a dominant impression …. On the basis of this impression and repeated memory, indifferent features are excluded, while telling features are stressed and refractory ones de-emphasized. The remaining whole is unified ever more decisively. (1892/SW.V, 217)

Now exclusion, intensification and unifying completion are understood as part of a process of articulating the structure of our experience of reality.

2.2 The 1890s: Understanding as Structural Articulation

This new, more descriptive structural approach is inaugurated in the essay “The Origin of Our Belief in the Reality of the External World and Its Justification” of 1890. Here Dilthey writes that the structure of all psychic life consists of impressions “evoking purposive reactions in the system of our drives and the feelings connected with them” (1890a/SW.II, 14). Rather than basing our initial sense of an external world on theoretical inferences from effects to causes, he roots it in a felt resistance to the will. But resistance must be internalized as a restraint of a volitional intention for it to signify the existence of something independent. Thus Dilthey is not merely replacing a representational phenomenalism with a direct perceptual realism. Each perceptual process has “an inner side” that involves “an energy and affective tone deriving from inner strivings that connect it to our own life” (1890a/SW.II, 14). All aspects of our own life are brought into play as we respond to the world.

In 1894 Dilthey published his “Ideas for a Descriptive and Analytic Psychology” and established how it differs from traditional explanative psychologies. He admits that even a descriptive psychology will seek to explicate the causal relationships of life, but that it must differ from explanative psychology by not trying to “derive a comprehensive and transparent cognition of psychological phenomena from a limited number of univocally determined elements” (1894/SW.II, 116). Unlike the associationists, Dilthey will not posit simple, stable impressions that are then combined into more complex ideas. They introduce unnecessary hypothetical elements into the foundation of psychology.

In psychology it is precisely the connectedness that is originally and continually given in lived experience: life presents itself everywhere only as a continuum or nexus. (1894/SW.II, 119–20)

It is the task of a descriptive and analytic psychology to explicate how different processes converge in the nexus of consciousness. This nexus is lived and must be distinguished from the overall acquired psychic nexus discussed earlier. The lived nexus is available to reflexive awareness and can be described as itself an ongoing process. Analysis then shows this process to have a rather uniform cross-sectional structure. Almost every momentary state of consciousness can be seen “to simultaneously contain some kind of representing, feeling, and willing” (1894/SW.II, 173).

If we were merely representational beings, the conditions of psychic life would be merely causal. But we at the same time estimate the value of what we represent through feeling.

Once external conditions evoke a sense of pressure or intensification in the sphere of feeling, a striving comes about to either maintain or to modify a given state. (1894/SW.II, 177)

The interest of feeling that attaches to aspects of what is experienced allows us to value them as either favorable or unfavorable to our existence and sets the stage for the will to possibly act on their basis.

To the extent that the parts [of the experiential nexus] are connected structurally so as to link the satisfaction of the drives and happiness and to reject suffering, we call this nexus purposive. It is solely in psychic structure that the character of purposiveness is originally given, and when we attribute this to an organism or to the world, this concept is only transferred from inner lived experience. Every relation of parts to a whole attains the character of purposiveness from the value that is realized in it. This value is experienced only in the life of feelings and drives. (1894/SW.II, 178)

Psychic life is not constructed synthetically from discrete elements, but is always already a continuum that is constantly differentiating itself from within. By describing and analyzing this continuum Dilthey brings out the breadth and depth of its scope and articulates it as a structural nexus. And as he considers the temporal development of this nexus, he further defines its purposiveness. Although the cognitive and volitional subsystems of mental life may posit external ends, the affective and overall psychic nexus displays what Kant called a purposiveness without a determinant purpose. The overall acquired psychic nexus exhibits a teleology that does not posit any final telos to which all previous stages are to be subsumed. The purposiveness of mental life is immanent and adaptive rather than external and predetermined. Each stage of our life can be understood as an epoch with its distinctive value.

Nothing can be more erroneous than viewing maturity as the goal of the development that constitutes life and thus transforming the early years into mere means. How could those years serve as means to a goal which in each case is so uncertain? Instead, it is part of the nature of life to strive to fill each moment with a richness of value. (1894/SW.II, 189)

A further task of Dilthey’s descriptive and analytic psychology is to show how the development of the psychic nexus produces the individuation of human life. Individuality is not conceived in terms of unique qualities that we are endowed with, but as something that each of us acquires historically. It is embodied in what was referred to earlier as a subject’s acquired psychic nexus and is only gradually articulated. Even when people share the same qualities their relative intensity will differ. Sometimes qualities are present to such a small extent as to be, in effect, unnoticeable. Prominent qualities, however, tend to reinforce certain related qualities and suppress others. Each individual can thus be understood as a structural configuration of a set of dominant qualities in tension with some subordinate qualities. This tension may be unresolved for a long time until finally some articulation or Gestalt is reached that defines a person’s character. Dilthey gives the example of strong ambition leading someone to gradually overcome shyness in public. Once a person recognizes that low self-confidence when speaking in public stands in the way of an important goal being fulfilled, that person can begin to cultivate the requisite qualities.

The initial response to Dilthey’s descriptive psychology was mixed. Hermann Ebbinghaus wrote an extended review which claimed that Dilthey still relies on hypotheses and that the differences between explanative and descriptive psychologies are minimal. Dilthey defended his position by showing that he never meant to banish explanative hypotheses from psychology altogether, merely from its descriptive foundations. Husserl later expressed his regret that the Ebbinghaus review deflected him from reading this “genial” anticipation of phenomenology until much later.

Another kind of criticism came from the Neo-Kantians, most of whom wanted to completely divorce philosophy from psychology. In 1894 the Baden School Neo-Kantian Wilhelm Windelband delivered a lecture in which he claimed that psychology has no real relevance for the historical sciences and should be considered a natural science rather than a human science. Windelband sees psychology as searching for laws just as the natural sciences do and historical studies as interested in unique patterns. Thus he proposed that the natural sciences are nomothetic and the historical or cultural sciences ideographic. Dilthey in turn rejected Windelband’s distinction by showing that many natural sciences have ideographic elements and many human sciences such as linguistics and economics have nomothetic aims. Moreover, Dilthey argued that the description of singular historical data only becomes meaningful if understood in the framework of regularities: “What is most characteristic of the systematic human sciences is the connection of the general and the individual ” (1895–6/SW.II, 227). Not only is it the case that universal considerations are as important as ideographic specificity, but also the understanding of individuality is not possible without reference to some broader context.

2.3 1900–1911: Historical Understanding and Hermeneutics

2.3.1 Interpreting from the Outside In

The final phase of Dilthey’s philosophy can be said to begin at the turn of the twentieth century with his essay “The Rise of Hermeneutics”. Whereas the early prize-essay on Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics had been more focused on textual and theological interpretation, the new essay makes hermeneutics a connecting link between philosophy and history. Dilthey argues that the study of history can be reliable only if it is possible to raise the understanding of what is singular to the level of universal validity. Here he also comes to the realization that

the inner experience through which I obtain reflexive awareness of my own condition can never by itself bring me to a consciousness of my own individuality. I experience the latter only through a comparison of myself with others. (1900/SW.IV, 236)

Others cannot be assumed to be mere extensions of myself. They are accessible to me only from the outside. It is the task of understanding to confer “an inside” to what is first given as “a complex of external sensory signs” (1900/SW.IV, 236).

Whereas up to then the intelligibility of lived experience had been assumed to provide us an understanding of ourselves, now Dilthey asserts that we can understand ourselves only by means of our objectifications. The understanding of self requires me to approach myself as others do, that is, from the outside to the inside.

The process of understanding, insofar as it is determined by common conditions and epistemological means, must everywhere have the same characteristics. (1900/SW.IV, 237)

To the extent that rules can guide the understanding of the objectifications of life they make possible a theory of interpretation. Hermeneutics is the theory of interpretation that relates to all human objectifications—that is, not only speech and writing, but also visual artistic expressions, more casual physical gestures as well as observable actions or deeds.

This new hermeneutic perspective that approaches the inside from the outside also alters Dilthey’s conception of psychic structure. In the first of three “Studies Toward the Foundation of the Human Sciences” dating from 1904–9, Dilthey considers what linguistic expressions can teach us about the intentionality of consciousness. No longer merely explicating the breadth of psychic life through the interweavings of acts of cognition, feeling and willing, Dilthey uses expressions such as “I am worried about something” to disclose the referential structure of a lived experience. Psychic acts have contents that are related to the objects of the world by means of what Dilthey calls attitudinal stances. These judgmental attitudes toward the world are

indefinite in number. Asking, believing, presuming, claiming, taking pleasure in, approving, liking and its opposite, wishing, desiring, and willing are such modifications of the psychic attitude. (1904–9/SW.III, 43)

These attitudinal and judgmental stances are not just cognitive, but pre-delineate something more encompassing, which can be called “reflective knowledge” to distinguish it from the direct knowing of lived experience and reflexive awareness. This judgmental reflective knowledge (Wissen) adds to the conceptual cognition (Erkenntnis) of reality a “positing of values” and “the determination of purposes and the establishment of rules.” (1904–9/SW.III, 25)

While the kind of epistemology (Erkenntnistheorie) established by Kant and others suffices for the natural sciences, the human sciences require a more full-blooded theory of knowledge (Theorie des Wissens). Knowledge is to be “distinguished from a mere representation, presumption, question, or assumption by the fact that a content appears here with a sense of objective necessity” (1904–9/SW.III, 27–28). This objective necessity is to be located in the evidentness that accompanies thinking that is properly executed and reaches its goal whether through the self-given reality of lived experience or the “givenness that binds us to an outer perception” (1904–9/SW.III, 28).

For the human sciences, things in the world are not merely cognitively apprehended as phenomenal objects, but known as real for our life-concerns (Lebensbezüge). Thinking of the unfinished manuscripts in his office, Dilthey writes in the Second Study Toward the Foundation of the Human Sciences:

I am tired from overworking; having reviewed my files, I worry about their unfinished contents, whose completion demands incalculably more work from me. All this “about”, “of”, and “toward”, all these references of what is remembered to what is experienced, in short, all these structural inner relations, must be apprehended by me, since I now want to apprehend the fullness of the lived experience exhaustively. And precisely in order to exhaust it, I must regress further in the structural network to the memories of other lived experiences. (1904–9/SW.III, 50)

Every attempt to characterize a lived experience leads beyond it to other structurally related experiences that ground it. This involves not just an observational process of willful attention, but also an involuntary “being-pulled-along by the state of affairs itself” (1904–9/SW.III, 51) to other constituent parts of the nexus of human knowledge.

Some of these refinements incorporated into Dilthey’s descriptive program were inspired by reading Husserl’s Logical Investigations (1900–01). Dilthey specifically follows Husserl in his account of how language contributes to “significative apprehension” (1904–9/SW.III, 60). In reading words we do not represent them as mere sets of letters but fulfill their meaning by representing their objects. There is a triadic structural relation between the intuitive content of a linguistic expression, an act that gives it meaning, and the object that embodies that meaning as what is expressed. But whereas Husserl’s phenomenology focused in the conceptual structures of objective apprehension, Dilthey gives equal attention to the felt structures of what he calls “objective having” (1904–9/SW.III, 66). In objective apprehension we progress from attitude to objects, in objective having we regress from objects to attitude. This regressive turn from the outside to the inside is brought to bear on how feelings are to be interpreted. “ Whether we feel our own state or some object, it involves only a state of being as a kind of attitude…. The way this state of being depends on outer objects or on the state of the subject is obscured through an inverse attitude that loses itself in the depth of the subject” (1904–9/SW.III, 69). Instead of regarding feelings merely as subjective states such as pleasure or displeasure, they can be interpreted as attitudes that assess what is given in consciousness as either furthering or diminishing one’s state of being in the world. Feelings can be added to our earlier list of attitudes.

Feelings as attitudes allow us to evaluate the world. Our values express adjudicative attitudes based on feeling. Although the setting of purposes is grounded in the lived experience of values, the life of feelings has an immanent teleology that does not require it to go over into the desire to act. The structural nexus of willing is thus different from that of feeling. There are many feelings that evoke further feelings rather than the impulse to do something in response to them. A feeling of suffering can for instance elicit a kind of self-pity that spreads the suffering and elicits a “distinctively mellow” (1904–9/SW.III, 76) mood that immobilizes.

The final general attitude relevant to the structural nexus of knowledge is that of willing. In the lived experiences of willing “we possess a reflexive awareness of an intention to realize a state of affairs” (1904–9/SW.III, 82). If we call this state of affairs to be realized a “purpose” then what is expected from this purpose is a satisfaction of some kind.

2.3.2 Reinterpreting Purposiveness and Distinguishing Elementary Understanding and Higher Understanding.

Dilthey’s most important work is The Formation (Aufbau) of the Historical World in the Human Sciences of 1910. Here Dilthey applies the same kind of structural analysis that we saw him develop for lived experience to the understanding of history. The human sciences give form to the historical world by analyzing the structural systems in terms of which human beings participate in history. In the Introduction to the Human Sciences Dilthey had conceived the psychic nexus, cultural systems and external organizations of society as purposive systems. Now a more neutral covering concept is used to capture all the ways the forces of life can converge. This is the concept of the “productive nexus or system” (Wirkungszusammenhang). Now the efficacy of life and of the historical world is to be understood in terms of productivity before any causal or teleological analysis is applied. The carriers of history, whether they be individuals, cultures, institutions, or communities, are productive systems capable of producing value, meaning, and, in some cases, realizing purposes. Each is to be considered structurally as centered in itself.

Individuals can be studied as psychic productive systems inherently related to each other as well as to more inclusive productive systems that are also at work in history. These larger productive systems come about because of the need for communication, interaction, and cooperation among individuals. But they can also take on a life of their own and survive the individuals that formed and shaped them. Dilthey’s category of Wirkung or productivity is at the root of Gadamer’s theory of the productive history (Wirkungsgeschichte) of works of art that grants them new meanings over time that exceed those intended by their creators. In the Introduction to the Human Sciences, Dilthey had been unwilling to consider purposive social systems as subjects or carriers of history. In The Formation of the Historical World in the Human Sciences, he qualifies his opposition to the idea of a transpersonal subject such as the soul of a people by de-reifying it as the spirit of a people that is to be considered as a logical rather than a real subject. It is possible to regard cooperative productive systems as logical subjects that transcend individuals without positing them as super-empirical real subjects.

Despite this increased importance granted to more encompassing cultural systems and organizations of society, Dilthey continues to insist that the individuals participating in them are never completely submerged by them. This is because any such productive system only engages some aspects of an individual. Moreover, the individuals active in a cultural system often put their stamp on its mode of productivity so that not just the rationally agreed upon function of the system is achieved. Summing up these two points, Dilthey discerns a difficulty in conceptualizing the sciences of these cultural systems in terms of the idea of purposes alone:

The individuals who cooperate in such a function belong to the cultural system only through those processes by which they contribute to the realization of the function. Nevertheless, they participate in these processes with their whole being, which means that a domain based purely on the system’s functional purpose can never be constructed. Rather, other aspects of human nature are also constantly at work in this domain supplementing the energies devoted to the system’s functions. (1910/SW.III, 208)

Individuals give only part of themselves to these more inclusive systems, yet they can express their whole being through this part. No cultural system will embody merely the purposes it was meant to fulfill. That is why it is crucial to reconceive purposive systems as productive systems. A productive nexus or system may be purposive in a general sense without fulfilling a determinate purpose. It is to be understood more generally as producing objectifications that express human values as well as purposes—leaving open the extent to which specific goals are achieved. The important thing is how human values and purposes are expressed in productive systems and how their meaning is to be understood.

As in the essay “The Rise of Hermeneutics”, understanding was said to involve a process of referring back from outer sensory phenomena to a reality that involves inner processes. But now in The Formation of the Historical World in the Human Sciences Dilthey recognizes that this inner reality need not be psychological in nature. He uses the example of how the statutes of a state express the common will of a community. The inner content of the laws on the books is a legal meaning-formation. The expressions we read in law books articulate an inner relation among legal imperatives. What is expressed in these laws is not the mental states of individual legislators, but a general way of regulating human relations. Dilthey makes the same claim for individual poetic creations. What is expressed in a drama is

not the inner processes in the poet; it is rather a nexus created in them but separable from them. The nexus of a drama consists in a distinctive relation of material, poetic mood, motif, plot, and means of presentation. (1910/SW.III, 107)

The interpretation of history must deal with all manifestations of life, not merely expressions that are intended to communicate a state of mind. In the section entitled “The Understanding of Other Persons and Their Manifestations of Life”, Dilthey distinguishes three classes of life-manifestations. The first class consists of concepts, judgments and larger thought-formations. They are intended to communicate states of affairs, not states of mind. Thus the proposition “two plus two equals four” means the same in all contexts and says nothing about the person uttering it. Actions form a second class of manifestations of life. Actions as such are not meant to communicate anything, but they often do reveal something about the intentions of the actor. Thus if someone picks up a hammer nearby some nails and wooden boards, it is legitimate to assume that he or she wants to assemble the boards into some artifact. If this occurs in a large workshop, it is also plausible to think the person is a carpenter. This might also tell us something about the person’s livelihood, but not much more. There is a third class of life-manifestations that Dilthey calls “expressions of lived experience” and which disclose more about the individual uttering them. Expressions of lived experience can range from emotional exclamations and gestures to personal self-descriptions and reflections to works of art. Often these expressions are more revealing than was intended:

An expression of lived experience can contain more of the nexus of psychic life than any introspection can catch sight of. It draws from depths not illuminated by consciousness. But at the same time, it is characteristic of an expression of lived experience that its relation to the spiritual or human content expressed in it can only be made available to understanding within limits. Such expressions are not to be judged as true or false but as truthful or untruthful. (ca. 1910/SW.III, 227)

A work of art is often more disclosive of human life in general than of the specific life of the artist. It may disclose something about the state of mind or the attitude of the artist, but a work of art will only be great if its “spiritual content is liberated from its creator” (ca. 1910/SW.III, 228).

After having analyzed these three kinds of manifestations of life, which can be called theoretical, practical and disclosive respectively, Dilthey proceeds to distinguish various modes of understanding them. Elementary understanding goes back to the associative relation that normally exists between an expression and what is expressed in it. It assimilates the meanings that are commonly attached to expressions in the community that we grow up in. Dilthey adapts Hegel’s idea of “objective spirit” to account for this commonality of meaning. Now objective spirit logically encompasses “the manifold forms in which a commonality existing among individuals has objectified itself in the world of the senses”, allowing the past to become “a continuously enduring present for us” (ca. 1910/SW.III, 229). Whereas Hegel restricted objective spirit to the legal, economic and political aspects of historical life, Dilthey expands the concept to include not only the sciences, but also the triad of art, religion and philosophy that Hegel had assigned to absolute spirit. But most of all, objective spirit embodies the everyday, mundane aspects of life that we grow up with.

From earliest childhood, the self is nurtured by this world of objective spirit. It is also the medium in which the understanding of other persons and their life-manifestations takes place. For everything in which spirit has objectified itself contains something that is common to the I and the Thou. Every square planted with trees, every room in which chairs are arranged, is understandable to us from childhood because human tendencies to set goals, produce order, and define values in common have assigned a place to every square and every object in the room. (ca. 1910/SW.III, 229)

This common background suffices for the elementary understanding of everyday life. But whenever the common meaning of life-manifestations is called into question for some reason, higher understanding becomes necessary. This can occur because of an apparent inconsistency among various claims being made, or because an ambiguity that needs to be resolved. In each case we discern an unexpected complexity that requires us to shift our frame of reference. Higher understanding cannot continue to rely on the common meanings of an expression that derive from a shared local background between speaker and listener, writer and reader. Higher understanding must replace the sphere of commonality, where inference by analogy suffices, with that of universality, where inductive inference must take over. Here the human sciences become relevant by offering the appropriate universal disciplinary contexts that can help to deal with uncertainties of interpretation. These universal systematic contexts can be social or political, economic or cultural, secular or religious. When expressions can be determined to be functioning in a specific disciplinary context then ambiguities tend to disappear. Literary scholars may be able to clarify a puzzling poetic passage by showing it to contain a literary allusion to a classical work with a foreign vocabulary. Or they can perhaps clarify it by seeing it as a way of accommodating certain technical demands of the genre as such. These cases of higher understanding establish a larger context of reference.

However, higher understanding can also focus on more specific contexts related to a work or its author. The consideration of such contexts should come only at the conclusion of the interpretive process and represents a shift from exploring the relation “of expression to what is expressed” toward the relation “of what has been produced to productivity” (ca. 1910/SW.III, 233). Here we move from meaning relationships to something like a productive relationship to which knowledge about the authors becomes relevant. But the first recourse here is to consult more of the products of the author. How does a sentence fit into a paragraph, a chapter, a whole work, or a corpus as a whole? Only if these contexts fail to resolve the problem may we consider psychological claims about the author. The understanding of the individuality of an author should only bring in psychological factors as a last resort. Dilthey writes

we understand individuals by means of their affinities, their commonalities. This process presupposes the connection between the universally human and individuation. On the basis of what is universal, we can see individuation extended to the manifoldness of human existence. (ca. 1910/SW.III, 233)

However, the highest form of understanding is not the reconstruction of the individuality of the author. It involves something that has been confused with reconstruction, but is distinct. What Dilthey points to is a process of re-creation or re-experiencing, which he contrasts with understanding as such:

Understanding as such is an operation running inverse to the course of production. But a fully sympathetic reliving requires that understanding go forward with the line of the events themselves. (ca. 1910/SW.III, 235)

Re-experiencing develops understanding by completing the hermeneutical circle. If understanding goes “back” to the overall context, re-experiencing goes “forward” by following out the parts that give focus to the whole. A re-experiencing is not an actual re-construction but produces a better understanding that refines the original. This is made clear by the following example:

A lyrical poem makes possible, through the sequence of its verses, the re-experiencing of a nexus of lived experience—not the real one that stimulated the poet, but the one that, on its basis, the poet places in the mouth of an ideal person. (ca. 1910/SW.III, 235)

Whereas the arts can expand the horizon of our lived experience by means of the ideal and imaginary means of fiction, history must do so by a process of structural articulation. The task of the human sciences is to analyze the productive nexus of history as it exhibits itself in stable formations or systematic structures. The productive nexus of history differs from the causal nexus of nature in producing values and arriving at purposes.

The carriers of this constant creation of values and goods in the world of human spirit are individuals, communities, and the cultural systems in which individuals cooperate. This cooperation is determined by the fact that, in order to realize values, individuals subject themselves to rules and set themselves purposes. All these modes of cooperation manifest a life-concern connected to the human essence that links individuals with each other—a core, as it were, that cannot be grasped psychologically but is revealed in every such system of relations among human beings. (1910/SW.III, 175–76)

Each such socio-cultural system can be regarded as being centered within itself on the basis of some function, whether it be economic, scientific, political, artistic or religious. The structures to be analyzed here provide various cross-sections of what takes place in history. But there are also more composite and enduring socio-historical contexts that we can delineate such as nation-states and historical periods.

A nation-state is a composite institutional organization that contains and shapes many socio-cultural productive systems which then generate certain commonalities. When socio-cultural systems transcending the scope of a nation come into contact with local productive systems, they also begin to assume commonalities distinctive of that nation. In the individual members of a nation-state these commonalities can produce a sense of solidarity. But Dilthey also warns of excesses in that regard when he notes that many Germans are “placing the highest value ... not in the serene world-view of the Greeks, not in the intellectually delimited consideration of purpose of the Romans, but in the raw exertion of power without any limit” (1910/SW.III, 196).

Nation-states are regionally defined historical wholes, but we can also delineate temporal composite wholes such as historical phases. What characterizes a generation according to Dilthey is the crystallization of a movement sparked by the maturation of a certain age group. An epoch is more impersonal and large-scale. It marks a pervasive “permeating tendency” (1910/SW.III, 198). Each epoch defines a life-horizon by which people orient their life. “Such a horizon places life, life-concerns, life-experience, and thought-formation in a certain proportion” (1910/SW.III, 198), which tends to restrain the way individuals can modify their outlooks. But an epoch is only an overall tendency that encompasses opposing forces. In fact, a new epoch will often be sparked by the dissatisfactions produced by any force that becomes too dominant and complacent.

The structural analysis of history in terms of cultural systems and the external organizations of society can be guided by the various human sciences. But a reflective mode of judgment is needed when historians try to make sense of the more composite structures of nation-states and epochs. History is both a judgmental art concerned with meaning and a science concerned with objective truth. Only historical reflection can create the right balance that will transform the conceptual cognition of the human sciences into adequate historical knowledge.

2.3.3 The Categories of Historical Knowledge.

This shift to historical knowledge is the main theme of the notes (ca. 1910) for a second volume of The Formation of the Historical World in the Human Sciences (1910) which were published posthumously in 1927 as Drafts for a Critique of Historical Reason. Here Dilthey analyzes the categories of life that are relevant to historical knowledge. He distinguishes between formal and real categories. Formal categories stem from elementary logical operations that are at work in all apprehension: they include the processes of comparing, noting sameness, differentiating and relating. Although such elementary operations are prediscursive, they provide the basis for discursive thought. The prediscursive noting of sameness prepares the way for the unifying concepts of discursive thought and the process of relating provides the basis for synthetic procedures. These prediscursive and discursive modes of thought account for the formal categories of unity, plurality, identity, difference, degree and relation that are shared by the natural and human sciences.

But the real categories are not the same in the natural and human sciences. Whereas time is an ideal abstract form for the natural sciences, for the human sciences it has a qualitative content. It is experienced as advancing into the future and “always contains the memory of what has just been present” (ca. 1910/SW.III, 216). The relation between the past and the present becomes the source for the category of meaning which is Dilthey’s main historical category. The present never merely is in the sense of being observable and it can be understood meaningfully only to the extent that the past asserts its presence in it. When the present is lived, “the positive or negative value of the realities that fill it are experienced through feeling. And when we face the future, the category of purpose arises through a projective attitude” (ca. 1910/SW.III, 222). Meaning, value, and purpose are the three central categories of the human sciences and each relates to time in its own way. What is valued by feeling focuses on the momentary present, but for the will everything in the present tends to be subordinated to some future purpose. Only the category of meaning can expand the present into a presence that includes the past and overcomes the mere juxtaposition or subordination of the various aspects of life to each other. The understanding of meaning involves the encompassing sense of reflective knowledge that attempts to relate cognition to evaluation and the setting of goals.

Dilthey’s distinction between the natural and human sciences is not a metaphysical distinction. For that reason he does not create a dualism between nature as the domain of causality and history as the domain of freedom. There are many determining forces at work in history because it cannot be divorced from natural conditions. But to understand how individuals participate in history we must replace the purely external relation of cause and effect with the integral relation of “agency and suffering, of action and reaction” (ca. 1910/SW.III, 219).

The doing and undergoing that characterizes human involvement in history can be brought home most forcefully in autobiography.

Here a life-course stands as an external phenomenon from which understanding seeks to discover what produced it within a particular environment. The person who understands it is the same as the one who created it. This results in a special intimacy of understanding. (ca. 1910/SW.III, 221)

Autobiography begins with what memory has selected as significant life-moments, which reflection then gives a certain coherence. Thereby the initial tasks of “explicating a historical nexus are already half solved by life itself” (ca. 1910/SW.III, 221).

But the fact that history derives a special intimacy through the capacity for autobiography does not mean that we should be content to understand history through individuals alone. This also becomes evident in relation to Dilthey’s own work as a biographer of Schleiermacher. It became ever more clear to Dilthey that his biography could not solve its task of understanding the life of Schleiermacher without considering the intellectual life of Berlin in which he participated. A biography is likely to bring more contextual determining factors into play than an autobiography, but the biographer must remain open to the interplay of these influences and individual initiative. Dilthey writes that an individual

does not face a limitless play of forces in the historical world: he dwells in the sphere of the state, religion, or science—in brief, in a distinctive life-system or in a constellation of them. The inner structure of such a constellation draws the individual into it, shapes him, and determines the direction of his productivity. Historical achievements stem from the possibilities inherent in the inner structure of a historical moment. (ca. 1910/SW.III, 266–67)

Individuals worthy of a biography are those who have seized those momentary possibilities.

When turning to the nexus of universal history, we move further beyond the individual life-courses focused on by autobiography and biography. Although universal-historical understanding cannot ignore the results of autobiography and biography, it will focus more on the history of nations, cultural systems, and the external organizations of society.

Each of these histories has its own center to which the processes are related and consequently the values, purposes, and significance that result from this relationship. (ca. 1910/SW.III, 291)

Anthropological reflection expects history to teach what life is and yet history is dependent on life as lived. There is a hermeneutical circularity here that could be escaped “if unconditioned norms, purposes, or values [could] set the standard for contemplating an apprehending history” (ca. 1910/SW.III, 281). Unlike his Neo-Kantian contemporaries such as Hermann Cohen and Heinrich Rickert, Dilthey is not willing to accept unconditional values that transcend life. The spiritual nexus of history “is that of life itself insofar as life produces connectedness under the conditions of its natural environment” (ca. 1910/SW.III, 280). Life is the ultimate context behind which we cannot go. It is the horizon of productivity which encompasses the organic and the mental, but cannot be defined by either. Since “life is intimately related to temporal fulfillment” (ca. 1910/SW.III, 249), historicity is part of its essence. Consequently, the objective validity that is to be attached to any value cannot be separated from our temporal engagement with life. Values are not simply given or imposed from on high, but are produced as part of the human process of explicating the meaning of history. In light of Dilthey’s skepticism about transcendent unconditional values, it may seem surprising that he presented an ethical system that expects human beings to make unconditional commitments that are self-binding.

3. Dilthey’s Reflections on Ethics and Worldviews and His Doubts about Metaphysics

In 1890 Dilthey offered a lecture course at the University of Berlin that was posthumously published with the title System of Ethics (1890b). Here Dilthey sets himself the task of developing a “psycho-ethical” approach that is rooted in “anthropological-historical analysis” (1890b/SW.VI,104). Whereas traditional psychology has analyzed feelings mainly as responses to sense impressions that come from without, a psycho-ethical understanding of the feelings that can motivate us to act must be rooted in anthropological analysis of our inner drives, instincts and desires. Instead of focusing on the intellectual processes whereby human beings adapt to their surroundings, Dilthey argues that most of our responses are basically emotive and volitional. The feelings that measure the effect the world has on us are not just the subjective aspect of our representations of the world. These feelings are rooted in certain drives among which a sense of group solidarity is central (1890b/SW.VI,104).

This solidarity encompasses a fellow-feeling (Mitgefühl)(1890b/SW.VI,104–05) that goes deeper than the sympathy of the British moralists. Dilthey regards sympathy as a feeling “transferred from one living being to another” (1890b/SW.VI,89). Sympathy, compassion, and pity are modes of “suffering with” (Mitleid) that are derivative because they affect us from the outside. They involve an external “conjoint movement” (Mitbewegung) with others (1890b/SW.VI,89). Dilthey considers these psychological forms of sympathy or empathy (Mitempfindung) to be superficial compared to the more basic anthropological fellow-feeling of solidarity that produces an “inner relationship” (1890b/SW.VI,104)– with others.

The extent to which we are motivated by a sense of solidarity is a function of the sphere of commonality of objective spirit that we grow up in. Our anthropological sense of solidarity and its fellow-feeling provides a more positive incentive for sociability than Hume’s sympathy and Schopenhauer’s compassion. But even the fellowship of solidarity is a mere natural incentive which does not become ethical until it is transformed into a more active or participatory incentive of benevolence (1890b/GS.X, 70).

As he develops his anthropologically based approach to ethics, Dilthey leads up to three main ethical incentives. One of them is the benevolence (Wohlwollen) that we just related to human solidarity. The other two incentives are to strive for what is right (Rechtschaffenheit) and to perfect oneself in a socially legitimate manner (Vollkommenheit). These three ethical incentives had already been predelineated as moral principles in Dilthey’s Habilitationsschrift of 1864 entitled “Versuch einer Analyse des moralischen Bewußtseins” (see 1864/GS.VI, 26–27). In fact, the concluding section THREE 12 of the System of Ethics is taken almost exclusively from this earlier work, where the ethical incentives were formulated as three moral oughts. This raises the question how it is possible to move from anthropologically derived ethical incentives that are a posteriori to ultimately arrive at moral oughts that are a priori. There is a crucial subsection THREE 9.3 that prepares us for this transition. It is entitled “The Feeling of Duty and Justice, the Consciousness of the Commitment that Inheres in the Duty to Do What is Right or Just .” Here Dilthey is quite explicit that the commitment to do what is right demands a consciousness that cannot be conceived as a mere instinctive inner bond with others rooted in our sense of solidarity. The commitment to do what is right must now come from within on the basis of “respect for others as ends in themselves” (1890b/SW.VI, 128). The mere life-value of group solidarity is elevated to the spiritual value of respect for all others as individual ends-in-themselves. Having replaced Humean sympathy with benevolence, Dilthey now engages Kantian duty as part of his analysis of moral self-reflection. But instead of appealing to respect for the law to justify doing what is right, Dilthey derives moral duty from a commitment that is based on both a “fidelity to oneself and respect for the self-worth of other persons” (1890b/SW.VI,128). The sense of obligation (Verbindlichkeit) that comes with this commitment (Bindung) involves a recognition of a reciprocal human connectedness rather than a one-sided dependence on a higher law.

Formally Dilthey moves even closer to Kant at the end of the lectures by acknowledging that ultimately we must make “moral judgments” that are “unconditional” and “synthetic a priori” (1890b/GS.X, 108). Although Dilthey had rejected the possibility of synthetic a priori theoretical judgments for outer experience, he is now willing to speak of synthetic a priori practical judgments for inner experience. Had Dilthey published his 1890 lectures himself he would probably have tempered the language that was imported from his early essay. But he clearly still thinks that morality requires judgmental assent to oughts that are unconditionally self-binding.

The normative implications of anthropological reflection about life and history also led Dilthey to address the value of worldviews. Just as the nature of universal history forces us to conceive of history as more than a human science, so worldviews are more broadly based attempts at acquiring a unified perspective on life. The sciences are by their nature partial and cannot provide a comprehensive worldview. A worldview attempts to provide not only a cognitive picture of the world, but also an estimation of what in life is valuable and worth preserving, and finally how we can strive to improve reality. Worldviews have been developed in literary, religious and philosophical works. Philosophers have produced metaphysical formulations of worldviews that attempt to give them a universal conceptual determinacy. Dilthey analyzes three recurrent types of such metaphysical formulations: naturalism, the idealism of freedom, and objective idealism. The naturalism of Democritus, Hobbes and others derives everything from what can be cognized and is pluralistic in structure; idealism of freedom as found in Plato, Kant, and others insists on the sovereignty of the will and is dualistic; objective idealism as found in Heraclitus, Leibniz and Hegel affirms reality as the embodiment of a harmonious set of values and can be considered monistic. The three types of metaphysical worldviews are incommensurable in that each sets its priorities differently. Dilthey finds naturalism too reductive; his ethical views incline him toward the idealism of freedom; aesthetically he felt attracted towards objective idealism. No metaphysical formulation can have more than relative validity because it attempts to arrive at a totalization that transcends experience. Literary and poetic expressions of worldviews tend to be more successful because they do not claim to be totalizing. All that is humanly possible is to probe reality on the basis of life-experience and to settle for more limited philosophical insights informed by historical understanding. Ultimately, our reflective understanding of life and history must remain determinate-indeterminate.

We can see certain parallels with Dilthey’s attempt to replace metaphysical systems with more informal life-based “meta-physical reflection” or worldviews in the young Rudolf Carnap, who studied in Jena with Dilthey’s student Herman Nohl before moving to Vienna. Carnap’s paper “The Elimination of Metaphysics Through Logical Analysis of Language” refers to Dilthey and his students as positive counterexamples to varieties of meaningless metaphysical systems as found in Fichte, Hegel and Heidegger. Another essay by Carnap entitled “Metaphysics as Expression of an Attitude to Life” acknowledges the importance of Dilthey’s notion of “Lebensgefuehl.” Carnap’s analogue for Dilthey’s “Weltanschauung” is “Weltauffassung.” Carnap also incorporated a more or less Diltheyan conception of the human sciences in his Der logische Aufbau der Welt of 1928. Carnap refers to Dilthey’s Introduction to the Human Sciences, but replaces its language of “facts of consciousness” with that of “elementary experiences.” He does not refer to Dilthey’s last main work Der Aufbau der geschichtlichen Welt in den Geisteswissenschaften, but he did read Hans Freyer’s Theorie des objektiven Geistes, a work heavily influenced by Dilthey’s Aufbau and its reinterpretation of objective spirit as the medium of intersubjective communication. Carnap writes in his own Aufbau:

only the more recent history of philosophy (since Dilthey) has called attention to the methodological and object-theoretical distinctness of the domain of the human sciences (Geisteswissenschaften). (Carnap 1928: 23)

Carnap acknowledges the independent nature of spiritual (geistigen) or intersubjective objects such as political states and social customs. They differ from psychical and physical objects in that they can “survive” even as the original subjects that generated them “perish and other subjects take their place” (Carnap 1928: 23). It is not clear why Dilthey’s reflective analysis of the distinctive methods of the various sciences and his empirical approach to lived experience did not earn him more serious consideration by the Vienna Circle as a whole and other analytically oriented philosophers. But what is evident is that his theory of understanding (Verstehen) came to be widely misinterpreted as a kind of empathy. Although Dilthey had sharply differentiated between understanding as a judgmental process and empathy as a mere feeling, Carnap suggested that the understanding of others is an intuitive act that involves a measure of empathy, but which can be cognitively vetted in part through the analysis of objective manifestations ranging from gestures, linguistic expressions to practical actions (Carnap 1928: 55, 143). This suggestion by Carnap may have negatively influenced subsequent discussions of Dilthey’s theory of Verstehen by analytic philosophers, leading Theodor Abel, Ernest Nagel, and Arthur Danto to go even further by reducing it to “empathic identification.” Later Danto recognized that this is not the case and acknowledged that “Verstehen is a very brilliant notion, utterly misconceived heretofore by crass philosophical critics, myself included” (Danto 1970: 215). Verstehen is not some immediate projection of ourselves into others, but stands for a deliberate process that finds the proper context to relate others and their objectifications to what is already familiar to us. It is a reflective mode of inquiry that provides the framework for more specific explanations, whether causal or rational.


Primary Literature

Original Works Cited

An asterisk (*) on a date indicates the work was published posthumously.

1860* Schleiermacher’s Hermeneutical System in Relation to Earlier Protestant Hermeneutics, in SW.IV, 33–227.
1864* “Versuch einer Analyse des moralischen Bewußtseins”, in GS.VI, 1–28.
1867* “Die dichterische und philosophische Bewegung in Deutschland 1770–1800,” in GS.V, 12–30.
ca. 1880–93* Drafts for Volume II for the Introduction to the Human Sciences, in SW.I, 243–458.
1883 Introduction to the Human Sciences (Volume I), in SW.I, 47–242.
1887 Poetics, in SW.V, 29–174.
1890a “The Origin of Our Belief in the Reality of the External World and Its Justification,” in SW.II, 8–57.
1890b* System of Ethics, in GS.X.
1892 “The Three Epochs of Modern Aesthetics and Its Present Task,” in SW.V, 175–222.
1894 “Ideas for a Descriptive and Analytic Psychology,” SW.II, 115–210.
1895–6 “Contributions to the Study of Individuality,” SW.II, 211–284.
1900 “The Rise of Hermeneutics,” in SW.IV, 235–260.
1904–9 “Studies Toward the Foundation of the Human Sciences,” in SW.III, 21–97.
1910 The Formation of the Historical World in the Human Sciences, in GS.VII, 79–190; page reference is to the edition in SW.III, 101–212.
ca. 1910* “Drafts for a Critique of Historical Reason,” in GS.VII, 191–294; page reference is to the edition in SW.III, 213–314.
1911* “The Problem of Religion,” in GS.VI, 288–305.

Modern Editions and Collections

[GS] Gesammelte Schriften, 26 vols., Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1914–2006. Cited volumes:
  1. Die Jugendgeschichte Hegels und andere Abhandlungen zur Geschichte des Deutschen Idealismus, H. Nohl (ed.), 1921.
  2. Die geistige Welt. Einleitung in die Philosophie des Lebens. Erste Hälfte: Abhandlungen zur Grundlegung der Geisteswissenschaften, G. Misch (ed.), 1924.
  3. Die geistige Welt. Einleitung in die Philosophie des Lebens. Zweite Hälfte: Abhandlungen zur Poetik, Ethik und Pädagogik, G. Misch (ed.), 1924b.
  4. Der Aufbau der geschichtlichen Welt in den Geisteswissenschaften, B. Groethuysen (ed.), 1927.
  5. System der Ethik, H. Nohl (ed.), 1965.
[SW] Selected Works, R.A. Makkreel and F. Rodi (eds.), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1985–2010. Cited volumes:
  1. Introduction to the Human Sciences, 1989.
  2. Understanding the Human World, 2010.
  3. The Formation of the Historical World in the Human Sciences, 2002.
  4. Hermeneutics and the Study of History, 1996.
  5. Poetry and Experience, 1985.
  6. Ethical and World-View Philosophy, 2019.
[JD] Der junge Dilthey: Ein Lebensbild in Briefen und Tagebüchern, 1852–1870, C. Misch, née Dilthey (ed.), 2nd edition, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1960.
  • Briefwechsel zwischen Wilhelm Dilthey und dem Grafen Paul Yorck von Wartenburg, 1877–1897, Halle (Saale), Germany: M. Niemeyer, 1922.
  • Das Erlebnis und die Dichtung: Lessing, Goethe, Novalis, Hölderlin, Leipzig, Germany: Teubner, 1922.
  • Descriptive Psychology and Historical Understanding, R.M. Zaner and K.L. Heiges (trans.), with an introduction by R.A. Makkreel, The Hague: Martinus Nijhof, 1977.
  • Dilthey’s Philosophy of Existence, W. Kluback and M. Weinbaum (trans.), New York: Bookman Associates, 1957.
  • Essence of Philosophy, S.A. Emery and W.T. Emery (trans.), Chapel Hill: University of North Carolina Press, 1954.

Secondary Literature

  • Carnap, R., 1928, Der logische Aufbau der Welt, Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag.
  • Damböck, C., 2012 “Rudolf Carnap and Wilhelm Dilthey: ‘German’ Empiricism in the Aufbau”, in R. Creath (ed.), Carnap and the Legacy of Logical Empiricism, Institute Vienna Circle Yearbook, 75–96.
  • Damböck, C. and H-U. Lessing (eds.), 2016, Wilhelm Dilthey als Wissenschaftsphilosoph, Freiburg: Verlag Karl Alber.
  • D’Anna, G., H. Johach, and E.S. Nelson (eds.), 2013, Anthropologie und Geschichte; Studien zu Wilhelm Dilthey aus Anlass seines 100. Todestages, Wuerzburg: Koenigshausen & Neumann.
  • Danto, A. 1970, “Causation and Basic Actions”, Inquiry, 13: 125.
  • de Mul, J., 2004, The Tragedy of Finitude: Dilthey’s Hermeneutics of Life, T. Burrett (trans.), New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • Ermarth, M., 1978, Wilhelm Dilthey: The Critique of Historical Reason, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Lessing, H-U., R.A. Makkreel, and R. Pozzo (eds.), 2011, Recent Contributions to Dilthey’s Philosophy of the Human Sciences, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommmann-Holzboog.
  • Makkreel, R.A., 1975, Dilthey: Philosopher of the Human Studies, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press; 2nd edition, with afterword, 1992.
  • –––, 2015, Orientation and Judgment in Hermeneutics, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Makkreel, R.A. and J.D. Scanlon (eds.), 1987, Dilthey and Phenomenology, Washington, DC: Center for Advanced Research in Phenomenology and University Press of America.
  • Nelson, E.S., 2012, “Dilthey and Carnap: Empiricism, Life-Philosophy, and Overcoming Metaphysics”, Pli: Warwick Journal of Philosophy, 23: 20–49.
  • Nelson, E.S. (ed.), 2019, Interpreting Dilthey: Critical Essays, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Owensby, J., 1994, Dilthey and the Narrative of History, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Rickman, H.P., 1979, Wilhelm Dilthey: Pioneer of the Human Studies, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Rodi, F., 2003, Das strukturierte Ganze: Studien zum Werk von Wilhelm Dilthey, Göttingen, Germany: Velbrueck Wissenschaft & Co.
  • ––– (ed.), 1983–2000, Dilthey-Jahrbuch für Philosophie und Geschichte der Geisteswissenschaften, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht.
  • Rodi, F. and H-U Lessing (eds.), 1984, Materialien zur Philosophie Wilhelm Diltheys, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.
  • Scholtz, G. (ed), 2013, Diltheys Werk und die Wissenschaften: Neue Aspekte, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck Ruprecht

Other Internet Resources

Copyright © 2020 by
Rudolf Makkreel <philrm@emory.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free