First published Wed Dec 9, 2020

Hermeneutics is the study of interpretation. Hermeneutics plays a role in a number of disciplines whose subject matter demands interpretative approaches, characteristically, because the disciplinary subject matter concerns the meaning of human intentions, beliefs, and actions, or the meaning of human experience as it is preserved in the arts and literature, historical testimony, and other artifacts. Traditionally, disciplines that rely on hermeneutics include theology, especially Biblical studies, jurisprudence, and medicine, as well as some of the human sciences, social sciences, and humanities. In such contexts, hermeneutics is sometimes described as an “auxiliary” study of the arts, methods, and foundations of research appropriate to a respective disciplinary subject matter (Grondin 1994, 1). For example, in theology, Biblical hermeneutics concerns the general principles for the proper interpretation of the Bible. More recently, applied hermeneutics has been further developed as a research method for a number of disciplines (see, for example, Moules inter alia 2015).

Within philosophy, however, hermeneutics typically signifies, first, a disciplinary area and, second, the historical movement in which this area has been developed. As a disciplinary area, and on analogy with the designations of other disciplinary areas (such as ‘the philosophy of mind’ or ‘the philosophy of art’), hermeneutics might have been named ‘the philosophy of interpretation.’ Hermeneutics thus treats interpretation itself as its subject matter and not as an auxiliary to the study of something else. Philosophically, hermeneutics therefore concerns the meaning of interpretation—its basic nature, scope and validity, as well as its place within and implications for human existence; and it treats interpretation in the context of fundamental philosophical questions about being and knowing, language and history, art and aesthetic experience, and practical life.

1. Interpretive Experience

The topic of this article, then, is hermeneutics insofar as it is grasped as the philosophy of interpretation and as the historical movement associated with this area. In this, hermeneutics is concerned, first of all, to clarify and, in turn, to establish the scope and validity of interpretive experience.

1.1 Understanding as Educative

In hermeneutics, interpretive experience is typically clarified in reference to understanding. In this context, when we say that we understand, what we mean is that we have really gotten at something through an attempt at interpretation; and, when we say we do not understand, we mean that we have not really gotten anywhere at all with our interpretation. For this reason, understanding can be described as a ‘success’ of interpretation (even if, since Heidegger, understanding is more commonly described as a fulfillment, realization, or enactment). In hermeneutics, such success of understanding is not measured by norms and methods typical of the modern natural sciences and quantitative social sciences, such as whether our understanding derives from a repeatable experiment, nor by norms typical of much of modern philosophy, such as whether our understanding has indubitable epistemic foundations.

Now, philosophers associated with hermeneutics describe the success of understanding in a number of manners. However else the success of understanding is described, though, it is typically also described as edifying or educative. Indeed, Hans-Georg Gadamer, the philosopher perhaps most closely associated with hermeneutics in our times, closely connects interpretive experience with education. By education, he has in mind the concept of formation (Bildung) that had been developed in Weimar classicism and that continued to influence nineteenth-century romanticism and historicism in Germany (Truth and Method, Part I.1).[1] Education, as formation, involves more than the acquisition of expertise, knowledge, or information; it concerns the enlargement of our person through formal instruction, especially in the arts and humanities, as well as through extensive and variegated experience. Accordingly, the success of understanding is educative in that we learn from our interpretive experience, perhaps not only about a matter, but thereby also about ourselves, the world, and others.

That the success of understanding is educative in this manner can be clarified by an example, say, in reading a text such as Thucydides’ History of the Peloponnesian War. When we say that we understand this text, we mean that our attempts to interpret it (whether rigorously, as in scholarship, or more casually, as in evening reading) have gotten at something, perhaps: that in politics, prudent reasoning is not always persuasive enough to stem the tide of war. Certainly, we have not arrived at this understanding in result of repeatable scientific experiment or based on an indubitable epistemic foundation. But it is not for this reason any less educative. In this understanding, we have come to something that we can agree or disagree with, something that in any case expands or changes our views about the role of reason in politics (and no doubt then also of public discourse and the causes of war), and, finally, something that can also teach us something about ourselves and the world in which we find ourselves.

1.2 Against Foundationalism

Hermeneutics may be said to involve a positive attitude—at once epistemic, existential, and even ethical and political—toward the finitude of human understanding, that is, the fact that our understanding is time and again bested by the things we wish to grasp, that what we understand remains ineluctably incomplete, even partial, and open to further consideration. In hermeneutics, the concern is therefore not primarily to establish norms or methods which would purport to help us overcome or eradicate aspects of such finitude, but, instead, to recognize the consequences of our limits. Accordingly, hermeneutics affirms that we must remain ever vigilant about how common wisdom and prejudices inform—and can distort—our perception and judgment, that even the most established knowledge may be in need of reconsideration, and that this finitude of understanding is not simply a regrettable fact of the human condition but, more importantly, that this finitude is itself an important opening for the pursuit of new and different meaning. In view of this positive attitude toward the finitude of human understanding, it is no surprise that hermeneutics opposes foundationalism.

Hermeneutics opposes what can be described as the ‘vertical’ picture of knowledge at issue in epistemological foundationalism, focusing, instead, on the ‘circularity’ at issue in understanding. In epistemological foundationalism, our body of beliefs (or at least our justified beliefs) are sometimes said to have the structure of an edifice. Some beliefs are distinguished as foundations, ultimately, because they depend on no further beliefs for their justification; other beliefs are distinguished as founded, in that their justification depends on the foundational beliefs (Steup and Neta 2015, Section 4.1). This is a ‘vertical’ picture of human knowledge in that new beliefs build on established beliefs; new beliefs are justified on the basis of already justified beliefs, and these beliefs, in turn, are justified by still other beliefs, all the way down to the foundational beliefs. Inquiry, then, is an ‘upward’ pursuit, one that adds new ‘floors’ to the edifice of what we already know.

1.3 The Hermeneutical Circle

In hermeneutics, by contrast, the emphasis is on the ‘circularity’ of understanding. This emphasis is familiar from the concept of the hermeneutical circle. Central to hermeneutics, this concept is not only highly disputed but has also been developed in a number of distinct manners. Broadly, however, the concept of the hermeneutical circle signifies that, in interpretive experience, a new understanding is achieved not on the basis of already securely founded beliefs. Instead, a new understanding is achieved through renewed interpretive attention to further possible meanings of those presuppositions which, sometimes tacitly, inform the understanding that we already have.[2] Philosophers have described such hermeneutically circular presuppositions in different ways and, since Heidegger, especially in terms of presuppositions of the existential and historical contexts in which we find ourselves. This contemporary significance of hermeneutically circular presuppositions has origins in an older (and perhaps more commonly known) formulation, namely, that interpretive experience—classically, that of text interpretation—involves us in a circular relation of whole and parts. This formulation derives from antiquity and has a place in the approaches of nineteenth-century figures such as Schleiermacher and Dilthey. On the one hand, it is necessary to understand a text as a whole in order properly to understand any of its parts. On the other hand, however, it is necessary to understand the text in each of its parts in order to understand it as a whole.

In contemporary hermeneutics, the concept of the hermeneutical circle is rarely restricted to the context of text interpretation, and, too, the circularity of interpretive experience is not necessarily cast in terms of the relation of whole and parts. Nevertheless, as Grondin suggests, this older formulation can help to illustrate the circular character of interpretive experience (2016, 299). In text interpretation so conceived, our efforts to understand a text have no firm foundation from which to begin. Rather, these efforts unfold always in media res, through an interpretation of the whole of a text that proceeds from presuppositions about the parts; and, no less, through an interpretation of the parts that proceeds from presuppositions about the whole. Understanding, then, is not pursued ‘vertically’ by layering beliefs on top of foundations, but rather ‘circularly,’ in an interpretive movement back and forth through possible meanings of our presuppositions that by turns allow a matter to come into view. In this, the pursuit of understanding does not build ‘higher and higher;’ it goes ‘deeper and deeper,’ gets ‘fuller and fuller,’ or, perhaps ‘richer and richer.’

2. Hermeneutics as Historical Movement

Hermeneutics, taken as a historical movement, is informed by a longer history that dates back to antiquity. The modern history of hermeneutics originates with figures in nineteenth- and early twentieth-century German thought, especially Friedrich Schleiermacher and Wilhelm Dilthey. Contemporary hermeneutics is shaped, in turn, especially by Martin Heidegger and Hans-Georg Gadamer, as well as by Paul Ricoeur and others (see Palmer 1969, Grondin 1994, L. Schmidt 2006, Zimmerman 2015).

2.1 The Art of Interpretation

In accord with a common account of the modern historical origins of hermeneutics, recognizably philosophical contributions to hermeneutics originate with Friedrich Schleiermacher.[3] Closely associated with German romanticism, Schleiermacher developed his hermeneutics in the first decades of the nineteenth century. He proposes a universal hermeneutics that pertains to all linguistic experience, and not just to the interpretative concerns of specific disciplines (Scholtz 2015, 68). Schleiermacher characterizes hermeneutics as the art of interpretation, maintaining that this art is called for not simply to avoid misunderstandings in regard to otherwise readily intelligible discourses. Rather, the art of interpretation is necessary for discourses, paradigmatically written texts, in regard to which our interpretive experience begins in misunderstanding (Schleiermacher, “Outline,” §§ 15–16). Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics is multifaceted but keyed to the idea that the success of understanding depends on the successful interpretation of two sides of a discourse, the ‘grammatical’ and ‘psychological’ (Schleiermacher, “Outline,” §§ 5–6). By the ‘grammatical’ side, he means the contributions to the meaning of the discourse dependent on the general structure of the language it uses. By the ‘psychological’ side, he has in view the contributions to the meaning of the discourse dependent on the individual author’s or creator’s mind. Whereas the ‘grammatical’ side of a discourse is a matter of general linguistic structures, the ‘psychological’ side finds expression in linguistic forms that would traditionally be associated with style.

Schleiermacher indicates that discourses can be differentiated by whether they are predominated by the ‘grammatical’ or ‘psychological’ and he develops methodological considerations appropriate to these sides. At the same time, though, he recognizes that the interpretation of each side is reciprocally informed by the other (see Schleiermacher, “Outline,” § 11, § 12). Interpretation aims at the “reconstruction” of the meaning of a discourse, but, in this, the task is “to understand the discourse just as well or even better than its creator,” a task which, accordingly, is “infinite” (Schleiermacher, “Outline,” § 18).

2.2 Justification of the Human Sciences

The history of the modern origins of hermeneutics includes distinctive contributions by Wilhelm Dilthey. Whereas Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics is closely associated with German romanticism, Dilthey’s considerations may be grasped in connection with historicism. ‘Historicism’ refers to a nineteenth- and early twentieth-century intellectual movement that no longer treated “human nature, morality, and reason as absolute, eternal, and universal,” but sought, instead, to grasp these as “relative, changing and particular,” shaped by historical context (Beiser 2011, 1). Dilthey’s overall (though never completed) project was to establish a critique of historical reason that would secure independent epistemological foundations of research in the human sciences, that is, the sciences distinguished by their focus on historical experience (Grondin 1994, 84–90; Bambach 1995, 127–185; Makkreel 2015). In this, Dilthey’s concern is to defend the legitimacy of the human sciences against charges either that their legitimacy remains dependent on norms and methods of the natural sciences or, to his mind worse, that they lack the kind of legitimacy found in the natural sciences altogether.

Dilthey associates the purpose of the human sciences not with the explanation of ‘outer’ experience, but, instead, with the understanding of ‘lived experience’ (Erlebnis). In an important essay, “The Rise of Hermeneutics,” Dilthey affirms that the understanding achieved in the human sciences involves interpretation. But this means that hermeneutics, grasped as the theory of the universal validity of interpretation, does more than lay out the rules of successful interpretive practice. Hermeneutics clarifies the validity of the research conducted in the human sciences. Indeed, he ventures that the “main purpose” of hermeneutics is “to preserve the general validity of interpretation against the inroads of romantic caprice and skeptical subjectivity, and to give a theoretical justification of such validity, upon which all the certainty of historical knowledge is founded” (Dilthey, “The Rise of Hermeneutics,” Section V).

While Schleiermacher and Dilthey are central for the modern historical origins of hermeneutics, hermeneutics has also been shaped by contributions from other figures, such as Friedrich Ast. And hermeneutics has also been influenced by ideas about meaning, history, and language developed in the period by figures such as Johann Gottfried Herder, Wilhelm von Humboldt, and Friedrich Schlegel (see Grondin 1994; Rush 2020).

2.3 Contemporary Hermeneutics

Contemporary hermeneutics is demarcated from the modern historical origins of hermeneutics by the influence of a new use Heidegger makes of hermeneutics in his early phenomenological inquiries into human existence. In turn, contemporary hermeneutics remains largely shaped by Hans-Georg Gadamer’s ‘philosophical hermeneutics,’ which he describes as an attempt further to develop and expand on Heidegger’s influential breakthrough. Contemporary hermeneutics also receives contour from Paul Ricoeur’s contributions to hermeneutics, from philosophical controversies with critical theory and deconstruction, and from the emergence of postmodern hermeneutics. Further developments include innovations in hermeneutics made by some philosophers in the Anglo-American tradition and the development of hermeneutics in ethical and political philosophy. Most recently, further developments include a renewal of interest in normative dimensions of interpretive experience, and responses in hermeneutics to a recent rise of interest in realism.

3. Hermeneutics and Existence

The principal impetus for contemporary hermeneutics, then, is a new use Heidegger makes of hermeneutics in his early phenomenological inquiries into what, in Being and Time, he calls the ‘being’ or also, the ‘existentiality,’ of human ‘existence’ (Heidegger, Being and Time, § 7, section C). Heidegger’s philosophy is oriented by the question of the meaning, or, sense of being (die Frage nach dem Sinn des Seins), but as he argues in Being and Time, inquiry into this question itself begins with inquiry into the sense in which human beings can be said to be or exist (Heidegger, Being and Time, §§ 1–4). Heidegger defines inquiry into the sense of the being of human existence as hermeneutical, that is, as a matter of self-interpretation. Within this context, Heidegger leaves behind the idea that hermeneutics is primarily concerned with the methods or foundations of research in the arts and humanities. Rather, as he argues, such hermeneutical research is itself only possible because human beings are, in their very being, interpretive. For Heidegger, understanding is a mode or possibility of human existence, and, indeed, one that is projective, oriented toward the interpretive possibilities available to us in the situations in which we find ourselves (see especially Heidegger, Being and Time, §§ 31–32). Accordingly, inquiry into the sense of the being of human existence is enacted in our own attempts to understand our own being, as we may interpret our being through the course of our affairs.

Heidegger’s use of hermeneutics in the context of his early phenomenological inquiries into human existence can be described as a breakthrough in the historical movement of hermeneutics (Gadamer, Truth and Method, Part II.3). But Heidegger’s considerations also continue to be a subject of considerable discussion, and his insights remain at issue, to a greater or lesser degree, in a range of current philosophers and debates. Heidegger’s later works are important for hermeneutical considerations of history, language, art, poetry, and translation, as well. As Heidegger develops, however, he comes to claim that his paths of thinking can no longer be served by hermeneutics, and his thought comes to be characterized by new and different orientations.

3.1 The Hermeneutics of Facticity

Heidegger clarifies the role played by hermeneutics in his early phenomenological inquiries into human existence through a critical reconsideration of Husserl’s classical phenomenology, or more specifically, a critical reconsideration of the aspects of Husserl’s phenomenology that rely on his transcendental and eidetic methods.[4] In this, Heidegger opposes his own ‘hermeneutical’ phenomenology against Husserl’s ‘transcendental’ approach.

Husserl’s phenomenology is guided by epistemological considerations, and his principal concern is to find a priori foundations for research in the sciences. Husserl believes that modern science, despite all methodological and technological sophistication, has failed to account for the basic epistemic foundation on which it relies. He maintains that this foundation may be discerned in consciousness—not, however, in any factual consciousness or ego, but rather in the transcendental ego and its a priori eidetic structures. He argues that phenomenological inquiry into these structures proceeds methodologically on the basis of what he refers to as the ‘epoché.’ The epoché is a universal suspension of the ‘natural attitude,’ that is, belief in the existence of objects. The epoché thereby allows us to redirect our awareness to objects in their appearance as such. In contrast with Cartesian methodological doubt, the epoché is not a doubt about the existence of mind-independent reality, but, instead, a ‘bracketing’ of our belief in existence that frees us to focus on a priori eidetic structures of appearance (see, for example, Husserl, Ideas I, §§ 27–32).

Heidegger’s critical reconsideration of Husserl’s phenomenology is guided not by epistemological concerns, but, instead, fundamental ontological ones. Heidegger agrees with Husserl that modern science has failed to account for the grounds on which it relies, and he also turns to phenomenology in order to bring these grounds into focus. Yet, Heidegger believes that phenomenology concerns an origin much deeper than consciousness, the transcendental ego, and its eidetic structures. For him, phenomenology contributes to ontology, first of all, by bringing into focus the being, or, ontological structures, that comprise human existence itself. For the early Heidegger, these structures involve what he calls ‘facticity.’ By this, he does not mean that human existence is a fact. Rather, he means that the ontological structures that comprise human existence are found not in consciousness, but, instead, in our being in the world—or, as he determines this terminologically, being-in-the-world (in-der-Welt-sein) (Heidegger, Being and Time, § 12 ff.). Thus, our attempts to understand ourselves (or, for that matter, to understand anything else) remain bound by structures of being in the world. Specifically, our attempts to understand ourselves (or anything else) remain conditioned by pre-structures that determine in advance which possibilities of a situation we find significant, and by moods that determine in advance our attunement to a situation we are “thrown” into, that is, a situation that affects us even though we have not chosen to be in it (Heidegger, Being and Time, §§ 28–34).

Heidegger, on the basis of his consideration of the facticity of human existence, concludes that it would be a fool’s errand for phenomenological inquiry to proceed on the basis of Husserl’s epoché. After all, the epoché merely allows us to reflect on a priori eidetic structures of consciousness, when what we should be after are structures of our being in the world. Heidegger argues that phenomenological inquiry should begin instead with consideration of these structures of being in the world as they come into view through our own individual involvement in the world. Heidegger’s phenomenology proves to be self-interpretation, as it seeks to clarify the structure of being in the world on the basis of nothing else than our own individual experience of being in the world. Thus, phenomenology unfolds as the explication of the structures of being in the world that, initially at least, we experience more or less vaguely, more or less tacitly, in our own everyday involvements with things and others. In Heidegger’s critical reconsideration of Husserl’s phenomenology, hermeneutics is a possibility of human existence itself and, indeed, a possibility that aims at our explication of ourselves in our very existence.

3.2 Difficulties of Self-Interpretation

Heidegger maintains that such self-interpretation of existence is fraught with difficulties. One reason, he believes, is that structures of being in the world are made inconspicuous by the very involvement in the world that they enable. He famously makes this case in the course of his phenomenological considerations of the way we find human existence “initially and for the most part,” namely, in the undifferentiated “averageness” of everyday existence (Heidegger, Being and Time, 43; § 20). In this averageness of everyday existence, Heidegger argues, the structure of the world is given through the purposes we have, the referential relations that comprise the situations in which we attempt to realize these ends, and the things we employ in the service of these ends. In the averageness of everyday existence, our access to this structure is granted not through reflection on it but, instead, through our ordinary affairs, as we cognize the structure indirectly through the things (Zeuge, useful things or tools) that we employ to carry out our projects (Heidegger, Being and Time, §§ 14–18; see also Heidegger, Ontology, § 20). Yet, as he argues, in this form of cognizance, “circumspection” (Umsicht), the structure of the world itself recedes from view precisely by our absorption in those projects (Heidegger, Being and Time, 69).

Heidegger maintains that the self-interpretation of existence is made difficult, moreover, because being in the world always also entails being with others. In this, Heidegger argues that in the averageness of everyday existence, we tend to interpret ourselves not by what differentiates us from others, but, instead, by what can be attributed indifferently to anyone. Such interpretations may be attractive because accessible to anyone, but they come at the price of being distorting and reductive. In the averageness of everyday existence, the sense of self that comes into focus through self-interpretation is not a self in its singular possibilities to be. It is rather a sense of self characterized by circumscribed possibilities, which, for Heidegger, finds expression in the pronoun ‘they,’ or ‘one’ (das Man)—so that we interpret our own possibilities restrictively in terms of what ‘one’ thinks, what ‘one’ does, and no more (see Heidegger Being and Time, § 27; see also Heidegger, Ontology, § 6).

Another, related difficulty of self-interpretation concerns the historical transmission of interpretations. In this, Heidegger maintains that, as interpretations of existence are passed down from tradition, the “original sources” of concrete, existential concern, come to be covered over (Heidegger, Ontology, 59). Indeed, for this reason, Heidegger calls for a “destruction” or, perhaps, ‘de-structuration’ (Destruktion) of interpretations of being and the being of existence that have been passed down from the history of Western philosophy (see Heidegger, Being and Time, §6). This, to be sure, is a call that has important implications for the study of the history of philosophy, one that has been influential for philosophers such as Jacques Derrida, John Sallis, and Claudia Baracchi.

4. Contemporary Hermeneutics

Contemporary hermeneutics is largely shaped by Hans-Georg Gadamer’s ‘philosophical hermeneutics.’ Gadamer’s approach is guided by the insight that the success of understanding involves a distinctive experience of truth. Consider, once more, the example of coming to understand something through an interpretation of Thucydides’ History of the Peloponnesian War, namely, that in politics, prudent reasoning is not always persuasive enough to stem the tide of war. When I come to understand this, so goes Gadamer’s insight, I experience what I understand not simply as a novel or enriching idea. Rather, I experience what I have understood as something that makes a claim to be true. Thus, to understand something means to understand something as true. The chief issue of Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics is to clarify that such a hermeneutical experience of truth is not only valid in its own right, but that it is distinct from, and even more original than, the sense of truth at issue in knowledge secured through the norms and methods of modern science. Indeed, it is precisely this concern that Gadamer’s title of his magnum opus is meant to evoke: his philosophical hermeneutics focuses on a hermeneutical experience of truth that cannot be derived from scientific method.

4.1 Humanism and Art

The point de départ for Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics is the concern that the success of the scientific method has alienated us from the validity of the truth at issue in interpretive experience. Philosophical hermeneutics therefore begins with an attempt to recover the sense of truth at issue in interpretive experience by focusing our attention on motifs from the tradition of humanism and on the ontology of art. Gadamer’s considerations of motifs from the tradition of humanism are oriented by Weimar classicism and its legacy in nineteenth-century German intellectual life. His account helps us to recover the validity of an experience of truth that is not measured by scientific method but that, instead, depends on our education, grasped as formation (Bildung) through formal education and experience, as well as the concordant cultivation of capacities, such as common sense (sensus communis), judgment, and taste (Gadamer, Truth and Method, Part I.1.B).

Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics upholds that the primary example of the hermeneutical experience of truth is found in our encounters with art. Gadamer believes this becomes clear once we overcome modern assumptions about the subjectivity of aesthetic experience, in which the being of art is reduced to that of an immediately present object that, in turn, has the property of producing affects, such as aesthetic pleasure, in a subject. In his hermeneutics, by contrast, the being of art is rather a matter of a realization or “enactment” (Vollzug) that we participate in (Gadamer, Truth and Method, 103). The experience of an artwork unfolds as an event of interpretation that, when it is a success, allows us to recognize something that purports or claims to be true.

In Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics, the treatment of the experience of art is expansive, but a synopsis of his definitive formulation from Truth and Method is instructive. Gadamer, first, introduces the theme of ‘play,’ or, of the ‘game’ (Spiel) to emphasize that the experience of art is an event of interpretation that exceeds the subjective intentions or interests of those involved in it (Gadamer, Truth and Method, Part I.II.1.A). Insofar as we agree to play a game, we give ourselves over to the context of meaning that comprises the game. We allow ourselves to be oriented by the norms that govern, and thus enable but never determine, thoughts and actions appropriate to the playing of the game. Likewise, when we participate in an experience of an artwork, we give ourselves over to the context of meaning that comprises the work, and, thus, allow our interpretive experience to be governed by the limits and possibilities of interpretation appropriate to the work. When we experience a performance of Athol Fugard, John Kani, and Winston Ntshona’s The Island, for example, we allow our interpretive experience to be governed by limits and possibilities of interpretation that have to do with apartheid-era South Africa, Robben Island Prison, and parallels with Sophocles’ Antigone.

Gadamer maintains that in our experience of art, such play culminates in what he calls ‘transformation into structure.’ By this, he means that our experience of art comes to be that of a work, grasped in its ‘ideality’ or meaningfulness, in distinction from the activities involved in its presentation (such as the activity of actors presenting a drama). With our experience of such a ‘transformation into structure,’ the work of art allows us to recognize something as true (Gadamer, Truth and Method, Part I.II.1.B). He describes this interpretive experience of truth as a process of mediation, by which a claim of truth at issue in an artwork comes into view through the repeated projection and supersession of inadequate interpretations, until such mediation becomes sufficient, or ‘total.’ There is, as anyone who has experienced an artwork will confirm, no method to ensure the success of this process of repeated projection and supersession; it depends on the quality of our interpretive work, and, this quality can be enlarged by our formation of our capacities such as common sense, judgment, and taste.

4.2 Tradition and Prejudice

Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics proceeds on the basis of these considerations of humanism and art as an attempt to establish the essential elements of the hermeneutical experience of truth.[5] In this, the hermeneutical experience of truth is conditioned by tradition and language.

The claim that the hermeneutical experience of truth is conditioned by tradition is not reducible to historicism or the historicist project of determining, say, what an artist or an author took to be true through a reconstruction of the historical context of the artwork or text under consideration. Quite to the contrary, the hermeneutical experience of truth concerns something that holds true for our own existence. Rather, then, the hermeneutical experience of truth is conditioned by tradition in the sense that it is limited and made possible by the historical transmission of meaning. The claim that the hermeneutical experience of truth is conditioned by tradition stresses the sense of the etymological origins of the word ‘tradition’ in the Latin trāditiōn- (stem of trāditiō), a handing over, delivery or handing down of knowledge (OED 2020, “tradition, n.”). This claim also stresses the sense of Gadamer’s German term for tradition, Überlieferung, which, translated literally, means a ‘delivering over.’ In this, the hermeneutical experience of truth involves belonging to a historical tradition. Contrary to a common misconception of Gadamerian philosophical hermeneutics, traditions are not monoliths. Traditions are more like processes—idiomatic, dynamic, and evolving—that, to borrow from Whitman, “contain multitudes” (Whitman, Song of Myself, Sec. 51). Accordingly, to belong to a tradition is not first to possess an identity derived from a cultural or ethnic heritage; it is, rather, to be a participant in a movement of handing down, delivering over.

In Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics, the hermeneutical experience of truth, as conditioned by tradition, is thus a matter of prejudice. Gadamer clarifies the meaning of ‘prejudice’ in reference to the early Heidegger. Gadamer agrees with Heidegger that human existence is characterized by facticity, so that understanding, or, our projection of possibilities, is oriented by ‘pre-structures’ that are a matter of thrownness. Yet, such ‘pre-structures’ are best described as ‘prejudices’ because they concern more than the individual situations that comprise our existence. These ‘pre-structures’ are shaped by the larger context of historically inherited meanings that remain operative, or, in effect, in such situations of our individual existence in the first place (Gadamer, Truth and Method, Part II.II.1.A).

Tradition, so conceived, proves to be a legitimate source of authority for the hermeneutical experience of truth. Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics thus comprises a counterpoint to the rejection of the authority of tradition in modern science. Gadamer associates this rejection above all with the “prejudice against prejudice” developed in the European Enlightenment (Gadamer, Truth and Method, 270). In this, the motto of the Enlightenment is that we should think for ourselves, basing our beliefs in our own use of reason and not the authority of tradition, whether this authority is conceived in terms of superstition, religious or aristocratic rule, or custom. Gadamer recognizes that the Enlightenment charge to think for ourselves is legitimate, but he does not believe it follows from this that tradition cannot be a source of truth. He writes,

The Enlightenment’s distinction between faith in authority and using one’s own reason is, in itself, legitimate. If the prestige of authority displaces one’s own judgment, then authority is in fact a source of prejudices. But this does not preclude its being a source of truth, and that is what the Enlightenment failed to see when it denigrated all authority (Gadamer, Truth and Method, 279).

In Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics, the experience of truth does not demand that we liberate ourselves from the authority of tradition, but, on the contrary, recognizes tradition as a possible source of our claims of truth. To be sure, tradition is not therefore a foundation of claims to truth. Tradition is, after all, a process of transmission, which is ultimately “ungroundable” and “underivable” (Gadamer, Truth and Method, 254, translation modified).[6] Yet, even if it is not a foundation, tradition is a legitimate interpretive wellspring, in the sense that it makes possible and shapes all understanding.

4.3 Normative Implications

The hermeneutical experience of truth is, therefore, governed by the “principle of history of effect” (Gadamer, Truth and Method, Part II.II.B.iv). This means that our attempts to understand are always guided more by tradition, and thus prejudice, than we are able to make explicit to ourselves. This principle, as Gadamer maintains, has important normative implications for interpretive experience. These implications follow from the fact that it is impossible to become completely self-conscious of the prejudices operative in our attempts to understand. As Gadamer puts the point in an ontological register, “to be historically means that knowledge of oneself can never be complete” (Gadamer, Truth and Method, 302). Because of this, the experience of truth leads not to self-certainty, but to the insight that we should proceed always with a Delphic self-knowledge of our limits.

Such Delphic self-knowledge should carry over to our assessment of knowledge secured by modern science, as well. For, as Gadamer puts the point, “when a naïve faith in scientific method denies the existence of effective history, there can be an actual deformation of knowledge” (Gadamer, Truth and Method, 301). This is evident first of all from the humanistic study of the history of science. After all, knowledge based on the best results of science today may well have the same fate as the discredited scientific knowledge of past times. It is also evident that we should carry over Delphic self-knowledge to our assessment of scientific knowledge from the fact that scientific inquiry is always guided by more prejudice than can be kept in check by any method: for example, in the selection of research questions, in hypothesis formation, and in any number of metaphysical (or other) assumptions tacitly or unconsciously used to characterize objects of inquiry.

Gadamer maintains that the normative implications of the ‘principle of history of effect’ mean that in our interpretive experience, we should attempt always to expand our horizons. By horizon, Gadamer has in mind the “range” of our capacity to understand (Gadamer, Truth and Method, 302), as this is made possible and limited by the breadth and depth of what we have already come to understand in our lives. In this concept of horizon, it is not difficult to hear the echo of the humanistic sensibility that interpretive experience is educative. Our horizon is the formation we have achieved through our interpretive experience, both from our formal education and from our life-experience. Thus, the normative demand of interpretive experience is always to become more educated.

Gadamer describes the expansion of our horizons as a “fusion of horizons” (Gadamer, Truth and Method, 306). This term is perhaps misleading, however, because it can be mistaken to signify that an interpreter has a distinct ‘horizon’ that is then expanded through the assimilation of another distinct horizon, say, that of a text we are interpreting. Really, though, what Gadamer means is that in interpretive experience, our attempts to understand can and should lead us to recognize that our own horizon is not as insular or narrow as we first thought. Rather, we can and should come to recognize that our horizon belongs to a larger context of the historical transmission of meaning, so that when we come to understand something, we are thereby raised “to a higher level of universality that overcomes not only our own particularity but also that of the other” (Gadamer, Truth and Method, 305). In this, ‘fusion’ signifies something closer to the verbal form of Gadamer’s Verschmelzung, that is verschmeltzen, to melt together. We expand our horizons through interpretive experience that melts away at the rigidity of our horizon, so that we can see how it melts into and mixes with a larger movement of transmission.

4.4 Language

The hermeneutical experience of truth is conditioned by not only tradition but also language. In Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics, the relation of truth to language is described in reference to being. Gadamer expresses this relation in a celebrated motto, “being that can be understood is language” (Gadamer, Truth and Method, 474).[7] According to this motto, language is primarily a ‘medium’ that shows us the being, or meaningful order, of the world and the things we encounter in it (Gadamer, Truth and Method, Part III.1).[8] Thus, language is only secondarily an instrument that we use, among other things, to represent something, communicate about it, or make assertions about it. The experience of language as a medium takes place in what Gadamer calls “hermeneutical conversation” (Gadamer, Truth and Method, 388). The primary example of such hermeneutical conversation is a conversation between interlocutors about something; but, he believes that hermeneutical conversation also includes all interpretive experience, so that the interpretation of artworks and texts is conceived as a conversation between the interpreter and work about the subject matter of the work. In hermeneutical conversation, interlocutors may, of course, use language to represent, communicate or make assertions. More originally, however, hermeneutical conversation concerns the being of the matter under consideration. Hermeneutical conversation is thus an event of interlocution that aims to show something in its being, as it genuinely or truly is.

The hermeneutical experience of truth can be described as the success of conversation so conceived. But, in this, truth is not experienced as a matter of “correctness,” or as this may be clarified, a matter of correct predication (Gadamer, Truth and Method, 406). In the experience of truth as correct predication, truth is typically conceived as the property of a proposition, statement or utterance that suitably connects a subject with a predicate. In the hermeneutical experience of truth, by contrast, the concern is not with predication, that is, the connection of a subject with a predicate, but, instead, with conversation, grasped as an event of interlocution concerned with the being of a subject itself. In such a conversation, truth is reached, if it is reached, not when a subject is suitably connected with something else, but, instead, when the subject is sufficiently shown in its own being, as it truly is. The measure of such sufficiency is established not in advance, but is achieved in the course of conversation along with the claim of truth that it measures.

Philosophical hermeneutics maintains that the experience of truth as correct predication is dependent on the hermeneutical experience of truth. This is because in truth as correctness, the proper connection of subject and predicate depends in part on the being of the subject. In predication, the being of the subject is typically either left out of account or is presumed already to be determined or interpreted. But, the being of the subject—what it truly is—is a matter of interpretation. In illustration, we may consider the fictional conversation presented by Plato in the Republic among Socrates, Glaucon and other interlocutors about justice. In conclusion of our interpretive experience, we may assert the proposition, ‘justice is nearly impossible to achieve!’ But, whether this is so will depend on the being of justice, and the truth of the being of justice will depend, in turn, on an interpretation of it, whether we derive it from Plato’s text or otherwise. Truth as correctness, then, depends on the hermeneutical experience of truth, and such truth, in turn, is a matter of interpretation.

Finally, in Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics, it is claimed that the hermeneutical experience of truth is ‘universal.’ This does not mean that the hermeneutical experience of truth takes place every time we converse about something. Rather, it means that the hermeneutical experience of truth remains always a problem, whenever we wish to understand something, and even when a conversation culminates in an experience of truth. Each hermeneutical experience of truth remains open to further interpretation (see Gadamer, “The Universality of the Hermeneutical Problem”).

5. Symbol, Metaphor, and Narrative

Contemporary hermeneutics receives further contour from Paul Ricoeur’s considerations of language, and especially of linguistic forms such as symbolism, metaphor, and narrative. Ricoeur takes orientation from the claim of the early Heidegger’s hermeneutical phenomenology that self-understanding is, in the end, to be grasped in ontological terms: self-understanding is the self-interpretation of human existence, grasped as the enactment of the distinctive possibility of such existence. Ricoeur, however, proposes a hermeneutical phenomenology that, as he puts it in an important early essay, ‘grafts’ hermeneutics to phenomenology in a different manner than Heidegger proposes (Ricoeur, “Existence and Hermeneutics,” 6). Heidegger believes that for the self-interpretation of human existence, the interpretations of the human condition found in the human sciences are derivative; what is called for is an analysis of the sense of being, or, the structures, of human existence as these are disclosed through our own individual being in the world. Ricoeur criticizes Heidegger’s proposal as a “short route,” or perhaps better, short cut, that bypasses the significance for our self-interpretation of the multiple and even conflicting interpretations of the human condition found in other disciplines and areas of philosophy (Ricoeur, “Existence and Hermeneutics,” 6). He proposes, instead, a hermeneutical phenomenology that embraces a “long route” of self-interpretation, one that is mediated by passing through hermeneutical considerations of these multiple and conflicting interpretations (Ricoeur, “Existence and Hermeneutics,” 6).

Ricoeur’s contributions are notoriously difficult to reduce to a specific position or otherwise categorize, in part because he practiced what he preached. In his career, his route to self-understanding was influenced by reflexive philosophy, Husserl and Heidegger, French structuralism, as well as by contemporary Anglo-American philosophy (see Ricoeur “On Interpretation,” 12–15). Moreover, his inquiries range over topics in areas as diverse as religion, anthropology, psychology, history, and literature. His contributions to hermeneutics are perhaps especially characterized, however, by the concern for possibilities of the mediating role of language to establish critical distance in interpretive experience and by his focus on the significance of interpretive experience for ethical and political agency.

In an early formulation of what he has in mind by the hermeneutical ‘long route’ to self-understanding, Ricoeur maintains that the pursuit of self-understanding has to be mediated by hermeneutical considerations of semantic structures of interpretation that are common to research across the human sciences (Ricoeur, “Existence and Hermeneutics,” 11). In this, Ricoeur’s approach is “organized around the central theme of meaning with multiple or multivocal senses…” or, what he calls “symbolic senses” (Ricoeur, “Existence and Hermeneutics,” 11). This involves a novel conception of interpretation itself. Traditionally in hermeneutics, the purpose of interpretation is thought of as making apparent the single, unitary meaning of something. Ricoeur, by contrast, stresses that the aim of interpretation also includes making apparent the plurality of meanings at issue in a speech act or text. He writes, “Interpretation…is the work of thought which consists in deciphering the hidden meaning in the apparent meaning, in unfolding levels of meaning implied in the literal meaning” (Ricoeur, “Existence and Hermeneutics,” 13).

Ricoeur explains that the itinerary of the hermeneutical long route to self-understanding passes through an analysis of a broad range of symbolic forms, such as the “cosmic” symbolism revealed by the phenomenology of religion, the symbolic character of “desire” revealed by psychoanalysis, and the symbolic forms revealed by the study of literature and the arts (Ricoeur, “Existence and Hermeneutics,” 13). In his Freud and Philosophy: An Essay on Interpretation, Ricoeur describes Freud, along with Nietzsche and Marx, as a master of the ‘hermeneutics of suspicion.’ In this, interpretation, as a ‘deciphering of hidden meaning in the apparent meaning,’ takes on a critical function through the exposure of repressed or distorted meaning that lies beneath the surface of commonly accepted meaning.

Later in his career, Ricoeur’s considerations of the hermeneutical long route to self-understanding shift attention from a semantics of symbols to considerations of metaphor and especially narrative. Ricoeur’s considerations of metaphor build from the claim that metaphor should be grasped not first as the substitution of one conventional name for a different one, but, instead, as a “peculiar predication,” one “consisting in the attribution to logical subjects of predicates that are incompossible with them” (Ricoeur, “On Interpretation,” 8). Crucial for Ricoeur is that metaphorical predication thus not only concerns what Frege called ‘sense’ but also ‘reference.’ Metaphors are linguistic innovations that allow us to refer to aspects of reality for which words are otherwise unavailable (Ricoeur, “On Interpretation,” 10).

Ricoeur maintains that narrative, too, concerns both sense and reference, but on a different scale. By narrative, he has in mind “the diverse forms and modes of the game of storytelling” (Ricoeur, “On Interpretation,” 2) and in his three-volume treatise Time and Narrative, he focuses on the role of narrative not only in literary fiction but also in the recounting of history. He argues that while there are a diversity of forms and modes of narrative, all narratives nevertheless perform a common function, namely, they mark, organize, and clarify temporal experience (Ricoeur, “On Interpretation,” 2). In this, he claims that in narrative the work of such schematization of temporal experience is achieved by the composition of the plot, or, emplotment. Through narrative emplotment, we make apparent the meaning of persons, relations, and events that comprise human affairs—say, in fiction, those that can happen, and in history, those that have happened. Crucial for Ricoeur is that narrative emplotment is referential; as he makes the point in regard to fiction, “the plots we invent help us to shape our confused, formless, and in the last resort mute temporal experience” (Ricoeur, “On Interpretation,” 6).

Ricoeur maintains, however, that the referential function of narrative is not simply to assert something about the world but has implications for ethical and political life. In fiction, narrative emplotment not only helps us evaluate the meaning of human actions, but, moreover, contributes to the creation of “the horizon of a new relating that we may call a world” (Ricoeur, “On Interpretation,” 10; see also Ricoeur, “Imagination in Discourse and Action”). In so doing, fiction refers to possibilities of reality that can orient our agency and contribute to our efforts to reshape reality.

6. Philosophical Controversies

The development of hermeneutics since Gadamer forwarded his ‘philosophical hermeneutics’ in Truth and Method has been fostered by philosophical controversies about the consequences of his project. The most significant of these controversies are about the consequences of philosophical hermeneutics in relation to critical theory and to deconstruction.[9] Although philosophical interest in these controversies is extensive, in each case, discussion arises in close connection with Gadamer himself. In the case of the controversy in relation to critical theory, discussion originates between Jürgen Habermas and Gadamer over the problem of critique, or, more specifically, the critique of ideology. In the case of the controversy in relation to deconstruction, discussion originates between Jacques Derrida and Gadamer. While this discussion is itself layered and gives rise to new questions over time, it concerns, in part, the question of whether the success of understanding genuinely achieves a determination of meaning.

Gadamer’s engagements with Habermas and Derrida themselves are sometimes hailed as examples, or perhaps case studies, of his own conception of hermeneutical conversation. Gadamer has claimed that such conversation proceeds always from “recognizing in advance the possibility that your partner is right, even recognizing the possible superiority of your partner” (Gadamer, “Reflections on My Philosophical Journey,” 36). Gadamer famously puts this belief into practice in his discussions with both Habermas and Derrida, and the legacy of these debates plays an important role in Gadamer’s subsequent thinking.

6.1 Hermeneutics and Critical Theory

One important controversy about the consequences of Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics, then, concerns whether it offers a basis for the critique of ideology. This concern is raised with emphasis by the critical theorist Jürgen Habermas. Habermas, building on Hegel, Marx and Engels, as well as his original theory of recognition and communication, maintains that an ideology is a nexus of political doctrines, beliefs, and attitudes that distort the political realities they purport to describe. Accordingly, ideologies reinforce equally distorted power relations that, in turn, prevent the openness of discussion that is necessary for legitimate democratic political deliberation and decision-making (see Sypnowich 2019, Sec. 2). In view of this, one purpose of critical theory is to establish a basis to critique ideology. Habermas and other critical theorists sought a basis of critique with the ability to expose even some of our most cherished political doctrines, beliefs, and attitudes as ideological distortions that result from forms of domination passed down from tradition.

Habermas raises the objection against Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics that the hermeneutical experience of truth offers too little basis for such critique (see Habermas, “The Universality Claim of Hermeneutics”).[10] Habermas raises the objection that philosophical hermeneutics, with its adherence to the authority of tradition, leaves no room for the critique of ideologies entrenched in the historically transmitted prejudices on which our experience of truth relies. Moreover, as we might accordingly worry, what Gadamer describes as the hermeneutical experience of truth might not be an experience of truth at all, but, rather, a distorted communication that is complicit in ideology, since the so-called truth results from a conversation that might not be open, but oriented by prejudices that reinforce relations of domination.

While the influence of Habermas’s objection is extensive, Gadamer has mounted rejoinders on behalf of his philosophical hermeneutics (see “Reply to My Critics”; see also “What is Practice? The Conditions of Social Reason”). The thrust of Gadamer’s argument is, first, that it is actually Habermas’s position, not his own, that remains uncritical, since it is naïve to believe in the possibility of a basis of critique that is somehow not subject to the authority of tradition. And, Gadamer stresses, second, that the hermeneutical experience of truth is no blind acceptance of the authority of tradition. Rather, as he argues, interpretive experience remains critical, in that such experience unfolds precisely though the questioning of our prejudices, and judgment about what aspects of our prejudices remain valid and which have become invalid for matters of concern to us now.

6.2 Hermeneutics and Deconstruction

A further important controversy about the consequences of Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics arises in the context of Derrida’s project of deconstruction. While the relation between hermeneutics and deconstruction is complex, pivotal for the controversy is whether the success of understanding really achieves a determinate meaning. Gadamer, as we have seen, maintains that the success of understanding is to understand something in its being, as it genuinely or truly is. Moreover, we experience such a truth as a claim, one that we can agree or disagree with, and that purports to be justified by the interpretive experience which first gives rise to it. Yet, as we may now observe, Gadamer’s notion of the success of understanding thereby trusts in the authenticity of our own experience that we really have come to understand something determinate, or, in any case, determinate enough that it makes a claim of truth. Derrida’s deconstruction poses a challenge to this idea because Derrida argues that discursive experience is governed by an operation—or, perhaps better, a structure of inoperativity—that would preclude the possibility of understanding something with such determinacy (see Lawlor 2019).

Derrida clarifies the character of this structure of inoperativity in terms of a number of concepts over the course of his career, but perhaps none are more influential than that of “différance” (see Derrida, “Différance”). Derrida describes différance as a twofold structure of difference and deferral. Building on terms from Saussure’s linguistics, différance thus indicates, first of all, that in discursive experience, determining the meaning of something remains beyond our reach because linguistic signs present what they are supposed to signify never per se but always only heterogeneously through signifiers. And différance indicates, furthermore, that since this heterogeneity cannot be superseded, our attempts to determine the meaning of something remain interminably in deferral (Derrida, “Différance”). Because discursive experience is thus imbued with heterogeneity, our attempts to determine the meaning of something are not fully under our control but, instead, remain subject to a free play of signs (see Derrida, “Différance,” “Structure, Sign and Play”).

Derrida’s deconstruction poses a challenge to Gadamer’s notion of the success of understanding as a hermeneutical experience of truth. Gadamer, as we have said, trusts that our experience of truth really involves a determinate claim. Derrida’s considerations suggest, however, that such trust is misplaced. If, in the success of understanding, our experience purports to involve a determinate claim to truth, then our experience of this determinacy must be misguided, since the possibility of determinacy is precluded in advance by différance. As Derrida puts the point during the 1981 initial meeting with Gadamer, “I am not convinced that we ever really have this experience that Professor Gadamer describes, of knowing in a dialogue that one has been perfectly understood or experiencing the success of confirmation” (Derrida, “Three Questions to Hans-Georg Gadamer,” 54). Indeed, in an important early essay, Derrida maintains that the pursuit of success of such a kind is not merely misguided, but a symptom of our suppression, perhaps repression, of an anxiety about the insuperable role of heterogeneity involved in all interpretive experience (Derrida, “Structure Sign and Play,” 292).

Gadamer takes up the challenge posed by Derrida’s deconstruction not primarily as an objection to his hermeneutics but, instead, as an impetus to dedicate renewed attention to the role played by difference in interpretive experience. After all, even though philosophical hermeneutics does not involve the technical notion of différance, Gadamer’s hermeneutics makes space for difference in important regards. First, Gadamer certainly recognizes that every determinate claim of truth remains open to further interpretation. And, second, he recognizes that the hermeneutical experience of a determine claim of truth is itself a legacy of difference, since interpretive experience unfolds in the free play of conversation. Gadamer’s response to the challenge posed by deconstruction unfolds in attempts to expand and deepen these and related considerations of the role played by difference in interpretive experience. Gadamer develops this response in a number of essays, and is led to develop hermeneutical considerations of a number of themes brought into focus by his encounter with Derrida, such as the significance of what he calls the eminent text (see for example Gadamer, “Hermeneutics Tracking the Trace,” and “Text and Interpretation”). Matters of central concern for the philosophical controversy between hermeneutics and deconstruction have also been further developed by several philosophers associated with hermeneutics, such as John Caputo (1987), James Risser (1997), Donatella di Cesare (2003) and others.

7. Postmodern Hermeneutics

The rise of postmodernism has proved to be an important impetus for developments within hermeneutics. While ‘postmodernism’ signifies a number of things, of particular influence in philosophy is Jean-François Lyotard’s definition of postmodernism as an “incredulity toward metanarratives” (Lyotard, Postmodern Condition, xxiv). By ‘metanarrative,’ Lyotard has in mind foundational stories of modern Western philosophy, especially, as these foundational stories function to legitimate discourses in the sciences (Lyotard, Postmodern Condition, 34). Examples of metanarratives include, say, stories about the objectivity of science and the contribution that science makes to the betterment of society.

Lyotard sees both a danger and a possibility in the postmodern rejection of metanarratives. Lyotard maintains that postmodern incredulity toward metanarratives has resulted, first, in the increased danger that our valuation of knowledge will be reduced to one, totalizing standard, namely, that of an “information commodity” produced and exchanged for the accumulation of wealth and power (Lyotard, Postmodern Condition, 5). But, he believes, the postmodern incredulity toward metanarratives has resulted in a new possibility, too, of liberating the creation of narrative meaning from the need to establish legitimating foundations. Philosophers of postmodernism have sought to clarify such a postmodern possibility for the creation of meaning through the development of hermeneutics (see Vattimo, Beyond Interpretation, Gary Madison 1989, John D. Caputo 1987, 2018; for a creative intervention in postmodern hermeneutics, see Davey 2006). In this, hermeneutics places stress on the possibility of interpretive experience to produce new meaning and shifts away from concerns about truth and existence.

Probably the most influential conception of postmodern hermeneutics is embodied in Gianni Vattimo’s notion of ‘weak thought.’ Vattimo’s hermeneutics is influenced not only by figures such as Gadamer and Heidegger, but also Nietzsche, as well as the important Italian philosopher Luigi Pareyson (see Benso, 2018). By ‘weak thought,’ Vattimo has in mind interpretive practices that incrementally diminish the efficacy of narratives about the purported ‘being’ of things that have been passed down from the tradition of Western metaphysics. Vattimo embraces the postmodern possibility to liberate the creation of meaning from any needs for foundation or legitimacy. Building on Heidegger and Nietzsche, Vattimo argues that despite all postmodern incredulity, narratives passed down about the purported ‘being’ of things continue to be in effect, often tacitly, in a broad range of our current beliefs and practices. What is then called for are interpretive practices that loosen the hold of these narratives, and thus expose that what they have to say about the ‘being’ of things are not eternal verities but, instead, mockups that are subject to interpretive revision. Vattimo, then, defines interpretive experience not in Gadamerian terms of a conversation that brings something into focus in its being, as it genuinely is. Rather, he conceives of interpretive experience as a practice of recovery, even convalescence (Verwindung), that weakens the effects of interpretations of ‘being’ passed down from Western metaphysics. Indeed, Vattimo associates the possibility to liberate meaning through weak thought as the pursuit of what he calls ‘accomplished nihilism,’ in that weak thought seeks to unmask every sense of ‘being’ which purports to be more than the result of an interpretation (see Vattimo, Beyond Interpretation, The End of Modernity).

8. Further Developments

Research in hermeneutics is perhaps more diverse now than at any other period in the historical movement, and has also begun to expand interest in hermeneutical considerations to contexts such as feminist philosophy (see Warnke 2015), comparative philosophy (see, for example, Nelson 2017), philosophy of embodiment (see, for example, Kearney 2015), and Latin American philosophy (see, for example, Vallega 2019). While it is impossible to gather all directions of current research in a short article, some further developments have received particular attention.

8.1 Hermeneutics in Anglo-American Philosophy

Hermeneutics, grasped as a historical movement, is typically associated with continental European traditions of thought and the reception of these traditions in the global context. This reception has included contributions to the development of hermeneutics made by noteworthy Anglo-American philosophers. Hermeneutics has been adopted by Richard Rorty, has been connected with the later Wittgenstein and Davidson, and has also been taken up by philosophers associated with the so-called ‘Pittsburgh school,’ Robert Brandom, and John McDowell.[11]

Rorty, in his now classic Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature, presents a ranging critique of modern philosophy that focuses on epistemology, especially the idea that knowledge is a representation or mental ‘mirroring’ of mind-independent reality. Against epistemology, Rorty proposes hermeneutics, which he characterizes as “an expression of hope that the cultural space left behind by the demise of epistemology will not be filled…” (Rorty 1979, 315). Hermeneutics holds this void open with what he calls ‘conversation.’ In this, conversation pursues not the truth, conceived as a correspondence of mind and mind-independent reality, but, instead, edification (Rorty 1979, 318, 360, 378). Edification, itself Rorty’s proposed translation of the German Bildung (Piercy 2016, 447) concerns not truth, then, but instead the discovery of new and useful possibilities.

Philosophers associated with the University of Pittsburgh have also taken up and developed themes in hermeneutics. Robert Brandom, for his part, has argued that his inferentialist approach in semantics is able to support major tenets of Gadamerian hermeneutics, thereby suggesting that the traditions of inferentialism and hermeneutics can complement one another (see Brandom 2002 and 2004; see also Lafont 2007). John McDowell, in his Mind and World, also introduces a notion connected with hermeneutics. In this text, McDowell wishes to resolve the question of how the mind, ultimately, in the ‘spontaneity’ or freedom of reason, relates to the world. He argues that the question itself is a symptom of naturalism, the idea typical of modern science that immutable laws govern everything in nature. In this, the worry about the place of the spontaneity of reason in nature arises precisely from our reductive conception of nature in the first place. McDowell resolves the question of the relation of reason and nature, then, through the proposal of an alternative naturalism, one that treats reason as a ‘second nature,’ or, a process of the realization of potentials. McDowell draws on notions of tradition and formation (Bildung) in order to clarify this second nature. He writes, “human beings are intelligibly initiated into this stretch of the space of reasons by ethical upbringing, which instills the appropriate shape to their lives. The resulting habits of thought and action are second nature” (McDowell 1994, 84).

It is an open question how consistent Rorty’s, McDowell’s and Brandom’s reactions to hermeneutics are with views developed within the historical movement of hermeneutics.[12] Still, Rorty’s and McDowell’s respective critical stances toward modern epistemology and science, their novel uses of the concept of formation (Bildung), as well as Rorty’s novel use of the concept of conversation, place them in a productive exchange with continental philosophical scholars on themes more customarily associated with nineteenth- and twentieth-century German philosophy generally as well as with the historical movement of hermeneutics. Moreover, Rorty’s turn to edification and the discovery of novel possibilities it affords as an alternative to the pursuit of truth places him in proximity to postmodern hermeneutics, in particular.[13]

8.2 Hermeneutics in Ethical and Political Philosophy

Hermeneutics, since Heidegger at least, claims a special affinity with practical philosophy. Both Heidegger and Gadamer, for example, uphold Aristotle’s ethics as an important source for their respective approaches to interpretive experience.[14] Gadamer, in particular, develops the implications of his hermeneutics for practical life. Although Gadamer provides no systematic ethical or political theory, he maintains the significance of interpretive experience as a counter to the alienation produced in modern, bureaucratically managed society, he develops a hermeneutical approach to the ethical significance of friendship as well as a related approach to political solidarity (see Gadamer, “Friendship and Solidarity”; see Vessey 2005). Moreover, Paul Ricoeur has argued that an important test of the universality of hermeneutics is the extension of hermeneutical considerations to the practical sphere. In this, he clarifies that and how interpretive experience, especially the interpretive experience of narrative, plays an important role no less in practical agency than political critique (see Ricoeur, From Text to Action).

It is therefore perhaps no surprise that several philosophers have developed approaches and positions in ethical and political philosophy in connection with hermeneutics. In ethical philosophy, for example, Dennis Schmidt has recently argued that Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics comprises an ‘original ethics,’ in that Gadamer clarifies normative implications of interpretive experience that, however, are irreducible to any ethical system or principles (see D. Schmidt 2008, 2012 and 2016). In political philosophy, Richard Bernstein’s considerations of human rationality ‘beyond objectivism and relativism,’ and the attention he gives to hermeneutics in this context, has been an important impetus (Bernstein 1983). Relatedly, Genevieve Lloyd has invoked hermeneutic motifs to question norms of rationality from a feminist perspective (Lloyd 1984). Fred Dallmayr’s use of Gadamer’s hermeneutics in his considerations of political theory, comparative political theory, and inter-cultural dialogue (see for example Dallmayr 1987, 1996 and 2009) have been likewise influential. Georgia Warnke has defended Gadamer’s hermeneutics as a middle path between subjectivism and conservatism, and, in turn, she has examined the significance of hermeneutics for democratic theory, theories of deliberative democracy, questions of race and identity, and solidarity (see for example Warnke 1987, 1993, 2002, 2007 and 2012). Linda Martίn Alcoff has also drawn substantially on Gadamer’s hermeneutics in considerations of race and gender identity (see Alcoff 2006). Lauren Swayne Barthold has drawn on hermeneutics to develop a feminist approach to social identity and, more recently, to examine the significance of civic dialogue to foster pluralistic, democratic communities (see Barthold 2016 and 2020).

8.3 The Return of Normativity to Hermeneutics

Recent research in hermeneutics has seen a rise of interest in the role played in interpretive experience by a number of normative matters. In this, some argue that the influence of Heidegger and Gadamer over contemporary hermeneutics has led to a neglect of normative considerations in current debate. To be sure, it is possible to defend Heidegger and Gadamer against the charge that their approaches leave too little room for normative considerations. When it comes to Heidegger, Steven Crowell, for example, argues that phenomenology as conceived by Husserl and Heidegger can itself be grasped as inquiry into a “normatively structured ‘space of meaning’” (Crowell 2016, 238). Crowell, in his consideration of Heidegger, focuses on Heidegger’s analysis of human existence, arguing that Heidegger’s view of the role played by care in human existence speaks to the possibility of being responsive to norms as such (Crowell 2013). When it comes to Gadamer, attempts to defend his philosophical hermeneutics against charges that it neglects normative concerns have played an important role in debate since Habermas first raised objections against Gadamer.

Recent interest in the role played in interpretive experience by normative considerations, though, has also led to a revival of interest in these matters in hermeneutics before Heidegger. Kristin Gjesdal, in her recent Gadamer and the Legacy of German Idealism, for example, recommends that we return to Schleiermacher in order to focus attention on “critical-normative standards in interpretation” (Gjesdal 2009, 7). Rudolf Makkreel, in his recent Orientation and Judgment in Hermeneutics, argues for the priority of judgment, and with it, reflection and criticism, in interpretive experience. Really, Makkreel’s project is to develop an original position or approach within hermeneutics in its own right, one that takes up hermeneutical considerations in our contemporary, multi-cultural context, and that relies on a broad range of philosophers associated with hermeneutics. But, he develops his view of judgment, and the normative considerations involved in it, in reference to Kant and Dilthey in particular.

8.4 Hermeneutics and New Realism

Recent developments in hermeneutics have arisen in response to ‘new realism.’ This school of thought is represented especially by philosophers Maurizio Ferraris and Markus Gabriel, and invites comparisons with the ‘speculative realism’ of philosophers such as Quentin Meillassoux and Graham Harman (see Ferraris 2012, Gabriel 2015, Gabriel 2020, Meillassoux 2008; Harman 2018). The new orientation toward realism is characterized, first of all, by a rejection of a common thesis of postmodern and radical constructivism: the position that our interpretations are constitutive of what we otherwise call reality. To this extent, the new interest in realism is compatible with other forms of realism. Yet, new realism opposes not only radical constructivism but also a basic tenet of metaphysical realism: the idea that reality is comprised exclusively of mind-independent things. One of the most influential approaches of such new-realist opposition against metaphysical realism is found in Gabriel. He makes a distinction between metaphysics and ontology, and argues in his new realist ontology that what we usually associate with mind, namely, our descriptions or interpretations of things, are no less real than what they relate to. Such descriptions or interpretations are rather distinguished by their function, which is to individuate (Gabriel 2015, 9–11).

The rise of this orientation toward realism has garnered significant attention in its own right. Especially important for contemporary hermeneutics, however, is that this new orientation toward realism has been an impetus for new developments. At one extreme, the rise of realism has recently led Gianni Vattimo not only to defend his postmodern hermeneutics against realism, but, moreover to develop a polemical critique of the motivations, philosophical and otherwise, to pursue realism. In this, Vattimo maintains that the rise of realism is motivated, in part, by a conservative reactionism against the consequences of postmodernism. He writes, for example, that among other roots of realism is “the fundamental neurosis that follows the late-industrial society as the regressive reaction of defense against the postmodern Babel of languages and values” (Vattimo 2016, 77).

Other developments within hermeneutics have been much more favorable toward the renewed interest in realism. Some philosophers, such as Günter Figal and Anton Koch, have discerned important affinities between hermeneutics and new realism, and, in turn, have developed positions that they have identified as ‘hermeneutical realism.’ Hermeneutical realism opposes the postmodern view that interpretations constitute reality, maintaining, by contrast, that interpretive experience belongs to reality. Figal, in his hermeneutical realism, develops his realistic approach principally in terms of the phenomenological problem of appearance. In this, he focuses on space, grasped as what first places us in referential relations to objects, and, with this, makes available interpretive possibilities to determine the sense of them (Figal, 2009, 2010 and 2015). Koch, for his part, develops his hermeneutical realism on the basis of motifs found in German Idealism, arguing for the necessity of the subject, grasped in its spatio-temporal, corporeal, and living subjectivity, as what makes things interpretable (as he has it, readable and translatable) (Koch 2016 and 2019). Thus, on his view, while real things are independent of individual interpretations, such things are not independent of being interpretable in general.

Finally, hermeneutical realism has also led to novel research on classical figures in hermeneutics. Whereas Vattimo, for example, sees in Gadamer the seeds of his postmodern hermeneutics (see Vattimo, “Story of a Comma”), Figal, by contrast, brings into focus the realism of Gadamer’s concern for the substantiveness (Sachlichkeit) of interpretive experience (see Figal 2010, 2). Moreover, some philosophers have found that hermeneutical realism sheds light on central motifs of the later Heidegger (Keiling 2018).


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Other Internet Resources


The author wishes to thank David Liakos, co-author of Liakos and George 2019, for consultation on this entry, as well as Tobias Keiling for consultation, in particular, about hermeneutics and new realism. The author is also grateful to very helpful comments made by a referee in the peer-review process.

Copyright © 2020 by
Theodore George <t-george@tamu.edu>

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