Diodorus Cronus

First published Tue Apr 23, 2024

[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by Matthew Duncombe replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

Diodorus Cronus (died circa 284 BCE) was a figure widely known and admired in antiquity, for his dialectical skills, contributions to the study of logic and his philosophical views. Recent philosophy and scholarship have engaged with his Master Argument and his modal system, but other aspects of his thought, including a version of atomism, arguments against change, ambiguity, singular reference and past-tense statements, have been relatively neglected. Debates over his affiliation have played an important role in the historiography of post-classical Greek philosophy, in particular whether there was a Dialectical school, of which Diodorus would be a principal representative.

1. Biography

Diodorus was born in Iasos, a city in ancient Caria, on the west coast of modern-day Turkey. Iasos had been part of the Delian league during the Peloponnesian war (431–404BCE) and Diodorus studied dialectic with a minor teacher Apollonius Cronus, a native of Cyrene. Diodorus inherited the nickname, ‘Cronus’, from Apollonius. ‘Cronus’ seems to have meant ‘old codger’ (Plato Euthydemus 287b), although it may also have implied ‘cunning’ (Döring 1972, 124; Muller 1985, 128; Iliad II 205; Odyssey XXI, 415; Hesiod Theogony 18). Apollonius had studied with Eubulides of Miletus, a student of Euclides of Megara. Euclides was a long-standing member of the Socratic circle (Phaedo 59b-c; Theaetetus 142a-143b).

Diodorus’ date of death is easier to establish than his date of birth. David Sedley has shown that Diodorus died in Alexandria around 284BCE (Sedley 1977, 80), a date now generally accepted (Sorabji 1980, 106; Algra 1999, 52; Duncombe 2023). Diodorus was teaching in Athens in the 310s BCE, where we know he taught Zeno of Citum, founder of Stoicism, and Philo the Logician, Diodorus’ colleague in the Dialectical school. The sceptic Arcesilaus arrived in Athens around 295BCE and was at least influenced by Diodorus, if not directly taught by him. When Ptolemy Soter (d. 282–3) began to draw Greek intellectuals to Alexandria, it seems Diodorus joined them. In Alexandria, Diodorus was sufficiently well known that Callimachus could feature him in epigrams. Callimachus himself did not arrive in Alexandria until 290–85. We know from Diogenes Laertius (DL, 2, 111–2) that Diodorus died during the reign of Ptolemy Soter, so before 283–2. If Diodorus died in Alexandria, it cannot have been before 290 and was probably after 285, but before 283–2, making 284 a reasonable conjecture.

Aside from the historical interest, dating Diodorus death to the mid-280s makes it extremely unlikely that Aristotle (c.384-322) was influenced by Diodorus. Even if Diodorus had an exceptionally long career of 50 years, starting, say in 334BCE, his active period barely overlaps with Aristotle’s lifetime. Diodorus did use technical language we find in Aristotle’s writings and some of his arguments follow Aristotle’s closely, so it seems possible that Didodorus had access to Aristotle’s texts, presumably while they were still in circulation before the death of Theophrastus (Falcon 2014). But given that Diodorus must have been relatively young, it seems that an influence would have been from Aristotle to Diodorus.

Diodorus was traditionally thought to be part of the Megaric school, founded by Euclides of Megara. However, the scholarly consensus is now that Diodorus was part of a separate Dialectical School. Diodorus is described in our most reliable sources as a ‘dialectician’ (or ‘Dialectician’), and it is only very late that we have evidence that he was called a ‘Megaric’ (Denyer 2002), although it is possible that Chrysippus termed certain paradoxes developed by Diodorus ‘Megaric questions’ (Döring 1989, 297; Ebert 2008, 279; Allen 2018, 36–37). For detailed discussion of this issue, see the entry on the Dialectical School.

2. Metaphysics

2.1 The Master Argument

The main testimony for the Master Argument comes from Epictetus and he tells us the following:

The Master Argument seems to have been put from these sorts of premises. For these three conflict with each other: Every past truth is necessary; the impossible does not follow from the possible; there is a possible truth which neither is true nor will be. When he saw this conflict, Diodorus used the persuasiveness of the first two premises to establish that nothing is possible that neither is true nor will be (Epictetus Discourses, 2, 19, 1.1–2.1 = Döring 131).

Epictetus’ report gives us the following information:

Every past truth is necessary;
The impossible does not follow from the possible;
There is a possible truth which neither is true nor will be.

But (MA1) to (MA3) are reported to form an inconsistent triad; so we must deny one of them. Diodorus denied (MA3). That is, he affirmed:

All possible truths are either true or will be true (cf. Boethius, Commentary on the De Interpretatione of Aristotle, 234.22–26 = Döring 138).

The Master Argument is sometimes thought to be an argument for fatalism (see the relevant section of the entry on fatalism, the discussion of the Master Argument in the entry on the Dialectical School and the entry on Arthur Prior). Sometimes it is thought to be an argument for Diodorus’ account of possibility. Sometimes (including by Epictetus at Discourses, 2.18,17) it is thought to be a paradox or sophism to be solved. These are not exclusive options. Taken as a sophism we can see the argument as a trilemma, or a demonstration that the three premises are inconsistent and so one must be rejected. Diodorus could then be seen to reject the third, to yield his account of possibility. Diodorus account of possibility was taken in antiquity to yield a form of fatalism, since only what is now or will be true is possible (Alexander In An. Pr. 183.34 – 184.10). That is, anything not true now or in the future is impossible. I’m not a lawyer and never will be; so, according to Diodorus definition of possibility, it is not merely false, but also impossible that I be a lawyer.

We do not know precisely how Diodorus formulated the argument. It seems likely that, in the centuries separating Diodorus’ formulation from Epictetus report, some degree of regimentation had already taken place (Marion and Rukert, 2016, 211n55). Epictetus formulates the argument as a trilemma to exhibit the logical space of options, and to contrast the approaches of the Dialectician Panthoides (who rejected MA1), the Stoic logician Chrysippus (who rejected MA2) and Diodorus himself (who rejected MA3). The trilemma had become a common technique for presenting a philosophical issue (Seel, 1993, 295), but it is unlikely that the originator of the argument presented it this way, since we know that Diodorus used MA1 and MA2 as premises to argue for D, not merely to show that MA3 is incompatible with MA1 and MA2 and invite us to reject one. Epictetus also presents the premises in assertoric, rather than interrogative, form and Diodorus would likely have presented the argument dialectically, although it does not come down to us in that form.

Although the contemporary literature on the Master Argument involves machinery from modal and temporal logic, in ancient times the argument was well-known outside philosophical circles, and was discussed in informal, social contexts (Epictetus, Discourses 2.19.8), suggesting that it could be stated informally. None of the ancient logicians who knew how the Master Argument was formulated thought that it was invalid, since the approach seems to have been to reject one or more premises. So, it must have been plausibly valid to thinkers with a range of logical views.

Here is one tentative, non-technical way to think about the moves in the argument, which may resemble Diodorus’ presentation. I did not train in gymnastics in childhood; so I am not now an Olympic gymnast. Neither will I be in the future. It is now too late for me to be an Olympic gymnast! But is it possible that I am or will be an Olympic gymnast? Suppose that it is possible that I will be an Olympic gymnast. That implies that I did train in gymnastics from childhood. But, since I did not train in gymnastics from childhood, it is by now impossible that I trained in gymnastics. So if it is possible that I will be an Olympic gymnast, an impossibility would follow from that possibility. But the impossible does not follow the possible. So, it is not possible that I will be an Olympic gymnast.

A similar line of thought would block the present possibility of me being an Olympic gymnast. Suppose it is possible that I am now an Olympic gymnast. That implies that I did train in gymnastics from childhood. But, since I did not train in gymnastics from childhood, it is by now impossible that I trained in gymnastics. So if it is possible that I am an Olympic gymnast, an impossibility would follow. But the impossible does not follow the possible. So, it is not possible that I am an Olympic gymnast. Hence, unless I either am, or will be, and Olympic gymnast, it is not possible for me to be an Olympic gymnast.

2.2 Antecedents of the Master

We find a possible antecedent to the Master Argument in Aristotle’s Metaphysics 9.3. There are two relevant parts of that passage. The first is an account of potentialities which Aristotle attributes to ‘the Megarics’ and others:

There are some who say, for example, the Megarics, that something is possible only when it is actual and that thing is not possible when it is not actual. For example, someone who is not building cannot build, but someone who is building can when building. Similarly in the other cases. (Metaphysics 9.3, 1046b29–32)

Although the precise view, and the identity of those who hold the view, is disputed, the target view seems to be that that something has a power or capacity only when that capacity is manifest. Roughly:

\(\alpha\) can \(\phi\) only when \(\alpha\) is \(\phi\)-ing.

For example, a builder can build only when in fact building. M0 resembles D for M0 looks like another way to reject MA3. According to MA3, it is possible that a builder builds, while in fact the builder is not building and never will. But according to M0, while the builder is not building, the builder cannot build. If what the builder cannot do is not possible for the builder, then it is not possible that the builder builds, while not, in fact, building. You might think that M0 and D are both motivated by a suspicion of mere possibilities, that is, possibilities that exist but remain unactualized.

On the other hand, D differs from M0 in three important ways. First, M0 is formulated in terms of the powers that individuals have to act: a builder can build only when building. D is formulated in terms of whole propositions being true or possible. Second, M0 is a one way conditional, while D makes an equivalence claim between a possible truth and what is or will be true, so would be a biconditional. Third, and most importantly, D involves a disjunction: anything possible either is true or will be; M0 makes no such distinction between present and future truths. How can these differences be explained?

There are two (compatible) explanations for the first difference. First, it might simply be appealing to think, like Aristotle, that modal truths, such as, ‘it is possible that the builder build’ are grounded in facts about individuals and their powers, such as the builder and his power to build. If that is the case, then the move to a propositional formulation would be relatively harmless, and amenable to both those who think there are existing, but unactualised, possibilities, and those who don’t. The second is that Diodorus himself was one of the originators of propositional logic (see the entry on the Dialectical School). Thus, it would be natural for him to formulate the point using modal operators on propositions, rather than in terms of individuals and their powers. The formulation would look like this:

It is possible that \(p\) only if it is true that \(p\).

There is no reason to think that this was an actual interim stage in the development, but it is useful to consider for heuristic purposes. Once we consider D1, the second difference between M0 and D can also be explained simply too. It is natural to think that:

If it is true that \(p\), then it is possible that \(p\).

In fact, this is just to accept the T axiom of modal logic, which many modal logics accept. These two taken together would allow a biconditional formulation like this:

It is possible that \(p\) if and only if it is true that \(p\).

The third difference is a little more philosophically interesting. Aristotle presents a series of arguments against M0. One of the most powerful is that M0 seems to rule out change (Metaphysics 9.3, 1047a10–15). Aristotle’s basic line of thought is that, according to M0, \(a\) can sit only when sitting. So, when \(a\) is sitting can \(a\) stand? Apparently not:

  1. if \(a\) is sitting, \(a\) is not standing.
  2. But if \(a\) is not standing, \(a\) lacks the power to stand (from M0).
  3. If \(a\) lacks the power to stand, \(a\) cannot stand.
  4. If \(a\) cannot stand, \(a\) will not stand in the future.
  5. So, if \(a\) is sitting, \(a\) does not stand in the future.

Since ‘sitting’ and ‘standing’ are just arbitrary properties, the argument generalises to all change. Aristotle would need some suppressed premise to connect the idea that something cannot stand to the idea that it never will stand. Such a principle might be found in De Caelo 1, 11–12 (Makin and Denyer 2000).

This sort of argument could be blocked by accepting the disjunctive account that what is possible is true or will be. For in that case, even if a lacks the power to stand now, it does not follow that a cannot stand in the future. That is, suppose a is sitting. With the disjunctive account, at present, if a is not standing, a may still be able to stand, as long as a turns out to be standing in the future. Thus, the Diodorean account of possibility could be a development of the Megaric position on powers. But even if D is historically connected to the Megaric position in Metaphysics 9.3, it does not follow that Diodorus was affiliated to a Megaric ‘school’, especially because the Master Argument seems to defend D on independent grounds.

That suffices for MA3, the negation of which is supposed to be the conclusion of the Master Argument. What about the premises that lead us to that conclusion? MA2 tells us that entailment cannot take us from possibilities to impossibilities: possibility is closed under entailment. Some readers, such as (Mates 1953, 39) and (Denyer 1981b), have thought that we should understand MA2 in terms of Diodorus’ own account of ‘following’, which we know from other sources (SE M 8, 112–117 = Döring 142): a conditional is true iff it is not possible that the antecedent is true and the consequent false. It is unclear whether Diodorus intended his own notion of ‘possible’ here. But since the Master Argument seems to have been intended to argue for Diodorean possibilities, he could not invoke his own notion without begging the question. Probably the best way to understand this premise also appeals to Metaphysics 9.3. After Aristotle has rebutted the Megaric position, Aristotle introduces a ‘test’ for whether something is possible:

What is possible is that for which, if the actuality of what is said to have the possibility obtains, then nothing impossible will result. (Metaphysics 9.3, 1047a24–6)

This test works like this. To test whether \(p\) is possible, suppose p is actual. If nothing impossible follows this supposition, \(p\) is possible. I am sitting and we want to test whether it is possible that I stand. So, suppose I stand. If nothing impossible results from this supposition, it is possible that I stand. The problem is, stated as baldly as this, the test is underdetermined. I can apply the test making no accommodations: I am sitting in a room where no one is standing. And we want to test whether it is possible that I stand. So, suppose I stand. In that case, I am standing but also no one in this room is standing. This is a contradiction and so an impossibility. So it turns out that, according to the test, I cannot stand. It seems unreasonable to apply the test with no accommodation whatsoever, but also unreasonable to allow all accommodations by changing the truth-value of any proposition. If I’m maximally accommodating, only self-contradictory propositions turn out impossible. So we can hold some propositions as a fixed background for testing some p, for example, the necessary truths. The advantage of understanding MA2 in light of this test is that it gives a clear way to operationalize MA2 – using this idea of supposition- and also it is a conception of possibility shared by people like Aristotle who hold that some possibilities are not and never will be realized (although cf. Makin and Denyer 2000).

Finally, what about MA1? MA1 seems obvious: the past is fixed, what’s done is done and cannot be undone, and something like this was accepted by Aristotle, who quotes Agathon: ‘For even from god this power is kept, this power alone/To make it true that what’s been done had never been’ (Nicomachean Ethics 1139b10, Trans. Broadie and Rowe). But MA1 is not just saying that the past is irrevocable; it is saying that it is necessary. There are things which are irrevocable which are, for all that, not necessary. For example, it is not within my power to change what happens is a distant galaxy: from my standpoint, what happens far away is unalterable. But what happens in a distant galaxy is not always necessary: there are irrevocable, but contingent, truths.

Even with this caveat, MA1 needs careful formulation. Martha Kneale (Kneale 1937) introduced three classes of counterexample to MA1 into this literature, but her contribution is sometimes overlooked. These counterexamples are cases where a past truth seems to become false. But a past truth that can become false is not a necessary truth. The first class of counter examples are past negative existentials. (i) ‘There has never been a female Labour UK Prime Minister’. This is a past truth, but it could become false, if the UK elects a female Labour Prime Minister. The second class are past temporal distance. (ii) ‘Socrates died 2422 years ago’ is a past truth in 2023, but will be a past falsehood from 2024 onwards. Kneale’s third class are past definite descriptions, such as (iii) ‘The UK Prime Minister who completed a PhD was Scottish’. Should the UK elect another holder of a doctorate, this would become false.

The solution may be to notice – with (Denyer 2009, 38–39) who follows (Prior 1967) – that not every sentence that involves a past tense is a past-tense sentence. All three of Kneale’s cases are not past truths in the sense that the main operator of the sentence is a past-tense operator, but rather the main connective is either a negation or an existential quantifier. For example ‘There has never been a female Labour UK Prime Minister’ can be written as ‘It is not the case that there has been a female Labour UK Prime Minister’. This is formalised as ‘\(\neg \langle P\rangle p\)’ where ‘\(p\)’ is the present-tense sentence ‘there is a female Labour UK Prime Minister’ and ‘\(\langle P\rangle\)’ is the past-tense operator ‘it has been the case that…’. If (i) changes its truth value when a female Labour Prime Minister is elected, that is only because (i) is a present-tense negated sentence.

With all that, however, taking an historical perspective on the Master Argument, as well as the more common logical perspective, shows why the Master Argument might be appealing. It develops a conclusion that is radically anti-Aristotelian, that what is possible is or will be the case, a modal collapse, from premises that an Aristotelian would accept, and indeed, that Aristotle appears to have accepted. Not only that, but it seems that Diodorus’ notion of modality differs in an explicable way from the Megarics of Metaphysics 9.3, perhaps in response to Aristotle’s criticism, while retaining the spirit of their view.

2.3 Fate and the Diodorean Modal System

The Master Argument is supposed to be, amongst other things, an argument for ‘fatalism’ or ‘logical determinism’, because it argues for Diodorus’ notion of possibility, which leaves no room for counterfactual possibilities and hence rules out freedom. Several sources report Diodorus’ account of possibility (Boethius On Aristotle’s On Interpretation 234.22–6; Alexander On Aristotle’s Prior Analytics 183–4; Simplicius On Aristotle’s Categories 196, 220–25). According to these sources, Diodorus’ view is that: it is possible that \(p\) just in case either \(p\) is the true or will be true. Here is Alexander’s report:

According to him it is possible for me to be at Corinth if I am at Corinth or if, otherwise, I am going to be at Corinth. But if I were never in Corinth, it would not be possible. And a child’s becoming a grammarian is possible if he ever becomes one. (Alexander On Aristotle’s Prior Analytics, 183–4)

This case fits well with the other reports. It is possible that Alexander is in Corinth if either he is in Corinth or is going to be in Corinth. It is possible that a child becomes a grammarian if he does in fact become one. In general, where ‘\(p\)’ is a present tensed content, and ‘\(\langle F\rangle \ldots\)’ is a one-place modal operator meaning ‘it will be the case at some future time that…’, then:

Diodorean Possibility.
It is possible that \(p\) iff \(p\) or \(\langle F\rangle p\)

Diodorean possibility ignores any intrinsic features of Alexander or the child, for example, whether the child has the capacity to learn grammar. All that Diodorean possibility cares about is what in fact turns out to be the case. What is more, if evaluating whether \(p\) is possible, we only take account of what is true now and in the future. So if we know the truth values of a proposition at all times (or even just all future times), we know whether it is Diodorean possible. This contrasts with our usual modal notion of possibility. Suppose that \(p\) is always false. Is it possible? On a standard notion of possibility, the answer is ‘we cannot tell’, for we cannot tell whether \(p\) is possible, even if we know its actual truth values at all times. But for Diodorus, the answer is ‘no’.

Since Diodorus links modalities to time, how he thought about time will impact on his modal notions. Generally, scholars assume that for Diodorus time is linear, discrete, and has no beginning or end moment. To be linear means, informally, that time does not branch in either the forwards or backwards direction. To be discrete means that each moment that has a successor (or predecessor) has a corresponding immediate successor (or predecessor).

It is easy to derive other modalities in a standard way from Diodorean possibility. Assuming that ‘Necessarily \(p\)’ is equivalent to ‘not-possibly not \(p\)’ and that ‘contingently \(p\)’ is equivalent to ‘possibly-\(p\) and not-necessarily \(p\)’ we can arrive at:

Diodrean Necessity.
Necessarily \(p\) iff \(p\) and [\(F\)]\(p\).
Diodorean Contingency.
\(\langle C\rangle p\) iff ((\(p\) or \(\langle F\rangle p\)) and not (\(p\) and [\(F\)]\(p\)))

Where ‘[\(F]p\)’ is read as ‘it will be the case at every future time that \(p\)’ and ‘\(\langle C\rangle p\)’ as ‘it is possible and not necessary that \(p\)’. So it is now necessary that Alexander is in Corinth iff Alexander is in Corinth and always will be. It is now contingent that Alexander is in Corinth iff Alexander is either not now in Corinth but will be or is now in Corinth but will not be.

So this modal scheme allows for present contingents. Does it allow future contingents? In a limited sense, yes, according to Denyer (1981b). What this scheme does allow are future asynchronous contingencies. Will it be contingent tomorrow that Alexander is in Corinth? That is:

\(\langle F\rangle \langle C\rangle p\).

This would cash out to:

\(\langle F\rangle\)((\(p\) or \(\langle F\rangle p\)) and not (\(p\) and [\(F\)]\(p\))).

And that can hold in two circumstances. Either tomorrow, Alexander will not be in Corinth, but will be the day after. Or, tomorrow, Alexander will not be in Corinth but will be the day after. The Diodorean modal scheme also allows synchronous future contingents, when at some future time (possibly \(p\) and possibly not-\(p)\):

\(\langle F\rangle\)(\(\Diamond p\) and \(\Diamond\)not-\(p\)).

By substitution, this would result in:

\(\langle F\rangle\)((\(p\) or \(\langle F\rangle p\)) and (not-\(p\) or \(\langle F\rangle\)not-\(p\))).

But that can be satisfied if, say, tomorrow Alexander is in Corinth and will not be the day after. It would also be satisfied if tomorrow Alexander is in Corinth the day after but not tomorrow. So there are at least some future contingents.

But is this enough to say that the Diodorean modal system is not ‘deterministic’? Bobzien (1993, 73) rejects Denyer (1981b), who claims that the system is not deterministic, as it allows future contingents in the above senses. Bobzien argues that this sense of future contingents is still deterministic, since determinism is concerned with free action and actions are particular events at particular times. Diodorus’ modal system, she claims, cannot allow simultaneous possibilities for events at the same time. Although it is unclear whether any ancient critic could have articulated the point this way, Bobzien claims, where ‘\(t)n\)’ is a rigid designator for the present moment (in her case 12 noon on 3rd September 1991), ‘Dio is walking at \(t_n\)’ is not Diodorean contingent, as this would mean that Dio would have to walk and not walk at precisely that time, which is impossible, or we say, as above, that ‘Dio is walking at \(t_n\)’ is true at some future time and false at some other future time. But we cannot say that, since from \(t_n\) onwards, the matter is settled one way or another. So, says Bobzien, Diodorean modalities are deterministic in the sense that they do not allow present contingencies about specific events.

This dispute is important, since one key question is just how ‘deterministic’ Diodorus’ modal system is, but very little literature addresses that question. On Denyer’s view, Diodorus is weakly deterministic, as it allows for future contingents, on a particular understanding of them. ‘It will be the case that Dio walks’ is a future contingent, since there is a time further in the future when Dio walks a time still further in the future when he does not. For Bobzein, this is still deterministic, not because she thinks that to be non-deterministic, you need future contingents with robust counter-factual modalities, but rather because, even on a Diodorean understanding, by the time some specific moment, \(t_n\), is present, ‘(possibly Dio is walking and possibly Dio is not walking)’ is not true, so whether Dio is walking is not a contingent matter at any present moment. Since non-determined actions only take place in the present, and it is not contingent for Dio whether he is walking at any present moment, \(t_n\), it is determined whether Dio is walking or not.

It does seem that Diodorus could hold on to present contingents. Diodorus was a temporal atomist, in that he holds that time is composed of discrete indivisible units of duration, which implies that the timeline is non-dense, i.e. it is not the case that between any two moments there is a third moment. He could accept Bobzein’s point – at any given atomic moment, \(t_n\), Dio walks or he does not walk. If Dio walks at \(t_n\), it is fixed at \(t_n\) that Dio walks. But this is precisely what we would expect, given Diodorus atomism. It does not follow from this that Dio cannot be walking at \(t_n\) and not walking at the next atomic moment, \(t_{n+1}\). And if that turns out to be the case, then it is contingent at \(t_n\) that Dio is walking, since it is possible that he walks (because he is in fact walking at \(tn)\) and not necessary that he walks (because he is not walking later). The only exception to this is the last moment of time. If \(t_n\) is the last moment of time, it cannot be the case that Dio is not walking at \(t_{n+1}\), and so, it is not contingent that Dio is walking at \(t_n\).

Diodorus’ atomism assists this sort of argument, since this argument does not work if time is dense. If time is dense, then between \(t_n\) and \(t_{n+1}\) there is a third moment, call it \(t_{n+ 1/2}\). We are assuming that tn is the last moment of Dion’s walking, since \(t_{n+1}\) is the first moment of Dion’s not walking. So is Dio walking or not walking at \(t_{n+ 1/2}\)? Either answer has a powerful argument against it. On the one hand, Dio is not walking at \(t_{n+ 1/2}\), for \(t_n\) was the last moment of his walking. But, on the other hand, Dio is not not walking at \(t_{n+ 1/2}\), for \(t_{n+1}\) is the first moment of his not walking.

Diodorus cannot have continuous change. Suppose changes from Dio walking to not walking between \(t_n\) and \(t_{n+1}\). Since there are only temporal atoms, there can only be ‘leaps’ between Dio walking and not walking. Diodorus can certainly say that there are synchronous possibilities. Whether this is enough for Dio to be acting freely when he walks, is a wider issue. But it certainly does not rule out Dio from acting freely on the grounds the present is fixed.

More worrying for those who are concerned with human freedom might be Diodorus’ commitment to the view that what will never happen is impossible. If, as a matter of fact, Dio always walks from \(t_n\) onwards, it is, at \(t_n\) impossible that Dio does not walk. Dio is freely walking only if he could do otherwise. On Diodorus’ view, Dion, while walking at \(t_n\), is not freely walking, since it is not possible for him to do otherwise. Similarly, one might say that Dio is sitting, but not freely sitting, if chained to the floor. That may be right. But there is no reason to think that Diodorus must accept the ‘could do otherwise’ condition on free action. Compatibilists reject that condition too. Diodorean modalities are compatible with a variety of views about human freedom except, perhaps, the most implausible sort of libertarianism.

We can see this if we look at how Diodorean modality works with the Lazy Argument. On Diodorus view, if it turns out that I pass my exam, it turns out impossible that I failed. On the other hand, if it turns out that I fail my exam, it turns out impossible that I passed. But nothing about that determines how it will turn out. So, I am still motivated to work hard, since what is not yet determined is whether I will pass or fail. From an ethical perspective, this might lead into a philosophical consolation, of sorts. It is not determined how things will turn out, but once they have turned out a certain way, there is no point worrying about it, since by then it could not have been otherwise.

3. Logic

3.1 Conditionals

Lots of sources point to intense debate in our period on the nature of conditionals. An epigram of Callimachus jokes that the debate was so widespread that even the crows on the rooftops were cawing about it (Sextus M1 309.4–7 = Döring 128 (part))! What remains of this rich debate is somewhat murky, but it does allow us to make some informed interpretations of Diodorus’ views on the conditional. The main source is again, Sextus (PH 110–112), who distinguishes four conditionals in order of strength: Philo’s, Diodorus’, Connection (which was probably Chrysippus’ on the evidence of DL 7 73) and Meaning. Sextus orders the conditionals in terms of logical strength, but it unclear which was the first to arise chronologically (pace (Sedley 1977, 101). It may be that Philo’s arose first, and was refined in response to something like the paradoxes of material implication.

In any case, a conditional is true, according to Philo just in case ‘it does not begin with a truth and end with a falsehood’ (Sextus PH II 110. Translation Annas and Barnes, modified. Cf. M II 114). For example, ‘if it is day, I am conversing’, is true when both it is day and I am conversing. Philo is usually interpreted as articulating the modern material conditional (Sedley 1977, 101; Mates 1949, 234; Mates 1953, 43). That is, where ‘\(\to\)’ is the material conditional:

‘if \(p\) then \(q\)’ is a true Philo conditional iff \((p\) \(\to\) \(q)\).

Sextus then tells us that Diodorus conditional is one that ‘neither could nor can begin from truth and end in falsehood’ (PH 2110 Trans. Annas and Barnes, modified. Cf. M 2.115).

‘if \(p\) then \(q\)’ is a true Diodorean conditional iff it (i) neither was possible nor (ii) is possible that \((p\) & not\(-q)\).

Some scholars took Diodorus to be anticipating modern notions of strict implication (e.g. Hurst, 1935, 485). That view has been discredited, since the Diodorean conditional should be stronger than the strict conditional: ‘if \(p\) then \(q\)’ is a true Diodorean conditional iff the proposition that \(p\) now strictly implies the proposition that \(q\) and the proposition that \(p\) has always strictly implied the proposition that \(q\). Instead, it is common to follow Mates (Mates 1949) and hold that a conditional holds in the Diodorean sense iff it holds in in Philo’s sense all times. That is where ‘\(\to\)’ represents the material conditional:

‘if \(p\) then \(q\)’ is a true Diodorean conditional iff at all times, \((p\)\(\to\)\(q)\).

So ‘if it is day, I am conversing’ turns out false, since there are times when ‘it is day’ is true, but ‘I am conversing’ is false (Cf. \(M 2 115)\). One quibble with this common way to understand Diodorus’ conditionals is that Philo’s conditional is not obviously the material conditional, since ancient propositions tend to be tensed and the material conditional both is a tenseless proposition and conjoins tenseless propositions. A more serious difficulty with Mates’ reading is that it makes clause (ii) redundant. (i) on its own, read in line with Diodorean possibility, would yield the ALL-TIME conditional (as pointed out by Mates himself (Mates 1949, 238)). So why would Diodorus formulate his conditional with the redundant clause? Third, for Diodorus, if something is true at all times, it is necessarily true. So, for Diodorus the ALL-TIME conditional will just be a strict conditional. But we saw that Diodorus’ conditional should be stronger than the strict conditional. All this has led some to suggest that Diodorus’ conditional, while intended to be stronger that Philo’s, tried to be more neutral and so compatible with a range of views of possibility, each of which would yield different accounts of the conditional (Sedley 1977, 102).

4. Ontology

4.1 Simples and ‘atomism’

Simples are the basic constituents of of bodies, time, and space are ‘simples’ (amerē) (Döring 117F, Döring 120). Diodorus used the term amerē in his ontology (Döring 116). Diodorean simples are physically indivisible and metaphysically simple, in that it is not possible to divide them. In contrast, Epicurus held that atoms are physically indivisible, but could be divided into ‘conceptual’ parts, such as a top and a bottom. Diodorus denied that simples have such conceptual parts (Sedley 1977, 87; Denyer 1981a, 36–37; Döring 119; see also Döring 117A; Döring 117C; Döring 117D; Döring 117E). Diodorus holds that there are partless minima of time and minima of space (Döring 120; Sextus M10,119). The consensus is now that Diodorus is committed to atomism about time (Denyer 1981a, 36–37; Muller 1988, 138; and Berryman 2016), but this is rejected by Wehrli (1960, 5:63) and McKirahan (1979, 242).

Diodorean simples have location but also extension. Diodorus’ simples are ‘very small’ (Döring 117A; Döring 117C; Döring 117D; Döring 117E). Being small implies being extended. Likewise, simple spaces lack parts, but have extension. Several of Diodorus’ arguments assume simple spaces precisely the same size as simple bodies. If simple bodies are extended, so too are simple spaces. Finally, simple times lack parts, but have duration (Sorabji 1983, 19). Although they lack parts, Diodorean simples have other properties, such as being ‘imperceptible’ (Döring 119). Diodorean simples have relational properties. A simple body occupies a simple space just in case the simple body is spatially located at that simple place. Likewise, a simple body exists at a simple time just in case the simple body is temporally located at that simple time. Simple places can relate to each other. For example, places can be ordered from first to second, and the same applies to simple times. This point is stressed by (Sorabji 1983, 369–70; Sextus M10,119–20). Finally, simples can form complexes. In fact, they are the principles (archai) of complexes (Döring 116; Döring 117A; Döring 117C; Döring 117D; Döring 117E; Döring 117F).

4.2 Motivation for atomism

What might have motivated Diodorean atomism? No Diodorean argument for atomism is recorded so the debate is speculative, but interesting, since it shows how different parts of Diodorus thinking could be connected. Mau (1954, 28) and Sedley (1977, 88) both suggest that Diodorus could frame an argument for atomism using his definition of possibility. Such an argument would work like this:

Something is possible (dunaton) just in case it either is true or will be [D]
Nothing is divided into an infinite number of parts [Premise]
Nothing will be divided into an infinite number of parts [Premise]
So, it is not possible that anything be divided into an infinite number of parts
So, necessarily, anything is divided into only a finite number of parts [Equivalent to C1]

However, Denyer rejects this as a reconstruction of Diodorus motivation (Denyer 1981a, 35–36). The atomism that results from the above argument is not Diodorean atomism, since it allows simples that are of different sizes. Suppose that you have two objects of different sizes at the last moment of time. Neither will be further divided. So, both are simples. But, by hypothesis, each has a different size. But, according to Denyer, Diodorean simples are not only small, but also all have the same size. If two simples had different sizes, one would be equal in size to a part of the other. But this is not allowed, since neither have parts. So, all simples have the same size.

Several responses are open to this. The first is that Diodorus only relies dialectically on bodies and spaces having the same size in his anti-change argument (see below). So he does not need to commit to all simple bodies having the same size. Second, it may be plausible that all simple bodies do have the same very small size, even on the above argument. Grains of sand on a beach, through a long process of erosion, are all small and roughly of the same size and shape. Given an arbitrarily long time, erosion would create arbitrarily small grains of arbitrarily similar size and shape. On some interpretations, Diodorus’ Master Argument needs an assumption that there is no first moment of time (Denyer, 1999). Roughly, if there were a first moment, at that moment, there are no past truths, including necessary past truths. So (MA1) would be false. But if there is no first moment of time, there is an arbitrarily long time for erosion to occur. So we have an indefinitely long time for such physical processes to act on all bodies. Denyer himself holds that Diodorean atomism is established by Diodorus arguments against motion and change (Denyer 1981a, 33). But, since those arguments rely extensively on atomism, it is unclear whether these arguments could motivate atomism without begging the question.

5. Physics

5.1 Arguments against present change

Diodorus’ atomism was instrumental in his arguments about change, but Diodorus attitude towards change was sophisticated. Diodorus denied that there is change in the present, but not that there was change in the past (Döring 121; Döring 122; Döring 123). Some have thought this position is incoherent, since past change entails present change at some time, an objection we will consider below. For now, consider how Diodorus defended the claim that there is no present change.

The traditional scholarly narrative has been that Diodorus responds to Zeno of Elea’s arguments, perhaps positing simples as a response to the Dichotomy paradox, but then arguing that, even in that case, motion is impossible (Sedley 1977, 85–86; Denyer 1981a, 40, 43; Sorabji 1983, 18, 369; and Muller 1985, 137). More recent scholarship has tried to show that Diodorus rejected not only motion but also present qualitative and existential change for both simples and complexes (Duncombe 2023). A few examples should give a flavour of Diodorus strategy, which involves using his atomism to support his anti-change arguments. Here is an argument against present change of simples, attributed to Diodorus by Sextus Empiricus:

For the partless body must be surrounded in a partless place, and it moves (kinētai) neither in that place (for it fills it, and it is necessary that a thing which will move has a place larger than it), nor a place that it is not in. For it [the body] is not yet in that place in order that it [the body] might move in it [the place]. Thus it does not move (Sextus, M10,86 = Döring 123 (part); my translation drawing on Bury).

Sextus reports reasoning of this sort:

Every simple body occupies a simple place [Premise]
Any simple body that moves, moves either (a) in a place it occupies or (b) in a place it does not occupy [Premise]
If a simple body moves, it moves in a place larger than it [Premise]
If a body and the place it occupies are simple, both are the same size [Premise]
So, no simple body moves in the place it occupies [MP P3,P4]
No simple body moves in a place it does not occupy [Premise]
Therefore, no simple body moves. [MT, P2,C1,P5]

Diodorus’ argument is valid, but premises 2, 3 and 4 seem false. Premise 2 seems false because it is not exhaustive: a body may move from a place it occupies to a place it does not occupy. But appealing to his atomism, Diodorus could defend the premise. Moving from one place to another implies being partly in one place and partly in another in one moment. But since neither bodies, times or places have parts according to Diodorus, nothing can be partly in another at some moment. Premise 3 seems false because it seems rotary motion can take place in a place precisely the same size as the thing rotating. But, as Diodorus could argue, rotation depends on parts because the rotating thing has a vertical axis and some point which rotates around the vertical axis. But these would be separate parts to the rotating thing, which is blocked by Diodorus atomism. Finally, premise 4 seems doubtful: why should both simple body and simple place be the same size? (Denyer 1981a, 36) offers an ingenious argument that all simples are the same size. Suppose for reductio that two partless simples, \(a\), and \(b\), differ in size. In that case one must be larger than the other, say \(a\) is larger than \(b\). But if \(a\) is larger than \(b, b\) is the same size of a part of \(a\). So \(a\) has parts. But this contradicts our supposition.

Diodorus deployed a slightly different strategy against existential change:

And the fact that nothing perishes follows from the fact that nothing changes (kineisthai). For just as nothing changes (kineitai) in the place where it is not, so too the living being dies neither in the time when it lives nor in the time when it does not live, so it never dies. (Sextus, M1, 312=Döring 128 (part))

This line of argument shifts to a slightly different strategy. Diodorus’ argument against movement argues that there is no movement because there is no place for movement to take place. This argument against existential change is that things cannot perish or die because there is no time when existential change can take place. The argument reported by Sextus runs like this:

Anything that dies, either (a) dies at a time when that thing lives or (b) at a time when it does not live [Premise]
Nothing dies at a time when it lives [Premise]
Nothing dies at a time when it does not live [Premise]
Nothing dies at a time when it lives nor at a time when it does not live [&, P2,P3]
So, nothing dies [MT on P1,C1]

This style of argument also relies on Diodorus’ atomism. ‘Dies’ could mean (a) being in the process of dying (b) the result of that process. If we take a process reading, of course, something can be in the process of dying at a time when it lives, so premise (2) is false. If we take the result reading, anything that dies, dies at a time it does not live, since the first moment of being dead is the first moment of not being alive. But Diodorus’ atomism collapses this distinction, since if time is atomic there is no continuous process of dying, merely a series of moments, the last of which is the last moment of being alive.

These arguments against change of simples do not rule out change of complexes, since even if simples cannot change, it does not follow that wholes composed of complexes cannot change. Wholes may have properties their parts do not have. So Diodorus needs another argument against change for complexes. We have a detailed report of such an argument in Sextus (M 10, 114–17), known as the Predominance Argument. Diodorus did not simply argue that ‘simples cannot change; complexes are just unstructured bundles of simples; so, complexes cannot change’. He attempted a more ambitious argument that a whole cannot change because change cannot ‘transmit’ from parts to the whole. But it is difficult to make the argument intelligible and even remotely compelling (see (Hankinson 2015) and (Duncombe 2023) for differing attempts to make sense of this argument).

The overall argument says that for a whole to change, it must change all-out. But all-out change is impossible. So, a whole cannot change. Why is all-out change impossible? All out change is change of all the parts. It is impossible because all-out change entails predominant change, that is, change of most of the parts. But predominant change is impossible. Predominant change occurs when more than half of the parts are changing, but a few are resting. Diodorus subjects predominant change to a Sorites-style or little-by-little argument.

A body changes by predominance iff more than half its parts are changing and less than half its parts are unchanging [Premise]
Suppose there is a body, \(a_1\), of 2 changing and 1 unchanging parts
\(a_1\) changes by predominance [From P1 and P2]
For any \(x\), if \(x\) is a body of \(n\) parts changes by predominance and one part is added to \(x\), the body still changes by predominance [Premise]
\(a_2\) is \(a_1\) with one unchanging part added [Premise]
\(a_2\) changes by predominance [From P4 and P5]
A body \(n\) with 2 changing and \(n\) unchanging parts changes by predominance [Reiteration P4-C2]

But now say, \(n= 9998\), we have \(a9998\), a body that changes by predominance, but where far less than half of its parts change. Which contradicts P1. So predominant change is impossible. Since predominant change is necessary for all-out change, all out change is also impossible. One example Sextus gives, which may well have been Diodorus’ own, was a greying beard. Another example might be a spinning top with a two part rotating flywheel and a one part non-rotating stem. Adding parts to the stem will not stop the top rotating, but eventually it seems absurd to say that the top is rotating by predominance.

It is hard not to agree with Sedley that this is one of Diodorus’ ‘feebler efforts’ (Sedley 1977, 92). As Sextus points out (M 10, 118) the Sorites-style argument can barely start, since with the addition of one non-moving part, there are two moving and two non-moving parts and so P4 is false, and that must be because P3 is false too. What’s more, it is hard to see why predominant change precedes all-out change. One approach to this question distinguishes the transitive and intransitive senses of ‘changes’. There is a sense of ‘unchanging’ which is the opposite of the transitive ‘\(a\) changes \(b\)’. That is, ‘\(a\) is unchanging’ would mean ‘a is not changing something else (but could itself be changed). Opposite to the intransitive ‘\(a\) changes’ would be ‘\(a\) is not itself changing’. Diodorus could answer Sextus objection if we take the first sense of unchanging to be at stake throughout the argument. A two-part body with two parts changing something else and one not changing anything else, but open to being changed, is changing by predominance. It has, as it were, two changing parts and one ‘free rider’ not contributing to the change, but not inhibiting it either. Adding further free riders will not inhibit the change. But still, it seems absurd to say that a body composed of 9998 free riders not contributing to the change and two doing all the changing, is changing by predominance.

This is perhaps the earliest Sorities or little-by-little argument recorded. The little-by-little strategy was deployed originally with ‘changes’, which is not usually considered a vague predicate, and which makes the argumentative strategy limited in power. But whatever the merits of this style of argument, we can see that Diodorus rejects change quite broadly, not only movement of simples, but also existential change and qualitative change, for simples and complexes. But all of his arguments target present change, and several rely on the indivisibility of the present moment.

5.2 Truths about past change

Although Diodorus argues against present change, he accepted that there are some past truths about change:

But according to reason it [sc. the body] has changed [kekinētai]. For that which is earlier observed in a certain place is now observed in another place; precisely what would not have come about unless it [the body] had changed (kinēthentos). (Döring 123 (part))

The argument seems valid:

For a body \(a\), if \((a\) has occupied some place \(y)\) and \((a\) occupies some place \(z)\), then \(a\) has moved [Premise]
\(a\) has occupied place \(y\) [Premise]
\(a\) occupies place \(z\) [Premise]
So, \(a\) has moved [MP on P1–P3]

But Sextus thinks that something has gone wrong, since each past tense proposition entails the truth of the corresponding present tense proposition (M10, 91–2).

Sextus’ Thesis.
If it has been the case that \(p\) then it is the case that \(p\) at some earlier time.

Plausible as this principle might seem, there are various counterexamples. One class of counterexamples include temporal duration in the past, such as ‘The Peloponnesian War lasted 27 years’, but there is no time at which ‘the Peloponnesian War is lasting 27 years’. Diodorus, of course, needs counterexamples that involve change in the past, and gives a class of counterexamples that involve successive relations and relational change. (H) ‘Helen had three husbands’ is a past truth but does not entail that ‘Helen has three husbands’ was at some time true. Helen had a succession of husbands, not three at the same time. That is, Helen was a serial monogamist not a polygamist. There is some present tense proposition that (H) corresponds to, namely, ‘there are three men, such that Helen married the first, then later the second, then later the third’. But this proposition is not a problem for Diodorus, since it is not a present truth about change, but rather a present proposition about what exists, namely, three men that bore a relation to Helen. This solution, of course, coheres well with Diodorus atomism and views about change. On Diodorus’ view it is true that ‘Achilles moved’, but never true that ‘Achilles is moving’. That is, Achilles bears different relations to different places at different times, but there is no time at which Achilles is moving from one to the other. But what is now true is that there are two places such that Achilles occupied each. Similarly, Helen bears different relations to different men at different times, but there is no time when she bears the relation to all three of them. All that is now true is that there are three men, such that Helen married each.

6. Philosophy of Language

6.1 Ambiguity, Meaning and Paradox

Ambiguity had seemed like a threat to making epistemic progress using dialectic for Plato and the first generation of Socratics (Phaedrus 237b-c; Antisthenes 151 = DL 6.3; Antisthenes 160 = Epictetus Diss. 1.17.10–12), and for a philosopher who made dialectic a specialism, reflection on ambiguity would be crucial. The basic worry was that two agents engaged in dialectic might simply mean different things by the same term, and so would fail even to contradict one another. For example, if we are arguing over whether Socrates is virtuous, we need to know whether ‘Socrates’ refers to this historical Socrates, Plato’s Socrates or Xenophon’s Socrates. If you hold that ‘Socrates is virtuous’ and I hold that ‘Socrates is not virtuous’, unless we refer to the same individual, we have not even contradicted each other.

Diodorus is sometimes attributed a ‘Humpty Dumpty’ view of language, where ‘words mean what I take them to mean’ (Nawar 2021, 610 cites Ammonius In De Int. 38.17–22; Simplicius In Cat. 27.18–21), but the evidence suggests that Diodorus is only committed to something weaker, namely, that no term is ambiguous, that is no term has more than one meaning (cf. Aristotle’s Categories 1a1–15 and Atherton 1993, 153). ‘Kid’ can mean an immature goat or a young human. Here we get a sketch of Diodorus’ reasoning in (Döring 111). The text distinguishes three claims:

No word is ambiguous (i.e. each word has at most one meaning).
No one says or thinks anything ambiguous (i.e. each thought picks out at most one thing).
Each person says precisely what they think they say (i.e. each thought precisely expresses speaker intentions).

(A2) and (A3) are premises for (A1). It is unclear whether singular terms and singular thoughts are at stake here, or whether Diodorus had in mind whole statements. But just working through with statements and thoughts the argument seems to go like this:

Suppose that I say ‘a kid has four legs’ but intend ‘a young goat has four legs’
If ‘kid’ is ambiguous, I said two things: ‘a young human has four legs’ and ‘a young goat has four legs’ [P1 and definition of ambiguity]
But I said precisely what I intended, i.e. ‘a young human has four legs’ [P1 and A3]
So, I said at most one thing i.e. ‘a young human has four legs’ [from P3, i.e. A2]
So, ‘kid’ is not ambiguous [MT C1, P2]

There are a few observations to make about this argument. The first obvious question is about whether (A2) is true. Why can a thought not be ambiguous? Why, for example, can it not simply be that if I think ‘a kid has four legs’ it is indeterminate which of two thoughts I’m thinking. If thoughts can be indeterminate, then speaker intentions can be too, and so terms can be ambiguous. This sort of worry goes back at least as far as Plato’s Theaetetus 209b-c. The answer may have to do with the fact that to have a successful thought at all, it seems to need to be determinate, because it needs to be about one thing, rather than another. But in that case, why can I not be wrong about what I’m thinking about?

Another point here is that P2 claims that I said two things, not that I thought two things. This suggests a philosophy of language in which words connect to the world via propositions rather than thoughts. If some term is ambiguous, sentences that use the term express several propositions. But A3 appears to reject this picture, making the intentions of the speaker trump objective meanings.

Is (A3) true? There seem to be cases where I can say something which I do not intend. Suppose I say ‘a philosopher is the largest person in the agora’, intending to pick out Socrates. Unbeknown to me, Phaedo is also in the agora, and Phaedo, a philosopher, is taller than Socrates. Arguably, I have said a truth, about Phaedo, that I did not intend to say. One way to render this more plausible would be to say that speaker meaning is decisive in determining meaning: speaker meaning in roughly the Gricean sense that the meaning is a matter of a speaker intending to induce a psychological state in the hearer. Maybe this is what is going on with Diodorus. But there are reason to be sceptical about that. For one thing, Diodorus seems to hold that statements express thoughts, and the thoughts determine what the sentence says. And second there is no clear reason to think that Diodorus intends to produce some belief in the hearer, rather than just express something. It seems that Diodorus takes a radically internalist view of meaning. What I say does not depend at all on external factors about the world. That seems in keeping with the evidence we have about naming, which looks like it assumes speaker intentions are sufficient to fix names.

6.2 Diodorus on naming

Diodorus is sometimes thought to have a radical conventionalism about naming, where not only are all names merely conventional labels for what they name, but also speaker intentions are sufficient to fix that convention. Roughly this would be because Diodorus holds that meaning is speaker meaning and meaning wholly fixes denotation.

Several sources report that Diodorus named his slaves after logical particles, roughly translated as ‘However’, ‘On The One Hand’ and ‘On The Other Hand’ (Döring 112–115). These were the standard terms for introducing premises in dialectical arguments. Since antiquity this has been seen as evidence of Diodorus’ radical conventionalism about naming. He also gave one of his daughters, Theognis, a masculine name (Döring 101).

Simplicius (Döring 113) and Ammonius (Döring 112) give us some information about the debate into which Diodorus inserted his examples. It seems that the question was whether some terms have a purely formal linguistic role. ‘However’ presumably was a putative example of a non-referring expression, with a purely formal role of introducing a second premise in an argument. Diodorus made ‘however’ into a referring expression (of course, this is not really a counterexample, since just because I can use a term as a referring expression it does not follow that it naturally is a referring expression). But in any case, we know that there was an ancient debate about whether the genders of nouns are natural or not, dating at least as far back as Protagoras (Aristotle Rhetoric 3.5. 1407b7–8 = DK A27 = LM D23; Aristotle, Sophistical Refutations 14, 173b17–22 = DKA28 = LM D24. Cf. Aristophanes Clouds 658ff. Thanks to Nicholas Denyer for drawing my attention to these sources). Diodorus’ presumably named one of his daughters Theognis in a similar way, to give a counterexample to the claim that nouns have natural genders. If, after all, we can apply a masculine name to a female person, then the gender of the noun cannot be natural. (But again, this seems not to be an on-target counterexample, since the naturalist will simply say that you have used the name incorrectly).

6.3 Paradoxes

Most modern scholarship credits the discovery of the Veiled Paradox and the Horns Paradox to Eubulides (based on DL 2 108). However, Diogenes does not say that Eubulides invented these paradoxes, merely that he posed them. In fact, Diodorus invented the Veiled Paradox and the Horns Paradox: “Diodorus … was thought by some to have invented the Veiled Man and Horns arguments” (DL 2 111,translation Mensch). This piece of evidence has been overlooked. But even if we credit Eubulides with the invention of these paradoxes, it seems likely that these were especially associated with Diodorus. It is puzzling why Diodorus might invent these two, which are not the most philosophically interesting, at least compared with the Liar and the Sorites. But the Veiled and Horns pose a particular threat to question-and-answer dialectic.

You might think that each dialectical question should be answerable with at least one of ‘yes’ or ‘no’. This is comparable to the Principle of the Excluded Middle. Dialectical portions of Plato’s dialogues present Socratic dialectic this way. However, the Horns seems to show that not every question has a simple ‘yes’ or ‘no’ answer. The Horns paradox sketched at (DL VII, 187) probably went something like this. The questioner asks: ‘Have you lost your horns?’. If the answerer replies ‘yes’, that implies an absurdity, namely, that the answerer had horns. If the answerer replies ‘no’, that also implies an absurdity, namely, that the answerer has horns. But from either answer, an absurdity follows. And not just an absurdity: having horns was an insult implying cuckoldry. The question does not have a non-absurd yes-or-no response, because the question makes a false presupposition, namely, that the answerer had horns.

On the other hand, you might think that each dialectical question should be answerable with at most one of ‘yes’ or ‘no’. This is comparable to the Principle of Non-Contradiction. But the Veiled seems to show that some questions should be answered both ‘yes’ and ‘no’. The Veiled argument probably went like this (Lucian, Philosophers for Sale 22 = LS 37L). The questioner asks: ‘Do you know your own father? The answerer replies, ‘yes’. The answerer then asks, ‘Do you know this veiled person?’. The answerer replies ‘no’. ‘But’, says the questioner, ‘this person is your father. So, you both know and do not know your father’.

Diodorus’ views on ambiguity could be seen in the context of the threat these paradoxes posed to Socratic dialectic. If no term in dialectic is ambiguous because each sentence precisely expresses the speakers’ meaning, neither paradox can get a grip. The Veiled paradox trades on the fact that two different terms, ‘your father’ and ‘this veiled man’, both mean your father. But, according to Diodorus theory, each term means precisely one thing, the thing the speaker intends. So, on Diodorus’ theory ‘your father’ and ‘this veiled man’ either (a) do not mean the same thing, or (b) the answerer already intends both to refer to their father. But in either case, the paradox is blocked. Likewise, with the Horns paradox, the sentence ‘Have you lost your horns?’ trades on the sentence presupposing two different propositions: ‘You had horns’ and ‘you have lost them’. But, on Diodorus’ theory, each sentence expresses precisely one proposition. This would block questions which have false suppositions, like the Horns question.

7. Conclusion

Scholars have tended to see parts of Diodorus as influential on the Hellenistic schools, especially Stoic logic and fatalism, and possibly also Epicurean atomism. Sometimes he is seen as forming a bridge from Aristotelian to post-Classical philosophy. But the tendency has been to think of Diodorus as engaged in a largely negative enterprise, dialectical in the sense that it took premises accepted by his opponents and derived conclusions unacceptable to his opponents. If his arguments were influential, it was because of their negative impact. But looking synoptically at the evidence, we can certainly see a coherent world view, supported by structured arguments. The Master Argument supports an anti-Aristotelian view of modality (although see De Caelo 1, 11–12 for a view of modality similar to Diodorus’), in the spirit of a Megaric suspicion of unactualized possibilities. This modal system, in turn, supports a view about fate and even a certain atomism. That atomism, in turn, supports a view about present change being impossible, but past change being possible. Diodorus’ reflections on meaning and naming support a defence of the possibility of dialectic for getting to truths. Thus scholars are right to think of Diodorus as a dialectician not for familiar reasons that he was interested in logic, or practiced philosophy through discussion and argued from the assumptions of his opponents, but because he espoused a set of substantive views associated with the Dialectical School.


Collections of Primary Sources

  • Döring, K., 1972, Die Megariker. Kommentierte Sammlung der Testimonien, Amsterdam, Grüner [Greek and Latin Texts, with introduction, translation and commentary in German].
  • Giannantoni, G., 1983–1990, Socratis et Socraticorum Reliquiae, 4 vols, Elenchos 18, Naples. [Greek and Latin Texts, with introduction and commentary in Italian].
  • Long, A.A. and D.N. Sedley, 1987, The Hellenistic Philosophers, 2 volumes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. [Volume 1 includes English translation of, and commentary on, several relevant primary sources. Volume 2 includes Greek and Latin Texts.]
  • Montoneri, Luciano, 1984, I Megarici: Studio Storico-Critico e Traduzione Delle Testimonianze Antiche, Catania: Edizioni Cuecm [substantial introduction in Italian and translation of sources into Italian].
  • Muller, Robert, 1985, Les Mégariques. Fragments et Témoignages, Paris: Vrin [French translation of the texts, with French introduction and commentary].

Secondary Sources

  • Algra, K., 1999, The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Allen, J., 2018, “Megara and Dialectic”, in Dialectic after Plato and Aristotle, edited by Thomas Bénatouïl and Katerina Ierodiakonou, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 17–46.
  • Atherton, C., 1993, The Stoics on Ambiguity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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Thanks to Nicolas Denyer and Caterina Pello for comments on earlier drafts.

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