Picture of Arthur Prior sitting on a bench

Prior in 1953, Cranmer Square,
Christchurch, New Zealand
(Courtesy of Martin Prior)

Arthur Prior

First published Mon Oct 7, 1996; substantive revision Tue Jan 28, 2020

Arthur Prior (1914–1969) undertook pioneering work in intensional logic at a time when modality and intensional concepts in general were under attack. He invented tense logic and was principal theoretician of the movement to apply modal syntax to the formalisation of a wide variety of phenomena. Prior and Carew Meredith devised a version of the possible worlds semantics several years before Saul Kripke published his first paper on the topic. An iconoclast and a resourceful innovator, Prior inspired many to undertake work in intensional logic.

Much of Prior’s research consisted of the tireless exploration of a labyrinth of axiomatic calculi. Yet for him the point of a logical calculus was always that it had a subject matter, be it time, obligation, agency, or even biology, and a concern for philosophical problems never lay far below his theorems. It was the extra-symbolic world that mattered to Prior, not the formal results per se. He wrote:

Philosophy, including Logic, is not primarily about language, but about the real world. … Formalism, i.e. the theory that Logic is just about symbols and not things, is false. Nevertheless, it is important to ‘formalise’ as much as we can, i.e. to state truths about things in a rigorous language with a known and explicit structure. (1996a: 45)

The first New Zealand-born logician, Prior was the founding father of logic in New Zealand and also a driving force behind the renaissance in British logic from 1956.

1. Work on Tense Logic

Prior’s most significant achievement was the invention and development of tense logic. Tense logic involves two new modal operators, ‘It will be the case that’ and ‘It has been the case that’.

During the 1940s, the logic of time was in its infancy. In 1941 Findlay briefly suggested a ‘calculus of tenses’, as explained below, and in 1947 both Łoś, in Poland, and Reichenbach, in the United States, published limited proposals concerning the logic of time (Łoś 1947, Reichenbach 1947; Łoś’s paper was reviewed in English by Hiż 1951; see also Prior 1967a: 12–15, 212–213, and Tkaczyk and Jarmużek 2018). However, neither Łoś nor Reichenbach anticipated the crucial idea of using modal operators to create a formal calculus of time.

Prior catalysed the field with his detailed proposals for a modal logic of time-distinctions. His tense logic was nothing less than a new paradigm for the study of time (Hasle and Øhrstrøm 2016). Prior went on to use his tense logic to articulate theories about the structure and metaphysics of time and to mount a robust defence of freewill and indeterminism. Tense logic is now also employed for the manipulation of time-dependent data and has numerous applications in computing, including database management, program verification, and commonsense reasoning in artificial intelligence.

1.1 Origins of Tense Logic

Prior’s earliest mention of a logic of time-distinctions is to be found in the penultimate chapter of his unpublished manuscript The Craft of Formal Logic. The Craft, completed in 1951 (Prior 1951), was intended to be his first book on formal logic. Following von Wright in ‘Deontic Logic’ (von Wright 1951b), Prior remarked that there are other groups of modal predicates to be set alongside the ordinary or ‘alethic’ modes of necessity and possibility. He referred to these non-alethic modalities as ‘quasi-modals’. After noting that Peter of Spain classified adverbial distinctions of time as modes, he said:

That there should be a modal logic of time-distinctions has been suggested in our own day by Professor Findlay. (1951: 750)

Findlay’s paper ‘Time: A Treatment of Some Puzzles’ had appeared in the Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy in 1941. Prior became aware of it as a result of its appearance in Flew’s 1951 collection Essays on Logic and Language, which arrived in New Zealand just as Prior was writing the final chapters of The Craft. The suggestion Prior referred to is barely more than a passing comment: ‘[O]ur conventions with regard to tenses are so well worked out that we have practically the materials in them for a formal calculus’, wrote Findlay. He continued in a footnote:

The calculus of tenses should have been included in the modern development of modal logics. It includes such obvious propositions as that

\(x\) present \(\leftrightarrow(x\) present) present;

\(x\) future \(\leftrightarrow(x\) future) present \(\leftrightarrow (x\) present) future;

also such comparatively recondite propositions as that

\((x).(x\) past) future; i.e., all events, past, present and future, will be past.

Prior’s discovery of Findlay’s footnote followed hard on the heels of another discovery. In 1949 he learned (from Geach’s review of Julius Weinberg’s Nicolaus of Autricourt: A Study in 14th Century Thought) that, for the scholastics, an expression like ‘Socrates is sitting down’—an example discussed by Aristotle—is complete, in the sense of being assertible as it is, and is true at certain times, false at others. Prior was more familiar with the view (still widespread today) that such an expression is incomplete until a time-reference is supplied, and hence that—despite the seeming naturalness of doing so—one cannot regard the expression as changing its truth-value with the passage of time. The ancient view, that this change in value can and does occur, was a crucial discovery for Prior. He wrote about it in The Craft, contrasting it with the modern view that ‘Socrates is sitting down’ is not a ‘complete proposition’ but rather a ‘movable part’ that occurs in many different complete propositions: ‘“Socrates is sitting down” is thought of, we might say, as a diary entry, with a date, hour, minute and second beside it, and this date, etc. is part of the “proposition”’ (1951: 98). (For more about Prior’s discussion of temporality in The Craft see Markoska-Cubrinovska 2017.)

This idea that tensed propositions are liable to be true at one time and false at another became central to Prior’s philosophy. In a summary of his views, composed nearly two decades later, he wrote:

Certainly there are unchanging truths, but there are changing truths also, and it is a pity if logic ignores these, and leaves it … to comparatively informal ‘dialecticians’ to study the more ‘dynamic’ aspects of reality. (Prior 1996a: 46)

1.1.1 Tense, indeterminism and freewill

Geach’s review sent Prior back to the ancient sources, and he found Aristotle saying that some propositions about the future, namely propositions concerning events that are not determined at the time of utterance, are neither true nor false when they are uttered, since there is, at that time, as yet no definite fact with which they accord or conflict. Prior quoted Aristotle’s argument (in ch. 9 of De Interpretatione) for believing in such events: if the future were determined, ‘there would be no need to deliberate or take trouble, on the supposition that if we should adopt a certain course, a certain result would follow, while, if we did not, the result would not follow’ (Prior 1953: 322–323).

For many years Prior had been a Barthian Calvinist, and, as Prior put it, the theologian Karl Barth ‘attacked freewill in the name of religion’ (Prior n.d.b: 1). In his mature work, however, Prior was on the side of freewill and indeterminism. He developed profound technical analyses of the idea that the future is open, a branching tree of possibilities. The mature Prior said:

One of the big differences between the past and the future is that once something has become past, it is, as it were, out of our reach—once a thing has happened, nothing we can do can make it not to have happened. But the future is to some extent, even though it is only to a very small extent, something we can make for ourselves. And this is a distinction which a tenseless logic is unable to express. (Prior 1996b: 48)

There can be no doubt that the origin of Prior’s tense logic was bound up with his change of mind about freewill. Landmark papers on his path from determinism to indeterminism and the rejection of Calvinism were:

  • (Prior n.d.a), in which a transitional soft determinism is propounded. This early typescript—which cites William James on freewill and determinism—probably dates from around 1941. According to determinism, the ‘causal chain’ is ‘all-embracing’, Prior said, but even though we are ‘part of the causal chain’, we are not ‘pure effect’. The ‘chain of causation’ runs ‘within’ us ‘as well as outside’: we ourselves are causes. He continued: ‘The only kind of universe in which general freedom is conceivable is one which we might call “loosely packed”’, and he emphasized that determinism ‘is compatible with a relatively loose packing of the things in the world’. In a loosely packed universe, ‘Causes and effects may not form a single chain; events may run in a number of chains which are partly independent of one another’. He explained:

    In a box of powder which is ground infinitely small and packed infinitely tightly, the slightest disturbance in one area will affect the most distant grains. If, however, the grains are relatively large and packed relatively loosely, one can imagine, for example, a circular motion of the grains in one area which does not affect even quite closely adjacent grains at all … Common notions of freewill and partial responsibility seem to involve a picture of the world rather like this…. The common notion assumes a ‘moderately’ loose packing in which there is elbow-room for a measure of free action, but in which we are sufficiently bound together by ‘necessity’ for us to have a measure of influence on one another and responsibility for one another.

    (In another typescript from the same period (Prior n.d.b) he wrote that ‘our choices are pre-determined’ but that ‘it is in our power to find out what the forces are which determine our choices, and even to exercise some control over them (while, of course, being in this very exercise “controlled” by other forces which do not worry us). Prior’s (n.d.b) is discussed in detail in Hasle (1999) and (2012).)

  • (Prior 1947), in which he firmly distances himself from Barth.

  • (Prior 1953), in which (following the Polish logician Jan Łukasiewicz) he uses a 3-valued logic to formalize the Aristotelian view that ‘propositions about such future events as are not already predetermined’ are neither true nor false (1953: 322).

  • (Prior 1955b), his first publication on tense logic.

1.1.2 The first tense logic

Prior wished to formalise the ancient insight that propositions can change in truth value with the passage of time. He soon realised that off-the-shelf modal syntax could be adapted to do this. It was simply a matter of taking seriously the idea he had discussed in The Craft of Formal Logic: tense is a species of modality, to be set alongside the ordinary (‘alethic’) modes of necessity and possibility. When he discovered the ‘Master Argument’ of Megarian logician Diodorus Chronos (in Benson Mates’ 1953 book Stoic Logic), Prior’s exegesis of Diodorus’s argument became the backdrop to his first publication on tense logic, ‘Diodoran Modalities’ (1955b).

Diodorus defined the possible as what is or will be true: according to Diodorus, what actually happens is all that can happen. Diodorus, Prior later said, ‘seems to have been an ancient Greek W.V. Quine, who regarded the Aristotelian logic of possibility and necessity with some scepticism, but offered nevertheless some “harmless” senses that might be attached to modal words’ (1967a: 16). Prior found this deterministic definition of the possible uncongenial and set about locating a fallacy in the argument that Diodorus had used to support it, the so-called Master Argument:

The aim of the Master Argument, as I conceive it, was to refute the Aristotelian view that while it is now beyond the power of men or gods to affect the past, there are alternative futures between which choice is possible. Against this, Diodorus held that the possible is simply what either is or will be true. (Prior 1962a: 138; see also 1967a: 33.)

Consideration of the Master Argument brought together three of Prior’s great interests: indeterminism, modal logic, and the logic of time. In the course of his reflections on the argument, Findlay’s footnote pushed its way to the front of his mind. His wife Mary remembered ‘his waking me one night, coming and sitting on my bed, and reading a footnote from John Findlay’s article on time, and saying he thought one could make a formalised tense logic’ (Kenny 1970: 336).

‘Diodoran Modalities’, completed by early 1954, set out Prior’s initial exploration of his calculus of tenses. On the first page he wrote:

I here propose to do something a little different, namely to employ the ordinary propositional variables ‘\(p\)’, ‘\(q\)’, ‘\(r\)’ etc., for ‘propositions’ in the Diodoran sense [i.e. propositions which ‘may be true at one time and false at another’] and to use certain operators which take such propositions as arguments, and which form functions taking such propositions as values. I shall use ‘\(Fp\)’ for ‘It will be the case that \(p\)’. (1955b: 205.)

The calculus of tenses presented in ‘Diodoran Modalities’ is the system produced by adding the following axioms, rules, and definition, to the ordinary propositional calculus. \((1)\ F(p \vee q) \equiv(Fp) \vee (Fq)\). \((2)\ FFp \rightarrow Fp\). (3) If \(p \equiv q\) is provable in the calculus (or is an axiom) then \(Fp \equiv Fq\) follows. (4) If \(p\) is provable in the calculus (or is an axiom) then \(Gp\) follows; where \(Gp\), the future perpetual form ‘It will always be the case that \(p\)’, is defined as \(\neg F\neg p\).

1.1.3 Prior’s 1954 Wellington Address

There was clearly more work to be done on this calculus—for one thing there was no mention of the past—and Prior duly set about extending his creation. He worked fast, and in August 1954 unveiled a system of far greater sophistication, in his Presidential Address to the second New Zealand Congress of Philosophy, held in Wellington.

Prior’s expanded calculus contained two additional axioms concerning futurity, \(Gp \rightarrow Fp\) and \(Fp \rightarrow FFp.\) There was also a simplification: instead of following his previous practice and defining \(G\) as \(\neg F\neg\), Prior took \(G\) as undefined and defined \(F\) as \(\neg G\neg\); this enabled him to replace the somewhat unwieldy axiom (1) by the more elegant \(G(p \rightarrow q) \rightarrow(Gp \rightarrow Gq)\). Moreover, he transformed this calculus of ‘pure futurity’ into a calculus of ‘pure pastness’ by replacing \(F\) throughout the axioms, rules, and definition, by the past tense operator \(P\) (‘It has been the case that’), and replacing \(G\) by the past perpetual operator \(H\) (‘It has always been the case that’).

Like ordinary modal logic, both these ‘pure’ calculi are monomodal; that is, each contains only one undefined modal operator. Prior wanted a ‘full tense calculus’, containing the two undefined operators \(G\) and \(H\), together with the operators \(F\) and \(P\) defined in terms of them (such a calculus is known as a \(bi\)modal logic). To obtain the full calculus it was not enough simply to bundle together the two ‘pure’ systems, because the two tense operators would remain independent of one another. Some interactive axioms, ‘laws which relate to the interaction of pastness and futurity’, were also required. Prior chose \(p \rightarrow\) \(GPp\) and \(p \rightarrow HFp.\)

What are the justifications for his axioms and rules? In ‘Diodoran Modalities’, Prior was content to describe \(FFp \rightarrow Fp\) as ‘obvious enough’, but by the time of the Wellington Congress his thinking had moved forward considerably. He there set out what he called the ‘\(l\)-calculus’ (he was later to prefer the term ‘\(U\)-calculus’). ‘\(l\)’ is the relation ‘is later than’ (relating dates). In the \(l\)-calculus, the propositions of the tense calculus are treated as expressing properties of dates. ‘lxz & \(px\)’ (where \(p\) might be ‘Socrates is sitting down’, for example) is read ‘\(x\) is later than \(z\) and \(p\) at \(x\)’ \((x\) and \(z\) are dates). Using the (arbitrary) date \(z\) to represent the time of utterance, \(Fp\) is equated with \(\exists x(lxz \amp px)\) (‘\(p\) at some time later than \(z\)’), and \(Pp\) with \(\exists x(lzx \amp px)\) (‘\(p\) at some time earlier than \(z\)’). \(Gp\) and \(Hp\) are equated with the universal quantifications \(\forall x(lxz \rightarrow px)\) and \(\forall x(lzx \rightarrow px)\) respectively. (Much later, Prior recast the date-terms of his \(U\)-calculi as ‘instant propositions’—propositions true at one and only one instant—so introducing what is now called hybrid logic.)

Prior showed that if various assumptions are made concerning the relation \(l\), the axioms of the tense calculus can be proved in the \(l\)-calculus. (Two years later, he and Meredith used essentially the same strategy in creating the possible worlds semantics for ordinary modal logic.) He discovered that \(FFp \rightarrow Fp\) and its image \(PPp\rightarrow Pp\) follow from the assumption \(lxy \rightarrow (lyz \rightarrow lxz),\) stating that the relation \(l\) is transitive. \(Fp \rightarrow FFp\) and its image \(Pp \rightarrow PPp\) follow given the assumption lxz \(\rightarrow \exists y(lxy \amp lyz),\) stating that ‘between any two dates there is another date’ (a condition sometimes said to express time’s density). \(Gp \rightarrow Fp\) follows given \(\exists xlxz,\) stating that ‘there is a date later than any given date’, i.e., that there is no last moment of time. \(Hp \rightarrow Pp\) requires \(\exists xlzx,\) stating that there is no first moment of time.

Prior showed, furthermore, that no assumptions at all are needed for the derivation of the two interactive axioms \(p \rightarrow GPp\) and \(p \rightarrow HFp,\) nor for the axioms \(G(p \rightarrow q) \rightarrow(Gp \rightarrow Gq)\) and \(H(p \rightarrow q) \rightarrow (Hp \rightarrow Hq)\). In the case of these formulae, the ordinary machinery of truth-functional and quantifier logic suffices for their proof. The same is true, he showed, of the four rules of the tense calculus ((3) and (4) above, together with the \(P\) form of (3) and the \(H\) form of (4)). This part, therefore, of Prior’s calculus of tenses is purely logical, whereas others of the axioms—those stating that \(l\) is transitive, that time is dense, and that there is no first or last moment of time—express physical properties of time. In later work, Prior considered further calculi, in which these particular ‘physical’ axioms are replaced by others, for example axioms stating that time has a first moment, or is linear (a ‘straight line’), or is non-linear, with the present always standing at the junction of a number of branches, any of which might become the actual future.

Which is metaphysically basic, the tense calculus or the \(l\)-calculus? Prior issued a warning against regarding the above interpretation of the tense calculus within the \(l\)-calculus as ‘a metaphysical explanation of what we mean by is, has been and will be’: the \(l\)-calculus, he said, is not ‘metaphysically fundamental’. His reason is that ‘\(F\)(Socrates is sitting down)’ means ‘It is now the case that it will be the case that Socrates is sitting down’, whereas there is no genuine way of representing the indexical ‘now’ in the \(l\)-calculus (the date variable \(z\) is not an indexical, any more than ‘21 January 1954’ is an indexical). Prior continued: ‘If there is to be any “interpretation” of our calculi in the metaphysical sense, it will probably need to be the other way round; that is, the \(l\)-calculus should be exhibited as a logical construction out of the \(PF\)-calculus rather than vice versa.’ This idea of the primacy of the tense calculus over the \(l\)-calculus (or, as he later put it, of McTaggart’s \(A\)-series over the \(B\)-series) became a central and distinctive tenet of his philosophy. Prior took a similar metaphysical position with respect to ordinary modal logic, arguing that the language of possible worlds is to be interpreted in terms of a language with modal operators and not, as is popularly held, vice versa. These issues form the theme of his final book Worlds, Times and Selves. (For more about the world–time parallel, see Rini and Cresswell 2012.)

1.1.4 The Master Argument and three-valued logic

In a matchless piece of philosophical reconstruction—in ‘Diodoran Modalities’—Prior expresses the conclusion of the Master Argument, that what neither is nor will be true is not possible, as \((\neg p \amp \neg Fp) \rightarrow \neg \Diamond p\), and derives this in his calculus from Diodorus’ premisses, \(Pp \rightarrow \neg \Diamond \neg Pp\) and \(\neg\Diamond q \rightarrow (\Box(p \rightarrow q) \rightarrow \neg\Diamond p),\) together with two ‘broad assumptions about time, likely to have been taken for granted both by Diodorus and by his main opponents’, viz. \(p \rightarrow HFp\) and \((\neg p \amp \neg Fp) \rightarrow P\neg Fp.\)

So the Master Argument is indeed valid. The fallacy, Prior tells us, lies with the second ‘broad assumption’ \((\neg p \amp \neg Fp) \rightarrow P\neg Fp\) (which says: when anything neither is nor will be the case, it has been the case that it will not be the case). This, Prior tells us, is not true if \(p\) refers to a future contingency, and thus has the truth value ½ or ‘indeterminate’. Where \(p\) is indeterminate, both \(Fp\) and \(\neg Fp\) are indeterminate, so the consequent of the disputed formula, \(P \neg Fp\), is false. \(\neg p\) must also be indeterminate (for if the negation of \(p\) were determinate, \(p\) could not be indeterminate). Thus the antecedent of the ‘broad assumption’, \(\neg p \amp \neg Fp\), is indeterminate, since both its conjuncts are indeterminate.

The next step of Prior’s argument was to appeal to Łukasiewicz’s 3-valued truth-table for \(\rightarrow\). According to the table, an indicative conditional with a false consequent and an indeterminate antecedent is not true but indeterminate:

\(\rightarrow\) 1 ½ 0
1 1 ½ 0
½ 1 1 ½
0 1 1 1

Thus Prior was able to ‘deny that propositions of the form [\(( \neg p \amp \neg Fp) \rightarrow\) P\(\neg\)Fp] are in all cases true’, so faulting the Master Argument.

The Master Argument for determinism continued to exercise Prior for the rest of his life, and some of the most useful and mathematically most interesting parts of his work were inspired by his thoughts on it. To pick just one example, from computer science, tense calculi that Prior developed—leading on from the idea that the Master Argument is defeated if time is conceived as branching into the future—have become useful for describing and verifying the behaviour of distributed and concurrent processing systems (see e.g. Ben-Ari, Pnueli, and Manna 1983).

1.2 Tense Logic Comes of Age

The text of Prior’s Wellington address was not published until 1958 (in the journal Franciscan Studies, under the title ‘The Syntax of Time-Distinctions’). It was Prior’s 1956 John Locke lectures at Oxford and the ensuing book Time and Modality (published in 1957) that brought Prior’s discoveries in tense and modal logic before a wider audience. A number of logicians—notably Thomas, Geach, Lemmon, Meredith and Kripke—took an immediate interest in Priorean modal logic, in particular his Diodoran system and his system \(Q\), a multivalued logic admitting the existence of contingent beings. Less immediate attention was paid to his tense logic. The bibliography of the subject in Prior’s 1968 volume Papers on Time and Tense reveals that up until 1965 the only publications in the field were either by Prior himself or were reviews of his work (chiefly of Time and Modality). Yet a momentum was slowly gathering.

At a colloquium on modal and many-valued logics held in Helsinki, in 1962, Hintikka proposed a tense-logical construal of his possible worlds semantics, maintaining that ‘if we do not want to tie our logic to old-fashioned physics, we are undoubtedly wiser if we … no longer require that the alternativeness relation (in this case it could perhaps be more appropriately termed “futurity relation”) effect a linear ordering’ (1963: 76). Prior had happily tied his 1954 \(l\)-relation to ‘old-fashioned physics’: he later made it clear that he did not think much of the view of time embodied in twentieth century physics (1996b: 49–51).

A pupil of von Wright, Hintikka had been stimulated by the latter’s proposals for the wide application of modal logic (see the next Section) and had come to appreciate the possibility of applying modal notions to the study of the logic of time before he learned of Prior’s sophisticated work (through reading Time and Modality, which he reviewed in 1958). Hintikka was perhaps the first to stress the importance of a semantical approach to the tenses. During the early 1960s, he travelled regularly between Helsinki and California and his ideas on tense influenced a number of logicians working in California, in particular Dana Scott.

1962 was a significant year for tense logic. As well as Hintikka’s talk in Helsinki, Scott gave a lecture on tense logic in Amsterdam (Hans Kamp, then an undergraduate, was among his audience). Scott’s work on tense logic was one aspect of his study of the semantics of natural language, which he pursued in close collaboration with Richard Montague. Scott was aware of Prior’s work, and was also influenced in his understanding of tense by Reichenbach’s 1947 analysis (the latter was a powerful figure at UCLA until his death in 1953). Prior himself was critical of Reichenbach’s analysis of the tenses, describing it as having been ‘in some ways a hindrance rather than a help to the construction of a logic of tenses’ (Prior 1967a: 13). Scott’s work in tense logic was different in style from Prior’s. He established the completeness and decidability of various axiomatic tense logics, and also showed that the temporal predicate logic of the reals is non-axiomatisable. His work in tense logic is widely cited but remains unpublished. Prior learned of Scott’s work in January 1964, in a letter from Lemmon (who the previous year had left Oxford for Claremont, near Los Angeles).

In 1965 Prior visited California for several months, as Flint Professor of Philosophy at UCLA. For the first time he found himself among a group of enthusiasts for tense logic. Shortly after the visit ended he was to write: ‘I suppose that California is the most logically mature place in the world, and now that the logic of tenses is pursued so widely and so vigorously there, its raw pioneering days can be considered over’ (1967a: vi). When Prior arrived at UCLA, Nino Cocchiarella was just completing a Ph.D. thesis on quantified modal and tense logic, under Montague’s supervision (‘Tense and Modal Logic: A Study in the Topology of Temporal Reference’). Cocchiarella’s interest in the philosophy of time had initially been aroused by Reichenbach’s work on space and time, but it was his acquaintance with Prior’s Time and Modality that swept him into tense-logical research. (Only later did he learn of Scott’s work.) Prior’s visit also coincided with Hans Kamp’s arrival at UCLA as a graduate student. Kamp attended Prior’s lectures on tense logic in his first semester and became deeply interested in the subject. The lectures led more or less directly to the topic of Kamp’s Ph.D. thesis, written under Montague’s supervision and entitled ‘On Tense Logic and the Theory of Order’ (1968). In Kamp’s work the development of tense logic achieved a new level of formal sophistication. Segerberg, too, had just arrived in California, to study under Scott at Stanford. Segerberg had become interested in tense logic in Finland in 1964, at a series of summer seminars given by von Wright, who was independently pursuing a tense logic arising from his study of the logic of action, and later shown to be equivalent to a system Prior had discussed in Time and Modality (Prior 1957: 23–4; see von Wright 1965 and Segerberg 1967, 1989).

In December 1965 Scott delivered his famous talk to the Hume Society at Stanford entitled ‘The Logic of Tenses’. A multilith of Scott’s handwritten notes for this talk has been circulating ever since among tense logicians. Four days later Prior himself addressed the Society, again on tense logic. It was in this fecund atmosphere that Prior completed the manuscript of his book Past, Present and Future, which remains to this day one of the most important references in the field.

The years 1965–7 saw the publication of work in tense logic by Åqvist, Bull, Clifford, Cocchiarella, Garson, Geach, Hamblin, Luce, Makinson, Rescher, Segerberg, von Wright—and, of course, Prior. In a little over a decade Prior’s invention had become an internationally pursued branch of logic.

Prior always had a firm belief that his tense logic would one day find useful applications in other disciplines (possibly in mathematical physics, he thought). When the outside demand for tense logic did come, it was from linguistics (via Montague’s papers, especially his 1970) and from computer science. An early and influential computer science application was by Pnueli, who employed tense logic in formal reasoning about the behaviour of concurrent programs (Pnueli 1977). Pnueli is sometimes mistakenly credited with having originated tense logic, but in fact he first learned of it from the classic 1971 volume Temporal Logic by Rescher and Urquhart (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995: 344)—a book dedicated to Prior and which is an elegant introduction to his work. The citation for Pnueli’s 1996 A. M. Turing Award begins ‘For seminal work introducing temporal logic into computing science’. (Goldblatt 1987 surveys the connections between temporal logic and computer science that were emerging during the decade following Pnueli 1997.)

Prior would not have been completely surprised to learn how useful tense logic has proved to be in computer science. He himself took little interest in computing, beyond including material on elementary boolean circuit theory in his undergraduate lectures, but a number of the logicians with whom he was in touch were more deeply involved (Dov Gabbay and Dana Scott, for instance). Through others Prior knew something of the potential. He wrote ‘There are practical gains to be had from this study too, for example in the representation of time-delay in computer circuits’ (1996a: 46). In Past, Present and Future he remarked concerning logics of discrete time that their usefulness ‘does not depend on any serious metaphysical assumption that time is discrete; they are applicable in limited fields of discourse in which we are concerned only with what happens next in a sequence of discrete states, e.g. in the workings of a digital computer’ (1967a: 67). Other logics from a wide group that Prior and von Wright pioneered are also finding computational applications, for example epistemic logic in artificial intelligence and knowledge-base engineering, and the logic of action in programming theory. It is pleasant to reflect that two major forces in the genesis of these software technologies were Prior’s love of ancient and medieval logic and his concern to make conceptual room for freedom of the human will.

2. Work on Modal Logic

Of the four technical papers that marked the explosive beginning of Prior’s career as a formal logician in 1952 (1952a-d), two concerned modal logic. ‘Modality De Dicto and Modality De Re’ is a discussion of this distinction as it appears in Aristotle, Ockham, and Peter of Spain, together with a comparison of these earlier views with those of von Wright in his 1951 book An Essay on Modal Logic. ‘In What Sense is Modal Logic Many-Valued?’ concerns Łukasiewicz’s four-valued matrices for modal logic. In this paper Prior took issue with the view ‘that the logic of modality cannot be satisfactorily studied unless we use a many-valued calculus for its formal expression’, and he proposed a subversive interpretation of the four-valued matrices according to which modal propositions remain bivalent. This paper was the curtain raiser to Prior’s extensive study of Łukasiewicz’s work on modality, and thereafter he read Łukasiewicz widely—even material in Polish, saying ‘the symbols are so illuminating that the fact that the text is incomprehensible doesn’t much matter’.

2.1 The Craft of Formal Logic

Prior’s entry into modal logic was bound up with his passion for ancient and early logic. His first essay on the subject, the penultimate chapter—‘Modality’—of his ill-fated manuscript The Craft of Formal Logic, is largely historical in nature, with discussions of Aristotle, Peter of Spain, John Wallis, the Port Royal Logic, Isaac Watts’ Logick, Whately, Aldrich, de Morgan, and Hume and Mill on natural necessity. To judge by his references in The Craft, his first encounters with modern symbolic modal logic must have been the pioneering explorations by Lewis in his and Langford’s Symbolic Logic, Bochenski’s chapter ‘La Logique de la Modalité’ in his La Logique de Théophraste, and Feys’ article ‘Les Systèmes Formalisés des Modalités Aristotéliciennes’ (Lewis and Langford 1932, Bochenski 1947, Feys 1950). Other important early influences were von Wright’s ‘Deontic Logic’ and An Essay in Modal Logic, both published in 1951. Probably through Bochenski’s writings, Prior had discovered Łukasiewicz’s work in symbolic modal logic by the time of ‘In What Sense is Modal Logic Many-Valued?’. In that paper Prior focussed on Łukasiewicz’s ‘On Variable Functors of Propositional Arguments’ (Łukasiewicz 1951b), which he described in a 1952 review of Łukasiewicz’s symbolic logic as ‘quite the most exciting contribution that has been made to symbolic logic in English for a very long time’. Łukasiewicz’s work on modality was a major influence on Prior, who wrote in the Preface to Time and Modality: ‘[W]hile I differed radically from the late Professor Łukasiewicz on the subject of modal logic, my debt to him will be obvious on almost every page’.)

One of Prior’s conclusions in ‘Modality’, significant for his later work, is that ‘[t]here is everything to be said … for the … view that we may not only use devices developed in the study of quantity to throw light on modality, but also vice versa’ (1951: 747). One of the most distinctive features of his mature philosophy was the view that quantification over possible worlds and instants is to be interpreted in terms of modality and tense, which constitute primitive notions—a view he held in tandem with the belief that the study of such quantifications could usefully illuminate the study of modality and tense (as in his own \(U\)-calculi, described below).

Prior arrived at another important insight in the penultimate chapter of The Craft. Early in 1951 he read von Wright’s article ‘Deontic Logic’ and in ‘Modality’ he gave a cameo discussion of this area. His reading of von Wright reinforced in his mind an idea that he had come across in Peter of Spain, Isaac Watts, and the Port Royal Logic, an idea that was to be of considerable significance for his own future work. What von Wright called the ‘alethic’ modes—necessity, possibility, impossibility and contingency—are members of an extended group of concepts that includes the epistemic modes (‘it is known that’, ‘it is not known to be false that’, etc.), the doxastic modes (such as ‘it is believed that’), and the deontic modes (which include ‘it is permitted that’ and ‘it is obligatory that’). In The Craft Prior also listed Watts’ ‘it is written that’ and ‘it is said that’, noting that ‘one could think of innumerable others’ (1951: 749). Later, von Wright was to draw attention to what may be called the agentive modes: ‘the agent brings it about that’, ‘the agent makes it true that’, and the like (von Wright 1963).

Prior introduced the collective term ‘quasi-modals’ for the non-alethic modes (1951: 749) and remarked, accurately, that ‘there is a hint of a large field here’ (1951: 752). He was later to refer to his own tense operators as quasi-modal operators (1968: 138). By the time he wrote Formal Logic he was advocating the study of ‘the general modal form “It is — that \(p\)” … as a distinct propositional form’, observing that ‘this field has not been much cultivated’ (1955a: 218).

2.2 General Intensional Logic

Between them Prior and von Wright pioneered the now much investigated field of general intensional logic, in which the syntax, and latterly the semantics, developed for the study of the alethic modalities is used in the analysis of a wide range of quasi-modal concepts. Von Wright’s deontic logic and Prior’s tense logic were the first major successes in this field.

Prior was convinced that no satisfactory metalinguistic analysis can be given of sentences having the general modal form ‘It is — that \(p\)’. In Formal Logic he wrote: ‘It is quite plain, for example, that I am not talking about the sentence “Socrates is dead” when I say “I wish that Socrates were dead”’ (1955a: 219). In Time and Modality he reiterated the point, now in connection with the tenses: ‘“Professor Carnap will be flying to the moon” … is quite obviously a statement about Professor Carnap, and quite obviously not a statement about the statement “Professor Carnap is flying to the moon”’ (1957: 8).

What, then, is the semantic value of an expression replacing \(p\) in a sentence of the general modal form ‘It is — that \(p\)’? Certainly not a truth value, as is the case with the standard extensional propositional calculus, for substituting a different expression with the same truth value into the sentence of the form ‘It is — that \(p\)’ may alter the truth value of the latter sentence. Prior’s answer—and in a sense it amounts to a rejection of the question—is that modal functions take propositions as arguments, but propositions are logical constructions. All sentences containing the word ‘proposition’—including such sentences as ‘A modal operator expresses a function from propositions to truth values’—mean no more and no less than sentences which contain neither the word ‘proposition’ nor an equivalent. In essence, Prior’s view is that there are intensional contexts but no intensions. For the last six years of his life he worked on a book that was to give systematic expression to his views on propositions. The incomplete manuscript, which Prior had entitled Objects of Thought, was published posthumously in 1971.

2.3 Prior and Possible Worlds Semantics

Prior’s detailed contributions to the development of modal logic are legion. At least one aspect of his work has not received the recognition it deserves. Several years ahead of Kripke, Prior and his collaborator Carew Meredith invented crucial elements of the possible worlds semantics for propositional modal logic, including the all-important binary relation, which opens the way to modelling systems of different strengths. Meredith was a lecturer in mathematics at Trinity College, Dublin; his interest in logic had been stimulated by the arrival of Łukasiewicz in Dublin shortly after the second world war.

Prior foreshadowed his later work on possible worlds semantics in The Craft. Discussing work by Boole, he wrote:

What Boole was after might perhaps have been plainer if he had said something like this: There is one ‘hypothetical Universe’, which contains the totality of what we might call possibilities, or if you like, ‘possible worlds’. (1951: 462.)

Then in the penultimate chapter of The Craft he said:

For the similarity in behaviour between signs of modality and signs of quantity, various explanations may be offered. It may be, for example, that signs of modality are just ordinary quantifiers operating upon a peculiar subject-matter, namely possible states of affairs … It would not be quite accurate to describe theories of this sort as ‘reducing modality to quantity’. They do reduce modal distinctions to distinctions of quantity, but the variables to which the quantifiers are attached retain something modal in their signification — they signify ‘possibilities’, ‘chances’, ‘possible states of affairs’, ‘possible combinations of truth-values’, or the like. (1951: 736–7.)

As sources for these ideas Prior cited John Wallis (a seventeenth century mathematician) and the account of logically necessary and logically impossible propositions given by Wittgenstein in the Tractatus (1951: 737). Interestingly, he mentioned Carnap only in a footnote: ‘Professor Carnap has a similar definition of logical necessity in terms of what he calls “state-descriptions”’ (ibid). Prior did not refer to, and presumably had not at that time read, Carnap’s 1946 paper ‘Modalities and Quantification’, which attempted a semantics for quantified S5 in terms of state-descriptions. (A state-description is a class of sentences satisfying certain conditions; each state-description represents a possible state of affairs.) Carnap too cited the Tractatus account of modal propositions as his inspiration (1946: 47).

Prior goes on in The Craft to defend his account of modality as quantification over possible states of affairs against various alternatives, for example the Andersonian account, according to which ‘Every table here is necessarily brown’ means ‘There is a property which every table here in fact possesses, and of which it is true that everything that possesses it is in fact brown’. John Anderson, Professor at the University of Sydney, was a leading figure in the development of philosophy in Australasia.

In 1956 Prior wrote up (and circulated in mimeograph form) his and Meredith’s formal work on what he later described (1962a: 140) as the ‘logic of world-accessibility’, in a paper entitled ‘Interpretations of Different Modal Logics in the “Property Calculus”’ (Meredith and Prior 1956, first published in Copeland 1996). It carried the attribution ‘C.A.M., August 1956; recorded and expanded A.N.P.’. Prior mentioned this paper in Past, Present and Future (1967: 42–5) and in his 1962 articles ‘Possible Worlds’ and ‘Tense-Logic and the Continuity of Time’. The paper seems to have been the earliest to employ a binary relation between points in order to discriminate between S5 and weaker systems, the points being regarded as possible states of affairs. Carnap’s pioneering 1946 paper concerned only S5 and contained no such relation.

The property calculus is essentially a variation of Prior’s 1954 \(l\)-calculus described above. In the \(l\)-calculus, tense-modal propositions are treated as predicates expressing properties of dates, and quantification theory is supplemented with various special axioms for a binary relation ‘\(l\)’ taking dates as arguments. In the modal version of the calculus, sentences of modal logic are treated as if they express properties of certain objects \(a, b, c\), etc. Objects are related by a binary relation \(U\). In their 1956 paper Prior and Meredith supplied no account of what a formula of form ‘\(Uab\)’ might express. They gave the following definitions of necessity \(\Box\) and possibility \(\Diamond\), where ‘\(pa\)’ indicates that object \(a\) has the property expressed by the sentence \(p\).

\[\begin{align} (\Box p)a &= \forall x(Uax \rightarrow px) \\ (\Diamond p)a &= \exists x(Uax \amp px). \end{align}\]

(Following Łukasiewicz, Prior and Meredith themselves used ‘L’ in place of ‘\(\Box\)’ and ‘M’ in place of ‘\(\Diamond\)’.) Their calculus consisted of ordinary quantification theory supplemented by these definitions, together with certain axioms governing the relation \(U\)—see below—and the following clauses:

\[\begin{align} (\neg p)a &= \neg (pa) \\ (p \rightarrow q)a &= (pa) \rightarrow (qa). \end{align}\]

It is implied in the 1956 paper that a proposition \(p\) is to be called a theorem of the calculus if and only if \(pa\) is provable for an arbitrarily chosen object \(a\).

Axioms for \(U\) are selected from a list containing (among others):

1. \(Uaa\) \((U\) is reflexive)

2. \(Uab \rightarrow (Ubc \rightarrow Uac)\) (\(U\) is transitive)

3. \(Uab \rightarrow Uba\) (\(U\) is symmetrical).

Axiom 2 was also present in the 1954 \(l\)-calculus.

Prior and Meredith stated in their 1956 paper that the distribution principle \(\Box(p \rightarrow q) \rightarrow (\Box p \rightarrow \Box q)\) is a theorem in the absence of any special axioms for \(U\); that \(\Box p \rightarrow p\) is a theorem if axiom 1 is imposed; that axiom 2 gives the S4 principle \(\Box p \rightarrow \Box \Box p\); and that 2 together with 3 give the S5 principle \(\Diamond \Box p \rightarrow \Box p\). Their approach was proof-theoretic in its basic orientation and they offered no completeness results. In (1962a) and (1962b) Prior extended this approach to systems between S4 and S5, and to systems independent of S4 between T and S5.

What of the meaning of the binary relation \(U\)? As previously remarked, the idea that the variables of quantification of the calculus should range over possible states of affairs or possible worlds is present in The Craft. In 1960, following a suggestion by Geach, Prior began thinking of \(U\) as a relation of accessibility between worlds. Prior tells us that Geach cashed out the notion of ‘reaching’ one world from another in terms of ‘some dimension-jumping vehicle dreamed up by science fiction’ (1962b: 36; see also 1962a: 140). (Geach referred to the whole business as ‘Trans World Airlines’.) With this interpretation of \(U\) to hand, the property calculus can be viewed as treating \((\Box p)a\) — or ‘Necessarily\(-p\) in world \(a\)’ — as short for ‘\(p\) is true in all worlds accessible from \(a\)’.

Lemmon, in a draft of material intended for his and Dana Scott’s projected book ‘Intensional Logic’, mistakenly credited Geach with the idea that the binary relation ‘may be intuitively thought of as a relation between possible worlds’. In a letter to Scott, written after Lemmon’s death in 1966, Prior remarked: ‘What Geach contributed was not the interpretation of \([U]\) as a relation between worlds (God knows when that started), but the interpretation of \([U]\) as a relation of accessibility’. When Prior said ‘God knows when that started’ he was presumably referring to the idea that the ‘objects’ of the calculus be regarded as possible worlds. He was right to think that the history of this idea is a tangled one. Priority is often assigned to Leibniz, but scholars have traced the idea back to Duns Scotus and William of Ockham (Knuuttila 1993).

It seems that the binary relation first made its appearance in a 1951 article by Jonsson and Tarski, ‘Boolean Algebras with Operators’. In their Theorem 3.14 they established that every closure algebra is isomorphic to an algebraic system formed by a set and a reflexive and transitive relation between its elements; their Theorem 3.5 considered also a symmetry condition. In hindsight, these theorems (which explicitly concerned boolean algebras) can be viewed as in effect a treatment of all the basic modal axioms and corresponding properties of the accessibility relation. Concerning this article, Saul Kripke remarked (in Copeland 1996: 13):

Had they known they were doing modal logic, they would have had the completeness problem for many of the modal propositional systems wrapped up, and some powerful theorems. Mathematically they did this, but it was presented as algebra with no mention of semantics, modal logic, or possible worlds, let alone quantifiers. When I presented my paper at the conference in Finland in 1962, I emphasized the importance of this paper. Tarski was present, and said that he was unable to see any connection with what I was doing!

During the next eight years the binary relation was reinvented by a number of logicians. Prior, in his address to a conference in Wellington in 1954, seems to have been the first to use the binary relation in an explicitly tense-modal context. Other landmarks were an address by Montague to a conference held at UCLA in 1955 (Montague’s binary relation held between models rather than points or indices interpretable as worlds, and the notion of a possible world was absent), Prior and Meredith’s property calculus of 1956, lectures by Smiley in Cambridge in 1957 (Smiley pursued an algebraic approach), Kanger (1957), Hintikka (1957, 1961) and Kripke (1959a, 1959b, 1963). Kripke was familiar with Kanger’s work involving the binary relation at the time he obtained his own results. Kanger himself had read the 1951 paper by Jonsson and Tarski and he described his results as similar to theirs (Kanger 1957: 39). (Copeland (2002) gives a detailed history of possible worlds semantics.)

To the modern eye, Prior’s 1956 possible worlds semantics looks familiar yet also strange. There is no semantic ascent, and there are no frames, models, valuations, satisfaction clauses or truth conditions. Prior’s modal semantics belongs to a pre-modern era, the era of ‘translational’ semantics, a type of semantics that pre-dated the meteoric rise of Tarski-style truth-conditional semantics in the 1960s and 1970s (Copeland 2016). A translational semantics translates the targeted sentences into a more illuminating language, such as Prior’s enriched predicate calculus. For anyone who understands Prior’s augmented predicate calculus, his translational clauses, such as \((\Diamond p)a = \exists x(Uax \amp px),\) offer both an explanation of the meanings of the modal operators and an account of how the meanings of complex sentences (e.g. the S4 and S5 axioms) arise recursively from the meanings of their parts.

2.4 Prior and Kripke

Kripke first became interested in modal logic in 1956, as a result of reading Prior’s paper ‘Modality and Quantification in S5’ (Prior 1956a). Kripke was at this time still at high school, working on logic in almost complete isolation in Omaha, Nebraska. In 1958, he read Time and Modality and was impressed by the parallel Prior drew between tense and the alethic modalities.

At almost exactly the same time, Prior was reading Kripke’s first paper, ‘A Completeness Theorem in Modal Logic’ (Kripke 1959a), in his capacity as referee for the Journal of Symbolic Logic. In this paper Kripke stated and proved a completeness theorem for an extension of S5 with quantifiers and identity; the binary relation made no appearance. His first publication to mention the binary relation—which he interpreted as a relation of relative possibility between worlds—was written in 1962 and appeared in 1963 (Kripke 1963); the paper contained completeness proofs for propositional \(M\), S4, \(B\), and S5. Kripke reported (in correspondence with Copeland) that the idea of the binary relation occurred to him much earlier than 1962, in fact shortly after his paper on S5 was first submitted in the spring of 1958.

By the late summer of 1958, Kripke had a completeness result for S4. On 3 September 1958 he wrote to Prior, mentioning his work on semantical completeness theorems for quantified extensions of S4 with and without the Barcan formula (Marcus 1946, 1962). (Prior himself had already given an early counterexample to the Barcan formula in a tense-modal context (Prior 1957: 26, Copeland 2016).) In his September letter, Kripke gave a branching-time matrix, characteristic for S4. This is essentially a tense-logical interpretation of the reflexivity + transitivity semantics for S4. He wrote:

in an indetermined system, we perhaps should not regard time as a linear series, as you have done. Given the present moment, there are several possibilities for what the next moment may be like—and for each possible next moment, there are several possibilities for the moment after that. Thus the situation takes the form, not of a linear sequence, but of a ‘tree’.

(Some of the Kripke–Prior correspondence is now published in Ploug and Øhrstrøm 2012.)

There was a two-way traffic of ideas. A constant domain was assumed in Kripke’s 1959 ‘A Completeness Theorem in Modal Logic’, and Kripke suspects that Time and Modality first interested him in the problem of treating variable domains. He worked on Prior’s suggestion—formalised in Prior’s system \(Q\)—that variable domains might lead to truth-value gaps even at the level of propositional logic, although Kripke did not pursue this approach in his published material. Further, Kripke thinks it probable that Prior’s work on many-valued matrices in Time and Modality gave him the idea of converting possible worlds models into many-valued matrices, an approach he followed in his 1963 paper ‘Semantical Analysis of Modal Logic I: Normal Modal Propositional Calculi’.

3. Life and Philosophical Development

3.1 Launching Out

In 1932, at the age of 17, Prior left his home town, sleepy Masterton in the North Island of New Zealand, to become a student at the University of Otago in the South Island city of Dunedin. He seemed to prefer the South Island, saying the North Island gave him ‘the willies’. The son of a doctor, he initially planned a career as a biologist, but was soon beckoned away by theology and philosophy, graduating from Otago in 1935 with a B.A. in philosophy. At Otago he had thoughts of entering the ministry of the Presbyterian Church, and he was accepted into the required program of study. ‘Who’, he had asked himself in a 1931 manuscript, ‘are the greatest thinkers the world has known?’—answering ‘I have no hesitation in placing JESUS OF NAZARETH at the top of this list’ (Prior 1931: 107). In 1936, he abandoned the idea of entering the ministry, although he did subsequently work for a time as a locum minister in Birmingham, England, during his ‘bohemian period’ at the end of the 1930s.

It was John Findlay, Professor of Philosophy at Otago, who introduced Prior to logic. Findlay, a contemporary of Gilbert Ryle and William Kneale, had studied at Oxford and at Graz; his influential book Meinong’s Theory of Objects and Values was published during Prior’s second year at Otago. Under Findlay’s direction, Prior studied the 18th century British moralists and cut his teeth on W.E. Johnson’s classic text Logic. It was Findlay who first aroused his interest in the history of logic. In correspondence, Prior described Findlay’s Otago lectures as ‘thrilling’, and remarked that his offprint of Findlay’s 1936 article ‘Relational Properties’ was one of his ‘most valued literary possessions’. In 1949 he wrote of Findlay, ‘I owe to his teaching, directly or indirectly, almost all that I know of either Logic or Ethics’ (1949: xi), and he was later generously to describe Findlay as ‘the founding father of modern tense-logic’ (1967a: 1).

In 1936, the year following his graduation, Prior married. It was a whirlwind romance. In a letter written at the beginning of June 1936, he said he was ‘taking an interest in a rather desperate & in some ways rather dangerous little friend’, adding that he had been solemnly advised ‘not to fall in love’ with her. The rather dangerous Clare Hunter, an up-and-coming freelance reporter for the Otago Daily Times, was a feminist and free thinker. She encouraged Prior in what he called his ‘innate Bohemianism’. Before July was out, the two were planning to ‘get quietly married at the end of the year’, wrote Prior. This must soon have seemed too long a wait, for they wed the very next month. (There is a thumbnail biography of Hunter in Grimshaw (2018).)

Prior gained his M.A. in philosophy in 1937. His thesis, criticizing various philosophical approaches to logic, involved him in reading ‘a lot about Wittgenstein & certain kindred writers’, including Karl Popper. But the thesis was awarded only a second by the external examiner. Fortunately, Findlay knew a budding logician when he saw one, and secured Prior a one-year assistant lectureship at Otago. During the 1937 academic year Prior gave courses on logic, ethics, and probability theory. Findlay pressed him to contribute to the Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy, and Prior’s ‘The Nation and the Individual’ (influenced by John Wisdom) became his first published paper in philosophy, in December 1937. (Prior’s earlier theological writings are discussed in Hasle (1999) and (2012), Grimshaw (2002), and Jakobsen (2012) and (2016).) Prior mentioned ‘The Nation and the Individual’ and its origins in a 1937 letter:

The view of Philosophy as ‘analysis’ (to which Wittgenstein & co. have made important contributions) has proved remarkably fruitful in the fields of Logic, Ethics, Physics, Psychology & Metaphysics; but I would like to see it applied—& I think it is capable of very fruitful application—in Theology, Sociology, Economics & Political Ethics. … I’m … trying a little work along those lines at present myself—figuring out the consequences of treating a Nation as what these champions of ‘Analysis’ call a ‘logical construction’.

3.2 Religious Journalist

At the end of 1937 Prior set aside thoughts of an academic career and travelled to Europe with Clare, spending three bohemian years there. They planned to earn a living from freelance writing; Arthur wanted to gain ‘a footing in the English literary world’ (as he wrote to the New Zealand poet Ursula Bethell), and said he had ‘hopes of ending up eventually as the editor of a religious periodical’. This interlude in Europe, and its aftermath in New Zealand, was a critical period in Prior’s development—the crucible in which the mature thinker was formed. His social and political philosophy settled firmly to the far left, but ultimately fell short of Marxism; his pacifism escalated, only to be overturned by world events; and his theism began to wane into unbelief.

January 1938 saw the couple boarding the Orient Line’s S.S. Ormonde in Sydney, carrying large rucksacks. The Ormonde was bound for London via Colombo, Suez, Naples and Toulon. In Colombo, Prior took the opportunity to visit ‘a Hindoo temple, a Buddhist one, a Mahommedan mosque, a Roman Catholic church & an Anglican church’. He was, at this stage of his life, obsessed with religion. He believed in the virgin birth and the voice of the devil, and was a devout Presbyterian (Prior 1940). His impressions after his first encounter with extreme religious diversity were, he said, ‘very vivid, but very confused’. He described the Anglican church as ‘a foreign growth’, and what he called ‘the R. C. place’ was, he said, not ‘sufficiently distinguishable from the idolatries around it’. He decided that ‘Buddhism was a much saner sort of religion than either Hinduism or Mohammedanism’, and that ‘the Mahommedans are a particularly arrogant crowd, & obviously think they’re the lords of creation’.

Prior mused in a letter, ‘Ought I not to be trying to do a bit of “witnessing” to these crowds of heathen?’ Several of his early publications were given over to propounding the Christian message: the Christian God, he wrote, is ‘the Lord God Omnipotent, the High and Holy One who inhabiteth ETERNITY, absolutely independent of all being other than himself, and Creator, Lord and Judge of all’ (Prior 1934).

In later life, however, he described himself as having ‘no religious beliefs’ (Prior c.1967). In 1961, when Max Cresswell—then a logic student aged 21—met him for the first time, in Manchester, Prior announced: ‘Mr Cresswell, isn’t it a pity that God does not exist’.

3.3 First Taste of Europe

The Priors disembarked from the Ormonde in France. They planned to sleep out, but with winter fading into spring they soon tired of it, and moved into a small apartment in the village of Roquebrune, on the south coast. They ended up staying several months. Arthur liked France, saying ‘It’s the Reddest country we’ve been in so far’. Clare worked as a baker in a cake shop while Arthur translated essays by the French philosopher Georges Sorel. They swelled their meagre income by gambling at nearby Monte Carlo. ‘[W]e play very cautiously’, Arthur said—‘we’re a few hundred francs up’.

A short visit across the border to Hitler’s Germany left Prior aghast. ‘We got out of the place as fast as we could’, he said: ‘the general mental atmosphere is just one big Hell’. At Roquebrune he met a young German backpacker, a Lutheran, pleasant and mild of manner, according to Prior, but pro-Hitler and virulently anti-Jewish—the German responded with ‘a queer look’ when Prior ‘told him that if I was in Germany I would be a member of the Bekenntniskirche’, the anti-Hitler, Barth-inclined German Confessional Church. The Priors also visited Austria, not long after the March 1938 Anschluss (union) with Germany. Horrified by the rampant anti-semitism they found there, they wrote an article about the plight of the Austrian Jews for the Otago Daily Times, under Clare’s nom de plume ‘John Everdean’. They reported that posters bearing slogans like ‘You will never get clean milk if you get it from Jews’ were ruining Jewish businesses, and Jewish shops had a ‘dirty yellow placard pasted across the door’, warning customers away (Everdean 1938).

Prior anticipated his arrival in England with mixed feelings. He had experienced the English at close quarters aboard the Ormonde: they ‘stink with Race Prejudice’, he wrote. His experiences on the boat had he said taught him that he liked ‘Americans better than Englishmen’—and ‘Australians better than New Zealanders’. It was in the early summer of 1938 that the couple crossed the English Channel and settled in London. Whether the reality was better or worse than Prior’s expectations is hard to say. He certainly found ‘abominable race-prejudice’, and politically there was also ‘plenty to disgust us’—as well as ‘the extraordinary backwardness of England as compared with N.Z.’.

‘England’s a country that fills one with a kind of impotent and maddening despair’, he said. But he also emphasized that ‘London is the place to meet worth-while people’, saying not very long after he arrived, ‘We have so far been much more “successful” in London than we ever expected’. There was also a disappointment awaiting him: the SCM Press had declined a book manuscript on theologian Karl Barth he had sent to them just before leaving New Zealand. Next he tried T. & T. Clark, but the book never did see the light of day.

Prior was soon contributing reviews to a handful of magazines, including The Student Movement and the left-wing feminist weekly Time and Tide. The snag was that his work was usually unpaid—but he was allowed to keep the books he reviewed and he sold them at half-price. Things looked up when T. S. Eliot gave him a ‘decent payment’ for two reviews in the literary magazine The Criterion. (Prior found Eliot ‘decidedly on the old side’ and ‘very shy & quiet’.) But money was always tight. Eventually Clare started taking in typing and Arthur found temporary clerical work in the Examinations Department of London University (Prior 1941).

3.4 Politics

At first, the Priors lived in a handsome Georgian hotel close to the famous libraries of the British Museum and University College, but they quickly moved into cheaper accommodation in Lambeth. They were a short stroll from the bustling working-class street market of Lambeth Walk, and not far from overcrowded and insanitary slums. No doubt Lambeth reinforced the views Arthur had expressed the year before in the Otago Daily Times, under the pseudonym ‘Independent Labour’: ‘We must all fight either with the wage-earners for a society of wage-earners or with the profit-seekers for a society of profit-seekers’. For Arthur the ‘fundamental question’ was: ‘Are the workers going to group together to organise and undertake their own enterprise, or are they going to be at the beck and call of a privileged class’ (Prior 1937a).

He saw London through socialist eyes. The streets ‘are full of beggars’, he wrote to his cousin Hugh Teague: ‘blind men, paralytics, pavement artists, organ grinders, Welsh miners’. He gave the Red salute to the miners (who were fleeing in their thousands from devastating unemployment in Wales) and found they returned it ‘with great gusto’. The previous year he described his ‘thinking on social questions’ as owing ‘a great deal’ to the Trotskyist writings of Auckland philosopher William Anderson and also to the writings of the Marxist-Leninist thinker Sorel, whose essays he translated at Roquebrune. He said he learned more from Sorel ‘than from any other Marxist theoreticians’. Like Sorel, he saw the importance of ‘the substitution of a “producer-mentality” for an “employee-mentality” among the workers’: England’s problems, Prior said, included the ‘servility of the English masses’ and ‘their almost unbounded willingness to “keep their place”’.

He told Hugh: ‘I personally get much the same kind of “kick” out of reading Lenin at his best, as I do out of reading some of the tough & argumentative old Scottish Calvinists—John Knox and the rest’. Prior remained strongly left-wing for the rest of his life, but his flirtation with communism was over by 1946. In that year he wrote to his friend Lex Miller, saying he had been ‘released’ from ‘a sort of complex that I have had about Marxism right up till now, a kind of inward bondage to it despite all my points of difference from it, based on the feeling that though its philosophy might be abominable its economics were unanswerable.’

As Prior explained to Miller, he now saw that ‘the Marxists were guilty of an economic fallacy’:

all this business about capitalism involving a ‘contradiction’ seems to be just hooey … I write, of course, with the zeal of a convert; or more accurately with the indignation of a man who has just discovered that he has been hoodwinked for years.

In February 1939, Arthur summed up his and Clare’s situation in London: ‘I’m afraid we haven’t acclimatised ourselves to the ways of England’, he wrote: ‘We’ve no desire to be back in N.Z., but there’s a lot over here that it’s hard to stomach’. Worse, war was approaching. During the Munich crisis, in the autumn of the previous year, Clare had watched sandbag air-raid shelters being constructed across London, and she saw long queues everywhere as people waited to get gas masks fitted. She was (she wrote) ‘half-expecting to hear any moment the noise of thunder as planes filled the air’ (Everdean 1938a).

Hitler invaded Czechoslovakia in March 1939, and in July Arthur wrote about the plight of Czech refugees in the weekly newspaper The Christian World (Prior 1939). The Priors had been involved for some time in aiding refugees, and they applied for a job that Arthur called ‘tutor-&-mother-superior’ at a small hostel in the East End, caring for Jewish children fleeing Austria. It was, he said, ‘a very bitter disappointment’ when they did not get the job.

As Europe sank into war, the Priors were ardent pacifists. Not long after their visits to Germany and Austria, and as the Spanish Civil War raged, they joined the pacifist organisation Pax. New Zealand writer Dan Davin—who described the prewar Prior as resembling Welsh poet Dylan Thomas—spent some time with him in Oxford during the weeks before Britain’s declaration of war on Germany, saying that Prior would argue for long hours about pacifism in Oxford’s ‘Lamb & Flag’ pub (Kenny 1971).

When Britain finally lurched onto a war footing in September 1939, Prior found doubts about his pacifism creeping in: ‘I must confess my pacifism was a little shaky round about that time’, he wrote in December. ‘I was sure enough of my own duty not to join up, but was hesitant to condemn the whole business’.

3.5 Personal Courage, Bleak Times

During the first months of 1940 Prior worked on what he described as ‘a large book, on “The Theology of the Church of Scotland”’. Life in London went on almost normally during this time of Phoney War, but the situation worsened dramatically after the fall of France in June. A German invasion of Britain seemed imminent. Chillingly, Winston Churchill warned of the coming fighting ‘in the fields and in the streets’ (Churchill 1940/2007). For the Priors, it was time to go home.

Once back on New Zealand soil, Prior met with criticism and hostility for failing to stay and play his part in the war. But the journey home was certainly no cowardly retreat: more than 12,000 miles of unfriendly ocean lay between the Priors and New Zealand. At the beginning of August 1940, in Glasgow, they boarded an armed New Zealand liner, the MV Rangitiki, bound for Wellington via the Panama Canal. Their route lay across the North Atlantic, where German submarines and aircraft had sunk a total of 81 civilian vessels during the preceding two months, with a further 144 civilian vessels going down in British coastal waters in the same period (Roskill 1954). There were also armed German surface vessels preying on shipping in the waters around New Zealand, even laying minefields in the approaches (Waters 1956). During June–August these armed raiders sank several defenceless ships close to New Zealand—news that, like news of the Atlantic sinkings, could hardly have failed to reach the Priors. All in all, it must have been a nerve-racking journey.

Luckily the voyage passed without incident, and in September the Priors disembarked from the Rangitiki in Wellington. The ship was not so fortunate on her return journey to England, when she was attacked by a German battleship in the North Atlantic—in the same month that her sister liner the Rangitane was sunk while also en route from New Zealand to the UK. It had been a narrow escape for the Priors. As they started to pick up the threads of life in Wellington, the Luftwaffe’s bombs devastated their previous home of Lambeth.

The couple took an apartment in central Wellington, and in October Arthur started teaching French, English and History at a secondary school in the suburb of Rongotai. He gave this up in March 1941 and the Priors returned to Dunedin, joining the household of fellow pacifists Jack Brailsford and his wife Ruth—Arthur’s ‘Aunty Ruth’, who had cared for him when his mother died not long after his birth. Jack, a conscientious objector in the first world war, had been imprisoned for his pacifism in 1916 and was not released until just before the end of the fighting in 1918 (Brodie 1999).

It was while the Priors were living with the Brailsfords that Clare fell for their adopted Russian son Victor Roussin—at that time known as Norman Brailsford—and her marriage to Arthur disintegrated. Arthur, who did not want the relationship to end, eventually fled to Christchurch. The divorce became final in March 1943. What might have been a lengthy period of sadness for him was cut short in January of that year. He met Mary Wilkinson, the daughter of a Presbyterian minister, while attending a Student Christian Movement conference in Christchurch. They said afterwards that it was love at first sight. ‘We got engaged after meeting four times’, Mary remembered. The marriage began in October 1943 and lasted for the rest of Arthur’s life.

During 1941 Arthur had come to view his pacifism as untenable, though in December he wrote two letters to the Otago Daily Times defending ‘liberty of conscience’ and the right to be a conscientious objector. In January 1942, while he and Clare were still living with the Brailsfords in Dunedin, Arthur was called up, and instead of appealing for conscientious objector status himself, he applied to enlist in the Royal New Zealand Air Force (perhaps because, under the regulations in force at that time, such an appeal would have required him to say ‘that it is wrong to engage in warfare in any circumstances’). There is no evidence that Clare’s pacifism had also weakened, and Arthur’s thinking was manifestly undergoing other fundamental changes at this time. His enlistment papers contained the brief but telling entry ‘Religion: Atheist’. It seems that a philosophical and spiritual chasm had opened up between him and Clare.

The Air Force finally embraced him in November 1942 and he became a wireless mechanic, servicing aircraft radio equipment in New Zealand until January 1945, when he was posted to the New Hebrides islands (now Vanuatu), some 2000 miles to the north of New Zealand. There he remained until the Pacific war ended, returning to New Zealand in October 1945.

3.6 New Man

With his second marriage, Prior changed. He became ‘secure and serene’ (Kenny 1971). The rather priggish young man disappears from his letters and a more mature, more lovable Prior emerges. In November 1945, he applied for a temporary lectureship at Canterbury University College, in Christchurch, a vacancy created by Popper’s departure. By now he had a further three articles in the Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy—‘Can Religion be Discussed?’ (1942), ‘The Meaning of Good’ (1944), and ‘The Subject of Ethics’ (1945)—and with a strong recommendation from Findlay, he got the job. Prior started work in February 1946, on a salary of £600 a year. It was a new beginning.

At Canterbury he was thrown entirely on his own resources, being as he put it ‘the only philosopher about the place’. Prior bore the responsibility for providing a broad and balanced philosophy curriculum, yet his own formal education in philosophy had stopped short nine years previously. His one recourse in the face of isolation was to read, and read he did. In logic he began by returning to W.E. Johnson. Next came J.N. Keynes’s Studies and Exercises in Formal Logic and then (in his own phrase) he got stuck into Principia Mathematica. He learned a lot about the history of the subject from Peirce, whom he found ‘unexpectedly magnificent’. An important discovery, in 1950, was Bochenski’s Précis de Logique Mathematique (Bochenski 1949). Prior was fascinated by the ‘very neat symbolic notation’ due to Łukasiewicz, and before long he turned his back completely on the more usual Peano-Russell notation. In Łukasiewicz’s parenthesis-free notation, C\(pq\) is written for ‘If \(p\) then \(q\)’, and Bochenski was later to describe Prior as even more of a ‘CCCC-logician’ than he was himself. Łukasiewicz’s own Aristotle’s Syllogistic and Tarski’s Introduction to Logic soon followed. By now the logic bug had well and truly bitten. Prior saw from the work of the Poles that formal precision is possible in philosophy and this delighted him. The upshot of Prior’s reading for the curriculum was that his students learned Aristotelian and medieval logic, using Polish notation and with Bochenski’s Précis de Logique Mathematique as a text. ‘Despite the language difficulty, I have found this a first-class textbook to accompany lectures to New Zealand students’, Prior declared (1952c: 35).

An exuberant, playful man of seemingly inexhaustible vitality, Prior made an excellent teacher. He had no trace of pomposity or pretension. His students appreciated the friendly welcome they would receive at his home, not to mention his relaxed attitude toward the administrative paraphernalia of roll-taking and the like. In those days Canterbury University College was a formal, stuffy place and Prior was a breath of fresh air. Formality made him impatient; and he despised people he called ‘bullshit artists’ and ‘dicky-lickers’. In a milieu where jacket and tie were the norm—even in a sweltering New Zealand summer—Prior would lecture in baggy khaki shorts and roman sandals. His student Jim Wilson recalls the friendly informality of Prior’s first-year classes:

The strained precision of clock time was alien to him, so he was usually late for his own lectures (or anyone else’s for that matter—he was very egalitarian about it). But he almost always turned up eventually, thinning hair blown vertical by his dash on his bike when he remembered the time. He would pull cycle clips off his trousers and plonk an ancient shopping bag on the desk in front of him. Out of this bag would come … a cabbage, a bunch of carrots, a loaf of bread, a bottle of milk … until, always at the bottom, he would find the book he was looking for. Back into the bag went the rest of the goodies, then he would look up at us, apologise for being late if he was more than usually so, and ask: ‘Now where were we last time?’ Someone in the front row would consult her or his notes—Arthur couldn’t as he never had any—and would say ‘You were just dealing with such and such’. ‘Ah yes, thank you’ Arthur would respond, and forthwith launch into an extempore exposition which followed on perfectly from the previous session and was beautifully structured and clear even though he was just thinking along with us. And of course we could stop him and ask for clarification or elaboration at any time, without in the slightest affecting the overall structure and direction of his thoughts.

Soon after his discovery of Précis de Logique Mathematique, Prior wrote to Bochenski in Fribourg and then, a little later, to Łukasiewicz in Dublin. He was excited to receive replies. ‘We are, all of us, very isolated, being few and scattered’, wrote Bochenski. ‘It is a real pleasure to hear that a Colleague so far away is interested in the same problems you are working at and that he finds one’s little writings may be of some use.’ Thus began Prior’s voluminous correspondence with logicians the world over. There were other ways, too, in which his isolation lessened. In 1951 he met and became friends with John Mackie and Jack Smart, at a conference in Sydney. This was Prior’s first experience of being among a large gathering of philosophers; Mary Prior described the conference as his ‘entry into a wider world’. In the same year George Hughes was appointed to the Victoria University of Wellington. Prior and Hughes had to make the most of their all-too-infrequent meetings, sometimes talking until the birds woke. Prior soon imparted his enthusiasm for logic to Hughes.

Prior was also fortunate in having a number of excellent students during these early years, among them Jonathan Bennett and Ronald Butler: for Prior they were oases in the desert. In 1952, he gained an assistant lecturer, Sandy Anderson, son of the Sydney philosopher John Anderson, and following Prior’s promotion to Professor later that year, Philosophy became a department in its own right. Prior argued successfully for a new permanent member of staff, and in 1954 J.M. (Michael) Shorter was appointed to a lectureship. The young, Oxford-educated Shorter worked previously at Aberdeen University, where Prior happened to be in touch with Polish logician Władysław Bednarowski.

Prior worked intensely, often all through the night. 1949 saw the publication of his first book, a slim but potent volume titled Logic and the Basis of Ethics. It was published by the Clarendon Press and soon became prominent in Oxford. Austin liked it and Ryle approved of ‘Prior’s complete lack of mugwumpery’. In the Introduction Prior explained that by the ‘logic of ethics’ he meant ‘not a special kind of logic, nor a special branch of logic, but an application of it’, and the book is a vigorous examination of the arguments of each side in the naturalism/anti-naturalism debate.

Logic and the Basis of Ethics contained no symbolism, and Prior’s phrase ‘the logic of ethics’ was little more than a battle cry. The few technical concepts that he used all related to syllogistic logic. It was not until 1952 that Prior began publishing papers in symbolic logic—four of them, suddenly, in the same year. At the unusually late age of 38 Prior had become a formal logician. He wrote these papers while completing the manuscript of what was intended to be his second postwar book, The Craft of Formal Logic. This began life in 1949 as a Dictionary of Formal Logic, but, at the advice of the Clarendon Press, Prior soon switched to a more orthodox format.

His logical interests veered sharply while he was writing The Craft. To sixteen chapters on the logic of categoricals, hypotheticals, terms and relations, he added, almost as an afterthought, one on modal logic and one on the axiomatic method. Prior finished the manuscript in December 1951 and sent it to the Clarendon Press; fourteen months later they wrote agreeing to publish the book if Prior would both shorten it and give greater emphasis to modern logic. He undertook to make the changes, but ended up writing a completely different book. This was finally published in 1955 with the title Formal Logic; it ran into a second edition in 1962.

The Craft was Prior’s third book-length manuscript that failed to make it into print. His manuscript on Barth had died the death before the war, and his The Theology of the Church of Scotland was a casualty when the Priors’ Christchurch house caught fire in 1949—the book’s remains, 163 charred pages of his handwriting, are in the Bodleian Library. (Scottish theology nevertheless remained ‘part of the mulch that nourished his work’, Mary Prior said.) The Craft survives intact in the Bodleian, except for a few missing pages. Some parts of it were published posthumously, under the title The Doctrine of Propositions and Terms, but much of this fascinating manuscript remains unpublished.

Formal Logic is steeped in Polish notation and the axiomatic method, and typifies Prior’s mature work. It teaches, enthusiastically yet without fuss, that there was life—fascinating life—before the here and now of logic. What Prior once wrote admiringly of Łukasiewicz is no less true of Prior himself: ‘having done very distinguished work as a mathematical logician in the modern style, [he] is at the same time interested in the history of his subject … and contrives both to use modern techniques to bring out more clearly what the ancients were driving at, and to learn from the ancients useful logical devices which the moderns have in general forgotten’ (1952c: 37).

After Findlay, Łukasiewicz was the greatest single influence on Prior’s development as a logician. Prior’s 1952 review article ‘Łukasiewicz’s Symbolic Logic’ was one of his first papers to make extensive use of symbolism. He there discussed Łukasiewicz’s book Aristotle’s Syllogistic From the Standpoint of Modern Formal Logic (published in 1951) and two articles, ‘The Shortest Axiom of the Implicational Calculus of Propositions’ and ‘On Variable Functions of Propositional Arguments’. The first of these articles stimulated Prior’s interest in economical bases for propositional and pure implicational logics (initially aroused by his study of Peirce) and the opening chapters of Formal Logic drew heavily on Łukasiewicz’s work in this area.

Prior seems first to have learned of Łukasiewicz through the writings of his pupil Bochenski. Łukasiewicz had devised an axiomatic treatment of Aristotle’s reduction of the imperfect syllogistic moods to those of the first figure, which Prior encountered in Bochenski’s Précis. This enchanted Prior. He was taking his students through the derivations as early as 1951, and summarized Łukasiewicz’s system in the final chapter of The Craft. Throughout the chapter he made extensive use of Łukasiewicz’s symbolic notation. It was Łukasiewicz’s axiomatic treatment of traditional logic that fully brought home to Prior the power of modern symbolic methods. Moreover, it was probably his reading of Łukasiewicz that made clear to him the fundamental importance of propositional logic. ‘It seems that Aristotle did not suspect the existence of another system of logic besides his theory of the syllogism’, Łukasiewicz had written, ‘[y]et he uses intuitively the laws of propositional logic …’ (1951a: 49). (Łukasiewicz’s axiomatisation of the syllogistic incorporated his own three-axiom formalization of propositional logic (1951a: 80).)

In his review, Prior approvingly quoted Łukasiewicz’s assertion that ‘the logic of the Stoics, the inventors of the ancient form of the propositional calculus, was much more important than all the syllogisms of Aristotle’ (Łukasiewicz 1951a: 131). In The Craft, propositional logic is barely mentioned until the final chapter, whereas Formal Logic begins with a thorough introduction to the subject. On page 3 of Formal Logic Prior stated that the logic of propositions is ‘basic, and the rest of logic built upon it’.

His interest in economical bases for propositional and pure implicational logics, initially aroused by his study of Peirce, was stimulated by Łukasiewicz’s article ‘The Shortest Axiom of the Implicational Calculus of Propositions’, and the opening chapters of Formal Logic draw heavily on Łukasiewicz’s work in this area.

3.7 Back to England

In 1954, Gilbert Ryle visited New Zealand. He brought Prior an invitation to visit Oxford and deliver the John Locke lectures. Prior arranged a twelve month leave of absence from Canterbury and arrived in Oxford at the beginning of 1956. Rather quickly a small group began to form around him: Ivo Thomas, John Lemmon, Peter Geach. (His meetings with Prior were Lemmon’s first introduction to modal logic.) Hughes summarized the news arriving back home: ‘this wild colonial boy just hit Oxford and started to gather around him the main people [interested in] logic, and he started to organise a lot of parties, almost, for the serious doing of logic’. Prior kitted out his tiny rented apartment with a toyshop blackboard and held open house. On Mondays during Hilary and Trinity terms he lectured on modal logic, his great passion, and on tense logic, his great invention. The lectures were published the following year, under the title Time and Modality.

In the summer break following the John Locke lectures, Prior organised a Logic Colloquium in Oxford. Logic was deeply out of fashion in 1950s Britain, and its practitioners were isolated and somewhat demoralized. As Prior wrote shortly after the Colloquium, ‘There are logicians in England and Ireland; but it must be admitted that they are somewhat scattered, and so far as I could gather they had never had any general get-together’ (1956b: 186). Prior’s Colloquium brought together Lemmon, Thomas, Geach, M. Kneale, W.C. Kneale, M.W. Dick, Lewy, Smiley, Bennett, Lejewski, Faris, Nidditch, Carew Meredith, David Meredith, and others. It was all a huge success, and the Colloquium became a regular fixture. Through his John Locke lectures, the Colloquium, and his numerous visits around the country, Prior helped to revitalise British logic. The group he left behind saw similarities between themselves and the close-knit group of researchers that existed in Warsaw before 1939.

It was no doubt with mixed feelings that he returned to New Zealand. After twelve months of logical companionship on a grand scale, life at Canterbury was a lonely prospect. Seething with enthusiasm for logic, he threw himself once more into a massive correspondence, but it could no longer satisfy him. Prior pined. When the offer arrived of a newly established second chair at the University of Manchester, he snatched it up. The Priors left New Zealand again in December 1958.

3.8 Religion

As well as Prior’s journeyings between the hemispheres, there was his seemingly complicated inner journey from religious believer to non-believer. The inner journey, which is not easy to chart, was complete by the time he arrived in Manchester, and seems to have taken many years. It may have begun in 1941, with Prior’s developing interest in psychoanalytic explanations of the origin of religious beliefs (a topic first alluded to in Prior (1935)). In his September 1942 publication ‘Can Religion Be Discussed?’—a dialogue between five characters named Barthian Protestant, Modernist Protestant, Catholic, Logician, and Psychoanalyst—Prior gave the closing speech to Psychoanalyst, who explains that circumstances may ‘push’ a believer into

an emotional crisis in which they will go mad unless they do something about it, and then in the painful process of their own analysis they will see for themselves the roots of their urge to believe. Only in this way are genuine atheists made. (Prior 1942a: 150)

If these remarks were autobiographical there is no hint of it within the article. But Prior was more forthcoming in an unpublished seven-page manuscript dated 25 March 1942 (Prior 1942b, Jakobsen 2016). There he made it clear that he no longer considered himself a Christian, speaking of his ‘Christian days’ in the past tense, and denying that his ongoing interest in theology was a ‘relapse into Christianity’.

In ‘Can Religion Be Discussed?’ Prior made Psychoanalyst say ‘it’s the religious illusion that’s irresistible’, and in the 1942 manuscript he stated bluntly that ‘Theology is an illusion’, adding ‘but it is an illusion that is somehow “close to life”’. In this manuscript he mentioned Freud by name several times; and in a typescript concerning the application of Freudian theory to religion, possibly also written in 1941 or 1942 (Prior n.d.c., Hasle 1999, 2012), Prior explored ‘the hidden non-religious basis and source of all religious worship’. He spoke of ‘breaking the religious spell’ and of ‘the subconscious roots of religion’ being ‘laid bare’. The ‘Being’ that the religious ‘refer to as the real object of worship’ is, Prior suggested, ‘all the time a fiction’.

Prior’s position at this point, then, was seemingly that religious discourse is a form of fictional discourse—although the fiction is ‘close to life’. He also appears to have thought that believers utilize what Psychoanalyst calls ‘tricks’ in order to prevent knowledge of the subconscious origins of this fiction from reaching their consciousness, and so breaking the religious spell (Prior 1942a: 146–7).

Prior soon retreated from this leap toward unbelief. According to his military record, he was a ‘Presby’ (Presbyterian) again by about 1944. But although his scepticism born of psychoanalysis had weakened, it seems this was eventually replaced by philosophical scepticism of a more ordinary sort. The New Zealand philosopher Jim Thornton, who was Prior’s student during the period 1949–1953, recollected that ‘at the time when I was one of his senior students I got the impression that he thought Hume’s scepticism on religious belief was impressive’. Thornton continued ‘He enjoyed drawing our attention to Hume’s irony in various passages in the Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, and also in the closing paragraph of the essay Of Miracles’:

Mere reason is insufficient to convince us of its veracity: And whoever is moved by Faith to assent to it, is conscious of a continued miracle in his own person, which subverts all the principles of his understanding, and gives him a determination to believe… (Hume 1777, 10.101)

Despite his liking for Hume’s scepticism, Prior took the serious step in 1951 of becoming an elder of St Martin’s Presbyterian Church in Christchurch. Elders are responsible for the spiritual oversight of the congregation, and he was assigned a ‘district’ of perhaps 15–20 households drawn from the congregation, and was expected to visit each of them regularly. Whatever his philosophical doubts may have been, Prior was now a pillar of the Presbyterian community. ‘Lord, I believe; help thou mine unbelief!’ he had made his Barthian Protestant character say in 1942.

1956, the year of Arthur’s sabbatical in Oxford, seems to have been a turning point. Perhaps sheer distance helped to loosen religion’s tug, not only on him but also on Mary. Once back in New Zealand, the family’s churchgoing was much less regular. Speaking of this time, their son Martin said ‘I think Mary and Arthur were starting to lapse in their beliefs’. Arthur continued as an elder at St Martin’s, officially until he left the country for Manchester in December 1958, but ceased attending the monthly meetings of elders from April 1958—and contrary to custom, did not even bother to send in his apologies for the meetings that he missed.

Robert Bull, who was Arthur’s student from 1957, remembered him taking his church duties flippantly. On one occasion Arthur broke off a conversation about logic with a puckish ‘I’ve got to go and deliver the fucking communion cards’. Mary laughed, exclaiming ‘Arthur!’. The cards were invitations to the communion service and, as an elder, he was obliged to deliver one to each person in his district. By this time, the Priors’ religious observance was probably just a matter of not wanting to upset the boat—and perhaps especially not the Reverend Frank Wilkinson, Mary’s father.

Once the Priors were in Manchester, churchgoing became a thing of the past.

3.9 Last Years

Prior was at Manchester for seven years. In 1966, Anthony Kenny recommended him for a fellowship at Balliol. The move would mean a drop in both status and salary, not to mention an increase in teaching, but Prior did not hesitate. His sabbatical in Oxford had been one of his happiest years. ‘This is the good life’, he told George Hughes once he was settled in at Balliol. He felt he simply belonged. Prior soon built up a reputation for being one of the best teachers in Oxford—though his students were sometimes surprised to be given eighteenth century moralists to read instead of books by the currently fashionable.

Just before his departure from Manchester, Prior told Tom Richards, a visiting New Zealander, that he was going to Oxford with a mission. Prior’s own work was an exemplary fusion of philosophy and logic, and he went to Oxford with the intention of interesting the mathematical logicians in philosophy and the philosophers in mathematical logic. The time was right; and Prior spared no energy in preaching his message:

[F]ormal logic and general philosophy have more to bring to one another than is sometimes supposed. I do not mean by saying this to underrate the work of those who have explored the properties of symbolic calculi without any concern as to what they might be used to mean … Nor do I mean to underrate what recent philosophers have done in the way of exploring the obstinate and intricate ‘logic’ embedded in common discourse, even when they have not derived or sought to derive anything like a calculus from it … But these activities are, or can be, related to one another very much as theory and observation are in the physical sciences; and I must confess to a hankering after well-constructed theories which much contemporary philosophy fails to satisfy. (1957: vii.)

Prior did not live to enjoy the entente cordiale between philosophy and logic that he helped usher in. His health began to let him down during his second year at Balliol. He was found to have both angina pectoris and polymyalgic rheumatism. During the autumn of 1969 the rheumatism grew steadily worse. He was at this time on sabbatical at the University of Oslo. The pain left him with no zest for work. He dutifully gave his weekly seminars and spent the remainder of his time brooding savagely on how painful it was to do such elementary things as put on a coat. His hosts made him an appointment with a rheumatologist, who prescribed cortisone. In a letter written a few days later, and a few days before his heart failed, Prior described himself as one of the miracles of modern medicine. ‘I’ve been sleeping well … running up and down stairs … I can stand on one leg and put a sock on the other (first time for months) … they’ve got me cured now and I’m fine.’

3.10 Legacy in New Zealand

Long after he departed for England in December 1958, Prior and his ideas remained a strong influence on the development of logic in New Zealand—beginning with his arranging for Robert Bull and Jonathan Bennett to share the teaching of his Advanced Logic course at Canterbury in 1959. Bull had recently found a completeness proof for a Diodorean logic of pure implication and taught this to the class (‘heaven help me—and them’, he says now).

Hugh Montgomery was among Bull’s audience. Montgomery had been a mathematics student at Canterbury during the 1940s, while Prior was single-handedly booting undergraduate logic into existence. Now resuming his studies after a career as a furniture manufacturer in Christchurch, Montgomery fell heavily for logic. He found himself ‘becoming more and more interested in tenses’, after reading Prior’s ‘Diodoran Modalities’. 1962 saw him joining the Canterbury philosophy department as an assistant lecturer (by then Shorter had succeeded Prior as professor and two lecturers had been appointed, Jim Thornton and Rudi Ziedens).

Montgomery was soon publishing a brisk flow of papers on modal logic. Many were co-authored with Richard Routley, who graduated from the Victoria University of Wellington—known to all as ‘Vic’—not long before Montgomery enrolled in Bull’s course. ‘I grew up in the shadow of Prior’, Routley said: ‘He was, I suppose, the dominant figure in New Zealand philosophy in the late 1950s’. There were other important philosophers working there, Routley conceded, ‘but they did not have the panache of Prior, or the larger-than-life stature, or the doctrine’ (Sylvan 1996: 126). Routley moved to Australia and went on to pioneer relevant and dialethic logics, as well as environmental philosophy, changing his name to Sylvan in the 1980s (he loved trees, especially the New Zealand kauri). Montgomery—with Prior’s forceful backing—was appointed associate professor at Auckland University in 1969, and then to Auckland’s chair of philosophy in 1970.

Bull, meanwhile, had followed Prior to England in 1960. He was supposed to be going to Cambridge, but Prior’s suggestion that he divert to Manchester won the day. Max Cresswell joined them in Manchester a year later. A student of George Hughes and David Londey at Vic, Cresswell had accidentally come across Prior’s Formal Logic in the university library in 1957, at the end of his first undergraduate year. Excited by this discovery he also devoured Time and Modality. When he won a Commonwealth Scholarship for postgraduate study in the United Kingdom, Cresswell seized the opportunity to work with Prior. In 1963, he turned in his Ph.D., on propositional logics, and—with a strong reference from Prior—arrived back at Vic to step into Londey’s shoes. (Londey, an Australian, was returning home.) Cresswell went on to dominate New Zealand logic for the next three decades. Bull completed a Ph.D. on modal logic under Prior, in 1962, and then enrolled at Oxford to study for a DPhil under Michael Dummett. At Oxford, Bull began publishing an important series of papers developing Priorean tense and modal logics (including his 1964, 1965 and 1970—his and Krister Segerberg’s 1984 handbook entry ‘Basic Modal Logic’ is still valuable today). With two doctorates in hand, Bull worked at Birmingham and then Leeds before returning to a senior lectureship at Canterbury, at the end of 1968. From afar, Prior was stationing his men to fight for logic in his native land.

When Cresswell arrived back, Wellington was becoming the focal point of logic in New Zealand. Hughes and Londey had a strong group of graduate students, including Dorothy Grover and Tom Richards. Londey liked to use the English translation of Hilbert and Ackermann’s pre-war Grundzüge der Theoretischen Logik as a text for his advanced course, and in 1965 he and Hughes published their own The Elements of Formal Logic, aimed at undergraduates—Prior reviewed it in the Australasian Journal of Philosophy, describing it as ‘a very good buy’ and ‘broadly in the style of Hilbert and Ackermann, and even more that of von Wright’ (Prior 1966). Also in 1965, Hughes and Cresswell trialled the idea of an undergraduate course in modal logic. The Elements contained no modal logic, and the lack of any suitable textbook for the new course was a problem. ‘We’ll have to write our own’, Hughes said jokingly to Cresswell. Their famous An Introduction to Modal Logic appeared in 1968, overnight turning modal logic from a subject accessible only to experts into one that almost everybody with a bit of logic could understand.

Logical mass was building. Malcolm Rennie, a young Australian, joined Auckland University in 1965 as a lecturer (snatched it is said from under the nose of Jack Smart, who wanted him for the University of Adelaide). Rennie was strongly influenced by Prior’s work, and began publishing a stream of papers on tense and modal logic. His 1971 article on Prior’s tense system \(QK_t\) included a eulogy: ‘This paper is dedicated to the memory of the late Arthur Prior: it was never my good fortune to meet him, but I am very grateful for his personal encouragement in correspondence, and for the interest generated by his many fertile and imaginative writings’ (Rennie 1971: 107). In 1968, Rennie taught a graduate course on Prior to his Auckland students, covering Priorean tense logic in Polish notation.

On the other side of the world, at the 1968 Joint Session of the Aristotelian Society and Mind Association at Liverpool University, Prior attended a symposium on ‘What Actually Exists?’, given by Peter Geach and Robert Stoothoff. He was impressed by Stoothoff, saying approvingly in a letter to Montgomery that the young American had ‘done a lot of fighting for logic’. Stoothoff was unexpectedly contacted by Canterbury and offered Shorter’s—Prior’s—chair. He accepted, arriving in Christchurch in 1970. (Shorter was moving on to a fellowship at Lincoln College, Oxford.) Also in 1970, the Czech logician Pavel Tichý accepted a senior lectureship in philosophy at the University of Otago. Tichý had fled his native Prague soon after Soviet tanks took command of the streets in 1968. (His escape from East to West was ably assisted by Geoffrey Keene, a logician from Exeter University in the UK (Svoboda et al. 2004: 26).) Once settled in New Zealand Tichý wrote a paper on quantified S5, taking Hughes and Cresswell to task for mis-formalizing a modal principle stated by Prior and von Wright (Tichý 1973, Prior 1955a: 211). Soon he was indulging in the national logical pastime of exploring Priorean temporal logics.

1970 saw Cresswell visiting Segerberg in Finland (on the shores of the Baltic at Villa Wolax, the gracious 19th century summerhouse that the Segerbergs were renting from the von Wright family). Cresswell and Segerberg gathered mushrooms in the forest and spoke of logic in New Zealand. It was an auspicious meeting. When Montgomery died, at the tragically early age of 53, Cresswell proposed Segerberg for the Auckland chair. The Segerbergs remember getting a call from New Zealand ‘in the middle of the night’. The job came ‘on a silver platter’, Segerberg said. After a brief visit in 1979, Segerberg moved to Auckland in 1980. He found that New Zealand logic was ‘in a vibrant state’.

By about 1970 a new generation of home-grown logicians had begun to enter the post-Prior landscape. In 1971, Rob Goldblatt took up a junior lectureship in mathematics at Vic. Wellington born and bred, Goldblatt learned modal logic from lectures by Cresswell and Hughes during his second undergraduate year, and he completed his Ph.D. thesis ‘Metamathematics of Modal Logic’ under Cresswell in 1974. ‘That remarkable thesis established modal logic as a mature mathematical discipline’, Bull said. Soon Goldblatt was publishing a deluge of papers on modal logic. Also in 1974 Fred Kroon, previously one of the students in Rennie’s Prior course at Auckland, was appointed to a lectureship in the Auckland philosophy department. John Bigelow, who, as a Canterbury undergraduate, had been taught ‘terrific logic’ by Montgomery, took up a lectureship in philosophy at Vic in 1973. Another admirer of Prior, Bigelow was deeply immersed in tense and modal logic (working with Hughes on tense logic), and he later staunchly defended Prior’s presentism. When Bigelow arrived home in 1973 from his Ph.D. studies at Cambridge, he found that New Zealand had become ‘a powerhouse in logic’.

An interdisciplinary logic group formed around Hughes and Cresswell in 1968, meeting at first fortnightly, and then weekly from about 1970. The Wellington logic group ‘was a deliberate attempt to marry interests in mathematics and philosophy’, said Wilf Malcolm, who worked on the foundations of mathematics (Malcolm 1975) and later became Professor of Pure Mathematics at Vic. Apart from the sheer logical talent of those involved in the Wellington group, Cresswell put the group’s stellar success down to the fact that—unlike much in today’s universities—it was not a managed creation: it had ‘just grown and wasn’t planned’.

The Wellington group, and New Zealand logic more generally, were a magnet for visitors. Angelika Kratzer first visited the group in 1974, initiating an association with the University of Konstanz and logicians in Germany. Others from Germany soon arrived, including Arnim von Stechow and Rainer Bäuerle. Stanisław Surma visited, also in 1974, kick-starting the group’s association with Polish logicians (later, Segerberg hired Surma at Auckland). Dick Epstein visited the group from the United States in 1974, and then returned in 1975 for a two-year stay at Vic; while there he worked on computability and also on what he called ‘relatedness logic’, a form of relevance logic. Other visitors from North America included Doug Walton, who spent the year 1975–76 at Vic working on the logic of action. Steve Thomason visited the group in 1973 while spending a year with Bull at Canterbury, where he worked on embedding second-order logic in modal logic and on applying category theory to modal logic.

Mike Dunn and Nuel Belnap visited the Wellington group during 1975–76, Donald Davidson in 1977, Leszek Szczerba (a colleague of Tarski) in 1977, and Segerberg briefly in 1979 (in 1971 the group worked through his recent Ph.D. thesis ‘An Essay in Classical Modal Logic’ (Segerberg 1971)). Many others spent time with the group. David Lewis first visited in 1971, and then for several months in 1976, thereafter becoming a regular visitor to New Zealand. Lewis and Ken Pledger, another member of the group, shared an enthusiasm for train timetables, which they exchanged eagerly. Pledger was a geometer from the Vic mathematics department who—like many—first encountered modal logic in Hughes’ and Cresswell’s 1968 book. Pledger worked on extensions of S3 and on a modal system lying somewhere between B and S5, and later spent a sabbatical at Warsaw University with Szczerba—another geometer—where he finished a Ph.D. on ‘Some Interrelations between Geometry and Modal Logic’.

In 1976 the Wellington group ran a week-long logic school, coinciding with Lewis’s stay. Epstein did much of the organizing. Hughes lectured on modal logic and Cresswell on the formal semantics of natural languages—his groundbreaking book Logics and Languages had appeared in 1973. Numerous other group members and visitors lectured on their research. The school ‘brought out into the open … a wide variety of quite exciting work … that had in fact been building up over quite a period of time’, Malcolm said. The Vic logicians were surprised by the large number of enrolments in the school—academics and students from New Zealand, Australia, and beyond. It was a spectacular shop-window, heaped with New Zealand logic. Malcolm later described the school as the Wellington group’s ‘coming-of-age’.

By then, the compliment that the founding father of logic in New Zealand had once paid to California was true also of his own country. New Zealand had become one of the most logically mature places in the world for the study of modality and tense.


Works by Prior

  • n.d.a., ‘Reactions to Determinism’, Typescript, no date, 5 pages, Bodleian Library Prior Archive. [Prior n.d.a. available online]
  • n.d.b., ‘Determinism in Philosophy and in Theology’, Typescript, 4 pages, Bodleian Library Prior Archive. [Prior n.d.b. available online]
  • n.d.c., ‘The Case of Edward Irving’, typescript, 5 pages, Bodleian Library Prior Archive (Box 6), (In the secondary literature this item is sometimes cited as ‘Prior 1942’ but in fact the date is uncertain.)
  • 1931, ‘Essays Literary’, Typescript, 157 pages, Macmillan Brown Library, University of Canterbury.
  • 1934, ‘Athanasius Contra Mundum’, Open Windows, vol. 8, no. 4, pp. 6–7.
  • 1935, ‘Logic and Dogma’, Open Windows, vol. 9, no. 5, p. 19.
  • 1937a, ‘What is Socialism?’, Four letters to the Otago Daily Times under the pseudonym ‘Independent Labour’, dated 6 July, 10 July, 15 July, 20 July. [6 July, 10 July, 15 July, and 20 July available online]
  • 1937b, ‘The Nation and the Individual’, Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy, vol. 15, pp. 294–298.
  • 1938, ‘Hitler Comes to the Tyrol’, under the nom de plume John Everdean, with Clare Prior, Otago Daily Times, 18 June, p. 4. [Prior 1938 available online]
  • 1939, ‘The Czech Church in Exile’, The Christian World, 13 June, p. 4.
  • 1940, ‘Missions and the Home Front’, International Review of Missions, July, pp. 340–352.
  • 1941, ‘Some Mail Gone Missing’, Outlook, February 26, pp. 10–11.
  • 1942a, ‘Can Religion be Discussed?’, Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy, vol. 20, pp. 141–151.
  • 1942b, Untitled manuscript, 7 pages, 25 March, Bodleian Library Prior Archive (Box 7).
  • 1944, ‘The Meaning of Good’, Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy, vol. 22, pp. 170–174.
  • 1945, ‘The Subject of Ethics’, Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy, vol. 23, pp. 78–84.
  • 1947, ‘Supralapsarianism’, The Presbyter, vol. 5, pp. 19–22.
  • 1949, Logic and the Basis of Ethics, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1951, The Craft of Formal Logic, typescript, 772 pages + 4 handwritten pages of corrections, Bodleian Library Prior Archive (Box 22).
  • 1952a, ‘Modality De Dicto and Modality De Re’, Theoria, vol. 18, pp. 174–180.
  • 1952b, ‘In What Sense is Modal Logic Many-Valued?’, Analysis, vol. 12, pp. 138–143.
  • 1952c, ‘Łukasiewicz’s Symbolic Logic’, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, vol. 30, pp. 121–130.
  • 1952d, ‘The Parva Logicalia in Modern Dress’, Dominican Studies, vol. 5, pp. 78–87.
  • 1953, ‘Three-Valued Logic and Future Contingents’, Philosophical Quarterly, vol. 3, pp. 317–326.
  • 1955a, Formal Logic, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1955b, ‘Diodoran Modalities’, Philosophical Quarterly, vol. 5, pp. 205–213.
  • 1956a, ‘Modality and Quantification in S5’, The Journal of Symbolic Logic, vol. 21, pp. 60–62.
  • 1956b, ‘Logicians at play; or Syll, Simp and Hilbert’, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, vol. 34, pp. 182–192.
  • 1957, Time and Modality, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • 1958a, ‘The Syntax of Time-Distinctions’, Franciscan Studies, vol. 18, pp. 105–120.
  • 1962a, ‘Tense Logic and the Continuity of Time’, Studia Logica, vol. 13, pp. 133–148.
  • 1962b, ‘Possible Worlds’, Philosophical Quarterly, vol. 12, pp. 36–43.
  • 1962c, ‘Logic in England Today’, typescript, Translated into Polish as ‘Wspólczesna logika w Anglii’, Ruch Filozoficzny, vol. 21, pp. 251–256.
  • 1966, ‘Critical Notice: The Elements of Formal Logic by Hughes and Londey’, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, vol. 44, pp. 224–231.
  • c.1967, Autobiographical note, in Kenny 1971.
  • 1967a, Past, Present and Future, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1967b, ‘Logic, Modal’, in Edwards, P. (ed.) 1967, The Encyclopedia of Philosophy, New York: Macmillan.
  • 1968, Papers on Time and Tense, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1971, Objects of Thought, Oxford: Clarendon Press. (Edited by Geach, P.T., Kenny, A.J.P.)
  • 1976a, The Doctrine of Propositions and Terms, London: Duckworth. (Edited by Geach, P.T., Kenny, A.J.P.)
  • 1976b, Papers in Logic and Ethics, London: Duckworth. (Edited by Geach, P.T., Kenny, A.J.P.)
  • 1977, Worlds, Times and Selves, London: Duckworth. (Edited by Fine, K.)
  • 1996a, ‘A Statement of Temporal Realism’, in Copeland, B.J. (ed.) 1996, Logic and Reality: Essays on the Legacy of Arthur Prior, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1996b, ‘Some Free Thinking about Time’, in Copeland, B.J. (ed.) 1996, Logic and Reality: Essays on the Legacy of Arthur Prior, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 2003, Papers on Time and Tense, Second expanded edition, edited by Braüner, T., Copeland, B.J., Hasle, P. and Øhrstrøm, P. Oxford: Oxford University Press.


  • Bayart, A., 1958, ‘Correction de la Logique Modale du Premier et du Second Ordre S5’ [‘Soundness of First and Second Order S5 Modal Logic’], Logique et Analyse, vol. 1, pp. 28–44.
  • –––, 1959, ‘Quasi-Adéquation de la Logique Modale du Second Ordre S5 et Adéquation de la Logique Modale du Premier Ordre S5’ [‘Quasi-Completeness of Second-Order S5 Modal Logic and Completeness of First-Order S5 Modal Logic’]. Logique et Analyse, vol. 2, pp. 99–121.
  • Ben-Ari, M., Pneuli, A., Manna, Z., 1983, ‘The Temporal Logic of Branching Time’, Acta Informatica, vol. 20, pp. 207–226.
  • Bochenski, I.M., 1947, La Logique de Théophraste, Fribourg: Librairie de l’Université de Fribourg.
  • –––, 1948, Précis de Logique Mathématique, Bussum: Kroonder.
  • Brodie, J. (ed.), 1999, Remembrance of Friends Past: Testimonies and Memorials to the lives and works of New Zealand Quakers who died from 1843 to 1998, Wellington: Beechtree Press. ‘Brailsford, John Annesley’, pp. 28–29, and ‘Brailsford, Ruth Fordham’, pp. 29–30.
  • Bull, R.A., 1964, ‘An Axiomatisation of Prior’s Modal Calculus \(Q\)’, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, vol. 5, pp. 211–214.
  • –––, 1965,‘An Algebraic Study of Diodorean Modal Systems’, Journal of Symbolic Logic, vol. 30, pp. 58–64.
  • –––, 1970, ‘An Approach to Tense Logic’, Theoria, vol. 36, pp. 282–300.
  • Bull, R.A., Segerberg, K., 1984, ‘Basic Modal Logic’, in Gabbay, D.M., Guenthner, F. (eds), Handbook of Philosophical Logic, vol. 2, Dordrecht: Reidel, pp. 1–88.
  • Carnap, R., 1946, ‘Modalities and Quantification’, The Journal of Symbolic Logic, vol. 11, pp. 33–64.
  • Churchill, W.L.S., 2007, Blood, Toil, Tears and Sweat: The Great Speeches, ed. D. Cannadine. London: Penguin.
  • Copeland, B.J. (ed.), 1996, Logic and Reality: Essays on the Legacy of Arthur Prior, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 2002, ‘The Genesis of Possible Worlds Semantics’, Journal of Philosophical Logic, vol. 31, pp. 99–137.
  • –––, 2016, ‘Prior, Translational Semantics, and the Barcan Formula, Synthese, vol. 193, pp. 3507–3519.
  • Cresswell, M., 1973, Logics and Languages, London: Methuen.
  • Everdean, J., 1938a (Clare Prior), ‘Sidelights on the Crisis: A New Zealander in London’, Otago Daily Times, 25 October, p. 5. Everdean 1938a available online]
  • Feys, R., 1950, ‘Les Systèmes Formalisés des Modalités Aristotéliciennes’, Revue Philosophique de Louvain, vol. 48, pp. 478–509.
  • Findlay, J.N., 1933, Meinong’s Theory of Objects, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1941,‘Time: A Treatment of Some Puzzles’, Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy, vol. 19, pp. 216–235.
  • Flew, A. (ed.), 1951, Essays on Logic and Language, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Geach, P., 1970, ‘Arthur Prior: A Personal Impression’, Theoria, vol. 36, pp. 186–188.
  • Goldblatt, R., 1987, Logics of Time and Computation, Stanford: CSLI.
  • Grimshaw, M., 2002, ‘The Prior Prior: Neglected Early Writings of Arthur N. Prior’, Heythrop Journal, vol. 43, pp. 480–95.
  • –––, 2018, The Arthur Prior Letters 1936–1941: Philosophical, Theological and Political Correspondence, Christchurch: Canterbury University Press.
  • Hasle, P., 1999, ‘The Problem of Predestination—a Prelude to A. N. Prior’s Tense Logic’, in Wegener, M. (ed.) 1999, Time, Creation and World-Order, Aarhus: Aarhus University Press.
  • –––, 2012, ‘The Problem of Predestination: As a Prelude to A.N. Prior’s Tense Logic’, Synthese, vol. 188, pp. 331–347.
  • Hasle, P., Øhrstrøm, P., 2016, ‘Prior’s Paradigm for the Study of Time and its Methodological Motivation’, Synthese, vol. 193, pp. 3401–3416.
  • Hilbert, D., Ackermann, W., 1928, Grundzüge der Theoretischen Logik [Principles of Mathematical Logic], Berlin: Julius Springer.
  • Hintikka, K.J.J., 1957, Quantifiers in Deontic Logic, Societas Scientiarum Fennica, Commentationes Humanarum Litterarum, vol. 23.4, Helsinki.
  • –––, 1958, ‘Review of Time and Modality’, Philosophical Review, vol. 67, pp. 401–4.
  • Hintikka, K.J.J., 1961, ‘Modality and Quantification’, Theoria, vol. 27, pp. 119–128.
  • Hiż, H., 1951, ‘Review of “Foundations of the Methodological Analysis of Mill’s Canons” by Jerzy Łoś’, Journal of Symbolic Logic, vol. 16, pp. 58–59.
  • Hughes, G.E., 1971, ‘Arthur Prior (1914–1969)’, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, vol. 49, pp. 241–243.
  • Hughes, G.E., Cresswell, M.J., 1968, An Introduction to Modal Logic, London: Methuen.
  • Hume, D., 1777, An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, ed. L.A. Selby-Bigge, Oxford: Clarendon, 1902.
  • Jakobsen, D., 2012, ‘An Introduction to “Faith, Unbelief, and Evil”’, Synthese, vol. 188, pp. 399–409.
  • –––, 2016, ‘An Illusion Close to Life’, Synthese, vol. 193, pp. 3429–3439.
  • Johnson, W.E., 1921–24, Logic, Vols 1–3, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Jónsson, B., Tarski, A., 1951, ‘Boolean Algebras With Operators, Part I’, American Journal of Mathematics, vol. 73, pp. 891–939.
  • –––, 1952, ‘Boolean Algebras With Operators, Part II’, American Journal of Mathematics, vol. 74, pp. 127–162.
  • Jordan, A.A., 1945, The Development of Mathematical Logic and of Logical Positivism in Poland between the Two Wars, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kanger, S., 1957, Provability in Logic, Stockholm: Almqvist and Wiksell.
  • Kenny, A., 1970, ‘Arthur Norman Prior’, Proceedings of the British Academy, vol. LVI, pp. 321–349.
  • Keynes, J.N., 1906, Studies and Exercises in Formal Logic, London: Macmillan.
  • Knuuttila, S., 1993, Modalities in Medieval Philosophy, London and New York: Routledge.
  • Kripke, S.A., 1959a, ‘A Completeness Theorem in Modal Logic’, The Journal of Symbolic Logic, vol. 24, pp. 1–14.
  • –––, 1959b, ‘Semantical Analysis of Modal Logic’, (Abstract) The Journal of Symbolic Logic, vol. 24, pp. 323–324.
  • –––, 1963, ‘Semantical Analysis of Modal Logic I: Normal Modal Propositional Calculi’, Zeitschr. f. math. Logik und Grundlagen d. Math., vol. 9, pp. 67–96.
  • Lewis, C.I., Langford, C.H., 1932, Symbolic Logic, London: Century.
  • Łoś, J., 1947, ‘Podstawy analizy metodologicznej kanonów Milla’ [‘The Foundations of a Methodological Analysis of Mill’s Methods’], Annales Universitatis Mariae Curie-Skłodowska, Sectio F, vol. 2, pp. 269–301. English translation in Przełęcki, M., Wójcicki, R. (eds) 1977, Twenty-Five Years of Logical Methodology in Poland, Warsaw: Polish Scientific.
  • Łukasiewicz, J., 1920, ‘On Three-Valued Logic’, Ruch Filozoficzny, vol. 5, pp. 170–171. English translation in Borkowski, L. (ed.) 1970, Jan Łukasiewicz: Selected Works, Amsterdam: North Holland.
  • –––, 1948, ‘The Shortest Axiom of the Implicational Calculus of Propositions’, Proceedings of the Royal Irish Academy, vol. 52, pp. 25–33.
  • –––, 1951a, Aristotle’s Syllogistic From the Standpoint of Modern Formal Logic, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1951b, ‘On Variable Functors of Propositional Arguments’, Proceedings of the Royal Irish Academy, vol. 54, pp. 25–35.
  • Malcolm, W.G., 1975, Number and Structure, Wellington: Reed.
  • Marcus, R. C. Barcan, 1946, ‘A Functional Calculus of First Order Based on Strict Implication’, Journal of Symbolic Logic, vol. 11, pp. 1–16.
  • Marcus, R. C. Barcan, 1962, ‘Interpreting Quantification’, Inquiry, vol. 5, pp. 252–259.
  • Markoska-Cubrinovska, A., 2017, ‘Time and Truth in “The Craft of Formal Logic”: Prior’s Early Temporal Semantics Born from Reflexions on Diodorus and Boole’, in Hasle, P., Blackburn, P., Øhrstrøm, P. (eds) 2017, Logic and Philosophy of Time: Themes from Prior, vol. 1, Aalborg: Aalborg University Press.
  • Mates, B., 1953, Stoic Logic, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Meredith, C.A., Prior, A.N., 1956, ‘Interpretations of Different Modal Logics in the “Property Calculus”’, In Copeland, B.J. (ed.) 1996, Logic and Reality: Essays on the Legacy of Arthur Prior, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1965, ‘Modal Logic With Functorial Variables and a Contingent Constant’, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, vol. 6, pp. 99–109.
  • Meredith, D., 1977, ‘In Memoriam: Carew Arthur Meredith (1904–1976)’, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, vol. 18, pp. 513–516.
  • Montague, R., 1970, ‘Pragmatics and Intensional Logic’, Synthese, vol. 22, pp. 68–94.
  • Øhrstrøm, P., Hasle, P., 1993, ‘A.N. Prior’s Rediscovery of Tense Logic’, Erkenntnis, vol. 39, pp. 23–50.
  • –––, 1995, Temporal Logic: From Ancient Ideas to Artificial Intelligence, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Ploug, T., Øhrstrøm, P., 2012, ‘Branching Time, Indeterminism and Tense Logic: Unveiling the Prior–Kripke Letters’, Synthese, vol. 188, pp. 367–379.
  • Pnueli, A., 1977, ‘The Temporal Logic of Programs’, Proceedings of the Eighteenth Annual Symposium on Foundations of Computer Science, New York: Institute of Electrical and Electronics Engineers.
  • Prior, M., 2003, ‘An Interview with Mary Prior’, in Prior, A, 2003 (eds Braüner, Copeland, Hasle, and Øhrstrøm).
  • Reichenbach, H., 1947, Elements of Symbolic Logic, New York: Macmillan.
  • Rennie, M.K., 1971, ‘Semantics for \(QK_t\)’, The Journal of Symbolic Logic, vol. 36, pp. 97–107.
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  • –––, 1971, An Essay in Classical Modal Logic, No. 13 in the series Filosofiska Studier, Uppsala University (series editor Stig Kanger).
  • ––– (ed.), 1977, An Introduction to Modal Logic: The ‘Lemmon Notes’, American Philosophical Quarterly Monograph No. 11.
  • –––, 1989, ‘Von Wright’s Tense Logic’, In Schilpp, P.A., Hahn, L.E. (eds) 1989, The Philosophy of Georg Henrik von Wright, Illinois: Open Court.
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Other Internet Resources


My sources for this essay—other than Prior’s published work and his papers and extensive correspondence held in the Bodleian Library, Oxford—are: (i) interviews and/or correspondence with Jonathan Bennett, John Bigelow, Ray Bradley, Colin Brown, Robert Bull, Nino Cocchiarella, Max Cresswell, Vincent Denard, John Faris, Dov Gabbay, Peter Geach, Rob Goldblatt, Jaakko Hintikka, George Hughes, Hans Kamp, Saul Kripke, Fred Kroon, Peter Øhrstrøm, Mary Prior, Stephen Read, Dana Scott, Krister Segerberg, Jack Smart, Richard Sylvan, Jim Thornton, Jim Wilson, and Georg Henrik von Wright; (ii) Cresswell and Crossley (1989), an unpublished edited transcript of a panel discussion concerning Prior held at the 1981 Annual Conference of the Australasian Association for Logic in Wellington (the participants were Robert Bull, Martin Bunder, Max Cresswell, John Crossley, Charles Hamblin, George Hughes, John Kalman, David Lewis, Michael McRobbie, Wilf Malcolm, Ken Pledger, Tom Richards, Krister Segerberg, and Pavel Tichý); (iii) an unpublished edited transcript of a conversation recorded in the Philosophy Seminar Room at Victoria University of Wellington on 6 March 1980 (the participants were Max Cresswell, Yuri Fradkin, Rob Goldblatt, George Hughes, Wilf Malcolm, and Chris Parkin); (iv) letters from Prior to Hugh Teague in 1938, kindly supplied to me by Martin Prior and now published in Grimshaw (2018); (v) letters from Prior to Ursula Bethel, 1936–1941, held in the Macmillan Brown Library, University of Canterbury, New Zealand, and now published in Grimshaw (2018); (vi) letter from Prior to Lex Miller in March 1946, held in the Lex Miller Papers at Stanford University Archives; (vii) Prior’s Knox College student files, held in the Hocken Collections, University of Otago Library, Dunedin, New Zealand; (viii) Prior’s Academic Transcript at the University of Otago, held in the Hocken Collections; (ix) Hugh Montgomery’s Academic Transcript at Canterbury University College, held in the Macmillan Brown Library, University of Canterbury; (x) University of Auckland Minutes of the Education Committee for 8 February 1971, and Department of Philosophy Annual Report for 1968, held in the University of Auckland archives (xi) MV Rangitiki Voyage Card 1938–46 (Guildhall Library, London), Movements Card 1940–45 (British National Archives, London), and Passenger List for Voyage 28 (Archives New Zealand, Wellington); (xii) Prior’s Military Records, Royal New Zealand Air Force (which contain biographical information not available elsewhere), held in the New Zealand Defence Force Personnel Archives, Upper Hutt, New Zealand; (xiii) the Annual Calendars of Canterbury University College, Christchurch, New Zealand; (xiv) Session Minute Book of St Martin’s Church, Christchurch, New Zealand, 1935–1951; (xv) Prior (2003), an interview with Mary Prior, included in the 2003 edition of Prior’s Papers on Time and Tense (Per Hasle was the interviewer); (xvi) Geach (1970), Hughes (1971), Kenny (1970), Meredith (1977), and Thomas (1968, 1971). A number of people commented helpfully on earlier versions of this material: Colin Brown, Robert Bull, Aneta Markoska-Cubrinovska, Per Hasle, George Hughes, Saul Kripke, David Lewis, Peter Øhrstrøm, Diane Proudfoot, Stephen Read, Krister Segerberg, Miriam Solomon, and Bob Stoothoff. Thanks also to Jørgen Albretsen, Kerrie Brailsford, and Les Gee.

Copyright © 2020 by
B. Jack Copeland <jack.copeland@canterbury.ac.nz>

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