Intersections Between Analytic and Continental Feminism

First published Tue Dec 23, 2003; substantive revision Wed Jan 11, 2023

To the extent that Continental and analytic approaches to feminism differ, they do so primarily in the theoretical resources to which they appeal: analytic approaches typically take their starting point from philosophers in the English-speaking world – Russell, Moore, Quine et al. – while Continental approaches typically take theirs either from Germany – Hegel, Marx, the Frankfurt School et al. – or from France – Lacan, Kristeva, Derrida et al. Yet feminist philosophers are not always wedded to one tradition over the other; both analytic and Continental feminists look to the French philosopher, Simone de Beauvoir, for example, and both find theoretical resources in the works of J.L. Austin and Michel Foucault. Feminist work also often reveals the theoretical advantages of crossing the lines between analytic and Continental philosophy and between the two branches of Continental feminism. Indeed, Ann Garry recommends “that feminists use methodological distinctions very sparingly, that is, only when they are needed to avoid confusion or are otherwise extremely helpful” (2018, 23). Thus, although this entry distinguishes broadly analytic and broadly Continental feminist traditions, it also tries to clarify intersections and overlaps between the two traditions as well as the ways in which feminists within them build on one another’s work. The entry focuses on three topics common to the two traditions: problems of who or what women are, issues pertaining to freedom and domination, and questions of epistemic injustice.

1. Defining Women

For feminists, the question of who or what women are has never been easily answered and the situation has only become more complicated over time. Both analytic and Continental traditions find a clear articulation of the problem in Simone de Beauvoir’s 1949 book, The Second Sex where she famously claims that “One is not born, but rather becomes a woman” (1953, 281). Elizabeth Spelman’s consideration of this claim (1988) can serve as a starting basis for the analytic tradition’s reflections on the question of who or what women are meant to be while Judith Butler’s analysis (1990) can do the same for the Continental tradition.

1.1 The Analytic Tradition

The claim that “One is not born, but rather becomes a woman” signals a distinction between sex, comprising physical and biological aspects of bodies, and gender, comprising learned behaviors, attitudes and aspirations. While this distinction is complex and controversial enough (see the entry on feminist perspectives on sex and gender) Beauvoir’s claim also raises what are now termed intersectional issues. Spelman notes that in parts of The Second Sex Beauvoir recognizes that if one is not born but rather becomes a woman, it is not the same to become a white woman as it is to become a Black one and not the same to become a bourgeois woman as it is to become a proletarian one. Indeed, Beauvoir bemoans the effect this difference has for women’s struggles for freedom and equality. Women “live dispersed among the males,” she writes, “attached through residence, housework, economic condition, and social standing to certain men – fathers or husbands – more firmly than they are to other women. If they belong to the bourgeoisie, they feel solidarity with men of that class, not with proletarian women; if they are white, their allegiance is to white men, not to Negro women” (1953, xix). Not only are women’s allegiances bound to class and race but their classes and races can lead to tensions and conflicts with other women. Among other observations Beauvoir makes, Spelman notes, are that bourgeois women can be hostile to their working class male and female servants; that upper-class girls are brought up to believe in their superiority to working class men and that during the American Civil War some white Southern women defended slavery even more fiercely than their male counterparts.

In other parts of The Second Sex, however, Beauvoir ignores the consequences of intersections of gender with class and race, and talks about women in general. Spelman points to her contrast between women, on the one hand, and proletarians, aborigines, Blacks and Jews, on the other, as well as to her ascription of women’s failure historically to reject their subordinate social position to the advantages they gain from their alliance with “a superior caste.” Here Beauvoir seems to forget that many women are proletarians, aborigines, Blacks and Jews and she writes as if all women shared the same relation to the white bourgeois men she calls the “superior caste”(1953, xxi). Spelman also notes the contrast Beauvoir sets up between men defined as citizens and women depicted as wives “shut up in the home;” the way she refers appreciatively to August Bebel’s comparison of women and the proletariat in his Women under Socialism; the use she makes of Hegel’s discussion of the relationship between master and slave to describe the relationship between men and women; and her comparison of “Negro slavery” with female slavery (Spelman 1988, 64–5).

Beauvoir’s work thus contains a contradiction in its thinking about women: Sometimes it conceives of women as a homogenous group, uniformly subordinate to men, and sometimes it conceives of women as “dispersed,” with different relations of solidarity with, and subordination to, different groups of men. Both conceptions have problems. In conceiving of women as dispersed according to race and class Beauvoir’s work raises the question of what similarities in experience, interest or concern might underwrite feminist struggles. Sally Haslanger calls this the commonality problem (2000, 37). What experiences does a black Sudanese Muslim woman displaced by ethnic cleansing in Dafur share with the late Queen of England (Mikkola 2007, 363)? What connects white middle-class women pursuing professional careers with, say, poorer women or women of color who may take over their domestic chores (Ehrenreich 2002)? Might interests in a living wage by female childcare workers not oppose interests of more privileged women in affordable day care (Collins 1998, 223)? Moreover, in conceiving of women as a homogeneous group and contrasting them to proletarians, aborigines, Blacks and Jews Beauvoir betrays her identification of women in general with a certain group of women, namely those that are not proletarian, aboriginal, Black or Jewish. Haslanger calls this the normativity problem (2000, 37). Talk of women as a single group falsely generalizes the interests, characteristics and concerns of specific women – mainly those that are middle-class, European, white and heterosexual – and makes them the norm for all.

Kimberlé Crenshaw draws the consequences of this false generalization for anti-discrimination law (1989), which has the resources to deal with discrimination against Blacks or women but not discrimination against Black women, and for the issue of violence against Black women (1991). Civil rights groups often downplay statistics about domestic violence in Black neighborhoods because they do not want to feed stereotypes about the violence of Black men. Feminists often downplay the same statistics because they do not want domestic violence to appear to be simply a crime against women of color. Black men thus serve as the norm for civil rights advocates and white women as the norm for women’s rights advocates. The peculiar vulnerability of women of color at the intersection of racism and sexism disappears from view.

Crenshaw’s work on intersectionality underscores concerns about exclusion already voiced by the Combahee River Collective, founded in 1974, as well as by writers such as bell hooks (1981, 7), Aída Hurtado (1989, 849–50) and the contributors to such influential anthologies as This Bridge Called My Back (Moraga and Anzaldua 1981) and All the Women Are White, All the Blacks Are Men, But Some of Us Are Brave: Black Women’s Studies (Hull, Scott and Smith 1982). Recognition of the myriad intersections that complicate the identity of women also continues to develop, encompassing intersections with not only class, race, sexuality and nationality but disability, cisgender and so on. (See Bettcher and Garry 2009; Hall 2015, Bettcher 2021 and Hypatia’s special issue on decolonial feminism. 2020). Indeed, some scholars worry that putative intersectional analyses have wandered too far from their roots in Black feminist theory. (See Nash 2018).

Those analytic feminists interested in preserving some notion of women as a common identity pursue various strategies. Ann Garry (2011) looks to a Wittgensteinian family resemblance analysis. We can give up on the existence of some property, experience, or interest that all women share without giving up on overlapping and crisscrossing characteristics that become clear within specific social contexts. For her part, Haslanger proposes an “ameliorative” concept of women, one that can help with attempts to end sexist oppression. If gender cannot be defined in terms of characteristics or concerns common to members of a particular gender, she thinks it can nonetheless be defined “in terms of how one is socially positioned, where this is a function of, e.g., how one is viewed, how one is treated, and how one’s life is structured socially, legally, and economically.” On this account, gender categories represent hierarchical relations in which one group maintains a subordinate relation to another and the difference between the two groups is marked by “sexual difference” (2000, 38). Thus:

S is a woman iffdf S is systematically subordinated along some dimension (economic, legal, political, social, etc.) and S is “marked” as a target for this treatment by observed or imagined bodily features presumed to be evidence of a female’s biological role in reproduction (2000, 39).

Haslanger acknowledges that this definition excludes some we might intuitively think of as women such as women of inordinate privilege whose observed or imagined bodily features do not mark them for subordination. Nevertheless, she thinks that if we tailor our definition to the feminist purposes of overcoming subordination these “women” are not the ones who matter (2000, 46).

Yet Mari Mikkola claims that the confusion Haslanger’s terms would create by excluding many commonly defined as women “is unlikely to help in the task of challenging existing social conditions” (2009, 84). Worse, Katharine Jenkins (2016) thinks the definition excludes some trans women and probably includes only those trans women whose gender presentation is respected because they are perceived as possessing bodily features associated with a female’s role in reproduction; consequently they are perceived as either cisgender or as having undergone medical interventions that have altered some of their bodily features so that they now are understood as the same sort of features cis women possess (400). Jenkins thinks Haslanger’s ameliorative project can be rescued by considering gender not only in terms of class, as Haslanger does in talking about gender, but also in terms of identity, as Haslanger does in talking about race, where racial identities involve navigating the norms associated with them. Hence, both class as a woman and possession of a female gender identity need to be the focus of an ameliorative inquiry. (415–6).

In a later article (which refers to Judith Butler and Monique Wittig and thus indicates the artificial character of any strict separation of analytic and Continental schools in feminist philosophy), Haslanger concedes Jenkins’ point. Although she reiterates that her concern in her earlier essay was social function: “a theoretical analysis of the social factors that produced...gendered identities” (2020, 235) she now claims that her earlier account of gender did not offer an adequate replacement for identity.

1.2 The Continental Tradition

Continental feminists are often as concerned as Haslanger is with commonality and normativity problems. Debra Bergoffen takes up Beauvoir’s comparison of women and Black people in “Of Women and Slaves” (2017) while Chandra Mohanty criticizes the “add and stir” approach (2003, 518), which tries to counter the exclusion of many women but still takes the experiences of white European heterosexual women as the base while mixing in the experiences of others, say, Indonesian Nike workers, as if they were mere seasoning. Nor can the concerns be accommodated by taking Indonesian Nike workers as normative for non-Western women any more than the concerns of mid-twentieth century Parisian women can be taken as normative for Western ones (2003, 34). Indeed, as Catherine Homan writes, “Pursuing inclusion through the attempt to ‘add women’ or add people of color or any other traditionally marginalized identity ‘and stir’ is bound to fail because it does not question the norms of the tradition in the first place” (2022).

In her 1990 and now-classic book, Gender Trouble: Feminism and the Subversion of Identity, Judith Butler pushes such concerns further by questioning the relation between construction and representation. As a political movement, feminism supposes that it represents a set of pre-existing subjects, namely women, who are uniformly oppressed by a uniform patriarchy. Yet if we follow Foucault, we have to ask who these pre-existing subjects are. More specifically, if we return to Beauvoir’s claim that “One is not born, but rather becomes a women” we have to ask who or what it is that becomes a woman. It is misleading to think of oppression in terms of structures of power over against the subjects that precede them because subjects, as the particular subjects they are, are first constituted through specific authorizations “through the forms of power that regulate, control, represent and protect them.” Hence, “the juridical formation of language and politics that represents women as ‘the subject’ of feminism is itself a discursive formation and effect of a given version of representational politics” (1990, 2). While Beauvoir’s claim assumes a pre-existing female sexed person who acquires the attitudes, behaviors and aspirations of a feminine gender through socialization, Butler maintains that it is through regimes of gender that we first conceive of bodies as sexed. “Gender is … the discursive/cultural means by which ‘sexed nature’ or ‘a natural sex’ is produced and established as ‘prediscursive’” (1990, 7). This discursive formation of both gender and sex is not only inevitably exclusionary and not only “the mark imposed by the oppressor” (Wittig 1992, 11) but also inconsistent and incoherent both across different historical contexts (see Riley 1988) and in relation to race, class, sexual identities and so on.

As Butler points out, Luce Irigaray (1985) complicates matters further. Here Irigaray’s reference is Beauvoir’s claim that a woman “is defined and differentiated with reference to man and not he with reference to her; she is the incidental, the inessential as opposed to the essential. He is the Subject, he is the Absolute – she is the Other” (1953, 13). Beauvoir insists that there is no time in history in which women were not the Other: men are always the One and women are always the Other. Moreover, as the Other, they live only in relation to the One and have no free human existence or subjectivity on their own. They occupy space in a man’s world only as relative and inessential aspects of it. Yet Irigaray explains that if women are the Other to men they cannot be defined independently of a definition of men. To define women as the Other of men is to articulate their identity within a vocabulary that takes men as its norm. But if they cannot be defined independently of men, how are they Other from them? If women can be articulated only within a male-normed language, then language cannot get at their otherness at all. They are always, instead, part of a language system expressing the One. The “exclusion” of women, Irigaray writes, “is internal to an order from which nothing escapes: the order of (man’s) discourse. To the objection that this discourse is perhaps not all there is, the response will be that it is women who are ‘not-all’” (1985, 88). Julia Kristeva agrees. “A woman cannot be,” she writes. “It is something which does not even belong in the order of being” (1981, 137). Thus, if women risk disappearing into various nodes of intersectionality in the analytic tradition, in the Continental they risk being unable to be thought at all.

Is there any way to rescue them? Butler is not wedded to the idea that we need a stable conception of women. Rather, she wonders whether we should entertain “a radical critique that seeks to free feminist theory from the necessity of having to construct a single or abiding ground,” and she asks whether “the construction of the category of women as a coherent and stable subject” is “an unwitting regulation and reification of gender relations” (1990, 5).

Some other feminists making use of Continental sources are unsure about this conclusion. Iris Marion Young (1994) turns to Jean-Paul Sartre’s distinction between a series and a group. For Sartre, a group is a collection of people who consciously undertake a common project together where the project typically is one best taken up by this sort of group (1994, 724). Storming the Bastille is an example. In contrast, a series is less organized and not at all self-conscious; here the example is people waiting for a bus. These individuals possess a common interest in traveling along a certain route, but they have, or need have, no direct relation to one another. This series could become a group were individuals within it to start complaining about the length of time they wait for the bus, and they could undertake together some sort of collective protest. Nonetheless, without this move toward collective action, they remain isolated from one another and focused on the bus, which Sartre and Young call a practico-inert reality, rather than on each other.

Women, for Young, are a series, where one practico-inert reality is an effect of a compulsory heterosexuality that focuses on the features of a body connected to sexual reproduction. Other practico-inert realities include pronouns, verbal and visual representations, clothes, cosmetics, social spaces, and spaces associated with the sexual division of work and other activities. In each case, these realities describe structures or objects to which individuals relate themselves serially, as bus-riders relate themselves to a bus. Conceiving of women as a series thus allows for the sense in which they share certain features but in which they can also possess striking differences in their relation to the realities that make them part of that series. Women are “a serial collective defined neither by any common identity nor by a common set of attributes that all individual in the series share” (1994, 737). At the same time, they can always become a group through collective action.

In another broadly phenomenological attempt to rescue the common identity of women, Linda Martín Alcoff (2005) appeals to the phenomenology of Maurice Merleau-Ponty to anchor women’s identity in embodiment. Bodies and bodily experiences differ for men and women. These differences can stem from cultural practices that promote different ways of moving, siting, standing, running, speaking, and throwing a ball, for instance. Moreover, because of differences in physical strength, men and women also approach the same task differently, using different parts of their bodies to do the same things. Finally, in distinction from men, women’s bodily experiences include the “experience of breasts, menses, lactation and pregnancy” (2005, 106). For Alcoff, these differences lead to differences in women’s orientations or what, following the hermeneutic philosopher Hans Georg Gadamer, she calls horizons on themselves and their world. She does not deny that these horizons vary according to the traditions and cultures to which various women belong; nor does she deny that horizons also vary according to intersections with other factors, such as race and class. At the same time, she argues, “The possibility of pregnancy, childbirth, nursing, and in many societies, rape are parts of females’ horizons … and they exist there because of the ways they are embodied” (2005, 176). Yet here again, the specter of false generalizations looms. Stephanie Julia Kapusta (2016) questions Alcoff’s emphasis on biological differences and pregnancy given the way in which it can marginalize and inflict psychological, moral, or political harms on certain individuals, including trans people.

Other hermeneutic approaches to women’s identity include Georgia Warnke’s After Identity: Rethinking Race, Sex and Gender (2007) and Lauren Barthold’s A Hermeneutic Approach to Gender and Other Social Identities (2016). Warnke claims identities are interpretations of, or ways of understanding, who we and others are. As such they necessarily comply with the conditions of understanding: they are culturally and historically situated, motivated by particular concerns and interests and inevitably partial. We can thus understand people as women only in particular contexts and ought not suppose their identities or commonalities to extend beyond those contexts. For her part, while also conceiving of women’s identity in hermeneutic terms, Barthold questions both Alcoff’s and Warnke’s work. In her view a hermeneutic approach to identities must include an account of an individual’s various social identities and possibilities for negotiating among them, an account of the individual’s identity formation and an ability to assess the adequacy of particular social identities in socio-political terms.

1.3 Conclusion

In Beauvoir’s work, both broadly analytic and broadly Continental feminist approaches find resources for raising questions about who women are, how they might be defined and for what purposes. Both approaches are interested in developing a definition of women that is inclusive, sensitive to intersecting oppressions and useful to feminist struggles. There are affinities in some of the ways theorists in each tradition try to accomplish these goals: for example between Garry’s appeal to family resemblances and Young’s appeal to series that can become groups. Critics within each tradition also overlap in questioning the exclusions that the proffered definitions involve.

2. Freedom and Domination

With regard to questions of freedom and domination, the distinction between Continental feminists in the (French) post-structuralist tradition and those in the (German) tradition of critical theory is perhaps more pronounced than that between the latter and those in the analytic tradition.

2.1 The Continental Tradition

Butler begins her analysis in Gender Trouble (1990) by returning to Irigaray and Kristeva’s criticism of Beauvoir and arguing that their insights into the closed nature of a gendered linguistic system raise issues about a substance-accident metaphysics as a whole. According to this metaphysics, both sex and gender are meant to be accidental attributes attached to a substantial subject. One is essentially a subject and only accidentally a male or female, masculine or feminine one. Yet, if women can be defined only in terms of men, as the Other of men, then sex and gender are not as much accidents as they are relations – not attributes a subject possesses but oppositions between linguistic terms: male versus female and masculine versus feminine. Furthermore, if sex and gender are not attributes, perhaps we should rethink the subject or substance to which they are meant to attach. Perhaps there is only language which, in articulating a relation between male and female, masculine and feminine, posits a substance on which to erect those terms. Butler quotes Michel Haar’s commentary on Nietzsche:

All psychological categories (the ego, the individual, the person) derive from the illusion of substantial identity. But this illusion goes back basically to a superstition that deceives not only common sense but also philosophers – namely, the belief in language and, more precisely, in the truth of grammatical categories (1977, 17–8).

In other words, language inspires us to add substantial identities to actions because verbs need subjects. Turning from Nietzsche to J.L. Austin, Butler conceives of women (and men) as “performatives.” Performative speech acts for Austin are utterances such as “the meeting is now open” or “I now pronounce you husband and wife” in which, uttered under appropriate circumstances, the speech act does something by saying something. The speech act thus brings a state of affairs into existence. Likewise, according to Butler, the language of sex and gender, appropriately institutionalized, creates men and women.

What is meant by appropriately institutionalized? For Foucault (1978) the most important sites of power lie in everyday social practices such as social work, medicine and psychiatry, in scientific and social scientific disciplines that type individuals and create categories of identity, and in institutions such as prisons, schools and hospitals. Such power is productive: social institutions and practices create modern identities such as gays, Blacks and manic-depressives. For Butler and others, the construction of men and women takes a similar path as the result of compulsory heterosexuality. As a form of power, compulsory heterosexuality imposes a set of norms about how and whom we should desire and establishes a set of sanctions from this set. By doing so, it divides human populations into two genders that are in turn supposed to be connected to two sexes with two directions of sexual desire. Thus, one is a man with a male body and a desire for women or one is a woman with a female body and a desire for men. “The heterosexualization of desire,” Butler writes, “requires and institutes the production of discrete and asymmetrical oppositions between ‘feminine’ and ‘masculine,’ where these are understood as expressive attributes of ‘male’ and ‘female’” (1990, 17).

This account of identities as effects of power obviously raises the question of what happens to our capacities for critical agency and rational reflection, capacities to which Marxists and other social critics have traditionally appealed for a purchase on relations of power and subordination. If the subject, as a woman or gay person for example, is an effect of power, the structure of oppression is already built into the identity. How can women or gay people be agents for the emancipation of, or equal justice for, women or gay people if their identity is itself an effect of unequal power relations? Indeed, if we become subjects at all only within everyday disciplinary practices, then subjects are always already effects of power. To emancipate ourselves from power would be to emancipate ourselves from ourselves. How then how are we to address issues of freedom and autonomy?

Butler looks to resignification. Power not only produces but reproduces itself. This constant production and reproduction opens possibilities for “resignification, redeployment, subversive citation from within, and interruption and inadvertent convergences with other [power/discourse] networks” (1995, 135). Yet other Continental feminists find this approach unsatisfying. Nancy Fraser finds the positive connotations that Butler associates with resignification “puzzling.” “Why,” she asks, “is resignification good? Can’t there be bad (oppressive, reactionary) resignifications?”(1995, 67–8). If all subjectivity is a construction of power/discourse networks, why should we not simply be content with the subjects that our current disciplinary practices enforce? Or, if some resignifications are good, which ones? How do we determine which sort we should endorse?

In general, Fraser thinks feminists too eagerly turned to poststructuralist theories in the 1990s and that this turn has consequences: not only does it leave women with no prospects for change other than resignification but it also reduces gender inequality to a matter of language and culture. Here her criticism is directed at what she calls Lacanianism in feminism (2013). The work of Lacanian feminists has some merit, she says, in that it shows gender to be a discursive construction. Sexual identity is based on the process of identification, language, and socialization in which the child enters into the symbolic order, governed by the incest taboo or what Lacan calls “the law of the Father.” Subjugation to that law and becoming a subject are thus one and the same. Given the law’s phallocentric tilt, women are pretty much condemned. Nevertheless this analysis remains too historically unspecific for Fraser. What we need from discourse theory, she maintains, are insights into how our social identities are formed and altered over time, how social groups form and disintegrate, how dominant groups retain their cultural dominance and what the prospects are for emancipatory change.

Moreover, we need to balance cultural with economic analysis. For Fraser (2007), gender is a two-dimensional identity. It organizes a status hierarchy, one on which what she calls cultural feminism focuses, that permeates popular culture and everyday interactions in ways that demean women. But gender also structures a material and economic division between paid productive work and unpaid domestic work, and within paid productive work, it largely structures the division between higher-paid manufacturing and professional occupations and lower-paid, “pink collar” ones. An adequate feminist theory, she claims, must therefore allow for two independent, cultural and material analytic perspectives. In another work (2009), she adds a third political perspective to deal with issues of representation. Feminism for the 99%: A Manifesto (2019), written with Cinzia Arruzza and Tithi Bhattacharya, takes up these tasks, focusing on the need to fight for affordable housing, decent paying jobs, universal healthcare, and the like in order to win for women and working people in general the freedom to determine the course of their own lives.

Seyla Benhabib (1995), Amy Allen (2008) and Allison Weir (2013) also question Butlerian equations between identity, law and power that seem to deprive women of agency. Benhabib distinguishes between a stronger and a weaker version of the claim that identities such as women and gay people are constructions of power (1995, 20). The stronger version insists that subjects are entirely the effects of power, particularly of a compulsory heterosexuality, and that as effects they can only accept their mode of being a subject or try to subvert it from within. A weaker version of the claim, however, would simply emphasize that infants are born into a world of existing gendered relations, hierarchies and distributions of power and are acculturated into this world by parents, teachers and the like. To say that infants are born into prevailing structures of power, however, is not to say that they are already entirely constituted by them. Hence, Benhabib claims, there remain capacities for reflection and accountability that are not simply themselves effects of power.

While more sympathetic to Foucault and Butler, Allen uses Jessica Benjamin’s (1988) account of recognition to make a similar point. There may be “no outside to power, in the sense that there is no possible human social world from which power has been completely eliminated.” Nevertheless, we need not deny “moments of mutual recognition…within ongoing, dynamically unfolding, social relationships” that can provide for both the constitution of autonomous selves and a reference point for social and political critique (2008, 91). Weir likewise stresses relations of recognition, as well as of “identification, of flourishing, of meaning, of love, of different kinds of power, including empowerment and solidarity” (2013, 91). Again, resistance to domination is not just a matter of resignifying within oppressive structures. Rather it is a matter of transforming women. Indeed, Weir asks “What have we been doing in our women’s studies programs, associations of feminist philosophers and academics, feminist movements, lesbian communities, women’s cooperative, and culture building and other alternative communities if we haven’t been …producing women as something other than subjected?” (2013, 94).

2.1 The Analytic Tradition

Working from an Anglo-American liberal tradition, Martha Nussbaum raises questions similar to those that Allen, Benhabib, Fraser and Weir raise about a post-structuralist feminism. Indeed, she thinks the latter is irretrievably self-involved and needs to be rejected in favor of the kind of theoretical and practical work that can end oppressive practices and institutions (1999a). Her own starting point is what she calls the “capabilities approach,” an approach that is rooted in “respect for the dignity of persons as choosers” (2000, 71–2) and that asks what individuals within a given society are able to do and to be – what their capabilities or freedoms are. Following John Rawls here Nussbaum focuses on the distribution of resources and opportunities within a country or political entity. Like Amartya Sen, she adds to Rawls’ view, first, the question of what individuals’ needs for resources are and, second, the question of how they are able to convert these resources into human functionings (1999, 34). By human functionings, Nussbaum means the realization of one or more capability – the enjoyment of good health, for example. She is interested in both the basic functionings, without which we would not regard a life as human or fully human, and the less basic functionings, without which we would not regard a human life as flourishing.

The “we” here is not meant to be ethnocentric. The claim is, rather, that a just society provides individuals with capabilities for human functionings where the idea of the important capabilities is one to which people from different traditions with different conceptions of the good could agree as necessary to the pursuit of their particular conception. This idea provides a checklist of capabilities against which to measure forms of oppression and discrimination in particular countries. Thus, inequalities based on gender hierarchies as well as practices such as female genital mutilation will be precluded and a defense of such practices as part of the cultural tradition will not work. If cultural tradition confines women to the house, even if widowed and without means of support, then such practices are to be condemned as violating capabilities for even basic functioning. Indeed, while practices such as female genital mutilation and female confinement violate capabilities for life, nutrition and bodily integrity, all inequalities based on gender hierarchies, in Nussbaum’s view, undermine capabilities for self-respect and emotional development that are part of human functioning. Ultimately, Nussbaum’s concerns are the same as Fraser’s: that a focus on genealogy and resignification cannot do the work of undoing the social, political and economic discrimination that women suffer in far too many cultures and countries and that it is this discrimination that feminism must try to combat.

Other feminists have concerns about Nussbaum’s approach, however. Susan Moller Okin objects to the narrative approach that Nussbaum introduces in Women and Human Development insofar as it relies on retelling the experiences of two poor Indian women, Vasanti and Jayamma. Okin points out that despite the sort of cross-cultural dialogue in which Nussbaum thinks feminists should engage (Nussbaum 2000, 7), she rarely quotes these women directly and refracts their views through her own (Okin 2003, 295). From where, then, does Nussbaum’s checklist of capabilities come? Okin calls her idea of a fully human life “highly intellectualized” and maintains that the capacities central to it “seem to derive far more from an Aristotelian ideal than from any deep or broad familiarity with the lives of women in the less developed world” (2003, 296). Likewise, while Alison Jaggar thinks the narrative approach may be anodyne as long as it is meant simply heuristically, she argues that there is little evidence that Nussbaum’s list of capabilities reflects anything like a consensus or even overlapping consensus of “people across the world who are reasonably well-informed and uncoerced” (2006, 313). Rather, in spite of a long list of interlocutors, Jagger thinks Nussbaum pays insufficient attention to questions of inclusiveness and representation.

2.3 Conclusion

Feminists in both the analytic and Continental traditions raise concerns about a post-structuralist identification of the subject, including the feminist subject, with power. If women, like gay people and others, are the effects of discourses of power how can they also be the agents of their own emancipation? Some feminists find this question to be so removed from the horrific lives many women live as to be farcical. For example, Nussbaum asks that we attend to capacities and functionings and Fraser likewise insists that we move away from what she sees as purely cultural concerns to include socio-economic ones. Others try to secure theoretical grounds for agency and autonomy outside of power.

3. Epistemic Injustice

Feminism has an obvious relation to epistemology insofar as it must justify the legitimacy of its claims and the credibility of those making them. Miranda Fricker’s book, Epistemic Injustice: Power and Ethics of Knowing (2007) has grounded much of the current discussion in the analytic tradition, which has largely focused on cataloging and categorizing instances of epistemic injustice. The Continental tradition traces this issue back to concerns with ideology and power/knowledge regimes that have long been a part of emancipatory discussions.

3.1 The Analytic Tradition

Fricker takes up two varieties of epistemic injustice: testimonial and hermeneutical. Her account of the former can be seen as a development of claims Jennifer Hornsby and Rae Langton (1998) made about silencing with reference to Catharine MacKinnon’s claim that pornography interferes with women’s freedom of speech (1993). Freedom of speech involves not simply the ability to make claims but, more importantly, the ability to have illocutionary effects in which one’s audience takes up those claims. MacKinnon focuses on the ability to refuse sex by saying no. Under the influence of pornography one’s audience may not recognize what one is trying to do with one’s words and may fail to take this no as a refusal. For Fricker, structural identity prejudices in general affect one’s credibility as a speaker and conveyor of knowledge. Her example is the way, in the screenplay of “The Talented Mr. Ripley,” Marge Sherwood is unable to communicate her suspicions about Ripley to her father-in-law, Herbert Greenleaf, because of the identity prejudices he holds about women. Assuming that women tend to respond emotionally instead of rationally to a situation, he downgrades her credibility and effectively silences her. The testimonial injustice here excludes Sherwood from the social practice of pooling information.

Kristie Dotson (2011) distinguishes two different kinds of silencing practices: testimonial quieting and testimonial smothering. While testimonial quieting characterizes a failure to recognize the speaker as a knower and thus to offer the speaker appropriate uptake, Dotson describes testimonial smothering as a coerced truncation by speakers of their own testimony. Speakers recognize that their audiences are unwilling or unable to offer appropriate uptake to their testimony, and in response, limit and shape their testimony in order to “insure that the testimony contains only content for which one’s audience demonstrates testimonial competence” (2011, 244). Dotson characterizes both of these silencing practices as forms of epistemic violence, and both have dramatic effects for the epistemic pursuits of individuals and communities alike.

Dotson (2017) extends this analysis by offering an epistemological reading of Pauli Murray’s (1947) conception of a Jane Crow system of subordination, one that both targets Black women, making them hypervisible, and ignores them, making them invisible. Dotston is interested in the production of knowledge that facilitates this kind of subordination and identifies three conditions for it. First, shared assumptions and other epistemic resources can highlight certain subjects for study and render others uninteresting or irrelevant. From this point of view, Black women occupy “negative socio-epistemic space.” Second, this negative-epistemic space means that Black women lack credibility precisely in trying to articulate it. Finally, in what Dotson calls epistemic backgrounding, Black women serve as the backdrop for some other subjects of study – for example, in claims that Black boys are the most endangered U.S. population, as if the factors that cause this endangerment (poverty, poor schools and the character of policing) do not apply to Black girls as well.

With regard to hermeneutical injustice, Fricker focuses on gaps in the collective hermeneutical resources that make it difficult for members of particular groups, including women, to make sense out of and articulate important areas of their experience. The available resources are either not adequate for expressing these areas of experience or they are misleading. Where this failure or inadequacy affects people differentially it is unjust, Fricker argues. As an example she points to the damage done to many women’s lives and careers after they suffered unwanted sexual advances on the job before sexual harassment was a hermeneutical resource available to make sense out of their experience (2007, 152). Fricker thinks it would be a mistake to see this gap in the collective hermeneutic resources as merely bad timing, as might be the case if one suffered from a disease that had not yet been diagnosed or understood. Rather, to the extent that the gap affected women and their sexual harassers differentially it led to an injustice. It also derived from one. Fricker argues that the hermeneutical gap was the result of “unequal hermeneutical participation” in which women were left out of or barred from engaging in the formation of the relevant collective understandings (Fricker 2007: 152). This marginalization, she argues, results from a combination of two forms of power: identity power that downgrades a speaker’s credibility and material power. In a social world in which men have more power than women, men also have more say over defining what experiences mean and the result is to render “the collective hermeneutical resource structurally prejudiced” (2007, 154–5).

Shelley Tremain (2017) finds a problem with Fricker’s distinction between hermeneutical gaps due to diseases not yet diagnosed and hermeneutical gaps that reflect hermeneutical injustice. While Fricker wants to see the former as a case of mere bad luck, Tremain points to the lack of hermeneutical resources many disabled people suffer because of social, cultural and political norms that are as inadequate and misleading as those distorting attempts to articulate the experience of sexual harassment. As she writes, “Until the relatively recent formation and rise of ‘the mad pride movement’ and related social movements, the hermeneutical resources that such disabled people required in order to collectively understand the political character of their situation were unavailable to them” (178).

Other feminists add to Fricker’s account of hermeneutical injustice just as they do to her account of testimonial injustice. Following up on Charles Mills’ account of white ignorance (1998), Gaile Pohlhaus, Jr., for example, conceives of the consequence of this structural prejudice as a willful hermeneutical ignorance in which “dominantly situated knowers…continue to misunderstand and misinterpret the world” (2012, 716). Dotson uses this idea of willful hermeneutical ignorance to identify a third feature of epistemic injustice along with testimonial and hermeneutical injustice: namely contributory injustice in which willful hermeneutical ignorance compromises a speaker’s epistemic agency and obstructs the capacity to contribute to a community’s collective hermeneutical resources (2012, 31).

Fricker’s solution to testimonial injustice relies on the virtuous sensibility that allows one, when necessary, to neutralize one’s identity prejudices and negative credibility judgments about speakers while her solution to hermeneutical injustice relies on an awareness of possible gaps in the hermeneutical resources available to them. In responding to her critics, Fricker also distinguishes between “in-group intelligibility” within marginalized groups and their “frustratingly failed attempts to communicate” (2016, 167) with dominant groups. Together with Jenkins she also underscores the relation between testimonial injustice and ignorance, especially with regard to trans experiences (2017).

3.2 The Continental Tradition

Feminists in the Continental tradition are also interested in Fricker’s work. Warnke (2014) as well as Cynthia Nielsen and David Utsler (2023) note its affinities with Gadamer’s hermeneutics, although they note that unlike Gadamer, Fricker supposes the possibility of neutralizing one’s identity prejudices where identity is not relevant. For Gadamer, because prejudices are ineradicable as anticipatory orientations, we cannot neutralize them. We can, however, reveal them to ourselves – and thereby question them – by always according an initial credibility to our interlocutors, not, as Fricker supposes, only when we have reason to suspect identity prejudice.

Other feminists in the Continental tradition are concerned with Fricker’s reliance on virtue ethics and they stress the need to go beyond the dyadic instances of epistemic injustice on which she focuses. Axel Honneth (2023) argues for the necessity of embedding questions of epistemic injustice in normative social theory and, in particular, in a theory of social struggles for recognition. Alcoff (2017) makes three recommendations. First, we can look at what José Medina calls “complex histories and chains of social interactions that go beyond particular pairs and clusters of subjects” (Medina 2013, 60). Second, we can look at Foucault’s account of power/knowledge regimes for a robust account of collective hermeneutical resources and the exclusions they enforce as well of the institutional mechanisms that determine what is and is not to count as knowledge and who is and who is not to count as a knower. Finally, we can look at Foucault’s development of genealogy as a form of critique that allows for the disruption of epistemic hierarchies that may be inherited but that are nonetheless contingent.

In addition to Gadamer and Foucault, feminists in the Continental tradition look to the Marxist tradition and, in particular, to the work of Jürgen Habermas. What Fricker conceives of as structural prejudice in the collective hermeneutical resources, they see as the sort of ideological obfuscation that undermines a society’s capacity to understand its own creations. Thus, Habermas points to the power-relations our hermeneutical resources include and asks us not to forget that “the background consensus of established traditions … can be a consciousness forged of compulsions.” (1977, 358–9). (Also see Mills 2017.) Habermas’s early work focused on psychoanalysis as a model for a critical social theory but he later turns to a reconstructive science of communicative competence and to the possibilities of deliberative forms of democracy. Deliberative democratic theory looks to non-coercive exchanges of arguments among free and equal citizens who justify their claims and proposals by appealing to considerations that can be accepted by all those affected (1998, 458). Accordingly, Benhabib (1996) maintains that only those norms are valid that are agreed to in deliberations that have the following features:

1) participation in such deliberation is governed by norms of equality and symmetry; all have the same chances to initiate speech acts, to question, to interrogate, and to open debate; 2) all have the right to question the assigned topics of conversation; and 3) all have the right to initiate reflexive arguments about the very rules of the discourse procedure and the way in which they are applied or carried out (70).

Other feminists have sought an expanded version of deliberative theory that recognizes impediments to the participation of women and other marginalized groups. Fraser insists that critical theory needs to “render visible the ways in which societal inequality infects formally inclusive public spheres and taints discursive interaction within them” (1992, 121). She thus calls for a principle of participatory parity where all members of a society participate as peers. Social policies and actions must thus acknowledge the legitimacy of claims to recognition, achieve fairness in distributing resources and assure political representation (2005). For her part, Young (1996) questions the exclusionary function of rational argumentation. She thus substitutes communicative for deliberative democracy in order to expand the scope of considerations beyond the exchange of reasons to include story-telling as well as argumentation on grounds close to Fricker’s and Dotson’s concerns: namely that power relations can stifle speech (1996). Likewise Simone Chambers looks to a melding of deliberative and diversity theory (2003) while Noelle McAfee (2008) looks beyond a Habermasian proceduralism to an integrative model of public deliberation that respects the importance of multiple, partial views.

3.3 Conclusion

The concept of epistemic injustice has proved a fruitful one for feminists, as for critical race theorists, disability theorists and others. Those in the analytic tradition have focused on mapping its contours, nailing down the precise form of injustice it involves and exposing forms of socially positioned ignorance in which dominant groups continue to misapprehend the world. Those in the Continental tradition conceive of such ignorance as ideology and, like those in the analytic tradition, understand it as a mechanism of both distortion and silencing. They have also probed the conditions for forms of public communication and discourse free of coercion. Moving on from Fricker’s work, feminists in both analytic and Continental traditions remain interested in expanding the concept of epistemic injustice beyond dyadic relations to examine its systemic reach and consequences.

4. General Conclusion

Analytic and Continental feminists share interests in avoiding exclusion in attempts to define women, in overcoming patriarchal forms of oppression and in securing the claims of women to know and to participate in epistemic projects. Analytic and continental feminists sometimes pursue these interests in different ways, sometimes in similar ways and sometimes in conversation with one another. Collectively they take up and further develop a rich history of liberal, Marxist, post-structuralist, hermeneutic and linguistic thought.


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