Pragmatist Feminism

First published Sun Aug 22, 2004; substantive revision Thu Nov 19, 2020

Pragmatist feminism is a developing field of philosophy that emerged in the 1990s as a new approach to feminist philosophy. It utilizes and integrates core concepts of pragmatism, including its emphasis on pluralism, lived experience and public philosophy, with feminist theory and practice with a focus on social change. Pragmatist feminist philosophers have been addressing several different projects over the past decades, including a) the recovery of women who were influential in the development of American pragmatism but whose work subsequently all but disappeared in the history of philosophy, b) a rereading of the “canon” of pragmatist philosophers, analyzing their writing in light of their philosophies and attitudes about women, and c) the utilization of pragmatist philosophies as a resource for contemporary feminist philosophy and activism. The late 20th century saw a resurgence of interest in American pragmatist philosophy, and part of the energy of that resurgence was due to feminist interest in pragmatism. Twenty-first century feminist philosophers are incorporating a wider vision of American and global activism into the pragmatist-feminist dialogue.

What is now called “classical” American pragmatism is a grouping of philosophies that developed between the late nineteenth and the early twentieth century and were largely influential from the Progressive Era (1890–1915) up until the Second World War. Pragmatists, such as John Dewey, William James, and Jane Addams, were interested in the intersection of theory and practice, bringing philosophical thinking into relationship with the social and political environment. For these thinkers, philosophizing was an active process, both as a way to change social realities and to use experience to modify the philosophies themselves. Early pragmatists were often humanists; they saw the social environment as malleable, capable of improvement through human action and philosophic thought. Because of this, many of the classical pragmatists were engaged in social action, often participating in experiments in education and working for egalitarian social reforms. Both early and contemporary pragmatists reject the idea of a certain Truth that can be discovered through logical analysis or revelation and are more interested in knowledge gained through experiences of all sorts, while emphasizing the social context of all epistemological claims. Pluralism is a central value for pragmatists, who understand that knowledge is shaped by multiple experiential viewpoints. As such, women’s experiences are an essential part of pragmatist philosophy.

The weaving together of feminism and pragmatism situates social and political issues in historical, geographic and relational contexts and particularly addresses systems of oppression that have marginalized the voices of women and people of color. Biographical and theoretical approaches illuminate the connections between feminism and pragmatism as activist-orientated philosophies. These efforts are consistent with feminist methodology; they utilize personal experiences as well as theoretical work that focuses on embodied living in a social organism to address contemporary feminist social and political concerns.

Both feminism and pragmatism are fields that extend beyond the boundaries of traditional philosophy. Some early pragmatist feminists worked in areas that are now considered social science fields. Looking beyond academic philosophy to find the women who were influential social philosophers has expanded traditional philosophical methodology and has opened a a “new space for thinking” in philosophy. Understanding these reformers as philosophers helps us see how those outside of modern, professional, academic settings developed, expressed, and enacted groundbreaking theories and can illuminate how philosophers today might span the boundaries between scholarship and activism, between philosophy and other disciplines, and between the academy and the community.

Many of the historical women discussed here did not call themselves pragmatists but contemporary scholars and activists rely on their philosophies in a renewed emphasis on public and engaged philosophy in the pragmatist tradition (Lake 2014; Hamington & Bardwell-Jones 2012; Yun Lee 2011). This entry will first consider the influence of particular women in the classical pragmatist era, then highlight feminist rereadings of classical pragmatist work, describing how contemporary pragmatist feminist philosophers are drawing upon the work of early pragmatist feminist writers in order to pursue projects within epistemology, education, social action, and democratic pluralism. Finally, this entry will briefly consider emerging contemporary scholarship from global pragmatist feminist.

1. Early Feminist Contributions to American Pragmatism

Women were significant partners in the development and articulation of classical American pragmatism. Historical analyses bring into view the lives of philosophers and activists such as Jane Addams, Mary Parker Follett, Charlotte Perkins Gilman, Emily Greene Balch, Lucy Sprague Mitchell, Anna Julia Cooper, Mary Whiton Calkins, and Ella Flagg Young. These women bring added dimensions to pragmatism; they remind us of the issues that were subsequently left behind as American philosophy became more exclusively technical and academic. For most of these women, pragmatism was a philosophic practice used to accommodate their new academic and political engagement with the world, as well as a method of reforming politics and culture. The pragmatist approach to philosophy that brought theory and practice together helped these women trust in and learn from experience and intellectually engage in a host of social reform movements.

The historical recovery of female voices in the history of philosophy in the last few decades is an ongoing project; it both helps us become aware of women’s influence on the history of philosophy and shines a light on the processes that lead to the marginalization of women’s voices (see the entry feminist history of philosophy). Recovering these women thinkers also allows us to hear new or excluded voices in the philosophic conversation, in some cases resulting in opening up the definition of philosophy itself. Recognizing “philosophical techniques are means, not ends”, these women rejected “philosophizing as an intellectual game that takes purely logical analysis as its special task…” (Seigfried 1996: 37). Because of the gender-based discrimination against women as rational thinkers and their exclusion from the academy, history has rarely carried the names and texts of these women into our philosophy textbooks (see for example Eileen O’Neill’s 1998 essay “Disappearing Ink”). Thus, it should not be surprising that many of the women whose work has been brought into the feminist-pragmatist discussion were college-educated activists rather than professional academic philosophers; nevertheless, scholarship has shown that their work had an enormous impact on the development of pragmatist thought. A historical look at how these women affected what became known as pragmatism demonstrates the interactive and relational nature of philosophizing.

The history of pragmatism is recent enough that we can more easily recover and recognize the women who participated in forming this uniquely American school of thought, formerly considered only through the work of such male thinkers as William James, Charles Sanders Peirce, George Herbert Mead, George Santayana, and John Dewey. The work of women who were in philosophic and activist dialogue with these philosophers, and who were original philosophers in their own right, had mostly disappeared until the latter part of the twentieth century. Charlene Haddock Seigfried’s work, particularly her 1996 book Pragmatism and Feminism, was central in the effort to bring these invisible women back into the philosophical discussion, as well as to bring feminist perspectives to the field of pragmatism.

In the Progressive Era, many of the college-educated social reformers in the Chicago area lived at Hull House or were associated with the University of Chicago. Some of the Hull-House reformers, such as Sophonisba Breckinridge and Edith and Grace Abbott, held academic positions but did most of their academic and activist work in the realm of social reform. Some, such as Julia Lathrop and Florence Kelly, went on to hold influential governmental positions. Other feminist pragmatists working on social and philosophic issues worked with James and Royce at Harvard or were engaged with feminist reforms in other fields such as suffrage activism or peace work. Early feminist pragmatists included the following women:

Jane Addams (1860–1935) was a central figure in the development of pragmatist thought. In her lifetime Addams was revered as one of America’s most famous social reformers, the founder of Hull House, and the recipient of the 1931 Nobel Peace Prize. Her pragmatist philosophies emerged from her experiences working in the poverty-stricken immigrant neighborhoods of Chicago, from her collaborations with the talented women who lived at Hull House, as well from reflection on texts and direct dialogue with philosophers of her time (including John Dewey, William James, George Herbert Mead, and W.E.B. DuBois). Addams published eleven books and hundreds of essays, writing on ethics, social philosophy, and pacifism, in addition to analyzing social issues concerning women, industrialization, immigration, urban youth, and international mediation.

Emily Greene Balch (1867–1961) was a member of the first graduating class at Bryn Mawr, engaging in graduate studies at the University of Chicago and the Harvard Annex, and ultimately teaching at Wellesley College for over 20 years. Along with Addams, she was a founding member of Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom. While trained as a sociologist and an economist, evidence of pragmatist philosophy is abundant in her work. This is particularly true in her support of social democracy and in her fundamental faith that the social environment was capable of transformation through philosophical reflection and action. Her commitment to pluralism and economic justice led her to work on suffrage activism and global racial justice. She received the Nobel Peace Prize in 1946.

Ella Lyman Cabot (1866–1934) struggled to be a philosopher in the male-dominated philosophies of early 20th century. She took classes at Harvard and Radcliffe with James and Royce. She continued to be part of the Harvard philosophical community and as such was also a formative influence on others’ writings. She was also a longtime advocate of women’s rights. She wrote seven books on ethics and education. Her work was recovered in John Kaag’s 2013 book Pragmatism, Feminism, and Idealism in the Philosophy of Ella Lyman Cabot.

Mary Whiton Calkins (1863–1930) studied under pragmatists William James and Josiah Royce at Harvard, primarily working in psychology, which was then a sub-field of philosophy. In 1905, Calkins became the first woman president of the American Psychological Association and in 1918 became the first woman president of the American Philosophical Association. She was an advocate for women’s suffrage, claiming in 1905 that “a distinction based on difference of sex is artificial and illogical” (Harper (ed.) 1922: 171). While not generally categorized as a pragmatist philosopher, her influence as a female philosopher created a pathway for other women philosophers.

Elsie Ripley Clapp (1882–1965) was a student of classical pragmatists, taking over fourteen courses from Dewey at Columbia, working as his graduate assistant, and collaborating on research projects with him for years (see Seigfried 2001: 89–90). Clapp commented on drafts of Dewey’s work, and contributed original ideas (Seigfried 1996: 92). Dewey publicly acknowledged Clapp for her contributions to Democracy and Education, but only in the introduction, not attributing to her any particular ideas in the body of the text. At his retirement in 1927, Dewey suggested that Clapp should be appointed to teach his courses at the Teachers College, but she was not offered the position by the college. She went on to collaborate with Eleanor Roosevelt on significant rural education projects of her time.

Anna Julia Cooper (1858–1954) was an educational reformer, particularly focused on the education of African-American women. She received her BA and MA at Oberlin College and earned her Ph.D. at the Sorbonne at the age of 66. Her writings about the dual oppressions of race and gender are considered one of the foundations of contemporary feminist theories of intersectionality. She is best known for her 1892 book, A Voice from the South by a Black Woman of the South.

Alice Chipman Dewey (1858–1927) is generally credited with bringing Dewey’s philosophic Hegelian thinking into contact with real social issues. She was raised in Michigan by her pioneering grandfather and attended a Baptist seminary after high school. Her lifelong interest in education led her to be a school teacher. This work along with her commitment to the women’s rights movement led her to study at the University of Michigan where she met John Dewey. Their daughter Jane described Alice’s influence on John by saying that “things which previously had been matters of theory acquired through his contact with her a vital and direct human significance” (Rockefeller 1991: 150). Alice Dewey continued her interest in education as principal of University of Chicago Lab School where she worked with Dewey on experimental and experiential education reform.

Mary Parker Follett (1868–1933) studied with Royce, James, and Hart at Radcliffe/Harvard. Her academic training was primarily in political theory and philosophy. Like Addams and many of the feminist pragmatists of her era, her philosophy was developed out of her deep engagement with issues in her Boston community, and from observing how people interact in public life. Follett thought that the simple act of voting would never change society and thus never directly advocated for women’s suffrage. Like most pragmatists, Follett critiqued the dualism of individualism claiming “(t)he group and the individual come into existence simultaneously” (1918: 127). Follett’s advocacy of “power-with” rather than “power-over” in political as well as organizational work is considered a precursor to contemporary feminist analyses of power (see Pratt 2011; Kaag 2011; Whipps 2014b). Follett published three books and many essays and speeches. Her work has gained new significance in contemporary management theory and in modern leadership studies.

Charlotte Perkins Gilman (1860–1935) was a lifelong friend of both John Dewey and Jane Addams. Gilman stayed at Hull House for about a month in 1895 where she lectured and explored the settlement culture. Gilman, not formally trained in philosophy, was interested in the philosophy of “find(ing) out what ailed society and how most easily to improve it” (Upin 1993: 42). Gilman was particularly concerned with the industrial and economic conditions of women, both in the home and in the workplace. She sought to use philosophy in order to address the social and political problems of her time and place, particularly related to women’s issues. She is the author of nine novels, including the feminist utopian novel Herland, and ten works of nonfiction, including Women and Economics: A Study of the Economic Relation Between Men and Women as a Factor in Social Evolution. Gilman’s short story “The Yellow Wallpaper” is a classic in feminist literature.

Lucy Sprague Mitchell (1878–1967) was born in the generation after Jane Addams and was a student of the classical pragmatists. As a feminist educator she both defined and reflected the progressive era philosophies of reform and social change through educational progress. In 1903, Mitchell became the first dean of women at the University of California at Berkeley where she encountered the sexism that was pervasive in the academy in that era. After moving back to New York, she began a 60-year career in child-centered education, combining educational scholarship in both research and practice, with founding and administrating innovative programs. In her lifetime, she was also seen as an example for other women who were interested in professional lives while marrying and raising children, something that was rarely available to the women of her generation. Mitchell’s Bank Street School demonstrated the effectiveness of pragmatist child-centered education and continues to influence childhood development specialists and educators.

Ella Flagg Young (1845–1918) was a lifelong educator and then administrator in the school system in Chicago, and later was a professor of education at the University of Chicago. She was elected the first woman president of the National Education Association and worked for women’s suffrage. According to Seigfried, Dewey was specific about how Young’s “original interpretations and applications of his theories went beyond his own understanding” (Seigfried 1996: 80). According to Joan K. Smith (1977), Young began taking classes from John Dewey at the University of Chicago in the fall of 1895; at that point she had over 30 years of experience in teaching and administration. She published three books on education.

2. Feminist Re-reading of Classical Pragmatist Philosophers

Feminist philosophers have taken on the project of re-examining philosophic texts through the lens of gender, analyzing how particular thinkers’ philosophies often depend on the subjugation of women; for example, Rousseau’s idealized “Emile” is only possible through the supporting role of the idea of “Sophie”. Likewise, feminist pragmatists are examining the role of women and gender in the canon of pragmatist philosophy, particularly looking at the work of John Dewey, Charles Sanders Peirce, William James and George Herbert Mead. Pragmatism originated in a time when our culture was in the midst of enormous change in women’s roles, yet early century male pragmatists were often unaware of how gender biases affected knowledge and culture as well as their own ideas. Like many figures in the philosophical canon, at times they universalize the male perspective. Yet, as we will see, pragmatism and feminism overlap in significant ways, and even in their critiques, feminists find value in these thinkers’ works.

Books such as Feminist Interpretations of John Dewey (Seigfried 2001) and Feminist Interpretations of William James (Tarver and Sullivan 2015) have made these influences clear. In this latter volume Erin McKenna’s essay, “Women and William James”, points out James’ expectation that the women in his life (particularly his wife, mother and sister) play traditional roles of self-sacrifice. The concept of “free will” is central to James’ work, yet, as McKenna reveals, he didn’t grasp how his gender, class, and race provided him this freedom.

The opportunity to exercise “free will” was not shared equally, and he did not see now his freedom intersected with the oppression of others. (McKenna 2015: 83)

Other pragmatist feminists have also examined the gendered reception of philosophers’ writings, for example, Marilyn Fischer reread James’s acclaimed “The Moral Equivalent of War” in the context of its time, demonstrating that James drew on “common conceptions shared by militarists, misogynists, and imperialists of the day” (2018).

Dewey’s thinking was also shaped by the gendered expectations of his time and place, even though women played more equal roles in his life. As Seigfried noted (1998), Dewey was a supporter of many feminist causes. Yet, as she also pointed out later, “the pitfalls of a view of women seen solely from a male perspective, even that of a sympathetic male” still affect Dewey’s writing (2001: 10). Why does this matter? As Nancy Tuana has said,

Paying attention to the workings of gender within the texts of philosophy will make visible the complexities of the inscription of gender ideologies. (Tarver and Sullivan 2015: ix)

These feminist re-readings and analyses have provided a view of the cultural context of pragmatist writings; it helps us understand how and why women were marginalized in the intellectual history of pragmatism. As we will see, these important critiques have not deterred feminist pragmatists from seeing the value in and building upon the work of these classical pragmatist thinkers.

3. Pragmatist Feminist Philosophical Themes

Contemporary feminists are also implementing and extending pragmatist philosophies as a foundation for feminist theory. These feminist philosophers working in the pragmatist tradition point out that pragmatism offers a valuable, although often unrecognized, resource for feminist thinkers, especially as it is developed in the work of women pragmatists and activists. We see this particularly in feminist pragmatist writings on experience, epistemology, education and social action.

For example, contemporary feminists point out how traditional philosophy’s emphasis on rational, logical absolutes devalues the ambiguities of the experience of an embodied life. For feminist pragmatists, pluralistic communities have epistemological value and provide the base for an inclusive problem-solving approach to social issues. The pragmatist understanding of education as a social and political force, as a major aspect of how society and individuals are shaped, has been echoed by contemporary feminists who analyze our educational curriculum and methods of teaching. Both pragmatism and feminism are more likely to bring social context to the forefront of philosophy, opening space for realities in flux, for emergent situations to be shaped and reconstructed by their context. Pragmatists emphasize that we must include particular and individual experiences in a pluralistic discussion of multiple realities, and that all parties involved in an issue also be involved in the problem-solving process.[1]

3.1 Valuing Experience

A historical examination of pragmatism shows a reverse ordering of the theory-action method sometimes assumed in philosophic thought, and often critiqued by feminist thinkers. In its privileging of theory, some philosophical texts leave us with the impression that ideas normally originate from ideal and often solitary theoretical thinking that is then diffused into the general culture. However, in the case of many women activists, like Jane Addams, it is evident that public and political activism shaped the character of the philosophy. Indeed, she advised leaders to “move with the people”, aiming to first “discover what people really want” so that they can together uncover a way forward that neither could alone “see very clearly till they come to it” (“Democracy and Social”, 1902 [2002]: 69). Such a method is consistent with pragmatism; as 20th century pragmatist Sidney Hook said, “social action is the mother of inspiration and not, as is usually imagined, its offspring” (1940 [1991]: 3). Feminist theory has also grown out of the activism of the women’s movement; it incorporates the understandings that have resulted from social activism. Pragmatist philosophers often made these same points in their critiques of positivism. Both pragmatists and feminists advocate for the practical use of philosophy in the realm of personal and public experience; pragmatism and feminism generally also share a social and/or political focus and advocate specific cultural changes.

The pragmatist commitment to situated knowledge, rather than abstract or idealized knowing has been influential in some fields of feminist ethics, particularly in care ethics. Maurice Hamington draws on Addams’s ethics to articulate “a proactive embodied care” based on “ habits of interaction” (2004: 104). George Herbert Mead’s philosophy of the self has also played a prominent role in care ethics for both Hamington and Heather Keith. As Keith said of Mead’s concept: “ the self is wholly integrated into an ecology of both physical and social relationships facilitates a conception of selfhood valuable to the sort of personal and moral liberation called for by feminism” (1999: 330).

Currently feminists and pragmatists share an effort to radically change oppressive political and social structures, an effort that finds resonance with the early feminist-pragmatists. Jane Addams and other feminist reformers like Charlotte Perkins Gilman were continuously involved in fighting oppression, especially of women, children, and minorities. Pragmatism’s continued insistence that philosophy address the problems of the current social situation supports critiques of gender, race and class oppression, even though the majority of pragmatism’s male founders were often relatively inattentive to cultural gender-related oppression.

3.2 Epistemology

Feminists and pragmatists share an interest in the situatedness of the knower within their social environment. They are both committed to an epistemology that is based in experience and relationality. Feminist-pragmatists point out that the search for universalized ideals bankrupts ordinary experience and robs from philosophic thought the creativity of thinking with and through complex networks of experience and interaction. In Pragmatism and Feminism, Seigfried highlights aspects of pragmatism that make it useful to feminist epistemology, noting both fields share a critique of dualism. Seigfried reminds her reader of four dualistic aspects of rationalistic philosophy critiqued by Dewey and some feminists for its oppressive support of invidious social/economic hierarchies. The four dimensions of this rationalist approach include:

  1. The depreciation of doing and making and the over-evaluation of pure thinking and reflection;
  2. the contempt for bodies and matter and simultaneous praise of spirit and immateriality,
  3. the sharp division of practice and theory, and
  4. the inferiority of change and superiority of a fixed reality. (Seigfried 1996: 113)

Jane Duran, in “The Intersection of Pragmatism and Feminism” (1993), points out that feminist theorists critique this preoccupation with universals, writing that it seems “to pervade much of analytic philosophy (indeed philosophy as a whole)”. This desire for universals, she says, leads all the way back to Plato. Plato’s idealism carries with it a devaluation of the changing realm of the physical world. Duran points out that feminists, as well as pragmatists, are often less interested in universal generalities and notes that an emphasis on particulars as well as “relations and connections become almost more important than particulars themselves” (1993: 166). This pluralistic sense of refusing to constrict reality to that which is defined by logic or language helps feminists as philosophers propose an alternative vision of philosophy.

Susan Dielman points to the importance of discourse and language analysis in addressing hegemonic epistemic exclusions; she brings neopragmatist theory, specifically that of Richard Rorty, into the feminist pragmatist dialogue in order to understand “the interconnectedness of power and discourse” (2012: 99).

Feminist pragmatists have also built on John Dewey’s concept of experience as philosophical support for a position that holds together the subject and object in a nondualistic epistemology. Yet, as postcolonial feminists have pointed out, experience in itself is conditioned by one’s cultural background. Ofelia Schutte (2000) notes that “the nature of knowledge is not culture-free but is determined by the methodologies and data legitimated by dominant cultures” (2000: 40). Feminist-pragmatist Celia T. Bardwell-Jones (2008) draws on Josiah Royce’s theory of interpretation to address the problem of translation “at the borders of conflicting experience…where differences are translated instead of assimilated” (2008: 22). Such epistemological translation work is essential for feminists and pragmatists, given that in both fields theory is inherently about changing the world. Jane Addams embodied this intersection of pragmatism and feminism in her efforts to interpret across class and cultural boundaries; through this interpretative and activist work she sought to reconstruct the social order and increase justice for women and the underprivileged. Addams’ understanding of the relationship between action and truth contributed to her choice of a career in the public world. For her, a motivation to understand truth would compel her to seek it out in the world of action. As a public philosopher, reformer, and activist embedded in her community, Addams was called to act under inherently messy, dynamic, and ambiguous situations (see Fischer 2005, 2011, 2013 and Lake 2014, 2015). This interpretive activism opened opportunities for reconstruction, redefining relations between the public and the expert, students and the instructor, the governed and the governors.

Similarly contemporary feminist thinkers have changed the academy and the larger culture by re-analyzing and reconstructing the ways that we think, the hierarchies of knowing, as well as the social conventions that have defined gender. Erin McKenna in The Task of Utopia: Pragmatist and Feminist Perspective (2001) uses this process-orientation to create a social/political philosophy that is always open to change, rather than one with finished “ends” in view. With both feminism and pragmatism we can consider philosophizing contextually as a creative force, reacting to as well as reconstructing our multiple environments.

Feminist social analysis often produces the conditions for philosophic reflection, creating what Addams called “perplexities” that are the starting-points for philosophical and political change (1902 [2002]: 77). In “Feminist-Pragmatist Revisioning of Reason, Knowledge, and Philosophy” (1993), Phyllis Rooney notes that the classical pragmatists would have welcomed the challenges that contemporary feminisms have brought to philosophy. She compares these rifts to what Peirce called the “irritations of doubt” (Peirce 1877, quoted in Rooney 1993: 21) which open the door to inquiry and signal possibilities for recreation and rediscovery. Dewey called this irritation “an unsettlement” which “aims at overcoming a disturbance” or the “uncertainties of life” (1916 [1985]: 336–337), which he says, are the motivations for beginning to do philosophy. In Democracy and Social Ethics, Addams references moments of “perplexities” as openings to begin rethinking social values and epistemological claims. Pragmatism and feminism then share a movement toward active philosophizing about those “irritations”, “uncertainties”, and “perplexities”.

Feminist epistemologists such as Susan Bordo and Alison Jaggar point out how traditional philosophy’s emphasis on rational, logical absolutes has devalued the ambiguities of changing embodied experience. Feminist and pragmatists have both rejected body/mind dualisms. Shannon Sullivan in Living Across and Through Skins (2001) brings the pragmatist tradition of transactional knowing through embodied and relational lived experience to the feminist epistemology of standpoint theory, describing what she calls a “pragmatist-feminist standpoint theory”. This pragmatist-feminist perspective suggests knowing unfolds in relationships enacted through our physical embodiment and the social environment; knowing should thus incorporate “multiple marginalized perspectives”. Using Dewey’s standard of truth as that which results in “transactional flourishing” Sullivan considers “questions about which standpoints can help promote flourishing transactions” (2001: 146–47). In doing so, she corrects the privileging of women’s experiences that is found in Sandra Harding’s feminist standpoint theory, and locates knowing as transactions among diverse others, possibly even non-humans. Sullivan’s work is particularly significant in the ways she investigates feminist issues of embodiment drawing on both Continental and American Pragmatist perspectives.

Wicked problem scholars and community change-agents Valerie Brown and Judith Lambert also employ a feminist pragmatist epistemology in their 2013 Collective Learning for Transformational Change: A Guide to Collaborative Action. Brown and Lambert, for instance, argue that sustainable and just transformational change on our collective social problems requires we begin by first sharing our values. Since our core values tend to shape our perspective and our actions, recognizing the range of values involved explicates the complexities. Their model also emphasizes individual narratives and legitimizes a range of knowledge, including individual, community, specialized, organizational, holistic, and collective knowledge cultures (2013: 22).[2] This shared epistemological framework has had—and continues to have—a significant influence on educational practices.

3.3 Education

Pragmatist feminists of the Progressive Era had an enormous influence on childhood and adult educational theory and practice. Addams’ educational philosophy provides a model for the interaction between thinking and action. For her, as well as for other educators like Lucy Sprague Mitchell, education is not seen as standing apart from life but rather blending seamlessly into the fabric of experiences and providing a meaning-making function. Addams understood that while education informs experience (providing historical context as well as skills), it must also interact with and change in response to current social needs. In understanding the culture that students come from as well as the values of their lives, Addams argued for an educational approach that uses students’ own experiences (personal as well as cultural) as starting points for learning.

In general, early pragmatist-feminist writing consistently demonstrates a distrust of educational theories that are disconnected from experience. In Twenty Years at Hull House (1910), Addams talks about how the professor’s lack of interest in matters of the “welfare of mankind” leaves behind the messy and chaotic experiential realm of student relationships for the more pure intellectual realm; she argued this separation also opens students to the influence of “charlatans” (1910 [1990]: 247). Addams’ vision of education, even in the early days of Hull House, fostered an interchange between the intellectual culture of a liberal arts education and the practical aspects of urban industrial life, bringing life and thought together.

Addams was involved in educational reform in the Chicago Public Schools and later was a member of the Chicago School Board. However, her philosophy of education has had more enduring impact on adult education theory and practice, primarily as a result of her innovations at Hull House. In working with adults, she integrated arts, literature and history into industrial life; later she celebrated the arts and culture that was already present in the lives of her industrial immigrant communities. In contrast, Lucy Sprague Mitchell’s Bank Street School demonstrated the effectiveness of pragmatist child-centered education and continues to influence childhood development specialists and educators.

Further, a host of feminist pragmatists had a direct and sustained influenced on Dewey’s educational philosophy: from Jane Addams and Alice Chipman Dewey, to Ella Flagg Young, Elsie Ripley Clapp, and Lucy Sprague Mitchell. Indeed, Dewey had not published in philosophy of education, or worked on educational issues, before he came to Chicago where he experienced Jane Addams’s Hull House and worked with individuals like Ella Flagg Young. Her contributions to Dewey’s philosophy included: (1) “the extent to which freedom meant … a respect for the inquiring or reflective process of individuals”; (2) an understanding of “the way that the interactions of persons with one another influences their mental habits”; and, (3) “how all psychology that was not simply physiological was social” (Seigfried 1996: 80).

Pragmatist philosophy of education continues to have a global influence. Dewey is often cited as the catalyst for experiential learning and civic engagement practices. For instance, David Kolb utilizes Dewey’s philosophy to advocate for a move away from narrowly framed and abstract specialization towards experiential learning (2003). Kolb, like many others, extends this philosophy of education, emphasizing learning as a spiral cycle of reflective action and engagement (Brown and Lambert 2013; Norton 2005).

Other contemporary feminist philosophers of education draw on the pragmatist tradition, especially the work of early pragmatist women, in their conceptualization of education as a political and emancipatory practice. Possibly because of its interest in the relationship between theory and action, philosophy of education has always occupied a privileged place in pragmatist philosophy, and feminist pragmatist writing reflects this.

Feminist philosophers, such as Elizabeth Minnich and Jane Roland Martin, have critiqued the traditional canon, pointing out the ways that the canon perpetuates the traditional power structures by excluding the works of women and minorities. Minnich points out that the administrative structures of colleges and universities often place programs like women’s studies or African-American studies on the periphery of the college hierarchies. Minnich’s 1990 book, Transforming Knowledge, draws on both a feminist critique and pragmatist practices to advocate for a rethinking of the patriarchal assumptions at the base of our academic traditions. This work reconstructs what it means to do philosophy, opening our definitions of philosophy to voices that may have been previously excluded or marginalized. Minnich and other feminist thinkers show us how many traditional theorists have been blinded by their inability to conceive of ideas outside of the dominant hegemonic traditions. Minnich points out that pragmatism can share with feminism the vitality that arises from an opening of philosophy to newness, to otherness, to diversity.

Maxine Greene, a philosopher of education who draws on multiple philosophical traditions, has inspired a generation of educators and philosophers to think of education in terms of a practice of freedom, to provide an opening of spaces for new ways of thinking and being. In The Dialectic of Freedom (1988), Greene relies on John Dewey, the example of Jane Addams, as well as feminist novels, to describe the ways that women have told the truths about their private and public lives. Greene wants an educational system that allows radical difference, that leaves open a space for diverse others to appear in the public world, to “tear aside the conventional masks…that hide women’s being in the world” (1988: 57).

More recent feminist pragmatist pedagogies integrate scholarship on wicked problems, sustainability education, and community engagement (Lake 2015; Whipps 2014a); Parker 2010). This educational approach extends the work of Dewey and Addams, highlighting the need for “context-sensitive, dialogue-driven, action-based” learning (Lake 2015: 252). The integration and application of these fields offers students opportunities to impact real problems, develop skills, and foster virtues necessary for collaboratively addressing public problems. Current research on this form of education highlights how it prepares students to take on the role of an integrator and “boundary spanner” (Ramaley 2014: 12) in addition to fostering “change agent” skills (Svanström, Lozano-García, and Rowe 2008).

3.4 Social Action

Early feminist pragmatists often influenced the intellectual culture of the Progressive Era and early pragmatist thought through activism. While early feminist pragmatists were influenced by Darwinian thought, they rejected the harsh position of Social Darwinism that pits humans in a competitive fight for individual survival. Instead, they used the concepts of evolution to theorize the possibilities of social progress, affirming a social ethic that mandates humans have both the ability and the responsibility to improve their environment. Charlotte Perkins Gilman, for example, concentrated much of her writing on social issues of women’s environment, working towards radical changes in the home environment to make it more democratic and egalitarian. Gilman’s writing recommended some Hull House innovations as examples of some of the social changes she recommended, such as having professional cooks making healthy family meals in a public kitchen, instituting day care centers, and abolishing industrial child labor. Addams was also quite perceptive about the perplexities of home life for women; in Democracy and Social Ethics, she consistently advocated that the private home life of women should more directly align with a public social good.

Addams’s life work—involving both place-based local activism and global outreach—is a powerful illustration of enacting experimental values under specific conditions through an iterative process of concrete experience and reflective theorizing. Rather than a philosophic retreat from the events and textures of everyday life, feminist pragmatists have chosen to do philosophy in an interactive and public mode. Marilyn Fischer describes Addams’s activism and writing as “an experiment in real time of the process of democratic, pragmatist political reconstruction”. She continues by labeling her activism as “the sort of concrete experience from which pragmatist theory emerges and to which it must return for validation” (2013: 229). In Jane Addams’s Evolutionary Theorizing: Constructing Democracy and Social Ethics (2019), Fischer shows that Addams, in analyzing the most pressing social issues of her day, drew on a vast array of international intellectual resources, most notably from theorists across the disciplines who patterned their work on evolutionary biology. By showing that Addams was a more wide-ranging intellectual than has been documented to date, Fischer’s work also expands our understanding of the roots of classical American pragmatism.

Peace activism is a field of social activism that engaged many of the women of the early progressive pragmatist era. Starting with the Spanish American War of 1899 and in the decades prior to World War I, pragmatists and feminists worked on anti-imperialist campaigns and fought militarist influences in society. After the beginnings of the war in Europe, political activism in opposition to war and working for alternatives to war became, for some women, their primary occupation. Yet, for most of these activists, “peace” was much more that the absence of war; instead it signaled a new cooperative approach to social life. As noted early, Jane Addams and Emily Greene Balch both received the Nobel Peace Prize (Addams in 1931, Balch in 1946). Addams and Balch were also founding members of Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom, an organization which continues to be internationally influential in gender justice work.

In the early 20th century peace activism and women’s suffrage movements were often linked. For these women, the movement toward social justice, toward egalitarian economic structures, and away from competitive hierarchies necessitated a social structure based in cooperation and peace, not war. Such belief in the possibility of substantially changing social and political realities is at the heart of both pragmatism and feminism. Contemporary scholars of peace, such as political scientist Patricia M. Shields, draw on Addams’s philosophy of “ positive peace” which includes advocacy for social justice at all levels of society and governance (2017: 37).

Twenty-first century feminist pragmatists also have expanded the philosophies of early pragmatists feminists by bringing new activist voices into the philosophic dialogue such as Gloria Anzuldua, Grace Lee Boggs, bell hooks, Audre Lorde and Angela Davis (see Lake 2019, 2020; McKenna and Pratt 2015; James 2009, 2013; Varner 2020 (Other Internet Resources)). A number of contemporary feminist pragmatists (Heldke, Lake, McKenna, Parker) are advocating for ecological justice, food justice, and animal justice. Others are looking to scholars of wicked problems like Valerie Brown and Bryan Norton, and Design and Systems Thinking experts like Margaret Wheatley, Josina Vink, and Arturo Escobar for new ways to address social problems.

Asian American Civil Rights activist Grace Lee Boggs (1915–2015) has received particular attention in recent years from pragmatist feminists who have found Boggs’s emphases on lived experience, pluralism, complexity, and praxis to align with pragmatist feminist traditions (Lake 2020). Boggs’ place-based philosophic-activism in Detroit was preceded by formal philosophical training in pragmatism. She received her 1940 Ph.D. in philosophy (see Grace Chin Lee) from Bryn Mawr where she wrote her dissertation on pragmatist George Herbert Mead.

3.5 Democratic Pluralism

Democracy was a core concept for many early feminist pragmatists, especially Jane Addams and Mary Parker Follett. For example, democracy as an ethic provided the theoretical framing for Addams’ beginning work at Hull House as well as her later work with labor unions and feminist activism. In Democracy and Social Ethics (1902) Addams theorized a continually evolving democracy based on social association, particular to each generation and locality. As an ethical system, it placed on each person “a moral obligation” to chose experiences of “mixing on the thronged and common road” where we can “least see the size of one another’s burdens” (1902 [2002]: 8–7). She critiqued earlier formations of liberty and democracy that weren’t developed out of experience and interaction, and that didn’t embrace all classes of society. Addams took this sense of empathic understanding to larger and larger communities, as she moved from local to national to international work. Democracy, for Addams, is built upon dialogue, joint experiences and social equality. She understood we must give up on the hope that we will “settle our perplexities by mere good fighting”, suggesting this stance emerged from a “childish conception of life” (1910 [1990]: 57). Her nephew, James Weber Linn, wrote that Addams’ distrusted legislation when it was not “preceded by full discussion and understanding” (155). Addams’ commitment to dialogic and relational democracy emerged from the recognition that “genuine social reform” across ideological differences tends to happen through “slow, plodding dullness” (Fischer 2016: 5).

As a political philosopher, Mary Parker Follett wanted to move the practice of democracy away from the mere action of voting to small community based decision-making. She believed that problem-solving via dialogue and action in local but diverse networks and organizations was the best basis for democracy. Rejecting compromise as a way of dealing with difference, she instead advocated for “integration”, believing conceptual resolution of differences must be worked out in everyday action together. According to Follett, the process of resolution requires full honesty, self-knowledge, careful listening and understanding of what is symbolized in the others’ demands.

A pluralistic community is an important theoretical and practical component of pragmatist conceptions of democracy. The “social ethics” advocated by Dewey and Addams embraces equality and multiplicity, narrative and perplexity, fellowship and cooperative action, sympathetic understanding and the expansion of our ethical framework. Scott Pratt has noted that these pluralistic values in American philosophy may have deeper roots than James, Dewey and Addams. For example, in Native Pragmatism Pratt traces the gender and cultural pluralistic values of American philosophy to the early 19th century writings of Lydia Marie Child on indigenous North Americans.

In fact, Addams, Dewey, and Follett all critiqued the ideal of liberal individualism which positions individuals as autonomous beings in competition with each other for their freedoms. Instead pragmatist feminists focus on living in a reciprocal and interdependent social environment, believing this holds the promise of civilization, cooperation, and coexistence; they work to build communities that foster these joint associations. By prioritizing community, pragmatist-feminists encourage us to rethink what it means to live in a democracy (Green 1999), to provide a feminist communitarian philosophy (Whipps 2004), or to re-conceive alternative ways of structuring societies (Boggs and Kurashigo 2012). Early pragmatist writers join with contemporary feminists in a critique of the hierarchical systems of power that limit diverse perspectives. Several contemporary pragmatist-feminists have built upon these foundations to develop pragmatist-feminist political philosophies, including Judith Greene in Deep Democracy: Community, Diversity, Transformation (1990), Beth Singer in Pragmatism, Rights and Democracy (1999), and Erin McKenna in The Task of Utopia (2001). These feminist pragmatists imagine a participatory democracy in which all members of the society are involved in creating the community. Yet many contemporary feminists criticize recent communitarian philosophies as potentially harmful to feminist issues; they argue the call for a “return” to community values means a return to values that restrict gender roles or limit diversity. With this critique in mind, Addams can be seen as a basis for a feminist progressive communitarianism that critiques isolated individualism and understands personal identity as necessarily embedded in social and political community. While pragmatists and feminists share the concern for relational community and pluralistic thinking, they differ in how they construct the Other. Pragmatists, Seigfried says,

are more likely to emphasize that everyone is a significantly and valuably Other … and tend to celebrate otherness by seeking out and welcoming difference as an expression of creative subjectivity. (Seigfried 1996: 267)

As Francis Hackett, an early resident of Hull House, said about Addams, “one feels in her presence that to be an ‘other’ is itself a title to her recognition” (1969: 76). Feminists, on the other hand, having experienced the position of marginalized otherness as women, are more inclined to “expose the controlling force exercised by those who have the power to construct the Other as a subject of domination” (Seigfried 1996: 267).

Shannon Sullivan, in Revealing Whiteness (2006), notes that Addams was “ahead of her time” in her theoretical and practical focus on reciprocal class and race relations, yet cautions that such reciprocal relations have also “unintentionally furthered white people’s ontological expansiveness” (2006: 168). Sullivan draws on Dewey’s and James’ writing on habit, as well as psychoanalytic theory, to call for responsibility for one’s unconscious attitudes. In either embracing the diversity of the other, or in critiquing a system that makes persons into object-others, both feminism and pragmatism provide theoretical tools to analyze and actively fight against the unjust hierarchies created by racism, classism, and sexism. Contemporary black feminist pragmatists such as V. Denise James are building on the work of Anna Julia Cooper, Ida B. Wells and others, to develop black feminist visionary pragmatism, a term which describes “academic, cultural, and activist projects that attempt to take a practical view of social amelioration, while positing a vision of a radically changed, more just society” (James 2013).

4. Global Pragmatist Feminisms

Nancy McHugh’s (2015) The Limits of Knowledge highlights one of the most compelling aspects of feminist pragmatist work: the need to engage along and across borders. McHugh argues for a transactionally situated approach that aims to generate and sustain a vantage point from which to see complex, interconnected problems facing both local and global communities across social, economic, cultural, educational, and political divides. This means we begin in “the complexities of the everyday world” and engage with those who are impacted by the results. At its best, such an approach seeks out “ marginalized views and marginalized knowledge,” recognizing that long-standing histories shape the present situation, and that our location is embodied (10). Phillip Dorstewitz highlights how feminist pragmatists seek to engage “at the system’s edges” (370) in order to engage in philosophic-activist work. Susan Griffin (2009) notes that such work is critical for fostering “ the capacity to recognize the actual circumstances of the world, while simultaneously seeing what lies beneath them” (9).

In the twentieth century, those identifying as pragmatist feminist scholars were mostly from North America. In the first two decades of the twenty-first century, global pragmatist feminist voices have made important contributions to the field. For instance, Clara Fischer, who also writes on Irish Feminism, turns to John Dewey to address body/mind and emotion/reason dualisms, demonstrating that feminists could draw on the pragmatist tradition to address philosophies of embodiment (2018). Dorothy Rogers current projects seek to highlight the work of indigenous and early Mexican feminists who rejected the assimilationist agenda in education (2020, Other Internet Resources) and Alessandri and Stehn uncover the Mexican influences on Gloria Anzaldua’s writing (2020). Núria Sara Miras Boronat, Universitat de Barcelona, organized a feminist pragmatist conference in Barcelona in January 2020. She has published on Addams and pragmatist peace philosophies (2019), and also works on philosophies of play, drawing on Mead’s work which was influenced by his interaction with Hull House (2013). There has also recently been a shift towards uncovering and exploring the philosophic-activist work unfolding beyond the borders of the global north.

5. Conclusion

As pragmatist feminist philosophy continues to develop, more women who worked in the pragmatist tradition are being uncovered, and their voices incorporated back into the pragmatist tradition. Contemporary pragmatist feminist philosophers are utilizing those perspectives to address contemporary philosophical and activist concerns. Feminist philosophers bring these recovered perspectives to contemporary feminist projects, such as domestic violence (Banerjee 2008), queer theory, sex trafficking and community organizing (see Fischer, Jackson, Brown and Hamington in Hamington 2010) and human rights (Lowe 2019). The combined force of pragmatism and contemporary feminism is leading to a deeper understanding of contemporary progressive feminist goals, bringing action and theory together in egalitarian practice.


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