Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi

First published Thu Dec 6, 2001; substantive revision Tue Aug 22, 2023

Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi (b. 1743, d. 1819) was a critic of both modern philosophy and its offspring (the rationalism of German late Enlightenment), of Kant’s transcendental idealism, of Fichte’s systematic philosophy, and eventually of Schelling’s idealism. He was initially not regarded as a first–rate philosopher, but he had the natural talent of asking the right question: has philosophy forgotten the difference between conditions of conceptualization and conditions of existence? Has it forgotten that explanations must start with what cannot be further explained? Has it forgotten that thinking and being are different? Jacobi intended to amend this mistake; hence he channeled his efforts toward a philosophical definition of existence. By focusing on existence, in the form of the individual agent, his philosophy drew a solitary path that led to the universe of the living, populated by singular subjects, a personal God, and a divine order of values. Jacobi put in circulation expressions and themes that resonate to this day (di Giovanni, 1994: 115).

He was the one who forged the philosophical meaning of the concept of ‘nihilism,’ marking a difference from its religious connotation. In his vocabulary, nihilism was the necessary outcome of all philosophy after Aristotle. Though he never considered himself an irrationalist, he was accused of attacking reason and reintroducing conservative values. In truth, he criticized the instrumental use of reason and the discursive shape of reasoning. Instead, he promoted a different array of notions that would eventually unearth the possibility to conceive reality anew.

1. Life and Intellectual Career

Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi’s life spanned an era of great intellectual ferment in Germany. He witnessed or was engaged with some of the most significant cultural developments, if not revolutions, that the modern Western world experienced. His family did not lead him to take up intellectual life, as was the case for his older brother, the poet Johann Georg (1740–1814), Jacobi nonetheless arrived on the central stage of the philosophical world thanks to his criticism of the German Enlightenment and, perhaps primarily, for his work on Spinoza’s philosophy. His analysis of Spinoza’s ‘Ethics’ was the main topic of his first philosophical publication in 1785, and it made Spinoza a necessary point of reference in the assessment of rationality as such. This factor, together with his investigation of fundamental inconsistencies in Kant’s transcendental philosophy, made Jacobi into one of the forefathers of the far–reaching turn in the history of thinking now known as Classical German Philosophy.

While also writing political commentary, Jacobi held official positions in few governing bodies, in the course of such work he worked toward a more liberal administration of taxation. He married Helene Elisabeth (Betty) von Clermont, a noblewoman, and together they established a literary circle in Pempelfort, hosting some of the greatest minds of the age.

Jacobi was born in Düsseldorf on January 25, 1743, in the family of a prosperous merchant. He was intended to carry on his father’s business, and he was sent to a Frankfurt commercial house for apprenticeship. This, however, merely revealed his true vocation for a literary career, leading to his moving to Geneva (1759) to study under Georges–Louis Le Sage. Le Sage exposed him to the Enlightenment in the shape of the French Encyclopedists, as well as to Charles de Bonnet’s psychology: later, Jacobi’s vast library included a copy of the ‘Essai analytique sur les facultés de l’âme’. Together with Bonnet’s thinking, Jacobi encountered new ideas, from Voltaire to Rousseau, that developed from eighteenth century rationalism the cradle of lay criticism. In 1762 Jacobi returned to Düsseldorf, married, and took charge of his father’s trading house, but only until 1772, when he took up a position in the administration of Jülich and Berg. During this period, essays by Mendelssohn and Kant, submitted to a competition hosted by the Berlin Academy, caught his attention, as he later confirmed in his ‘David Hume Dialogue’: they had a long–lasting influence on his interpretation of scientific reasoning and metaphysics (Pistilli 2007). Jacobi then began what became an extensive correspondence with the thinkers of his age. If the salon that he hosted with his wife was an outer sign of his literary ambitions, the number and notoriety of those he corresponded with, from Johann Gottlieb Fichte to Friedrich Gottlieb Klopstock and from Immanuel Kant to F.D.E. Schleiermacher, confirmed the range of his intellectual facility.

In 1772, with Christoph Martin Wieland, Jacobi drafted a project to launch a journal, the Teutcher Merkur, inspired by the French gazette Mercure de France. Wieland began as editor of the publication in 1773, and Jacobi used it to publish some of his occasional writings. More important than his relationship with Wieland was his interactions with Goethe in 1774 (Heinz, 1965). That encounter catalyzed Jacobi’s next efforts, ‘Eduard Allwills Papiere’ (1775/6) and ‘Woldemar. Eine Seltenheit aus der Naturgeschichte’ (1777/9) (Prantl, 1881: 579). These works were to become paradigmatic instances of Jacobi’s philosophical novels, forming a reaction to the prevalent style of Sturm und Drang. Jacobi’s fresh and inspiring friendship with Goethe did not last long, however. Goethe’s reaction to the ‘Woldemar’ was a bitter eye–opener for Jacobi: Goethe enacted a crucifixion of the book on a tree in 1779 (di Giovanni, 1994: 52–53). In 1779, Jacobi left for Munich to accept an appointment at a government office but then resigned the same year due to the pressure of the controversies aroused by his liberal reform proposals, following from his support for Adam Smith’s doctrines, as shown in his publications.

The next decade proved decisive for Jacobi. In 1780, he met Lessing in Wolfenbüttel. During their conversations Lessing supposedly confessed his Spinozism. When Lessing died in 1781, M. Mendelssohn began drafting a laudatory portrait of this great champion of the German Enlightenment. Jacobi felt obliged to inform Mendelssohn of Lessing’s true philosophical tendency, but Jacobi’s report shocked Mendelssohn: being a Spinozist entailed being an atheist and a subversive who disregarded all morality and religion. Mendelssohn engaged with Jacobi to assess Lessing’s Spinozism and, more importantly, Spinoza’s own teaching. This exchange between the two began in 1783 and eventually provided the basis of Jacobi’s 1785 famous volume ‘Über die Lehre des Spinoza in Briefen an den Herrn Moses Mendelssohn’. In addition to Mendelssohn’s response of 1786, to which Jacobi replied the same year, the extent and acrimony of the debate that Jacobi aroused led this work to be a milestone in the prehistory of Classical German Philosophy. Jacobi’s controversy with Mendelssohn led to an unearthing of the peculiar humanism and the distinct rationality that were part of the vision of the Enlightenment, to which Jacobi proposed a reasoned rejection, uncovering its Spinozian hidden soul. The so-called Spinozarenaissance that followed this public exchange between Jacobi and Mendelssohn made Spinoza’s ‘Ethica, ordine geometrico demonstrata’ a touchstone for any philosophical system to come (Jaeschke and Sandkaulen, 2004). At the same time, Spinoza’s renaissance fostered the so-called Spinoza controversy, or that of Pantheismusstreit, which ignited passionate disputes around the nature of freedom, the reality of final causes, and the actual existence of individual entities. For Jacobi, finding a route through Spinoza’s philosophy was the best opportunity to thoroughly discuss the essence of rationalism, which dismisses free human actions and puts in their place the pure atheistic fatalism that a coherent system of knowledge implies.

As Goethe stressed, this controversy touched everyone in their deepest convictions. Only two years after the ‘Spinoza Briefen’, Jacobi published another book, ‘David Hume über den Glauben, oder Idealismus und Realismus. Ein Gespräch’. Its main purpose was to shake off the traces of irrationalism that he was accused of due to his use of the term Glaube (faith) in the ‘Spinoza Briefen’ (Jacobi, (1994 (2): 255 and JWA 2,1: 9)[1]. Jacobi confirmed that his notion of faith was reminiscent of the role that this concept played in Hume’s philosophy, though he rejected the latter’s skepticism. Jacobi’s realism was in fact tempered by a different interpretation of the pillars of human knowledge, which allowed him to challenge the problematic positing of the Ding an sich in Kant’s transcendental philosophy. His dictum that ‘Without that presupposition [of the thing in itself], I could not enter into [Kant’s] system, but with it I could not stay within it’ (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 336 and JWA 2,1: 109) became a well–known summary of a diagnosis that concerned both Kant’s idealism as well as many of its heirs. Not least of these was Fichte’s ‘Wissenschaftslehre’ (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 501 and JWA 2,1: 194).

In 1789, Jacobi published a second, augmented edition of the ’Spinoza Briefen’, putting forth a solution to the dichotomy between nature and freedom (Sandkaulen, 2000: 64ff). The additions marked Jacobi’s explicit opposition to Kant’s recently published ‘Critique of Practical Reason’, but they also helped announce the main topic of the last decade of eighteenth century: freedom.

As the French troops marched toward Düsseldorf in 1794, Jacobi fled his home and moved to safer locations, which included Hamburg and Holstein. Eventually he settled in Eutin (1798). During this period, Jacobi began to draft what later became ‘Von den göttlichen Dingen und ihrer Offenbarung’, which was only published in 1811. While in Eutin, he still did not experience peace, at least so far as his intellectual output was concerned. Jacobi had become involved in the dispute over Fichte’s alleged atheism, the so–called Atheismusstreit. His famous letter ‘Jacobi an Fichte’ was written to clear Fichte of the accusation of atheism: Fichte’s ‘Wissenschaftslehre’ was no more atheistic than geometry or arithmetic. Instead, it was nihilistic (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 519 and JWA 2,1: 215). In Jacobi’s eyes, Fichte’s philosophy was simply Spinozism but based upon subjectivity: the systematic operation that Spinoza’s substance performs is achieved by Fichte’s doctrine of science and shows how the necessary connection between singular entities is achieved by the activity of the absolute (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 502 and JWA 2,1: 195). Thus, all existing actuality (in ethics as much as in epistemology) must be considered the manifestation of a rational universality that Fichte called ‘the absolute I’. By contrast with this widespread understanding of rationality, Jacobi re–drafted his own notion of Vernunft. Initially, Jacobi was critical of the idea of reason (e.g., Jacobi, 1994 (2): 230 and JWA 1,1: 115) due to the terminological legacy advanced by the philosophical systems that he was battling against. He moved slowly toward a different, more refined understanding of the term, which bears traces of Jacobi’s own theoretical evolution. This first appears in the second edition of the ‘Spinoza Briefen’ (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 375 and JWA 1,1: 259–260). The second supplement to ‘Jacobi an Fichte’ shows further evidence of this evolution (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 529 and JWA 2,1: 229), as Jacobi’s 1802 publication ‘Über das Unternehmen des Kriticismus, die Vernunft zu Verstande zu bringen, und der Philosophie überhaupt eine neue Absicht zu geben’ does.

In 1805, Jacobi moved to Munich to join the newly established Bayerische Akademie der Wissenschaften, becoming its president in 1807. Alerted by Schelling’s early writings, Jacobi had sensed an unequivocal Spinozian naturalism in his speech entitled ‘Über das Verhältnis der bildenden Künste zur Natur’, given at the Akademie der Wissenschaften on the king’s name day, October 10, 1807. His suspicion was confirmed by Schelling’s essay on human freedom (1809), reading which gave Jacobi the impulse to finish his ‘Von den göttlichen Dingen und ihrer Offenbarung’. With this last book, Jacobi sought to show that an unprecedented effort to reject the existence and rationality of human beings’ free activity animated Spinoza, Kant, Fichte, and the youngest (‘second’) daughter of transcendental thinking (as he referred to Schelling’s philosophy). As had happened with the ‘Spinoza Briefen’ and the ‘Jacobi an Fichte’, the ‘Von den göttlichen Dingen’ became the center of a dispute. This third debate of the post–Kantian era, the so–called Theimusstreit, broke out only to provide Jacobi with a suitable spotlight to shine on his conclusive definitions of rationality and God. In a sense, he here disclosed his philosophical testament. He was forced to resign from his position at the Akademie in 1812. As a retired but still prominent cultural personality, Jacobi worked until his death at editing of his Collected Works, assisted by his disciples J.F. Köppen and C.J.F. Roth.

After receiving Hegel’s positive review of the third volume of his Collected Works (Jacobi, 1825–27: vol. 2, 467–68), Jacobi regretted being too old to study Hegel’s thought; he was convinced that Hegel had finally grasped his philosophy, at least better than he had at the time of ‘Glauben und Wissen’.

He died in Munich on March 10, 1819.

2. Early Writings

From his occasional writings, Jacobi might seem to be an engaged intellectual with some proclivity to disputing the tenets of the Enlightenment. His ‘Discours préliminaire zu Le Noble’ (1771) already hints at some of the ideas that he later developed in his polemical writings, such as in his 1782 article ‘Etwas dass Lessing gesagt hat’, which presents the despotism of the Medieval popes as preferable to that of enlightened princes. Regardless, Jacobi did not agree with any authoritarian use of the political power, as shown in his 1781 essay ‘Über Recht und Gewalt, oder philosophische Erwägung eines Aufsatzes von dem Herrn Hofrath Wieland über das göttliche Recht der Obrigkeit’. In this text Jacobi publicly denies Wieland’s claim that right comes from the ability to impose obedience through the use of force.

Apart from these minor texts and two political essays published in 1779 (‘Eine politische Rhapsodie. Aus einem Aktenstock entwendet. Ein eingesandtes Stück’ and ‘Noch eine politische Rhapsodie, worinn sich verschiedene Plagia befinden; betitelt: Es ist nicht recht, und es ist nicht klug’), in the second half of the 1770s, Jacobi gained momentum toward earning a wider audience, thanks to the publication of his two novels. Much in debt to Goethe’s blessing, which he had received during their first meeting in 1774, Jacobi eventually provides a definite form to his internal unrest concerning the existence of a personal God, the endlessness of time, and the reasons for his ineffable and yet visceral fervor.

The ‘Eduard Allwills Papiere’ is an epistolary novel and first published in 1775 in the journal Iris, which was led by Jacobi’s brother Johann Georg. This initial edition included only five of the 21 letters that made up the final novel. A second edition appeared in 1776 in the journal Teutscher Merkur, including seven more letters, plus one more that did not appear in the final edition. A third edition, which was published in 1781, presented minor changes and additions. The fourth edition, published in 1792, contains major changes (for instance, here we can find the details of Jacobi’s criticism of idealism), as well as an important supplement, the letter ‘An Erhard O**’, which provides clear insight into Jacobi’s definition of the human being. In this edition, we can see how much the ‘Spinoza Briefen’ and the ‘David Hume Dialogue’, published during the 1780s, influenced the content of the novel. The fifth and final edition, published in 1812, does not differ much from the fourth. In this novel, Jacobi blames the idea of the moral genius, as embodied by Allwill, and takes distance from the movement of the Empfindsamkeit and Sturm und Drang (Ivaldo, 2003: 31). Allwill is dominated by a limitless will (to will all), as will is everything he is (all is will): he rejects law and truth, making his own determination the only right. While Allwill approaches Jacobi’s own tendency toward a repudiation of a pharisaic formality of life, Allwill makes the mistake of considering himself to be the origin of morality, laws, and values. Thus, Jacobi seems to praise him for prioritizing his own inner moral impulse but condemns him for dismissing the universal rationality that an inner moral impulse must reveal.

‘Woldemar. Eine Seltenheit aus der Naturgeschichte’ appeared in the Teutscher Merkur in 1777 in the form of a fragment with the title ‘Freundschaft und Liebe. Eine wahre Geschichte, von der Herausgeber von Eduard Allwills Papiere’. In a more elaborate form, it is published in 1779, with the title ‘Woldemar. Eine Seltenheit aus der Naturgeschichte’. In 1779, the philosophical part of the novel is published in the journal Deutsches Museum, under the title ‘Ein Stück Philosophie des Lebens und der Menschheit: Aus dem zweiten Bande von Woldemar’. It is published again in 1781 with minor changes and under the title ‘Der Kunstgarten. Ein philosophisches Gespräch’. In 1794, after Jacobi has published all of his major philosophical texts, he publishes a new edition of ‘Woldemar’, including an analysis of Aristotle’s ethics and providing a different conclusion. This version is eventually included in Jacobi’s Complete Works in 1821. The text introduces the figure of Woldemar, a passionate young man, melancholic and impulsive, who will discover that his beautiful soul must be amended through the recognition of higher values and universal laws. Unlike Allwill, Woldemar eventually understands that those universal values do not exclude the needs of his inner self; instead, they bring his desires and passions to a higher, less egoistic perspective on friendship and affection. This new ethical horizon heals Woldemar’s suffering and proves to be the only means of attaining real love.

3. Main Philosophical Works

3.1 The ‘Spinoza Letters’ (1st edition, 1785)

The text of the ‘Über die Lehre des Spinoza in Briefen an den Herrn Moses Mendelssohn’ is somewhat difficult to map out, as it combined both Jacobi’s and Mendelssohn’s arguments and counterarguments regarding Lessing’s alleged Spinozism, two poems by Goethe, a letter to Hemsterhuis, reports of Lessing’s claims, and digressions on Spinoza’s philosophy. All things considered, everything boils down to a few clear theoretical theses that had far–reaching repercussions throughout both philosophy and society. This work had three different editions: 1785, 1789, and 1819. The first edition opens with Goethe’s poem ‘das Göttliche’. It proceeds to a short report of the circumstances that led Jacobi to contact Mendelssohn, followed by the presentation of the first letter Jacobi sent to him in 1783. A second poem by Goethe, ‘Prometheus’, follows, suggesting that here the first section of the book has come to an end, establishing the core subject of the controversy: rationality displaying its fundamental proposition with the principle a nihilo nihil fit (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 187 and JWA 1,1: 16–17).

This principle offers a glimpse of an approach to knowledge, according to which everything is necessarily and sufficiently determined by its ground (Grund). For this, the principle of the ground inscribes all instances within a system of references that supports their determination (Sandkaulen, 2000; Della Rocca, 2015). Thus, the principle of the ground may be a crucial topic in metaphysics, as it provides the guidelines for both epistemology and ontology (Fine, 2012). Jacobi’s critical view of systematic knowledge pivots around this principle, although he does not imply that systematic knowledge should be rejected without reservation. Systematic knowledge meets a rational need, as it seems to pose a perfect balance between a universal design and singular entities. Jacobi contends that a closer reading, however, uncovers that those singular entities, when inscribed in that universal design, lose their identity and substance. Reality, as conceived through the principle of the ground, is merely an all–devouring whole that does not provide any room for individuals.

If we examine the arch that extends from the first poem to the second (from ‘das Göttliche’ to ‘Prometheus’), it is easy to decipher Jacobi’s twofold intention: on one side, he celebrates the human capacity to transcend systematic determinism (‘das Göttliche’); on the other, he faces the appalling truth that rationality appears to call for a deterministic universe that is dominated by a blind fate that disregards individuals (‘Prometheus’). The only Promethean way out is to rise against this systematic determination of reality in a rebellion that should be based upon a different understanding of rationality and reality. In fact, it must be stressed, Jacobi does not provide an alternative to philosophical determinism out of a poetic illusion. Instead, he calls for a rational, not poetic, alternative to rationalism.

After being accused of defending Spinoza, due to his great regard for Spinoza’s philosophy, and then being blamed for not reading Spinoza accurately enough, Jacobi provides to Mendelssohn a solid, though synthetic, analysis of Spinoza’s ‘Ethics’. In this text, Jacobi not only displays his accuracy in analysis (at least taking into account the general framework of Spinoza’s ‘Ethics’) but also his insight in interpretation (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 217–228 and JWA 1,1: 92–112). Spinoza should be considered, according to Jacobi, the pinnacle of rationalism and the ultimate outcome of a coherent evolutionary narrative of the traditional metaphysics inaugurated by Aristotle (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 227 and JWA 1,1: 110–111). Nevertheless, Jacobi adds, that very same rationalism is also the cause of a thorough disregard for the existence of concrete individuals, which is grounded upon their practical certitude (true freedom) (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 229 and 234 and JWA 1,1: 113 and 120–125). Jacobi’s critique of rationalism implies his counterproposal, providing a new platform for notions that could rationally support individual existence (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 233–234 and JWA 1,1: 120–125). Jacobi considers that individuality must be conceived together with the profile of a free human being, an existent that is precisely the prime victim of Spinozism (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 193 and JWA 1,1: 27–28). However, because Jacobi’s notion of freedom represents a necessary basis for all existence, the eradication of any rational justification of free human beings not only erases the notion of true freedom but also eradicates existence in general (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 212 and JWA 1,1: 78–79).

Jacobi urges philosophers embroiled in metaphysical rationalism to perform a salto mortale (i.e., a somersault, jumping–head–over–heels) to redress their position in the face of reality (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 195 and JWA 1,1: 30). Instead of an illusory purity of a self–contained system of explanations, true knowledge must be grounded upon an immediate recognition of an I that acts upon and reacts to a world that is external to it (Sandkaulen, 2000: 11–22). Jacobi’s Unphilosophie does not merely contradict systematic knowledge. More precisely, it intends to amend systematic knowledge by providing its missing footing: only when we assume the concrete existence are we justified with regard to any other claim concerning reality. Explanations are thus not entirely a bad habit. It is only that they come second, after the subject has assumed its own existence as paradigm of existence as such. What Jacobi is really rejecting here is the thesis according to which the system of explanations is self–sufficient. The only issue here is that the first assumption of our knowledge (existence) is and must be immediate; if it were mediated and explained, then the basis for the mediation would fall into the system of explanations that eradicates all true existence. The salto mortale would thus be nothing more than the logical act that any philosopher must perform, taking into account the total annihilation of substantiality yielded by systematic knowledge. Instead of pure discursive thinking, Jacobi combines the logical act of the salto mortale with the epistemology of the Glaube (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 234 and 270–303 and JWA 2,1: 27–67), referring to the immediate assumption of an existence granted by a practical I. This higher knowledge, often associated with specific faculties, such as Gefühl and Sinn, labels both Jacobi’s fundamental contribution to epistemology and his most controversial teaching (Bowman, 2021).

Notwithstanding that his notion of faith (Glaube) does not have any religious underpinning, some unfortunate, final references to J.K. Lavater and K.W. Jerusalem expose Jacobi’s ‘Spinoza Briefen’ to the charge of irrationalism and fideism. These accusations were not arbitrary though. Jacobi’s use of the terms Glaube (faith) and Offenbarung (revelation) to present his reformed epistemology did avert suspicion. The publication of the ‘David Hume Dialogue’ was in fact a direct consequence of his need to clear himself of both charges.

3.2 The ‘Spinoza Letters’ (2nd edition, 1789)

After the publication of the ‘Spinoza Briefen’, the Spinozismusstreit erupted. This was not confined to private letters but also appeared in publications, such as Mendelssohn’s immediate reaction ‘An die Freunde Lessings’ and Jacobi’s couterreaction ‘Wider Mendelssohns Beschuldigungen betreffend die Briefe über die Lehre des Spinoza’ (1786) (JWA 1, 2: 376–377). If we interpret the ‘David Hume Dialogue’ as a concrete advance in Jacobi’s careful consideration of the specificity of the terminology that he proposed in the first edition of the ‘Spinoza Briefen’, its second edition brings to the fore the conclusive general outcome of the Spinoza controversy: freedom becomes the main topic in light of the function it fulfills within the epistemology of what is actually true (JWA 1, 2: 370).

The new materials provided include further documentation of Mendelssohn’s letters, eight supplements, mainly on Spinoza’s philosophy and its relation to Leibniz, a reasoned petition in favor of a personal God, by contrast with pantheism, and finally a list of theses (52) on human freedom. This list is particularly interesting. It presents 23 theses in opposition to human freedom and 29 in support of it. Contrary to any conjecture of a possible convergence between Jacobi’s argument in favor of human freedom and Kant’s practical principles, it must be stressed that Jacobi’s countervailing theses are not antinomic. They rather show an evolution of his thesis in support of human freedom from a critical assessment of fatalism (Homann, 1973). The distinct division between the two realms of reality, one incorporating freedom and the other disregarding it, is foreign to Jacobi’s intention.

Moreover, fatalism follows a mechanical understanding of the notion of cause, which necessarily leads to the belief that the corporeal (extended being) and the theoretical (representational being) realms both consist of a sequence of conjoined instances. In opposition to this picture, Jacobi places his pharmakon, made of an interplay between the activity and passivity of the I and its opposing Thou. As Jacobi shows in the ‘David Hume Dialogue’ (Jacobi, 1994(2): 277–278 and JWA 2,1: 37–39) and broadly advances here, a total mechanization of reality in the sense of an entire whole made of things properly determined by their explanations reduces all things to nothing (JWA 1, 1: 263).

Systematically understood, explanations deprive what is explained of its independent substance and make the whole (the enclosed system of explanation) the only substance. So too, the same all–encompassing substance is devoid of its existence, as existence is and can only be based upon the active engagement of an agent. (Jacobi, 1994(2): 370–372 and JWA 1,1: 247–249). If we take a closer look at the 52 theses on human freedom, it can be understood that the theory supporting human freedom presents a broader conception of reality than the one in opposition to it. Jacobi does not merely draft his idea of reality in contrast to the systematic conception of reality but in adjusting its tenets and substituting its core principle. According to the resulting picture, the unjustified (that is, in a sense, disconnected and even unknown) autonomy of the practical I must be preserved as the basis of any justified and systematic knowledge of reality. The autonomy of the I is thus the foundation of existence (Jacobi, 1994(2): 344 and JBW 12: 207). Following out this line of reasoning, Jacobi addresses Kant’s practical philosophy as presented in the ‘Critique of Practical Reason’, which came out just one year before the second edition of the ‘Spinoza Briefen’, to make the paradigm of reality from the spontaneous activity of a finite subject. As a paradigm, then, the latter should not itself be subject to further explanation by systematic philosophy. Instead, explanation must halt before it (Jacobi, 1994(2): 345 and JWA 1,1: 163–164).

Apparently, Fichte followed Jacobi’s logic concerning the necessity of a practical basis for reality, but he did not respect the final rule, unleashing the systematic approach upon the definition of the foundation of existence. This encourages Jacobi’s reaction: the famous ‘Jacobi an Fichte’ thus reads as a further evolution of issues raised in the ‘Spinoza Briefen’.

3.3 The ‘Spinoza Letters’ (3rd edition, 1819)

The final version of the ‘Spinoza Briefen’ has only minor changes. One important addition includes the Vorbericht, where Jacobi contends that his original idea has merely become clearer, not changed. It is apparent that his evolution as a thinker has not included a change in perspective, only clarifications in its delivery. Jacobi stresses how his notion of truth and the very foundation of his theory of knowledge yield a philosophical perspective that could save life. His antagonists, in contrast, seem occupied with a form of thinking that would destroy it (JWA 1, 1: 339). He presents the theoretical tools for making of the practical agent the unmovable foundation for all existence and all life, while also revealing a way to connect to a living personal God: the same notion of Vernunft, following a certain degree of evolution between the first and the second edition of the ‘Spinoza Briefen’, eventually becomes the ‘Sinn für das Uebersinnliche’, matching the way in which the senses perceive natural phenomena (JWA 1, 1: 341 and JWA 1,1: 158). It can even be claimed that in the ‘Vorbericht’, the religious underpinning of Jacobi’s arguments becomes more explicit. However, Jacobi never surpasses the limits that he placed on rationality itself: his thought never aspires to become a theological or philosophical system. He rejects both forms of systematic knowledge due to the anti–systematic character of the ground of reality (JWA 1, 1: 347). Still, this approach does not translate into an attraction to irrationalism. Rather, it implies a different conception of rationality altogether.

3.4 The ‘David Hume Dialogue’ (1787)

First published in 1787 with the German title ‘David Hume über den Glauben oder Idealismus und Realismus. Ein Gespräch’ (‘David Hume on Faith, or Idealism and Realism. A Dialogue’), this work includes three distinct sections, although only two are named in the title. The first section is dedicated to the need to clarify the controversial term Glaube (which extends from Jacobi, 1994(2): 254 and JWA 2, 1: 8 up to Jacobi, 1994(2): 279 and JWA 2, 1: 40). An intermission between the first and the second sections introduces an interesting account of Jacobi’s own philosophical education (up to Jacobi, 1994(2): 287 and JWA 2, 1: 49). The second section (up to Jacobi, 1994(2): 306 and JWA 2, 1: 71) criticizes the principle of the ground (Der Satz des Grundes) (Jacobi, 1994(2): 288 and JWA 2, 1: 50) in contraposition to the principle of reason (das Principium der Vernunft), which is intended as part of the principle of life (das Principium des Lebens) (Jacobi, 1994(2): 301–302 and JWA 2, 1: 65) and ushers in the topic that dominates the third and final section: the living being. Hence, the third section revolves around the rationality of life, providing an analysis of Leibniz’s philosophy.

The theory of knowledge that the notion of Glaube inaugurates relies on the immediate experience that the subject reports. As Jacobi claims in the ‘Spinoza Briefen’: ‘[f]aith is the element of all human cognition and activity’ (Jacobi, 1994(2): 234 and JWA 1, 1: 125). This thesis follows after another paradigmatic one, which integrates the former and states that ‘[w]e can only demonstrate similarities. Every proof presupposes something already proven, the principle of which is Revelation’ (Jacobi, 1994(2): 234 and JWA 1, 1: 125). To the unexperienced reader, approaching Jacobi’s texts for the first time, the theological character of these two assertions may look unequivocal, but that reader would be mistaken. In general, in Jacobi’s view, the notion of Glaube, reminiscent of Hume’s concept of belief (also translated as ‘Glaube’) (di Giovanni, 1994: 90), must conflict with the rationalistic foundation of knowledge endorsed by systematic (or modern) philosophy. Nevertheless, Jacobi’s interpretation of the foundation of knowledge remains rational. We can profit from a few lines in the ‘Prefatory Note’ to the ‘David Hume Dialogue’ to shed light on the use of the term ‘Glaube’ in Jacobi’s vocabulary: ‘as a realist I am forced to say that all knowledge derives exclusively from faith, for things must be given to me before I am in a position to enquire about relations’ (Jacobi, 1994(2): 256 and JWA 2, 1: 10). This thesis, so straightforward, is the pivot upon which Jacobi’s realism will be built.

The first part of this claim entails the thesis that was already put forth in the ‘Spinoza Briefen’, but the second, explanatory part prompts the reader to recognize the real scope of ‘Glaube’: faith is not knowledge, as it does not include or address relations; rather, it concerns the distinct cognition of what is at the basis of all knowledge and relations. It is different from any other epistemological faculty and from sensibility and perception as well (Sandkaulen, 2019: 33–54) because it forms a subjective response to what lies beyond any thinking process or theoretical modeling. It refers instead to the apprehension (Vernehmen) that is necessarily at the beginning of the definition of reality. Faith, in general, is not even assent because its content cannot be doubted, as the price for doubting its content is idealism. One excerpt from the dialogue addresses precisely this point: ‘Hume himself grants in the same essay [‘Essay on Human Understanding’] that we only derive the representation of power from the feeling of our own power, and specifically, from the feeling of its use in overcoming an obstacle. He concedes, therefore, that we have the feeling of a power, and that we perceive the results of its application. But he does not take this to be a complete experience of cause and effect, since we have no sensation of HOW the power brings about this result. His doubts are after the manner of the idealists, and are closely connected with these. In the same manner I can of course doubt that it is I who (in virtue of what appears to me to be a power in me) stretch out my hand, move my foot, follow the thread of our present dialogue and control it from my side, since I have no possible insight either into the nature of what I take to be the cause of what happens, or into its connection with the result. I can doubt this just as much as I can doubt that I perceive anything outside me. If it’s in you to be disturbed by such doubts, then there is nothing that I can say to you. But I think that your faith triumphs over them just as easily as mine’ (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 292 and JWA 2, 1: 55–56).

Due to their common background in modern epistemology, the ideas conveyed in this passage can easily find a place within contemporary debates about the philosophy of mind, epistemology, and metaphysics.[2] However, contemporary readers may find Jacobi’s response unhelpful precisely because Jacobi does not explicitly respond to idealists’ doubts, although he repeatedly shows, from the ‘David Hume Dialogue’ to the ‘Spinoza Briefen’ and from the ‘Jacobi an Fichte’ to the ‘Von den güttlichen Dingen’, how idealism is destined to annihilate the very basis for all knowledge, thus falling into an empty teaching (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 291 and JWA 2, 1: 56–57). A critical reply to what Jacobi calls idealism (that is, a consistent system of explanations that proves self–sufficient) would require the assumption that problems with idealism arise from a faulty explanation or inference. It would, therefore, assume idealism’s principal thesis, i.e., that discursive thinking can be self–sufficient and can accommodate a foundation of its own knowledge. Instead, Jacobi formulates a sophisticated refutation of what he calls idealism, which takes the concept of the cause (in the shape of the existence of a free agent) as its center of gravity. He then progresses toward his thesis that knowledge has its foundation outside of itself. Within this new framework, Jacobi contends that the connection between the system of knowledge and the foundation of knowledge necessarily falls outside of thinking process. Here, Jacobi announces his motto: ‘Ich erfahre, daß ich bin, und daß etwas außer mir ist, in demselben untheilbaren Augenblick’ (‘I experience that I am, and that there is something outside me, in one and the same indivisible moment’) (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 277 and JWA 2, 1: 37). The self–consciousness of the I and its consciousness are interdependent; however, they are not to be analyzed in the manner of Fichte, to name a philosopher that, against all appearance, was very close to Jacobi, both personally and intellectually (Ivaldo, 1996). Their interdependence is not granted in consideration of a subtle and advanced dissection of the dialectic that proves their shape and fundamental merging. Instead, Jacobi guides our attention to the ‘bin’ and the ‘ist’ that the ‘erfahre’ necessitates. Experience, no matter its shape or form, conceptually necessitates the existence of two sides, the I and the Thou (as Jacobi calls any given that is opposite to the I). Jacobi claims that existence forms a given before and beyond any reasoning because it is the basis upon which all reasoning can genuinely begin. In other terms, existence falls outside of reasoning. Hence, it is important to assume that the human being can have direct contact, not mediated by arguments or thinking process, with what lies at the basis of all knowledge. This connection is immediate, not irrational; in fact, the human being is rational, precisely because he exhibits the ability to connect with what lies before and beyond reasoning (JWA 3: 10–11).

The notion of ‘Glaube’ introduces us to the specificity of Jacobi’s epistemology through its implication of how an immediate apprehension of existence does not keep us from describing existence rationally. Still, rationality is not entirely overt, so long as we do not assume its practical profile: that is, only free actions exhibit the original way in which the I meets the Thou. In different terms, it is only as a free agent that the I finds both itself and the world around itself. This move makes the practical horizon the only perimeter in which the ultimate foundation of what gives content to our knowledge can actually be defined; existence, in other terms, is a practical quality (Jacobi, 1994 (2): 194 and JWA 1, 1: 28).

As this picture takes on clearer contours, the magnitude of the role that the notion of cause plays in Jacobi’s philosophy can be realized (Sandkaulen 2000: 171ff). The difference that this thesis makes can be appreciated through an examination that the connection between cause and effect (UrsacheWirkung) happens in time, while the connection between ground and consequence (GrundFolge) does not take account of time (Sandkaulen, 2000: 133–170). As seen in Spinoza’s system, the principle of the ground presents a realty that is frozen in eternity, while the determination of an item is not temporally given. For Jacobi, instead, existence changes in time or, better said, existence is precisely the what that a free agent defines in its time. This distinction then allows a series of additional important advancements in respect to Jacobi’s realism, as the introduction of the passing of time (in the form of irreversibility) into our picture of reality makes things more difficult for a mechanistic picture of reality (e.g., Prigogine, 1988: chapters 2 and 3). Obviously, this is not to claim that a classical Newtonian dynamic picture of reality does not consider time; it is only to show that the same picture presents the problem of the reversibility of states, while Jacobi’s realism establishes that no distinct state of reality is reversible. On the one hand, determinism presents a series of interlaced determinations that complete a picture that is fixed in eternity (sub specie aeternitatis). In contrast, Jacobi’s realism portrays a reality that takes the passing of time as a foundational aspect. Ultimately, Jacobi’s realism prohibits the reversibility of states.

3.5 The Open Letter to Fichte (1799)

Written between March 3 and 21, 1799, the letter was published with Fichte’s consent, due to Jacobi’s apparent intention to clear Fichte’s name of the charge of atheism. Although in truth, Jacobi merely suggests that the charge of atheism be dropped, only to replace it with the accusation of nihilism (JWA 2, 2: 471–473, and Ivaldo, 2003: 94–99). In Jacobi’s eyes, nihilism is marked by distinct features specific to modern thinking (although Jacobi then traces the same features back to Aristotle, see Jacobi, 1994(2): 541 and JWA 2, 1: 378–379) that are detrimental to meaning as such. The core message of Jacobi’s letter is that a system of explanatory interconnections exhibits a perfectly harmonious ground, which suppresses all individuality and makes existence impossible (Jacobi, 1994(2): 508–509 and JWA 2, 1: 202–203). This letter became quite well–known due to its simple and straightforward statement that Jacobi’s own efforts lead inevitably ‘to my ‘non-philosophy’, that has its essence in ‘non-knowledge’ just as your [Fichte’s] ‘philosophy’ has it solely in knowledge’ (Jacobi, 1994(2): 501 and JWA 2, 1: 194).

This makes Fichte the ‘true Messiah of speculative reason, the genuine son of the promise of a philosophy pure through and through, existing in and through itself’ (Jacobi, 1994(2): 501 and JWA 2, 1: 194). For the first time, the reader of Jacobi’s texts finds this astonishing equation. Nihilism and philosophy go hand in hand, making Jacobi’s non–philosophy and non–knowledge the only remedy. The reason for Jacobi’s use of qualifications such as ‘pure’ (rein) and ‘through and through’ (durchaus) with regard to Fichte’s speculative arguments for his doctrine of knowledge is that modern philosophy is necessarily oblivious of the need to refer to what is beyond reasoning when giving meaning to reasoning itself. To escape delusion and anchor our thinking to existence, finding a theoretically acceptable connection to the ‘realm of beings’ is needed (Jacobi, 1994(2): 508 and JWA 2, 1: 202). If the original and immediate duality of an I and a Thou is rejected, then one is destined either to derive everything from the I or to derive everything from brute matter: ‘Nobody can deny that the spirit of speculative philosophy […] is to make unequal the equal certainty that these two propositions have for the natural man: ‘I am’ and ‘There are things outside me’. Speculative philosophy had to try to subordinate one of these propositions to the other; to derive the former from the latter or the latter from the former — exhaustively, in the end — so that there would be but one being and one truth before its eye, the all–seeing one!’ (Jacobi, 1994(2): 501 and JWA 2, 1: 194).

The inevitable conclusion is that pure philosophy leads either to materialism, explaining everything from a self–determining matter, or to idealism, explaining everything from the self–determining intelligence. At the center of all this lies the notion of self–determination, which allows Spinoza and Fichte to mirror one another without differences being detected. As Jacobi summarizes this, idealism is just ‘inverted’ materialism, pure mathesis, where the unity of reality simply displays the operativity of a ground. Science thus forms an instance of the activity of this ground, and our comprehension of reality turns it into a sophisticated construction: ‘[w]e comprehend a thing only in so far as we can construct it, i.e., let it arise before us in thoughts, let it become. And in so far as we cannot construct it, or produce it ourselves in thoughts, we do not comprehend it […]. So if a being is to become for us a fully comprehended object, we must cancel it in thought as something objective, as standing on its own; we must annihilate it in order to let it become something thoroughly subjective, our own creation, a mere schema’ (Jacobi, 1994(2): 508 and JWA 2, 1: 201–202). Here, Jacobi identifies a distinction between ‘the true’ (das Wahre) and truth (die Wahrheit), between what is objective, given, i.e., a being in an I–independent reality (the true), and what is constructed by the I according to the activity of its own structure (the truth). Here again, Jacobi shows that he does not wish to dismiss science altogether. Instead, he introduces a different notion of truthfulness and a different understanding of the function that our rationality must fulfill. The nihilistic outcome of the science of truth is overcome by the necessity that the true be presupposed for reasoning: ‘I understand by ‘the true’ something which is prior to and outside knowledge; that which first gives a value to knowledge and to the faculty of knowledge, to reason [Vernunft]. ‘Taking hold of‘ [Vernehmen] presupposes something capable of being taken hold of; reason presupposes the true: it is the faculty of presupposing the true’ (Jacobi, 1994(2): 513 and JWA 2, 1: 208).

Now that the major features of Jacobi’s realism have become clearer, one must also stress a passage that announces his future efforts and identifies the final destination of his non–philosophy: ‘[a] reason that does not merely per–ceive [the true] but produces all truth from itself alone; a reason which is the very essence of truth and has the fullness of life within itself — a self–subsisting reason of this kind (the fullness of the good and true) must of course be present, for otherwise nowhere would there be the good and the true; the root of nature and of all beings would be a pure nothingness, and the ultimate aim of reason the discovery of this great mystery’ (Jacobi, 1994(2): 514 and JWA 2, 1: 209). This final step in Jacobi’s endeavor foreshadows his philosophy of religion, which will be developed in a text, ‘On the Divine Things and their Revelation’, that he will publish only in 1811. In that text, a mature account of Jacobi’s realism is given, taking the form of a sophisticated theism.

3.6 On Critique’s Attempt to Reduce Reason to the Understanding (1802)

The German title of the ‘On Critique‘s Attempt’ reads as ‘Ueber das Unternehmen des Kriticismus, die Vernunft zu Verstande zu bringen, und der Philosophie überhaupt eine neue Absicht zu geben’. Motivated by the challenge to provide philosophy a new objective, Jacobi asserts that Kant does not push open the limits of transcendental philosophy to launch the quest for a self–sufficient speculative thinking; rather, he holds that an independent object should continue to be a necessity for epistemology.

However, Jacobi remarks that the same independence of the object cannot find a proper place in Kant’s system of reason, as it cannot really connect with the subject. In a sense, summarizes Jacobi, the subject and the object are in mystical connection (mystische Verbindung) (JWA 2, 1: 269) This is made more explicit here than in the previous publications, although the idea had already been clarified; see, for instance the Supplement 7 of the second edition of the ‘Spinoza Briefen’ or the Supplement 2 of the ‘Jacobi an Fichte’, published in the Collected Works (1812–1825) as an independent essay with the title ‘On the Inseparability of the Concept of Freedom and Providence from the Concept of Reason’. Jacobi indicates that problems arise where reason is deprived of the proper power that it must be accountable for. On one side, reason (Vernunft) seeks the unconditioned, while on the other, the understanding (Verstand) limits the range of knowledge to the conditioned. This produces a conflict. This conflict between reason and understanding appears to be resolved by Kant, so Jacobi contends, as the understanding positively limits reason, and reason negatively limits the understanding (JWA 2, 1: 272). Nevertheless, the calamitous outcome is clear: true authority (Jacobi, 1994(2): 542 and JWA 2, 1: 380) is given to the understanding, which uses the ideas of reason for its own purposes and never gives jurisdiction over the definition of objective reality to reason.

And yet, Kant’s transcendental philosophy is neither decidedly rejected nor unequivocally accepted. On the one hand, Jacobi acknowledges that, beyond the conflict between reason and understanding, Kant’s system allows sense–perception (Sinnlichkeit) to exercise power over understanding, de facto limiting understanding to merely being the faculty that elaborates upon content that it does not own or provide (JWA 2, 1: 272–273). On the other hand, Jacobi observes that the imagination (Einbildungskraft) plays a crucial epistemological role, mediating between the a priori and a posteriori of sense–perception. As a result of this investigation of the ‘Critique of Pure Reason’, which is the most analytical of his publications (JWA 2, 1: 278ff), Jacobi demonstrates how the imagination discloses what Kant’s idealism could lead to.

3.7 On the Divine Things and Their Revelation (1811)

The composition of ’On the Divine Things and Their Revelation’ (‘Von den göttlichen Dingen und ihrer Offenbarung’) stretched between the last years of the eighteenth century and the first decade of the nineteenth century (Jaeschke, 2000: 175–176). It includes three texts: ‘Ueber eine Weissagung Lichtenbergs’, originally published in 1802; the ‘Claudius-Rezension’, which was scheduled to appear in 1798; and a final long essay on Idealism and Realism. The whole project was described by Jacobi himself as being devoted to revelation (Livieri, 2023). By contrast with the immediate interpretation of this reference to revelation, the ‘Preface’ to the third volume of the Complete Works (1816) states in clear terms that the ‘Von den güttlichen Dingen’ manifests a thematic agreement with both the ‘Jacobi an Fichte’ (1799) and ‘Ueber das Unternehmen’ (1802). Hence, the idea of revelation takes shape within a conceptual background that neither refers to Christian theology nor explicitly addresses any topics of the philosophy of religion. Instead, Jacobi uses the term (Offenbarung) as it is used in plain German, which emphasizes the immediate apprehension of real being. This linguistic strategy may appear hazardous at first glance, but it fits well with Jacobi’s critical stance in opposition to Kant’s philosophy and its heirs: the term revelation announces the necessary duality in epistemology (an I in front of a Thou) and demands that immediacy be a key factor.Moreover, Offenbarung must be considered the major concept that introduces us to Jacobi’s epistemology in general, in fact it must prove instrumental to the subtle connection that he establishes between two realms of being: the finite and the divine (Koch, 2019: XVIIIff).

To present the content schematically, it is necessary to begin with the distinction that Jacobi draws between ‘integral externalists’ and ‘integral internalists’ in matters of religion. The first support the authority of externality in the form of historical instances of the divine (the historical Jesus, divine messengers, etc.), while the second privilege the inner voice of the divine in the form of a conscience that is ingrained in the rational nature of the human. Jacobi finds instances of truth in both approaches, but a proper way to settle the issue would be to find a third, more productive, stance, that would not be a simple mediation between the two parties. Jacobi finds such a solution in his theism, according to which God is clearly not the God of the Christian Bible, notwithstanding the many references to the Old and New Testament and Jacobi’s explicit profession of faith, but a God that results from an anthropomorphism that mirrors reciprocal theomorphism: ‘I am who I am. This sovereign proclamation grounds everything. Its echo in the human soul is the revelation of God in it: ‘made in His image, in the likeness of who is’. By creating the human being God theomorphized it (theomorphisirt); necessarily then the human being anthropomorphizes (anthropomorphisirt). What makes the human being a human being, i.e., an image of God, is reason’ (JWA 3: 112. See Goretzki, 2021).

As it is stated in the essay ‘On Critique’s Attempt to Reduce Reason to the Understanding’, reason functions as the real definition of humanity, thanks to which the divine things are revealed, namely, God, freedom, virtue, and the immortality of the soul. This mediation between the divine and finite things is the basic operation executed by reason itself, which is embodied in the human being and can thus be defined as a concrete free agent. In fact, as moral agents make existence conceivable, the same agent concurrently connects the finite world with the supramundane one by way of connecting the finite world with its divine origin. The practical dimension of the agent is thus key for connecting the God–creator with existence in any fashion. Only God gives nature, the finite world, a ‘face‘, as much as our reason gives our knowledge of nature its real footing in existence. In this sense, one may claim that reason perceives what God creates: the order of reality, intended in both the moral and ontological senses.

A re–evaluation of Kant’s philosophy is therefore given in this text, performed in view of the authority that practical reason must exercise upon every aspect of our rationality, whether epistemological or practical. Jacobi recognizes Kant’s merit, his ‘spirit’, in the fact that Kant did assume that there is in human reason — as the law of its truth immune to all error — an immediate cognition of both reality in general and of its supreme ground, of a nature below that cognition and of a God above it (JWA 3: 85). Kant needed to assume an immediate knowledge before science to arise, and nevertheless he also ‘considered it necessary to transform this purely revealed and independent knowledge into one dependent on demonstrating, and the immediately known into one mediated. He wanted to build the understanding under reason as foundation and then elevate reason above it. The supremacy of reason, its eminent dignity as the unique and sole universal ground and source of all principles, thus came to the fore only afterwards, and then only validated on condition that it reach a settlement with the understanding. But such a settlement could not be reached. Based as it would have been, not on reserving space reciprocally, but on reciprocal surrender — on one side simply denying, the other simply affirming — it amounted to the neutralization and dispossession of [any] supremacy. And since the understanding, with its veto–power to which it in advance claimed to be entitled, simply stood up against the unreasonable demands of reason, there was no way out. Practical reason could not make good on behalf of faith, outside the domain of science and cognition, what the theoretical (the understanding) had destroyed on behalf of science and cognition. The doctrines of God, immortality, and freedom had to be straight out abandoned. There remained only a doctrine of nature, a philosophy of nature’ (JWA 3: 88).

In the end, Kant, against his own spirit, does not credit reason with its proper place and function. However, Jacobi does not contend that reason must be given free rein, but instead, reason must always communicate with the understanding, although their functions and relative hierarchy must be maintained and made productive (JWA 3: 79). If their distinctions in rank and their synergy are not kept, then either reason would lose itself in empty dreams or Schelling’s philosophy of nature would establish itself as the only coherent outcome of an overpowering understanding. In the last section of the text, Jacobi shows that, contrary to what one may suppose, Schelling’s doctrine of the Unitotality does not represent the true form of a scientific approach to reality, for real science respects Jacobi’s theism: true science moves only within the horizon of the conditioned. Instead, Schelling’s doctrine displays the paramount misstep of equating freedom with necessity, the science of nature with the science of God, the doctrine of the conditioned with knowledge of the unconditioned. In short, Schelling’s doctrine would make of the ground (in the form of nature) the origin and reality of all being. In Jacobi’s eyes, his own theism proves its superiority against Schelling’s naturalism, as theism does not ban necessity, whereas Schelling’s naturalism bans real freedom (JWA 3: 110): Jacobi’s theism rejects naturalism’s veto, while it allows the science of the understanding to produce knowledge of the conditioned and, at the same time, introduces a different logos for the unconditioned.

4. Retrospect (1815–1819)

Jacobi retired from the Munich Academy of Sciences in 1812 and dedicated himself to publishing his Collected Works, whose first volume went out that same year. Beyond the many corrections and additions he made to his past publications, Jacobi wrote two important texts that must be considered here. These texts provide a clear self–assessment and constitute an insightful summary of Jacobi’s own philosophical views. They include the general ‘Introduction’ to his opera omnia, which was published in its second volume (1815), and the ‘Foreword’ to the fourth volume (1819). They bring to light a much–needed clarification of the relationship between reason and understanding, namely that between the immediate apprehension of things (both finite and divine) and the systematic determination of the conditioned. A final word on the rationality of the connection between unconditioned and conditioned was not only needed to clarify Jacobi’s ideas, which necessarily evolved over the years, but also to present his contribution to a major debate in Classical German Philosophy. This clarification also serves the purpose of mitigating his rejection of idealism. Jacobi moves from a clear definition of a major portion of the history of Western philosophy: ever since Aristotle, priority was given to the understanding; hence, rationality has primarily been the capacity used to reflect upon objects only to connect them or their properties to other objects or other properties (Jacobi, 1994(2): 540–541 and JWA 2, 1: 378–379). As a consequence, abstraction and reflection are the only operations that have qualified thinking as a scientific endeavor. Jacobi stands against this prioritization and gives Kant credit for having redressed the original supremacy of reason, the faculty of revelation and perception.

Jacobi stresses the need for the understanding to acquire the content of knowledge from two distinct faculties of perception, one represented by the senses (for finite things) and the other represented by reason (for divine things). If Jacobi seems to be steering away somewhat from the theism theorized in the ‘Von den güttlichen Dingen’, where reason plays a fundamental role in both horizons (finite and divine) (JWA 3: 85), he eventually confirms that reason is the faculty that oversees our capacity to think and know. Still, this supremacy does not revoke the epistemological function of the understanding, which, with its mediating and connecting, gives knowledge its subject matter and, by doing so, validates the identity of the Self. This text is significant precisely because it gives the understanding a specific role in the constitution of the self–consciousness, updating Jacobi’s analysis of the understanding (Jacobi, 1994(2): 547–548 and JWA 2, 1: 386. See Ivaldo, 2003: 122]. The same collaboration between reason and understanding in the overall project of the definition of the I is again at the center of the 1819 ‘Foreword’, which further elaborates this teamwork by defining the nature of science itself. Science does not reject the idea of God or that of divine things; rather, it limits its knowledge to finite objects, without dismissing the knowledge of a higher and original being, which must play the role of the presupposition for all cognition. Consequently, the human being finds himself in the search for God, inasmuch as he admits the limitations of his own knowledge. Recalling Socrates’s and Saint Paul’s teachings, Jacobi concludes his intellectual career with a Kantian admission of the essential religious outcome of our self–discovery, eventually exhibiting the necessity of a higher order of reality.


An important development is the near completion of the critical editions of Jacobi’s Correspondence (Briefausgabe) and Works (Werke. Gesamtausgabe) which were initiated as far back as the early 1980s. All together, there will be forty-three volumes, thirteen of Works (texts and appendices) and thirty of Correspondence (texts and commentaries), all published by Meiner (Hamburg) and frommann–holzboog (Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt).

One more project, the Jacobi-Wörterbuch-online sponsored by Sächsische Akademie der Wissenschaft (Leipzig), offers a vivid picture of Jacobi’s intellectual profile.

For more information see:

The critical edition of Jacobi’s Notebooks has recently been published: F.H. Jacobi, Die Denkbücher, Vol. 1,1–1,2, ed. by Sophia V. Krebs, Stuttgart–Bad Cannstatt: Frommann–Holzboog, 2000. However, the commentary is still in preparation (Reihe II: Kommentar. Bände II,1 und II,2).

Consult also the ‘Preface to the Paperback Edition’ (2009) in Jacobi (1994 (2)) which includes a complete list of Jacobi’s publications.

Primary Literature

  • 2019. David Hume über den Glauben oder Idealismus und Realismus: Ein Gespräch (1787); Jacobi an Fichte (1799), O. Koch (ed.), on the basis of the edition by W. Jaeschke and I.–M. Piske, with a new introduction, Hamburg: Meiner. [This includes the works below dated 1787 (2) and 1799.]
  • 2018. Brief über den Nihilismus, I. Radrizzani (ed.), with a translation from the French by P. Göcergi, Stuttgart–Bad Cannstatt: Frommann–Holzboog. This is the German edition of Lettre sur le nihilisme et autres textes, I. Radrizzani (ed.), Paris: Flammarion, 2009.
  • 2009. Sur l’entreprise du criticisme de ramener la raison à l’entendement et de donner à la philosophie une nouvelle orientation; suivi de Lettre à Fichte, P. Cerutti (ed.), Paris: J. Vrin.
  • 2008. Des choses divines et de leur révélation, P. Cerutti (ed.), Paris: J. Vrin.
  • 2005. “Ich träume lieber Fritz den Augenblick...”, der Briefwechsel zwischen Goethe und F.H. Jacobi, M. Jacobi (ed.), new edtion by A. Remmel and P. Remmel, Hildesheim: Weidmann.
  • 2000 (2). ‘On Transcendental Idealism’, appendix to the 2nd Edition of David Hume über den Glauben oder Idealismus und Realismus, B. Sassen (trans.), in Kant’s Early Critics, The Empiricist Critique of Theoretical Philosophy, pp. 169–175. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • 2000 (1). David Hume et la croyance, idéalisme et réalisme, L. Guillermit (ed.), Paris: J. Vrin. First published in 1981 for Marseille: Université de Provence.
  • 1994 (2). The Main Philosophical Writings and the Novel Allwill, G. di Giovanni (ed. and trans.), Montréal & Kingston: McGill-Queen’s University Press; paperback edition, with new Preface, 2009. Includes complete major texts from original editions and with original pagination, historical and critical notes, extensive bibliography that includes a complete list of Jacobi’s publications.
  • 1994 (1). Religionsphilosophie und spekulative Theologie. Der Streit um die Göttlichen Dinge (1799–1812), Quellenband, Philosophisch-literarische Streitsachen 3.1, W. Jaeschke (ed.), Hamburg: Meiner, includes Jacobi’s Von den göttlichen Dingen und ihrer Offenbarung and several texts by different authors that took part to the dispute with different degrees of involvement.
  • 1993. Transzendentalphilosophie und Spekulation. Der Streit und die Gestalt einer Ersten Philosophie (1799–1807), Quellenband, Philosophisch–literarische Streitsachen 2.1, W. Jaeschke (ed.), Hamburg: Meiner. The volume presents the texts Jacobi an Fichte and Drei Briefe an Köppen together with several letters from Reinhold, Fichte, Schelling, Bouterwek, and Jean Paul that help frame the debate about the notions of Realism and Transcendental Idealism.
  • 1988. The Spinoza Conversations between Lessing and Jacobi: Text with Excerpts from the Ensuing Controversy. Introduced by Gérard Vallée, G.Vallée, J.B. Lawson, and C.G. Chapple (trans.), Lanham, New York: University Press of America.
  • 1987. ‘Open Letter to Fichte, 1799’, Philosophy of German Idealism, Diana I. Behler (trans.), Ernst Behler (ed.), New York: Continuum, 119–141.
  • 1983 (2). David Hume über den Glauben, oder, Idealismus und Realismus (1787), and the Vorrede to the 1815 edition, H. Beck (ed.), New York: Garland Publishing.
  • 1983 (1). La Doctrine de Spinoza clairement exposée dans le lettre à Hemsterhuis de juillet 1784, Paris: A. Braik.
  • 1982. Dialogue sur l’idéalisme et le réalisme, L. Guillermit (ed.), Marseille: Université de Provence.
  • 1981 ff. Werke: Briefwechsel, Nachlaß, Dokumente, Suttgart-Bad Constatt: Frommann-Holzboog. This critical edition of Jacobi’s works is divided into two series of volumes: Letters and Texts, Commentaries.
  • 1981 ff. Werke: Gesamtausgabe der Bayerischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, Walter Jaeschke (ed.), Hamburgh: Meiner. This critical edition supplements the one cited in the immediately preceding entry.
  • 1970. Nihilismus: die Anfänge von Jacobi bis Nietzsche, D. Arent (ed.), Köln: Hegner.
  • 1967. Streit um die göttlichen Dinge. Die Auseinandersetzung zwischen Jacobi und Schelling, W. Weischedel (ed.), includes texts from the dispute between Jacobi and Schelling Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft.
  • 1966. Lettres inédites de F.H. Jacobi, J.Th. de Booy and R. Mortier (eds.), Genève: Studies on Voltaire and the eighteentn century.
  • 1965. Fliegende Blätter und Sentenzen aus seinen Werken und Briefen, selection and afterworld by R. Gumpert, Heidelberg: Sauer–Verlag.
  • 1957. Friedrich Heinrich JacobisAllwill”, critical edition with introduction and notes by J. U. Terpstra, Groningen: Djacarta.
  • 1946. Oeuvres philosophiques de F.-H. Jacobi, J.-J. Anstett (trans.), Paris: Aubier.
  • 1943. Freundschaftsbriefe aus empfindsamer Zeit, a selection of letters by J. Heyderhoff, Düsseldorf: Völkischer Verlag.
  • 1926. Die Schriften Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi, selection with an introduction by L. Matthias, Berlin: Die Schmiede.
  • 1916. Die Hauptschriften zum Pantheismusstreit zwischen Jacobi und Mendelssohn, H. Scholz (ed.), Berlin: Reuther & Reichard. Includes all the relevant texts in the dispute between Jacobi and Mendelssohn.
  • 1912. Jacobis Spinoza Büchlein: nebst Replik und Duplik, F. Mauthner (ed.), München: Müller.
  • 1869 (2). Aus F.H. Jacobi’s Nachlaß. Ungedruckte Briefe von und an Jacobi und andere. Nebst ungedruckten Gedichten von Goethe und Lenz, 2 volumes, R. Zoeppritz (ed.), Leipzig: Engelmann.
  • 1869 (1). Aus dem Leben und für das Leben—Weisheitssprüche von Fr.H. Jacobi, J. Hamberger (ed.), Gotha: Perthes.
  • 1854. F. H. Jacobi’s ausgewählte Werke, volumes I–III, Leipzig: G. Fleischer, 1854.
  • 1844. Anthologie aus den Werke von J.G. Jacobi und F.H. Jacobi. Parabeln von F.A. Krummacher. Amsterdam: Bibliographisches Institut in Hildburghausen.
  • 1825–27. Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi’s auserlesener Briefwechsel, 2 volumes, F. Roth (ed.), Leipzig: Fleischer.
  • 1812–1825. Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi’s Werke, eds Köppen, J.F. and Roth, C.J.F., vols. I–VI. Leipzig: Gerhard Fleischer. Reprinted, Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1968. This is the edition that Jacobi himself supervised before his death and the one still most easily available. It must however be treated with care, since editorial comments and emendations tend to impose Jacobi’s later views on the earlier texts. The series includes four texts that present Jacobi’s overview on his own lifelong enterprise: Einleitung in des Verfassers sämmliche philosophische Schriften (1815), Vorrede zu Band III der Werke (1816), Vorbericht zur zweiten Ausgabe (1816), and Erweiterung der dritten Auflage (1819).
  • 1817. ‘Fliegende Blätter.’Minerva, Leipzig: Taschenbuch für das Jahr 1817, 259—300.
  • 1811. Von den Göttlichen Dingen und ihrer Offenbarung, Leipzig: G.Fleischer.
  • 1807. Über gelehrte Gesellschaften, ihren Geist und Zweck. Eine Abhandlung, vorgelesen bey der feyerlichen Erneuung der Königlichen Akademie der Wissenschaften zu München von dem Präsidenten der Akademie, München: E. A. Fleischmann.
  • 1803. [Three letters in] Köppen, Friedrich. Schellings Lehre oder das Ganze der Philosophie des absoluten Nichts, Nebst drey Briefen verwandten Inhalts von Friedr. Heinr. Jacobi. Hamburg: 207–278.
  • 1802 (2). ‘Über das Unternehmen des Kriticismus, die Vernunft zu Verstande zu bringen, und der Philosophie überhaupt eine neue Absicht zu geben.’ Beyträge zur leichtern Uebersicht des Zustandes der Philosophie beym Anfange des 19. Jahrhunderts, C.L. Reinhold (ed.), Hamburg, 3: 1–110.
  • 1802 (1). ‘Über eine Weissagung Lichtenbergs,’ Taschenbuch für das Jahr 1802, J. Georg Jacobi (ed.), Hamburg: Perthes: 3–46.
  • 1799. Jacobi an Fichte, Hamburg: Perthes. Supplement II was republished in Werke II, 1815 (Jacobi, 1812–1825) under the title of ‘Über die Unzertrennlichkeit der Freiheit und Vorsehung von dem Begriffe der Vernunft.’
  • 1796. Woldemar (2 Theile, Neue verbesserte Ausgabe), Königsberg: Nicolovius.
  • 1795. ‘Zufällige Ergießungen eines einsamen Denkers in Briefen an vertraute Freunde,’ J.C.F. Schiller (ed.), Die Horen, 3 (8): 1–34.
  • 1794. Woldemar, 2 Theile. Königsberg: Nicolovius.
  • 1792. Eduard Allwills Briefsammlung, herausgegeben von Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi, mit einer Zugabe von eigenen Briefen, Königsberg: Nicolovius; 1957, critical edition, J.U. Terpstra (ed.), Groningen: Djakarta, 1957.
  • 1789. Über die Lehre des Spinoza in Briefen an den Herrn Moses Mendelssohn. Neue vermehrte Ausgabe, Breslau: Gottlieb Löwe.
  • 1788. ‘Einige Betrachtungen über den frommen Betrug und über eine Vernunft, welche nicht die Vernunft ist, von Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi in einem Briefe an den Herrn geheimen Hofrath Schlosser.’ Deutsches Museum, 1(2): 153–184.
  • 1787 (2). David Hume über den Glauben, oder Idealismus und Realismus. Ein Gespräch, Breslau: Gottlieb Löwe. 1983 facsimile reproduction that includes the Vorrede of 1815, New York and London: Garland.
  • 1787 (1). Translation of Fr. Hemsterhuis, Alexis: oder, Von dem goldenen Weltalter, tr. F.H. Jacobi. Riga: Hartknoch.
  • 1786. Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi wider Mendelssohns Beschuldigungen betreffend die Briefe über die Lehre des Spinoza. Leipzig: Georg Joachim Goeschen.
  • 1785. Über die Lehre des Spinoza in Briefen an den Herrn Moses Mendelssohn, Breslau: Gottlieb Löwe.
  • 1782. Etwas das Leßing gesagt hat. Ein Commentar zu den Reisen der Päpste nebst Betrachtungen von einem Dritten, Berlin: George Jacob Decker.
  • 1781 (2). Vermischte Schriften. Erster Teil, that includes Der Kunstgarten, which is a revision of ‘Ein Stück Philocophie des Lebens und der Menschheit.’ (1779). Breslau: J.F. Korn.
  • 1781 (1). ‘Über Recht und Gewalt, oder philosophische Erwägung eines Aufsazes von dem Herrn Hofrath Wieland, über das göttliche Recht der Obrigkeit, im deutschen Merkur, November 1777’ Deutsches Museum, 1: 522–554.
  • 1779 (4). ‘Ein Stück Philosophie des Lebens und der Menschheit: Aus dem zweiten Bande von Woldemar.’ Deutsches Museum, 1: 307–348; 393–427.
  • 1779 (3). Woldemar. Eine Seltenheit aus der Naturgeschichte, vol. 1. Flensburg and Leipzig.
  • 1779 (2). ‘Noch eine politische Rhapsodie, worinn sich verschiedene Plagia befinden; betitelt: Es ist nicht recht, und es ist nicht klug.’ Baierische Beyträge zur schönen und nützlichen Litteratur, 1 (5): 418–458.
  • 1779 (1). ‘Eine politische Rhapsodie. Aus einem Aktenstock entwendet. Ein eingesandtes Stück.’ Baierische Beyträge zur schönen und nützlichen Litteratur, 1 (5): 407–418.
  • 1777. ‘Freundschaft und Liebe. Eine wahre Geschichte, von der Herausgeber von Eduard Allwills Papiere.’ Der Teutsche Merkur, XVIII: 97—107; XIX (1777): 32—49, 229—259; XX (1777): 246—267. This text represents the basis upon which Jacobi will later develop the Woldemar.
  • 1776. ‘Eduard Allwills Papiere.’ Der Teutscher Merkur, XIV.2: 14—75; XV.3 (1776): 57—71; XVI.4 (1776):229—262.
  • 1775. ‘Eduard Allwills Papiere.’ Iris, IV.3: 193—236.
  • Jacobi/Baggasens, Reinhold, 1831. Jens Baggasens Briefwechsel mit Karl Leonhard Reinhold und Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi, 2 volumes, K. & A. Baggasen (eds.), Leipzig: Brockhaus.
  • Jacobi/Bouterwek, 1868. Fried. Heinr. Jacobi’s Briefe an Friedr. Bouterwek aus dem Jahren 1800 bis 1819, W. Meyer (ed.) Göttingen: Deuer.
  • Jacobi/Hamann, 1955–1979. Johann Georg Hamann, Briefwechsel, volumes 6–7, A. Henkel (ed.), Wiesbaden & Frankfurt am Main: Insel-Verlag.
  • Jacobi/Goethe, 2005. “Ich träume lieber Fritz den Augenblick …”: Der Briefwechsel zwischen Goethe und F. H. Jacobi, A. Remmel and P. Remmel (eds.), Hildesheim: Weidmann. This is a new edition of 1892, Briefwechsel zwischen Goethe und Fr. H. Jacobi, ed. Jacobi, Max.
  • Jacobi/Humboldt, 1892. Briefe von Wilhelm von Humboldt an R. H. Jacobi, A. Leitzman (ed.), Halle: Niemeyer.
  • Jacobi/Mendelssohn, 1929. Mendelssohn-Briefwechsel, A. Altmann (ed.), in Moses Mendelssohn: Gesammelte Schriften, Jubiläumsausgabe. Berlin: Akademie-Verlag. Reprint, 1971: Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog
  • Die Bibliothek Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi. Ein Katalog, volumes 1.1 and 1.2, K. Widemann, M. Brüggen, H. Gockel, P.–P. Schneider (eds.). Stuttgart–Bad Cannstatt: Frommann–Holzboog, 1989. Band 1,1. Bibliothek Katalog, Bd. 1:XLIV, 1–452 S. And Band 1,2. Bibliothek Katalog, Bd. 2: VI, 453–942 S.

Secondary Literature

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  • –––, 1971. ‘Über das Verhältnis von Erkenntnisgewißheit und Anschauungsgewißheit in F. H. Jacobis Interpretation der Vernunft,’ Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi. Philosoph und Literat der Goethezeit. Beiträge einer Tagung in Düsseldorf (16.-19. 10. 1969) aus Anlaß seines 150. Todestages und Berichte, K. Hammacher (ed.), Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, 7–26.
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  • Baus, Lothar, 1989. ‘Woldemar’ und ‘Allwill’ alias Johann Wolfgang Goethe. Autentische Schilderungen von F.H. Jacobi über Goethe, Henriette von Roussillon und deren empfindamsame Freunde nebst originalbriefen Goethes, Homburg/Saar: Asclepios.
  • Beiser, Frederick C., 1992. Enlightenment, Revolution and Romanticism: The Genesis of Modern Political Thought, 1790–1800, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
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  • Booy, J.Th. de, & Mortier, Roland, 1966. Les années de formation de F.H.Jacobi, d’après ses lettres inédites à M.M.Rey (1763–1771), avec “Le Noble” de Madame de Charrière, Geneva: Institut et Musée Voltaire.
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  • –––, 2003. ‘1799: The Year of Reinhold’s Conversion to Jacobi,’ in Die Philosophie Karl Leonhard Reinholds, M. Bondeli and W. Schrader (eds.), Fichte-Studien, Supplementa, Amsterdam/New York: Rodopi, 259–282.
  • –––, 2001. ‘Rehberg, Reinhold und C.C.E. Schmid über Kant und moralische Freiheit,’ in Vernunftkritik und Aufklärung, M. Oberhausen D.P. Delfosse, and R. Pozzo (eds.), Suttgart-Bad Canstaat: Fromann-Holzboog, 93–113.
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  • Goldenbaum, Ursula, 2009. ‘Der Pantheismusstreit als Angriff auf die Berliner Aufklärung und Judenemanzipation,,’ in Aufklärung: Interdisziplinäres Jahrbuch zur Erforschung des 18. Jahrhunderts und seiner Wirkungsgeschichte, Volume 21: Special Issue (‘Religion’), Robert Theis (ed.), Hamburg: Meiner.
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  • –––, 1986. ‘Die Vernuft hat also nicht nur Vorstellungen, sondern wirkliche Dinge zu Gegenstände. Zur nachkantische Leibniz-Rezeption, vornehmlich bei F.H. Jacobi,’ Beiträge zur Wirkungs- und Rezeptionsgeschichte von Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (Studia Leibnitiana, Supplementa 26), A.F. Heinekamp (ed.), Wiesbaden, Stuttgart: Steiner Verlag, 213–224.
  • –––, 1985. ‘Über Friedrich Heinrich Jacobis Beziehungen zu Lessing im Zusammenhang mit dem Streit um Spinoza,’ in Lessing und der Kreis seiner Freunde, G. Schulz (ed.), Heidelberg: L. Schneider, 51–74.
  • –––, 1984. ‘Die Stellung des Jacobi.Kreises zu Religionsfrage–Lessing und der Pantheismusstreit,’ in Düsseldorf in der deutschen Geistesgeschichte (1750–1850), G. Kurz (ed.), Düsseldorf: Schwann, 79–101.
  • –––, 1979. ‘Der persönliche Gott im Dialog? J.G. Hamanns Auseinandersetzung mit F.H. Jacobis Spinozabriefen,’ in Johannes Georg Hamann. Acta des Internationalen Hamann-Colloquium in Lüneburg 1976, B. Gajek (ed.), Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, 194–210.
  • –––, 1978. ‘Ein bemerkenswerter Einfluß französischen Denkens. Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi Auseinandersetzung mit Voltaire und Rousseau,’ Revue Internationale de Philosophie, 32: 327–347.
  • –––, 1971. ‘Jacobi und das Probelm der Dialektik,’ in Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi. Philosoph und Literat der Goethezeit. Beiträge einer Tagung in Düsseldorf (16.-19. 10. 1969) aus Anlaß seines 150. Todestages und Berichte, K. Hammacher (ed.), Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, 119–155.
  • –––, 1969. Die Philosophie Friedrich Heinrich Jacobis, München: Wilhelm Fink Verlag.
  • ––– and Hans Hirsch (eds.), 1993. Die Wissenschaftspolitik des Philosophen Jacobi (Fichte-Studien Supplementa 1), Amsterdam–Atlanta: Rodopoi.
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  • –––, 2001. Radical Enlightenment: Philosophy and the Making of Modernity 1650–1750, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
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  • –––, 1996. Filosofia delle cose divine. Saggio su Jacobi, Brescia: Morcelliana.
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This entry was rewritten by Paolo Livieri in 2023, but since it retains the entire Bibliography from the previous version of this entry written solely by George di Giovanni, the latter remains credited as the second author.

Copyright © 2023 by
Paolo Livieri <>
George di Giovanni

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