Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling

First published Mon Oct 22, 2001; substantive revision Thu Feb 9, 2023

Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling (1775–1854) is, along with J.G. Fichte and G.W.F. Hegel, one of the three most influential thinkers in the tradition of ‘German Idealism’. Although he is often regarded as a philosophical Proteus who changed his conception so radically and so often that it is hard to attribute one clear philosophical conception to him, Schelling was in fact often an impressively rigorous logical thinker. In the era during which Schelling was writing, so much was changing in philosophy that a stable, fixed point of view was as likely to lead to a failure to grasp important new developments as it was to lead to a defensible philosophical system. Schelling’s continuing importance today relates mainly to three aspects of his work. The first is his Naturphilosophie, which, although many of its empirical claims are now indefensible, opens up the possibility of a modern hermeneutic view of nature that does not restrict nature’s significance to what can be established about it in scientific terms. The second is his anti-Cartesian account of subjectivity, which prefigures some of the most influential ideas of thinkers such as Nietzsche, Heidegger, and Jacques Lacan, in showing how the thinking subject cannot be fully transparent to itself. The third is his later critique of Hegelian Idealism, which influenced Kierkegaard, Marx, Nietzsche, Heidegger, and others, and aspects of which are echoed by thinkers such as T.W. Adorno and Jacques Derrida. Schelling’s focus on humankind’s relationship to nature has gained particular relevance as the seriousness of the climate emergency has become fully apparent in recent years.

1. Career

Schelling was born in Leonberg near Stuttgart on 27 January 1775. He attended a Protestant seminary in Tübingen from 1790 to 1795, where he was close friends with both Hegel and the poet and philosopher Friedrich Hölderlin. He moved to Leipzig in 1797, then to Jena, where he came into contact with the early Romantic thinkers, Friedrich Schlegel and Novalis, and, via Goethe’s influence, took up his first professorship from 1798 to 1803. From 1803 to 1806 he lived in Würzburg, whence he left for Munich, where he mainly lived from 1806 onwards, with an interruption from 1820 to 1827, when he lived in Erlangen. He moved to Berlin in 1841 to take up what had, until Hegel’s death in 1831, been Hegel’s chair of philosophy. Although his lectures in Berlin were initially attended by such luminaries as Kierkegaard, Engels, Bakunin, Ranke, Burkhardt, and Alexander von Humboldt, he soon came to be largely ignored by most of the leading thinkers of the day. It is clear, however, that his philosophical thought still influenced many who rejected him on mainly political grounds. He died on 20 August 1854 in Bad Ragaz, Switzerland. Schelling’s influence on many directions in modern philosophy has been seriously underestimated in the English-speaking world, though sustained new attention to his work in recent years has increasingly brought him into contemporary debates about naturalism, freedom, aesthetics, epistemology, and ontology.

2. Transcendental Philosophy and Naturphilosophie

The significance of the work of the early Schelling (1795–1800) lies in its attempts to give a new account of nature which, while taking account of the fact that Kant had irrevocably changed the status of nature in modern philosophy, avoids some of the consequences of Kant’s theory that were seen as problematic by Kant’s contemporaries and successors. For the Kant of the Critique of Pure Reason (1781, 1787) nature is largely seen in the ‘formal’ sense, as that which is subject to necessary laws. These laws are accessible to us, Kant argues, because cognition depends on the subject bringing forms of thought, the categories, to bear on what it perceives. The problem this leads to is how the subject could fit into a nature conceived of in deterministic terms, given that the subject’s ability to know is dependent upon its ‘spontaneous’ self-caused ability to judge in terms of the categories. Kant’s response to this dilemma is to split the ‘sensuous’ realm of nature as law-bound appearance from the ‘intelligible’ realm of the subject’s cognitive and ethical self-determination. However, if the subject is part of nature there would seem to be no way of explaining how a nature which we can only know as deterministic can give rise to a subject which seems to transcend determinism in its knowing and in its self-determined actions. Kant himself sought to bridge the realms of necessity and spontaneity in the Critique of Judgement (1790), by suggesting that nature itself could be seen in more than formal terms: it also produces self-determining organisms and gives rise to disinterested aesthetic pleasure in the subject that contemplates its forms. The essential problems remained, however, that (1) Kant gave no account of the genesis of the subject that transcends its status as a piece of determined nature, and (2) such an account would have to be able to bridge the divide between nature and freedom.

The tensions in Schelling’s philosophy of this period, which set the agenda for most of his subsequent work, derive, then, from the need to overcome the perceived lack in Kant’s philosophy of a substantial account of how nature and freedom come to co-exist. Two ways out of Kantian dualism immediately suggested themselves to thinkers in the 1780s and 90s. On the one hand, Kant’s arguments about the division between appearances and things in themselves, which gave rise to the problem of how something ‘in itself’ could give rise to appearances for the subject, might be overcome by rejecting the notion of the thing in itself altogether. If what we know of the object is the product of the spontaneity of the I, an Idealist could argue that the whole of the world’s intelligibility is therefore the result of the activity of the subject, and that a new account of subjectivity is required which would achieve what Kant had failed to achieve. On the other hand, the fact that nature gives rise to self-determining subjectivity would seem to suggest that a monist account of a nature which was more than a concatenation of laws, and was in some sense inherently ‘subjective’, would offer a different way of accounting for what Kant’s conception did not provide. Schelling seeks answers to the Kantian problems in terms that relate to both these conceptions. Indeed, it is possible to argue that the conceptions are in one sense potentially identical: if the essence of nature is that it produces the subjectivity which enables it to understand itself, nature itself could be construed as a kind of ‘super-subject’. The main thinkers whose work is regarded as exemplifying these alternatives are J.G. Fichte, and Spinoza.

The source of Schelling’s concern with Spinoza is the ‘Pantheism controversy’, which brought Spinoza’s monism into the mainstream of German philosophy. In 1783 the writer and philosopher F.H. Jacobi became involved in an influential dispute with the Berlin Enlightenment philosopher Moses Mendelssohn over the claim that G.E. Lessing had admitted to being a Spinozist, an admission which at that time was tantamount to the admission of atheism, with all the dangerous political and other consequences that entailed. In his On the Doctrine of Spinoza in Letters to Herr Moses Mendelssohn, (1785, second edition 1789), which was influenced by his reading of Kant’s first Critique, Jacobi revealed a problem which would recur in differing ways throughout Schelling’s work. Jacobi’s interpretation of Spinozism was concerned with the relationship between the ‘unconditioned’ and the ‘conditioned’, between God as the ground of which the laws of nature are the consequent, and the linked chains of the deterministic laws of nature. Cognitive explanation relies, as Kant claimed, upon finding a thing’s ‘condition’. Jacobi’s question is how finding a thing’s condition can finally ground its explanation, given that each explanation leads to a regress in which each condition depends upon another condition ad infinitum. Any philosophical system that would ground the explanation of a part of nature thus “necessarily ends by having to discover conditions of the unconditioned” (Scholz, ed., 1916, p. 51). For Jacobi this led to the need for a theological leap of faith, as the world’s intelligibility otherwise threatened to become a mere illusion, in which nothing would be finally grounded at all. In the 1787 Introduction to the first Critique Kant maintains this problem of cognitive grounding can be overcome by acknowledging that, while reason must postulate the “unconditioned (…) in all things in themselves for everything conditioned, so that the series of conditions should thus become complete” (Kant, Critique of Pure Reason B, p. XX), by restricting knowledge to appearances, rather than assuming it to be of “things in themselves”, the contradiction of seeking conditions of the unconditioned can be avoided. As we have already seen, though, this gives rise precisely to the problem of how a subject which is not conditioned like the nature it comes to know can emerge as the ground of knowledge from deterministic nature.

The condition of the knowledge of appearances for Kant is the ‘transcendental subject’, but what sort of ‘condition’ is the transcendental subject? The perception that Kant has no proper answer to this problem initially unites Schelling and Fichte. Fichte insists in the Wissenschaftslehre (1794) that the unconditioned status of the I has to be established if Kant’s system is to legitimate itself. He asserts that “It is (…) the ground of explanation of all facts of empirical consciousness that before all positing in the I the I itself must previously be posited” (Fichte 1971, p. 95), thereby giving the I the founding role which he thought Kant had failed adequately to explicate. Fichte does this by extending the consequences of Kant’s claim that the cognitive activity of the I, via which it can reflect upon itself, cannot be understood as part of the causal world of appearances, and must therefore be part of the noumenal realm, the realm of the ‘unconditioned’. For Fichte the very existence of philosophy depends upon the free act of the I which initiates the reflection on its own activity by the I.

Schelling takes up the issues raised by Jacobi and Fichte in two texts of 1795: Of the I as Principle of Philosophy or on the Unconditional in Human Knowledge, and Philosophical Letters on Dogmatism and Criticism. In a move which prefigures aspects of Heidegger’s questioning of the notion of being, he reinterprets Kant’s question as to the condition of possibility of synthetic judgements a priori as a question about why there is a realm of judgements, a manifest world requiring syntheses by the subject for knowledge to be produced, at all. In Of the I, Schelling puts Kant’s question in Fichtean terms: “how is it that the absolute I goes out of itself and opposes a Not-I to itself?” (Sämmtliche Werke [SW], I/1, p. 175). He maintains that the condition of knowledge, the ‘positing’ by the I of that which is opposed to it, must have a different status from the determined realm which it posits: “nothing can be posited by itself as a thing, i.e. an absolute/unconditioned thing (unbedingtes Ding) is a contradiction” (ibid., p. 116). However, his key worry about Fichte’s position already becomes apparent in the Philosophical Letters, where he drops the Fichtean terminology: “How is it that I step at all out of the absolute and move towards something opposed (auf ein Entgegengesetztes)?” (ibid., p. 294). The problem Schelling confronts was identified by his friend Hölderlin, in the light of Jacobi’s formulation of the problem of the ‘unconditioned’. Fichte wished to understand the absolute as an I in order to avoid the problem of nature ‘in itself’ which creates Kantian dualism. For something to be an I, though, it must be conscious of an other, and thus in a relationship to that other. The overall structure of the relationship could not, therefore, be described from only one side of that relationship. Hölderlin argued that one has to understand the structure of the relationship of subject to object in consciousness as grounded in ‘a whole of which subject and object are the parts’, which he termed ‘being’. This idea will be vital to Schelling at various times in his philosophy.

In the 1790s, then, Schelling is seeking a way of coming to terms with the ground of the subject’s relationship to the object world. His aim is to avoid the fatalist consequences of Spinoza’s system by taking on key aspects of Kant’s and Fichte’s transcendental philosophy, and yet not to fall into the trap Hölderlin identified in Fichte’s conception of an absolute I. In his Naturphilosophie (philosophy of nature), which emerges in 1797 and develops in the succeeding years, and in the System of Transcendental Idealism of 1800, Schelling wavers between a Spinozist and a Fichtean approach to the ‘unconditioned’. In the Naturphilosophie the Kantian division between nature as appearance and nature in itself is seen as resulting from the fact that the nature theorised in cognitive judgements is objectified in opposition to the knowing subject. This objectification, the result of the natural sciences’ search for fixed laws, fails to account for the living dynamic forces in nature, including those in our own organism, with which Kant himself became concerned in the third Critique and other late work, and which had played a role in Leibniz’s account of nature. Nature in itself is thought of by Schelling as a ‘productivity’: “As the object [qua ‘conditioned condition’] is never absolute/unconditioned (unbedingt) then something per se non-objective must be posited in nature; this absolutely non-objective postulate is precisely the original productivity of nature” (SW I/3, p. 284). The Kantian dualism between things in themselves and appearances is a result of the fact that the productivity can never appear as itself and can only appear in the form of ‘products’, which are the productivity ‘inhibiting’ itself. The products are never complete in themselves: they are like the eddies in a stream, which temporarily keep their shape via the resistance of the movement of the fluid to itself that creates them, despite the changing material flowing through them.

Schelling next tries to use the insights of transcendental philosophy, while still avoiding Kant’s dualism, to explain our knowledge of nature. The vital point is that things in themselves and ‘representations’ cannot be absolutely different because we know a world which exists independently of our will, which can yet be affected by our will:

one can push as many transitory materials as one wants, which become finer and finer, between mind and matter, but sometime the point must come where mind and matter are One, or where the great leap that we so long wished to avoid becomes inevitable. (SW I/2, p. 53)

The Naturphilosophie includes ourselves within nature, as part of an interrelated whole, which is structured in an ascending series of ‘potentials’ that contain a polar opposition within themselves. The model is a magnet, whose opposing poles are inseparable from each other, even though they are opposites. As productivity nature cannot be conceived of as an object, since it is the subject of all possible real ‘predicates’, of the ‘eddies’ of which transient, objective nature consists. However, nature’s ‘inhibiting’ itself in order to become something determinate means that the ‘principle of all explanation of nature’ is ‘universal duality’, an inherent difference of subject and object which prevents nature ever finally reaching stasis (SW I/3, p. 277). At the same time this difference of subject and object must be grounded in an identity which links them together, otherwise all the problems of dualism would just reappear. In a decisive move for German Idealism, Schelling parallels the idea of nature as the producing subject with the spontaneity of the thinking subject, which is the condition of the syntheses required for the constitution of objectivity. The problem for Schelling lies in explicating how these two ‘subjects’ relate to each other.

In the System of Transcendental Idealism Schelling goes back to Fichtean terminology, though he will soon abandon most of it. He endeavours to explain the emergence of the thinking subject from nature in terms of an ‘absolute I’ coming retrospectively to know itself in a ‘history of self-consciousness’ that forms the material of the system. The System recounts the history of which the transcendental subject is the result. A version of the model Schelling establishes will be adopted by Hegel in the Phenomenology of Mind. Schelling presents the process in terms of the initially undivided I splitting itself in order to articulate itself in the syntheses, the ‘products’, which constitute the world of knowable nature. The founding stages of this process, which bring the world of material nature into being, are ‘unconscious’. These stages then lead to organic nature, and thence to consciousness and self-consciousness. Schelling claims, in the wake of Fichte, that the resistance of the noumenal realm to theoretical knowledge results from the fact that “the [practical] act [of the absolute I] via which all limitation is posited, as condition of all consciousness, does not itself come to consciousness” (SW I/3, p. 409). He prophetically attempts to articulate a theory which comes to terms with the idea that thought is driven by forces which are not finally transparent to it, of the kind later to become familiar in psychoanalysis. How, though, does one gain access by thought to what cannot be an object of consciousness? This access is crucial to the whole project because without it there can be no understanding of why the move from determined nature to the freedom of self-determining thinking takes place at all.

Schelling adopts the idea from the early Romantic thinkers Friedrich Schlegel and Novalis, whom he knew in Jena at this time, that art is the route to an understanding of what cannot appear as an object of knowledge. Philosophy cannot represent nature in itself because access to the unconscious must be via what appears to consciousness in the realm of theoretical knowledge. The work of art is evidently an empirical, appearing object like any other, but if it is not more than what it is qua determinable object it cannot be a work of art, because this requires both the free judgement of the subject and the object’s conveying of something beyond its objective nature. Although the System’s own very existence depends upon the transition from theoretical to practical philosophy, which requires the breaking-off of Jacobi’s chain of ‘conditions’ by something unconditioned, Schelling is concerned to understand how the highest insight must be into reality as a product of the interrelation of both the ‘conscious’ and the ‘unconscious’. Reality is not, therefore, essentially captured by a re-presentation of the objective by the subjective. Whereas in the System nature begins unconsciously and ends in conscious philosophical and scientific knowledge, in the art work: “the I is conscious according to the production, unconscious with regard to the product” (SW I/3, p. 613). The product cannot be understood via the intentions of its producer, as this would mean that it became a ‘conditioned’ object, something produced in terms of a pre-existing rule, and would therefore lack what makes mere craft into art. Art is, then, “the only true and eternal organ and document of philosophy, which always and continuously documents what philosophy cannot represent externally” (ibid., p. 627). The particular sciences can only follow the chain of conditions, via the principle of sufficient reason, and must determine any object via its place in that chain, a process which has no necessary end. The art object, on the other hand, manifests what cannot be understood in terms of its knowable conditions, because an account of the materials of which it is made or of its status as object in the world does not constitute it as art. Art shows what cannot be said. Philosophy cannot positively represent the absolute because ‘conscious’ thinking operates from the position where the ‘absolute identity’ of the subjective and the objective has always already been lost in the emergence of consciousness.

Although Schelling’s early work did not fully satisfy either himself, or anybody else, it manages to address, in a cogent and illuminating fashion, many topics which affect subsequent philosophy. The model presented in the System impresses not least because, at the same time as establishing the notion of the history of self-consciousness that would be decisive for Hegel, it offers, in a manner which goes beyond its sources in Fichte, a model of the relationship between the subject and its conceptually inaccessible motivating forces which would affect thinkers from Schopenhauer, to Nietzsche, to Freud, and beyond.

3. Identity Philosophy

Although the period of Schelling’s ‘identity philosophy’ is usually dated from the 1801 Presentation of My System of Philosophy until sometime before the 1809 On the Essence of Human Freedom, the project of that philosophy can be said to be carried on in differing ways throughout his work. The identity philosophy derives from Schelling’s conviction that the self-conscious I must be seen as a result, rather than as the originating act it is in Fichte, and thus that the I cannot be seen as the generative matrix of the whole system. This takes him more in the direction of Spinoza, but the problem is still that of articulating the relationship between the I and the world of nature, without either reverting to Kantian dualism or failing to explain how a purely objective nature could give rise to subjectivity.

Schelling’s mature identity philosophy, which is contained in the System of the Whole of Philosophy and of Naturphilosophie in Particular, written in Würzburg in 1804, and in other texts between 1804 and 1807, breaks with the model of truth as correspondence. It does so because:

It is clear that in every explanation of the truth as a correspondence (Übereinstimmung) of subjectivity and objectivity in knowledge, both, subject and object, are already presupposed as separate, for only what is different can agree, what is not different is in itself one. (SW I/6, p. 138)

The crucial problem is how to explain the link between the subject and object world that makes judgements possible, and this cannot be achieved in terms of how a subject can have thoughts which correspond to an object essentially separate from it. For there to be judgements at all what is split and then synthesised in the judgement must, Schelling contends, in some way already be the same. This has often been understood as leading Schelling to a philosophy in which, as Hegel puts it in the Phenomenology, the absolute is the ‘night in which all cows are black’, because it swallows all differentiated knowledge in the assertion that everything is ultimately the same, namely an absolute which excludes all relativity from itself and thus becomes inarticulable. This is not a valid interpretation of Schelling’s argument. In an early version of the identity philosophy he had said the following:

For most people see in the essence of the Absolute nothing but pure night and cannot recognise anything in it; it shrinks before them into a mere negation of difference, and is for them something purely privative, whence they cleverly make it into the end of their philosophy (…) I want to show here (…) how that night of the Absolute can be turned into day for knowledge (SW I/4, p. 403).

In order to try to get over the problem in monism of how the One is also the many, Schelling, following the idea outlined above from Hölderlin, introduces a notion of ‘transitive’ being, which links mind and matter as predicates of itself. Schelling explains this ‘transitivity’ via the metaphor of the earth:

you recognise its [the earth’s] true essence only in the link by which it eternally posits its unity as the multiplicity of its things and again posits this multiplicity as its unity. You also do not imagine that, apart from this infinity of things which are in it, there is another earth which is the unity of these things, rather the same which is the multiplicity is also unity, and what the unity is, is also the multiplicity, and this necessary and indissoluble One of unity and multiplicity in it is what you call its existence (…) Existence is the link of a being (Wesen) as One, with itself as a multiplicity. (SW I/7, p. 56)

‘Absolute identity’ is, then, the link of the two aspects of being, which, on the one hand, is the universe, and, on the other, is the changing multiplicity which the knowable universe also is. Schelling insists now that “The I think, I am, is, since Descartes, the basic mistake of all knowledge; thinking is not my thinking, and being is not my being, for everything is only of God or the totality” (SW I/7, p. 148), so the I is ‘affirmed’ as a predicate of the being by which it is preceded. In consequence he already begins to move away, albeit inconsistently, from the German Idealist model in which the intelligibility of being is regarded as a result of its having an essentially mind-like structure.

Schelling is led to this view by his understanding of the changing and relative status of theoretical knowledge. It is the inherent incompleteness of all finite determinations which reveals the nature of the absolute. His description of time makes clear what he means: “time is itself nothing but the totality appearing in opposition to the particular life of things”, so that the totality “posits or intuits itself, by not positing, not intuiting the particular” (SW I/6, p. 220). The particular is determined in judgements, but the truth of claims about the totality cannot be proven because judgements are necessarily conditioned, whereas the totality is not. Given the relative status of the particular there must, though, be a ground which enables us to be aware of that relativity, and this ground must have a different status from the knowable world of finite particulars. At the same time, if the ground were wholly different from the world of relative particulars the problems of dualism would recur. As such the absolute is the finite, but we do not know this in the manner we know the finite. Without the presupposition of ‘absolute identity’, therefore, the evident relativity of particular knowledge becomes inexplicable, since there would be no reason to claim that a revised judgement is predicated of the same world as the preceding — now false — judgement.

Schelling summarises his theory of identity as follows:

for being, actual, real being is precisely self-disclosure/revelation (Selbstoffenbarung). If it is to be as One then it must disclose/reveal itself in itself; but it does not disclose/reveal itself in itself if it is not an other in itself, and is in this other the One for itself, thus if it is not absolutely the living link of itself and an other. (SW I/7, p. 54)

The link between the ‘real’ and the ‘ideal’ cannot be regarded as a causal link. Although there cannot be mental events without physical events, the former cannot be reduced to being the causal results of the latter: “For real and ideal are only different views of one and the same substance” (SW I/6, p. 501). Schelling wavers at this time between a ‘reflexive’ position of the kind which Hegel will soon try to articulate, in which, in Schelling’s terms, “the sameness of the subjective and the objective is made the same as itself, knows itself, and is the subject and object of itself” (SW I/6, p. 173), in the ‘identity of identity and difference’, and the sense that this position cannot finally circumscribe the structure of the absolute. The structure of reflection, where each aspect reflects itself and then is reflected in the other, upon which this account of the identity of subject and object relies, must be grounded in a being which carries it:

reflection (…) only knows the universal and the particular as two relative negations, the universal as relative negation of the particular, which is, as such, without reality, the particular, on the other hand, as a relative negation of the universal. (…) something independent of the concept must be added to posit the substance as such. (SW I/6, p. 185)

Without this independent basis subject and object would merely be, as Schelling thinks they are in Fichte, relative negations of each other, leading to a circle “inside which a nothing gains reality by the relation to another nothing” (SW I/4, p. 358). Schelling prophetically distinguishes between the cognitive — reflexive — ground of finite knowledge and the real — non-reflexive — ground that sustains the movement of negation from one finite determination to another. As a two-sided relationship reflection alone always entails the problem that the subject and the object in a case of reflection can only be known to be the same via that which cannot appear in the reflection. If I am to recognise myself as myself in a mirror, rather than see a random object in the world, I must already be familiar with myself before the reflection, in a way which is not part of the reflection. This means a complete system based on reflection is impossible, because, in order for the system to be grounded, it must presuppose as external to itself what it claims is part of itself. Schelling will, in his philosophy from the 1820s onwards, raise versions of this objection against Hegel’s system.

Schelling’s own dissatisfaction with his early versions of identity theory derives from his rejection of Spinozism. Spinoza regards the move from God to the world of ‘conditions’ as a logical consequence of the nature of God. Schelling becomes convinced that such a theory gives no reason why the absolute, the ‘unconditioned’, should manifest itself in a world of negative ‘conditions’ at all. Schelling is therefore confronted with explaining why there is a transition from the absolute to the finite world, a finite world which he comes to see increasingly in terms of the suffering and tragedy it has to involve. In Philosophy and Religion (1804), he claims, as does Jacobi, that there is no way of mediating between conditioned and unconditioned, and already makes the distinction between ‘negative’ and ‘positive’ philosophy, which will form the heart of his late work. Explicating the structure of the finite world leads to “negative philosophy, but much has already been gained by the fact that the negative, the realm of nothingness, has been separated by a sharp limit from the realm of reality and of what alone is positive” (SW I/6, p. 43). The question which comes to concern Schelling is how philosophy can come to terms with a ground which cannot be regarded as the rational explanation of the finite world, because the finite world involves so much that makes no rational sense.

4. The ‘Ages of the World’

Schelling’s work from his middle period (1809–1827) is usually referred to as the philosophy of the Ages of the World (WA = Weltalter), after the title of the unfinished work of that name he worked on in the period 1809–1827. The work characteristic of this period begins with the 1809 On the Essence of Human Freedom (FS = Freiheitsschrift) (written in Stuttgart). The WA philosophy is an attempt to explain the emergence of an intelligible world at the same time as coming to terms with mind’s inextricable relation to matter. The initial concern is to avoid Spinoza’s fatalism, which he thinks renders the human freedom to do good and evil incomprehensible. Schelling’s crucial objection is to the idea that evil should be understood as merely another form of negativity which can be comprehended by insight into the inherent lack in all finite parts of a totality, rather than as a positive fact relating to the nature of human freedom. He now sees the fundamental contradictions of the Naturphilosophie in terms of the relationship of the intelligibility of nature and ourselves to a ground without which there could be no intelligibility, but which is not the explicable cause of intelligibility. In an attempt to get to grips with the problem of the ground of the finite world Schelling introduces a Kant-derived conception of ‘willing’ in the FS which will be influential for Schopenhauer’s conception of the Will: “In the last and highest instance there is no other being but willing. Willing is primal being, and all the predicates of primal being only fit willing: groundlessness, eternity, being independent of time, self-affirmation” (SW I/7, p. 350). Schelling now establishes a more conflictual version of the structure of the identity philosophy. The ‘ground’ is ‘groundless’ — in the sense of ‘uncaused’ — and it must be understood in terms of freedom if a Spinozist determinism is to be avoided. This means there cannot be an explanation of why there is the finite world, because that would entail taking the ground as a cause and thus rendering freedom non-existent.

At the same time Schelling insists there must be that against which freedom can be manifest — a being which is not free and is therefore necessitated — for it to be meaningful freedom at all. The theory is based on the antagonisms between opposing forces which constitute the ‘ages of the world’, the past, present, and future. He argues that the world whose origins the WA wishes to understand must entail the same conflicting forces which still act, though not necessarily in the same form, in this world, of which the mind is an aspect: “Poured from the source of things and the same as the source, the human soul has a co-knowledge/con-science (Mitwissenschaft) of creation” (WA, p. 4). Schelling suggests that there are two principles in us: “an unconscious, dark principle and a conscious principle”, which must yet in some way be identical. The same structure applies to what Schelling means by ‘God’. At this point his account of the ground is not consistent, but this inconsistency points to the essential issue Schelling is trying to understand, namely whether philosophy can give a rational account of the fact of the manifest world. As that which makes the world intelligible, God relates to the ground in such a way that the ‘real’, which takes the form of material nature, is ‘in God’ but “is not God seen absolutely, i.e. insofar as He exists; for it is only the ground of His existence, it is nature in God; an essence which is inseparable from God, but different from Him” (SW I/7, p. 358). The point is that God would be just be some kind of inarticulable, static One if there were not that which He transcends: without opposition, Schelling argues, there is no life and no sense of development, which are the highest aspects of reality. The aim of the move away from Spinoza is to avoid the sense of a world complete in itself which would render freedom illusory because freedom’s goal would already be determined as the goal of the totality. Schelling starts to confront the idea that the rational reconciliation of freedom and necessity that had been sought by Kant in the acknowledgement of the necessity of the law, and which was the aim of German Idealism’s attempt to reconcile mind and nature, might be intrinsically unattainable.

Wolfram Hogrebe has claimed that the WA philosophy is an ontological theory of predication. Being, as initially One and enclosed within itself, is not manifest, and has no reason to be manifest. Hogrebe terms this ‘pronominal being’. The same being must also, given that there is now a manifest world, be ‘predicative being’, which “flows out, spreads, gives itself” (SW I/8, p. 210–211). The contradiction between the two kinds of being is only apparent. Schelling maintains, in line with the identity philosophy, that the “properly understood law of contradiction really only says that the same cannot be as the same something and also the opposite thereof, but this does not prevent the same, which is A, being able, as an other, to be not A” (SW I/8, p. 213–4). One aspect of being, the dark force, which he sometimes terms ‘gravity’, is contractive, the other expansive, which he terms ‘light’. Dynamic processes are the result of the interchange between these ultimately identical forces. If they were wholly separate there would either be no manifest universe, because contraction would dominate, or the universe would dissipate at infinite speed because expansion would dominate. The result would be the same: there would not be a world. If something is to be as something it must both be, in the positive sense in which everything else is, which makes it indeterminately positive, pronominal, and it must have a relationship to what it is not, in order to be determinate, which brings it into the realm of predication by taking it beyond itself. In the WA the One comes into contradiction with itself and the two forces constantly vie with each other. Differences must, however, be grounded in unity, as otherwise they could not be manifest at all as differences. The ground is now increasingly regarded as the source of the transitory nature of everything particular, and less and less as the source of tranquil insight into how we can be reconciled to finite existence. The mood of the WA is summed up in Schelling’s reference to the “veil of melancholy which is spread over the whole of nature, the deep indestructible melancholy of all life” (SW I/7, p. 399). The source of this melancholy is that everything finite must ‘go to ground’ and that we are aware of this. Awareness thus both makes sense of things and yet is also what is underpinned by a negativity it must constantly seek to come to terms with.

The abandonment of his residual Spinozism leads Schelling to a growing concern with the tensions which result from contradictions that are also embodied in human beings. The ages of the world are constituted by the development of forms and structures in the material and the mental world. This development depends upon the expanding force’s interaction with the contracting force’s slowing of any expansion, which allows transient but determinate forms to develop. This process also gives rise to language, which Schelling regards as the model for the development of the whole world because it manifests how expansion and the release of tension can lead to intelligibility, rather than mere dissipation:

It seems universal that every creature which cannot contain itself or draw itself together in its own fullness, draws itself together outside itself, whence e.g. the elevated miracle of the formation of the word in the mouth belongs, which is a true creation of the full inside when it can no longer remain in itself. (WA I, p. 56–7)

Language as ‘contracted’ material signifier, and ‘expanding’ ideal meaning repeats the basic structure of the WA, and Schelling insists that, like the material world without the ‘ideal’ capacity for expansion, language can become ‘congealed’. This interaction between what is contained in itself and what draws something beyond itself is also what gives rise to consciousness, and thus to an inherent tension within consciousness, which can only be itself by its relation to an other. Hegel uses a related model of subjectivity, but Schelling will come to reject Hegel’s model for its failure to confront the ultimately irresolvable tension in all subjectivity. Schelling’s later philosophy will present a subject whose origin prevents it from ever achieving the ‘self-presence’ that Hegel tries to explicate by setting out the complete structure of ‘self-reflection’ in the other. Schelling’s WA philosophy is never completed: its Idealist aim of systematically unifying subject and object by comprehending the real development of history from the very origins of being founders on problems concerning the relationship between philosophical system and historical contingency which do not admit of solutions. Furthermore, the structures he develops lead him to ideas which take him beyond Idealism and make him one of the crucial precursors of existential and other non-Idealist forms of modern philosophy.

5. Positive and Negative Philosophy, and the Critique of Hegel

Schelling has often been understood as providing the transitional ‘objective idealist’ link between Fichte and Hegel. By regarding Hegel’s system as the culmination of German Idealism this interpretation fails to do justice to Schelling’s real philosophical ambitions. Many of these insights, particularly in the later philosophy (1827–1854), directly and indirectly influenced the ideas of thinkers, such as Feuerbach, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Heidegger, and Adorno, who were critical of Hegel’s claim to articulate a complete philosophical system.

The differences between Hegel and Schelling derive from their respective approaches to understanding the absolute. For Hegel the absolute is the result of the self-cancellation of everything finite, whose mode of being is precisely to change into something different. Philosophy can therefore articulate the nature of the absolute by an account of how finite determinations are always transcended. This takes the form of the ‘negation of the negation’, in a system whose end comprehends its beginning. For Hegel the result becomes known when the beginning negates itself as being ‘in itself’ to becomes being ‘for itself’ at the end of the system, thus in a process in which it reflects itself to itself by becoming other to itself. Schelling already becomes publicly critical of Hegel while working on a later version of the WA philosophy in Erlangen in the 1820s, but makes his criticisms fully public in lectures given in Munich in the 1830s, and in the 1840s and 1850s as professor in Berlin. The aim of the Idealist systems was for thought to reflect what it is not — being — as really itself, even as it appears not to be itself, thereby avoiding Kant’s dualism. The issue between Schelling and Hegel is whether the grounding of reason by itself is not in fact a sort of philosophical narcissism, in which reason admires its reflection in being without being able fully to articulate its relationship to that reflection. Like Hegel, Schelling argues that it is not the particular manifestation of knowledge which tells me the truth about the world, but rather the necessity of moving from one piece of knowledge to the next. However, a logical reconstruction of the process of knowledge can, for Schelling, only be a reflection of thought by itself. The real process cannot be described in philosophy, because the cognitive ground of knowledge and the real ground, although they are inseparable from each other, cannot be shown to reflect each other.

Dieter Henrich characterises Hegel’s conception of the absolute as follows: “The absolute is the finite to the extent to which the finite is nothing at all but negative relation to itself” (Henrich 1982, p. 82). Hegel’s system depends upon showing how each particular way of conceiving of the world has an internal contradiction. This necessarily leads thought to more comprehensive ways of grasping the world, until the point where there can be no more comprehensive way because there is no longer any contradiction to give rise to it. The very fact of the finite limitations of empirical thought therefore becomes what gives rise to the infinite, which, in Hegel’s terms, is thought that is bounded by itself and by nothing else.

Schelling accepts such a conception, to which he substantially contributed in his early philosophy, as the way to construct a ‘negative’ system of philosophy, because it explains the logic of change, once there is a world to be explained. The conception does not, though, explain why there is a developing world at all, but merely reconstructs in thought the necessary structure of development on the basis of necessities in thought. Schelling’s own attempt at explaining the world’s ontological and historical facticity will lead him to a ‘philosophical theology’ which traces the development of mythology and then of Christian revelation in his Philosophy of Mythology and Philosophy of Revelation, which, like all his substantial works after 1811, are not published in his lifetime. The failure of his philosophical theology does not, though, necessarily invalidate his philosophical arguments against Hegel. His alternative to the “common mistake of every philosophy that has existed up to now” — the “merely logical relationship of God to the world” (System der Weltalter, p. 57) — Schelling terms ‘positive philosophy’. The ‘merely logical relationship’ entails a reflexivity, in which the world necessarily follows from the nature of God, and God and the world are therefore the ‘other of themselves’. Hegel’s system tries to obviate the facticity of the world by understanding reason as the world’s immanent self-articulation. Schelling, in contrast, insists that human reason cannot explain its own existence, and therefore cannot encompass itself and its other within a system of philosophy. We cannot, he maintains, make sense of the manifest world by beginning with reason, but must instead begin with the contingency of being and try to make sense of it with the reason which is only one aspect of it and which cannot be explained in terms of its being a representation of the true nature of being.

Schelling contends that the identity of thought and being cannot be articulated within thought, because thought must presuppose that they are identical in a way which thought, as one side of a relation, cannot comprehend. By redefining the ‘concept’ in such a way that it is always already both subject and object, Hegel aims to avoid any presuppositions on either the subject or the object side, allowing the system to complete itself as the ‘self-determination of the concept’. Schelling presents the basic alternative as follows:

For either the concept would have to go first, and being would have to be the consequence of the concept, which would mean it was no longer absolute being; or the concept is the consequence of being, then we must begin with being without the concept. (SW II/3, p. 164)

Hegel attempts to merge concept and being by making being part of a structure of self-reflection, rather than the basis of the interrelation between subject and object. In Schelling’s terms, Hegel therefore invalidly assumes that ‘essence’, what we know of things, which is one side of the relationship between being and essence, can articulate its identity with the other side in the ‘concept’, because the other side is revealed as being ‘nothing’ until it has entered into a relationship which makes it determinate as a knowable moment of the whole process. For Hegel, on the other hand, Schelling has to invoke being as something immediate: this means it must be wholly opaque, and so is equivalent to nothing.

The problem which Hegel does not overcome is that the identity of essence and being cannot be known, because, as Schelling claims of his concept of being, “existing is not here the consequence of the concept or of essence, but rather existence is here itself the concept and itself the essence” (SW II/3, p. 167). The problem of reflection cannot be overcome in Hegel’s manner: identifying one’s reflection in a mirror as oneself (understood now as a metaphor for essence) entails, as we saw above, a prior non-reflexive moment if one is to know that the reflection is oneself, rather than a random reflected object. How far Schelling moves from any reflexive version of identity philosophy is evident in the following from the Introduction to the Philosophy of Revelation or Foundation of the Positive Philosophy of 1842–3:

our self-consciousness is not at all the consciousness of that nature which has passed through everything, it is precisely just our consciousness (…) for the consciousness of man is not = the consciousness of nature (…) Far from man and his activity making the world comprehensible, man himself is that which is most incomprehensible. (SW II/3, p. 5–7)

Schelling refuses to allow that reason can confirm its status via its reflection in being:

what we call the world, which is so completely contingent both as a whole and in its parts, cannot possibly be the impression of something which has arisen by the necessity of reason (…) it contains a preponderant mass of unreason. (Grundlegung der positiven Philosophie, p. 99)

The contemporary ramifications of the debate between Schelling and Hegel have been given new significance by the continuing elaboration of ‘non-metaphysical’ readings of Hegel by Robert Pippin and others. If Hegel is really the philosopher who insists that legitimation can only be in terms of the account we can give of how we came to adopt the forms of legitimation of our society, there being no extra-mundane perspective on these forms, how far is he from Schelling’s moves against rationalist metaphysics in his later philosophy? The difference between Hegel and Schelling seems here to lie above all in Schelling’s insistence that one cannot reduce the ways in which we face up to the terrors and irrationality of existence to what can be achieved by a philosophical system that makes sense of negativity by showing it has a rational basis. His attention to art and the unconscious in his early philosophy already suggests this direction in his later thinking.

Schelling is one of the first philosophers seriously to begin the critique of the model of metaphysics based on the idea of true representation, a critique which can be seen as one of the key aspects of modern philosophy from Heidegger to the later Wittgenstein and beyond. He is, at the same time, unlike some of his successors, committed to an account of human reason which does not assume that reason’s incapacity to ground itself should lead to an abandonment of rationality or the reduction to reason to the exercise of power, in the manner of Nietzsche. This is one of the respects in which Schelling has again become part of contemporary philosophical debate, where the need to seek means of legitimation which do not rely on the notion of a rationality inherent in the world remains a major challenge. Above all, Schelling’s account of mind and world, particularly his insistence on the need not to limit our conception of nature to what can be objectified by scientific methods, is, in the light of the ecological crisis, proving to be more durable than his reception might until recently have suggested. The question Schelling still poses is how the capacity for expanding human knowledge and control of nature can be reconciled with sustainable ways of inhabiting that nature.

6. The Schelling Revival

Philosophical responses to Schelling in the German-speaking world during the post-War era form a fairly continuous tradition, with perhaps the main innovations being Frank 1975 and Schulz 1975, which shift some of the focus of research towards his late philosophy and the critique of Hegel. In the English-speaking world, in contrast, a wider reception of Schelling only really got underway in the 1990s. This was manifested in a considerable increase in the number of books and articles on, and translations of Schelling, and in the foundation of the American Schelling Society. The decisive shift here was the claim that, rather than being, as he largely had been in Anglophone philosophy, a stage on the path from Kant, via Fichte, to Hegel, Schelling actually opens up aspects of modern philosophy which are independent of Hegelianism, and can challenge Hegel’s systematic philosophy (Bowie 1993). As Bowie showed, Schelling can therefore be brought into productive connection with a range of philosophers, such as Heidegger, Derrida, and others who have been influential in debates about the nature and aims of modern philosophy. The ensuing reception of Schelling was given a boost by Zizek (1997), which shows how Schelling’s philosophy relates closely to aspects of Lacan that form the focus of Zizek’s previous work on Hegel. Since then the growing Schelling reception has taken divergent paths, which reflect the perennially contested nature of Schelling interpretation. This reception involves some paradigmatic differences, of the kind that ensue from conflicting ways of approaching texts from the history of philosophy, from historicist reconstruction, to using the texts to question prevailing contemporary positions in philosophy in the way the Anglophone reception of Hegel by Brandom, McDowell, Pippin, and others has done. These differing approaches have offered new perspectives on the theological and other sources of Schelling’s philosophy, detailed historical and philosophical analysis of the finer detail of work from differing periods, Schelling’s role in the genesis of psychoanalysis (see, particularly, Ffytche [sic] (2012), which gives an exemplary historical, philosophical, and psychological account of the issue), and competing claims as to what constitutes the essence of Schellingian philosophy.

The bibliography below gives an indication of the basic content of some of the books that have appeared as part of the Schelling revival. The tensions between the approaches in these books both point to key issues in the understanding of Schelling’s philosophy, and involve difficulties that are inseparable from engagement with the history of philosophy. The attempt to interpret philosophy from the past demands an adequate reconstruction of the way philosophical issues were constituted in the era of the philosopher in question, on the assumption that philosophy, in various ways, is constituted dialogically. Schelling’s relationship to Kant and Fichte suggests what is at issue here, and raises the further issue that how Kant and Fichte themselves are interpreted repeats the same problem. At the same time, if Schelling is to be seen as contributing to our contemporary philosophical understanding, such contextual reconstruction can get in the way of interpretations which build critically on his work with a view to using it to illuminate the present. Examples of such issues are examined below in relation to some characteristic recent contributions to the Schelling literature.

Some of Schelling’s most important philosophical concerns relate to the modern understanding of nature, which is, of course, dominated by unparalleled advances in the natural sciences. One of the reasons Schelling came to be neglected was in part because his conception of nature in the Naturphilosophie was seen as being overtaken by those sciences. The revival of interest in Schelling relates not least to the realisation that what is now seen in terms of the ecological crisis can be interpreted in ways which suggest the kind of alternative conception of humankind’s relationship to nature paradigmatically present in Schelling’s objection to Fichte: ‘in the last analysis what is the essence of his whole opinion of nature? It is this: that nature should be used […] and that it is there for nothing more than to be used; his principle, according to which he looks at nature, is the economic teleological principle’ (SW I/7 p. 17). Jason Wirth argues that the industrialised world’s likely leading to the sixth Great Extinction event ‘opens a space to appreciate the radicality of Schelling’s ethical and ontological efforts to respond to the positivism and anthropocentrism at the heart of the ecological crisis’ (Wirth 2015: xv). He does so on the assumption that ‘the basic case for Schelling’s intrinsic interest and contemporary relevance has been made (xi), so that we can move beyond ‘explication’ to ‘develop the fundamental issues at stake in his thought’ (ibid.).

The danger here is that such development can lead to wide-ranging claims for Schelling that don’t always take adequate account of other approaches to the issues. How far is Schelling’s ‘retrieval of the question of nature’ (6) dependent on precisely those aspects of his Naturphilosophie which came to be widely rejected, and how can that philosophy be interpreted so that the reasons for that rejection are overcome? Whether it can be justified by metaphysical argument or not, seeing nature in Kant’s ‘formal’ sense as a ‘system of necessary laws’ is a plausible way of characterising one key assumption on which the investigations of the modern sciences are based. If that were all that is to be said about nature, there would be no point in trying to revive Schelling’s undoubtedly fruitful views on nature as a ‘productivity’, but neither can Schelling’s conception be used as a wholesale alternative that somehow obviates the ‘formal’ sense of nature.

Wirth maintains ‘Schelling’s nature from the perspective of its own living or wild ground – is no longer surrounding us as a place in which are located. We are the earth’s bio-regions’ (22). Hamilton Grant (2005) can be seen as seeking to cash in such a claim: ‘it is an argument of this book, as it was of Schelling’s, that metaphysics cannot be pursued in isolation from physics. To do so entails the reconstruction not only of Schelling’s naturephilosophy, therefore, but the repairing of the context from which it begins’ (2005: 8). Hamilton Grant provides a wealth of instructive historical detail from that context, but then infers from it that ‘the enemy in all this is all post-Cartesian European philosophy’s elimination of the concept, even the existence, of nature, a deficiency common equally to Kant and the postkantians’ (viii). It seems, though, hard to square this kind of totalising claim with aspects, especially of the early Marx and the Frankfurt School, for example, who were directly and indirectly influenced by Schelling.

Any analysis of the issues here must take account of their relation to the effects of political economy on how nature comes to be understood, otherwise the philosophical perspective can actually obscure key aspects of the issue of nature in modernity. There are evidently important issues here, and both Wirth and Hamilton Grant offer interesting philosophical and historical perspectives on aspects of them, but they do so at the risk of making claims that rely on a limited, exclusively philosophical perspective: ‘the present work asserts firstly that Schellingianism is resurgent every time philosophy reaches beyond the Kant-inspired critique of metaphysics, its subjectivist-epistemological transcendentalism, and its isolation of physics from metaphysics’ (5), and this entails ‘the systematic undoing of the critical revolution’ (6). It perhaps makes more sense, however, to suggest that a resurgence of ‘Schellingianism’, in the sense of radical questioning of humankind’s relationship both to internal and external nature, comes about when the concrete forms of that relationship, as they do in the contemporary ecological crisis, result in real historical breakdown. Whether a metaphysical account building on Schelling’s idea of nature as productivity rather than product, or on the primacy of being before reflection can do more than add to an already existing concrete historical revelation of the blindness of certain influential forms of philosophy to alternative views of nature depends on how one now sees the tasks of philosophy in the face of that breakdown.

Further difficulties in the reception of Schelling relate to claims about what the real core of his philosophy is, and these are compounded by the fact that he changed the emphasis, if not necessarily the underlying core, of his philosophy quite radically throughout his career. It might be argued that, rather than seeking to locate Schelling in a framework that is supposed to constitute the essence of his philosophy, one should use his explorations of nature, freedom, language, theology, existence, etc., where they are most fruitful in relation to both historical and contemporary issues. Whistler (2013) and Matthews (2011) both make claims regarding the core of Schelling’s thinking, and thereby, while offering much scholarly and historical insight, and detailed attempts to explicate some of Schelling’s more intractable texts, can also obscure some dimensions of that thinking. Both Whistler and Matthews attend almost exclusively to Schelling’s earlier Naturphilosophie and identity-philosophy.

Whistler claims his ‘book is, […], an attempt to reconstruct Schelling’s philosophy of the time, the Identitätssystem, by means of a focus on the role the symbol plays therein’ (Whistler 2012: vi). The book’s value lies in its cogent and extensive reconstruction and interpretation of some of the detail of that system, which has not been attempted before in English. However, this leads to claims such as the following, that in the Identitätssystem: ‘an absolute system is engendered which has no concern for reference or for the integrity of particular scientific pursuits’ (vii). This claim depends not least on an admittedly sophisticated account of a small part of Schelling’s Philosophy of Art on the nature of language as ‘symbol’ in a specific sense, which sees language as ‘producing’ its object, rather than as a form of representation of a pre-existing world. Language is here essentially performative, as in such things as promises, vows, etc.: ‘Referential language talks about reality more or less accurately; productive language is reality more or less intensely’ (208), so that ‘Meaning is performed in and as being; it is thus wholly immanent to, and ultimately identical with, being’ (201). The ultimate aim of this is to arrive at a new kind of theology: ‘In short, theology must be poietic, not referential — produce God, not refer to him (210).

There is much to be said for seeing language, in Charles Taylor’s terms, as both ‘constitutive’ (poietic), and ‘designative’ (referential), as the tradition from Hamann to Heidegger suggests. It is, though, hard to make sense of a conception that seems so cavalier about how language is also changed by scientific activity that can invalidate previous ways of talking about things. It is noticeable that such problems arise when the goal of a Schelling interpretation is essentially theological. Moreover, concentrating mainly on the early Schelling omits other dimensions of his view of language that can either complement or contradict what ensues from the ideas of the identity philosophy. The later Schelling, for example, asserts: ‘One is almost tempted to say: language itself is only faded mythology, in it is preserved in only abstract and formal differences what mythology preserves in still living and concrete differences’ (SW II/1 p. 52). This sustains the idea of poiesis, but opens up different issues with regard to language’s relation to philosophy and theology.

Matthews also concentrates on the earlier Schelling from a perspective where theology plays a major role, revealing informative connections of the young Schelling’s philosophy to Pietists such as Friedrich Christoph Oetinger and Phillip Matthäus Hahn, and offering discussions of how Schelling moves away from Kant. However, the dangers of a theological interpretation of Schelling are already apparent in Matthews’ agenda: ‘The speculative thesis of this work is that there exists in the work of Schelling a possible schema for a new configuration of unity and freedom capable of overcoming the destructive void of contemporary philosophy’ (Matthews 2011: 27). This supposedly new configuration involves: ‘the realization of nature in its sacred status as the deity externalized, the spirit of the divine made flesh’ (30). What is at issue is supposed to be manifest in the experience of art that transcends the ‘static categories of the understanding’ (22): ‘it is precisely this experience, this sublime realization of the oneness of our natures, which overcomes our alienation and redeems us, making us whole again with our nature’ (34). These rather grandiose claims may have made some sense during the period of the early Schelling, but invocation of ‘a telos that requires humans to act and order their lives so as to best express the harmony of the universe’ (69) seems to ignore the subsequent developments of modernity in science and technology, which manifests anything but the ‘harmony of the universe’.

Using theologically based interpretation of philosophy from the past while seeking to circumvent the political, social, and scientific experience of the modern era too easily suggests avoidance rather than confrontation of the contradictions of that era. Such an approach can really only invoke Schelling if one keeps to his early work, and it is notable that Matthews’s does not mention the effects of Jacobi and the early Romantics even on the early Schelling’s project, which make it hard to think of Schelling solely in terms of a theological harmony. The claim that the early Schelling involves the idea that ‘our way of thinking does, in this regard, actually manifest the structure of nature’ (183) also ignores Schelling’s later existential claims, such as the following: ‘our self-consciousness is not at all the consciousness of that nature which has passed through everything, it is precisely just our consciousness … for the consciousness of man is not = the consciousness of nature…. Far from man and his activity making the world comprehensible, man himself is that which is most incomprehensible (SW II/3 pp. 5–7). If even Schelling himself comes to question a theologically directed harmonisation of humankind’s relationship to the world, it seems questionable to construct an account of Schelling based wholly on the idea of such harmonisation.

McGrath (2021) also takes a predominantly theological approach, but this time in an extensive and informative examination of Schelling’s late philosophy: ‘What is ultimately at stake in the Schelling–Hegel dispute, then – and this is still not sufficiently recognised by the new generation of scholars of German idealism – is the philosophical interpretation of Christianity, or as I will put it in this work, the interpretation of the end of Christianity’ (McGrath 2021: 6). The essential tension in philosophical interpretation of Schelling McGrath points to is suggested when he cites Markus Gabriel’s deflationary understanding of ‘God’ in Schelling: ‘For Schelling, it is crucial to note that “God” refers to nothing more or less than the incessant and polymorphous becoming of intelligibility. God is sense, the almost trivial fact that the ways we access the world (our sense-making practices, which generate fields of sense) belong to the world itself’ (Gabriel 2015: 82). McGrath, in contrast, talks in terms of: ‘An absolute future when pantheism will be real, when God will actually be everything, without any diminishment of the reality of individual things, the eventfulness of time or the freedom of the human being – this is the master-thought of the late Schelling’ (McGrath 2021: 65).

There can be no philosophical argument that could substantiate such a vision, and this suggests where the philosophy/theology division becomes decisive in Schelling interpretation. McGrath has to rely on faith: ‘By a theology of revelation I mean a theology which assumes, not blind fidelity to authoritatively pronounced propositions, but an ordinary intellect “illumined” by faith’ (11). This leads, rather as it does in Matthews, to some fairly grandiose claims: ‘I mean to outline, elaborate and evaluate the logical, moral and existential arguments Schelling offers us for assuming revelation as an explanation for nature, the human situation and history’ (14), and ‘Schelling is proposing that the New Testament should be taken as offering us knowledge of ultimate things, knowledge that can and should be appropriated by philosophy in a post-Kantian register’ (30). One’s response to this will depend very much on one’s relationship to theology, but interpretations such as the following can make one wary of trying to actualise Schelling’s philosophy from a theological perspective: ‘Justice and a flourishing human civilisation will only be achieved via a universal experience of the redeeming God – this is the social-political upshot of the Philosophy of Revelation’ (240). The undeniable virtues of McGrath’s book lie in the wealth of detailed exploration of Schelling’s later texts, in his investigation of the distinction between negative and positive philosophy and its relationship to the critique of Hegel, and in his clarification of the idea of a ‘philosophical religion’ that is to be achieved via positive philosophy: ‘positive philosophy is the experience of the eventfulness of history, the disclosure, which can only be empirical, of meaningful history’ (50–1).

What the recent philosophical and theological takes on Schelling can be said to share is their insistence on his widening the scope of ‘meaning’ beyond a semantic view, to include all the ways in which the world is disclosed to us. Gabriel focuses on the Philosophy of Mythology, and he sets himself an essentially philosophical agenda in which it is read as a ‘combination of three approaches, an ontotheological, an anthropological, and one based on the history of self-consciousness’ (Gabriel 2006: 6), such that ‘One can see in Schelling’s thinking the attempt to shift the anthropological component of cognition into the centre of the founding of metaphysics’ (23). His ‘concept of the history of religion as the history of self-consciousness is constitutive for the whole of the Philosophy of Mythology’ (52). Whereas modern natural scientific understanding sees meaning in terms of semantic relations between language and a world of physical objects: ‘Mythological consciousness […] does not exclusively inhabit a world of meaning, but rather a world of meaningfulness’ (31). Schelling therefore, in a manner that is echoed in certain respects by Heidegger, ‘seeks to oppose modern [scientistic] consciousness via the proof that it arose from mythological consciousness’ (31).

As such, what differentiates Schelling’s ‘history of self-consciousness’ from Hegel’s is that from his early philosophy onwards ‘the last thing for Schelling is always the admission that self-consciousness comes up against a ground that precedes it which it has itself not posited’ (472–3). In the System of Transcendental Idealism this is what leads to art being the culmination of the system, and, in the late philosophy, religion as ‘the reference (re-ligio) of consciousness to a being that is not posited by itself’ (473). Although Schelling’s late philosophy seeks to sustain the idea of a positive philosophy as ‘a never completable proof of God’ (474), what remains most significant for contemporary understanding that no longer thinks in theological terms is that ‘our existence is always accompanied by an ineliminable contingency or facticity which corresponds to the fact that the world itself is groundless, even though its contents are necessarily connected to each other’ (475–6). One way of seeing this, as suggested by Bowie (2022), is to focus on the enduring ways in which, as the early Schelling and the early Romantics proposed, aesthetic questions can show limitations in modern philosophy whose predominant focus is epistemological.

Schelling was for a long time seen as a figure of the past. The contributors to the Schelling revival all in some respects seek to revive him for contemporary philosophy, which, as we have seen, can lead to perhaps rather grandiose claims. Such approaches do, though, offer challenges to some dominant ways of doing philosophy, but can at times risk excluding Schelling from more mainstream debate. Frank, as has Gabriel both in the book just discussed and in other work, has shown that it is possible to interpret Schelling in ways which directly affect almost any approach to philosophy, be it European/Continental, or analytic. Frank has recently done so by considering Schelling’s explications, which he returns to in various ways throughout his career, of the ‘identity of nature and spirit/mind [Geist]’ (Frank 2018: X). His conclusion is that ‘Schelling has shown the way out of a thousands of years old spiritualistic philosophy of the subject that is hostile to nature, and brought nature to the same level as spirit/mind’ (269). This might also sound suspiciously grandiose, but Frank both refers in detail to contextual historical sources that have been largely forgotten or neglected, and presents logical and metaphysical reasons for taking Schelling’s explorations of identity seriously with respect to contemporary debates concerning physicalism, reductive naturalism, and the like.

The core idea here is that the very philosophical difficulties still encountered with respect to notions of ‘identity’ may actually themselves be an indication of something important, especially with respect to the relationship between mind and nature. One sense of identity leads, as Leibniz suggested, to the idea that things are only ever strictly identical with themselves, which precludes saying anything that differentiates a thing as something at all; the other sense of identity raises the problem that if things are to be identified – knowledge being otherwise impossible – they must differ from themselves in some sense, which seems paradoxical. Schelling therefore thinks that ‘both sameness (‘Einfachheit’) and difference – thus something like self-differentiation – have to be assumed in the thought of identity’ (109).

Frank traces the history of the notion of ‘reduplicative identity’ and its adoption by Schelling to explicate what makes this idea plausible. This leads to the following: ‘For identity is after all a symmetrical relationship […] For this reason it is meaningless to call an identity theory more “idealist/mentalist” than “materialist”. It is neither of the two and both at once, as Schelling so neatly puts it’ (224). The basic position is summed up as follows:

‘Spirit/mind and nature are One’ is understood as: There is an X, and this X is on the one hand A (spirit/mind), and on the other B (nature). B as B is not ‘the same’ (‘einerlei’) as A; and A as A is not the same as B. The identity of the two rests on their being-equally-sustained-in-being by X (or absolute being) (211).

In the terms of contemporary philosophical debate: ‘Types of mental and types of neuronal states are not in themselves – or not metaphysically – different (namely not to the extent which they are sustained by X. They are only different from a conceptual (or epistemological) perspective’ (232). In such a relation of identity ‘two different but equally rigid designations’ are involved, ‘each of which could be sufficient to adequately determine the object and which both apply to the same thing (X)’ (252–3). Identity of nature and spirit therefore ‘appears (as opposed to logical freedom from contradiction) to include in it a kind of difference’ (251).

This position can be seen as avoiding both the kind of questionable bracketing of modern natural science seen in some of the metaphysical/theological accounts considered above, and the kind of reductive physicalism and scientism that plays too much of a role in certain parts of neuroscience-oriented analytical philosophy. A Schellingian account of identity resists any attempt to reduce the ways in which meaning arises in the world, such reductions being characteristic of philosophy which sees cognitive control as its major concern. Axel Hutter suggests one implication of this when he talks of how Schelling reveals

the decisive state of affairs for modern history, that the modern impulse for emancipation has turned into its opposite in being carried out concretely in history. Modern thought falls prey, after it has emancipated itself from external attachment to the authority of revelation, which it does completely justifiably, to another power: the ‘nature’ of its cognitive capacity, which it now obeys more blindly than it previously obeyed external authorities (Hutter 1996: 300).

In this sense, Schelling can be seen as inaugurating the idea of a ‘dialectic of Enlightenment’. The freedom that Schelling sees as inseparable from philosophy is the potential to see that wholesale focus on cognitive certainty can, for all the benefits it may offer, become precisely what we need to emancipate ourselves from, because we make sense of the world in many ways which cannot be reduced to cognition. Reason must therefore incorporate a sense of its own fallibility and historicity, because it involves what Schelling terms the ‘dark ground which must nevertheless be the ground of cognition’ (SW I.7: 413). We don’t always deal with needs and impulses, or with the meanings we gain from involvement in the natural world, just by knowing about the needs and about why something appears beautiful, overwhelming, senseless, etc. Instead we may act expressively, seeking sense in ways which cognitive command of the world cannot provide. How much the revival of Schellingian concerns might affect a world in which human relations to nature are evidently in crisis remains to be seen.


Primary Literature: Editions of Schelling’s Work

  • Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph Schelling’s Sämmtliche Werke, [SW], ed. K.F.A. Schelling, I Abtheilung Vols. 1–10, II Abtheilung Vols. 1–4, Stuttgart: Cotta, 1856–61. An easily accessible substantial selection of the complete works has been published, ed. M. Frank, as Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling, Ausgewählte Schriften, 6 Vols., Frankfurt: Suhrkamp 1985.
  • Die Weltalter, [WA], M. Schröter (ed.), Munich: Biederstein, 1946; other versions than the version from 1813 printed in the Sämmtliche Werke.
  • The Historisch-kritische Ausgabe, im Auftrag der Schelling-Kommission der Bayerischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, edited by H. M. Baumgartner, W.G. Jacobs, H. Krings, Stuttgart 1976– this will in time become the new standard edition.
  • Über die Möglichkeit einer Form der Philosophie überhaupt, 1794, (On the Possibility of an Absolute Form of Philosophy), Vom Ich als Prinzip der Philosophie oder über das Unbedingte im menschlichen Wissen, 1795, (Of the I as the Principle of Philosophy or on the Unconditional in Human Knowledge), Philosophische Briefe über Dogmatismus und Kriticismus, 1795, (Philosophical Letters on Dogmatism and Criticism), in The Unconditional in Human Knowledge: Four early essays 1794–6, translation and commentary by F. Marti, Lewisburg: Bucknell University Press, 1980.
  • Abhandlungen zur Erläuterung des Idealismus der Wissenschaftslehre, 1796–7, (Essays in Explanation of the Idealism of the Doctrine of Science).
  • Ideen zu einer Philosophie der Natur als Einleitung in das Studium dieser Wissenschaft, 1797, Ideas for a Philosophy of Nature: as Introduction to the Study of this Science, translated by E.E. Harris and P. Heath, introduction R. Stern, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • Erster Entwurf eines Systems der Naturphilosophie, 1799, (First Plan of a System of the Philosophy of Nature).
  • System des transcendentalen Idealismus, 1800, System of Transcendental Idealism, translated by P. Heath, introduction M. Vater, Charlottesville: University Press of Virginia, 1978.
  • Über den wahren Begriff der Naturphilosophie und die richtige Art, ihre Probleme zu lösen, 1801, (On the True Concept of the Philosophy of Nature and the Right Way to Solve its Problems).
  • Darstellung meines Systems der Philosophie, 1801, (Presentation of My System of Philosophy).
  • Fernere Darstellungen aus dem System der Philosophie, 1802, (Further Presentations from the System of Philosophy).
  • Bruno oder über das göttliche und natürliche Prinzip der Dinge, 1802, (Bruno, or On the Natural and the Divine Principle of Things), translated with an introduction by M. Vater, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1984.
  • Philosophie der Kunst, 1802–3, The Philosophy of Art, Minnesota: Minnesota University Press, 1989.
  • Vorlesungen über die Methode des akademischen Studiums, 1803 (On University Studies), translated E.S. Morgan, edited N. Guterman, Athens, Ohio: Ohio University Press, 1966.
  • Philosophie und Religion, 1804, (Philosophy and Religion).
  • System der gesammten Philosophie und der Naturphilosophie insbesondere, 1804, (System of the Whole of Philosophy and the Philosophy of Nature in Particular).
  • Aphorismen zur Einleitung in die Naturphilosophie, 1806, (Aphorisms as an Introduction to the Philosophy of Nature).
  • Aphorismen über die Naturphilosophie, 1806, (Aphorisms on the Philosophy of Nature).
  • Über das Verhältnis der bildenden Künste zur Natur, 1807, (On the Relationship of the Fine Arts to Nature).
  • Philosophische Untersuchungen über das Wesen der menschlichen Freiheit und die damit zusammenhängenden Gegenstände, 1809, (Of Human Freedom), translation with critical introduction and notes by J. Gutmann, Chicago: Open Court, 1936.
  • Briefwechsel mit Eschenmayer, 1810, (Correspondence with Eschenmayer).
  • Stuttgarter Privatvorlesungen, 1810, (Stuttgart Private Lectures).
  • Die Weltalter, 1811–15, (The Ages of the World), translated with introduction and notes by F. de W. Bolman, Jr., New York: Columbia University Press, 1967. The Abyss of Freedom/Ages of the World, trans. Judith Norman, with an essay by Slavoj Žižek, Ann Arbor: The University of Michigan Press, 1997.
  • Über die Gottheiten von Samothrake, 1815, Schelling’s Treatise on ‘The Deities of Samothrace’, translation and introduction by R.F. Brown, Missoula, Mont.: Scholars Press, 1977.
  • Initia Philosophiae Universae, 1820–1, ed. H. Fuhrmans, Bonn: Bouvier, 1969.
  • Über die Nature der Philosophie als Wissenschaft, 1821, (On the Nature of Philosophy as a Science).
  • System der Weltalter, 1827–8, (System of the Ages of the World), ed. S. Peetz, Frankfurt: Klostermann, 1990.
  • Einleitung in die Philosophie, 1830, (Introduction to Philosophy), ed. W. E. Ehrhardt (Schellingiana 11), Stuttgart: Frommann-Holzboog, 1989.
  • Grundlegung der positiven Philosophie, 1832–3, (Foundations of the Positive Philosophy), ed. H. Fuhrmans Turin: Bottega d’Erasmo, 1972.
  • Zur Geschichte der neueren Philosophie, probably 1833–4, On the History of Modern Philosophy, translation and introduction by A. Bowie, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • Philosophie der Offenbarung, 1841–2, (Philosophy of Revelation), ed. M. Frank, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1977.
  • Philosophie der Mythologie, 1842, (Philosophy of Mythology).
  • Philosophie der Offenbarung, 1842–3, (Philosophy of Revelation). Part translation in The Grounding of Positive Philosophy ed. and trans. B. Matthews, Albany: SUNY Press.
  • Philosophische Einleitung in die Philosophie der Mythologie oder Darstellung der reinrationalen Philosophie, between 1847 and 1852, (Philosophical Introduction to the Philosophy of Mythology or Presentation of the Purely Rational Philosophy).

Secondary Literature

  • Beach, Edward A., 1994, The Potencies of the God(s): Schelling’s Philosophy of Mythology, Albany: SUNY Press.

    [Account of the late philosophy.]

  • Bowie, A., 1990, Aesthetics and Subjectivity: from Kant to Nietzsche, Manchester: Manchester University Press, reprinted 1993, completely revised edition 2003.

    [Chapter on Schelling which characterises him in relation to Hölderlin and to Romantic and post-Romantic theories of aesthetics, and as a theorist of subjectivity who does not rely on the idea of self-presence.]

  • –––, 1993, Schelling and Modern European Philosophy: An Introduction, London: Routledge.

    [The first full-length account of Schelling in English to consider him as a major philosopher in his own right, rather than as a pendant to Hegel. Connects Schelling to issues in contemporary analytical and European philosophy.]

  • ––––, 2022, Aesthetic Dimensions of Modern Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

    [How seeing art as a kind of philosophy, and philosophy as a kind of art, in the manner Schelling does in the System of Transcendental Idealism can reorient contemporary philosophy.]

  • Bruno, G.A. (ed.), 2020, Schelling’s Philosophy. Freedom, Nature, and Systematicity, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

    [Useful collection of essays on the main phases of Schelling's philosophy.]

  • Buchheim, T., 1992, Eins von Allem. Die Selbstbescheidung des Idealismus in Schellings Spätphilosophie, Hamburg: Meiner.

    [Argues, against Walter Schulz, that the key to the late Schelling is the positive philosophy’s rejection of idealism, on the basis of ‘unprethinkable’ being’s resistance to incorporation into a philosophical system.]

  • Fenichel, T. 2019, Schelling, Freud, and the Philosophical Foundations of Psychoanalysis, London, NY: Routledge.

    [Schelling and Freud, the relationship between philosophy and psychoanalysis.]

  • Fichte, J.G., 1971, Werke I, Berlin: de Gruyter.

    [See § 1.]

  • Ffytche, M., 2012, The Foundation of the Unconscious. Schelling, Freud and the Birth of the Modern Psyche, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

    [Schelling’s role in the origins of psychoanalysis.]

  • Frank, M., 1975, Der unendliche Mangel an Sein, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp.

    [The classic modern account of Schelling’s critique of Hegel: a dense and very difficult, but indispensable work.]

  • –––, 1985, Eine Einführung in Schellings Philosophie, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp.

    [A detailed account of Schelling’s early work until the end of the identity philosophy: see §2.]

  • –––, 1991, Selbstbewußtsein und Selbsterkenntnis, Stuttgart: Reclam.

    [Contains a vital essay on Schelling’s identity theory, ‘Identität und Subjektivität’, which sees the theory as a major event in Western philosophy. The main idea of the essay is further developed in Frank, 2018.]

  • –––, 2018, ‘Reduplikative Identität’. Der Schlüssel zu Schellings reifer Philosophie, Stuttgart, Bad Cannstadt: Frommann Holzbog.

    [Detailed examination of the question of identity of nature and spirit in Schelling in relation to other philosophical theories of identity.]

  • –––, 1975a, with Kurz, G., Materialien zu Schellings philosophischen Anfängen, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp.

    [Essays on various aspects of Schelling’s philosophy between 1795 and 1804, with accompanying historical material.]

  • Hamilton Grant, I., 2008, Philosophies of Nature After Schelling, London: Continuum.

    [Reassessment of Schelling’s views of nature in relation to themes in contemporary European/Continental philosophy.]

  • Heidegger, M., 1971, Schellings Abhandlung über das Wesen der menschlichen Freiheit, Tübingen: Niemeyer.

    [Dense and difficult, but essential commentary on Schelling’s On the Essence of Human Freedom, with material from later lectures by Heidegger. See §3.]

  • –––, 1991, Die Metaphysik des deutschen Idealismus (Schelling), Frankfurt: Klostermann.

    [After the positive account in Heidegger (1971) the claim here is that Schelling is, after all, another example of the ‘Western metaphysics’ which culminates in Nietzsche’s ‘will to power’. Difficult and clearly flawed, because it ignores the late work altogether.]

  • Henrich, D., 1982, Selbstverhältnisse, Stuttgart: Reclam.

    [Important essays on Schelling, Hegel and modern philosophy.]

  • Heuser-Kessler, M.-L., 1986, ‘Die Produktivität der Natur’, Schellings Naturphilosophie und das neue Paradigma der Selbstorganisation in den Naturwissenschaften, Berlin: de Gruyter.

    [Claims that Schelling’s philosophy of nature can be linked to developments in non-linear dynamics and to the theory of self-organising systems.]

  • Hogrebe, W., 1989, Prädikation und Genesis. Metaphysik als Fundamentalheuristik im Ausgang von Schellings ‘Die Weltalter’, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp.

    [A brilliant, but demanding account of the WA as a theory of predication, which uses the tools of analytical philosophy to show how consistent much of Schelling’s position is.]

  • Hühn, L., 1996, Fichte und Schelling oder: über die Grenze menschlichen Wissens, Stuttgart, Weimar: Metzler.

    [Examination of the notion of ‘intellectual intuition’ in Fichte’s and Schelling’s accounts of the role of the subject in post-Cartesian philosophy.]

  • Hutter, Axel., 1996, Geschichtliche Vernunft. Die Weiterführung der Kantischen Vernunftkritik in der Spätphilosophie Schellings. Frankfurt a. M.: Suhrkamp Verlag.

    [How Schelling’s later conception of reason involves a ‘dialectic of Enlightenment’.]

  • Jähnig, D., 1966/1969, Schelling. Die Kunst in der Philosophie, 2 volumes, Pfullingen: Neske.

    [Detailed and impressive account of the importance of art for Schelling’s philosophy as a whole.]

  • Jaspers, K., 1955, Schelling: Größe und Verhängnis, Munich: Piper.

    [An interesting, if outdated, account of Schelling’s life and work, which sees Schelling as failing to achieve his philosophical goals.]

  • Kosch, M., 2010, Freedom and Reason in Kant, Schelling, and Kierkegaard, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

    [Detailed discussion of issues in moral philosophy in Schelling’s work after 1809.]

  • Marx, W., 1984, The Philosophy of F.W.J. Schelling: History, System, Freedom, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.

    [General and fairly accessible account, mainly of earlier work by Schelling, as far as On the Essence of Human Freedom.]

  • Matthews, B., 2011, Schelling’s Organic Form of Philosophy. Life as the Schema of Freedom, Albany: State University of New York Press.

    [The development of Schelling’s ideas on nature, freedom and philosophy in his earlier work.]

  • Nasser, D., 2013, The Romantic Absolute: Being and Knowing in Early German Romantic Philosophy, 1795–1804, Chicago: Chicago University Press.

    [Exploration of the meaning of the Absolute in Early German Romanticism, including Schelling.]

  • Nisenbaum, K., 2018, For the Love of Metaphysics. Nihilism and the Conflict of Reason from Kant to Rosenzweig, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

    [Deals with Schellings’s response to the ‘conflict of reason’ that follows from Kant’s philosophy, as a conflict between thinking and acting, or knowing and willing.]

  • Ostaric, L. (ed.), 2014, Interpreting Schelling: Critical Essays, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

    [Collection of essays on themes in Schelling, including a crucial essay on Schelling’s conception of identity by Manfred Frank.]

  • Sandkaulen-Bock, B., 1990, Ausgang vom Unbedingten. Über den Anfang in der Philosophie Schellings, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck and Ruprecht.

    [Excellent account of Schelling’s response to questions posed in particular by Jacobi concerning the grounding of philosophy in the absolute: historically detailed and very thorough on the early work.]

  • Sandkühler, H. J., 1970, Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph Schelling, Stuttgart: Metzler.

    [Contains bibliography, which compliments that of Schneeberger — see below.]

  • ––– (ed.), 1984, Natur und geschichtlicher Prozeß, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp.

    [Selection of essays on the philosophy of nature with useful bibliography of writings on that philosophy.]

  • Schneeberger, G., 1954, Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling. Eine Bibliographie, Bern: Franke.

    [The standard bibliography, to be complimented by those cited above.]

  • Scholz, H. (ed.), 1916, Die Hauptschriften zum Pantheismusstreit zwischen Jacobi und Mendelssohn, Berlin: Reuther and Reichard.

    [Contains most of the key texts by Jacobi in the Pantheism controversy.]

  • Schulz, W., 1975, Die Vollendung des deutschen Idealismus in der Spätphilosophie Schellings, Pfullingen: Neske.

    [The book which reoriented the study of Schelling after World War 2 towards the study of the later work, particularly the Hegel-critique, and linked Schelling to Kierkegaard and Heidegger. Difficult but thought-provoking.]

  • Snow, Dale E., 1996, Schelling and the End of Idealism, Albany: SUNY Press.

    [Excellent, very lucid, account of the early and middle Schelling in particular.]

  • Tilliette, X., 1970, Schelling une philosophie en devenir, Two Volumes, Paris: Vrin.

    [Encyclopedic historical account of the development of Schelling’s work: stronger on general exposition and on theology than on Schelling’s philosophical arguments.]

  • Welchman, A. and Norman, J. (eds.), 2004, The New Schelling, London: Continuum.

    [Mixed collection of essays, including translations of classic essays by M. Frank, and J. Habermas.]

  • Whistler, D., 2013, Schelling’s Theory of Symbolic Language. Forming the System of Identity, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

    [Schelling’s early identity philosophy as important in relation to questions of symbolism and as philosophy in its own right, that has been widely misunderstood.]

  • Wirth, J. M., 2003, The Conspiracy of Life: Meditations on Schelling and His Time, Albany: State University of New York Press.

    [Schelling as a philosopher of life, linked to related conceptions in European and Eastern philosophy.]

  • –––, 2004, Schelling Now: Contemporary Readings, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.

    [Collection of essays linking Schelling to themes in contemporary European/Continental philosophy.]

  • –––, 2015, Schelling’s Practice of the Wild. Time, Art, Imagination, Albany: State University of New York Press.

    [Reflections on Schelling’s views of nature in relation to issues concerning time and the imagination.]

  • White, A., 1983a, Absolute Knowledge: Hegel and the Problem of Metaphysics, Ohio: Ohio University Press.

    [Defends Hegel against Schelling’s critique, but does not take account of the arguments of Frank on the failure of reflection in Hegel.]

  • –––, 1983b, Schelling: Introduction to the System of Freedom, New Haven and London: Yale University Press.

    [Good introduction to Schelling’s work as a whole, which tends to focus, though, on its undoubted weaknesses, at the expense of its strengths.]

  • Zammito, J., 2018, The Gestation of German Biology: Philosophy and Physiology from Stahl to Schelling, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

    [On Schelling’s role in the emergence of modern biology.]

  • Žižek, S., 1996, The Indivisible Remainder: Essays on Schelling and Related Matters, London: Verso.

    [Sees Schelling as “the first to formulate the post-idealist motifs of finitude, contingency and temporality”, which means that Schelling is the source of key ideas in Žižek which were previously attributed to Hegel.]

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