Nelson Goodman

First published Fri Nov 21, 2014; substantive revision Thu Feb 8, 2024

Nelson Goodman (1906–1998) was one of the most influential twentieth-century American philosophers. Goodman’s philosophical interests ranged from formal logic and the philosophy of science to the philosophy of art. In all these diverse fields Goodman made significant and highly original contributions. Perhaps his most famous contribution is the “grue-paradox”, which points to the problem that in order to learn by induction, we need to make a distinction between projectible and non-projectible predicates. Other important contributions include his description of the technique which would later be called “reflective equilibrium”, his investigation of counterfactuals, his “irrealism”, his development of mereology (with Henry S. Leonard), a nominalistic account of logical syntax (with W.V. Quine), his contribution to the cognitive turn in aesthetics, and his general theory of symbols.

In this article we focus on Goodman’s life, conception of philosophy, philosophy of science, logic, language, and mathematics, and metaphysics. For Goodman’s theory of symbols and philosophy of art see the separate entry on Goodman’s Aesthetics.

1. Life

Henry Nelson Goodman was born on August 7, 1906, in Somerville, Massachusetts (USA), to Sarah Elizabeth (Woodbury) Goodman and Henry L. Goodman. In the 1920s he enrolled at Harvard University and studied under Clarence Irving Lewis (who later became his Ph.D. supervisor), Alfred North Whitehead, Harry Scheffer, W.E. Hooking, and Ralph Barton Perry. Goodman graduated from Harvard in 1928. It took him, however, 12 more years until he finished his Ph.D. in 1941 with A Study of Qualities (SQ). There are several possible reasons for the lateness of his Ph.D. Maybe the most important was that Goodman was Jewish, and therefore not eligible for a graduate fellowship at Harvard (Schwartz 1999; Elgin 2000a; Scholz 2005). He had to work outside the university to finance his studies. From 1928 until 1940, Goodman worked as the director of the Walker-Goodman Art Gallery at Copley Square, Boston. This interest and activity in the artworld is more frequently cited as a reason for the lateness of his Ph.D. During his graduate studies Goodman was also a regular participant in W.V. Quine’s seminars on the philosophy of the Vienna Circle (in particular of Rudolf Carnap). Goodman also worked closely with Henry Leonard, who wrote his Ph.D. at the same time under Alfred North Whitehead’s supervision. After military service, Goodman taught briefly as “instructor in philosophy” at Tufts College, and was then hired as associate professor (1946–51) and later as full professor (1951–64) at the University of Pennsylvania. He served briefly as Harry Austryn Wolfson Professor of Philosophy at Brandeis University (1964–67), finally returning to Harvard in 1968, where he taught philosophy until 1977. At Harvard, he founded Project-Zero, a center to study and improve education in the arts. Besides being an art gallery director as a graduate student, and private art collector throughout his life, Goodman was also involved in the production of three multimedia-performance events, Hockey Seen: A Nightmare in Three Periods and Sudden Death (1972), Rabbit, Run (1973), and Variations: An Illustrated Lecture Concert (1985) (Carter 2000, 2009).

Goodman was more interested in solving philosophical problems than in his celebrity as a philosopher. He authorized only two interviews (Goodman 1980, 2005), did not write an autobiography, and rejected the invitation to be honored with a volume in the prestigious Schilpp Library of Living Philosophers (Elgin 2000a, 2). Sparse bits of information about his personal life can only be gathered from the autobiographies of his contemporaries and their published correspondences (e.g., Quine 1985; Creath 1990) or his obituaries (e.g., Carter 2000; Elgin 1999 (Other Internet Resources), 2000a, 2000b; Elgin et al. 1999; Mitchell 1999; Scheffler 2001; Scholz 2005; Schwartz 1999). Goodman died on November 25, 1998, in Needham, Massachusetts, at the age of 92, after a stroke.

2. Anti-Absolutism

Nelson Goodman’s philosophy synthesizes German/Austrian Logical Empiricism, as developed and practiced by philosophers like Rudolf Carnap and Carl Hempel, with American Pragmatism of the kind practiced and advocated by C.I. Lewis. Goodman, however, departs from both traditions considerably. As we will see, he departs from Lewis’s pragmatism in dismissing the idea of an indubitable given in experience. He departs from logical empiricism in giving up a principled analytic/synthetic distinction.

2.1 The Myth of the Given in Experience

Goodman’s philosophy—especially his epistemology—is usually considered to be in opposition to the philosophy of the Logical Positivists, and of Rudolf Carnap in particular. But this characterization overlooks an important continuity between the philosophy of the Logical Positivists and Goodman’s work. The received view, that Goodman’s main work, The Structure of Appearance was intended as an anti-foundationalist reconception of Carnap’s Der logische Aufbau der Welt (cf. Elgin 2001; Hellman 1977) is particularly misleading here.

In fact, Goodman was quite aware that Carnap’s work was itself anti-foundationalist in the same respect as his. Already in his dissertation thesis A Study of Qualities (which was later developed into The Structure of Appearance), Goodman writes:

[…] Carnap has made it clear that what we take as ground elements [for a constitutional system] is a matter of choice. They are not dignified as the atomic units from which others must be built; they simply constitute one possible starting point. […] In choosing erlebs, Carnap is plainly seeking to approximate as closely as possible what he regards the original epistemological state […] Yet whether it does so or not is no test of the system. […] Hence […] argument concerning whether the elements selected are really primitive in knowledge is extraneous to the major purpose of the system. (SQ, 96–98)

The quote makes it obvious that Goodman himself did not consider his constructionalist approach in A Study of Qualities as an epistemological alternative to Carnap’s. Insofar as criticism of a foundationalist epistemology does play a role in The Structure of Appearance or A Study of Qualities, this criticism was rather directed at the philosophy of C.I. Lewis, who was Goodman’s teacher at Harvard. Lewis indeed held the view that empiricism must presuppose the incorrigibility and indubitability of what is given in experience. According to Lewis, I might need to revise, for example, that I saw a plane crossing the sky when I learn that what I mistook for a plane was Superman. However, nothing can make me revise that there was a blue and a red spot in the center of my visual field that then led to the (false) belief that there was a plane.

A Study of Qualities, on the other hand, begins with the argument that even the simplest judgments of this sort—as the one about a blue and a red spot in the center of my visual field—might be revised in the light of new evidence. My judgment that I had a blue spot in the middle of my visual field a few seconds ago when I looked at a ripe apple under normal conditions might be revised when I now judge that I have a red spot in my visual field, looking at the same object under the same conditions and know that it could not have changed its color. However, if such revisions can be made in retrospect, nothing of the “given” is indubitable or incorrigible. Judgments about qualia, in this sense, are decrees; which judgments are accepted is a matter of the overall coherence of my system of beliefs and my other qualia judgments.

The literal unverifiabilty of such quale-recognition is, nevertheless, in the last analysis beyond question. If I say the green presented by that grass now is the same as the green presented by it at a certain past moment, I cannot truly verify that statement because I cannot revive that past moment. The statement therefore constitutes an arbitrary and supreme decree. But a decree, simply because it is arbitrary, is not therefore necessarily haphazard. My quale-identifications are influenced; I do not feel equally inclined to identify the color presented by the grass now with the color presented by a cherry a moment ago, though such a decree if made would be equally supreme and unchallengeable on strict grounds. We are all much in the same position of absolute but sane monarchs; our pronouncements are law, but we use our heads in making them. (SQ, 17; cmp. SA (2nd ed.), 134)

Also in this respect Goodman is following Carnap and the logical empiricists. C.I. Lewis emphasizes this in his “Logical Positivism and Pragmatism” (Lewis 1941). There he explains that the main difference between the empiricism of the pragmatists and the empiricism of the logical positivists (especially the Carnap of Philosophy and Logical Syntax (1935)) is that the latter were ready to analyze empirical knowledge fully in the so-called “formal mode”. Accordingly, they analyze empirical knowledge as more or less coherent systems of accepted sentences, some of which are “protocols”, some are sentences of mathematics and logic, some are generalizations, etc. In particular, the formal mode would not distinguish between statements such as “This object looks red” and “This object is red”.

For Lewis, this sort of empiricism is not worthy of the name. After all, the experiential element does not seem to show up at all in this kind of formal analysis. Lewis claims instead that a proper empiricism must treat sentences of the form “This looks red.” as special, indubitable statements. We might err when classifying things as being red, but we cannot err when it comes to recognizing things as looking red. This is “the given” in experience, the phenomenal states we find ourselves in when making experiences. Without such an indubitable element, Lewis fears that our epistemology would necessarily collapse into a coherence theory of truth (Lewis 1952). Goodman, on the other hand, is ready to bite that bullet when throwing away the indubitable given. Lewis, the major advocate of pragmatism, comments on this move by Goodman that his “proposal is, I fear, a little more pragmatic than I dare to be” (Lewis 1952, 118).

Indeed, Goodman’s early and later philosophy is anti-foundationalist. This is truly a characteristic of his work on induction, metaphysics, logic and even the languages of art. It should, however, not be interpreted as a counter program to logical positivism. What Goodman did—in all these areas—is better understood as a continuation and enlargement of Carnap’s program. This is obvious if we consider Goodman’s relativism and irrealism. It is also apparent when we think about his pluralism in logic and his insistence that there are more cognitively valuable representation systems than just the sciences, namely the languages of art.

His anti-foundationalism therefore is more than just a restatement that there is no “bedrock” for knowledge—as was argued by Karl Popper and Otto Neurath, but also that there are no fundamental ontological objects, that there are no fundamental logical principles, and that there are no privileged representation systems. All of these echo Rudolf Carnap’s famous Principles of Tolerance (Carnap 1934): tolerance with regards to ontology, to logical principles, and to representation systems in general.

2.2 The Analytic/Synthetic Distinction and Likeness of Meaning

Goodman did, however, considerably depart from the logical positivists in denying the comprehensibility of the analytic/synthetic distinction. This rejection and Goodman’s gradual account of synonymy (or, rather, likeness of meaning) developed out of an exchange of letters between Morton White, Quine, and Goodman, which is also the historical background of Quine’s famous “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” (Quine 1951a).

On 25 May 1947, Morton White wrote a letter to Quine asking for advice on a paper in which he tried to deal with a solution to C.H. Langford’s paradox of analysis proposed by Alonzo Church. White was especially unhappy with Church’s invocation of abstract objects in order to explicate the notion of synonymy. White sent his discontentment with the proposed solution to Quine (White’s original paper appeared in print in 1948 under the title “On the Church–Frege Solution of the Paradox of Analysis”) and then sent Quine’s answer to Goodman. In 1947 the three discussed the matter by letter, until White was eventually chosen to write a survey of their discussion, which appeared in 1950 under the title “The Analytic and the Synthetic: An Untenable Dualism”. Quine presented his view on the matter in an address to the American Philosophical Association, which was published in 1951 as “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” (Quine 1951a).

At that time the postulation of new abstract objects, such as Fregean senses or other intensional objects, in order to explicate a certain notion of synonymy seemed an unacceptable move for someone with nominalist leanings such as Quine and a purist such as White. For Quine, an explication of “synonymy” or “analyticity” and the like should rather be given in behavioristic terms. The explication should tell us in what way “analyticity” and “synonymy” make a difference in speaker behavior. To learn that the difference lies in postulated abstract objects did not seem to explicate the notions in any promising way.

Goodman’s original discontentment with the whole situation was more serious. In a letter to White and Quine he claimed that not only did he find the explications of “synonymy” and “analyticity” so far provided to be problematic, but he did not even understand what these terms were supposed to mean pre-theoretically:

When I say I don’t understand the meaning of “analytic” I mean that very literally. I mean that I don’t even know how to apply the terms. I do not accept the analogy with the problem of defining, say, confirmation. I don’t understand what confirmation is, or let us say projectibility, in the sense that I can’t frame any adequate definition; but give me any predicate and (usually) I can tell you whether it is projectible or not. I understand the term in extension. But “analytic” I don’t even understand this far; give me a sentence and I can’t tell you whether it is analytic because I haven’t even implicit criteria…. I can’t look for a definition when I don’t know what it is I am defining. (Goodman in a letter to Quine and White, 2 July 1947, in White 1999, 347)

Goodman’s remark is instructive, since it undermines a move that Grice and Strawson would later make against Quine’s argumentation in “Two Dogmas of Empiricism”. In their “In Defense of a Dogma” (Grice and Strawson 1956) they argue that Quine’s skepticism about the analytic-synthetic distinction as such is undermotivated in light of our pre-theoretic grasp of the distinction. Goodman’s claim is that there in fact is no such pre-theoretic grasp of the distinction.

The official result of the exchange between White, Goodman, and Quine was that any sharp analytic-synthetic distinction is untenable and should just be abandoned:

I think that the problem is clear, and that all considerations point to the need for dropping the myth of a sharp distinction between essential and accidental predication (to use the language of the older Aristotelians) as well as its contemporary formulation—the sharp distinction between analytic and synthetic. (White 1950, 330)

Goodman’s view on the matter had already appeared in print in 1949 under the title “On Likeness of Meaning”. In this paper Goodman proposes a purely extensional analysis of meaning, the upshot of which is that no two different expressions in a language are synonymous. He discusses several objections to theories of meaning that rely on intensional entities (such as, for example, Fregean senses) to explicate the notion of synonymy in non-circular ways, such that the question of whether two terms are “synonymous” is comprehensible as well as scrutable. Goodman eventually rejects intensional approaches and opts for an extensional theory for sameness of meaning. According to such an extensional theory, two expressions have the same meaning if and only if they have the same extension. This criterion is certainly intelligible, but also scrutable; we can

decide by induction, conjecture, or other means that two predicates have the same extension without knowing exactly all the things they apply to. (PP, 225)

But an extensional theory is, of course, not thereby free of problems. Consider, for example, the expression “unicorn” and “centaur”, which have the same extension (namely the null-extension) but differ in meaning. Hence, whereas sameness of extension is a necessary condition for sameness of meaning, sameness of extension does not seem to be sufficient for sameness of meaning. Goodman proposes an extensional fix to this problem that gives necessary and sufficient conditions for sameness of meaning. He observes that although “unicorn” and “centaur” have the same extension, simply because of the trivial fact that they denote nothing, “centaur-picture” and “unicorn-picture” do have different extensions. Clearly, not all centaur-pictures are unicorn-pictures and vice versa. Thus the flight to compounds makes an extensional criterion possible:

[I]f we call the extension of a predicate by itself its primary extension, and the extension of its compounds as secondary extension, the thesis is as follows: Two terms have the same meaning iff they have the same primary and secondary extensions. (PP, 227)

The primary extensions of “unicorn” and “centaur” are the same (the null-extension), but their secondary extensions do differ: the compounds “unicorn-picture” and “centaur-picture” differ in extension.

If we allow all kinds of compounds equally, we arrive immediately at the result that by our new criterion no two different expressions have the same meaning. Consider the expressions “bachelor” and “unmarried man”: “is a bachelor but not an unmarried man” is a bachelor description that is not an unmarried-man description. Hence, by Goodman’s criterion, the secondary extensions of “bachelor” and “unmarried man” differ because the primary extensions of at least one of their compounds do. Since the same trick can be pulled with any two expressions, Goodman is left with the result that no two different expressions are synonymous, but he is ready to bite this bullet. P-descriptions that are not Q-descriptions are easy to construct for any P and Q (provided these are different terms) and these constructions might well be relatively uninteresting. If only such uninteresting constructs are available to make a difference in secondary extension, P and Q, despite being not strictly synonymous, might be more synonymous than a pair of predicates for which we are able to find interesting compounds (as in the case of “centaur” and “unicorn”). This turns sameness of meaning of different terms into likeness of meaning, and synonymy and analyticity into a matter of degree.

3. Nominalism and Mereology

3.1 Nominalisms

“Nominalism” can refer to a variety of different, albeit related, positions. In most cases, it either refers to the rejection of universals or of abstract objects. What nominalism means for Goodman undergoes two radical changes. In his Ph.D. thesis, A Study of Qualities, he uses the label “nominalist” to describe constructional systems whose constructional basis does not include abstracta, such as Carnap’s system in the Aufbau (Carnap 1928). Whether classes are used in the construction, as Carnap’s Aufbau indeed does, is irrelevant for the characterization of these systems as “nominalist”. Nominalism is not an issue of discussion here; “nominalist” merely occurs as a classification (for more details on constructional systems see section 4 below.)

Goodman first endorses a nominalist position in his famous joint article with W.V. Quine, “Steps Toward a Constructive Nominalism” (1947). Goodman and Quine set the agenda in the very first sentence of the article: “We do not believe in abstract objects”. And they conclude the first paragraph: “Any system that countenances abstract entities we deem unsatisfactory as a final philosophy” (Goodman and Quine 1947, 105).

Goodman and Quine first discuss nominalistically acceptable reductions of platonist statements. “Platonist” here refers to the use of terms for classes, numbers, properties, and relations—in short, anything that is not a concrete particular. The first examples are straightforward and their resolutions are well-known today. “Class \(A\) is included in class \(B\)” can be rendered as “Everything that is an \(A\) is a \(B\)” (where “\(A\)” and “\(B\)” now stand for the appropriate predicates, rather than for classes). “Class \(C\) has two members”, or “The number of \(C\)s is 2”, is rendered as “There are two \(C\)s”, and spelt out formally (based on Bertrand Russell’s theory of definite descriptions—see the discussion in the entry on Russell) as:

\[ \exists x \exists y(x \ne y \land \forall z(Cz \equiv (z = x \lor z = y))) \]

No recourse to classes or other abstract entities (e.g., numbers) is necessary. However, this strategy does not deliver a general recipe to account for statements that are typically expressed in a straightforward set-theoretic way. For instance, it seems to Goodman and Quine that there is no general recipe for expressing statements like “There are more cats than dogs” in a nominalistically acceptable fashion. If the total number of dogs were known, then, in principle, the quantifier strategy above could be used—albeit that, with hundreds of millions of dogs alive today, it would certainly not be practical. Quine and Goodman suggest a translation into the language of mereology with an additional auxiliary predicate “bigger than”; while this provides a surprisingly versatile solution for many cases, it is still not completely general (Goodman and Quine 1947, 110–11). Further, a general definition of the ancestral of a relation (as first given by Gottlob Frege 1879, §26) seemed to Quine and Goodman at the time to be out of reach for the nominalist. Leon Henkin (1962, 188–89) finds an elegant solution, quantifying over lists of successive inscriptions. Goodman later (PP, 153) suggests that his technique to formulate the ancestral of matching (SA, §§IX–X) could also solve the problem. We note that if second-order logic can be made palatable to the nominalist—perhaps by adopting a plural interpretation of second-order logic (Boolos 1984, 1985), or a proof-theoretic semantics, or in any other way—Frege’s original definition (which is not formulated in set theory, but in his version of second-order logic) can be employed (Rossberg and Cohnitz 2009).

Even though these two particularly pressing gaps appear to be capable of being closed, a general recipe for recasting platonist statements appears out of reach, in particular, when we consider statements of pure mathematics itself. Without such a nominalist recasting, Goodman and Quine hold, platonist mathematical statements cannot be deemed intelligible from a strictly nominalist perspective. The question becomes, according to Goodman and Quine,

how, if we regard the sentences of mathematics merely as strings of marks without meaning, we can account for the fact that mathematicians can proceed with such remarkable agreement as to methods and results. Our answer is that such intelligibility as mathematics possesses derives from the syntactical or metamathematical rules governing those marks. (Goodman and Quine 1947, 111)

Goodman and Quine construct a theory of syntax for the set-theoretic language and a proof theory based on the Calculus of Individuals (see section 3.2 below) supplemented with a token-concatenation theory. The tokens in question are concrete, particular inscriptions of the logical symbols, variable-letters, parentheses, and the “\(\in\)” (for set-membership) that are use to formulate the language of set theory. Primitive predicates are introduced to categorize the different primitive symbols: all concrete, particular “\(\in\)”-inscriptions, for instance, fall under the predicate “Ep”. Concrete complex formulae, e.g., “\(x \in y\)”, are concatenations of concrete primitive symbols—in our case the concatenation of “\(x\)” and “\(\in\)” and “\(y\)”. Bit by bit, Goodman and Quine define their way up to which concrete inscriptions count as correctly formed sentences of the language of set theory, and finally which concrete inscriptions count as proofs and theorems. Goodman and Quine argue that in this way the nominalist can explain the “remarkable agreement” of mathematicians mentioned above.

Since Quine and Goodman not only impose nominalistic strictures, but also finitism in their joint article (Quine and Goodman 1947, §2), the syntactic and proof-theoretic notions defined still fall short of the usual platonist counterparts. Even if any given sentence or proof is finite in length, the platonist would hold that there are sentences and proofs of any finite length, and thus sentences and proofs that are too long to have a concrete inscription in a given finite universe. Moreover, there are infinitely many (and indeed uncountably many) truths of mathematics, but—in particular, in a finite universe—there will only ever be finitely many inscriptions of theorems. Even if the universe is in fact infinite, perhaps a theory of syntax and proof should not make itself hostage to this circumstance.

Platonists and nominalists will likely disagree whether Goodman and Quine successfully argue their case in their joint paper. Goodman and Quine will be able to account for any actual mathematical proof and any theorem actually proven, since there are at any stage only finitely many of them, each of which is small enough to fit in our universe comfortably. Thus, arguably, they reach their goal of explaining the agreement in mathematical practice without presupposing mathematical platonism. Due to its finitistic nature, however, the account radically falls short of giving explications that are extensionally equivalent to the platonists’ conceptions (see Rossberg and Cohnitz 2009 for discussion and a landscape of possible solutions). Goodman later (1956) explains that nominalism is not incompatible with the rejection of finitism; it is

at most incongruous […]. The nominalist is unlikely to be a non-finitist only in much the way a bricklayer is unlikely to be a ballet dancer. (PP, 166; on the question of finitism see also MM, 53; Field 1980; Hellman 2001; Mancosu 2005)

Given the ardent pronouncements in the 1947 article with Quine, the common misunderstanding that Goodman’s mature nominalism encompasses, or is motivated by, the rejection of abstract objects is understandable. Nonetheless, it is incorrect. Goodman does not reject all abstract objects: in The Structure of Appearance, he embraces qualia as abstract objects (see section 4 below), some of which (in fact all but moments) are universals (SA, §VII.8). Goodman’s mature nominalism, from The Structure of Appearance onwards, is a rejection of the use of sets (and objects constructed from them) in constructional systems, and no blanket rejection of all universals or abstract particulars. To be sure, Goodman also refuses to acknowledge properties and other non-extensional objects, but the reason for his rejection of such entities is independent, and in fact more fundamental, than his nominalism: it is his strict requirement of extensionality (WW, 95n3; see also section 6 below). Goodman does occasionally include extensionalism in his nominalism (see LA, xiii, 74; under the entry “nominalism” the index of LA references some passage which discusses properties ; see also MM, 51; WW, 10n14). Strictly speaking, however, nominalism for Goodman is the refusal to use class terms in a constructional system—no more, and no less.

Goodman presents two positive considerations for the rejection of a set-theoretic language (not counting the remarks in Goodman and Quine 1947, 105). Methodologically, nominalistic constructions have the advantage that they do not use any resources that the platonist could not accept (Goodman 1958; PP, 171). The advantage of a nominalistic construction is thus one of parsimony:

As originally presented in A Study of Qualities […] the system was not nominalistic. I feel that the recasting to meet nominalistic demands has resulted not only in a sparser ontology but also in a considerable gain in simplicity and clarity. Moreover, anyone who dislikes the change may be assured that the process of replatonizing the system—unlike the converse process—is obvious and automatic; and this in itself is an advantage of a nominalistic formulation. (SA, Original Introduction, page L of the 3rd. ed.; regarding the simplicity remark see SA, §III.7)

All resources employed by the nominalist are (or should be) acceptable to the platonist, while the converse may not be the case (see also Goodman 1956, 31 (PP, 171); MM, 50).

By the time he writes The Structure of Appearance, Goodman has come around to a different criterion for whether or not a system obeys nominalistic structures: the predicates present in the whole system (SA, §II.3). This is as opposed to merely considering the basis of the system in answer to this question as he does in A Study of Qualities (as mentioned above). In Goodman 1958 (see also SA, §III.7), he suggests a different, perhaps more precise, way to characterize nominalistic systems in terms of the system’s generating relation:

System S is nominalistic iff S does not generate more than one entity from exactly the same atoms of S.

Goodman describes the criterion as demanding that “sameness of content” entails identity. Systems that have only mereological means of “generating” composite objects (see section 3.2 Mereology below) count as nominalistic according to this criterion. Parthood is transitive, so from atoms a and b only one further object can be “generated”, the mereological sum of a and b. A set-forming operation, however, will distinguish, for instance, between {a, b} (the set of a and b) and {{a, b}} (the set containing the set of a and b) and {{a}, {b}} (the set containing the singleton set of a and the singleton set of b). None of the these three are pairwise identical. Membership is not transitive. The first and third contain two members, but not the same members (both a and b are members of the first set, but not of the third), while the second set has only one member (namely the first set). All three (and infinitely many others) are generated from the same atoms, however, or as Goodman might put it, they have the same content: a and b. A system featuring a set-theoretic generating relation thus does not count as nominalistic.

The sameness-of-content criterion was criticized by David Lewis (1991, 40) as question-begging. Lewis suggests that the only alternatives for generating relations that Goodman allows are mereological, set-theoretical, or a combination of the two, and that only mereological generation passes the test. Unless one rejects set theory already, Lewis contends, one would not find the criterion plausible. There are, however, non-extensional mereological systems that violate the sameness-of-content criterion as well (see entry on mereology). Moreover, the sameness-of-content criterion may be understood as a version of Ockham’s Razor, demanding not to multiply entities beyond necessity.

3.2 Mereology

The Polish logician Stanisław Leśniewski (1886–1939) must surely count as the father of mereology—the theory of parts and wholes—but around 1930, Goodman re-invents the theory together with his fellow graduate student Henry S. Leonard (1905–1967). Only in 1935 do Goodman and Leonard learn of Leśniewski’s work through one of their fellow students, W.V. Quine (Quine 1985, 122). An early version of Leonard and Goodman’s system is contained in Leonard’s Ph.D. thesis, Singular Terms (Leonard 1930). In 1936, Leonard and Goodman present their mature system at a meeting of the Association of Symbolic Logic; the corresponding paper is published four years later under the title “The Calculus of Individuals and Its Uses” (Leonard and Goodman 1940). Subsequently, Goodman uses the calculus in his own Ph.D. thesis, A Study of Qualities (SQ), and a version of it in The Structure of Appearance (SA). Little is known about the nature of Goodman and Leonard’s cooperation on the calculus. Goodman attributes the first thought for the collaborative project to Leonard (PP, 149). Leonard, more concretely, suggests in a (still) unpublished note:

If responsibilities can be divided in a collaborative enterprise, I believe that it may be fairly stated that the major responsibility for the formal calculus […] was mine, while the major responsibility for discussions of applications […] lay with Goodman. (Leonard 1967)

Quine only mentions that he himself “was able to help them on a technical problem” (Quine 1985, 122). Leonard’s system of Singular Terms is significantly different from, and indeed in philosophically interesting ways weaker than, the Calculus of Individuals (Rossberg 2009), but the exact extent of Goodman’s technical contribution to the calculus remains unknown.

Perhaps surprisingly, nominalistic scruples were not the driving force behind the development the Calculus of Individuals. Instead, their goal is to solve a technical problem in Carnap’s Aufbau (1928) (see section 4 below), and to this end they employ both set-theoretic and mereological notions. Leonard, in his Ph.D. thesis (supervised by Alfred North Whitehead), presents his calculus as “an interpolation in Whitehead and Russell’s Principia Mathematica between *14 and *20” (Leonard 1967), and makes liberal use of class-terms in the formulation (Leonard 1930). Also the joint paper of Leonard and Goodman is formulated using class terms, as is the system Goodman used in his own Ph.D. thesis, A Study of Qualities (1941, SQ). It is not until his joint article with Quine (Goodman and Quine 1947) and his Structure of Appearance (1951, SA) that Goodman eschews the use of set theory to formulate the Calculus of Individuals.

As mentioned above, parthood, as opposed to the set-theoretic notion of membership, is transitive: if a is a part of b and b is a part of c, then a is a part of c. Neither the system Leonard and Goodman present in their 1940 article, nor the version in Goodman’s A Study of Qualities, nor the calculus he uses in The Structure of Appearance, take “part” as primitive. Rather, it is in all three cases defined based on the sole primitive notion adopted: overlap in SA, and discreteness in the other two systems. Overlap can pre-systematically be understood as sharing a part in common; discreteness as sharing no part in common. All three systems indeed define parthood so that these two pre-systematic understandings come out as theorems.

The Calculus of Individuals in all its formulations contains principles of mereological summation and mereological fusion. Mereological summation is a binary function of individuals, so that the sum s of two individuals a and b is such that both a and b, and all their parts, are parts of s—and also all sums of parts of a and b and are parts of s. Mereological fusion is a generalization of the mereological summation. In Leonard and Goodman 1940 fusion is defined using sets: all the members of a set α are “fused” in the sense that they, and all their parts, and all the fusions amongst their parts, end up being parts of the individual that is the fusion of set α.

The technical details of the different versions of the Calculus of Individuals can be found in this supplementary document: The Calculus of Individuals in its different versions (see also entry on mereology).

Unrestricted mereological fusion has been widely criticized as too permissive. It allows for so-called scattered objects (e.g., the sum of the Eiffel Tower and the Moon) and in the case of Goodman’s construction in The Structure of Appearance for sums of radically different kinds of objects, like sounds and colors. W.V. Quine, after endorsing this principle in a joint paper with Goodman (Goodman and Quine 1947), becomes one of its first critics in his review of The Structure of Appearance:

part, clear initially as a spatio-temporal concept, is here understood only by spatio-temporal analogy. […] When finally we proceed to sums of heterogeneous qualia, say a color and two sounds and a position and a moment, the analogy tries the imagination. (Quine 1951b, 559)

Goodman (1956) maintains that the criticism is disingenuous if put forward by a platonist: set-theoretic “composition” is as least as permissive as mereological fusion. Whenever there is a fusion of scattered concrete objects, there is also a set of them (see Simons 1987 or van Inwagen 1990 for prominent criticisms of unrestricted composition).

4. The Structure of Appearance

The Structure of Appearance is perhaps Goodman’s main work, although it is less widely known than, for example, Languages of Art. It is, in fact, a heavily revised version of Goodman’s Ph.D. thesis, A Study of Qualities. SA is a constitutional system, which, just like Rudolf Carnap’s Der logische Aufbau der Welt, shows how from a basis of primitive objects and a basic relation between those objects all other objects can be obtained by definitions alone. We commented above already on the anti-foundationalist nature of both Carnap’s and Goodman’s constitutional systems. For them, the point of carrying out such a construction was not to provide a foundationalist reduction to some privileged basis (of experience or ontology), but rather to study the nature and logic of constitutional systems as such. In this sense, Goodman’s interest in other “world versions”, such as the languages of art, should be seen as a continuation of his project in SA.

4.1 Goodman on Analysis

Because Goodman is interested in the nature and logic of constitutional systems as such, he begins his discussion in The Structure of Appearance with meta-theoretical considerations. Since the project of SA is to develop a constitutional system that defines other notions from a predetermined basis, the question is which conditions of adequacy should be in place for evaluating the definitions. Constitutional systems are systems of rational reconstruction, i.e., the concepts, objects, or truths that get constituted by definition from the basis are supposedly counterparts of concepts, objects or truths that we accept already pre-theoretically.

One might think that such a reconstruction is only successful if definiens and definienda are synonymous. However, Goodman argues that the definiens of an accurate definition need have neither the same intension nor even the same extension as the definiendum; thus, taking as an example Alfred North Whitehead’s analysis of geometrical points, points in space may be defined equally well as certain classes of straight lines or as certain infinite convergent sets of concentric spheres; but these alternative definientia are neither cointensive (synonymous) nor coextensive with each other. A set of sets of straight lines is just not the same set of objects as a set of infinite convergent sets of concentric spheres. Hence, their accuracy notwithstanding, the respective definitions are not coextensive with, let alone synonymous with, the definiendum. Accuracy of constructional definitions amounts to no more than a certain homomorphism of the definiens with the definiendum. This means that the concepts of the constructional system must provide a structural model for the explicanda in the sense that for every connection between entities that is describable in terms of the explicanda, there must obtain a matching connection, stateable in terms of the respective explicata or definientia, among the counterparts that the entities in question have within the system. In this way the two different definitions of “point” serve their purpose equally well. The objects in the sets generated—although being very different in kind—stand in just the right relations to one another within the sets to serve as an explicatum for “point” as geometry demands. This rather pragmatic criterion of adequacy for philosophical analyses serves Goodman well for a number of reasons. The most important is perhaps that Goodman does not believe there was any such thing as identity in meaning of two different expressions (see our discussion of likeness of meaning above). Thus, if synonymy was made the criterion of adequacy, no analysis could ever satisfy it. But relaxing the criteria of adequacy for philosophical analyses to structure-preservation also supports Goodman’s more radical theses in epistemology and metaphysics, especially in his later philosophy. One of his reasons to replace the notion of truth with that of “rightness of symbolic function”, the notion of certainty with that of “adoption”, and the notion of knowledge with that of understanding is the thought that the new system of concepts preserves the structural relations of the old without preserving the philosophical puzzles related to truth, certainty and knowledge (RP, chapter X).

4.2 The Critique of Carnap’s Aufbau

Goodman’s predecessor in studying a constitutional system by the means of modern formal logic is, as we already said, Rudolf Carnap, who follows a very similar project as Goodman in his Der logische Aufbau der Welt (Carnap 1928). In this book Carnap investigates the example of a world built up from primitive temporal parts of the totality of experiences of a subject (the so-called “elementary experiences” or just “erlebs”) and thus faces the problem of abstraction: how can qualities, properties and their objects in the world be abstracted from our phenomenal experiences.

Carnap tries to show that by using the method of “quasi-analysis” all the structure can be retained from the basis if the “erlebs” are ordered by a simple relation of part-similarity. Very roughly, the idea is that, although the individual temporal slices of our totality of experience are not structured (and thus have no parts), we can, via quasi-analysis, get to their quasi-parts, the “qualities” they share with other time-slices with which they are part-similar. Of course, time slices of the totality of our experiences can be part-similar with each other in a variety of ways. Perhaps two slices are similar with respect to what is in our visual field at the time in question, or they are similar with respect to what we hear or smell. However, since the time-slices are primitives in the system, we cannot yet even talk about these respects or ways in which the slices should be similar in order to, for example, be considered experiences of the same color. Carnap’s ingenious idea is to group exactly those erlebs together that are mutually part-similar, thereby grouping exactly those that share (pre-theoretically speaking) a property. For simple cases the quasi-analysis seems to give exactly the right results. Consider the following group of erlebs that, pre-theoretically have different colors.

[6 vertical colored bars, labeled A through F, A bar is green on the top half and black on the bottom half, B bar is all black, C bar is black on top half and red on bottom half, D bar is all red, E bar is all green, F bar is green on top third, black in middle third, and red on bottom third]

Figure 1a.

However, we do not yet know that there are such things as colors. In fact the only thing we know about the erlebs (AF) is that they are part similar as displayed in the following graph (where part-similarity between erlebs is indicated by a line):

[Graph: A and E on first row (2nd and 4th columns respectively), B and F on second row (1st and 3rd columns respectively), C and D on third row (2nd and 4th columns respectively). A has lines connecting it to B, C, F, and E. B has lines connecting it to A, F, and C. C has lines connecting it to B, A, D, and F. D has lines connecting it to C and F. E has lines connecting it to A and F F has lines connecting it to all others.]

Figure 1b.

If we take the graph and now group exactly those erlebs together that are mutually part-similar, we get the following sets:

\[ \{A, B, C, F\}, \{A, E, F\}, \{C, D, F\} \]

But, of course, these sets correspond exactly to the extensions of the colors in our example (viz. black, green, and red). Thus, by knowing about the part-similarity between erlebs alone, we seem to be able to reconstruct their properties with the method of quasi-analysis.

Goodman observes, however, that in unfavorable circumstances quasi-analysis will lead to the wrong results. Consider the following situation:

[6 vertical colored bars, labeled A through F, A bar is green on the top half and black on the bottom half, B bar is all black, C bar is black on top half and red on bottom half, D bar is all red, E bar is black on the top half and green on the bottom half, F bar is green on top third, black in middle third, and red on bottom third]

Figure 2a.

This corresponds to the following graph:

[Graph: A on first row 3rd column, B and F on second row (1st and 5th columns respectively), D on third row, 6th column, E and C on fourth row (2nd and 4th columns respectively). A has lines connecting it to B, C, F, and E. B has lines connecting it to A, F, C, and E. C has lines connecting it to all others. D has lines connecting it to C and F. E has lines connecting it to B, A, F, and C F has lines connecting it to all others.]

Figure 2b.

If we use Carnap’s rule for quasi-analysis, we will obtain all color classes except \(\{A, E, F\}\), the color class for “green”, because green only occurs in “constant companionship” with the color “black”. Goodman calls this the “constant companionship difficulty”.

A second problem can be illustrated with the following example of erlebs:

[6 vertical colored bars, labeled A through F, A bar is green on the top half and black on the bottom half, B bar is all black, C bar is black on top half and red on bottom half, D bar is all red, E bar is all green, F bar is green on top half and red on the bottom half]

Figure 3a.

This corresponds to this graph:

[Graph: A and E on first row (2nd and 4th columns respectively), B and F on second row (1st and 3rd columns respectively), C and D on third row (2nd and 4th columns respectively). A has lines connecting it to B, C, F, and E. B has lines connecting it to A and C. C has lines connecting it to B, A, D, and F. D has lines connecting it to C and F. E has lines connecting it to A and F F has lines connecting it to A, C, E, and D.]

Figure 3b.

But here \(\{A,C,F\}\) should be a color class resulting from quasi-analysis, although \(A\), \(C\), and \(F\) have in fact no color in common. Goodman calls this problem “the difficulty of imperfect community”. It is controversial to what extent these problems are devastating for Carnap’s project, but Goodman considered them to be serious.

4.3 Goodman’s Own Construction

In contrast to Carnap, Goodman begins from a realist basis, considering the example of a system built on phenomenal qualities, so-called qualia (phenomenal colors, phenomenal sounds, etc.) and thus faced the problem of concretion: how can concrete experiences be built up from abstract particulars?

In the visual realm, a concretum is a color-spot moment, which may be construed as the sum of a color, a visual-field place and a time, all of which stand in a peculiar relation of togetherness. Goodman adopts this relation as a primitive and then shows how, by means of it, it is possible to define the concept of the concrete individual as well as the various relations of qualification in which qualia and certain sums of qualia stand to the fully or partially concrete individuals that exhibit them.

After this is done, Goodman faces his second major constructional objective. He has to order the qualia into different categories. The problem is to construct for each of the categories (color, time, place, and so forth) a map that assigns a unique position to each quale in the category, and that represents the relative likeness of qualia by nearness in position. The solution to the problem requires in each case the specification of a set of terms by means of which the order at hand can be described, and then the selection of primitives suitable to define them. Goodman thereby shows how predicates referring to size and shape of phenomenal concreta may be introduced, and he suggests briefly some approaches to the definition of the different categories of qualia by reference to their structural characteristics.

Goodman shows in SA how using a mereological system can help to avoid the difficulty of imperfect community for a system built on a realist base (such as SA), as well as for a system built on a particularistic base (such as Der logische Aufbau der Welt). The constant companionship difficulty, on the other hand, does not arise in SA because no two concreta can have all their qualities in common.

4.4 The Significance of The Structure of Appearance

Very many of the side issues dealt with in A Study of Qualities and The Structure of Appearance reappear in Goodman’s later philosophy. The “grue”-problem (to be explained in the next section) as a problem of what predicates to use for projection and the related problem of how to analyze disposition predicates, as well as the question of how to explicate simplicity, tense, aboutness, and so on, all have their roots in Goodman’s dissertation. Alas, his most important work is also his most complicated, which is perhaps the reason why it is so often ignored. Other writings by Goodman are seemingly more accessible and have thus attracted a wider readership. However, it is arguable that the significance of Goodman’s “easier” pieces cannot be assessed adequately without relating them to the problems and projects of A Study of Qualities and The Structure of Appearance.

5. The Old and the New Riddle of Induction and their Solution

5.1 The Old Problem of Induction is a Pseudo-problem

The old problem of induction is the problem of justifying inductive inferences. What is traditionally required from such a justification is an argument that establishes that using inductive inferences does not lead us astray. Although it seems to be a meaningful question whether there is such a justification for our inductive practices, David Hume argues that there can be no such justification (Hume [1739–40] 2000; see the discussion of Hume in the entry on the problem of induction). It is important to understand that Hume’s argument is general. It is not just an argument against a particular attempt to justify induction in the sense above, but a general argument that there can be no such justification at all.

In order to see the generality of this argument, we have to note that the same problem also arises for deduction (FFF, §III.2). That deduction is in the same predicament is observed by Goodman and exploited for his solution of Hume’s problem of induction. Thus the upshot of Goodman’s understanding of Hume’s argument is that there can be no justification of our inferential practices, if such a justification requires a reason for their justifiedness. Accordingly, the old problem of induction, which requires such a justification of induction, is a pseudo-problem.

5.2 Hume’s Problem, Logic, and Reflective Equilibrium

If the problem of induction is not how to justify induction in the sense mentioned above, then what is it? It is helpful here to look at the case of deduction. Instances of deductive inferences are justified by showing that they are inferences in accordance with valid rules of inference. According to Goodman, the rules of logic are in turn valid because they are more or less in accordance with what we intuitively accept as instances of a valid deductive inference (FFF, 64).

On the one hand, we have certain intuitions about which deductive inferences are valid; on the other hand we have rules of inference. Confronted with an intuitively valid inference, we check whether it accords to the rules we already accept. If it does not, we might reject the inference as invalid. If, however, our intuition that the purported inference is valid is stronger than our confidence that our logical rules are adequate, we might consider amending the rules. This soon leads to a complicated process. We have to take into account that the rules must remain coherent and not too complicated to apply. In logic, we want the rules to be, for example, topic neutral, i.e., applicable to inferences (as far as possible) independent of specific subject matter. On the other hand, we also want to extract as much information from premises as possible, so we do not want to risk being too cautious in accepting rules. In this process we make adjustments on both sides, slowly bringing our judgments concerning validity into a reflective equilibrium with the rules for valid inferences until we finally get a stable system of accepted rules. (The term “reflective equilibrium” was introduced by John Rawls (1971) for Goodman’s technique. For a discussion of the reflective-equilibrium technique in the context of the recent debate regarding conceptual engineering, see Brun 2020.)

Reflective equilibrium is a story about how we actually justify our inferential practices. According to Goodman, nothing more can be demanded or achieved. It seems, perhaps, prima facie desirable that we also seek a justification in the sense of the old problem, but Hume’s argument suggests that such a justification is impossible. If this is correct, the remaining problem is to define our inferential practices by bringing explicit rules into reflective equilibrium with our tutored intuitions. “Justified” or “valid” are predicates that are applied to inferences on this basis.

It thus also becomes clearer how Goodman thought about Hume’s solution—that induction is merely a matter of custom or habit. Hume’s solution might be incomplete, but it is basically correct. The remaining task is then to explicate the pre-theoretic notion of valid inductive inference by defining rules of inference that can be brought into a reflective equilibrium with intuitive judgments of inductive validity.

5.3 The New Riddle of Induction

Before presenting Goodman’s solution, we first have to discuss Goodman’s own challenge, the so-called “New Riddle of Induction”.

Consider the following two (supposedly true) statements:

This piece of copper conducts electricity.
This man in the room is a third son.

B1 is a confirmation instance of the following regularity statement:

All pieces of copper conduct electricity.

But does B2 confirm anything like L2?

All men in this room are third sons.

Obviously, it does not. But what makes the difference? Both regularity statements (L1 and L2) are built according to the exact same syntactical procedure from the evidence statements. Therefore, it does not seem to be for a syntactical reason that B1 confirms L1 but B2 fails to confirm L2. Rather, the reason is that statements like L1 are lawlike, whereas statements like L2 at best express accidentally true generalizations. Lawlike statements, in contrast to accidentally true general statements, are confirmed by their instances and support counterfactuals. L1 supports the counterfactual claim that if this thing I have in my hand were a piece of copper, it would conduct electricity. In contrast, supposing that it is indeed true, L2 would not support that if an arbitrary man were here in the room, he would be a third son. To tell which statements are lawlike and which statements are not is therefore of great importance in the philosophy of science. A satisfactory account of induction (or corroboration — see the discussion of Popper in the entry on the problem of induction) as well as explanation and prediction requires this distinction. Goodman, however, shows that this is extremely hard to get.

Here comes the riddle. Suppose that your research is in gemology. Your special interest lies in the color properties of certain gemstones, in particular, emeralds. All emeralds you have examined before a certain time \(t\) were green (your notebook is full of evidence statements of the form “Emerald \(x\) found at place \(y\) date z \((z \le t)\) is green”). It seems that, at \(t\), this supports the hypothesis that all emeralds are green (L3).

Now Goodman introduces the predicate “grue”. This predicate applies to all things examined before some future time \(t\) just in case they are green but to other things (observed at or after \(t\)) just in case they are blue:

\(x\) is grue \(=_{df}\) \(x\) is examined before \(t\) and green ∨ \(x\) is not so examined and blue

Until \(t\) it is obviously the case that for each statement in your notebook, there is a parallel statement asserting that the emerald \(x\) found at place \(y\) date z \((z \le t)\) is grue. Each of these statements is analytically equivalent with the corresponding one in your notebook. All these grue-evidence statements taken together confirm the hypothesis that all emeralds are grue (L4), and they confirm this hypothesis to the exact same degree as the green-evidence statements confirmed the hypothesis that all emeralds are green. But if that is the case, then the following two predictions are also confirmed to the same degree:

The next emerald first examined after \(t\) will be green.
The next emerald first examined after \(t\) will be grue.

However, to be a grue emerald examined after \(t\) is not to be a green emerald. An emerald first examined after \(t\) is grue iff it is blue. We have two mutually incompatible predictions, both confirmed to the same degree by the past evidence. We could obviously define infinitely many grue-like predicates that would all lead to new, similarly incompatible predictions.

The immediate lesson is that we cannot use all kinds of weird predicates to formulate hypotheses or to classify our evidence. Some predicates (which are the ones like “green”) can be used for this; other predicates (the ones like “grue”) must be excluded, if induction is supposed to make any sense. This already is an interesting result. For valid inductive inferences the choice of predicates matters.

It is not just that we lack justification for accepting a general hypothesis as true only on the basis of positive instances and lack of counterinstances (which was the old problem), or to define what rule we are using when accepting a general hypothesis as true on these grounds (which was the problem after Hume). The problem is to explain why some general statements (such as L3) are confirmed by their instances, whereas others (such as L4) are not. Again, this is a matter of the lawlikeness of L3 in contrast to L4, but how are we supposed to tell the lawlike regularities from the illegitimate generalizations?

An immediate reply is that the illegitimate generalization L4 involves a temporal restriction, just as L2 was restricted spatially (see e.g., Carnap 1947). The idea would be that predicates that cannot be used for induction are analytically “positional”, i.e., their definitions refer to individual constants (for places or times). A projectible predicate, i.e., a predicate that can be used for induction, has no definition which would refer to such individual constants but is purely qualitative (e.g., because it is a basic predicate). The trouble is that this reply makes it relative to a language whether or not a predicate is projectible. If we begin with a language containing the basic predicates “green” and “blue” (as in English), “grue” and “bleen” are positional. “Bleen” is defined as follows:

\(x\) is bleen \(=_{df}\) \(x\) is examined before \(t\) and blue ∨ \(x\) is not so examined and green

But if we start with a language that has “bleen” and “grue” as basic predicates, “green” and “blue” are positional:

\(x\) is green \(=_{df}\) \(x\) is examined before \(t\) and grue ∨ \(x\) is not so examined and bleen
\(x\) is blue \(=_{df}\) \(x\) is examined before \(t\) and bleen ∨ \(x\) is not so examined and grue

Both languages are symmetrical in all their semantic and syntactical properties. So the positionality of predicates is not invariant with respect to linguistically equivalent transformations. But if this is the case, there is no semantic or syntactic criterion on whose basis we could draw the line between projectible predicates and predicates that we cannot use for induction.

5.4 Goodman’s Solution

Goodman’s solution to the new riddle of induction resembles Hume’s solution in an important way. Instead of providing a theory that would ultimately justify our choice of predicates for induction, he develops a theory that provides an account of how we in fact choose predicates for induction and projection. Goodman observes that predicates like “green” are favored over predicates like “grue”, because the former are much better entrenched, i.e., in the past we projected many more hypotheses featuring “green” or predicates co-extensional with “green” than hypothesis featuring the predicate “grue”. If two hypotheses are the same with respect to their empirical track-record, then the hypothesis that uses the better entrenched predicates overrides the alternatives. On the basis of these considerations, Goodman defines projectibility (and cognates) for hypotheses (FFF, 108):

A hypothesis is projectible iff it is supported, unviolated, and unexhausted, and all hypotheses conflicting with it are overridden.

A hypothesis is unprojectible iff it is unsupported, exhausted, violated, or overridden.

A hypothesis is nonprojectible iff it and a conflicting hypothesis are supported, unviolated, unexhausted, and not overridden.

The last definition takes care of situations when we are confronted with two hypotheses that are in conflict and neither has a better entrenched predicate. Entrenchment can even be further refined to account for cases in which a predicate inherits the entrenchment from another of which it is derivative. (The critical literature on Goodman’s New Riddle is too extensive to do it justice here; see Stalker 1994 and Elgin 1997c for selections of important essays on the topic. Stalker 1994 also contains an annotated bibliography, comprising over 300 entries. The discussion of course continued after the 1990s and the literature is still growing. For the relation of the grue-paradox to Kripke’s Wittgenstein’s rule following puzzle (1982), see, for instance, Wright 1984; Hacking 1993; Cohnitz and Rossberg 2006, 205–208; Kowalenko 2022.)

Goodman’s solution makes projectibility essentially a matter of what language we use and have used to describe and predict the behaviour of our world. However, this language-, or better version-relativism is just another aspect of Goodman’s irrealism.

6. Irrealism and Worldmaking

6.1 Irrealism

Goodman labels his own position “irrealism”. Irrealism, roughly, is the claim that the world dissolves into versions. Goodman’s irrealism is certainly the most controversial aspect of his philosophy.

Two lines of argument can be separated in Goodman’s writings (Dudau 2002). First, Goodman argues that there are conflicting statements that cannot be accommodated in a single world version: some truths conflict (WW, 109–16; MM, 30–44). If that is the case, we need many worlds, if any, to accommodate the conflicting versions and bring them in unison with the standard correspondence account of truth, that is, that the truth of a statement is its being in correspondence with a world. The second line of argument seems to be that we need no worlds at all if we need many. If we need a world for each version, why postulate the worlds over and above the versions?

Let us first have a closer look at the first line of reasoning. The Earth stands still, revolves around the Sun, and runs many other courses as well at the same time. Yet nothing moves while at rest. As Goodman concedes, the natural response to this is that the sentences

The Earth is at rest.
The Earth moves.

should be understood as elliptical for

The Earth is at rest according to the geocentric system.
The Earth moves according to the heliocentric system.

However, according to Goodman, this would be wrong-headed (WW, 112). Consider the following two historiographical sentences: “The kings of Sparta had two votes” and “The kings of Sparta had only one vote”. The first sentence is part of a report by Herodotus, the second part of a report by Thucydides. There is, again, an inclination to understand these sentences as ellipses for “According to Herodotus, the kings of Sparta had two votes”, and “According to Thucydides, the kings of Sparta had only one vote”. But obviously these latter two sentences do not tell us anything about Sparta. They only tell us about what Herodotus and Thucydides said about Sparta. It is true that “according to Herodotus, the kings of Sparta had two votes”, even if they actually had no vote or had three votes. The same holds for the relativizations to the geocentric and the heliocentric systems: it is true that the Earth is at rest according to the geocentric system, but that still does not inform us about the world. Thus, if we assume that (S1) and (S2) are both true, we end up with a contradiction if we take them to be literally true of one and the same world. If we do not take them to be literally true, but to be elliptical and implicitly relativized, we end up with two truths that are not about any world. At least, they are not about the parts of the world we were interested in. They turn out to be truths about versions, but not truths about planets. The solution chosen by Goodman is to claim that they are about two different worlds. Both state a literal truth about a world, but just not about the same world.

It is crucial for Goodman’s argument that in the conflict between (S1) and (S2) we have (a) an actual conflict between statements, and (b) no other way to resolve that conflict (like, for example, rejecting at least one of the two statements in a non-arbitrary way). Of course, other contemporaries of Goodman, such as Quine and Carnap, also consider the problem that experience alone might underdetermine theory-choice, but believed that pragmatic criteria will in the long run allow us to arrive at one all-encompassing coherent version of the world. In Quine’s (Quine 1981) and Carnap’s (Carnap 1932) philosophies, this is assumed to be a physical version. But Goodman does not believe in physicalist reductivism. First of all, there does not currently seem to be any convincing evidence that all truths are reducible to physics (just consider the problem of reducing mental truths to physical truths), and, secondly, physics itself does not even appear to form a coherent system (WW, 5). Hence, for Goodman, we are stuck with conflicting world versions we consider true. Since, as we have seen above, relativism is no option for Goodman—because it would make true statements true about versions only—we arrive at Goodman’s pluralism: conflicting true versions correspond to different worlds.

The second line of reasoning in Goodman’s writings toys with the idea that there are no worlds that the right versions answer to—or at the very least that such worlds are not necessary. The world versions suffice, and are really the only things that are directly accessible, anyway. The versions can for many purposes be treated as worlds (WW, 4 and 96; cmp. MM, 30–33).

Goodman of course recognizes a difference between versions and worlds. A version can be in English and comprise words. Worlds are neither in English nor comprise words. However, for a version that is true of a world, the world has to answer to it in a way. A world that “corresponds” to (S1), for example, is a world with planets and spacetime that is so arranged that one of the planets, Earth, is at rest in it. But “planet”, “spacetime”, “at rest”, and so on are ways to categorize reality that depend on a version. These predicates are the ones chosen in this very version. There was no world that came ordered in correspondence with these predicates before this version was constructed. Instead, the world corresponds to the version expressed by (S1), because the world with that structure was made, when that version was made.

But what are worlds made of? Should we not at least assume Reality to be some kind of stuff that allows structuring with alternative versions as dough allows structuring with a cookie-cutter? Does there not have to be some substance for our versions to project structure onto? According to Goodman, this “tolerant realist view” that a plurality of worlds can be versions of a unique underlying Reality is also nothing but a useless addition. A Reality underlying the worlds must be unstructured and neutral, and thus serves no purpose. If there are many equally satisfactory versions of the world that are mutually incompatible, then there is not very much left that the “neutral Reality” could be. Reality would have no planets, no motion, no spacetime, no relations, no points, no structure at all. One can assume there is such a thing, Goodman seems to admit, but only because Reality is really not worth fighting for (or fighting against, for that matter). If we can tell true from false versions and explain why some are true versions and others false versions of worlds without assuming anything like an underlying reality, why assume it then? Parsimony considerations should lead us to refrain from postulating it.

6.2 Worldmaking

While Goodman insists that “there are many worlds, if any” (MM, 127; see also MM, 31), Goodman’s worlds should not be conflated with possible worlds. There are no merely possible Goodman-worlds; they are all actual (WW, 94 and 104; MM, 31). It is Goodman’s view that worlds are “made” by answering to right versions, but there are no (merely possible) worlds that correspond to false versions. It is important to note that this view does not collapse into irrationalism or a fancy form of cultural relativism favored by postmodern thinkers. Making a true version is not trivial. Not surprisingly, it is not any easier than making a true version is for a realist. How we make true versions is absolutely the same on both accounts; the difference is only with respect to what we do when we make true versions (see WW, McCormick 1996, Schwarz 2000, and de Donato Rodríguez 2009 for discussion). Declos (2019) strictly distinguishes Worldmaking (that worlds are constructed) from what he terms “Pluriworldism” (that there is more than one world) in Goodman.

The constraints on worldmaking are strict. We cannot just create things; predicates must be entrenched and thus there must be some close continuity with former versions. Simplicity will keep us from creating new things from scratch, coherence from making anything in conflict with beliefs with higher initial credibility, and so on.

A world is made by making a world version. So, according to Goodman, the making of a world version is what has to be understood. Carnap’s Aufbau, as already mentioned, presents a world version, the systems in A Study of Qualities and The Structure of Appearance are world versions, and so are scientific theories. The heliocentric and geocentric worldviews are relatively primitive world versions, while Einstein’s theory of general relativity is a more sophisticated one. World versions do not have to be constructed in a formal language, though; indeed, they do not need to be in a language, formal or informal, at all. The symbol systems used in the arts—such as in painting, for instance—can be used in the process of worldmaking too. It is in this sense that philosophy, science, and art are all epistemically significant; they all contribute to our understanding; they all help to create worlds.

Making a world version is difficult. Acknowledging a great number of them does not make it easier. The hard work lies, for example, in creating a constructional system that overcomes the problems of its predecessors, is simple, uses well-entrenched predicates, or successfully replaces them with new ones (which is even harder), allows us to make useful predictions and so on. For Goodman, scientists, artists, and philosophers are faced with analogous problems in this.

Goodman’s insistence that we make worlds when we make their versions and that we might just as well replace talking about worlds with talk about versions creates a problem that is not simply solved by acknowledging that making a true version is very hard. Making a version and making the objects that the version is about are clearly two different tasks. As Israel Scheffler writes in the abstract to “The Wonderful Worlds of Goodman”:

The worldmaking urged by Goodman is elusive: Are worlds to be identified with (true) world-versions or do they rather comprise what is referred to by such versions? Various passages in [WW] suggest one answer, various passages another. That versions are made is easy to accept; that the things they refer to are, equally, made, I find unacceptable. (Scheffler 1979, 618)

Indeed, Scheffler argues, Goodman confusingly uses “world” and “worldmaking” both in a versional and in an objectual sense. As we said above, Goodman’s claim is that we make a world in the objectual sense by making a version of it. The claim is based on his conviction that the only structure of the world to which all true versions correspond does not exist independently; rather, it is only to be found because we project this structure onto the world with our conceptualizations. His favorite example is the constellation known as “Big Dipper”. Indeed, we “made” the Big Dipper by picking out one arbitrary constellation of stars and naming it. (More precisely, it is a so-called asterism that is part of the constellation Ursa Major—but the point still stands.) Which arrangement of heavenly bodies makes up the Big Dipper is purely conventional and hence only due to our conceptualization. Hilary Putnam (1992a) suggests that this idea may have some plausibility for the Big Dipper, but it does not, for instance, hold true of the stars that constitute the Big Dipper. True, “star” is a concept with partly conventional boundaries; however, that the concept “star” has conventional elements does not make it a matter of convention that “star” applies to something (and thus merely a matter of making a world version). Paul Boghossian (2006, chapter 3) presents an argument in a similar vein.

Putnam also points out that there is a tension between Goodman’s notion of worldmaking and his first line of thought that leads to his irrealism: the idea that there are conflicting statements in different adequate world versions. As Putnam argues, to say that a statement of one world version is incompatible with that of another (such that a single world cannot accommodate both versions) requires that the expressions in the two versions have the same meaning. However, it is not clear that our ordinary notion of meaning allows such inter-version comparison of sameness of meaning (a thought that Goodman should be sympathetic to, since he already doubts an intra-version notion of that kind). Moreover, there might be better ways to compare alternative versions (e.g., by way of homomorphism-relations between versions, as developed by Goodman in SA and discussed above in 4.1) and to explain how versions relate despite their apparent incompatibility (for example, by paying attention to the practice of scientists who manage to move from one version to another).


A. Primary sources


A Study of Qualities, Ph.D. dissertation thesis, Harvard University, 1941. First published New York: Garland, 1990 (Harvard Dissertations in Philosophy Series).
The Structure of Appearance, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1951; 2nd ed. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1966; 3rd ed. Boston: Reidel, 1977 (page numbers in our text refer to this last edition).
Fact, Fiction, and Forecast, University of London: Athlone Press, 1954; Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1955; 2nd ed. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1965; 3rd ed. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1973; 4th ed. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1983.
Languages of Art: An Approach to a Theory of Symbols, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1968; 2nd ed. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1976.
Problems and Projects, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1972.
Basic Abilities Required for Understanding and Creation in the Arts, Final Report (with David Perkins, Howard Gardner, and the assistance of Jeanne Bamberger et al.) Cambridge, MA: Harvard University: project no. 9-0283, grant no. OEG-0-9-310283-3721 (010). Reprinted (in part and with changes) in MM, ch. V.2.
Ways of Worldmaking, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1978; paperback edition Indianapolis: Hackett, 1985.
Of Mind and Other Matters, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1984.
(with Catherine Z. Elgin) Reconceptions in Philosophy and other Arts and Sciences, Indianapolis: Hackett; London: Routledge, 1988; paperback edition, London: Routledge, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1990.

For attempts at compilations of Goodman’s complete corpus see Berka 1991, the bibliography in Cohnitz and Rossberg 2006, or follow the link in Other Internet Resources below to the list of writings by Goodman compiled by John Lee (University of Edinburgh).

Works by Goodman cited in this entry

(with Henry S. Leonard) “The Calculus of Individuals and Its Uses”, Journal of Symbolic Logic, 5:45–55.
(with W.V. Quine) “Steps Toward a Constructive Nominalism”, Journal of Symbolic Logic, 12:105–22. Reprinted in PP, 173–98.
“On Likeness of Meaning”, Analysis, 10:1–7. Reprinted in PP, 221–30.
“On Some Differences About Meaning”, Analysis, 13:90–96. Reprinted in PP, 231–8.
“A World of Individuals”, in The Problem of Universals: a symposium, I.M. Bochenski, Alonzo Church, and Nelson Goodman. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, pp. 13–31. Reprinted in PP, 155–71.
“On Relations that Generate”, Philosophical Studies, 9:65–66. Reprinted in PP, 171–72.
“Conversation with Franz Boenders and Mia Gosselin” (revised text of a television interview, Belgium Radio-Television System, Brussels, August 1980), in MM, 189–200.
“Gewissheit ist etwas ganz und gar Absurdes” [“Certainty is something altogether Absurd”] (interviewed by Karlheinz Lüdeking), in Steinbrenner et al. 2005: 261–69.

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  • –––, 1992, Collected Works, ed. by S.J. Surma, J. Srzednicki, D.I. Barnett, and F.V. Rickey, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
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  • –––, 1985, The Time of My Life: An Autobiography, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
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