Rudolf Carnap

First published Mon Feb 24, 2020; substantive revision Tue May 5, 2020

Rudolf Carnap (1891–1970) was one of the best-known philosophers of the twentieth century. Notorious as one of the founders, and perhaps the leading philosophical representative, of the movement known as logical positivism or logical empiricism, he was one of the originators of the new field of philosophy of science and later a leading contributor to semantics and inductive logic. Though his views underwent significant changes at various points, he continued to reaffirm the basic tenets of logical empiricism, and is still identified with it. His influence declined, therefore, when logical empiricism lost its dominance in the 1950s and 60s, even though many of the efforts of the next philosophical generation (such as Quine’s) may be understood as responses to Carnap. Beginning in the 1980s, a reassessment set in that has resulted in a much more nuanced and complex picture of his philosophy and its development. The literature on him is now enormous and still growing rapidly, and his ideas are presently enjoying a major revival in various areas of philosophy.

1. General Characterization of Carnap’s Philosophy

1.1 Rational Reconstruction and Explication

Carnap differed fundamentally from the western philosophical tradition in his conception of philosophy and his attitude toward philosophical problems. These supposed problems, he thought, were largely artifacts of our inadequate tools—they originate in confusions due to the languages our species has evolved over millennia to deal with the practical problems of a pre-scientific and pre-technological everyday life. These primitive tools leave us unequipped even to express, let alone to address, the traditional problems of philosophy coherently; our inherited languages distort the picture too badly, and to see things more adequately we need to devise new concepts and organize our thoughts in less parochial categories. Just as we have devised new concepts and vocabularies to find out about the world in systematic scientific inquiry, so we have to leave behind our traditional ways of articulating how everything fits together, how we should understand our place in the world, and how we should shape our lives in response.

So philosophical inquiry became, for Carnap, a kind of “conceptual engineering” (see Creath 1990, Flocke forthcoming-b) rather than a form of inquiry or search for knowledge. It did not ask how things are, in Carnap’s view, but rather how—within the constraints of our available tools and the knowledge available from the sciences—we want things to be. This form of “voluntarism” (Jeffrey 1992) lies at the basis of Carnap’s philosophy from beginning to end.

Carnap applied this voluntaristic conceptual engineering in many different ways to many different problems, at different levels and on different scales. He applied it both within science and to larger problems about science (e.g., scientific language), or about the place of science in our lives. He applied it both to local reconstructions or explications of particular concepts (e.g., confirmation), and more globally, to entire language frameworks (see section 1.2 below). And he wanted the local and global to fit together; precise definitions of explicated concepts were to be situated within such larger frameworks.

The terminology evolved over the years. Carnap tended to think of his first engineering projects as “rational reconstruction”; later he favored the term “explication”. Both refer to the reconstruction or replacement of particular terms or concepts within our more primitive ordinary languages (or vestiges of them in scientific languages) rather than to the design and development of entire languages or language frameworks. There was a progressive change of emphasis over the course of Carnap’s career in the goals and the scope of this reconstructive engineering. In the early years Carnap (along with most of his colleagues in the 1920s Vienna Circle) saw these engineering projects in much the same light as the eighteenth-century Encyclopédistes and nineteenth-century positivists had seen them. Ordinary language and traditional concepts were to be overcome; they were to be replaced by better and more scientific ones. Later, Carnap’s view became more pluralistic and dialectical (Stein 1992); he increasingly recognized the practical nature of conceptual engineering and allowed more room for the standpoint of the language user, as well as the differing priorities and value systems involved in the choice of language frameworks or explications. Recently, Carnap’s idea of explication has attracted a good deal of attention (Maher 2007; Kitcher 2008; Carus 2007a; Dutilh Novaes & Reck 2017; Brun 2016; several papers in Wagner 2012), particularly among authors seeking to define the proper role of the new subdiscipline of experimental philosophy (Justus 2012; Shepherd & Justus 2015; Schupbach 2017) or of the methodology of mathematical philosophy (Leitgeb 2013). More details are to be found in the supplement on Methodology. (For more on conceptual engineering more generally, see, e.g., Cappelen 2018.)

1.2 Frameworks

Explications or rational reconstructions were envisaged by Carnap as situated (where possible) in larger linguistic or conceptual frameworks, constructed object languages with a hierarchy of metalanguages in which to define and explore truth, analyticity, synonymity, designation and other semantic resources of the object language, and of the object language with respect to its extra-linguistic environment.

Frameworks always involve logical consequence relation(s), their definition(s) of what follows from what logically. But this need not always mean that frameworks have purely logical object languages that are then provided with empirical interpretations. Other modes of inference employed in existing scientific disciplines, including conceptual inference, experimental procedures, and the reasoning from these, can also be reconstructed in or by frameworks. Carnap continued to hope that all of them could, eventually, be understood in more straightforwardly logical terms, but he realized that this was a long-term program and not immediately on the horizon. In particular, the framework could also come equipped with an inductive logic, where the deductive consequence relation for the object language is augmented by a numerical degree-of-confirmation assignment that satisfies the axioms of probability. In any case, Carnapian language or framework go beyond what we now mean by a formal language: they do not just involve a syntactic vocabulary and syntactic formation rules. From the modern logical point of view, a Carnapian framework is close to a logic or a formal theory (but perhaps with an interpretation), while from the philosophy of science point of view, a Carnapian framework is meant to reconstruct the conceptual and inferential presuppositions of a scientific theory rather than a scientific theory itself.

Carnap’s earliest attempts to develop frameworks, which sought to encompass the conceptual resources of all empirical knowledge, can be found in Der logische Aufbau der Welt (1928a, The Logical Construction of the World), commonly referred to as the Aufbau, its abbreviated original German title. Carnap there focused on sketching a phenomenalist framework in which scientific concepts could be constructed from pure observation. The idea was to have a single framework relative to which any scientific sentence whatsoever (other than purely logical or mathematical ones) could be judged to be cashable or not cashable in empirical, observational terms. However, as Carnap soon realized, the framework failed to address theoretical scientific concepts, disposition concepts, or probabilistic concepts, among much else.

The frameworks on which Carnap worked after this were less specific to particular epistemological problems, and more abstract and general. In his view, the specification of a framework was a prerequisite for any rational reconstruction of rational discourse whatsoever. As we will discuss in more detail below, his Logische Syntax der Sprache (1934, translated as The Logical Syntax of Language, 1937, hereafter LSS) worked out two different frameworks for mathematics (and physics) and developed a corresponding account of philosophy as the logical syntax of the language of science. Soon after, Carnap followed Alfred Tarski in making the basic concept of “truth” language-relative; and in 1950 he applied the same idea more explicitly to the basic concept of “existence”. It only made sense to speak of something “existing” relative to a framework (i.e., one could only speak of “existence” as internal to a framework), he said, not in any general sense (external to any framework whatever). This deflationary conception of truth and existence (and many other previously metaphysical concepts) again reflects Carnap’s resistance to the suggestive traps set by ordinary language and the philosophical tradition that has been too ready to fall into these traps.

In his later work, Carnap extended his construction of semantic frameworks by developing frameworks in which probabilistic relations play a central role, including eventually frameworks for rational decision and action (decision theory). The specific details of Carnap’s various linguistic frameworks are discussed in the following supplements: Aufbau (Section 1), Logical Syntax of Language, Semantics, The Reconstruction of Scientific Theories, and Inductive Logic.

1.3 Pluralism and Tolerance

Carnap differed from the philosophical tradition not only in his suspicion of ordinary language and its potentially misleading “philosophical” artifacts, and in his engineering impulse to replace our inherited languages by better-constructed and more precise constructed linguistic frameworks, but also in his increasingly pronounced pluralism among frameworks. In the Aufbau, Carnap had already discussed the availability of different frameworks (phenomenalist, physicalist, and more), and how they were more or less suitable for different purposes (see the supplement on Aufbau). But these frameworks still differed only in the choice of non-logical primitives and in the definition of non-primitive terms—the frameworks were still based on the same syntactic formation rules and on one and the same logical system. As far as the explicit endorsement of syntactic and logical pluralism and tolerance is concerned, the turning point came in 1932, while Carnap was writing his book (now often considered his masterpiece) Logical Syntax of Language. The starting point of that book, as we will see in more detail in section 4 below, had been strongly motivated by the search for a single standard language of science. But this was now combined with Carnap’s new idea that, for philosophical statements about science, the standard of communicative acceptability should not (as in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus) be that it have meaning (that it picture some state of affairs), but that it be translatable into the “formal mode of speech”. His criterion for the scientific (non-metaphysical) status of a philosophical statement, that is, had shifted from the reducibility of a sentence to “atomic” observation sentences to its expressibility as a statement solely about linguistic artifacts (rather than about the supposed things and processes they refer to). But Carnap had still thought, until late 1932, that a single standard language for logical syntax could be found, and had invested a lot of time in devising such a language system. At that point, however, two sets of controversies attracted attention: the so-called “protocol sentence debate” about the correct form of observation sentences (and by implication, the role of observation in science), and the dispute about the foundations of mathematics among the three schools of logicism, intuitionism, and formalism. Both these controversies came to seem to Carnap, after years of involvement in each of them, to stumble over artifacts of inherited language just like the old philosophical problems the Vienna Circle thought it had swept away. He came to regard the different positions in these debates not as potentially “right” or “correct” (or “wrong” or “incorrect”) but as different proposals for language frameworks in which to frame the questions, different ways of articulating the problems surrounding empirical evidence and the nature of mathematics, respectively. And it seemed to him that these proposals were mostly not mutually exclusive; on the contrary, he came to think that many different alternative languages should be pursued and developed to see how well they perform in different contexts. He saw them as motivated by different needs and requirements, perhaps by different ultimate values, and he thought the discussion of values should not be confused with the study and development of the language frameworks themselves: “in logic”, he famously wrote in the Syntax (LSS: §17), “there are no morals”.

This new pluralism undermined the initial premise of the Syntax book on which he was working then, but Carnap nonetheless took it on board. The language he had initially been intending to propose as the single standard language of science was now used simply as an example, and to be sure that it wasn’t taken too prescriptively Carnap also developed another language (Dr.-Seuss-like, he called them “Language I” and “Language II”), and stressed that both were acceptable, though each had its strengths and weaknesses for different purposes. The new linguistic pluralism was stated as the

principle of tolerance: we are not in the business of setting up prohibitions but of arriving at conventionsIn logic there are no morals. Everyone is welcome to set up his logic, i.e., his form of language, as he pleases. If he wants to discuss it with us, though, he needs to state his intentions clearly, and give syntactical specifications rather than philosophical debates. (LSS: §17)

This principle would remain a permanent, indeed the dominant, component of Carnap’s philosophy for the rest of his career. For more details on Carnapian tolerance, see the supplement Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology (Sections 1 and 2).

1.4 Metaphysics

Why, under this pluralism, should some statements and expressions still be excluded, as not having any content, as not conveying anything but as being just empty verbiage that purports to say something significant? Why, that is, should “metaphysics” still be excluded, as Carnap notoriously insisted? Surely the metaphysician is as free as anyone else to choose her language?

These questions take us back to the engineering ethos described in section 1.1 above, about explication and rational reconstruction. Language choice, for Carnap, was not an end in itself but was rather in the service of freeing ourselves from the distorted perspective on the world imposed on us by our inherited natural languages. These languages had not evolved to optimize the transparent representation of knowledge, but for very different, primitive practical purposes. For the pursuit of knowledge, and insight into the human condition in the light of that knowledge, better languages are needed. What makes a language “better”? In principle Carnap leaves that open. Everyone has their own values about what they want languages to do for them, and will choose accordingly. But Carnap’s own values were those of the Enlightenment. His value hierarchy placed the value of escaping from the complacent, passive acceptance of authority, or of traditional or folk ideas—and finding something objectively better—near the top. The replacement of knowledge accepted passively from authority or tradition by objective knowledge was his goal just as it had been the goal of the Encyclopédistes. And by “objective” knowledge, Carnap meant essentially scientific and practical knowledge, just as they did.

This did not mean a rejection of the humanistic tradition, or of dimensions to values other than the scientific and engineering-oriented. Carnap took entirely for granted (so deeply that he hardly ever bothered to make it explicit) that literature, art, and music shaped people’s values and were closely connected with them. But these were for individuals to negotiate. Since his experience of the First World War, he had realized that the German intelligentsia’s political indifference, its overindulgence in humanistic individual values, had been partly to blame for the war. He had resolved, therefore, to attend more to the framework that all humans shared, and that formed the basis for their social and political cohabitation. Objective knowledge was, to him as to the Enlightenment, at the core of this shared framework. Practical (especially political) decisions should be informed ones, arrived at in the light of the best possible knowledge about the available choices and their consequences.

Metaphysics was, in his view, a distraction from this program. Metaphysics was a kind of failed art form masquerading as knowledge, so it was both fake art and fake knowledge. Unlike a logical or mathematical proof or the confirmation of a scientific theory, metaphysical proposals are unable to command widespread agreement; even the criteria by which they should be judged are often in dispute.

On the other hand, all of Carnap’s repeated attempts, over several decades, to give a precise delineation—to explicate the distinction—between scientific (or meaningful or communicatively adequate) statements and metaphysical (non-scientific, non-meaningful) ones failed. He therefore became more liberal and less exacting about what was to be regarded as metaphysical. He was willing to allow that many metaphysical theories of past philosophers (he cites Aristotle, Leibniz, Kant, Peirce, and Whitehead, among others) could be regarded as useful steps toward the construction of “the most general frameworks containing categorial concepts which are fundamental for the representation of all knowledge”, and moreover that he himself regarded this task as among “the most important problems of philosophy” (Carnap 1963b: 862). See the supplement Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology (Section 2 and 3) for further detail.

1.5 Verification and Confirmation

Carnap’s life-long quest to explicate the distinction between statements that genuinely convey something and empty verbiage that only purports to say something (metaphysics) began with Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, the Vienna Circle’s provisional starting point. The Circle interpreted Wittgenstein as requiring what Carnap later called a “molecular” language, by which he meant a language that permitted only finitely restricted quantification. This posed an obvious problem in that scientific theories, the very paradigm of what the Circle regarded as proper (non-metaphysical) knowledge, nearly all contain unrestricted universal quantifiers and thus range, in principle, over an infinite number of instances. As Carnap already acknowledged in his first writings on the subject, well before Popper appeared on the scene, this meant that theories could not, strictly speaking, be verified; they could only be confirmed up to a certain confidence level, or disconfirmed (e.g., Carnap 1926: 7–9).

As we will see in section 5 below, this and related problems constituted a large part of the Circle’s agenda during the late 1920s and early 1930s. The important thing to keep in mind through all this is that “the verification principle” in its crude form was never advocated by Carnap or any other major figure in the Circle. (More detail on this in the supplement on The Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 1).) In the Aufbau, Carnap had, it is true, worked out a finitist, “molecular” phenomenalist language and advocated the epistemological benefits of reconstructing scientific concepts on its basis. During this period, he was attracted to a form of radical positivism that played down theories as mere auxiliary devices for the prediction of observations. The observations that confirm theories, in this view, was really all there was to science, in what amounted to a kind of instrumentalism about theories, as it would later be called.

But soon afterwards, in his Logical Syntax, and more explicitly when he published “Testability and Meaning” in 1936–37, Carnap decisively distanced himself from such doctrines. In the light of the new principle of tolerance, the obsession with just one standard language form seemed unnecessarily “absolutist” and rigid. In “Testability and Meaning” it is stressed that many different language forms are possible in science and should be investigated, and that none is “correct” or uniquely acceptable for the purposes of scientific confirmation. The point is to devise languages that meet certain goals of inquiry better than others, in the awareness that some languages may be better for the pursuit of one goal, while other languages are preferable for other goals. This is perhaps the first fully explicit expression of the engineering ethos described in section 1.1 above.

This period also marks a return to the recognition that radical positivism of the “molecular” or Tractatus sort hardly does justice to actual science—so Carnap returns now to science as it actually is done rather than an idealized, purely factual science. This meant, once again, an acceptance that theoretical vocabulary needed to be accounted for in one’s conception of science. Another kind of concept characteristic of actually practiced science that gets special attention in “Testability and Meaning” is disposition concepts (e.g., “soluble” or “refrangible”; more on disposition concepts in the supplement The Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 2)). Probabilistic concepts would soon come into focus as well as a significant preoccupation.

1.6 Theory Reconstruction and Inductive Logic

From this period, then, Carnap once again focused on scientific theories, and on theoretical languages as not fully reducible to empirical observation sentences. While he had given up the effort to reduce theories to observations, he remained preoccupied with the complementary problems of how a theory can be confirmed by observations, and how the empirical content of a theory can be determined. Both of these problems were articulated, and seen as interrelated, in “Testability and Meaning”, but thereafter they took separate paths. The first of these problems was central to Carnap’s preoccupation with inductive logic from about 1942, though he was never able to develop it to the point where it could be applied to the confirmation of theoretical sentences (as opposed to mere empirical generalizations). The second problem was the focus of significant attention to the nature of theoretical languages and the degree to which theories are constrained by evidence, as well as the problem how to identify the analytic and synthetic parts of a theoretical hypothesis or a theory, i.e., to distinguish what components of it come with the language framework in which it is expressed, and what components contain actual information about the world. See sections 8.1 and 8.3 below on Carnap’s further pursuit of both problems and his controversies and interactions with Popper, Hempel, and others on these issues. The supplement The Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Sections 3 and 4) deals in more detail with Carnap’s distinction between observation language and theoretical language in science, and with Carnap’s reconstruction of scientific theories and theoretical terms by means of Ramsey sentences and related logical resources.

His own primary attention during the later years of his career was to inductive logic, where he began by distinguishing two fundamentally different explicanda of the concept “probability”: (i) the idea of probability as relative frequency of some occurrence in a series of events or in a population, which he regarded as a legitimate and entirely empirical matter. He contrasted it with (ii) probability understood as an epistemic measure of our certainty or uncertainty about the empirical truth or adequacy of a statement. The latter was Carnap’s focus; at the outset he worked out a structural and logical conception of epistemic probability, influenced by Waismann and Keynes, as further explained in the supplement Inductive Logic, and progressed over the years toward a more “personalist” view, though never giving up the logical conception entirely. He worked closely with various students and associates on these problems, especially Richard Jeffrey, Yehoshua Bar-Hillel, and John Kemeny. See section 8.2 below, see the supplement Inductive Logic for the details of his structural account of probability, and see the supplement Methodology (Section 1) for his probabilistic explication(s) of inductive confirmation. Ray J. Solomonoff’s work on universal inductive inference was also triggered by Carnap’s inductive logic. (Solomonoff studied with Carnap in Chicago. See Sterkenburg 2018 for a discussion and evaluation.)

1.7 Structuralism

Another strand of Carnap’s indifference to ontology was his lifelong focus on structures as the main objects of knowledge. Even as early as 1922, Carnap had thought that mathematics, correctly understood, is not so much the study of quantity and number as the study of structures; Kant’s dictum that something is scientific just insofar as it is mathematical was now superseded, he thought, by his new dictum that something is scientific just insofar as it is structural (Carnap 1922b: p. cl[r], translated and quoted in Carus 2007a: 163). And if the object of our knowledge is not the particular or the qualitative but the structural, then, as Hermann Weyl had said, “A science can determine its subject matter only up to an isomorphic representation”.

In particular, it is altogether indifferent toward the “essence” of its objects of study…It is mysticism to expect of scientific knowledge that it reveal—to acquaintance—a deeper essence than that openly available to acquaintance. The conception of isomorphism pinpoints the unquestionable and ineluctable limit to knowledge. (Weyl 1926: 22 [1947: 25–26])

Weyl speaks here in the language of axiomatic systems and their structurally identical—isomorphic—models, a language largely articulated at the beginning of the twentieth century by David Hilbert. But Hilbert had only made more precise the notions of structuralism that went further back and had animated a great deal of nineteenth-century mathematics (see Schiemer 2013), culminating in the group-theoretic (algebraic) understanding of the new non-Euclidean geometries and Felix Klein’s celebrated “Erlanger Programm” for the unification of geometry by this means, which also inspired the early Bertrand Russell. Russell himself, and before him Gottlob Frege and Richard Dedekind, had given “top-down” definitions of structural concepts by means of higher-order logical quantifiers (as in Frege’s 1879 famous definition of the ancestral of a relation in his Begriffsschrift, or in Dedekind’s 1888 definition of simply infinite system in his Was sind und was sollen die Zahlen?, or in Whitehead and Russell’s 1910–1913 Principia Mathematica), all of which influenced Carnap significantly. An equally important influence, at about the same time as Klein, was the epistemological structuralism of Hermann von Helmholtz. Carnap was clearly inspired by these ideas, not only in his earliest work, but all through his career, even into his work on probability and induction, as we will see below (section 8).

Carnap is best known, though, for his application of structuralism first to epistemology, in the Aufbau, and then to mathematics itself, in the Syntax and later work, as well as to mathematically formulated scientific theories. The frameworks discussed in section 1.2 above were always structural ones, in which Carnap invariably abstracted from the actual instantiation of the structures in question in actual languages or conceptual systems, with the result that even some of his closest allies and associates misunderstood him, including (among others) Russell, Neurath, Popper, and Quine (see sections 3 through 8 below for details). The articulation of these structural frameworks is discussed in the supplements Aufbau, Logical Syntax of Language, Semantics, and Reconstruction of Scientific Theories.

Carnap’s structuralism about mathematics also points forward, in its anticipation, for instance, of Tarski’s structural delimitation of logic modeled on the Erlanger Programm (Tarski 1986, Sher 1991), and has recently been seen as a precursor of a new form of mathematical structuralism based on homotopy type theory in its emphasis on invariance (Awodey 2017).

From the Aufbau (see the supplement Aufbau (Section 2) on Carnap’s early structuralism) to his mature reconstruction of scientific theories (see the supplement The Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 6) on Carnap’s later structuralism), Carnap sought to articulate an innovative type of conceptual or linguistic structuralism about science that is metaphysically neutral and which resembles modern versions of structuralism about mathematics: the cognitive content of what can be asserted precisely and meaningfully in science can be reconstructed as a structural constraint on empirical content, and one should aim at such structural reconstructions as they enhance the objectivity of science. While structural properties are expressed using logical concepts usually discussed in the context of deductive logic, Carnap’s later work on inductive logic considers probability measures that are logical or structural in the analogous sense, i.e., where probabilities remain invariant under isomorphisms. This “inductive structuralism” is discussed in supplement Inductive Logic.

1.8 Values

Carnap is not generally known for his (very sparse) publications about values, but what he did publish is sufficient (in conjunction with recently published texts) to yield a fairly accurate insight into his thinking, which turns out to be sufficiently original to have significant potential for further development. Carnap’s main publication on values is the final (and longest) chapter of his replies to critics in the Schilpp volume (the Reply to Kaplan, Carnap 1963b). On the basis of this text, Carnap has generally been classified simply as an (ethical) non-cognitivist. And there is a close resemblance between Carnap’s proposed logic of normative statements (“optatives”, Carnap calls them) and that of Richard Hare (1954) published at about the time Carnap’s reply was written (though it was not published until 1963). The term “non-cognitivist” to describe the view that normative statements cannot be true or false (and that therefore no “ought” can be derived from an “is”, as Hume had put it), was, in fact, proposed by Carnap—one of his more widely-accepted (if low-profile) coinages.

However, it had been assumed that since Carnap required a framework to be in place for any kind of rational discourse to be possible, the choice of frameworks itself must be simply a matter of personal whim, at the level of Hume’s declaration that there is no rational argument for me to prefer the relief of a pain in my little toe to the prevention of some world-engulfing catastrophe. This problem of the irrationality of framework choice (George 2012) or—put another way—the supposed infinite regress in the selection of meta-frameworks for the choice of framework (Richardson 2007; Steinberger 2016; Carus 2017) has been discussed recently from various angles. It is a special case, in the way Carnap is still usually seen, of the supposedly more general impossibility, for Carnap, of bringing reason to bear on normative choices, since in his view all reasoning seems to presuppose internality to a framework.

But from an interpretive viewpoint, this was clearly an unsatisfactory position, since Carnap had in fact from his earliest days used reasoning to argue for normative positions, and continued to do so all his life. So there seemed to be a tension, at such a basic level that one would surely think Carnap must or should have been aware of it. In fact, there is no tension, as it turns out that Carnap (at least in his later years and probably for much of his career) held a quasi-Kantian view whereby the logical reasoning we employ in mathematics, logic, and science (including inductive logic and decision theory) is conceived as subordinate to (and narrower in scope than) a purely normative form of reasoning—in Kantian terms, Verstand (understanding) is subordinate to (and narrower than) Vernunft (reason). So at least it appears from a recently published fragmentary draft Carnap wrote in 1958 of a continuation of or sequel to the reply to Kaplan about values that had appeared in the Schilpp volume (Carnap 2017); see the supplement Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology for further discussion.

More recent forms of normative non-cognitivism have recast their doctrines somewhat to describe them as “expressivist” (Blackburn 1993; Gibbard 1990). From this starting point Huw Price (1988) has sought to generalize expressivism to include not only normative language but other kinds as well. In some more recent expositions of this proposed globalized expressivism or “functional pluralism” (Price 1997; see also Creath 1994 on the sense on which Carnap’s view can be called “functionalist”), he invokes Carnap’s conception of mathematics as the exemplar on which he proposes to model his approach to all sectors of language; he calls this the “Carnap thesis”, and assigns it fundamental importance in the development of a new “global expressivism” as he also calls his position (Price 2013, 2018). In view of the discussion above, it would seem that Carnap himself had already generalized his functionalist “Carnap thesis” regarding mathematics to at least values and possibly also to other sectors of language (Carus 2018; Price 2018). This is also consistent with the new-found interest in Carnap’s “inferentialism” (Peregrin 2011, forthcoming; Chalmers 2012), discussed further in section 5 below. Perhaps, in some respects, current philosophy is beginning to catch up to Carnap.

(General surveys of Carnap’s work can be found in, e.g., Mormann 2000, Friedman and Creath 2007.)

2. Toward the Aufbau

2.1 Beginnings

Carnap was born on 18 May 1891 in the small town of Ronsdorf, now part of Wuppertal, an industrial city near the Ruhr area of northwestern Germany. His mother was a schoolteacher, and her father, Friedrich Wilhelm Dörpfeld (1824–93), had been a leading educator and educational thinker in the Herbartian tradition. Carnap was home-schooled by his mother until secondary school, and brought up religious, but the emphasis was on the ethical, rather than the doctrinal, dimensions of religious life. As a result, Carnap said, he had no crisis of conscience when he later abandoned any belief in God or the supernatural. In 1908 the family moved to Jena, into the house of another famous relative, Carnap’s maternal uncle Wilhelm Dörpfeld (son of Friedrich Wilhelm), a well-known and highly influential archaeologist. Carnap made trips to Greece with his uncle during this time. He subsequently finished secondary school in Jena and enrolled in the university there, studying philosophy, physics, and mathematics, vaguely intending to become a high-school science teacher.

At the University of Jena he soon encountered the “Sera Circle”, an offshoot of the Youth Movement that swept Germany in the years before World War I. He became enthralled with the idea, as he later said, that social forms and behavioral standards did not have to be assimilated uncritically from the surrounding society, or from tradition, but could be freely invented. The “voluntarism” that suffuses every phase of his later philosophical career (Jeffrey 1992) seems to have had its origins here. He became not only an enthusiastic participant in the Youth Movement but also a leader, representing the Jena branch at the climactic national meeting of local Youth Movement groups at the Hoher Meißner in 1913 (Werner 2003).

Carnap’s first exposure to logic came from an obscure and reclusive professor of mathematics at Jena, Gottlob Frege. Carnap was so fascinated that he took every course Frege offered (including two courses on Frege’s Begriffsschrift and a course on Logic in Mathematics). His resulting shorthand notes are sufficiently detailed to permit a reconstruction of Frege’s response after the system of the Grundgesetze had been undermined by Russell’s paradox (Reck & Awodey 2005). It would be another decade, though, before Carnap came to see Frege’s logic as the key to a new way of doing philosophy. Carnap also studied with neo-Kantians and Lebensphilosophen, including Bruno Bauch (whose course on Kant’s First Critique left a lasting impression), Herman Nohl (a student of Dilthey) and—while in Freiburg for a semester—Heinrich Rickert, whose lectures Carnap was particularly enthusiastic about.

The war interrupted this development. Carnap and his Youth Movement friends, though hardly enthralled, felt they could not shirk their duty to serve. Carnap spent most of 1914–17 at the front (first the eastern, then the western), and took part in some of the bloodiest engagements. In 1917 he was wounded, awarded the Iron Cross, and spent the remainder of the war at a radio research facility in Berlin. He also became politically active: he joined the (by then anti-war) Independent Socialist Party, circulated excerpts from the world press, mostly critical of the German government, to friends with his comments (Werner 2015), and participated in the transformation of the Youth Movement (or parts of it) into a political force. He teamed up with Karl Bittel, another Youth Movement leader, to start the underground Political Circular, a newsletter for university Youth Movement adherents that appeared irregularly during the months immediately preceding the German Revolution of 1918. In the first issue, Carnap reviewed two books on proposals for worldwide political union (Carnap 1918a). He also prepared for publication a much longer and more detailed analysis of the entire political situation following Germany’s military defeat, but the Revolution occurred just as it was to be published, and it never appeared. (See the editors’ introduction to Carnap 2019; it has now been published, along with other early Carnap manuscripts, in Damböck, Sandner, & Werner forthcoming.)

Carnap’s newfound political orientation was a non-Marxist libertarian socialism of a kind represented by Gustav Landauer (1870–1919), a writer much admired by both Bittel and Carnap (Carnap 1919: 124, as described in Carus 2007a: 59). What is most striking about Carnap’s unpublished analysis of the German situation after the defeat, though, is how unpolitical it remains, in any literal sense. He certainly deplores the unwillingness of educated Germans to dirty their hands with politics, and urges a fundamental change in attitude, balancing the exclusive German emphasis on the contemplative life with greater involvement in the active life. However, what Carnap calls “politics” in this analysis is “everything… that has some connection with the public social life of people”—which, as he makes quite explicit, includes practically all human activities, including some very ivory-tower ones. Indeed, the key to his advocacy of greater “political involvement” is that he assigns intellectual work a central and indispensable role in arriving at the “form of community [Gemeinschaftsgestalt]” that could serve to coordinate the vast and heterogeneous multitude of tasks and jobs that have “some connection with the public social life of people”. Only by virtue of such a “form of community” can we hope to remove this otherwise anarchic hive of activities “from the realm of chaotic whim and subordinate them to goal-oriented reason” [“der choatischen Willkür zu entziehen und der zielbewußten Vernunft zu unterwerfen”] (Carnap 1918b: 17–18, translated and quoted in Carus 2007a: 63).

2.2 Der Raum

For Carnap the basis for “goal-oriented reason” could only be a comprehensive system of knowledge, and this exhortation to remove the design of our system of the sciences “from the realm of chaotic whim”, and to “subordinate” it to “goal-oriented reason” reverberates throughout his early philosophical papers (e.g., Carnap 1923: 107), which have now been published together with English translations in Carnap (2019). In the editors’ introduction to this new edition it is argued that this program was not just a momentary response to a particular crisis, but continued to inform the architectonic of Carnap’s philosophy throughout its development. This is hardly disputed with respect to the immediately following stages of Carnap’s career, addressing the nature and design of the system of knowledge—his dissertation on philosophical problems of space and geometry, Der Raum (1922a) and other early papers. Der Raum [Space] prefigures later works in its effort to disentangle various meanings of the word “space” and to show that philosophical confusion had resulted from the failure to distinguish them clearly. In this case, Carnap distinguishes “formal”, “intuitive”, and “physical” space. The first was a purely logical or set-theoretic construction of space; the second was built up from a version of Hilbert’s axioms restricted to a local, subjective space; the third was the space of physics. In each case, by separate arguments, Carnap reaches the conclusion that the space we must assume as the precondition for any knowledge is not Euclidean space, as Kant had argued (and some Kantians such as Natorp were still arguing), nor even any metric space, but topological space of arbitrarily many dimensions. While this represents a form of (neo-)Kantianism Carnap would soon leave behind, it was tempered by the critical role of the “factual basis [Tatbestand]” in deciding among mathematically possible kinds of physical space. The factual basis was determined only up to the topological relations among its elements; Carnap’s residual Kantianism is expressed in the topologically “necessary form” (not reaching to metrical relations) our perception imposes on its elements (see Heis 2011 on the neo-Kantian background in the philosophy of geometry).

2.3 The Aufbau Program

A series of notes taken during this period exhibit Carnap’s preoccupation with the question how the system of knowledge could, unlike the proposals of Diderot and d’Alembert in the Encyclopédie and those in its wake such as Comte’s and Ostwald’s (1914a, 1914b), be unified deductively, as Leibniz—and Frege—had envisaged (on Ostwald as a starting point for Carnap during this period, see Dahms 2016). What especially preoccupied the young Carnap was the challenge of giving the system empiricist underpinnings, i.e., finding deductive relations between sense perceptions and the abstract concepts of the advanced sciences. For a year or two he struggled with this problem without success, until finally, in early 1922, just before the publication of Der Raum, Carnap read Bertrand Russell’s Our Knowledge of the External World (1914). Here he found his answer—the concepts were to be derived not by analysis of experience, and deduction from the resulting elements, but by construction, using a “principle of abstraction” (Russell 1914a: 44–45; see also Pincock 2002). Experiences could be gathered into equivalence classes, and for purposes of constructing a “real” world, each such class can be regarded as a concept, defined by its extension. Immediate, momentary experience—the basis for knowledge among positivists, phenomenologists, as well as fictionalists such as the German philosopher Hans Vaihinger—need not be transcended in such a construction. The hitherto insurmountable problem of forcing the fluid character of lived experience into the straitjacket of deductive relations disappears.

This move also overcame another traditional positivist and phenomenological obstacle to Carnap’s project of a Leibnizian, deductive system of knowledge, formulated most drastically by Hans Vaihinger (who influenced Carnap in this regard): the “chaos” of subjective experience, as we immediately experience it, has no structure whatever. Nothing is really “given” but the undifferentiated chaos itself. No distinguishable “elements” present themselves as naturally isolable from it or as inherently available, without externally imposed fictions. Russell’s principle of abstraction—his method of substituting “logical constructions for inferred entities” (such as qualities)—solved this problem, but with the addition of a small but indispensable contribution from phenomenology. What enabled Carnap to obtain the elements he sought without isolating identifiable elements within the undifferentiated “chaos” was a single act of phenomenological discernment: a partition of the entire “chaos” into just two sectors, which he called the “living” and “dead” components of experience. This one distinction allowed Carnap to arrange experiences into a temporal sequence (“dead” experience is past; “living” experience present), making it possible to identify holistic temporal cross-sections of experience, in which the total experience of a given specious present remains intact as a momentary whole. This chronological sequence of experiential time-slices now gave Carnap the basic framework he needed for identifying qualities as cross-temporal equivalence classes of discernable persistences across series of adjacent specious presents. These holistic time-slices did not need to be analysed. Qualities and qualitative relations could, rather, be constructed as something like equivalence classes of sufficiently “similar” persistences across a series of adjacent time-slices (up to any desired degree of precision in “similarity”). The result was that what empiricists such as Hume or Mach had always hoped to achieve by “analysis of the sensations” could be achieved without analysis. Carnap called it “quasianalysis” (which is explained in more detail in the supplement Methodology (Section 3)). Physical objects could be constructed as connected classes of qualities, and from objects the path to a “reality” seemed clear.

In this early stage of what became the Aufbau project, Carnap still followed Vaihinger in distinguishing sharply between the direct, genuine, first-hand knowledge of the “chaos” and the fictive, constructed nature of “reality”. But he put the boundary between them in a different place. This was because Husserl’s phenomenology offered an escape route from Vaihinger’s completely undifferentiated chaos. It yielded certain distinctions within the chaos (e.g., between “living” and “dead” experience) that could claim a degree of objectivity. These distinctions, Carnap then thought, were not fictional, but actually extended the range of what could be genuinely known, even without fictions, just from the chaos itself. So Carnap’s boundary between the immediately known primary world (of sensory “chaos” plus a minimal, phenomenologically extrapolated structure) and a fictive secondary world of “reality” included more in the “primary” sector than Vaihinger’s. Carnap thought he could show on phenomenological grounds that the primary world is two-dimensional in all sense modalities (Carnap 1924). So the boundary between the fixed primary world and the freely choosable secondary worlds (“realities”) was located at the ascent from two to three dimensions. Within the primary world, the construction proceeded entirely by explicit definition, beginning from the qualities obtained by quasianalysis. Secondary worlds, by contrast, are not uniquely determined. The construction of a secondary world proceeds, rather, by optimizing its fit to whichever fictions are chosen to guide the construction, subject to the constraint of the (fixed) primary world.

Carnap remained as radically pragmatist about the choice among fictions to guide this ascent as Vaihinger; the choice of fictions was entirely practical and purpose-relative. (For more on Vaihinger’s account of fictions, see, e.g., Chapter 1 of Appiah 2017.) To obtain the scientific secondary world, Carnap maintained, we need only two fictions, corresponding roughly to Kant’s categories of cause and substance: a principle of induction (or uniformity of nature) and a principle of “continuity” (as Mach had called it), requiring certain clusters of perceptions, such as those grouped into a “physical object”, to remain constant, under certain conditions, while we are not perceiving them.

Sometime during 1924, the Aufbau project changed course drastically, and arrived at essentially its later published form (Carus 2016). The phenomenological approach to the basis was dropped; a fixed “primary world” was no longer to be distinguished by phenomenological intimation from the various “secondary worlds” built upon it. Russell’s “construction principle”, as Carnap called it, came to dominate the project, and would become the book’s epigraph:

The supreme maxim in scientific philosophizing is this: Wherever possible, logical constructions are to be substituted for inferred entities. (B. Russell 1914a: 155)

So now the two-dimensionality of perceptual space, for instance, is no longer obtainable from phenomenological discernment, but becomes as much a logical construction as everything else (Aufbau: §§89, 117, 124). And in a talk Carnap gave about the Aufbau project in Vienna in January 1925, we find a new guiding principle: “Overcoming subjectivity” (Carnap 1925a, 1925b, as quoted in Carus 2007a: 168; 2016).

2.4 Vienna and Wittgenstein

After completing the Aufbau first draft in late 1925, along these new lines, Carnap left for Vienna, where he became a lecturer [Privatdozent] and submitted the Aufbau manuscript to Moritz Schlick as his Habilitationsschrift. He immediately became an active participant in Schlick’s weekly Circle, which was embarking just then on yet another careful re-reading of Wittgenstein’s Tractatus. This group would soon (due to Otto Neurath’s effective propaganda) become known to the world as the “Vienna Circle”, the fount of a new (anti-)philosophy known as “logical positivism”—a term Carnap never liked.

Like others in the Vienna Circle, Carnap saw the Tractatus as a basis for solving the perennial problem of accommodating the truths of logic and mathematics to empiricism. Wittgenstein was no empiricist, but his characterization of logical truth as a pure artifact of representation, empty of empirical significance, gave the Vienna Circle what they needed. Their logicism extended Wittgenstein’s truth-functional conception of logic to the whole of mathematics, and their empiricism interpreted Wittgenstein’s atomic sentences as sense perceptions, along the lines of the Elementarerlebnisse at the basis of Carnap’s Aufbau. This version of Wittgenstein made mathematics consistent with empiricism. However, its weaknesses were obvious even to the Circle: First, from the empiricist perspective of the Vienna Circle, Wittgenstein’s truth-functional conception of logic seemed to require finitism; even the most abstract theories of physics could then employ only restricted, finitary quantification rather than unrestricted quantification over a potentially infinite number of observations ( Aufbau: §180; Carnap 1936–37: §23). And second, Wittgenstein’s exclusion of “elucidations” (meta-sentences about the object sentences framed in the language of science) was not only paradoxical (it made all statement and discussion of logical principles meaningless) but seemed at odds with recent developments in the foundations of mathematics, especially Hilbert’s metamathematics, and the brilliant use made of this approach by Skolem, Tarski, and by one of Carnap’s own students, Kurt Gödel. (In turn, Gödel’s arithmetization of syntax and his incompleteness theorems would have an enormous impact on Carnap’s Logical Syntax of Language just a few years later—see the supplement on Logical Syntax of Language for more details.)

Carnap set to work, after his arrival in Vienna, to solve these two problems. He embarked on a major project to explore “general axiomatics”, in which he sought to show that Hilbertian axiomatics could be accommodated within the Wittgensteinian representational framework—i.e., he sought to show that the Hilbertian “method of bifurcation” (into metalanguage and object language), while mathematically useful, could ultimately be reduced to a Wittgensteinian single language. The immediate goal was to prove a fundamental completeness theorem, purporting to show that a consistent axiom system is categorical just in case it is decidable (Awodey & Carus 2001). After three years of concentrated work on this project (a substantial manuscript of several hundred pages survives in Carnap’s papers), Alfred Tarski convinced him that this theorem was defective, and that Carnap’s attempt to work within a single language failed to capture the metamathematical concepts fully (but see Schiemer 2013). And late in 1930, Gödel actually showed that an important special case of Carnap’s theorem was false: second-order arithmetic, though categorical, is not decidable. This famous result put an end to Carnap’s project of fusing Hilbert and Wittgenstein.

3. The Aufbau

3.1 Main Point and Motivation of the Aufbau

As we saw in section 2 above, the Aufbau project began as a continuation of the encyclopedic ambitions of the Enlightenment, in response to the catastrophe of the war and the hopes inspired by the German revolution—only that in contrast to the eighteenth-century Encyclopédistes, and to similar projects since then, Carnap conceived the idea of a system of knowledge as a deductive system, under the influence of his teacher Frege.

By the time of the book’s publication the emphasis had shifted, but the idea of bringing all concepts into a single deductive system survives. In a lecture given to a general audience in Vienna in 1929, Carnap explains the point of his book by telling a dialectical story of human history as a struggle between “critical intellect” and “imagination”. At first imagination ruled the day, but then in antiquity, critical intellect made a discovery that enabled it to put strict limits on imagination’s claims:

That is the discovery of one [single] comprehensive space. All things are in space; any two things are always spatially related to each other. So there is also a path from me to any [given] thing.

So existence claims could now be subjected to a simple test:

Every thing is accessible. If someone now claims that a thing of a particular kind exists, I can demand of him that he show me the path from me to the claimed thing.

Imagination responds by relocating its gods and gremlins to remote or inaccessible locations, but as humankind explores more of the earth, this stops working. So imagination “goes for a really radical option; it evacuates its creations to the non-spatial, the ‘trans-spatial’”, which is plausible since we quite legitimately refer to things that are not physical objects, so not locatable in space. Feelings, mental images, and thoughts, for instance, are non-spatial. So instead of situating its gods in a physical location such as Mount Olympus, Carnap explained,

the putative God was removed from space into the realm of the spirits. God was regarded now as a spiritual being without a body.

But people starting noticing “that something isn’t quite right with that sort of claim, that there is something rather odd, something problematic about it”. So imagination went further and replaced theology with metaphysics.

Here the concept of God no longer has anything physical or anything physically rooted about it… The flight from the grasp of critical reason with its spatial system appears to have been completely successful.

But critical intellect now has an answer: the Aufbau system—“now a system is discovered that comprehends not just [corporeal] things, but everything thinkable, all concepts, whether thing-like or not”. This system is the natural successor and generalization, in Carnap’s dialectical drama, of physically all-encompassing space:

In space all things have spatial relations to each other, and there has to be a path of access from me to each thing. In the same way, on the basis of the concept-system, an all-comprehending conceptual space, so to speak, all concepts have relations to each other (in this case logical, conceptual relations). And here there has to be a connecting path to each concept from the contents of my experience, e.g., from my perceptions. Everything of which I can speak has to be traceable back to things experienced by me. All knowledge I can have relates either to my own feelings, mental images, thoughts, etc. or can be derived from my perceptions…

Though Carnap had redesigned the system in 1924 to dispense with the phenomenological development of the “primary world” from which the “realities” or “secondary worlds” of science and everyday reality were constructed, it could be said that he adopted Husserl’s method of “bracketing” the supposed external reality to which our subjective world appears to refer—and that he adopted it more radically and strictly than Husserl himself. For Carnap bracketed not just the external reality but also the internal subjectivity, leaving only the bare logical structure of the constitution system unbracketed (Carus 2016).

3.2 Significant Aspects of the Published Aufbau

In the published Aufbau this abstemious bracketing policy is applied very strictly. Carnap adopts a principle of extensionality that does not exclude the use of intensional languages in auxiliary roles, but denies them any ultimate significance. Fregean “Sinn” (sense) is specifically excluded as merely psychological (§44), having only “epistemic value” but not “logical value” (§50), which is limited to the extensional meaning of an expression. Each step in the spelled-out constitution of the subjective (“autopsychological”) world is explained not only in logical symbols but also in a simple paraphrase, then in “realistic language” (as ordinarily used in science) and finally in a language of “fictive construction”. But Carnap makes clear that this is solely for convenience and to make the steps more transparent to readers. The four languages may differ not only in form but in their “Sinn”, their epistemic value (the different mental images they elicit), he says, though their logical value is always identical and is expressed most neutrally and clearly in the symbolic language (§95); for more detail, see the supplement Aufbau.

Behind this radical extensionalism lies precisely the new strictness with which Carnap applied the Husserlian “bracketing” strategy in 1924—ironically just at the time he abandoned the phenomenological development of the constitutional basis. (More details on Carnap’s extensionalism are to be found in the supplement Semantics (Section 2).) The most direct expression of this was a more thoroughgoing and self-conscious rejection of ontology. In the final chapter of the Aufbau, which addresses some philosophical problems to which the constitutional system can be applied, the overriding theme is the irrelevance of ontological questions to the actual constitutional system (Friedman 2007). And in the same year as the Aufbau Carnap published a pamphlet on Pseudo-problems in Philosophy (Carnap 1928b) in which the “problem of realism” is the most prominent example of such pseudo-problems.

The actual detailed construction of the autopsychological realm occupies only a small part of the book. The first sections focus largely on what Carnap would later call “clarification of the explicandum” (see section 1.1 above). Carnap considers various options for the choice of basic elements (the elements or building blocks of which everything is to be constructed) and basic relations (the relations between and among these building blocks that is to effect the construction). The radicalism of Carnap’s push for simplification is expressed by his choice of only a single kind of basic elements, “elementary experiences”, and a single basic relation, “recollection of similarity”. The elementary experiences were not isolated “sense data” of traditional empiricism (the isolated pitch and timbre of momentary sounds or colored points of the visual field that we find in Hume or Mach), but holistic time slices of total experience, from which nothing has yet been abstracted; Carnap was here attempting to do justice to the psychology courses he had taken as an undergraduate, where he had learned about the new directions taken in Gestalt psychology by Köhler, Koffka, and others. By quasianalysis, an abstraction technique formalizing Russell’s “principle of abstraction”, (see the supplement Methodology (Section 3)) the similarities among these time-slices could retrospectively be grouped (by repeated application of the basic relation, recollection of similarity) into something like equivalence classes of, say, a certain color or a certain smell that were sufficiently similar. By this means Carnap constructs the subjective cognitive world of a single mind in some detail, up to the point where, on that basis, a three-dimensional objective world of space-time can be constructed (see the supplement Aufbau (Section 2) for more detail concerning some of these constructions).

At this crucial point of the Aufbau (§§125–7), the ascent from two to three dimensions, where Carnap stops spelling out the steps in detail, he also suspends the explicit definition applied up to there, and instead resorts to an informally described optimization approach, whereby certain fairly obvious desiderata (continuity of motions, temporal continuity of objects and processes, etc.) are to be maximized subject to certain (again fairly obvious) constraints (see the supplement Aufbau (Section 3) for further details). The construction of the physical realm and the further realms on its basis (the heteropsychological, social, cultural, and value realms) are sketched very sparsely. The book ends with a final section discussing some philosophical consequences of the constitution system, addressing (though only obliquely, and hardly by name) both phenomenology and various forms of realism.

3.3 Later Discussion of the Aufbau

When the book was published in 1928, it was widely discussed and, along with Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, became one of the classic texts of the Vienna Circle. Its effect was amplified in the English-speaking world by A.J. Ayer’s acknowledgement of Carnap as the philosopher to whom he “owe[s] most” in his best-selling Language, Truth, and Logic (Ayer 1936), which was understood as an accessible summary exposition of the supposed phenomenalism of the Aufbau, but misrepresented the book quite seriously. This misrepresentation contributed to the later neglect of the book among Anglo-American philosophers, which even the sophisticated discussion, critique, and further development by Nelson Goodman (1951) or the belated English translation (1967) could hardly budge. It also allowed many preconceptions about the book to continue circulating almost through the end of the twentieth century.

Only toward the end of that century did a revaluation set in, initiated by Michael Friedman, who took issue, in a series of papers (later collected in Friedman 1999), with the entire English-speaking tradition (going back to Ayer) of seeing the Aufbau as a phenomenalist project of reducing all knowledge to sense impressions on the model of Hume or Mach. Instead, Friedman pointed out, we should see it in the context of its neo-Kantian origins. From that perspective, the Aufbau is better understood as seeking a new basis of scientific objectivity—achieving objective knowledge despite the subjective starting point of individual perception, and the structuralism discussed above (section 3.2). On the basis of Friedman’s discussions, many others have since contributed to the revaluation of the Aufbau (Richardson 1998; Mormann 2000; Pincock 2005, 2009; the papers collected in Damböck 2016.)

This new interpretive interest in the Aufbau and its philosophical context has also led to renewed efforts to reconstruct the Aufbau’s constitution system with new tools. Goodman’s 1951 critique of quasianalysis has finally found responses and repairs from Mormann (1994, 1997, 2009) and Leitgeb (2007); Leitgeb (2011) goes further and argues that if the goals of the Aufbau strategy are limited in certain ways, Goodman’s and Quine’s critiques no longer apply (see the supplement Aufbau (Sections 3 and 4)). Chalmers (2012) suggests a much more drastic rationalistic revision of the Aufbau; where Carnap thought it would be possible, in principle, to derive all true scientific sentences whatsoever from basic true sentences in an “empiricistically acceptable” constitution system just by means of the system’s definitions, Chalmers drops any empiricist ambitions and replaces the role of definitions by that of a priori knowledge, including synthetic a priori knowledge (whose existence Carnap of course denied).

4. The Road to Syntax

The Wittgensteinian program favored by the Vienna Circle (section 2.4 above) had collapsed in 1930. But Carnap soon recovered, and during a sleepless night on 21 January 1931, conceived of an entirely new basis for the Vienna Circle’s characteristic doctrines (Awodey & Carus 2009). Instead of trying to fuse Hilbert and Wittgenstein, Carnap now dropped Wittgenstein altogether and pursued a Hilbertian approach. “Meaning” was no longer rooted in the correspondence between configurations of elementary facts and their linguistic representations. In fact, meaning was banished altogether, at least in our statements about the language of science (our metalinguistic “elucidations” such as those in the Tractatus itself or the Aufbau). The scientific language itself had empirical meaning, but how this was to be understood became a matter of dispute (the famous “protocol-sentence debate”) within the Vienna Circle (the sentences recording observations were called Protokollsätze by the Circle, which became “protocol sentences” in English). This brought about a split in the Circle between a more realistic “right wing” (who adhered to something closer to Wittgenstein’s picture theory and held that once a state of affairs was “registered [konstatiert]” by an observer there could be no further doubt) and the “left wing” who followed Carnap in his new reference-avoiding syntax program (see Uebel 2007 on this debate). In any case our elucidations of the object language remain, in the new syntax framework, entirely within the linguistic realm; we are talking always and only about language. In logical syntax, we should be careful not to talk about “facts” or “things” but instead only about sentences or thing-names. We should restrict ourselves in principle to the “formal mode of speech” (sentences and names), employing the “material mode of speech” (facts and things) only for convenience, and when we are sure we can translate it into the formal mode. The (meta-)mathematical methods of Hilbert, Tarski, and Gödel were, in other words, to be extended to the whole of knowledge.

Carnap’s immediate task was to create a canonical language for the formal mode of speech. Taking his cue from Hilbert’s metamathematics, he began by stripping this language down to bare bones, eliminating all problematic assumptions. It would consist simply of strings of dots on a page, and the basic laws of arithmetic would arise unambiguously in the metalanguage from the immediately evident patterns of dots (e.g., the commutative law from the perceptibly equivalent number of dots counted from the left and from the right). Carnap soon found he could not express certain essential concepts in this limited language, and turned instead to a more usual axiomatized arithmetic. This also had the advantage that, by using Gödel’s new trick of arithmetizing syntax, Carnap could now more easily express the syntax of the language (i.e., its logic) in the language itself. So the syntactic metalanguage collapses into the object language, and there is, as before, only a single language. The canonical language for the formal mode of speech seemed within his grasp.

This idea also gave Carnap a new route to the elimination of metaphysics, superseding the Wittgensteinian strategy with its meaning criterion. The new criterion dispensed with meaning. It required that any statement either be at the object level (straightforwardly factual) or translatable into the formal mode of speech—i.e., into the canonical language or an equivalent. Carnap assumed that his canonical language, once fully worked out, could express the entire language of physics, as well as containing its own metalanguage. Since the Vienna Circle’s “unity of science” program held that all knowledge was expressible in the language of physics, Carnap proposed his canonical language as a universal language for all knowledge (Carnap 1932b). Another way of expressing the new criterion, then, was that any acceptable statement must be phrased in the language of physics. The new idea of January 1931 flowed into Carnap’s discussions with Neurath and others to produce the new doctrine of physicalism (Uebel 2007, 2018).

But the demands on the “correct” language for the formal mode of speech were exorbitant. Carnap had originally wanted to keep it weak and uncontroversial, but it had to be capable of expressing all the mathematics needed for physics. On the other hand, its arithmetized syntax had to be capable of expressing the basic concept of “analytic truth”, or it would be impossible to determine when a formal-mode statement “holds”. Before 1930, it had been assumed that provability was the standard of mathematical truth, but now Gödel had shown that for each consistent and recursively axiomatized system that included enough arithmetic, some true sentences are not provable in the system. So a different criterion was needed, but one that would still—like provability—pick out the logically true sentences solely by means of the formation and transformation rules of the language. Carnap did attempt such a criterion for “analyticity” in the first draft of his syntax book (entitled Metalogic), written in late 1931 and the spring of 1932. He sent the typescript to Gödel, who pointed out that the new criterion was defective. In fact, he added, it is impossible to define analyticity or logical truth in any metalanguage that can be faithfully represented in the object language (e.g., by arithmetization); this is now familiar to us as Tarski’s theorem on the indefinability of truth. So Carnap’s single-language approach fails after all (Awodey & Carus 2007, 2009).

And without the single canonical language containing its own metalanguage, there is no longer any reason to regard any particular metalanguage as more “suitable” or “natural” than any other. One option may turn out to be more useful than another for particular purposes, but this is no reason to privilege it as uniquely “correct” (or canonical). With Gödel’s assistance, Carnap developed a new definition of analyticity, but it hardly seemed to matter any more; the language relativity of any definition of truth or analyticity moved to the center of attention. The disputes about protocol sentences within the Vienna Circle merged in Carnap’s mind with the disputes among intuitionists, logicists, and formalists in the philosophy of mathematics.

All these disputes, he realized in the autumn of 1932, concerned the question of how to set up a language, which has no right or wrong answers. One could only try out different ways, and see which ones worked better. This new attitude, which first appeared in Carnap’s reply to Neurath about protocol sentences (Carnap 1932b), received its definitive statement in the “principle of tolerance” quoted in 1c. above, enunciated in the Logical Syntax of Language (LSS: §17). In this principle, the voluntarist and utopian convictions of his youth, partially submerged during the Aufbau period, finally found adequate philosophical expression. He spent the remainder of his career absorbing the consequences of this breakthrough, and working on a vast number of language projects within the new freedom it afforded.

5. Logical Syntax of Language

The Syntax is probably Carnap’s best-known book, and has attracted much of the renewed attention to Carnap in recent years. At the time of its publication, the Vienna Circle was disintegrating, its members were fleeing from political persecution, and philosophical communication was disrupted. Its English translation, published 1937, lacked context and was almost uniformly misunderstood by nearly everyone, with the partial exception of Quine, whose later work in logic, the philosophy of logic, and logic-based philosophy was inspired by—though sometimes opposed to—the Logical Syntax. Through Quine, some of Carnap’s ideas eventually also found their way into the logic education of many philosophy departments in the US. On the other hand, what Quine understood, as is evident from his 1934 Harvard Lectures, immediately after the book’s publication (reprinted in Creath 1990), was the first draft of the Logical Syntax, in which the principle of tolerance was still absent. So even his comprehension of the Syntax was partial and one-sided (Creath 1987, Friedman 2006). In any case, the book was widely assumed to have been superseded by the time the translation appeared, now that Carnap had meanwhile embraced semantics and dropped his insistence on the “formal mode of speech” (above, section 1.3). Only recently, therefore, has the Syntax come to be appreciated in its full radicalism.

In this recent work, the principle of tolerance has attracted the most attention. Previously, the rejection of meaning and insistence on the formal, rather than the material, mode of speech had been in the foreground since, after all, the entire philosophical Part V of the book had been devoted to it, and Quine had reinforced that emphasis. It is fair to say that the principle of tolerance taken by itself—unlike the notion of analyticity or theses of conventionalism (see the supplement Carnap vs Quine on the Analytic-Synthetic Distinction)—was hardly discussed before its present, belated reception in the Carnap literature. It is a new idea on the philosophical scene today, whose consequences are still being digested.

It certainly has lost none of its explosive revolutionary force as a radical program for philosophy (Creath 2009), and this is what has most divided commentators. Like most revolutionary ideas, it has encountered steadfast and vocal resistance. Most commentators have been concerned to limit the scope of the principle of tolerance, to dilute it or trivialize it, while the appreciative minority has mostly remained defensive. Much of the literature, therefore, is devoted to clarification and the correction of misunderstandings (e.g., Goldfarb & Ricketts 1992; Ricketts 1994; Goldfarb 1995), rather than positive explorations of the principle of tolerance and its consequences (with a few exceptions: Carus 2017, Kitcher 2008, Creath 2009, Kutz, Mossakowski, and Lücke 2010, Justus 2012). Thus the remainder of this section will, after a brief exposition of the book’s contents, focus on these recent discussions and clarifications. Carnap’s principle of tolerance is discussed in more detail in section 1 of the supplement Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology, and the Logical Syntax more generally in the supplement Logical Syntax of Language.

5.1 Brief Exposition of Logical Syntax

The stated aim of the book is to show that logic is syntactical, i.e., that it consists in formal theories of linguistic symbols—a theory is “formal”, Carnap says (LSS [1937: 1]) when

no reference is made in it to either the meaning of the symbols (e.g., the words) or to the sense of the expressions (e.g., the sentences), but simply and solely to the kinds and order of the symbols from which the expressions are constructed.

The idea had of course been suggested by Hilbert’s “method of bifurcation [Methode der Zweiteilung]” as Carnap had called it, distinguishing a meta-mathematics with concrete meaning, on the one hand, from mathematics proper, on the other, which was to be regarded as purely formal, and the formal properties of which (e.g., consistency) Hilbert had aimed to study and prove in meta-mathematics—a method which Carnap sought to extend from mathematics to the whole of knowledge. The “chief motivation for my development of the syntactical method”, Carnap later wrote, was this:

In our discussions in the Vienna Circle it had turned out that any attempt at formulating more precisely the philosophical problems in which we were interested ended up with problems of the logical analysis of language. Since in our view the issue in philosophical problems concerned the language, not the world, these problems should be formulated, not in the object language, but in the metalanguage. Therefore it seemed to me that the development of a suitable metalanguage would essentially contribute toward greater clarity in the formulation of philosophical problems and greater fruitfulness in their discussions. (Carnap 1963a: 55)

That the main concepts of deductive logic (“e.g., provability, derivability from given premises, logical independence, etc”.) are purely syntactical was argued primarily by showing how they could be defined in two exemplary languages without reference to the meanings of any terms. Language I is a form of primitive recursive arithmetic, and was intended to exemplify a constructivist kind of language, while Language II contains classical mathematics. (In modern terminology, both of these “languages” are really theories.) Of the book’s five parts, the first three are taken up with the development of these two languages. In part IV, Carnap goes beyond the treatment of specific languages to sketch a template for “general syntax”; he tries to give a framework for the syntactical development or description of any language whatever. He abstracts from the syntactical categories of the particular language under consideration, and does not even assume he is given its set of variables, the distinction between its logical and descriptive vocabulary, its negation symbol, or any other syntactic property. Instead, all these sets and concepts are to be defined solely from the transformation (inference) rules of the language (see §46–47); Carnap is developing here what we would now call a version of “proof-theoretic semantics” or “logical inferentialism” (see the supplement Logical Syntax of Language for further details). Throughout all parts of the Logical Syntax, Carnap distinguishes between the “d-terms” specifiable this way (derivable, proof, demonstrable, refutable, decidable) from the “c-terms” (consequence, valid, contravalid, determinate, incompatible, content, synonymous). Though both are considered to be “syntactic” terms by Carnap, the c-terms seem closer to what we would now call “semantic”. This raises the question, for the modern reader, what Carnap actually means by “syntactic” (or “formal”) here; and it turns out (as Carnap himself later recognized) that “syntax” includes much of what he would later call “semantics”. Indeed we find (Wagner 2009: 22) that languages I and II are not actually “formal” in our sense at all; they are interpreted languages. While the syntactic method, as Carnap here conceives of it, requires that the interpretations be disregarded, a particular fixed interpretation implicitly remains in place. Carnap often refers to the import of some syntactic result or attribute “in material interpretation [bei inhaltlicher Deutung]” (e.g., LSS: 30), and the material interpretation sometimes slips in to play a role in the argument. Accordingly, Tarski (1936 [2002]: §2) characterizes Carnap’s definition of consequence for Language II in the Logical Syntax as semantic, acknowledges that “The first attempt at the formulation of a precise definition for the proper concept of following comes from R. Carnap” (in the Logical Syntax), and regards his own model-theoretic definition of logical consequence as essentially equivalent to Carnap’s (though applicable to a broader range of formalized languages than just to Language-II-like languages; see the supplement Logical Syntax of Language). This character of the Logical Syntax as a transitional work between syntax and semantics raises many subtle interpretative and historical issues that require distillation of the actual argument from the (often newly-invented) terminology in which it is embedded. Fortunately, Pierre Wagner’s (2009) excellent handbook on the Logical Syntax provides the reader with a guide.

For all the technical apparatus, Carnap later acknowledged that “the investigation of philosophical problems was originally the main reason for the development of syntax” (Carnap 1963a: 55), and the final Part V of the book is devoted to these. The focus, however, is on the “syntax” idea itself, not on the other main idea, the principle of tolerance. There is a simple reason for this: Part V was almost entirely written before Carnap arrived at the principle of tolerance in late 1932, and when the book went to the publisher it had to be cut (the definition of “analyticity” for Language II (§ 34d), for instance, was not even included in the original book, only in the 1937 English translation). And Part V is devoted to a sustained argument for sticking to the “formal mode of speech” and avoiding the “material mode of speech” unless it is translatable into the formal mode. So it is hardly surprising that philosophers (see for instance Woleński 2003) took this to be the book’s main philosophical point and thought Carnap had left it behind after the embrace of semantics in 1935.

5.2 Recent Discussion and Commentary

Much of the recent discussion surrounding the Syntax, especially the principle of tolerance, was inspired by Gödel’s critique of Carnap, unpublished until 1995, that was originally intended for the Schilpp (1963) volume on Carnap in the Library of Living Philosophers. Gödel withdrew his paper, but six successive drafts of it were found in his Nachlass, of which several have now been published (Gödel 1995). It appears, from its title (“Is Mathematics Syntax of Language?”) and much of the exposition, to focus specifically on the “syntax” thesis, or more generally on the “linguistic” accounts of the foundations of mathematics deriving from Wittgenstein’s Tractatus (Goldfarb 1995: 325). However, Gödel himself understood that Carnap had meanwhile left behind that view (in its Logical Syntax form), and recent commentary has focused on the principle of tolerance (see section 1 of the supplement Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology for the details of Gödel’s criticism).

Carnap’s early-1930s syntactical method of avoiding reference for terms in the philosophical metalanguage has recently been identified as the first self-consciously worked-out program of what is now often called “inferentialism” (Peregrin forthcoming), a different form of which is especially championed by Robert Brandom (1994, 2000), and has been found attractive by others (e.g., Price 2013). Though Carnap’s inferentialism had different motivations from Brandom’s program of “reference explained away” (Brandom 1984), there is clearly at least an analogous strategy at work. While Carnap himself left the syntax program in its original form behind when he went on to incorporate semantics into his overall program for scientific languages, the syntax episode with its explicitly inferentialist agenda is now viewed by some (e.g., Chalmers 2012, Peregrin forthcoming) an important innovation in its own right. Some of these commentators thus regard Carnap’s later embrace of semantics as a step backwards. That had also been the view of Neurath at the time (Uebel 2007, Mormann 1999, Carus 2019), and of Quine and others later (e.g., Goldfarb & Ricketts 1992; Ricketts 1996; Goldfarb 1997). These criticisms are at least partly due to a perception that Carnap returned to a substantive conception of meaning such as the Wittgensteinian one he had dropped in 1931, but actually his conception of reference and meaning remained minimalist and schematic, much to the frustration of, e.g., Russell (1940; see Pincock 2007), who sought a substantive account of the intrinsic nature of reference (see the supplement Semantics for further discussion).

6. Semantics and Modality

6.1 From Syntax to Semantics

Carnap had moved to Prague in late 1931, where he became a full professor at the German University, and wrote both drafts of the Logical Syntax of Language. The published book had tried to fuse the three major ideas of 1931–2. First, in January 1931, had come the rejection of Wittgenstein’s picture theory of meaning and its replacement by Hilbert’s sharp distinction between a language (a calculus, a purely formal symbol system) and its interpretation, with the requirement that a language be entirely specified by explicit rules. Closely bound up with this was the second idea, the insistence on the “formal mode of speech” and the avoidance of talk of meaning in the metalanguage. And third, late in 1932, had come the principle of tolerance: no language is definitive or “correct”, there is no logical “reality” for a language to “correspond to”. But within a year of the book’s publication, the second idea had been dropped; Carnap incorporated Tarski’s new semantical accounts of designation and truth, and extended his view of language accordingly. The first and third ideas, however, survived for the rest of Carnap’s career. What did not survive was the overreaction against “meaning” that accompanied the original insight of January 1931—the exclusive emphasis on the “formal mode of speech” in meta-discourse. In distinguishing between a language and its interpretation, Carnap’s first response had been to restrict extra-linguistic interpretation to the object language (and there to one particular—physicalistic—interpretation) and dispense with it entirely in the “elucidatory” metalanguage. But this restriction was loosened when Tarski convinced him in 1935 that interpretation could be completely specified by explicit rules governing satisfaction, designation, and truth.

By this time, the storm clouds gathering in Europe were obvious for all to see, and like many of the Vienna Circle, Carnap sought an appointment in North America. In 1936 he landed at the University of Chicago, where he would stay for nearly twenty years, longer than he spent anywhere else. While he felt personally and intellectually comfortable in the United States, his written prose was never as elegant or forceful in English as it had been in German, and his publications were mostly quite technical. The larger context of his philosophy was of course unknown to most colleagues and students, and remained obscure to the larger public. This decontextualization of logical empiricism was reinforced by political factors. As new immigrants, Carnap and his Vienna Circle friends felt vulnerable in the United States, and many of them, having previously supported socialist causes in Europe, were kept under observation by the FBI, including Carnap himself (Reisch 2005). It was thus in their interest to play down the larger significance of their philosophical preoccupations, and to pose as narrow specialists in technical subjects.

Carnap’s first major publication in English, soon after his arrival in the United States, was “Testability and Meaning” (1936–37), discussed in sections 1.5–6 above, the first in a series of attempts to explicate “empirical content” or “empirical reducibility” more loosely than the strict reducibility envisaged in the Aufbau. By the late 1930s, Carnap was willing to countenance a theoretical language whose primitive terms are not constructed bottom-up from observation sentences at all but entirely top-down, “floating in the air, so to speak” so that these basic theoretical terms can have “only an indirect interpretation, which is incomplete in a certain sense” (Carnap 1939: 65). With these steps, Carnap began his return to a consideration of the theoretical language, which he had left behind during the Vienna years. But his main focus, after “Testability and Meaning”, was the semantic framework itself. In the slim volume on Foundations of Logic and Mathematics for the Encyclopedia of Unified Science (1939), the tripartite classification of linguistic theory into syntax, semantics, and pragmatics was first laid out. A five-volume series of Studies in Semantics was projected, of which the first two volumes, Introduction to Semantics and Formalization of Logic were published in 1942–3. Carnap then pursued a long-standing interest in modal logic and intensional languages, and published “Modalities and Quantification” in 1946, Meaning and Necessity in 1947. More details on Carnap’s work in semantics can be found in the supplement Semantics.

Carnap had embraced semantics in 1935 because Tarski had convinced him that designation and truth could be described and discussed in an entirely schematic and objective way, free from any psychological, subjective, or epistemological entanglements or commitments (Carnap 1936). As we have seen, the return to a schematic form of “meaning” led many to regard Logical Syntax as outdated. Carnap himself (e.g., 1942: §39) was careful to deny this, but probably didn’t emphasize enough that the return of “meaning” did not mean a return to an explanatory conception of meaning like Russell’s multiple relation theory of belief or Wittgenstein’s picture theory. This abstract and schematic approach to meaning disturbed many empiricists, giving them the impression that Carnap had no interest in what actually underlay meaning, i.e., wherein the relation between predicate and property (cf. Wilson 1982) actually consists. As B. Russell (1940: 314) complained, for instance, Carnap ignored “certain prior questions to be considered” before “the relation of empirical knowledge to non-linguistic occurrences” could be “properly understood”. But these “prior questions” were just the ones Carnap had put aside in 1931 (Pincock 2007). In this respect there is a seamless continuity in Carnap’s “minimalism” with respect to language; even with the embrace of semantics in 1935, these questions remained absent, and only began to make a rather shadowy reappearance with Carnap’s (1939) addition of pragmatics (the study of language in use) to his conception of language. Semantics abstracts from use and focuses only on the expressions themselves and their designata, while syntax abstracts from designata as well (1939: 3–4; 1942: 9).

In Carnap’s work after 1935, it is important to distinguish between two different parts of the semantic enterprise. On the one hand, there are the repeated attempts to pin down the inferential relations between observation-statements and more general ones within the general framework of semantics. In this work, meaning and reference are considered particularly as they concern the empirical content (or meaning) of general statements, whether empirical generalizations or theories of more universal scope. This includes “Testability and Meaning” (Carnap 1936–37), the later work on the theoretical language (Carnap 1956a, 1959a), and much of the work on inductive logic (see section 8 below). On the other hand, there is the construction of the semantic framework itself, its logical delineation and development; even if this was in principle to serve the first purpose, it became in effect a distinct project. This includes the Studies in Semantics, the modal logic systems (Carnap 1946), and the later version of his logic textbook, Einführung in die symbolische Logik (Carnap 1968b). We discuss this second component in section 6.2, immediately following, and the first component in section 8 below.

6.2 Carnap’s New Priorities

There are two main changes leading from the linguistic frameworks of the Logical Syntax to the “semantic systems” of Meaning and Necessity: Carnap took the semantic turn, allowing for a relation of reference or designation; and beyond that he allowed for intensional operators which he supplied with a new intensional semantics.

From Foundations of Logic and Mathematics (1939) (and Introduction to Semantics, 1942) Carnap had taken up Tarski’s conception of semantic truth. The principle of tolerance in the Logical Syntax remained intact, but in the following refined form: the syntactic rules of formation can be chosen freely; if the syntactical rules of transformation (derivation, inference) are determined prior to the semantic rules, they may be determined freely as well, but the semantic rules will have to be selected such that the transformation rules are sound with respect to them; vice versa, if the semantic rules are chosen prior to the transformation rules, the former may be determined freely, in which case the latter will need to match the former by being sound with respect to them (see, e.g., section 12 of Carnap 1939). Completely new questions arose, e.g., whether the rules of inference of classical propositional logic would determine the semantics of the standard logical connectives uniquely (given certain constraints): this novel type of categoricity question was answered in the negative by Carnap (1943). (In recent years, this part of Carnap’s work has sparked a lively debate: see, e.g., Raatikainen 2008, Murzi & Hjortland 2009.) Semantics became just as important in Carnap’s work for the construction of formal languages as syntax had been in the Logical Syntax.

Secondly, Carnap extended Tarski’s extensional semantics by a new intensional one, in which the truth values of sentences with operators creating intensional contexts (such as a sentential operator for necessity) can also be determined compositionally. Carnap’s invention of what would become “possible worlds semantics,” which he showed one could spell out in an extensional metalanguage, had a decisive influence on the development of modal logic and intensional semantics. Even though there are significant differences between modern “Kripke semantics” (which is rightly associated with Saul Kripke’s work), Carnap’s intensional semantics is still a possible worlds semantics in the sense that it evaluates formulas at possible worlds (“state-descriptions” in Carnap’s terminology), and the semantic rule for Carnap’s operator ‘N’ for (logical) necessity invokes universal quantification over worlds: \(N(A)\) holds in state-description s if and only if A holds in every state-description (see §41 of Meaning and Necessity; the differences and similarities to Kripke semantics are explained in detail in the supplement Semantics (Section 1)). On the side of theoretical linguistics, Richard Montague’s later intensional semantics for natural language built on Carnap’s semantics (see Partee 2011).

As discussed in the supplement Semantics (Section 2), he partially weakened his early radical thesis of extensionality by the time of Meaning and Necessity.

6.3 Intensional Semantics

The languages to which Tarski’s semantics applied were extensional; Carnap’s semantics extends Tarski’s by assigning compositionally to each singular term, each predicate, and each sentence both an intension and an extension. The intension of an expression explicates what we understand when we understand it, and Carnap’s treatment of this is again “minimalist” in the sense that nothing subjective or psychological is involved; “understanding” is entirely schematic, i.e., determined solely by semantic rules. The extension of an expression at a state-description is determined by applying the semantic rules (or the expression’s intension) to the state-description. In the words of David Lewis (1970: 23):

The plan to construe intensions as extension-determining functions originated with Carnap… Accordingly, let us call such functions Carnapian intensions.

A state-description (an idea that derives from the “Spielräume” in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, and more distantly from Leibniz’s idea of possible worlds) is simply a set X of sentences for which the following is the case: for each atomic sentence in the object language, either the sentence or its negation is a member of X, but not both; and X only includes atomic sentences or negations of atomic sentences. One state-description describes the “actual state of the universe” (Carnap 1947: §2), and how a linguistic expression is evaluated at that state-description recovers the Tarskian extension of the expression. Intensions are assigned to linguistic expressions by evaluating them at arbitrary state-descriptions.

According to Carnap’s setup, two sentences A and B have the same intension if and only if the equivalence \(A \leftrightarrow B\) is L-true. A sentence is L-true (logically true) just in case it holds in in every state-description. For Carnap this definition of L-truth explicates the informal idea that a sentence is logically true if it is true in virtue of semantic rules alone without reference to empirical facts. Later, Carnap introduced the idea of “meaning postulates” that could restrict the range of state-descriptions (Carnap 1952) and adopted Quine’s terminology by which only those sentences are “logically true” whose truth is evident from the logical particles alone, while the larger class of sentences true in all state-descriptions are called “analytic”.

Carnap (1946, 1947) worked out an intensional semantics for necessity and possibility operators for different example languages, and for the modal logic S5 that C.I. Lewis (1944) had previously discussed (see the supplement Semantics (Section 1) for the details). He also started exploring areas that are presently of special interest, such as “hyperintensional” semantics (see, e.g., Yablo 2014): In the context of addressing the paradox of analysis, he found that a stronger or finer-grained notion of synonymy was needed than identity of intension, i.e., L-equivalence, and he defined a relation called “intensionally isomorphic to” for that purpose. In response to critiques by Benson Mates and Leonard Linsky (1949), who pointed out instances of apparent synonymity that were not intensionally isomorphic by Carnap’s definition, Carnap replied that this just showed that the ordinary-language conception of “synonymity” is vague, and that actually it conceals a number, perhaps a range, of explicanda; for certain purposes, he agreed, a still stronger (or finer-grained) conception of intensionality (and thus synonymity) might be required (Carnap 1949).

Alonzo Church used Carnap’s concept of intensional isomorphism in his reconstruction of Frege’s notions of sense and reference, “A formulation of the logic of sense and denotation” (Church 1951), and later also addressed a critique to Carnap directly (Church 1954), to which Carnap (1954b) replied. John Myhill (1958) in a critique of Church’s reconstruction, re-discovered a paradox first spelled out by Russell in Appendix B of Principles that raises precisely the same issue about individuating intensions, and since then the study of Russellian intensional logic, and finer-grained versions of intensional identity, has continued (Church 1976, 1985; Linsky 1988; Anderson 1989; Cantini 2004; Deutsch 2014).

Carnap argues in Meaning and Necessity (especially §30) that his method of extension and intension is an improvement over Frege’s method of reference and sense, because it preserves the extension and intension of a linguistic expression across contexts (i.e., regardless of whether they are extensional or intensional contexts), while Frege’s method does not. Before Michael Dummett’s work on Frege, Carnap’s detailed critical engagement with Frege’s theory of sense and reference in this book probably did more to establish Frege as a classic of analytic philosophy than any other single impulse. Not only Church, but many others were inspired not only to reconstruct Frege’s original view in a more rigorous way, but to do so in the light of Carnap’s challenge and his critique of those views from a modern point of view. Carnap’s intensional semantics is discussed in more detail in the supplement Semantics (Section 1).

7. Quine and “Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology”

The best-known aspect of Carnap’s reflections on semantics, however, concern his various controversies with Quine, which addressed a broad range of issues, two of which have aroused particular interest: ontology and “the” analytic-synthetic distinction. For many years after Quine launched his critique of Carnap, in the 1950s, it was widely agreed that Quine had “won”, and for several decades his paper “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” (Quine 1951) became perhaps the best-known and most widely cited paper in all analytic philosophy. However, since the revival of Carnap studies in the 1980s and 90s, the picture looks rather different, and if there is a mainstream opinion on the Carnap-Quine debates now, it would probably be something like the position articulated in a series of papers by Richard Creath (1987, 1990, 1991, 1994, 2007, 2009) to the effect that Quine at least partially misunderstood Carnap and that the two philosophers were largely talking past each other (while of course trying hard not to).

With respect to reductionism (the second dogma of empiricism in Quine’s 1951), Quine rightly criticized the viability of Carnap’s radical reductionism in the Aufbau—which, however, Carnap himself gave up soon after the Aufbau’s publication. It is much less clear whether Quine is right to attribute a weaker form of reductionism to the later Carnap, as Carnap regards the confirmation of scientific hypotheses to be holistic and theory-relative from the Logic Syntax at the latest. This is discussed in more detail in the supplement The Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 1).

The other “dogma of empiricism” that Quine discerned in Carnap was his adherence to “the” analytic-synthetic distinction. Unlike Quine, though, Carnap was not primarily interested in defining analyticity for natural language, but rather in the construction of linguistic frameworks for which a coherent notion of analyticity could be defined in precise terms. Nor did Carnap imagine that there was a single unique such distinction; he thought rather that any such distinction had to be language-relative and himself constructed precise definitions of analyticity for a number of linguistic frameworks with different applications. True, Carnap also attempted in Syntax to give a general definition of “analytic” that would apply to all languages, but did not think even at the time that he had succeeded. He went on trying to find one, but never seriously proposed a solution. So Quine’s criticism of Carnap’s lack of definition of ‘analytic-in-language-L’ with variable ‘L’ was definitely sound, but it ran in open doors, as Carnap had never claimed to have supplied such a definition even to his own satisfaction. It is a matter of ongoing debate, though, whether Quine’s concerns somehow undermined Carnap’s definitions of analyticity for particular formal frameworks and whether these constructed and language-relative notions of analyticity (the existence of which was of course acknowledged by Quine) satisfied the conceptual role that Carnap ascribed to them. In any case, Carnap himself did not think that every language had to have analytic sentences. Most sophisticated language frameworks, especially those equipped for scientific statements, would need them, since the analytic sentences are just those that “come with” the framework (by being provable by the rules of the framework without further assumptions), but it is possible, Carnap thought, to design a language that has no analytic sentences. (In terms of a modern analogy: there are systems of non-classical logic, such as three-valued Strong-Kleene logic, which include an interesting and well-defined logical consequence relation, but where the set of logically true statements is empty.) He did not think this worth pursuing, though, since to him it was obvious that such a language would not be scientifically useful. He often cited Einstein’s (1921) insistence that without Hilbert’s strict distinction between physical geometry and mathematical “purely axiomatic” geometry (the latter of which was regarded as analytic by Carnap), Einstein could never have formulated the theory of relativity.

The debate between Carnap and Quine about analytic and synthetic has produced a flood of commentary, which is still being added to (see, e.g., Juhl & Loomis 2010 or Ebbs 2017 for recent discussions, Proust 1986 [1989] for a broader historical perspective). The main points of the controversy, the main commentators, and Carnap’s own view of the matter are discussed in more detail in Carnap vs Quine on the Analytic-Synthetic Distinction.

On the subject of ontology, Quine criticized Carnap’s use of quantifiers over intensional entities in Carnap’s intensional semantics. Closely related criticisms were voiced by many others, especially including Carnap’s own former Vienna colleague Otto Neurath and the Oxford philosopher Gilbert Ryle, whose review of Meaning and Necessity (Ryle 1949) was perhaps the nastiest and most vituperative review ever written of anything Carnap wrote. Carnap responded (calmly) with his well-known paper “Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology” (1950a), in which he distinguished between two understandings of “existence” attributions, internal and external. Internal ones are framework-relative; they specify a language framework before claiming or denying or questioning the existence of a thing. External existence claims or questions lack such a relativization to a framework. For Carnap only internal questions make sense, if you take them literally. Thus “are there infinitely many numbers?” makes sense if you relativize it to a framework such as, for instance, Zermelo-Frankel set theory—which has an axiom of infinity, so the answer is (trivially) yes. But without such a relativization the question makes no sense to Carnap—unless, that is, you reinterpret it as a practical (normative) question of deciding among frameworks or explications. All of this applies, in particular, to the quantification over abstract entities in a framework for semantics, such as intensional semantics. In turn, Quine rejected Carnap’s internal/external distinction, which for Quine relied on the analytic/synthetic distinction, as accepting a framework would consist in accepting the sentences that are analytic in the framework. Whether the ontological internal/external distinction needs to build on the semantic analytic/synthetic distinction has itself become a topic in recent philosophical work on metaphysical deflationism about existence questions, which takes Carnap’s metaontological views as its historical starting point (see, e.g., Thomasson 2014; see the supplement Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology (Sections 2 and 3) for further discussion).

8. Inductive Logic and the Re-Emergence of the Theoretical Language

8.1 Confirmation

Carnap’s first sketch of a linguistic framework (that of the Aufbau) envisaged complete reducibility of all concepts by explicit definition, at least in principle. By the time of “Testability and Meaning” (1936–37), as we saw above, Carnap had conceded that such definitional reducibility is not always possible, and suggested various forms of incomplete reducibility that, while not employing only explicit definitions, at least required of empirically meaningful sentences a clear grounding in observation. He considers verifiability as a criterion for empirical content or meaning, and rejects it for essentially the same reason as he had a decade previously (in Carnap 1926: 7–9). He also considers Popper’s falsifiability criterion, and rejects it because only sentences of a very particular logical form are falsifiable at all (such as, e.g., “all swans are white”). Indeed, most scientific theories (all theories that use limit concepts, for instance) have to be stated using unbounded multiple mixed quantifiers, e.g., “for all x there is a y such that \((\ldots x \ldots y\ldots)\)”, and there are instances of such sentences which can neither be verified nor falsified by a single observational counter-instance. In particular, to falsify such a statement there would have to be a counter-instance x to falsify an unbounded existentially quantified (empirical) sentence, which (as Popper himself acknowledged) is not generally possible. So in these cases, typical of theoretical science, falsifiability has no advantage over verifiability. (For a more precise discussion of falsifiability, see Schurz & Dorn 1988.)

Carnap therefore opts neither for verification nor for falsification, but for a form of partial verification that he calls “confirmation”:

If in the continued series of such testing experiments no negative instance is found but the number of positive instances increases, then our confidence in the law will grow step by step. Thus, instead of verification, we may speak of gradually increasing confirmation of the law. (TM1: 425)

The acceptance or rejection of a scientific hypothesis becomes partially a practical matter, and to some degree a matter of convention. Carnap speaks in this connection of the “degree of confirmation” but means this not in a quantitative but merely “topological” (what he would later call “comparative”) sense. He specifically rejects Reichenbach’s proposal to equate degree of confirmation to “the degree of probability in the strict sense which this concept has in the calculus of probability, i.e., as the limit of relative frequency” (TM1: 427). Five years later Carnap would realize that the probability calculus could be given a different, epistemic interpretation as had been done historically by Bayes, Laplace, Pearson, and Keynes, and was now continued by Harold Jeffreys—and he would make that interpretation the basis of his remaining life’s work of developing quantitative explications of “degree of confirmation”. (For more details on Carnap’s work on confirmation and inductive logic, see the supplement Inductive Logic.)

8.2 Inductive Logic

Why did Carnap decide to change directions so radically, at the age of 52? This is unusual in a philosopher, especially as in Carnap’s case it involved reading his way into a whole new field of inquiry, as well as learning a whole new branch of mathematics. We know that the idea of a “degree of confirmation” had interested him since at least the time of “Testability and Meaning”. At this time, as we saw in section 8.1 above, he thought it could be defined only comparatively, since he rejected Reichenbach’s conflation of truth-value with frequency as well as his identification of relative frequency and confirmation (Carnap 1935b, 1936–37). And it had been the accepted wisdom in the Vienna Circle that the classical (epistemic) interpretation of probability had been entirely superseded by the frequency interpretation, partly because the latter relied on Laplace’s much-criticized principle of indifference, which they classified as metaphysical. Even Keynes (1921) had given insufficiently clear arguments and his axioms were defective, they thought, but there was interest in Wittgenstein’s logical (purely analytic) conception of probability, suggested in the Tractatus, and developed in more detail by Waismann (1930).

Then in 1937, right after “Testability and Meaning”, Carnap was sent the typescript of Reichenbach’s Experience and Prediction for evaluation by the University of Chicago Press. In a long letter to Reichenbach he takes him to task for exaggerating the drawbacks of what Reichenbach chastises as the “disparity conception” of probability, whereby the “weight” (or “degree of confirmation” as Carnap also calls it) and probability (understood as relative frequency) are two separate (disparate) things. Reichenbach had gone so far in his submitted draft, apparently, as to claim that the disparity conception was not only the root of all philosophical error, but a form of metaphysics. Carnap says that he himself is not sure what side he is on regarding the disparity conception (and there is no reason to doubt this, in 1937, as far as we know), but he thinks both its acceptance and its rejection are perfectly compatible with empiricism, and advises Reichenbach to tone down his rhetoric.

Though he was open-minded about the “disparity conception” during this period, it was only in the spring of 1941, according to Carnap’s autobiography, that he “began to reconsider the whole problem of probability” (1963a: 72). He re-read Keynes’s book more carefully, and found it very enlightening (ibid.). He began to develop a new conception of confirmation, influenced by both Waismann and Keynes:

But I tried a new approach. I believed that the logical concept of probability should supply an exact quantitative explication of a concept which is basic in the methodology of empirical science, viz. the concept of the confirmation of a hypothesis. (1963a: 72)

The starting point of Carnap’s new inductive logic was, first of all, precisely Reichenbach’s “disparity conception”—i.e., to distinguish very clearly between two different explicata of the ordinary-language word “probability”. One was relative frequency, which is an empirical matter, and was held up as the only acceptable interpretation of the Kolmogorov probability calculus by frequentists such as von Mises, Reichenbach, and (classically) Ronald Fisher. The other was epistemic probability, which Keynes and Harold Jeffreys held to be the only acceptable interpretation. Carnap called them “probability2” and “probability1” respectively, and set about clearing the ground for an explication of the latter, without casting any doubt on the legitimacy of “probability2” as an empirical tool. This distinction was the main focus of Carnap’s first article on inductive logic (Carnap 1945a).

The conception he developed in his next article (Carnap 1945b) was indeed logical in the Wittgenstein-Waismann sense, in that the relation between observation sentences and hypothesis was purely logical and analytic. To achieve this, a relativized principle of indifference was needed; unlike that of Laplace or Keynes, Carnap’s was entirely language-relative (framework-relative); it was no longer a quasi-metaphysical assertion about the nature of distributions, let alone about the statistical nature of the world, but a matter of constitutive definition. As in any other area of knowledge, Carnap thought it essential to define the framework before making assertions, so that we are all on the same page. (This logical or “structural” conception of probability and the relativized principle of indifference are explained in concrete detail in the supplement Inductive Logic.) This means that the value of a confirmation measure as applied to a hypothesis and the evidence for or against it is an analytical consequence (in the chosen language framework) of the logical and inductive method given by the framework.

In 1950, Carnap published what would be longest book of his career by far, the Logical Foundations of Probability, into which he worked these two papers (much expanded) and several others, and also went into great detail to bring a number of perspectives to bear on the clarification of the explicanda of “probability” and “confirmation” (both in the sense of probability1). He also goes into detail to discuss ways of arriving at axioms, and to motivate the choices he ends up with. In the course of these clarifications he addresses a number of philosophical issues surrounding induction, confirmation, and scientific inference. A simpler exposition than Carnap himself gave of his inductive logic project was given later by Kemeny (1963). See the supplement Inductive Logic for further details.

Carnap’s inductive logic encountered a wide range of criticisms, e.g., that of Hilary Putnam, whose philosophical development had been strongly influenced by regular meetings with Carnap at Princeton in the 1950s. Putnam criticized the general idea of an algorithmic account of the inductive confirmation of scientific hypothesis by evidence (as exemplified by the special confirmation measure \(c^*\) that is described in the appendix of Carnap 1950b), while at the same time laying the foundations of what would become formal learning theory (see Putnam 1963 and the concluding section of the supplement Inductive Logic). But perhaps the biggest obstacle to a better and more widespread understanding of Carnap’s inductive logic was the memorable caricature of Carnap’s whole enterprise by Karl Popper in his attacks on Carnap during the 1950s and 1960s (e.g., Popper 1963). These were so convincing that the philosophical public retained only the caricature and hardly bothered to consult the original. In other words, the same pattern repeated itself that we have already seen with respect to the Quine-Carnap controversies of the 1950s and 60s (section 7 above)—for a long time, the general philosophical public retained only one side of the debate, influenced mainly by Quine’s (and then Popper’s) superior rhetorical skills, as a result of which both Quine and Popper were much more widely read than Carnap (though Quine’s proximity to traditional American pragmatism surely also played a role). The difference between these cases is that Popper, unlike Quine, actually misrepresented Carnap’s position quite blatantly, as Carnap’s supporters (e.g., Bar-Hillel 1955, 1956; Kemeny 1955, 1963) were quick to point out. (Michalos 1971 gives a well-informed, brief, but balanced survey of the Popper-Carnap controversy.)

Statisticians (and statistically literate philosophers) have been quicker to acknowledge not only the continuity between Carnap’s inductive logic and the present-day renaissance of Bayesian statistical inference, but Carnap’s role in bringing epistemic probability back from the dead and ensuring that it was taken seriously again (e.g., Leblanc 1962; Skyrms 1996; Zabell 2007, 2011). Many of the standard features of current Bayesianism were first formulated in Carnap’s Logical Foundations and in his subsequent work. Carnap went on working on inductive logic for another 20 years after Logical Foundations; his final statement (the “Basic System”), in which prior probabilities depended on geometrical “quality space” features of the given framework, appeared after his death in two long installments, edited by his friend and associate Richard Jeffrey (Carnap 1971a, 1980; for an extensive discussion of the “Basic System”, see Hilpinen 1973, Sznajder 2017). His later work appeared to move in a more “personalist” direction (though see Sznajder 2018), but Carnap continued to insist that the prior probability from which a statistical inference proceeds be motivated rationally (by considerations of symmetry) and not be merely subjective; here he stuck to his original idea of the relation between evidence and hypothesis being purely analytic and thus framework-relative. Though this distinguishes his standpoint from current subjective Bayesians, there are and have been many other kinds of Bayesians that are reasonably close to Carnap’s views, including “objective” Bayesians (e.g., Jaynes 1968, J. Williamson 2010). (For more on Carnap’s relation to current Bayesianism and various discussions of it today, see the supplement Inductive Logic.) As one prominent Bayesian pointed out in 1971, one can distinguish at least 46,656 possible varieties of Bayesians (Good 1971), and Zabell (a later prominent Bayesian) thinks Carnap would surely qualify for inclusion among these. Zabell also cites a characteristically conciliatory passage from Carnap’s posthumous “Basic System” that sums up Carnap’s appraisal of the situation:

I think there need not be a controversy between the objectivist point of view and the subjectivist or personalist point of view. Both have a legitimate place in the context of our work, that is, the construction of a set of rules for determining probability values with respect to possible evidence. At each step in the construction, a choice is to be made; the choice is not completely free but is restricted by certain boundaries. Basically there is merely a difference in attitude or emphasis between the subjectivist tendency to emphasize the existing freedom of choice, and the objectivist tendency to stress the existence of limitations. (Carnap 1980: 119, quoted by Zabell 2007: 294)

8.3 Return to the Theoretical Language

As we saw in section 6.1, by the late 1930s Carnap had returned to a consideration of theoretical languages whose primitive terms are not constructed bottom-up from observation sentences at all but entirely top-down, “floating in the air, so to speak” so that these basic theoretical terms can have “only an indirect interpretation, which is incomplete in a certain sense” (Carnap 1939: 65). In Carnap’s mind, the question of confirmation of theories and the question of the empirical content of theories were directly and inseparably connected, as they had been in “Testability and Meaning”. In this subsequent work on these two questions, however, they were pursued separately, and for all of Carnap’s efforts, the two strands could not be joined up. His inductive logic was never able to assign a degree of confirmation other than zero to unrestricted universally quantified theories, which was obviously a defect of the theory and was seized upon by Popper as discrediting the entire enterprise (e.g., Popper 1963). Carnap’s own way around the problem was to argue that scientists often regard the degree by which a piece of evidence E confirms a universal law hypothesis \(\forall x P(x)\) to be given by the degree to which E confirms an “arbitrary” instance of the law \(P(a)\), where a is an individual constant that does not occur in E: see Carnap (1945b: §14). Later authors tried to repair the defect in alternative ways, with varying degrees of success; see the supplement Inductive Logic. On the other hand, though Carnap’s work on the empirical content of sentences in a theoretical language often discusses the relations between observational language and theoretical language, he was never quite able to spell out a criterion for empirically meaningful sentences in the theoretical language that did not fall prey to fairly straightforward criticism (e.g., Kaplan 1975). The grand design of connecting up the projects of explicating confirmation and of reconstructing scientific theoretical language remained a distant goal.

We have already surveyed the inductive-logic side in the previous section 8.2. On the theoretical-language side, Carnap’s first major paper was “The methodological character of theoretical concepts” (Carnap 1956a), followed by “Observation language and theoretical language” (Carnap 1958) and “Theoretical concepts in science” (1959a). Carnap also touches on theoretical languages in several parts of the Schilpp volume (1963). Philosophical Foundations of Physics (1966), finally, is a redaction by Martin Gardner of a class Carnap gave at UCLA in the late 1950s, presented as an introductory textbook in the philosophy of science. Among other things, it gives a lucid summary of Carnap’s mature views on the reconstruction of scientific theories. See the supplement The Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Sections 3–5) for details and criticism.

One common misunderstanding of Carnap’s work on the theoretical language is an extension of the above-discussed misunderstandings of the Aufbau (section 3 above). The Aufbau was traditionally perceived as an exercise in providing phenomenalist or empiricist foundations for scientific sentences. Therefore, it was assumed, the later work on both inductive logic and the theoretical language must be motivated by the aim of providing empiricist foundations for scientific sentences, to distinguish them from non-scientific, i.e., metaphysical sentences. This was certainly Popper’s view, for instance, and largely Quine’s, but they were not alone; it was widespread until the 1990s, when the new and more careful scholarship about logical empiricism began to take hold.

It is true, of course, that in Carnap’s later work on scientific theories and theoretical languages, he distinguishes between a theoretical language and an observation language, and studied the relations between them. What is often overlooked, though, is that even in the Aufbau (and even in the earliest proto-Aufbau manuscripts) Carnap was very clear that what we are to take as “the given” is not inherently fixed or given by nature (as Aristotle would have put it), but something we have to decide on, something we have to specify provisionally in our chosen form of rational reconstruction. Later Carnap became even clearer that what we choose to regard as “observation sentences” is purpose-relative and can’t be decided once for all contexts, in the abstract. As early as “Testability and Meaning” (TM1: §16) Carnap was saying that “there can be several and even mutually exclusive bases” for confirmation by observation. And in later work on the theoretical language this pluralism is extended; in “The methodological character of theoretical concepts” he merely enumerates various possible requirements of different kinds and strengths that might be imposed on the observation language.

In Carnap’s view, the choice of the theoretical language depends on the purpose. The boundary between “observational” and “theoretical” terms, likewise, is relative to the language chosen and not fixed by nature:

no sharp boundary separates the O-terms from the T-terms. The choice of an exact dividing line is somewhat arbitrary. From a practical point of view, however, the distinction is usually evident. (Carnap 1966: 258)

Observational terms are assumed to be fully interpreted; their specification comes with an explicit link to observation (precisely defined in some way), while theoretical terms are specified axiomatically and are, in the first instance, uninterpreted or only mathematically interpreted formulas. These formulas can then be endowed with physical (or chemical, or biological, or social) interpretations by means of correspondence rules, which logically relate observation terms and theoretical terms.

Carnap’s views on the theoretical language during this period developed in response to critiques and commentaries from (as well as personal correspondence with) C.G. Hempel (1945, 1958, 1963). One response to these interactions was Carnap’s adoption of an idea first suggested by Frank Ramsey (1929) for the purpose of separating the theoretical from the empirical content of a theory; this idea first appeared in print in (the original German version of) Carnap’s paper “Observation language and theoretical language” (1958). (This procedure is explained in detail in the supplement The Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Sections 4–6).) The idea was that a theory could essentially be stated in such a way that all the theoretical terms in it are eliminated, i.e., it could be stated solely in terms of its “empirical residue”. But Carnap’s goal in adopting this method was not to suggest that the theoretical language was eliminable, that theoretical terms could or should be eliminated (as some versions of traditional empiricism might have liked). The point was rather to understand the empirical content of theoretical claims, and its logical function within theories. This leads to many complications, which are still very much under discussion (e.g., Demopoulos 2007, Friedman 2011, Schurz 2005).

The Ramsey approach was adopted, following Carnap, by others, notably David Lewis (1970), who put it to a rather different, more metaphysical use that was later adopted by Frank Jackson and other advocates of the “Canberra Plan” of conceptual analysis. This was also Chalmers’s (2012) point of departure, in his more metaphysical adaptation of the Aufbau, mentioned above (section 3). See the supplement The Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 4).

9. Final Years and Legacy

In 1951, Herbert Feigl approached Paul Schilpp, the editor of the Library of Living Philosophers, about doing a volume not on a particular philosopher, but on logical empiricism as a movement. Carnap and Reichenbach were to be in the foreground, as representative figures for the movement as a whole. Schilpp was sufficiently interested that he persisted with the idea even after Reichenbach’s sudden death in 1953; the volume was now to be focused on Carnap alone. Carnap invested a great deal of time in the project. He took the task of writing an autobiography seriously, reviewing many of his old papers, including his extensive diaries, in preparation for it. The resulting autobiography was much too long, and had to be cut by a third before publication. (The cut portions are available at the Young Research Library, University of California at Los Angeles, Special Collections, Collection 1029 (Rudolf Carnap), Box 2, CM3, mostly in folder marked “M-A5”; extensive quotations and references can be found in Carus 2007a.)

Unfortunately, publication was delayed by a series of mishaps, and when the book finally appeared in 1963, logical empiricism was no longer at the forefront of interest. Analytic philosophers had largely been swayed by Quine’s critique of Carnap over the past decade, and philosophers of science were captivated by Thomas Kuhn’s book The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, published the year before in the International Encyclopedia of Unified Science, co-edited by Carnap. Logical empiricism no longer inspired passions, either for or against; it seemed to belong to the past. Carnap saw in the anti-war and student movements of the 1960s an American version of the Youth Movement that had played such an important role in his own development half a century earlier, but insofar as the students of the 1960s were interested in philosophy, it was not in logical empiricism. A few weeks before his death, Carnap prepared a report for an American Philosophical Association committee about his meeting in the summer of 1970 with some philosophers imprisoned in Mexico. It illustrates his continued interest in social and political matters and in his fellow philosophers, and appeared posthumously, in December of that year, in the Journal of Philosophy. When Carnap died in Los Angeles in 1970, the philosophical world at large (as opposed to the major figures whose views he had shaped, such as Quine, Goodman, Putnam, Jeffrey, or Stein) had lost interest in him. But half a century later, it is fair to say that Carnap’s work is as much in the foreground of philosophical discussion as it has ever been.

10. List of Supplements


Carnap’s Works

The two major collections of Carnap papers are at the Archive of Scientific Philosophy (Hillman Library, University of Pittsburgh) and at the Young Research Library (University of California at Los Angeles). Both of these collections have been used extensively in many of the publications cited.

  • 1918a [2019], “Völkerbund—Staatenbund”, Politische Rundbriefe, 1: 4 and 4: 15–16. Translated into English in Carnap 2019: 3–10. [Carnap 1918 available online]
  • 1918b, “Deutschlands Niederlage: Sinnloses Schicksal oder Schuld?” (typed), 29 October 1918, Archives of Scientific Philosophy, Hillman Library, University of Pittsburgh, Carnap Papers [089-72-04].
  • 1919, Politischer Rundbrief of 1 April 1919. Recommendation of G. Landauer’s book Revolution und Sozialismus, p.124. Archives of Scientific Philosophy, Hillman Library, University of Pittsburgh, Carnap Papers [110-01-28].
  • 1922a [2019], Der Raum: Ein Beitrag zur Wissenschaftslehre, Kant-Studien Ergänzungshefte, Nr. 56, Berlin: Reuther & Reichard. Translated into English in Carnap 2019: 21–208.
  • 1922b, Three positions papers on: (a) Beziehungslehre und Strukturlehre; (b) Ansätze zur Charakterisierung von Strukturen (with Bernhard Merten); (c) Aufbau der Wirklichkeit (Strukturtheorie des Erkenntnisgegenstandes) (carbons); late 1922. Archives of Scientific Philosophy, Hillman Library, University of Pittsburgh, Carnap Papers [091-17-12].
  • 1923 [2019], “Über die Aufgabe der Physik und die Anwendung des Grundsatzes der Einfachstheit”, Kant-Studien, 28: 90–107. Translated into English in Carnap 2019: 209–46.
  • 1924 [2019], “Dreidimensionalität des Raumes und Kausalität: Eine Untersuchung über den logischen Zusammenhang zweier Fiktionen”, Annalen der Philosophie und philosophischen Kritik, 4: 105–30. Translated into English in Carnap 2019: 247–298.
  • 1925a, “Gedanken zum Kategorienproblem. Prolegomena zu einer Konstitutionstheorie (Vortrag Wien)” (shorthand), 21 January 1925. Archives of Scientific Philosophy, Hillman Library, University of Pittsburgh, Carnap Papers [081-05-03].
  • 1925b, “Entwurf einer Konstitutionstheorie der Erkenntnisgegenstände” (typed), first sketch, 17 December 1924; this version typed, 28 January 1925. Archives of Scientific Philosophy, Hillman Library, University of Pittsburgh, Carnap Papers [081-05-02].
  • 1926 [2019], Physikalische Begriffsbildung, Karlsruhe: Braun. Translated into English as Physical Concept Formation in Carnap 2019: 339–440.
  • 1927, “Eigentliche und uneigentliche Begriffe”, Symposion, 1: 355–374.
  • [Aufbau] 1928a [1967], Der logische Aufbau der Welt, Berlin: Weltkreis. Second edition, Hamburg: Meiner, 1961. Translated into English as The Logical Structure of the World, Rolf A. George (trans.), Berkeley, CA: University of California Press, 1967.
  • 1928b, Scheinprobleme in der Philosophie, Berlin: Weltkreis.
  • 1929, Abriß der Logistik, mit besonderer Berücksichtigung der Relationstheorie und ihrer Anwendungen, Vienna: Springer.
  • 1930a, “Die alte und die neue Logik”, Erkenntnis, 1: 12–26. doi:10.1007/BF00208606
  • 1930b, “[Review of] Felix Kaufmann, Das Unendliche in der Mathematik und seine Ausschaltung”, Deutsche Literaturzeitung, 51: cols. 1674–1678.
  • 1930c, “Bericht über Untersuchungen zur allgemeinen Axiomatik”, Erkenntnis, 1: 303–307. doi:10.1007/BF00208622
  • 1930d, “Review: Der logistische Neupositivismus: E. Kaila (1930)”, Erkenntnis, 2: 75–77. doi:10.1007/BF02028134
  • 1930e, “Plan für Kaila-Aufsatz: Über die Erkenntnis des sog. ‘Nicht-Gegebenen’” (shorthand), 2 November 1930; also an outline headed ‘Kaila-Aufsatz’ on a separate sheet dated 29 October 1930, Young Research Library, University of California at Los Angeles, Special Collections, Carnap Papers (Collection 1029) [UCLA Box4, CM13, item1].
  • 1931, “Die logizistische Grundlegung der Mathematik” (The Logicist Foundations of Mathematics), Erkenntnis, 2: 91–105. doi:10.1007/BF02028142
  • 1932a, “Überwindung der Metaphysik durch logische Analyse der Sprache”, Erkenntnis, 2: 219–241. doi:10.1007/BF02028153
  • 1932b [1934], “Die physikalische Sprache als Universalsprache der Wissenschaft”, Erkenntnis, 2: 432–465. Translated into English as Unity of Science, Max Black (trans.), London: Kegan Paul, Trench & Co., 1934. doi:10.1007/BF02028172
  • 1932c, “Psychologie in physikalischer Sprache”, Erkenntnis, 3: 107–142. doi:10.1007/BF01886414
  • 1932d, “Erwiderung auf die vorstehenden Aufsätze von E. Zilsel und K. Duncker”, Erkenntnis, 3: 177–188. doi:10.1007/BF01886417
  • 1932e [1987], “Über Protokollsätze”, Erkenntnis, 3: 215–228. Translated in 1987 as “On Protocol Sentences”, Richard Creath and Richard Nollan (trans.), Noûs, 21(4): 457–470. doi:10.2307/2215667 (en) doi:10.1007/BF01886421 (de)
  • [LSS] 1934a [1937], Logische Syntax der Sprache, Vienna: Springer. Translated by Amethe Smeaton as The Logical Syntax of Language, London: Routledge, 1937.
  • 1934b, “Theoretische Fragen und praktische Entscheidungen”, Natur und Geist, 2: 257–260.
  • 1934c [1987], Die Aufgabe der Wissenschaftslogik, Vienna: Gerold. Translated as “The Task of the Logic of Science”, Hans Kaal (trans.), in Unified Science, Rainer Hegselmann and Brian McGuinness (eds.), Dordrecht: Reidel, 1987, 46–66. doi:10.1007/978-94-009-3865-6_3
  • 1934d [2004], “On the Character of Philosophic Problems”, W. M. Malisoff (trans.), Philosophy of Science, 1(1): 5–19. German original “Über den Charakter philosophischer Probleme” published in R. Carnap Scheinprobleme in der Philosophie und andere metaphysikkritische Schriften, T. Mormann (ed.), Hamburg: Meiner, 2004, 111–127. doi:10.1086/286302 (en)
  • 1935a, Philosophy and Logical Syntax, London: Routledge.
  • 1935b, “Review: Logik der Forschung. Zur Erkenntnistheorie der modernen Naturwissenschaft: Popper, Karl (1935)”, Erkenntnis, 5: 290–294. doi:10.1007/BF00172319
  • 1936 [1949], “Wahrheit und Bewährung”, in Actes du Congrès international de philosophie scientifique, Sorbonne, Paris 1935, fasc. 4. Unité de la science, Paris: Hermann, pp. 18–23. A modified version is translated as “Truth and Confirmation”, in Feigl and Sellars 1949: 119–127.
  • [TM] 1936–37, “Testability and Meaning”, Philosophy of Science,
    • [TM1] 3(4): 419–471 (sections 1–16). doi:10.1086/286432,
    • [TM2] 4(1): 1–40 (sections 17–28). doi:10.1086/286443
  • 1939, Foundations of Logic and Mathematics, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • 1942, Introduction to Semantics, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • 1943, Formalization of Logic, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • 1945a, “The Two Concepts of Probability: The Problem of Probability”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 5(4): 513–532. doi:10.2307/2102817
  • 1945b, “On Inductive Logic”, Philosophy of Science, 12(2): 72–97. doi:10.1086/286851
  • 1946, “Modalities and Quantification”, Journal of Symbolic Logic, 11(2): 33–64. doi:10.2307/2268610
  • 1947, Meaning and Necessity, Chicago: The University of Chicago Press; second edition: 1956.
  • 1949, “A Reply to Leonard Linsky”, Philosophy of Science, 16(4): 347–350. doi:10.1086/287056
  • [ESO] 1950a [1956], “Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology”, Revue Internationale de Philosophie, 4(11): 20–40. Reprinted in Carnap 1956b: 205–221.
  • [LFP] 1950b, Logical Foundations of Probability, first edition, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • 1952a [1956], “Meaning Postulates”, Philosophical Studies, 3(5): 65–73. Reprinted in Carnap 1956b: 222–229. doi:10.1007/BF02350366
  • 1952b, The Continuum of Inductive Methods, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • 1954a [1968], Einführung in die symbolische Logik, mit besonderer Berücksichtigung ihrer Anwendungen, first edition, Vienna: Springer; second edition, 1968.
  • 1954b [1956], “On Belief Sentences: Reply to Alonzo Church”, in Philosophy and Analysis, Margaret MacDonald (ed.), Oxford: Blackwell, pp. 128–131. Reprinted in Carnap 1956b: 230–232.
  • 1955a [1956], “On Some Concepts of Pragmatics”, Philosophical Studies, 6(6): 89–91. Reprinted in Carnap 1956b: 249–251. doi:10.1007/BF02341065
  • 1955b [1956], “Meaning and Synonymy in Natural Languages”, Philosophical Studies, 6(3): 33–47. Reprinted in Carnap 1956b: 222–229. doi:10.1007/BF02330951
  • 1956a, “The Methodological Character of Theoretical Concepts”, in The Foundations of Science and the Concepts of Psychology and Psychoanalysis, Herbert Feigl and Michael Scriven (eds.), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 38–76. [Carnap 1956a available online]
  • 1956b [1947], Meaning and Necessity: A Study in Semantics and Modal Logic, second edition, Chicago: University of Chicago Press. (This is an enlarged version of 1947.)
  • 1957, “How Can Induction Be Justified?” Unpublished Manuscript from the Carnap Papers at the Archives of Scientific Philosophy, Hillman Library, University of Pittsburgh, catalogue number 082-01-01.
  • 1958 [1975], “Beobachtungssprache und Theoretische Sprache”, Dialectica, 12(3–4): 236–248. Translated as “Observational Language and Theoretical Language”, in Hintikka 1975: 75–85. doi:10.1111/j.1746-8361.1958.tb01461.x
  • 1959a [2000], “Theoretical Concepts in Science”, unpublished lecture. Published in Stathis Psillos, 2000, “Rudolf Carnap’s ‘Theoretical Concepts in Science’”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part A, 31(1): 151–172. doi:10.1016/S0039-3681(99)00031-X
  • 1959b, Induktive Logik und Wahrscheinlichkeit (coauthor: Wolfgang Stegmüller), Vienna: Springer. doi:10.1007/978-3-7091-3142-8
  • 1961a, “Vorwort zur zweiten Auflage” (introduction to second edition), in Aufbau, second edition, Hamburg: Meiner, pp. X–XV.
  • 1961b, “On the Use of Hilbert’s ε-Operator in Scientific Theories”, in Essays on the Foundations of Mathematics, Y. Bar-Hillel et al. (eds.), Jerusalem: Magnes Press, pp. 154–64.
  • 1962, Logical Foundations of Probability, second edition, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • 1963a, “Carnap’s Intellectual Autobiography”, in Schilpp 1963: 3–84.
  • 1963b, “The Philosopher Replies”, in Schilpp 1963: 859–1013.
  • 1964, “Interview mit Rudolf Carnap”, in Mein Weg in die Philosophie, Rudolf Carnap, interview with Willy Hochkeppel, Stuttgart: Reclam, pp. 134–148.
  • 1966, Philosophical Foundations of Physics: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Science, New York: Basic Books.
  • 1968a “Inductive Logic and Inductive Intuition”, in The Problem of Inductive Logic, Imre Lakatos (ed.), Amsterdam: North-Holland, pp. 258–314.
  • 1968b, “On Rules of Acceptance”, in The Problem of Inductive Logic, Imre Lakatos (ed.), Amsterdam: North-Holland, pp. 146–50.
  • 1971a, “A Basic System of Inductive Logic, Part I”, in Carnap (and Jeffrey) 1971c: 33–165.
  • 1971b, “Inductive Logic and Rational Decisions”, in Carnap (and Jeffrey) 1971c: 5–31.
  • 1971c, Studies in Inductive Logic and Probability, volume 1, with Richard C. Jeffrey, Berkeley: University of California Press. See Jeffrey 1980 for volume 2.
  • 1974, An Introduction to the Philosophy of Science, New York, Basic Books; second edition of Carnap 1966.
  • 1980, “A Basic System of Inductive Logic, Part II”, in Jeffrey 1980: 7–155.
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