Paul Grice

First published Tue Dec 13, 2005; substantive revision Wed Dec 8, 2021

Herbert Paul Grice, universally known as Paul, was born on March 13, 1913 in Birmingham, England and died on August 28, 1988 in Berkeley CA. Grice received firsts in classical honours moderation (1933) and literae humaniores (1935) from Corpus Christi College, Oxford. After a year teaching in a public school, he returned to Oxford where, with a nearly five year interruption for service in the Royal Navy, he taught in various positions until 1967 when he moved to the University of California-Berkeley. He taught there past his official 1979 retirement until his death in 1988. He was philosophically active until his death—holding discussions at his home, giving lectures and editing a collection of his work that was posthumously published as Studies in the Way of Words. He is best known for his innovative work in philosophy of language, but also made important contributions to metaphysics, ethics and to the study of Aristotle and Kant. His work continues to be influential (and controversial) outside of philosophy in linguistics and artificial intelligence. Although relatively little work was published during his life, he had a very wide influence via lectures and unpublished manuscripts. The best known of these were the William James Lectures which he gave at Harvard in early 1967 and which circulated widely in unauthorized manuscript form until they were published as part of Studies in the Way of Words. He also played cricket, chess and piano, each at a very high level of accomplishment. A useful biography including both Grice’s personal and professional life is Chapman 2005; the review by Potts provides more perspective on some of the points.

1. Overview

The best known of the works published during Grice’s lifetime was his joint paper with Peter Strawson, “In Defense Of A Dogma”, a widely reprinted defense of the analytic/synthetic distinction against Quine’s attack in “Two Dogmas Of Empiricism”. The best known of his ideas, that of a conversational implicature, first appeared in a 1961 paper “The Causal Theory Of Perception”, but was a focus of the James Lectures. In contrast to the slogan, “meaning is use”, often associated (though perhaps inaccurately) with Wittgenstein, Grice distinguished those elements of language use which were due to meaning from those which are due to other aspects. To illustrate, the sentence “He has not been convicted of a crime yet” means that the person being referred to has not yet been convicted of a crime. But in many contexts, the speaker would be taken to imply that the person had committed at least one crime and was likely to be convicted in the future. In “The Causal Theory of Perception,” Grice deploys the distinction against J. L. Austin’s claim in Sense and Sensibilia that a sentence like ‘It looks to me as if I see something red’ is only correctly used when someone (possibly the speaker) has reason to doubt or deny that the speaker actually sees something red. Austin’s target is sense-datum theorists who attempt to introduce sense-data by appeal to such sentences. Grice argues convincingly that, while using the sentence may typically imply the doubt-or-denial condition, that implication is not part of the meaning of the sentence since the speaker can cancel the implication by adding ‘I do not mean to imply that there is any reason to doubt or deny that I see something red.’ What the speaker means on such a occasion can be true even if the speaker is using the sentence in an usual way, and there is no reason to doubt or deny the speaker sees something red.

This distinction between meaning and use has found many applications in philosophy, linguistics and artificial intelligence. Both the analytic/synthetic distinction, which relies on a conception of truth by virtue of meaning, and the idea of a conversational implicature require for their full philosophical development a theory of meaning. Grice provided the beginning of a theory of meaning starting with his 1957 paper “Meaning” and elaborated in later papers (Grice 1968, 1969, 1982). The basic idea was to distinguish two notions of meaning: what a sentence means in general apart from any use of it, and what a specific speaker means by using the sentence on a particular occasion. Grice sees the latter notion as entirely a matter of what the speaker intends. Grice’s idea was to show that the abstract notion of sentence meaning was to be understood in terms of what specific speakers intend on specific occasions.The following sections will outline the Grice-Strawson arguments for an analytic-synthetic distinction (Section 2), notions of conversational implicature (3), and then delve into his theories about meaning (4), reasoning (5), psychology (6), ontology (7), and value (8).

2. Defending a dogma

Grice and Strawson begin their article with a dissection of the various ways one can reject a dichotomy and conclude that Quine’s rejection of the analytic/synthetic distinction is one of the more extreme cases: “He declares, or seems to declare, not merely that the distinction is useless or inadequately clarified, but that it is altogether illusory, that the belief in its existence is a philosophical mistake” (Grice & Strawson, 142).

Grice and Strawson deploy a number of arguments against Quine’s position, but the two main ones involve the distinction between an utterance meaning something and not meaning anything, and between the kind of revision of belief that merely recognize a previous belief as false and the kind which involves a change of concept, and hence a change in the meaning of a word. These can both be illustrated with their pair of example sentences:

  1. My neighbor’s three year old child understands Russell’s theory of types.
  2. My neighbor’s three year old child is an adult.

They claim that it is not difficult to understand what someone would mean by uttering (1), and it is fairly clear what it would take to persuade someone that (1) is not false, as seems initially evident. But in the case of (2), they argue, in effect, that with further investigation one would either conclude that the speaker was using familiar words to express new concepts, or else would conclude that nothing at all was being said. No attempt will be made here to adjudicate the dispute with Quine, who would reject both of these dichotomies (new concepts/old concepts, something said/nothing said) as well. But the reader should note that the crucial claims are that someone who asserts (2) is either asserting it with a meaning other than the standard conventional one, or with no meaning at all. A further elaboration of their claims depends therefore on elucidating the notion of the meaning of an utterance, and Section 4 will explore Grice’s account of this notion further.

3. Conversational implicature

Conversational implicatures are, roughly, things that a hearer can work out from the way something was said rather than what was said. People process conversational implicatures all of the time and are mostly unaware of it. For example, if someone asks “Could you close the door?” the hearer does not usually answer “Yes”, instead they perform the non-linguistic act of closing the door. In this case, although the speaker used a form of words that is conventionally a question, the hearer can infer that the speaker is making a request.

Grice was the first to note this ubiquitous feature of language use and also the first to present a philosophical analysis. He begins by noting that conversations are usually to some degree cooperative enterprises. He then formulates the Cooperative Principle: “Make your conversational contribution such as is required, at the stage at which it occurs, by the accepted purpose or direction of the talk exchange in which you are engaged” (1989, 26).

At a more detailed level, he distinguishes four categories with more specific maxims. The category of Quantity includes two injunctions, one to make your contribution as informative as is required, and the second to make it no more informative than is required. The category of Quality is governed by a supermaxim: “Try to make your contribution one that is true”. The category of Relation has a single maxim, “Be relevant”, while the final category of Manner has a short “super” maxim “Be perspicuous” which has various submaxims (1989, 27).

Perhaps the first thing to note is that conversational maxims often come into conflict. One party to the conversation may be caught between saying something less informative than is desired (violating Quantity) and saying something for which there is insufficient evidence (violating Quality). One example of the application of these principles given by Grice is the following exchange:

  1. I’m low on gas.
  2. There is a station around the corner on Main St.

In this situation the sentence B uttered does not logically imply that the station is open. However, the remark is irrelevant unless the station is open, so A can infer from the combination of Manner and Quality that B believes he has good evidence that the station is open. Thus B’s utterance conversationally implicates that the station is open. One characteristic of conversational implicatures is that they can be cancelled. Thus if B adds to his remark above, “but I don’t know whether it is open” then there is no conversational implicature that the station is open. This contrasts with logical or semantic implications which cannot be cancelled without contradiction.

The most famous application of Grice’s ideas is to the debate about whether the truth conditions of declarative conditional statements, such as “If George is driving, he will be late” are accurately captured by the material conditional. Representing the sample sentences as ‘George is driving \(\rightarrow\) he will be late’ would make the sentence true if it is false that George is driving or true that he will be late (or both). Many writers argued that it would be inappropriate for someone to make the assertion if they knew that George was not driving. Grice’s response is that to argue that in most circumstances it is conversationally inappropriate to make that assertion, not because it is false, but because it violates conversational principles.

Symbolically, \(A \rightarrow B\) should not be asserted in circumstances where the speaker knows that \(A\) is false because the statement not-\(A\) is true and simpler; similarly, if the speakers knows \(B\) is true, \(B\) is a shorter simpler statement; and if the speaker knows both of those facts, then not-\(A\) and \(B\), is more informative. Thus the only circumstances in which the conditional is appropriate is where the speaker is ignorant of the truth values of \(A\) and \(B\), but has some good reason to think that if \(A\) does prove to be true, \(B\) will as well. On this account, the truth conditions of the conditional are those of the material implication, but the appropriate assertibility of a conditional tracks the conditional probability of \(B\) given \(A\).

It should be noted that while this explanation of the circumstances in which a conditional is asserted seems very plausible, the account does not readily extend to apparent discrepancies between ordinary language conditionals and the material conditional when the conditional is embedded in a larger context, e.g., “Mary believes that if George is driving, he will be late”. Mary’s believing that George will be late allows Mary to immediately form the material conditional belief George is driving \(\rightarrow\) George will be late. But this is clearly not enough for a speaker reporting on Mary’s beliefs to assert that Mary therefore believes that if George is driving then George will be late. Grice’s explanation cannot say why.

In the last two decades, there has been a burgeoning number of researchers investigating conversational implicature and Grice’s principles. Criticisms have come from two opposing directions. Some critics argue that Grice’s maxims are not sufficiently worked out to explain many of the phenomena related to implicature. For example, in the sentence, “Joan believes that some of her students will fail,” there seems to be an implicature that not all of her students will fail, even though the contained sentence is not asserted. In another direction, Wilson and Sperber, and separately Bardzokas, argue that Grice’s principles can be derived from more general principles and should be understood in the context of some version of relevance theory.

Another continuing topic generated by Grice’s ideas is the relation between semantics and pragmatics (see the entry on pragmatics). The nature of the distinction is controversial, as argued by Bach 1997 and Horn 2006. Korta & Perry 2011 (Ch. 11) points out that there are various theoretical meanings to “proposition” and that the extent to which pragmatic principles are needed to determine the proposition expressed by an utterance depends on which understanding of proposition is in play. Two examples of the ongoing debate are LePore and Stone 2015 which argues that most, or perhaps all, of what Grice thought as pragmatic is in fact governed by linguistic rules, and Recanati 2010 which argues the contrary, that pragmatics plays a larger role than is generally recognized.

4. Meaning

Grice contends sentence and word meaning can be analyzed in terms of what speakers (utterers, for Grice) mean. Utterers’ meaning, in turn, can be analyzed without semantic remainder in terms of utterers having certain intentions. To see the idea as initially outlined in Grice’s 1957 article, “Meaning,” imagine you are stopped at night at an intersection, when the driver in an oncoming car flashes her lights. You reason as follows: “Why is she doing that? Oh, she must intend me to believe that my lights are not on. If she has that intention, it must be that my lights are not on. So, they are not.” To summarize:

The driver flashes her lights intending
  1. that you believe that your lights are not on;
  2. that you recognize her intention (1);
  3. that this recognition be part of your reason for believing that your lights are not on.

Call such an intention an M-intention. Grice’s idea is that an utterer \(U\) means that \(p\) by uttering \(x\) if and only if \(U\) M-intends that \(p\) by uttering \(x\). We will use ‘M-intends’ in this way in what follows. Utterances may include, not just sounds and marks but also gesture, grunts, and groans—anything that can signal an M-intention. The example illustrates an indicative M-intention; such intentions may also be imperative. In such a case, the utterer intends to get the audience to perform an action.

In the case of sentence meaning, Grice’s idea is to explicate it in terms of M-intentions. He suggests that the claim that a sentence \(x\) means that \(p\) “might as a first shot be equated with some statement or disjunction of statements about what ‘people’ (vague) intend (with qualifications about ‘recognition’) to effect by \(x\)” (1957, 66). The underlying idea is the same as in the flashing lights example. When you utter, “She brandished her clarinet like a tomahawk,” I—as a Gricean audience—reason as follows. “The standard use of that sentence is to utter it intending (1) that the audience believe she brandished her clarinet like a tomahawk; (2) that the audience recognize the intention (1); and (3) that this recognition be part of the audience’s reason for believing that she brandished her clarinet like a tomahawk. This is a standard, non-deceptive use; hence I should believe that she brandished her clarinet like a tomahawk.”

Grice’s post-1957 work on meaning divides along two lines. First, he refines the analyses of utterer’s meaning and sentence meaning, primarily in the 1968 article, “Utterer’s Meaning, Sentence Meaning, and Word Meaning,” and the 1969 article, “Utterer’s Meaning and Intentions.” Second, he addresses the fact that utterers and audiences rarely, if ever, reason in the way suggested. As you read these words, for example, you are not reasoning in that way. You read and you understand straightaway without any intervening reasoning. So how can Grice’s suggested explanation be anything but illusory? These points will be considered in turn.

In “Utterer’s Meaning, Sentence Meaning, and Word Meaning,” Grice offers a revised version of his 1957 account of utterers meaning. Grice remarks that in

the earlier (1957) account I took the view that the M-intended effect is, in the case of indicatives-type utterance, that the hearer should believe something, and, in the case of imperative-type utterances, that the hearer should do something. I wish for present purposes to make two changes here.
  1. I wish to represent the M-intended effect of imperative-type utterances as being that the hearer should intend to do something (with, of course, the ulterior intention on the part of the utter that the hearer go on to do the act in question).
  2. I wish to regard the M-intended effect common to indicative-type utterances as being, not that the hearer should believe something (though there will frequently be an ulterior intention to that effect), but the hearer should think that the utterer believes something.

(1968, 230).

By way of illustration, suppose \(U\), who wants the audience \(A\) to close the door, utters ‘Close the door.’ \(U\) M-intends that \(A\) should intend to close the door, and note: we specify what \(U\) means using the subjunctive mood. \(U\) means that \(A\) should close the door. For the indicative case, suppose \(U\) utters ‘The door is closed,’ M-intending that \(A\) believe \(U\) believes the door is closed. We specify what \(U\) means using the indicative mood—thus: \(U\) means that the door is closed.

Grice captures the role of moods in specifying meaning by introducing a special notation. He represents the indicative case this way: \(U\) means that \(\vdash\)(the door is closed); the imperative: \(U\) means that !(the door is closed). Here ‘the door is closed’ represents a moodless, underlying syntactical element Grice calls a sentence radical; it designates the moodless proposition that the door is closed. Grice calls ‘\(\vdash\)’ and ‘!’ mood operators, and he explains them contextually as follows:

  1. \(U\) means that \(\vdash(p)\) by uttering \(x\) if and only if, for some \(A\), \(U\) utters \(x\) M-intending \(A\) to think \(U\) thinks that \(p\);
  2. \(U\) means that \(!(p)\) by uttering x if and only, for some \(A\), if \(U\) utters \(x\) M-intending (a) \(A\) to think \(U\) intends (to bring it about) that \(p\); and (b) \(A\) to intend that \(p\)—having, as part of his reason \(U\)’s intention (a).

More than two operators are required to handle the full range of things utterers mean, but a complete list is not necessary to formulate the revised account of meaning. The account can be stated as follows. Given a function from psychological states onto mood operators, if \(\psi\) is a psychological state and \(*_{\psi}\) the associated mood operator,

\(U\) means that \(*_{\psi}(p)\) by uttering \(x\) if and only if, for some \(A\), \(U\) utters \(x\) M-intending

  1. that \(A\) should think \(U\) to \(\psi\) that \(p\); and (in some cases only), depending on \(*_{\psi}\),
  2. that \(A\) should via fulfillment of (i), himself \(\psi\) that \(p\).

Grice uses his revised treatment of utterer’s meaning to refine the very rough and preliminary account of sentence meaning (structured utterance type meaning, in his terminology) he gave in “Meaning.” His account thereof uses the notion of having a procedure in one’s repertoire. He says,

This idea seems to me to be intuitively fairly intelligible and to have application outside the realm of linguistic, or otherwise communicative, performances, though it could hardly be denied that it requires further explication. A faintly eccentric lecturer might have in his repertoire the following procedure: if he sees an attractive girl in his audience to pause for half a minute and then take a sedative. His having in his repertoire this procedure would not be incompatible with his also having two further procedures: (a) if he sees an attractive girl, to put on a pair of dark spectacles (instead of pausing to take a sedative); (b) to pause to take a sedative when he sees in his audience not an attractive girl, but a particularly distinguished colleague (1969, 233).

Turning to sentence meaning, the idea is that users of a natural language like English have standard procedures for using sentences, and that—very roughly—a sentence means \(p\) among a group of utterers when and only when that group has the procedure of using it to M-intend that \(p\).

This is a promising start. It is undeniable that English speakers have the procedure of using ‘The door is closed’ to mean that the door is closed. That is (one of the many) things we do with that sentence. So, assuming we accept the explication of utterer’s meaning in terms of M-intentions, it undeniable that English speakers have the procedure of using that sentence to M-intend with regard to the proposition that the door is closed. This yields the explanatory payoff described earlier. We can see communication as a rational activity in which an utterer intends to produce certain results and audiences reason their way to those results via their recognition of the utterer’s intention to produce that very result.

This preliminary account must be complicated, however, as it is unacceptable on three grounds. First, there are infinitely many sentences. How does an utterer associate a procedure with each sentence of his language? If they must be acquired one by one, it will take an infinite amount of time. Second, sentences are structured utterance-types, where meaning of the whole is consequent (in ways determined by syntactic structure) on the meaning of the parts. The account does not capture this aspect of sentence meaning at all. Third, the account fails to represent the complexity introduced into the account of utterer’s meaning; there is no mention of moods.

These considerations lead Grice to posit that the procedures associated with sentences are resultant procedures arising recursively out of basic procedures associated with words. Grice explains that

As a first approximation, one might say that a procedure for an utterance-type \(X\) will be a resultant procedure if it is determined by (its existence is inferable from) a knowledge of procedures (a) for particular utterance-types which are elements in \(X\), and (b) for any sequence of utterance-types which exemplifies a particular ordering of syntactic categories (a particular syntactic form) (SWW, p. 136–7).

Grice introduces a canonical form for specifying resultant procedures. He does so by generalizing the special notation he has already used in specifying meaning. Recall that he represented the indicative case by: \(U\) means that \(\vdash\)(the door is closed);the imperative: \(U\) means that !(the door is closed). The indicative sentence ‘\(\vdash\)(the door is closed)’ is associated with the psychological state of belief: speakers can and do utter that sentence with the intention that audiences respond by believing the door is closed. The imperative ‘! (the door is closed)’ is similarly associated with an audience response of action: speakers can and do utter that sentence with intention that that audiences respond by closing the door. ‘\(\vdash\)’ and ‘!’ are examples of a type of syntactic item Grice calls a mood operator. He assumes that the syntactic structure of sentences divides into a mood operator and the rest of the structure. Grice uses ‘\(*+\mathrm{R}\)’ to represent this division. Now let \(\mathrm{P}_{*+R}\) be the set of propositions associated with \(*+\mathrm{R}\), and \(\psi\) the psychological state or action associated with \(*\). Then a resultant procedure for \(*+\mathrm{R}\) takes one of two forms. \(U\) has the resultant procedure of:

  1. uttering \(*+\mathrm{R}\) if, for some \(A\), \(U\) wants \(A\) to \(\psi\) that \(p\); or
  2. uttering \(*+\mathrm{R}\) if, for some \(A\), \(U\) wants \(A\) to think \(U\) to \(\psi\) that \(p\).

Call these type 1 and type 2 resultant procedures. As a definition of sentence meaning we can say that, where \(p \in \mathrm{P}_{*+\mathrm{R}}\), \(*+\mathrm{R}\) means \(p\) in a group \(G\) if and only if members of \(G\) have, with respect to \(*+\mathrm{R}\), a type 1 or type 2 resultant procedure, the type being determined by the type of the mood operator \(*_{\psi}\). (Qualifications will, of course, be necessary to handle ‘audienceless’ cases.)

So far, perhaps, so good. There are pleasant quibbles over details, but in broad outline, the account is a very plausible description of meaning. In fact, at least three authors, Bennett, Loar and Schiffer, have developed their own more detailed accounts along Gricean lines. However, when we turn from description to explanation, plausibility appears to decline. The explanatory idea is to see communication as a rational activity where audiences reason their way to beliefs or intentions via their recognition of the utterer’s intention to produce such results. What about the problem that utterers and audiences rarely if ever engage in such reasoning? Grice’s work on reasoning contains the answer.

Does this approach define sentence meaning in terms of speaker’s intentions without any semantic remainder? That depends on how one interprets

A procedure for an utterance-type \(X\) will be a resultant procedure if it is determined by (its existence is inferable from) a knowledge of the procedures (a) for particular utterance-types which are elements in \(X\), and (b) for any sequence of utterance-types which exemplifies a particular ordering of syntactic categories (a particular syntactic form). (1968, 235)

One possibility is to explain at least some basic procedures in terms of the concept of reference, where reference is analyzed in terms of speakers’ intentions. The basic procedure for ‘tiger’ for example would be to utter ‘tiger’ to refer to tigers. But there is another possibility: the knowledge in (a) and (b) includes the knowledge of the semantic properties of words, and the semantic properties of combinations of word, where those properties cannot be fully analyzed in terms of speakers’ intentions. Noting that the notion of a procedure is quite unclear, Grice observes that

We can, if we are lucky, identify “linguistic rules,” so called, which are such that our linguistic practice is as if we accepted these rules and consciously followed them. But we want to say that this is not just an interesting fact about our linguistic practice but also an explanation of it; and this leads us on to suppose that “in some sense,” “implicitly,” we do accept these rules.Now the proper interpretation of the idea that we do accept these rules becomes something of a mystery, if the “acceptance” of the rules is to be distinguished from the existence of the related practices]but it seems like a mystery which, for the time being at least, we have to swallow, while recognizing that it involves us in an as yet unsolved problem.

The appeal to implicitly followed linguistic rules casts a revealing light on Grice as a champion of the view that communication is an exercise in rational coordination through acts of speaker meaning. Since Grice, a central question has been “[h]ow much of this coordination derives from interlocutors’ specific knowledge of one another as people? How much exploits their knowledge of language itself?” (Lepore and Stone 2015, 1). With the appeal to implicitly followed rules, Grice has one foot squarely on “knowledge of language itself” side of that divide.

5. Reasoning

In Aspects of Reason, Grice begins by considering the suggestion that reasoning consists in “the entertainment (and often acceptance) in thought or in speech of a set of initial ideas (propositions), together with a sequence of ideas each of which is derivable by an acceptable principle of inference from its predecessors in the set” (2001, 5). He shows that it is scarcely plausible to suppose that reasoning always involves the entertainment or acceptance of a sequence of ideas—the steps in the reasoning—each of which is derivable (or taken by the reasoner to be derivable) from its predecessors.

He points out that reasoning is often, indeed typically, enthymematic in the following way. Jill reasons: “Jack broke his crown, but he is an Englishman; therefore, he will be brave.” She does not employ any suppressed premise. She merely thinks: ‘but he is an Englishman; therefore, he will be brave’. The thought occurs to her in a way that carries conviction with it, and she thinks it intending the inference signaled by ‘therefore’ to be valid. Grice suggests that it is a necessary condition of reasoning from \(A\) to \(B\) that one intend that there be a formally valid (and non-trivial) argument from \(A\) to \(B\). Grice devotes a good deal of attention to the question of what to add to this necessary condition in order to obtain a sufficient condition. He emphasizes that we typically reason with the intention of producing reasons relevant to some end, and he sees this intentional activity as involving the exercise of the ability to make reason-preserving transitions between sets of thoughts or beliefs (or intentions or whatever). A transition is reason-preserving if and only if necessarily, if one has reasons for the initial set, then one also does for the subsequent set. Like any ability, the ability to make reason-preserving transitions may be impaired. Good reasoning consists in an unimpaired exercise of the ability to make reason-preserving transitions; reasoning--good or bad--is an exercise that is not too impaired. As Grice says, “[T]o explain what reasoning is (and maybe what the term ‘reasoning’ means), it is necessary in the first instance to specify what good reasoning is, and then to stipulate that ‘reasoning’ applies to good reasoning and also to sequences which approximate, to a given degree, to good reasoning; the idea of good reasoning is, in a certain sense, prior to the idea of reasoning.”

There is an important corollary: when we articulate our reasoning explicitly, we are typically not making previously suppressed premises explicit; rather, we are constructing the steps as we supply them. Suppose, for example, we were to ask Jill, “Why do you think that follows?” She could answer by saying she thinks that all the English are brave; or that the English are brave when they break their crowns; or that people of Jack’s age and description are brave provided that they are also English; and so on. In proposing one of these alternatives, Jill is not reporting her suppressed premise; she is advancing a premise she is willing to put forward now as what she would—or, perhaps, should—have thought or said then if the question of formal validity had been raised.

Returning to meaning, why not view utterers and their audiences as similar to Jill? You say “Jack brandished his clarinet like a tomahawk,” and in response I straightaway believe that he did brandish his clarinet in that way. Like Jill, I do not entertain—even in a suppressed way—any intervening premises. My comprehension is immediate and automatic—unmediated by any reasoning at all. But this does not mean that we cannot see me as intending there to be a formally valid inference from your words to my belief. Moreover, like Jill, I could construct the missing steps. Thus: “The utterer has the resultant procedure of uttering ”He brandished his clarinet like a tomahawk“ intending (1) that the audience believe that the utter believes he brandished his clarinet like a tomahawk; (2) that the audience recognize that intention (1); and (3) that this recognition be part of the audience’s reason for believing that the utterer believes that he brandished his clarinet like a tomahawk. The utterer is following that procedure in a non-deceptive way; hence I should believe, not only that the utterer believes that he brandished his clarinet like a tomahawk; but also, to the extent that I have confidence in the utterer, I should believe that myself.”

Similar remarks hold for you as the utterer of “Jack brandished his clarinet like a tomahawk.” You reason: “I recognize him as an English speaker; hence he knows I have the procedure of uttering ”Jack brandished his clarinet like a tomahawk“ intending: (1) that my audience believe he brandished his clarinet like a tomahawk; (2) that the audience recognize that intention (1); and (3) that this recognition be part of the audience’s reason for believing that I believe that he brandished his clarinet like a tomahawk. He will believe that I am following that procedure here in a non-deceptive way; hence he will believe that I believe that he brandished his clarinet like a tomahawk; and, to the extent that he has confidence in me, he will believe that too.”

There is no denying that we can describe utterers and audiences in this way. But should we really embrace this description as an explanation of meaning? To see the worry, imagine we are demigods. For our amusement, we create a race of creatures. We program language use into their brains. We ensure, for example, that, when an utterer produces the sounds “She brandished her clarinet like a tomahawk,” audiences believe that she did. To handle deceptive contexts, figurative language use, language instruction situations, telling jokes, and so on, we also build in heuristics that more or less reliably produce a different appropriate belief in such situations. When a creature utters a sentence and the audience forms the appropriate belief, the explanation is our programming, programming that operates entirely at a physiological level that is entirely inaccessible to consciousness. So, even if an audience reasons to a belief based on a recognition of relevant utterer’s intentions, surely that reasoning is an epiphenomenon of limited explanatory interest. The worry is that we may be like the creatures we have imagined. There is extensive physiological and psychological evidence that our use of natural language is to be explained along the lines similar to the explanation in the case of our creatures.

Grice’s ‘Meaning Revisited’ contains an answer to this worry. The key idea is that the account of utterers meaning specifies an optimal state that actual utterers rarely if ever realize. We explain this idea then return to our worry. Grice says that,

The general idea that I want to explore, and which seems to me to have some plausibility, is that something has been left out, by me and perhaps by others too, in the analyses, definitions, expansions and so on, of semantic notions, and particularly various notions of meaning. What has been left out … [is] the notion of value.

Though I think that in general we want to keep value notions out of our philosophical and scientific enquiries—and some would say out of everything else—we might consider what would happen if we relaxed this prohibition to some extent. If we did, there is a whole range of different kinds of value predicates or expressions which might be admitted in different types of case. To avoid having to choose between them, I am just going to use as a predicate the word ‘optimal’ the meaning of which could of course be more precisely characterized later (1982, 237).

The analysis of utterers’ meaning illustrates what Grice has in mind. He suggests that, “[a]s a first approximation, what we mean by saying that a speaker, by something he says, on a particular occasion, means that \(p\), is that he is in the optimal state with respect to communicating, or if you like, to communicating that \(p\)” (1982, 242). The optimal state is what the analysis of utterers’ meaning specifies.

The point is that there is no need to insist that real utterers typically have all the intentions the analysis requires. We nonetheless, for purposes of psychological explanation, often regard them to have the requisite intentions. For Grice, audiences do so when they need to justify the actions and beliefs that result from utterances in their presence. For example, as a result of reading the last sentence, you believe that we believe that audiences regard utterers as having the intentions specified in the account of utterers’ meaning when audiences are called upon to justify the beliefs and actions they form in response to utterances. Why are you justified in believing this? Because you recognized that we uttered the sentence intending, by means of recognition of that very intention, to produce that belief. Similar remarks hold for us as utterers. Why are we justified in thinking that you will form a justified belief in response to our utterance? Because we know that you can supply the justification in terms of your knowledge of our intentions.

This pattern of justifications also yields an explanation. The justifications explain by showing that meaning and response are instances of people’s capacity to act rationally. Such instances include actions one engaged in without prior reasoning, and which one would have also engaged in if one had reasoned about whether to do so prior to acting. The appeal to such counterfactuals is explanatory to the extent that speakers and audiences meet this condition: for a wide range of cases of speaker meaning, speakers reliably make utterances and audiences reliably respond without reasoning in (more or less) ways they would have if they had reasoned with sufficient time, insight, and attention. Thus, the Gricean theory of meaning does explain meaning as a rational activity. Grice’s treatment of conversational implicature also illustrates the breadth and power of this approach. Our demi-god example ignored this connection between explanation and justification.

A further objection to Grice’s account of meaning is that young children understand the meaning of utterances but are not capable of processing the complexities apparently required by Gricean theory. Thompson (2007, 2008) provides one approach to defend a (neo)Gricean account against these arguments.

Grice’s treatment of conversational implicature illustrates the breadth and power of this approach. Indeed, one of the motivations Grice had in giving an account of meaning was to distinguish between what is meant—M-intended—and what is not M-intended but implied. Grice’s conversational maxims are principles of rational communication that audiences use to construct an inferential bridge from what is meant to what is implied.

The continuing lively debates (e.g., Petrus 2010) about conversational implicatures and meaning, which are present in linguistics and artificial intelligence as well as philosophy, are testimony to the continuing importance of Grice’s seminal ideas.

6. Everyday Psychological Explanation

Grice’s views on everyday psychological explanation are intertwined with his views on rationality. Grice contends that the right picture of rationality is the picture, given us by Plato and Aristotle and others, as something which essentially functions to regulate, direct, and control pre-rational impulses, inclinations, and dispositions. Both everyday psychological explanation and assessments of rationality employ commonsense psychological principles. By such principles we mean a relatively stable body of generally-accepted principles, of which the following are examples:

  • If a person desires \(p\), and believes if \(p\) then \(q\), then—other things being equal—the person will desire \(q\).
  • If a person desires \(p\) and desires \(q\), then—other things being equal—the person will act on the stronger of the two desires if the person acts on either.
  • If a person stares at a colored surface and subsequently stares at a white surface, then—other things being equal—the person will have an after-image.

These examples express relations among complexes consisting of psychological states and behavior, and, as such they serve a descriptive and explanatory function. Other principles play a more evaluative role. Consider for example:

  • If a person believes \(p\) and that \(p\) entails \(q\), and the person believes not-\(q\), then, other things being equal, the person should stop believing \(p\) or stop believing \(q\).

Conformity to this principle is a criterion of rationality. The descriptive-explanatory and evaluative principles collectively give us is a specification of how “pre-rational, impulses, inclinations, and dispositions” operate as well as a basis for evaluating that operation.

The essential point for our purposes is that everyday psychology has special status for Grice. He argues:

The psychological theory which I envisage would be deficient as a theory to explain behaviour if it did not contain provision for interests in the ascription of psychological states otherwise than as tools for explaining and predicting behaviour, interests (for example) on the part of one creature to be able to ascribe these rather than those psychological states to another creature because of a concern for the other creature. Within such a theory it should be possible to derive strong motivations on the part of the creatures subject to the theory against the abandonment of the central concepts of the theory (and so of the theory itself), motivations which the creatures would (or should) regard as justified. Indeed, only from within the framework of such a theory, I think, can matters of evaluation, and so, of the evaluation of modes of explanation, be raised at all. If I conjecture aright, then, the entrenched system contains the materials needed to justify its own entrenchment; whereas no rival system contains a basis for the justification of anything at all (1975b, 52).

Thus, while everyday psychology (or some preferred part of it) may not entirely accurately specify how in fact we think and act, it does specify how we ought to think and act.

Assume everyday psychology is uniquely self-justifying in the way Grice suggests; then we must reject the suggestion that everyday psychology is just a rough and ready theory that we will (or could) eventually abandon without loss in favor of a more accurate and complete scientific theory of behavior. Grice objects on this ground to theories that regard only scientific knowledge as truly descriptive and explanatory and that relegate commonsense psychological explanation to a second-class role as a theory, useful in daily life, but not a theory we should endorse as a description or explanation of reality. Grice remarks:

We must be ever watchful against the Devil of scientism, who would lead us into myopic overconcentration on the nature and importance of knowledge, and of scientific knowledge in particular; the Devil who is even so audacious as to tempt us to call in question the very system of ideas require to make intelligible the idea of calling in question anything at all; and who would even prompt us, in effect, to suggest that since we do not really think but only think that we think, we had better change our minds without undue delay (1975b, 53).

Thus, to return briefly to the theory of meaning, the picture that theory offers of ourselves as rational communicators producing justified psychological attitudes in each other is no mere accident, no explanatory way station to be abandoned as science progresses. It is an ineliminable feature of the way in which we understand ourselves and others. In addition to this result, Grice’s view of psychological explanation also yield consequences both for ontology and for ethics.

7. Ontology

Grice’s ontological views are liberal. As Grice says when commenting on the mind—body problem in ‘Method in Philosophical Psychology’,

I am not greatly enamoured of some of the motivations which prompt the advocacy of psychophysical identifications; I have in mind a concern to exclude such ‘queer’ or ‘mysterious’ entities as souls, purely mental events, purely mental properties and so forth. My taste is for keeping open house for all sorts of conditions of entities, just so long as when they come in they help with the housework. Provided that I can see them work, and provided that they are not detected in illicit logical behaviour (within which I do not include a certain degree of indeterminacy, not even of numerical indeterminacy), I do not find them queer or mysterious at all…. To fangle a new ontological Marxism, they work therefore they exist, even though only some, perhaps those who come on the recommendation of some form of transcendental argument, may qualify for the specially favoured status of entia realissima. To exclude honest working entities seems to me like metaphysical snobbery, a reluctance to be seen in the company of any but the best objects (1975, 30–31).

Our discussion of psychological explanation shows what Grice had in mind in his reference to entities that “come on the recommendation of some form of transcendental argument, [and hence] may qualify for the specially favoured status of entia realissima.” Suppose—as Grice thinks—certain way of thinking, certain categories, are part of what is entrenched. Then there are certain concepts or categories that we cannot avoid applying to reality.

This theme will not be pursued further here; rather, we turn to the more “Marxist” side of Grice’s ontology: the claim that if entities work, they exist. We illustrate this point with the concept of a proposition. The critical role of that notion in Grice’s theory of meaning motivates our focus on it. Quinean criticisms of the notion have placed under it under a cloud of suspicion, a cloud many see as hanging ominously over Grice’s theory.

One of Quine’s arguments is that synonymy is not a well-defined equivalence relation, the identity conditions for propositions are unclear and there is ‘no entity without identity’. On this issue, Grice is not committed to an equivalence relation of synonymy (thus his remark above about indeterminacy), and he parts company with Quine over whether clear identity conditions are required. Grice, as noted earlier, argues for such conditions. But the acceptability of his theory of meaning does not depend on the success of that defense. Within the theory of meaning, propositions are theoretical entities to be understood by the role in the theory, and that role, according to Grice, does not demand a strict criterion of identity. Rather: if they work they exist. It is worth noting in this regard that there are many respectable entities for which we do not have criteria or identity. Suppose my favorite restaurant moves. Is it a new restaurant with the same name? Or suppose it changes owners and names but nothing else? Or that it changes menu entirely? Or that it changes chefs? It would be foolish to look for a single criterion to answer these questions—the answers go different ways in different contexts. But surely the concept of a restaurant is a useful one and restaurants do exists. Quine and Grice differ on the theoretical usefulness of propositions. The main reason for disagreement is due to Quine’s attitude that concepts such as belief and desire are of, at most, secondary importance in the unified canonical science that is his standard for ontology. Grice, as we have already noted, thinks that everyday psychological theory is of first importance.

8. Ordinary Language Philosophy

Grice was constantly concerned with philosophical methodology, and the discussion so far omits one important methodological focus: ordinary language philosophy. Although it was by no means Grice’s sole philosophical commitment, it was a central one.

Grice is a well-known critic of ordinary language philosophy, and one of his main targets was J. L. Austin and a style of reasoning he popularized. Austin thought there was a relatively clear notion of what it is inappropriate to say, and that we could delineate truth-conditions by identifying instances of inappropriateness (Warner, 2012). For example, he inferred from (1) “Typically, when one acts, it would be inappropriate to say either that one acted voluntarily or that one acted involuntarily” to (2) “Typically, when one acts, one acts neither voluntarily nor involuntarily.” As Grice convincingly argues, the inference fails because being untrue is not the only form of inappropriateness. Something may be true but inappropriate to say for other reasons (Grice 1960, 1975, 1981, 1989).

Grice was, however, also a life-long practitioner of ordinary language philosophy. He begins the “Prolegomena” to Studies in the Way of Words by noting that “some may regard [ordinary language philosophy] as an outdated style of philosophy,” but he urges us “not to be too quick to write off such a style.” Instead, he urges us to build “a theory which will enable one to distinguish between the case in which an utterance is false or fails to be true, or more generally fails to correspond to the world in some favored way, and the case in which it is inappropriate for reasons of a different kind” (Grice 1989, 4). Much of Studies in the Way of Words addresses this task.

Why bother to build such a theory? There are many possible answers, and Grice would no doubt have given more than one, but we focus on just one answer, which is implicit in this work. Recall that, on his view, commonsense psychology consists, at least in part, of a body of self-justifying descriptive, explanatory, and evaluative principles. The principles are ‘self-justifying’ in the sense explained earlier in section 6. An illuminating description of these principles would be an illuminating description of how we think, and such a description would certainly be of interest. How do we get one? By carefully examining what we say. Two tenets of ordinary language philosophy were that a clear view of what we mean in the language we use is a clear view of what we think, and that a necessary step in getting clear view of what we mean is close attention to the details of what we say. But the detailed examination will only reveal what we mean if we can reliably distinguish between “the case in which an utterance is false or fails to be true, or more generally fails to correspond to the world in some favored way, and the case in which it is inappropriate for reasons of a different kind.”

9. Ethics

Grice uses this general account of reasoning to investigate moral reasoning and moral reasons. He emphasizes the connections between reasons, actions, and freedom. It is convenient to divide Grice’s approach into two stages (although he himself does not do so). The first stage argues that one must regard the exercise of rationality in the free adoption and pursuit of ends as an unrelativized good at which all persons should aim. The second stage examines the concepts of happiness and freedom to discover principles which persons—conceived of as rationally adopting and pursuing ends—must adopt insofar as they are to qualify as rational.

The first stage. Why think that one must regard the exercise of rationality in the free adoption and pursuit of ends as an unrelativized good at which all persons should aim? To begin with, what does Grice mean by an “unrelativized good”? Grice grants that the concept of unrelativized value requires defense; after all, things have value only relative to ends and beneficiaries. So how is unrelativized value to be understood? Grice defines unrelativized value “in Aristotelian style [as] whatever would seem to possess such value in the eyes of a duly accredited judge; and a duly accredited judge might be identifiable as a good person operating in conditions of freedom.” (Of course, this is still to talk about what is of value for and to persons; the point is to avoid relativization to this or that kind of person or kind of end.) So, why would a duly accredited judge see value in the free rational adoption and pursuit of ends, where such value is not ascribed because of the contribution that activity makes to some other end?

Grice’s views on commonsense psychology provide the answer. As noted earlier, Grice thinks that commonsense psychology exhibits two features: parts of it are self-justifying; and, it contains principles for evaluating thought and action, where some of those principles are self-justifying. When he turns to ethics, Grice adds that commonsense psychology represents us as exercising rationality in freely adopting and pursuing ends; moreover, this view of ourselves is self-justifying in the sense that we cannot coherently conceive of ourselves in any other way. Grice’s—very plausible—claim is that a “duly accredited judge” operating from within the theory of commonsense psychology would take the rational, free adoption and pursuit of ends as having unrelativized value. Hence, it does have such value.

The second stage: What principles must a free adopter and pursuer of ends embrace in order to qualify as rational? Grice addresses this question most fully in Aspects of Reason and The Conception of Value. The idea is that the combined requirements of rationality (outside ethics), freedom, and happiness impose substantive constraints on all persons. Grice develops this theme with great insight and subtlety; however, he did not complete the project, and the intricacies of his views are best left to the detail of his own works.

10. Conclusion

The sophistication and inventiveness of Grice’s work is well-known. What is less well-known is its ambitious and systematic nature. Emphasizing this latter aspect has been one goal of this brief presentation of Grice’s work, work which weaves meaning, reasoning, psychology, ontology, and value into a complex, unified whole.


Primary Sources

Books By Grice

  • 1989, Studies in the Way of Words (SWW), Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press; a collection including most of the important works published during his lifetime.
  • 1991, The Conception of Value, New York: Oxford University Press; a posthumous publication of the John Locke Lectures, delivered in 1979.
  • 2001, Aspects of Reason (ed. Richard Warner), Oxford: Oxford University Press; a posthumously published book exploring the nature of reasons and reasoning.

Selected Articles By Grice

  • 1957, (with P F Strawson), ‘In Defence Of A Dogma’, Philosophical Review, 65: 141–58; reprinted in SWW.
  • 1957, ‘Meaning’, The Philosophical Review, 66: 377–88; reprinted in SWW.
  • 1961, ‘The Causal Theory of Perception’, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (Supplementary Volume), 35: 121–52; reprinted in SWW.
  • 1968, ‘Utterer’s Meaning, Sentence Meaning, and Word-Meaning’, Foundations of Language, 4: 225-42; reprinted in SWW.
  • 1969, ‘Utterer’s Meaning and Intentions’, The Philosophical Review, 68: 147–77; reprinted in SWW.
  • 1971, ‘Intention and Uncertainty’, Proceedings of the British Academy, 57: 263–79.
  • 1975, ‘Logic and Conversation’, in The Logic of Grammar, D. Davidson and G. Harman (eds.), Encino, CA: Dickenson, 64–75; reprinted in SWW.
  • 1975b, ‘Method in Philosophical psychology (From the Banal to the Bizarre)’, Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association, 48: 23–53.
  • 1978, ‘Further Notes on Logic and Conversation’, in Syntax and Semantics: Pragmatics, v 9, P. Cole (ed.), New York: Academic Press, 183–97; reprinted in SWW.
  • 1981, ‘Presupposition and Conversational Implicature’, in Radical Pragmatics, P. Cole (ed.), New York: Academic Press, 183–97.
  • 1982, ‘Meaning Revisited’, in Mutual Knowledge, N.V. Smith (ed.), New York: Academic Press, 223–43; reprinted in SWW.

Secondary Sources

Books On Grice

  • Atlas, J. D., 2005, Logic, Logic, Meaning and Conversation: Semantical Underdeterminancy, Implicature, and their Interface, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Avramides, A., 1989, Meaning and Mind: An Examination of a Gricean Account of Language, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Bardzokas, V., 2010, Causality and Connectives: From Grice to Relevance, Amsterdam: Benjamins Publishing Co.
  • Chapman, S., 2007, Paul Grice, Philosopher and Linguist, London: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Cosenza, G. (ed.), 2001, Paul Grice’s Heritage, Turnhout: Brepols.
  • Davis, W. 1998, Implicature: Intention, Convention, and Principle in the Failure of Gricean Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Grandy, R., and R. Warner, 1986, Philosophical Grounds of Rationality: Intentions, Categories, Ends, Oxford: Oxford University Press. (A festschrift celebrating Grice’s work, with a lengthy editorial introduction and a response by Grice.)
  • Korta, K., and J. Perry, 2011, Critical Pragmatics: An inquiry into Reference and Communication, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge
  • Lepore, E., and M. Stone, 2015, Imagination and Convention: Distinguishing Grammar and Inference in Language , Oxford University Press.
  • Petrus, K, (ed.), 2010, Meaning and Analysis: New Essays on Grice, Hampshire, England: Palgrave Studies in Pragmatics, Language, and Cognition.
  • Recanati, F., 2010, Truth-conditional Pragmatics, Oxford University Press, Oxford.

Articles On Grice

  • Bach, K., 1997 “The Semantics Pragmatics Distinction: What it is and Why it Matters”, in K. Turner (ed.), The Semantics-Pragmatics Interface From Different Points of View. Amsterdam: Elsevier, 65–84.
  • Baker, J., 1989, “The metaphysical construction of value”, Journal of Philosophy, 10: 505–13.
  • Davis, W. 2007, “Grice’s Meaning Project”, Journal of Pragmatics, 26: 41–58.
  • Davies, M., 1996, “The Philosophy of Language”, in The Blackwells Companion to Philosophy, N. Bunin and E. Tsui-James (eds.), Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Grandy, R. E., 1989, “On Grice on language”, Journal of Philosophy, 10: 514–25.
  • Grim, P., 2011, “Simulating Grice: emergent pragmatics in spatialized game theory”, in Language, Games, and Evolution, edited by A. Benz, C. Ebert, G, Jager, and R. van Rooij, Berlin, Heidelberg: Springer Verlag.
  • Hazlett, A., 2007, “Grice’s razor”, Metaphilosophy, 38: 669–690.
  • Horn, L., 2006, “The Border Wars–A Neo-Gricean Perspective”, von Heusinger, K. and K. Turner (editors), Where Semantics Meets Pragmatics (Current Research in the Semantics/Pragmatics Interface: Volume 16), Amsterdam: Elsevier, 21–48.
  • Luhti, D., 2006, “How implicatures make Grice an unordinary ordinary language philosopher”, Pragmatics, 16: 247–274.
  • Neale, S, 1992, “Paul Grice and the philosophy of language”, Linguistics and Philosophy, 15: 509–559.
  • Potts, C., 2006, “Review: Paul Grice: Philosopher and Linguist”, Mind, 115: 743–747.
  • Searle, J., 2007, “Grice on meaning: 50 years later”, Teorema, 26: 9–18.
  • Soames, S., 2003, “Language use and the logic of conversation”, (Ch. 9 of Philosophical Analysis in the Twentieth Century (Volume 2: The Age of Meaning), Princeton: Princeton University Press 197–218.
  • Stalnaker, R., 1989, “On Grandy on Grice”, Journal of Philosophy, 10: 525–8.
  • Strawson, P. F., 1964, “Intention and convention in speech acts”, Philosophical Review, 73: 439–60.
  • Thompson, R., 2007, “Still relevant: H. P. Grice’s legacy” in “Psycholinguists and the philosophy of language”, Teorema, 26: 77–109.
  • –––, 2007, “Grades of Meaning,” Synthese, 161: 283–308.
  • Warner, R., 1989, “Reply to Baker and Grandy”, Journal of Philosophy, 10: 528–9
  • –––, 2013, “Austin, J. L.”, International Encyclopedia of Ethics, H. LaFollette (ed.), Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Ziff, P., 1967, “On H. P. Grice’s Account of Meaning”, Analysis, 28: 1–8.

Books Developing a (more or less) Gricean account of meaning

  • Bennett, J., 1976, Linguistic Behaviour, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Loar, B., 1981, Mind and Meaning, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Schiffer, S., 1972, Meaning, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wilson, D., and Sperber, D., 2012, Meaning and Relevance, New York: Cambridge University Press.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

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