The Analytic/Synthetic Distinction

First published Thu Aug 14, 2003; substantive revision Wed Mar 30, 2022

“Analytic” sentences, such as “Pediatricians are doctors,” have historically been characterized as ones that are true by virtue of the meanings of their words alone and/or can be known to be so solely by knowing those meanings. They are contrasted with more usual “synthetic” sentences, such as “Pediatricians are rich,” (knowledge of) whose truth depends also upon (knowledge of) the worldly fortunes of pediatricians. Beginning with Frege, many philosophers hoped to show that the truths of logic and mathematics and other apparently a priori domains, such as much of philosophy and the foundations of science, could be shown to be analytic by careful “conceptual analysis” of the meanings of crucial words. Analyses of philosophically important terms and concepts, such as “material object,” “cause,” “freedom,” or “knowledge” turned out, however, to be far more problematic than philosophers had anticipated, and some, particularly Quine and his followers, began to doubt the reality of the distinction. This in turn led him and others to doubt the factual determinacy of claims of meaning and translation in general, as well as, ultimately, the reality and determinacy of mental states. There have been a number of interesting reactions to this scepticism, in philosophy and linguistics (this latter to be treated in the supplement, Analyticity and Chomskyan Linguistics); but, while the reality of mental states might be saved, it has yet to be shown that appeals to the analytic will ever be able to ground “analysis” and the a priori in quite the way that philosophers had hoped. (Note that all footnotes are substantive, but inessential to an initial reading, and are accessed in a separate file by clicking on the bracketed superscript. The mention vs. use of a term will be indicated either by quotation marks or italics, depending upon which is most easily readable in the context.)

1. The Intuitive Distinction

Compare the following two sets of sentences:

All doctors that specialize on children are rich.
All pediatricians are rich.
Everyone who runs damages their bodies.
If Holmes killed Sikes, then Watson must be dead.
All doctors that specialize on children are doctors.
All pediatricians are doctors.
Everyone who runs moves.
If Holmes killed Sikes, then Sikes must be dead.

Most competent English speakers who know the meanings of all the constituent words would find an obvious difference between the two sets: whereas they might wonder about the truth or falsity of those of set I, they would find themselves pretty quickly incapable of doubting those of II. Unlike the former, these latter seem to be justifiable automatically, “just by knowing what the words mean,” as many might spontaneously put it. Indeed, denials of any of them, e.g.,

#Not all pediatricians are doctors – some aren’t at all!
#Not everyone who runs moves – some remain completely still!

would seem to be in some important way unintelligible, very like contradictions in terms (the “#” indicates semantic anomaly). Philosophers standardly refer to sentences of the first set as “synthetic,” those of the second as (at least apparently) “analytic.” (Members of set III. are sometimes said to be “analytically false,” although this term is rarely used, and “analytic” is standardly confined to sentences that are regarded as true.) We might call sentences such as (5)-(10) part of the “analytic data” to which philosophers and linguists have often appealed in invoking the distinction (without prejudice, however, to whether such data might otherwise be explained). Some philosophers might want to include in set III. what are called category mistakes (q.v.) such as #The number three likes Tabasco sauce, or #Saturday is in bed (cf., Ryle, 1949 [2009]), but these have figured less prominently in recent discussions, being treated not as semantically anomalous, but as simply false and silly (Quine 1960 [2013, p. 210]).

Many philosophers have hoped that the apparent necessity and a priori status of the claims of logic, mathematics and much of philosophy could be explained by their claims being analytic, our understanding of the meaning of the claims explaining why they seemed to be true “in all possible worlds,” and knowable to be so, “independently of experience.” This view led many of them to regard philosophy as consisting in large part in the “analysis” of the meanings of the relevant claims, words and concepts;[1] i.e., a provision of conditions that were individually necessary and jointly sufficient for the application of a word or concept, in the way that, for example, being a female and being a parent are each necessary and together sufficient for being a mother. Such a conception seemed to invite and support (although we’ll see it doesn’t entail) the special methodology of “armchair reflection” on concepts in which many philosophers traditionally engaged, independently of any empirical research.

1.1 Kant

Although there are precursors of the contemporary notion of the analytic in Leibniz, and in Locke and Hume in their talk of “relations of ideas,” the conception that currently concerns many philosophers has its roots in the work of Kant (1787 [1998]) who, at the beginning of his Critique of Pure Reason, wrote:

In all judgments in which the relation of a subject to the predicate is thought (if I only consider affirmative judgments, since the application to negative ones is easy) this relation is possible in two different ways. Either the predicate B belongs to the subject A as something that is (covertly) contained in this concept A; or B lies entirely outside the concept A, though to be sure it stands in connection with it. In the first case, I call the judgment analytic, in the second synthetic. (1787 [1998], B10)

He provided as an example of an analytic judgment, “All bodies are extended”: in thinking of a body we can’t help but also think of it being extended in space; that would seem to be just part of what is meant by “body.” He contrasted this with “All bodies are heavy,” where the predicate (“is heavy”) “is something entirely different from that which I think in the mere concept of body in general” (B11), and we must put together, or “synthesize,” the different concepts, body and heavy (sometimes such concepts are called “ampliative,” “amplifying” a concept beyond what is “contained” in it).

Kant tried to spell out his “containment” metaphor for the analytic in two ways. To see that any of set II is true, he wrote, “I need only to analyze the concept, i.e., become conscious of the manifold that I always think in it, in order to encounter this predicate therein” (B10). But then, picking up a suggestion of Leibniz, he went on to claim:

I merely draw out the predicate in accordance with the principle of contradiction, and can thereby at the same time become conscious of the necessity of the judgment. (B11)

As Jerrold Katz (1988) emphasized, this second definition is significantly different from the “containment” idea, since now, in its appeal to the powerful method of proof by contradiction, the analytic would include all of the (potentially infinite) deductive consequences of a particular claim, many of which could not be plausibly regarded as “contained” in the concept expressed in the claim. For starters, Bachelors are unmarried or the moon is blue is a logical consequence of Bachelors are unmarried—its denial contradicts the latter (a denial of a disjunction is a denial of each disjunct)—but clearly nothing about the color of the moon is remotely “contained in” the concept bachelor. To avoid such consequences, Katz (e.g., 1972, 1988) went on to try to develop a serious theory based upon only the initial containment idea, as, along different lines, does Paul Pietroski (2005, 2018).

One reason Kant may not have noticed the differences between his different characterizations of the analytic was that his conception of “logic” seems to have been confined to Aristotelian syllogistic, and so didn’t include the full resources of modern logic, where, as we’ll see, the differences between the two characterizations become more glaring (see MacFarlane 2002). Indeed, Kant demarcates the category of the analytic chiefly in order to contrast it with what he regards as the more important category of the “synthetic,” which he famously thinks is not confined, as one might initially suppose, merely to the empirical.[2] He argues that even so elementary an example in arithmetic as 7+5=12 is synthetic, since the concept of 12 is not contained in the concepts of 7, 5, or +,: appreciating the truth of the proposition would seem to require some kind of active “synthesis” by the mind uniting the different constituent thoughts (1787 [1998], B15). And so we arrive at the category of the “synthetic a priori,” whose very possibility became a major concern of his work. Kant tried to show that the activity of synthesis was the source of the important cases of a priori knowledge, not only in arithmetic, but also in geometry, the foundations of physics, ethics, and philosophy generally, a controversial view that set the stage for much of the philosophical discussions of the subsequent centuries (see Coffa 1991, pt. I).

Apart from geometry, Kant, himself, actually didn’t focus much on the case of mathematics. But, as mathematics in the 19th C. began reaching new heights of sophistication, worries were increasingly raised about its foundations. It was specifically in response to these latter worries that Gottlob Frege (1884 [1980]) tried to improve upon Kant’s formulations of the analytic, and presented what is widely regarded as the next significant discussion of the topic.[3]

1.2 Frege

Frege (1884 [1980], §§5,88) and others noted a number of problems with Kant’s “containment” metaphor. In the first place, as Kant (1787 [1998], B756) himself would surely have agreed, the criterion would need to be freed of “psychologistic” suggestions, or claims about merely the accidental thought processes of thinkers, as opposed to claims about truth and justification that are presumably at issue with the analytic. In particular, mere associations are not always matters of meaning: many people in thinking about Columbus may automatically think “the discoverer of America,” or in thinking about the number 7 they “can’t help but also think” about the numeral that denotes it, but it’s certainly not analytic that Columbus discovered America, or that a number is identical with a numeral. Moreover, while it may be arguably analytic that a circle is a closed figure of constant curvature (see Katz, 1972), someone could fail to notice this and so think the one without the other.

Even were Kant to have solved this problem, it isn’t clear how his notion of “containment” would cover cases that seem to be as “analytic” as any of set II, such as:

Anyone who’s an ancestor of an ancestor of Bob is an ancestor of Bob.
If Bob is married to Sue, then Sue is married to Bob.
If something is red, then it’s colored.

The transitivity of ancestor or the symmetry of married are not obviously “contained in” the corresponding thoughts in the way that the idea of extension is plausibly “contained in” the notion of body, or male in the notion of bachelor. (13) has seemed particularly troublesome: what else besides colored could be included in the analysis? The concept red involves color – and what else? It is hard to see what else to “add” – except red itself!

Frege attempted to remedy the situation by completely rethinking the foundations of logic, developing what we now think of as modern symbolic logic. He defined a perfectly precise “formal” language, i.e., a language characterized by the “form” – standardly, the shape—of its expressions, and he carefully set out an account of the syntax and semantics of what are called the “logical constants,” such as “and,” “or,” “not,” “all” and “some,” showing how to capture a very wide class of valid inferences containing them. Saying precisely how the constants are determined is a matter of controversy (see Logical Constants), but, at least roughly and intuitively, they can be thought of as those parts of language that don’t “point” or “function referentially,” aiming to refer to something in the world, in the way that ordinary nouns, verbs, adjectives, adverbs and prepositions seem to do. “Socrates” refers to Socrates, “dogs” to dogs, “(is) clever” to cleverness and/or clever things, but words like “or” and “all” don’t seem to function referentially at all. At any rate, it certainly isn’t clear that there are any ors and alls in the world, along with Socrates, the dogs, and sets or properties of them.

This distinction between non-logical, “referring” expressions and logical constants allows us to define a logical truth in a way that has become common (and will be particularly useful in this entry) as a sentence that is true no matter what non-logical expressions occur in it (cf. Tarski, 1936 [1983], Quine, 1956 [1976], Davidson 1980). Consequently (placing non-logical expressions in bold, and re-numbering prior examples):

All doctors that specialize on children are doctors.

counts as a (strict) logical truth: no matter what grammatical expressions we put in for the non-logical terms “doctor”, “specialize on” and “children” in (14), the sentence will remain true. For example, substituting “cats” for “doctors”, “chase” for “specialize on” and “mice” for “children,” we get:

All cats that chase mice are cats.

(Throughout this discussion, by “substitution” we shall mean uniform substitution of one presumably univocal expression for another in all its occurrences in a sentence.) But what about the others of set II? Substituting “cats” for “doctors” and “mice” for “pediatricians” in

All pediatricians are doctors.

we get:

All mice are cats.

which is obviously false, as would many such substitutions render the rest of the examples of II. (14) and (15) are patent logical truths; their truth depends only upon the semantic values of their logical particles. But All pediatricians are doctors and the other examples, (6)–(8) and (11)–(13), are not formal logical truths, specifiable by the logical form of the sentence (or its pattern of logical particles) alone; nor are their denials, e.g., (9) and (10), formal contradictions (i.e., of the form, where ‘p’ stands in for any sentence: “p and it is not the case that p”). How are we to capture them?

Here Frege appealed to the notion of “definition,” or —presuming that definitions preserve “meaning”— “synonymy”: the non-logical analytic truths are those that can be converted to formal logical truths by substitution of definitions for defined terms, or synonyms for synonyms. Since “mice” is not synonymous with “pediatrician,” (17) is not a substitution into (16) of the required sort. We need, instead, a substitution of the definition of “pediatrician,” i.e., “doctor that specializes on children,” which would convert (16) into our earlier purely formal logical truth:

All doctors that specialize on children are doctors.

Of course, these notions of definition, meaning and synonymy would themselves need to be clarified, But they were thought at the time to be sufficiently obvious notions whose clarification didn’t seem particularly urgent until W.V.O. Quine (1953 [1980a]) raised serious questions about them much later (see §3.3ff below). Putting those questions to one side, Frege made spectacularly interesting suggestions, offering a famous definition, for example, of the “ancestral” relation involved in (11) as a basis for his definition of number (see Frege’s Theorem and Foundations for Arithmetic), and inspiring the program of “logicism” (or the reduction of arithmetic to logic) that was pursued in Whitehead and Russell’s (1910–13) monumental Principia Mathematica, and the (early) Ludwig Wittgenstein’s (1922) Tractatus Logico-philosophicus.

Frege was mostly interested in formalizing arithmetic, and so considered the logical forms of a relative minority of natural language sentences in a deliberately spare notation – he didn’t take on the likes of (12)-(13). But work on the logical (or syntactic) structure of the full range of sentences of natural language has blossomed since then, initially in the work of Bertrand Russell (1905), in his famous theory of definite descriptions (see Descriptions), which he (1912) combined with his views about the knowledge by “acquaintance” with sense-data and universals into a striking “fundamental principle in the analysis of propositions containing descriptions”:

Every proposition which we can understand must be composed wholly of constituents with which we are acquainted (1912:58),

an early version of a proposal pursued by Logical Positivists, to be discussed in the next sections below. Frege’s and Russell’s formalizations are also indirectly the inspiration for the subsequent work of Noam Chomsky and other “generative” linguists and logicians (see supplement). Whether Frege’s criterion of analyticity will work for the rest of II and other analyticities depends upon the details of these latter proposals, some of which are discussed in the supplement,

2. High Hopes

Influenced by these developments in logic, many philosophers in the first half of the Twentieth Century thought analyticity could perform crucial epistemological work not only in accounting for our apparently a priori knowledge of mathematics, but also —with a little help from British empiricism—of our understanding of claims about the spatiotemporal world as well. Indeed, “analysis” and the “linguistic turn” (Rorty, 1992) soon came to constitute the very way many Anglophone philosophers characterized their work, particularly since such analyses of what we mean by our words seemed to be the sort of enterprise available to “armchair reflection” that seemed to many a distinctive feature of that work (see Haug, 2014). Many thought this project would also perform the more metaphysical work of explaining the truth and necessity of mathematics, showing not only how it is we could know about these topics independently of experience, but how they could be true in this and in all possible worlds, usually, though, without distinguishing this project from the epistemic one. Thus, Gilbert Harman (1967 [1999] begins his review of the topic combining the two projects:

What I shall call a ‘full-blooded theory of analytic truth’ takes the analytic truths to be those that hold solely by virtue of meaning or that are knowable solely by virtue of meaning. (p. 119, see also p. 127),

taking himself to be expressing the views of a number of other then contemporary philosophers.

This seemed like a grand unified plan until Saul Kripke (1972) and Hilary Putnam (1975) drew attention to fundamental differences between the metaphysical and epistemic modalities that had tended to be run together throughout this period. They pointed out that, for example, “water is H2O” might well be necessarily true, but not knowable a priori, and “The meter stick in Paris is one meter long” might be knowable a priori but not be necessarily true (that very stick might have been broken and never used for measurements; see A Priori Justification and Knowledge).

Once the metaphysical and epistemic issues are separated, it becomes less obvious that mere matters of meaning could really explain all necessities. Recall that Frege’s ambition had been to reduce mathematics to logic by showing how, substituting synonyms for synonyms, every mathematical truth could be shown to be a logical one. He hadn’t gone on to claim that the logical truths themselves were true or necessary by virtue of meaning alone. These were “Laws of Truth” (Frege, 1918/84:58), and it wasn’t clear what sort of explanation could be provided for them. Obviously, appealing merely to further synonym substitutions wouldn’t suffice. As Michael Devitt (1993a) pointed out:

the sentence ‘All bachelors are unmarried’ is not true solely in virtue of meaning and so is not analytic in the…sense [of true in virtue of meaning alone]. The sentence is indeed true partly in virtue of the fact that ‘unmarried’ must refer to anything that ‘bachelor’ refers to but it is also true partly in virtue of the truth of ‘All unmarrieds are unmarried.’ (Devitt 1993a, p. 287; cf., Quine 1956 [1976], p. 118)

It was certainly not clear that the truth of “All unmarrieds are unmarrieds” is based on the same sort of arbitrary synonymy facts that underlie “All bachelors are unmarried.” In any event, a different kind of account seemed to be needed (see footnotes 9 and 16).

Jerrold Katz and Paul Postal (1991, pp. 516–7) did claim that adequate linguistic theory should, inter alia, explain why, if John killed Bill is true, then so is Bill is dead. However, as David Israel (1991) pointed out in reply: “there are facts about English, about what propositions are expressed by certain utterances, and then there is a non-linguistic fact: that one proposition entails another” (p. 571). Utterances of sentences are one thing; the propositions (or thoughts) many different sentences may express, quite another, and the two shouldn’t be confused:

It is just not true that if the proposition expressed by [an utterance of John killed Bill] is true that, then “in virtue of [natural language] so, necessarily, is” the proposition expressed by [an utterance of Bill is dead]. Rather, if the proposition that, according to the grammar of English, is expressed by [an utterance of John killed Bill] is true, then, in virtue of the structure of the propositions concerned, the proposition that, according to the grammar of English, is expressed by [an utterance of Bill is dead] must also be true.--(D. Israel, 1991, p. 71, emphasis added)

Providing the metaphysical basis for logical truth is a fine issue (see Logical Truth), but as Devitt (1993a and b) and others (e.g., Paul Boghossian, 1996, Williamson, 2007) went on to stress, it has been the epistemological issues about justifying our beliefs in necessary truths that have dominated philosophical discussions of the analytic in the last seventy years.[4] Consequently, we will focus primarily on this more modest, epistemological project in the remainder of this entry.

2.1 Mathematics

As we noted (§1.2), Frege had developed formal logic to account for our apparently a priori knowledge of mathematics. It is worth dwelling on the interest of this problem. It is arguably one of the oldest and hardest problems in Western philosophy, and is easy enough to understand: ordinarily we acquire knowledge about the world by using our senses. If we are interested, for example, in whether it’s raining outside, how many birds are on the beach, whether fish sleep or stars collapse, we look and see, or turn to others who do. It is a widespread view that Western sciences owe their tremendous successes precisely to relying on just such “empirical” (experiential, experimental) methods. However, it is also a patent fact about all these sciences, and even our ordinary ways of counting birds, fish and stars, that they depend on often immensely sophisticated mathematics, and mathematics does not seem to be known on the basis of experience. Mathematicians don’t do experiments in the way that chemists, biologists or other “natural scientists” do. They seem simply to think, seeming to rely precisely on the kind of “armchair reflection” to which many philosophers also aspire. In any case, they don’t try to justify their claims by reference to experiments, arguing that twice two is four by noting that pairs of pairs tend in all cases observed so far to be quadruples.

But how could mere processes of thought issue in any knowledge about the independently existing external world? The belief that it could would seem to involve some kind of mysticism; and, indeed, many “naturalistic” philosophers have felt that the appeals of “Rationalist” philosophers to some special faculty of “rational intuition,” such as one finds in philosophers like Plato, Descartes and Leibniz and, more recently, Katz (1988, 1990), George Bealer (1987) and Laurence Bonjour (1998), these all seem no better off than appeals to “revelation” to establish theology. The program of logicism and “analysis” seemed to many to offer a more promising, “naturalistic” alternative.

2.2 Science and Beyond

But why stop at arithmetic? If logical analysis could illuminate the foundations of mathematics by showing how the axioms of arithmetic could all be derived from pure logic by substitution of synonyms, perhaps it could also illuminate the foundations of the rest of our knowledge by showing how its claims could similarly be derived from some kind of combination of logic and experience. Such was the hope and program of Logical Positivism (see Logical Empiricism) championed by, e.g., Moritz Schlick, A.J. Ayer and, especially, Rudolf Carnap from about 1915 in Vienna and Berlin to well into the 1950s in England and America. Of course, such a proposal did presume that all of our concepts were somehow “derived” either from logic or experience, but this seemed in keeping with the then prevailing presumptions of empiricism, which, they assumed, had been vindicated by the immense success of the empirical sciences.

For the Positivists, earlier empiricists, such as Locke, Berkeley and Hume, had erred only in thinking that the mechanism of construction was mere association. But association can’t account for the structure of even a simple judgment, such as Caesar is bald. This is not merely the excitation of its constituent ideas, Caesar, is, and bald, along the lines of the idea of salt exciting the idea of pepper, but, as Frege had shown, involves combining the noun Caesar and the predicate is bald in a very particular way, a fact that was important in accounting for more complex judgments such as Caesar is bald or not bald, or Someone is bald. Our thoughts and claims about the world have some kind of logical structure, of a sort that seems to begin to be revealed by Frege’s proposals. Equipped with his logic, it was possible to provide a more plausible formulation of conceptual empiricism: our claims about the empirical world were to be analyzed into the (dis)confirming experiences out of which they must somehow have been logically constructed.

But constructed out of which experiences? For the Positivists, the answer seemed obvious: out of the experiential tests that would standardly justify, verify or confirm the claim. Indeed, as Ayer (1934, chap 1) made plain, a significant motivation for the Positivists was to save empirical knowledge from the predations of traditional sceptical arguments about the possibility that all of life is a dream or the deception of an evil demon: if meaning could be tied to verification, such possibilities could be rendered “meaningless” because unverifiable (see Jerry Fodor, 2001, pp. 3–5, for a penetrating discussion of this motivation). In any event, interpreting Wittgenstein’s (1922) Tractatus claims about the nature of language epistemologically along the lines of the American philosopher, C.S. Peirce, they proposed various versions of their “Verifiability Theory of Meaning,” according to which the meaning (or what they called the “cognitive significance”) of any sentence was constituted by the conditions of its empirical (dis-)confirmation.[5] Thus, to say that the temperature of a liquid is of a certain magnitude is to say, for example, that the mercury in a thermometer immersed in the liquid would expand to a certain point marked by a numeral representing that magnitude, a claim that would ordinarily be disconfirmed if it didn’t. Closer to “experience”: to say that there is a cat on a mat is just to say that certain patterns of certain familiar visual, tactile and aural appearances are to be expected under certain circumstances.

The project of providing analyses in this way of especially problematic concepts like those concerning, for example, material objects, knowledge, perception, causation, expectation, freedom, and the self, was pursued by Positivists and other analytic philosophers for a considerable period (see Carnap 1928 [1967] for some rigorous examples, Ayer 1934 [1952] for more accessible ones). With regard to material object claims, the program came to be known as “phenomenalism”; with regard to the theoretical claims of science, as “operationalism” ; and with regard to the claims about people’s mental lives, “analytical behaviorism” (the relevant experiential basis of mental claims being taken to be observations of others’ behavior). Although these programs became extremely influential, and some form of the verifiability criterion was often (and sometimes still is) invoked in physics and psychology to constrain theoretical speculation, they seldom, if ever, met with any serious success. No sooner was an analysis, say, of “material object” or “freedom” or “expectation,” proposed than serious counterexamples were raised and the analysis revised, only to be faced with still further counterexamples (see Roderick Chisholm 1957, and Fodor 1981, for discussion). Despite what seemed its initial plausibility, philosophers came to suspect that the criterion, and with it the very notion of analyticity itself, rested on some fundamental mistakes.

3. Problems with the Distinction

3.1 The Paradox of Analysis

One problem with the entire program was raised by C.H. Langford (1942) and discussed by G.E. Moore (1942 [1968], pp. 665–6): why should analyses be of any conceivable interest? After all, if an analysis consists in providing the definition of an expression, then it should be providing a synonym for it, and this, then, should be wholly uninformative: if brother is analyzed as the presumably synonymous male sibling, then the claim Brothers are male siblings should be synonymous with Brothers are brothers, and thinking the one should be no different from thinking the other. But, aside from such simple cases as brother and bachelor, proposed analyses, if successful, often seemed quite non-obvious and philosophically informative. The proposed reductions of, say, material object statements to sensory ones (even where successful) were often fairly complex, had to be studied and learned, and so could hardly be uninformative. So how could they count as seriously analytic?[6]

This is “the paradox of analysis,” which can be seen as dormant in Frege’s own move from his (1884) focus on definitions to his more controversial (1892a) doctrine of “sense,” where two senses are distinct if and only if someone can think a thought containing the one but not other, as in the case of the senses of “the morning star” and “the evening star.” If analyses or definitions preserved sense, then, unlike the case of “morning star” and “evening star,” whenever one thought the definiendum, one should thereby be thinking the definiens. And perhaps one can’t think Bill is Bob’s brother without thinking Bill is Bob’s male sibling. But few of Frege’s definitions of arithmetic concepts are nearly so simple (see Gottlob Frege, §2.5). In their case, it seems perfectly possible to think the definiendum, say, number, without thinking the elaborate definiens Frege provided (cf. Bealer 1982, Michael Dummett 1991, and John Horty 1993, 2007, for extensive discussions of this problem, as well as of further conditions, e.g., fecundity, that Frege placed on serious definitions).

These problems, so far, can be regarded as relatively technical, for which further technical moves within the program might be made. For example, one might make further distinctions within the theory of sense between an expression’s “content” and the specific “linguistic vehicle” used for its expression, as in Fodor (1990a) and Horty (1993, 2007); and perhaps distinguish between the truth-conditional “content” of an expression and its idiosyncratic role, or “character,” in a language system, along the lines of the distinction David Kaplan (1989) introduced to deal with indexical and demonstrative expressions (such as I, now, and that; see Demonstratives, and Narrow Mental Content, as well as Stephen White, 1982). Perhaps analyses could be regarded as providing a particular “vehicle,” having a specific “character,” that could account for why one could entertain a certain concept without entertaining its analysis (cf. Gillian Russell 2008, and Paul Pietroski 2002, 2005 and 2018 for related suggestions).

However, the problems with the program seemed to many philosophers to be deeper than merely technical. By far, the most telling and influential of the criticisms both of the program, and then of analyticity in general, were those of Quine, who began as a great champion of the program (see esp. his 1934), and whose subsequent objections therefore carry special weight. The reader is well-advised to consult particularly his (1956 [1976], hereafter “CLT”) for as rich and deep a discussion of the issues up to that time as one might find. The next two sections abbreviate some of that discussion.

3.2 Problems with Logicism

Although pursuit of the logicist program produced a great many insights into the nature of mathematics, there emerged a number of serious difficulties with it. Right from the start there was, of course, the problem of the logical truths themselves. Simply saying, as Frege had, that they are “Laws of Truth” doesn’t seem to explain how we could know them a priori. But perhaps they, too, are “analytic” involving perhaps some sort of “implicit” acceptance of certain rules merely by virtue of accepting certain patterns of reasoning. But any such proposal has to account for people’s frequent, often apparent violations of rules of logic in fallacious reasoning and in ordinary speech, as well as of disputes about the laws of logic of the sort that are raised, for example, by mathematical intuitionists, who deny the Law of Excluded Middle (“p or not p”), or, more recently, by “para-consistent” logicians, who argue for the toleration even of contradictions to avoid certain paradoxes.[7] Moreover, given that the infinitude of logical truths needs to be “generated” by rules of inference, wouldn’t that be a reason for regarding them as “synthetic” in Kant’s sense (see Frege 1884 [1980], §88, Katz 1988, pp. 58–9, and MacFarlane 2002)?

Much more worrisome is a challenge raised by Quine (CLT, §II): even if certain logical truths seemed undeniable, how does claiming them to be analytic differ from claiming them to be simply “obvious”?[8]

Consider…the logical truth “Everything is self-identical”, “(x)(x = x)”. We can say that it depends for its truth on traits of the language (specifically on the usage of “=”), and not on traits of its subject matter; but we can also say, alternatively, that it depends on an obvious trait, viz., self-identity, of its subject matter, viz., everything. The tendency of [my] present reflections is that there is no difference. (CLT, p. 113)

Pressing the point more deeply:

I have been using the vaguely psychological word “obvious” non-technically, assigning it no explanatory value. My suggestion is merely that the linguistic doctrine of elementary logical truth likewise leaves explanation unbegun. I do not suggest that the linguistic doctrine is false and some doctrine of ultimate and inexplicable insight into the obvious trait of reality is true, but only that there is no real difference between these two pseudo-doctrines. (CLT, p. 113)

As we’ll see, this is the seed for the challenge that continues to haunt proposals about the analytic to this day: what explanatory difference is there between “analytic” claims and simply widely and firmly held beliefs, such as that The earth has existed for many years or There have been black dogs? We’ll consider some proposals —and their problems— in due course, but it’s important to bear in mind that, if no difference can be sustained, then it’s difficult to see the significance of the logicist program or of the claims of (strictly) “analytic” philosophy generally.

The most immediately calamitous challenge to Logicism was, however, the famous paradox Russell raised for one of Frege’s crucial axioms, his prima facie plausible “Basic Law V” (sometimes called “the unrestricted Comprehension Axiom”), which had committed him to the existence of a set for every predicate. But what, asked Russell, of the predicate x is not a member of itself? If there were a set for that predicate, that set itself would be a member of itself if and only if it wasn’t; consequently, there could be no such set. Therefore Frege’s Basic Law V couldn’t be true (but see Frege’s Theorem and Foundations for Arithmetic for ways to rescue something close to logicism, discussed in §5 below).

What was especially upsetting about Russell’s paradox was that there seemed to be no intuitively satisfactory way to repair set theory in a way that could lay claim to being as obvious and/or merely a matter of logic or meaning in the way that Frege and the Positivists had hoped. Various proposals were made, but all of them seemed simply tailor-made to avoid the paradox, and seemed to have little independent appeal (although see Boolos, 1971, for a defense of the “iterative” notion of set). Certainly none of them appeared to be analytic. Indeed, as Quine notes:

What we do [in set theory] is develop one or another set theory by obvious reasoning, or elementary logic, from unobvious first principles which are set down, whether for good or for the time being, by something like convention. (CLT, p. 111)

3.3 Convention?

Convention, indeed, would seem to be at the very heart of the analytic. After all, aren’t matters of meaning, unlike matters of fact, in the end really matters of arbitrary conventions about the use of words? For example, someone could invest a particular word, say, “schmuncle,” with a specific meaning merely by stipulating that it mean, say, unmarried uncle. Wouldn’t that afford a basis for claiming then that “A schmuncle is an uncle” is analytic, or knowable to be true by virtue of the (stipulated) meanings of the words alone?

Carnap (1956a) proposed setting out the “meaning postulates” of a scientific language as just such conventional stipulations. This had the further advantage of allowing terms to be “implicitly defined” by their conventional roles in such postulates, which might then serve as part of a theory’s laws or axioms. The strategy seemed especially appropriate for defining logical constants, as well as for dealing with cases like (11)-(13) above, e.g. “Red is a color,” where mere substitution of synonyms might not suffice.[9] So perhaps what philosophical analysis is doing is revealing the tacit conventions of ordinary language, an approach particularly favored by Ayer (1934/52).

Quine is sceptical such a strategy could work for the principles of logic itself. Drawing on his earlier discussion (1936 [1976]) of the conventionality of logic, he argues that logic itself could not be entirely established by such conventions, since:

the logical truths, being infinite in number, must be given by general conventions rather than singly; and logic is needed then in the meta-theory, in order to apply the general conventions to individual cases (CLT, p. 115)

If so, and if logic is established by convention, then one would need a meta-meta-theory to establish the conventions for the use of the logical particles of the meta-theory, and so on for what seemed like an infinite regress of meta-theories. This is certainly an argument that ought to give the proponents of the conventionality of logic pause: for, indeed, how could one hope to set out the general conventions for “all” or “if…then…” without at some point using the notions of “all” and “if…then…” (“ALL instances of a universal quantification are to be true”. “IF p is one premise, and if p then q another, THEN conclude q”)? (See Warren, 2017, however, for a reply, exploiting the resources of implicit definition; cf. fns 9 and 16.)

As we noted, Quine sees more room for convention in choosing between different, incompatible versions of set theory needed for mathematics that were developed in the wake of Russell’s paradox. Here:

We find ourselves making deliberate choices and setting them forth unaccompanied by any attempt at justification other than in terms of elegance and convenience. (CLT, p. 117).

But then it’s hard to see the difference between mathematics and the conventional “meaning postulates” Carnap had proposed for establishing the rest of science —and then the difference between them and any other claims of a theory. As Quine goes on to argue, although stipulative definitions (what he calls “legislative postulations”)

contribute truths which become integral to the corpus of truths, the artificiality of their origin does not linger as a localized quality, but suffuses the corpus. If a subsequent expositor singles out those once legislatively postulated truths again as postulates, this signifies nothing… He could as well choose his postulates from elsewhere in the corpus, and will if he thinks it this serves his expository ends. (CLT, pp. 119–20)

Carnap’s legislated “meaning postulates” should therefore be regarded as just an arbitrary selection of sentences a theory presents as true, a selection perhaps useful for purposes of exposition, but no more significant than the selection of certain towns in Ohio as “starting points” for a journey Quine (1953 [1980a], p. 35).

Quine’s observation certainly seems to accord with scientific practice. Suppose, say, Newton, himself, had explicitly set out “F=ma” as a stipulated definition of “F”: would “F=ma” be therefore justifiable by knowing the meaning the words alone? Our taking such a stipulation seriously would seem to depend upon our view of the plausibility of the surrounding theory as a whole. After all, as Quine continues:

[S]urely the justification of any theoretical hypothesis can, at the time of hypothesis, consist in no more than the elegance and convenience which the hypothesis brings to the containing bodies of laws and data. How then are we to delimit the category of legislative postulation, short of including under it every new act of scientific hypothesis? (CLT, p. 121)

So conventional legislation of claims, such as Carnap’s meaning postulates, affords the claims no special status. As vivid examples, Putnam (1965 [1975]) discusses in detail revisions of the definitions of “straight line” and “kinetic energy” in the light of Einstein’s theories of relativity.[10]

This appeal to “the containing bodies of laws and data” essentially invokes Quine’s famous holistic metaphor of the “web of belief” with which CLT eloquently concludes:

the lore of our fathers is a fabric of sentences [which] develops and changes, through more or less arbitrary and deliberate revisions and additions of our own, more or less directly occasioned by the continuing stimulation of our sense organs. It is a pale grey lore, black with fact and white with convention. But I have found no substantial reasons for concluding that there are any quite black threads in it, or any white ones (CLT, p. 132)[11]

3.4 Verification and Confirmation Holism

The picture presented in this last and many similar passages expresses a tremendously influential view of Quine’s that led several generations of philosophers to despair not only of the analytic-synthetic distinction, but of the category of a priori knowledge entirely. The view has come to be called “confirmation holism,” and Quine had expressed it more shortly a few years earlier, in his widely read article, “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” (1953 [1980a]):

Our statements about the external world face the tribunal of sense experience not individually, but only as a corporate body. (1953 [1980a], p. 41)

Indeed, the “two dogmas” that the article discusses are (i) the belief in the intelligibility of the “analytic” itself, and (ii), what Quine regards as the flip side of the same coin, the belief that “each statement, taken in isolation from its fellows, can admit of confirmation or infirmation at all” (p. 41), i.e., the very version of the Verifiability Theory of Meaning we have seen the Positivists enlisted in their effort to “analyze” the claims of science and commonsense.[12]

Quine bases his “confirmation holism” upon observations of Pierre Duhem (1914 [1954]), who drew attention to the myriad ways in which theories are supported by evidence, and the fact that an hypothesis is not (dis)confirmed merely by some specific experiment considered in isolation from an immense amount of surrounding theory. Thus, a thermometer will be a good indication of ambient temperature only if it’s made of the right materials, calibrated appropriately, and there aren’t any other forces at work that might disturb the measurement—and, of course, only if the background laws of physics and other beliefs that have informed the design of the measurement are sufficiently correct. A failure of the thermometer to measure the temperature could be due to a failure of any of these other conditions, which is, of course, why experimenters spend so much time and money constructing experiments to “control” for them. Moreover, with a small change in our theories or background beliefs, or just in our understanding of the conditions for measurement, we might change the tests on which we rely, but often without changing the meaning of the sentences whose truth we might be trying to establish (which, as Putnam 1965 [1975] pointed out, is precisely what practicing scientists regularly do).

What is novel—and highly controversial—about Quine’s understanding of these commonplace observations is his extension of them to claims presumed by most people (e.g., by Duhem himself) to lie outside their scope, viz., the whole of mathematics and even logic! It is this extension that seems to undermine the traditional a priori status of these latter domains, since it appears to open the possibility of a revision of logic, mathematics and any supposed analytic claims in the interest of the plausibility of the one, overall resulting empirical theory—containing the empirical claims and those of logic, mathematics and the analytic! Perhaps this wouldn’t be so odd should the revisability of such claims permit their ultimately admitting of a justification that didn’t involve experience. But this is ruled out by Quine’s insistence that scientific theories, along with their logic and mathematics, are confirmed “only” as “corporate bodies.”[13]

One might wonder why, though, there have historically been virtually no revisions of mathematics on empirical grounds. A common example offered is how Riemannian replaced Euclidean geometry in Einstein’s theory of General Relativity. But this mis-interprets the history. Non-Euclidean geometries were purely conceptual developments in the 19th C. by mathematicians such as Gauss, Riemann and Lobechevsky. Einstein simply argued in 1916 that one of these conceptual possibilities seemed to be better supported by physics than was the traditional Euclidean one, and should therefore be taken to be true of actual space(-time). It is only this latter claim that is empirical.

Certainly, though, Quine’s holism has been an epistemic possibility that many have taken seriously. For example, influenced by Quine’s claim, Putnam (1968 [1975]) argued that one ought to revise even elementary logic in view of the surprising results of quantum mechanics (a proposal not without its critics, see Quantum Logic and Probability Theory). And in his (1962 [1975] he also argued that it isn’t hard to imagine discovering that a purported analytic truth, such as Cats are animals, could be given up in light of discovering that the little things are really cleverly disguised robots controlled from Mars (but see Katz, 1990, pp. 216ff and G. Russell, 2008, for replies, and the supplement §3 for further discussion).

3.5 Quine on Meaning in Linguistics

Quine’s discussion of the role of convention in science seems right; but how about the role of meaning in ordinary natural language (cf. Chomsky’s 2000 cautions mentioned in footnote 10)? Is it really true that in the “pale grey lore” of all the sentences we accept, there aren’t some that are “white” somehow “by virtue of the very meanings of their words”? What about our examples in our earlier set II? What about sentences of the sort that interest Juhl and Loomis (2010) that merely link patent synonyms, as in “Lawyers are attorneys,” or “A fortnight is a period of fourteen days”? As Grice and Strawson (1956) and Putnam (1965 [1975]) pointed out, it is unlikely that so intuitively plausible a distinction should turn out to have no basis at all in fact.

Quine addressed this issue, first, in his (1953 [1980a], chapter 3), and then in a much larger way in his (1960, chapter 2, and 1974) and related articles. In his (1953 [1980a]) he pressed his objection to analyticity further to the very ideas of synonymy and the linguistic meaning of an expression, on which, we saw, Frege’s criterion of analyticity crucially relied. His objection is that he sees no way to make any serious explanatory sense of them. He explored plausible explanations in terms of “definition,” “intension,” “possibility,” and “contradiction,”, pointing out that each of these notions seems to stand in precisely as much need of explanation as synonymy itself (recall our observation in §1.2 above regarding the lack of any formal contradiction in “Some pediatricans aren’t doctors”). The terms seem to be mutually definable in what seems to be a—viciously?—small “closed curve in space” (Quine 1953 [1980a], p. 30). Though they might be invoked to explain one another, they could not in the end answer the challenge of how to distinguish an analytic claim from simply a tenaciously held belief.

To take a recent example, David Chalmers (2012) revisits Carnap’s (1956b) proposal for basing synonymy on “intension” by way of eliciting a person’s judgments about the extension of a term/concept in all possible worlds:[14]

Carnap’s key idea is that we can investigate the intension that a subject associated with an expression by investigating the subject’s judgments about possible cases. To determine the intension of an expression such as ‘Pferd’ for a subject, we present the subject with descriptions of various logically possible cases, and we ask the subject whether he or she is willing to apply the term ‘Pferd’ to objects specified in these cases. If we do this for enough cases, then we can test all sorts of hypotheses about the intension of the expression. (Chalmers 2012, p. 204)

But how are the informants to understand the questions they’re being asked? If they understand the term “possible” as logicians do, as truth in a set-theoretically specified model, then it will be too weak: there are obviously models in which synonymous expressions e.g., “horse” and “Pferd,” or “bachelor” and “unmarried male are assigned non-overlapping sets (cf. Quine [1953 [1980a], pp. 22–3), so that it’s logically possible for there be a horse that’s not a Pferd, or a bachelor that’s married (again, “a married bachelor” is formally contradictory only if one substitutes synonyms for synonyms; but we certainly can’t appeal to synonymy in trying to define synonymy). But if “possible” is understood (as it ordinarily would be) as merely imaginable, then it will be far too strong, ruling out ideas that the scientifically under-informed might find impossible, e.g., curved space-time, something having the properties of both waves and particles, or completely unconscious thoughts (which, at least, e.g., John Searle 1992, pp. 155–6, and Galen Strawson 1994, pp. 166–7 report having trouble conceiving). As Quine (1953 [1980a]) famously argued, such appeals to informant verdicts will only work if the informants understand the questions as about the very terms the proposed test is supposed to define, viz., “possible” as constrained by synonymy or preservation of meaning. Although, as many have noted (e.g., Williamson 2007, p. 50), there may be explanatory circularities in the best of theories, the circularity here seems particularly vicious, with the relevant ideas appearing not to perform any explanatory work other than bringing in each other’s laundry.

Why was Quine so convinced of this last claim? Because he thought it was possible to provide a satisfactory explanation of human language without them, indeed, without any mentalistic notions at all. In his (1953 [1980b], 1960 [2013] and 1974) he sketched a behavioristic theory of language that doesn’t rely on the postulation of determinate meaning or reference, and argued that, indeed, translation is “indeterminate”: there is “no fact of the matter” about whether two expressions do or do not have the same meaning (see Indeterminacy of Translation). This would appear to imply that there are pretty much no facts of the matter about people’s mental lives at all! For, if there is no fact of the matter about whether two people mean the same thing by their words, then there is no fact of the matter about the content of anyone’s thoughts. Quine himself took this consequence in stride—he was, after all, a behaviorist– regarding it as “of a piece” with Franz Brentano’s (1874 [1995]) famous thesis of the “irreducibility of the intentional”; it’s just that for him, unlike for Brentano, it simply showed the “baselessness of intentional idioms and the emptiness of a science of intention” (1960 [2013], p. 202). Needless to say, many subsequent philosophers have not been happy with this view, and have wondered where Quine’s argument went wrong.

3.6 Explaining Away the Appearance of the Analytic

One problem many have had with Quine’s argument is about how to explain the appearance of the analytic. It just seems an empirical fact that most people would spontaneously distinguish our original two sets of sentences (§1) by saying that sentences of the second set, such as “All pediatricians are doctors for children” are “true by definition,” or could be known to be true just by knowing the meanings of the constituent words. Moreover, they might agree about an indefinite number of further examples, e.g., that ophthalmologists are eye doctors, grandfathers are parents of parents, sauntering a kind of movement, pain and beliefs mental states, and promising an intentional act. Again, as Grice and Strawson (1956) and Putnam (1965 [1975]) stressed, it’s implausible to suppose that there’s nothing people are getting at in these judgments.

3.6.1 Centrality

Quine’s (1953 [1980a]) initial explanation of the appearance of the analytic invoked his metaphor of the web of belief, claiming that sentences are more or less revisable, depending upon how “peripheral” or “central” their position is in the web, the more peripheral ones being closer to experience. The appearance of sentences being “analytic” is simply due to their being, like the laws of logic and mathematics, comparatively central, and so are given up, if ever, only under extreme pressure from the peripheral forces of experience. But no sentence is absolutely immune from revision; all sentences are thereby empirical, and none is actually analytic.

There are a number of problems with this explanation. In the first place, centrality and the appearance of analyticity don’t seem to be so closely related. As Quine (1960, p. 66) himself noted, there are are plenty of central, unrevisable beliefs that don’t seem remotely analytic, e.g., “There have been black dogs,” “The earth has existed for more than five minutes,” “Mass-energy is conserved”; and many standard examples of what seem analytic aren’t seriously central: “Bachelors are unmarried,” “A fortnight is two weeks” or “A beard is facial hair” are pretty trivial verbal issues, and could easily be revised if people really cared (cf., Juhl and Loomis, 2010, p. 118).

Secondly, it’s not mere unrevisability that seems distinctive of the analytic, but rather a certain sort of unintelligibility: for all the unrevisability of “There have been black dogs,” it’s perfectly possible to imagine it to be false. In contrast, what’s peculiar about analytic claims is that their denials often seem peculiarly impossible to seriously think: it seems distinctively impossible to imagine a married bachelor. Now, of course, as we noted, this could be due simply to a failure of imagination. But what’s striking about about the unrevisability of many apparently analytic cases is that they don’t appear to be like scientifically controversial cases such as curved space-time or completely unconscious thoughts. The standard cases about, e.g., bachelors or pediatricians seem entirely innocuous. Far from unrevisability explaining analyticity, it would seem to be analyticity that explains this peculiar unrevisability: the only reason someone might balk at denying bachelors are unmarried is that, well, that’s just what the word “bachelor” means![15] The challenge, though, is to clarify the basis for this sort of explanation.

It is important to note here a crucial change that Quine (and earlier Positivists) casually introduced into the characterization of the a priori, and consequently into much of the now common understanding of the analytic. Where Kant and others had traditionally assumed that the a priori concerned beliefs “justifiable independently of experience,” Quine and many other philosophers of the time came to regard it as consisting of beliefs “unrevisable in the light of experience.” And, as we have seen, a similar status is accorded the at least apparently analytic. However, this would imply that people taking something to be analytic or a priori would have to regard themselves as being infallible about it, forever unwilling to revise it in light of further evidence or argument. But this is a further claim that many defenders of the traditional notions need not embrace (consider, again, the disputes philosophers have about the proper analysis of terms such as “knowledge” or “freedom”).

Indeed, a claim might be in fact analytic and justifiable independently of experience, but nevertheless perfectly well revised in the light of it. Experience, after all, might mislead us, as it (perhaps) misled Putnam when he suggested revising logic in light of difficulties in quantum mechanics, or suggested revising “cats are animals,” were we to discover the things were robots. Just which claims are genuinely analytic and a priori might not be available in the “armchair” at the introspective or behavioral surface of our lives in the way that Quine and much of the philosophical tradition has assumed. Certainly the “dispositions to assent or dissent from sentences” on which Quine (1960 [2013], chapter 2) standardly relied are likely very dubious guides (see the findings of “experimental philosophy” discussed in §4.1 below). Behavioral dispositions in general may have any of a variety of aetiologies that aren’t clearly distinguishable in actual behavior (one wonders how much of Quine’s seamless epistemology went hand in hand with his mentalistically seamless behavioristic psychology). The relevant dispositions might be hidden more deeply in our minds, and our access to them as fallible as our access to any other such facts about ourselves. The genuinely analytic may be a matter of difficult reflective analysis or deep linguistic theory (see Bealer, 1987, Bonjour 1998, Rey, 1998, and supplement), a possibility to which we will return shortly.

3.6.2 One Criterion Concepts

In his expansion of Quine’s point, Putnam (1962 [1975]) tried to rescue what he thought were theoretically innocuous examples of analytic truths by appeal to what he called “one-criterion” concepts, or concepts like, e.g., pediatrician, bachelor, widow, where there seems to be only one “way to tell” whether they apply. However, as Fodor (1998) pointed out, so stated, this latter account won’t suffice either, since the notion of “criterion” seems no better off than “meaning” or “analytic.” Moreover, if there were one way to tell what’s what, there would seem, trivially, to be indefinite numbers of other ways: look for some reliable correlate (living alone, frequenting singles bars for “bachelor”), or, just ask someone who knows the one way; or ask someone who knows someone who knows; or…, etc., and so now we would be faced with saying which of these ways is genuinely “criterial,” which would seem to leave us with the same problem we faced in saying which way appears to be “analytic.”

Fodor (1998) tried to improve on Putnam’s proposal by suggesting that a criterion that appears to be analytic is the one on which all the other criteria depend, but which does not depend upon them. Thus, telling that someone is a bachelor by checking out his gender and marriage status doesn’t depend upon telling by asking his friends, but telling by asking his friends does depend upon telling by his gender and marriage status; and so we have an explanation of why “bachelors are unmarried males” seems analytic, but, said Fodor, without it’s actually being so (perhaps somewhat surprisingly, given his general “asymmetric dependence” theory of content, see his 1990b and Rey, 2009, to be discussed shortly, §§4.2–4.3).

However, such asymmetric dependencies among criteria alone will not “explain (away)” either the reality or the appearance of the analytic, since there would appear to be asymmetric dependencies of the proposed sort in non-analytic cases. Natural kinds are dramatic cases in point (see Putnam 1962 [1975], 1970 [1975], 1975). At some stage in history probably the only way anyone could tell whether something was a case of polio was to see whether there was a certain constellation of standard symptoms, e.g. paralysis; other ways (including asking others) asymmetrically depended upon that way. But this wouldn’t make “All polio cases exhibit paralysis” remotely analytic—after all, the standard symptoms for many diseases can sometimes be quite misleading. It required serious empirical research to discover the proper definition of a natural kind term like “polio.” Precisely as Putnam otherwise stressed, methods of testing are so variable it is doubtful that even “single criterion” tests could provide a basis for the identification of the stable meanings of words.

Indeed, as many philosophers in the wake of Quine’s and Putnam’s work came to suspect, the recourse of philosophy in general to epistemology to ground semantics may have been a fundamental mistake. It was an enticing recourse: it seemed to offer a way to dispatch philosophical disputes and secure empirical knowledge from sceptical challenges regarding demons and dreams. But the above difficulties suggested that those disputes and challenges would need to be met in some other way, perhaps by looking not to words, but to the world instead.

3.6.3 The World, not Words

Indeed, another strategy that a Quinean can deploy to explain the appearance of the analytic is to claim that analyses are really not of the meanings of words, but of the actual phenomena in the world to which they refer (see Fodor, 1990b, 1998). Thus, claims that, e.g., cats are animals, triangles are three-sided, or that every number has a successor should not be construed as claims about the meanings of the words “cat”, “triangle” or “number,” but about the nature of cats, triangles and numbers themselves. Arguably, many such claims, if they are true, are necessarily so (cf., Kripke, 1972; Putnam, 1975), and may be commonly understood to be, and this might make them seem analytic. But then we would be faced with precisely the challenge that Quine raised: how to distinguish claims of analyticity from simply deeply held beliefs about “the nature” of things.

This recourse to the world may, however, be a little too swift. Cases of (arguably) deeply explanatory natural kinds such as polio or cats contrast dramatically with cases of more superficial kinds like bachelor or fortnight. whose natures are not specified by any explanatory science, but are pretty much exhausted by what would seem to be the meanings of the words. Again, unlike the case of polio and its symptoms, the reason that gender and marriage status are the best way to tell whether someone is a bachelor is, again, that that’s just what “bachelor” means. Indeed, should a doctor propose revising the test for polio in the light of better theory—perhaps reversing the dependency of certain tests—this would not even begin to appear to involve a change in the meaning of the term. Should, however, a feminist propose, in the light of better politics, revising the use of “bachelor” to include women, this obviously would. If the appearance of the analytic is to be explained away, it needs to account for such differences in our understanding of different sorts of revisions in our beliefs, which don’t appear to be issues regarding the external world.

4. Post-Quinean Strategies

There has been a wide variety of responses to Quine’s challenges. Some, for example, Davidson (1980), Stich (1983) and Dennett (1987), seem simply to accept it and try to account for our practice of meaning ascription within its “non-factual” bounds. Since they follow Quine in at least claiming to forswear the analytic, we will not consider their views further here. Others, who might be (loosely) called “neo-Cartesians,” reject Quine’s attack as simply so much prejudice of the empiricism and naturalism that they take to be his own uncritical dogmas (§4.1 in what follows). Still others hope simply to find a way to break out of the “intentional circle,” and provide an account of at least what it means for one thing (a state of the brain, for example) to mean (or “carry the information about”) another external phenomenon in the world (§4.2). Perhaps the most trenchant reaction has been that of empirically oriented linguists and philosophers, who look to a specific explanatory role the analytic may play in an account of thought and talk (§4.3). This role is currently being explored in considerable detail in the now various areas of research inspired by the important linguistic theories of Noam Chomsky (§4.4, and supplement, Analyticity and Chomskyan Linguistics).

4.1 Neo-Cartesianism

The most unsympathetic response to Quine’s challenges has been essentially to stare him down and insist upon an inner faculty of “intuition” whereby the truth of certain claims is simply “grasped” directly through, as Bonjour (1998) puts it:

an act of rational insight or rational intuition … [that] is seemingly (a) direct or immediate, nondiscursive, and yet also (b) intellectual or reason-governed … [It] depends upon nothing beyond an understanding of the propositional content itself…. (p. 102)

Bealer (1987, 1999) defends similar proposals. Neither Bonjour nor Bealer are in fact particularly concerned to defend the analytic by such claims, but their recourse to mere understanding of propositional content is certainly what many defenders of the analytic have had in mind. Katz (1998, pp. 44–5), for example, explicitly made the very same appeal to intuitions on behalf of the analytic claims supported by his semantic theory. Somewhat more modestly, Peacocke (1992, 2004) claims that possession of certain logical concepts requires that a person find certain inferences “primitively compelling,” or compelling not by reason of some inference that takes “their correctness…as answerable to anything else” (1992, p. 6; see also his 2004, p. 100 and the other references in fn 9 above for the strategy, and fn 7, as well as Harman, 1996 [1999], and Horwich, 2000, for qualms).

Perhaps the simplest reply along these lines emerges from a suggestion of David Lewis (1972 [1980]), who proposes to implicitly define, e.g., psychological terms by conjoining the “platitudes” in which they appear:

Include only platitudes that are common knowledge among us – everyone knows them, everyone knows that everyone else knows them, and so on. For the meanings of our words are common knowledge, and I am going to claim that names of mental states derive their meaning from these platitudes. (1972 [1980], p. 212)

Enlarging on this idea, Frank Jackson (1998) emphasizes the role of intuitions about possible cases, as well as the need sometimes to massage such intuitions so as to arrive at “the hypothesis that best makes sense of [folk] responses” (p. 36; see also pp. 34–5).[16]

The Quinean reply to all these approaches is, again, his main challenge: how in the end are we to distinguish such claims of “rational insight,” “primitive compulsion,” inferential practices or folk beliefs, from merely some deeply entrenched empirical convictions, folk practices or, indeed, from mere dogmas? Isn’t the history of thought littered with what have turned out to be deeply mistaken claims, inferences and platitudes that people at the time have found “rationally” and/or “primitively compelling,” say, with regard to God, sin, disease, biology, sexuality, or even patterns of reasoning themselves? Again, consider the resistance Kahneman (2011) reports people displaying to correction of the fallacies they commit in a surprising range of ordinary thought (cf. fn 7 above); or in a more disturbing vein, how the gifted mathematician, John Nash, claimed that his delusional ideas “about supernatural beings came to me the same way that my mathematical ideas did” (Nasar 1998, p. 11). Introspected episodes, primitive compulsions, intuitions about possibilities, or even tacit folk theories alone are not going to distinguish the analytic, since these all may be due as much to people’s (possibly mad!) empirical theories as to any special knowledge of meaning.

A particularly vivid way to feel the force of Quine’s challenge is afforded by a recent case that came before the Ontario Supreme Court concerning whether laws that confined marriage to heterosexual couples violated the equal protection clause of the constitution (see Halpern et al. 2001). The question was regarded as turning in part on the meaning of the word “marriage”, and each party to the dispute solicited affidavits from philosophers, one of whom claimed that the meaning of the word was tied to heterosexuality, another that it wasn’t. Putting aside the complex moral-political issues, Quine’s challenge can be regarded as a reasonably sceptical request to know how any serious theory of the world might settle it. It certainly wouldn’t be sufficient merely to claim that marriage is/isn’t necessarily heterosexual on the basis of common “platitudes,” much less on “an act of rational insight [into] the propositional content itself”; or because speakers found the inference from marriage to heterosexuality “primitively compelling” and couldn’t imagine gay people getting married![17]

Indeed, some philosophers have offered some empirical evidence that casts doubt on just how robust the data for the analytic might be. The movement of “experimental philosophy” has pointed to evidence of considerable malleability of subject’s “intuitions” with regard to the standard kinds of thought experiments on which philosophical defenses of analytic claims typically rely. Thus, Weinberg, Nichols and Stich (2001) found significant cultural differences between responses of Asian and Western students regarding whether someone counted as having knowledge in a standard “Gettier” (1963) example of accidental justified true belief; and Knobe (2003) found that non-philosophers’ judgments about whether an action is intentional depended on the (particularly negative) moral qualities of the action, and not, as is presumed by most philosophers, on whether the action was merely intended by the agent. Questions, of course, could be raised about these experimental results (How well did the subjects understand the project of assessing intuitions? Did the experiments sufficiently control for the multitudinous “pragmatic” effects endemic to polling procedures? To what extent are the target terms merely polysemous – see supplement, §3– allowing for different uses in different contexts?) However, the results do serve to show how the determination of meaning and analytic truths can be regarded as a far more difficult empirical question than philosophers have traditionally supposed (see Bishop and Trout, 2005, and Alexander and Weinberg, 2007, for further discussion).

4.2 Externalist Theories of Meaning

Developing the strategy of §3.3C above, Externalist theories of meaning (or “content”) try to meet at least part of Quine’s challenge by considering how matters of meaning need not rely on epistemic. or really any internal connections among thoughts or beliefs, in the way that many philosophers had traditionally supposed, but as involving largely causal and social relations between uses of words and the phenomena in the world that they pick out. This suggestion gradually emerged in the work of Putnam (1962 [1975], 1965 [1975] and 1975), Kripke (1972 [1980]) and Burge (1979, 1986), but it took the form of positive theories in, e.g., the work of Devitt (1981, 2015), Dretske (1988) and Fodor (1990b), who tried to base meaning in various actual or co-variational causal relations between states of the mind/brain and external phenomena (see Indicator Semantics; as well as the work on “teleosemantics” of Millikan, 1984), Papineau, 1987, and Neander, 1995, 2017, who look to mechanisms of natural selection; see Teleological Theories of Mental Content).

Consider, for example, Fodor’s proposal. Simplifying it slightly, Fodor (1990b) claimed that

a symbol S means p if

under some conditions, C, it’s a law that S is entokened iff p, and
any other tokening of S synchronically depends upon (i), but not vice versa.

Thus, tokenings of “horse” mean horse because there are (say, optimal viewing) conditions under which tokenings of “horse” co-vary with horses, and tokenings of “horse” caused by cows asymmetrically depend upon that fact. The intuitive idea here is that what makes “horse” mean horse is that errors and other tokenings of “horse” in the absence of horses (e.g., dreaming of them) depend upon being able to get things right, but not vice versa: getting things right doesn’t depend upon getting them wrong. The law in (i), so to say, “governs” the tokenings of (ii). (Note that this condition is metaphysical, appealing to actual laws of entokenings, and not upon asymmetric dependencies between epistemic criteria suggested by Fodor in his defense of Putnam we discussed in §3.6.2.)

Fodor’s and related proposals are not without their problems (see Loewer, 1996, Rey, 2009 and Causal Theories of Mental Content). Nevertheless, it’s worth noting that, were such theories to succeed in providing the kind of explanatorily adequate, non-circular account of intentionality to which they aspire, they would go some way towards saving at least intentional psychology from Quine’s attack, and provide at least one prima facie plausible, naturalistic strategy for distinguishing facts about meaning from facts about mere belief. The proposals, unlike those in the traditions of Carnap or of neo-Cartesians, have at least the form of a serious reply.

However, even if such externalist strategies, either Fodor’s or teleosemantic ones, were to save intentionality and meaning, they would do so only by forsaking the high hopes we noted in §2 philosophers harbored for the analytic. For externalists are typically committed to counting expressions as “synonymous” if they happen to be linked in the right way to the same external phenomena, even if a thinker couldn’t realize that they are by a priori (or, at any rate, “armchair”) reflection alone. By at least the Fregean substitution criterion (§1.2), they would seem to be committed to counting as “analytic” many patently empirical sentences as “Water is H2O,” “Salt is NaCl” or “Mark Twain is Samuel Clemens,” since in each of these cases, something may co-vary in the relevant way with tokenings of the expression on one side of the identity if and only if it co-varies with tokenings of the one on the other (similar problems and others arise for teleosemantics; see Fodor 1990b, pp. 72–73).

Of course, along the lines of the worldly turn we noted in §3.6.3, an externalist might cheerfully just allow that some sentences, e.g., “water is H20,” are in fact analytic, even though they are “external” and subject to empirical (dis)confirmation. Such a view would actually comport well with an older philosophical tradition less interested in the meanings of our words and concepts, and more interested in the “essences” of the worldly phenomena they pick out. Locke (1690 [1975], II, 31, vi), for example, posited “real” essences of things rather along the lines resuscitated by Putnam (1975) and Kripke (1972 [1980]), the real essences being the conditions in the world independent of our thought that make something the thing it is. Thus, being H2O may be what makes something water, and (to take the striking examples of diseases noted by Putnam, 1962 [1975]) being the activation of a certain virus is what makes something polio. But, of course, such an external view would still dash the hopes of philosophers looking to the analytic to explain a priori knowledge (but see Bealer 1987 and Jackson 1998 for strategies to assimilate such empirical cases to nevertheless a priori, armchair analysis). Such a consequence, however, might not faze an externalist like Fodor (1998), who is concerned only to save intentional psychology, and might otherwise share Quine’s scepticism about the analytic and the a priori.

Two final problems, however, loom over any such externalist strategies. One is how to provide content to “response-dependent” terms, such as “interesting,” “amusing,” “sexy,” “worrisome,” whose extensions vary greatly with users and occasions. What seems crucial to the contents of such terms is not any externalia that they might pick out, but simply some internal reactions of thinkers that might vary among them even under all conditions, but without difference in meaning. At any rate, there’s no reason to suppose there’s any sort of law that links the same phenomena to different people who find different things “interesting,” “funny,” or even “green” (cf. Russell, 1912; Hardin, 2008). The other problem is how to distinguish necessarily empty terms that purport to refer to (arguably) impossible phenomena such as perfectly flat surfaces, Euclidean figures, fictional characters or immortal souls. An externalist would seem to be committed to treating all such terms as synonymous, despite, of course, the fact that thoughts about them should obviously be distinguished (see Rey, 2009).

4.3 Internal Dependencies

A promising strategy for replying to these latter problems, as well as to Quine’s challenge in a way that might even begin to provide what the neo-Cartesian wants, can be found in a proposal of Paul Horwich (1998, 2005). He emphasizes how the meaning properties of a term are the ones that play a “basic explanatory role” with regard to the use of a term generally, the ones ultimately in virtue of which a term is used with that meaning. For example, the use of “red” to refer to the color of blood, roses, stop signs, etc,. is arguably explained by its use to refer to certain apparent colors in good light, but not vice versa: the latter use is “basic” to all the other uses. Similarly, uses of “and” explanatorily depend upon its basic use in inferences to and from the sentences it conjoins, and number terms to items in a sequence respecting Peano’s axioms (Horwich, 1998:45,129; see also Devitt 1996, 2002 for a similar proposal).

Although by allowing for purely internal explanatory conditions, this strategy offers a way to deal with response-dependent and necessarily empty terms, and promises a way of distinguishing analyticities from mere beliefs, there are still several further potential problems it faces. The first is that merely appealing to a “basic explanatory” condition for the use of a word doesn’t distinguish misuses and metaphors from etymologies, derived idioms and “dead metaphors”: saying “Juliet is the sun” can be explained by the use of “sun” to refer to the sun, but so can “lobbying” be explained by the use of “lobby” for lobbies of buildings (where politicians often met), and “the eye of a needle” by the shape of an animal eye. In these latter cases, the words seem to be “frozen” or “dead” metaphors, taking on meanings of their own. While they are explained by original “basic” uses, they are no longer “governed” by them.

Here it may be worth combining something of the Horwich view with something of Fodor’s aforementioned cousin suggestion of the asymmetric counterfactual (§4.2), along lines suggested by Rey (2009; 2020a, §10.3): the new “dead” uses of an idiom or metaphor no longer asymmetrically depend upon the explanatorily basic use. “Eye of a needle” would still mean the hole at the end of a needle, even if “eye” no longer referred to animal eyes. But “eye” used to refer to, say, the drawing of an eye, would both asymmetrically and explanatorily depend upon its being used to refer to actual eyes. And describing a three-way correspondence as “triangular” may asymmetrically and explanatorily depend upon thinking of certain geometric figures as triangular, but not vice versa – despite the impossibility of there ever being any actual triangles in the external world (see Allott and Textor, 2022, for development of this suggestion). Taking the asymmetric dependency to be “internally” explanatory relieves it of the excessive externalism with which Fodor burdened it, while avoiding the etymologies and dead metaphors facing Horwich’s view on its own.

However, although such a proposal may offer a promising strategy for meeting Quine’s challenge about many ordinary terms, it isn’t clear it would work for highly theoretic ones. For if Quine (1953 [1980a]) is right about even a limited holism involved in the use of scientific terms, then there may be no sufficiently local basic facts on which all other uses of a term asymmetrically and explanatorily depend. To take the kind of case that most interested Quine, it certainly seems unlikely that there is some small set of uses of, say, “number,” “positron,” “space” or “biological species” that are explanatorily basic, on which all other uses really depend. Such terms often come with a large cluster of terms appearing in claims that come as, so to say, a loose “package deal,” and revision over time may touch any particular claim in the interests of overall explanatory adequacy. Uses of a term involved in the expression of belief, either in thought or talk, will likely be justified and explained by the same processes of holistic confirmation that led Quine to his scepticism about the analytic in the first place (cf. Gibbard, 2008). Of course, Quine might be wrong about taking the case of theoretic terms in science to be representative of terms in human psychology generally (cf. Chomsky, 2000, footnote 10 above), and the above proposal might be confined to some restricted portions of a speaker’s psychology, e.g., to perception (as in Fodor, 1983, 2000). But, to put it mildly, the verdict on these issues is not quite in (see supplement §§4–5).

Lastly, a third (and, for some, a serious) possible drawback of this strategy is that it still risks rendering matters of meaning far less “transparent” and introspectively accessible than philosophers have standardly supposed. There is little reason to suppose that what is asymmetrically-explanatorily basic about one’s use of a term in thought or talk is a matter that is available to introspection or armchair reflection. As in the case of “marriage” mentioned earlier, but certainly with respect to other philosophically problematic notions, just which properties, if any, are explanatorily basic may not be an issue that is at all easy to determine. What are the asymmetric-explanatorily basic uses of “freedom” or “soul”? Do even people’s uses of animal terms really depend upon dubbings of species – or of individual exemplars – or do they depend more upon an innate disposition to think in terms of underlying biological kinds (cf. Keil 2014, pp. 327–333)? Do their uses of number words and concepts really depend upon their grasp of Peano’s axioms? Perhaps the usage is grounded more in practices of (finite) counting, estimates and noticing merely finite one-to-one correspondences; or perhaps they lie in the general recursive character of language (cf. Hauser et al 2002). Again, one may need the resources of a psychology that delves into far more deeply into the complex, internal causal relations in the mind than are available at its introspective or behavioral surface.

4.4 Chomskyan Strategies

Such an interest in a deeper and richer internal psychology emerged most dramatically in the 1950s in the work of Noam Chomsky. In his (1957, 1965, 1968 [2006]) he began to revolutionize linguistics by presenting substantial evidence and arguments for the existence of an innate “generative” grammar in a special language faculty in people’s brains that he argued was responsible for their underlying competence to speak and understand natural languages. This opened up the possibility of a response to Quine’s (1960) scepticism about the analytic within his own naturalistic framework, simply freed of its odd behaviorism, which Chomsky and others had independently, empirically refuted (see Chomsky 1959, and Gleitman, Gross and Reisberg 2011, chapter 7). Some of it also dovetails nicely with ideas of Friedrich Waismann and the later Wittgenstein, as well as with important recent work on polysemy. But the program Chomsky initiated is complex, and its relation to the analytic quite controversial, and so discussion of it is relegated to the following supplement to this entry:

Supplement: Analyticity and Chomskyan Linguistics.

5. Conclusion

Suppose, per the discussion of at least §3 of the supplement, that linguistics were to succeed in delineating a class of analytic sentences grounded in the constraints of a special language faculty in the way that some Chomskyans sometimes seem to suggest. Would such sentences serve the purposes for which we noted earlier (§2) philosophers had enlisted them? Perhaps some of them would. An empirical grounding of the analytic might provide us with an understanding of what constitutes a person’s competence with specific words and concepts, particularly logical or mathematical ones. Given that Quinean scepticism about the analytic is a source of his scepticism about the determinacy of cognitive states (see §3.5 above), such a grounding may be crucial for a realistic psychology, determining the conditions under which someone has a thought with a specific content.

Moreover, setting out the constitutive conditions for possessing a concept might be of some interest to philosophers generally, since many of the crucial questions they ask concern the proper understanding of ordinary notions such as material object, person, action, freedom, god, the good, or the beautiful. Suppose, further, that a domain, such as perhaps ethics or aesthetics, is “response dependent,” constituted by the underlying rules of our words and concepts; suppose, that is, that these rules constitute the nature of, say, the good, the funny, or the beautiful. If so, then it might not be implausible to claim that successful conceptual analysis could provide us with some a priori knowledge of such domains (although, again, sorting out the rules may require empirical linguistic and psychological theories not available to “armchair reflection”).

But, of course, many philosophers have wanted more than these essentially psychological gains. They have hoped that analytic claims might provide a basis for a priori knowledge of domains that exist independently of us and are not exhausted by our concepts. An important case in point would seem to be the very case of arithmetic that motivated much of the discussion of the analytic in the first place. Recent work of Crispin Wright (1983) and others on the logicist program has shown how a version of Frege’s program might be rescued by appealing not to his problematic Basic Law V, but instead merely to what is called “Hume’s Principle,” or the claim that for the number of Fs to be equal to the number of Gs is for there to be a “one-to-one correspondence” between the Fs and the Gs (as in the case of the fingers of a normal right and left hand), even in infinite cases. According to what is now regarded as “Frege’s Theorem,” the Peano axioms for arithmetic can be derived from this principle in standard second-order logic (see Frege’s theorem and foundations for arithmetic).

Now, Wright has urged that Hume’s Principle might be regarded as analytic, and perhaps this claim could be sustained by an examination of the language faculty along the lines of a Chomskyan linguistics set out in the supplement. If so, then wouldn’t that vindicate the suggestion that arithmetic can be known a priori? Not obviously, since Hume’s Principle is a claim not merely about the concepts F and G, but about the presumably concept-independent fact about the number of things that are F and the number of things that are G, and, we can ask, what justifies any claim about them? As George Boolos (1997) asked in response to Wright:

If numbers are supposed to be identical if and only if the concepts they are numbers of are equinumerous, what guarantee do we have that every concept has a number? (p. 253)

Indeed, as Edward Zalta (2013) observes,

The basic problem for Frege’s strategy, however, is that for his logicist project to succeed, his system must at some point include (either as an axiom or theorem) statements that explicitly assert the existence of certain kinds of abstract entities and it is not obvious how to justify the claim that we know such explicit existential statements. (2013, Section 6.2)

The concept of a unique successor to every number might be a defining feature of the lexical item, “number,” but that doesn’t itself imply that an infinity of numbers actually exists. Meanings and concepts are one thing; reality quite another. Justification of such existential statements and, with them, Hume’s Principle would seem to have to involve something more than appealing to merely the concept, but also —to recall Quine’s (CLT, p. 121, §3.3 above) claim— to “the elegance and convenience which the hypothesis brings to the containing bodies of laws and data,” i.e., to our best overall empirical theory of the world, irrespective of what constraints language might impose (see Wright, 1999, and Horwich, 2000, for further discussion).

The problem here becomes even more obvious in non-mathematical cases. For example, philosophers have wanted to claim not merely that our concepts of red and green exclude the possibility of our thinking that something is both colors all over, but that this possibility is ruled out for the actual colors, red and green, themselves (if such there be). It is therefore no accident that Bonjour’s (1998, pp. 184–5) defense of a priori knowledge turns on resuscitating views of Aristotle and Aquinas, according to which the very properties of red and green themselves are constituents of the propositions we grasp. But it is just such a wonderful coincidence between merely our concepts and actual worldly properties that a linguistic semantics alone obviously cannot ensure.

But suppose, nevertheless, there did in fact exist a correspondence between our concepts and the world, indeed, a deeply reliable, counterfactual-supporting correspondence whereby it was in fact metaphysically impossible for certain claims constitutive of those concepts not to be true. This is, of course, not implausible in the case of logic and arithmetic, and is entirely compatible with, e.g., Boolos’ reasonable doubts about them (after all, it’s always possible to doubt what is in fact a necessary truth). Such necessary correspondences between thought and the world might then serve as a basis for claims to a priori knowledge in at least a reliabilist epistemology, where what’s important is not believers’ abilities to justify their claims, but merely the reliability of the processes by which they arrive at them (see Reliabilist Epistemology). Indeed, in the case of logic and arithmetic, the beliefs might be arrived at by steps that were not only necessarily reliable, but might also be taken to be so by believers, in ways that might in fact depend in no way upon experience, but only on their competence with the relevant words and concepts (Kitcher 1980; Rey 1998; and Goldman 1999 explore this strategy).

Such a reliabilist approach, though, might be less than fully satisfying to someone interested in the traditional analytic a priori. For, although someone might turn out in fact to have analytic a priori knowledge of this sort, she might not know that she does (reliabilist epistemologists standardly forgo the “KK Principle,” according to which if one knows that p, one knows that one knows that p). Knowledge that the relevant claims were knowable a priori might itself be only possible by an empirically informed understanding of one’s language faculty and other cognitive capacities à la Chomsky, and by its consonance with the rest of one’s theory of the world, à la Quine. One would only know a posteriori that something was knowable a priori.

The trouble then is that claims that people do have a capacity for a priori knowledge seem quite precarious. As we noted earlier (footnote 7), people are often unreliable at appreciating deductively valid arguments; and appreciating the standard rules even of natural deduction is for many people often a difficult intellectual achievement. Consequently, people’s general competence with logical notions may not in fact consist in any grip on valid logical rules; and so whatever rules do underlie that competence may well turn out not to be the kind of absolutely reliable guide to the world on which the above reliabilist defense of a priori analytic knowledge seems to depend. In any case, in view merely of the serious possibility that these pessimistic conclusions are true, it’s hard to see how any appeal to the analytic to establish the truth of any controversial claim in any mind-independent domain could have any special justificatory force without a sufficiently detailed, empirical psychological theory to back it up.

Moreover, even if we did have a true account of our minds and the semantic rules afforded by our linguistic and conceptual competence, it’s not clear it would really serve the “armchair” purposes of traditional philosophy that we mentioned at the outset (§1). Consider, for example, the common puzzle about the possibility that computers might actually think and enjoy a mental life. In response to this puzzle some philosophers, e.g, Wittgenstein (1953 [1967], §§111, 281), Ziff, 1959, and Hacker, 1990, have suggested that it’s analytic that a thinking thing must be alive, a suggestion that certainly seems to accord with many folk intuitions (many people who might cheerfully accept a computational explanation of a thought process often balk at the suggestion that an inanimate machine engaging in that computation would actually be thinking). Now, as we noted in the supplement, §2, Chomsky (2000, p. 44) explicitly endorses this suggestion. So suppose then this claim were in fact sustained by linguistic theory, showing that the lexical item “think” is, indeed, constrained by the feature [+animate], and so is not felicitously applied to artifactual computers. Should this really satisfy the person worried about the possibility of artificial thought?

It’s hard to see why. For the serious question that concerns people worried about whether artifacts could think concerns whether those artifacts could in fact share the genuine, theoretically interesting, explanatory properties of a thinking thing (cf. Jackson 1998, pp. 34–5). We might have no empirical, scientific reason to suppose that genuine, biological animacy (n.b., not merely the perhaps purely syntactic, linguistic feature [+animate]!; see supplement §2) actually figures among them. And so we might conclude that, despite these supposed constraints of natural language, inanimate computers could come to “think” after all. Indeed, perhaps, the claim that thinking things must be alive is an example of a claim that is analytic but false, rather as the belief that cats are animals would be, should it turn that the things are actually robots from Mars; and so we should pursue the option of polysemy and “open texture” that Chomsky also endorses, and proceed to allow that artifacts could think.

Of course, a speaker could choose not to go along with, so to say, opening the texture this far. But if the explanatory point were nevertheless correct, other speakers could of course simply proceed to define a new word “think*” that lacks the animacy constraint and applies to the explanatory kind that in fact turns out to include, equally, humans and appropriately programmed artifacts. The issue would reduce to merely a verbal quibble: so computers don’t “think”; they “think*” instead. Indeed, it’s a peculiar feature of the entire discussion of the analytic that it can seem to turn on what may in the end be mere verbal quibbles. Perhaps the “linguist turn” of philosophy that we sketched in §§1.2–3.3 led into a blind alley, and it would be more fruitful to explore, so far as possible, conceptual and/or explanatory connections that may exist in our minds or or in the world to a large extent independently of language.

In any case, while the semantic conditions of a language might provide a basis for securing a priori knowledge of claims about mind-dependent domains, such as those of perhaps ethics and aesthetics, in the case of mind-independent domains, such as logic and mathematics, or the nature of worldly phenomena such as life or thought, the prospects seem more problematic. There may be analytic claims to be had here, but at least in these cases they would, in the immortal words of Putnam (1965 [1975], p. 36), “cut no philosophical ice…bake no philosophical bread and wash no philosophical windows.”[18] We would just have to be satisfied with theorizing about the mind-independent domains themselves, without being able to justify our claims about them by appeal to the meanings of our words alone. Reflecting on the difficulties of the past century’s efforts on behalf of the analytic, it’s not clear why anyone would really want to insist otherwise.


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I’m grateful to many readers for calling attention to errors in previous editions of this entry, and to Nicholas Allott, John Collins, Alexander Williams and anonymous referees for generous comments on drafts of the present one.

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