Scottish Philosophy in the 18th Century

First published Wed Jun 27, 2001; substantive revision Tue May 31, 2022

Philosophy was at the core of the eighteenth century movement known as the Scottish Enlightenment. The movement included major figures, such as Francis Hutcheson, David Hume, Adam Smith, Thomas Reid and Adam Ferguson, and also many others who produced notable works, such as Gershom Carmichael, Archibald Campbell, George Turnbull, George Campbell, James Beattie, Alexander Gerard, Henry Home (Lord Kames) and Dugald Stewart. I discuss some of the leading ideas of these thinkers, though paying less attention than I otherwise would to Hume, Smith and Reid, who have separate Encyclopedia entries. Amongst the topics covered in this entry are aesthetics (particularly Hutcheson’s), Moral philosophy (particularly Hutcheson’s and Smith’s), Turnbull’s providential naturalism, Kames’s doctrines on divine goodness and human freedom, Campbell’s criticism of the Humean account of miracles, the philosophy of rhetoric, Ferguson’s criticism of the idea of a state of nature, and finally the concept of conjectural history, a concept especially associated with Dugald Stewart.

1. Major figures

The major figures in Scottish eighteenth century philosophy were Francis Hutcheson, David Hume, Adam Smith, Thomas Reid and Adam Ferguson. Others who produced notable works included Gershom Carmichael, Archibald Campbell, George Turnbull, George Campbell, James Beattie, Hugh Blair, Alexander Gerard, Henry Home (Lord Kames), John Millar and Dugald Stewart.

2. Carmichael on Natural Law

Gershom Carmichael (1672–1729) studied at Edinburgh University (1687–1691), taught at St Andrews University (1693–1694), and spent the rest of his life at Glasgow, first as a regent in arts and then as professor of moral philosophy. He was a main conduit into Scotland of the European natural law tradition, a tradition of scientific investigation of human nature with a view to constructing an account of the principles that are morally binding on us. Among the great figures of that tradition were Hugo Grotius (1583–1645) and Samuel Pufendorf (1632–1694), thinkers whose writings played a major role in moral philosophical activity in Scotland during the Age of Enlightenment.

In 1718, during the first stirrings of the Scottish Enlightenment, Carmichael published Supplements and Observations upon the two books of the distinguished Samuel Pufendorf’s On the Duty of Man and Citizen. In 1724 he published a second edition containing extensive additional material. Carmichael affirms: “when God prescribes something to us, He is simply signifying that he requires us to do such and such an action, and regards it, when offered with that intention, as a sign of love and veneration towards him, while failure to perform such actions, and, still worse, commission of the contrary acts, he interprets as an indication of contempt or hatred” (Carmichael, [NR], p. 46). Hence we owe God love and veneration, and on this basis Carmichael distinguishes between immediate and mediate duties. Our immediate duty is formulated in the first precept of natural law, that God is to be worshipped. He seeks a sign of our love and veneration for him, and worship is the clearest manifestation of these feelings.

The second precept, which identifies our mediate duties, is: “Each man should promote, so far as it is in his power, the common good of the whole human race, and, so far as this allows, the private good of individuals” ([NR], p. 48). This relates to our ‘mediate’ duties since we indirectly signify our love and veneration of God by treating his creatures well. On this basis, Carmichael deploys the distinction between self and others in two subordinate precepts: “Each man should take care to promote his own interest without harming others” and “Sociability is to be cultivated and preserved by every man so far as in him lies.” These precepts, concerning duties to God, to self and to others, are the fundamental precepts of natural law, and though the precept that God is to be worshipped is prior to and more evident than the precept that one should live sociably with men, the requirement that we cultivate sociability is a foundation of the well-lived life.

Carmichael therefore rejects an important aspect of Pufendorf’s doctrine on the cultivation of sociability, for the latter argues that the demand “that every man must cultivate and preserve sociability so far as he can” is that to which all our duties are subordinate. Yet for Carmichael the precept that we worship God is not traceable back to the duty to cultivate sociability, and therefore the requirement that we cultivate and preserve sociability cannot precede the laws binding us to behave appropriately towards God.

For instance, God is central to the narrative concerning the duty to cultivate our mind, for performance of this duty requires that we cultivate in ourselves the conviction that God is creator and governor of the universe and of us. Carmichael criticises Pufendorf for paying too little attention to the subject of cultivation of the mind, and indicates some features that might profitably have been considered by Pufendorf, for example the following.

Due cultivation of the mind involves filling it with sound opinion regarding our duty, learning to judge well the objects which commonly stimulate our desires, and acquiring rational control of our passions. It also involves our learning to act on the knowledge that, as regards our humanity, we are neither superior nor inferior to other people. Finally, a person with a well cultivated mind is aware of how little he knows of what the future holds, and consequently is neither arrogant at his present happy circumstances nor excessively anxious about ills that might yet assail him.

The Stoic character of this text is evident, as is Carmichael’s injunction that we not be disturbed on account of evils which have befallen us, or which might befall us, due to no fault of ours. The deliberate infringement of the moral law is said however to be another matter; it prompts a discomfort peculiarly hard to bear. In full concord with the Stoic tendency here observed, we find him supporting, under the heading ‘duty to oneself’, a Stoic view of anger. Though not expressing unconditional disapproval of anger, he does point out that it is difficult to keep an outburst of anger within just limits, and that such an outburst is problematic in relation to natural law, for: “it must be regarded as one of the things which most of all makes human life unsocial, and has pernicious effects for the human race. Thus we can scarcely be too diligent in restraining our anger” ([NR], p. 65). Anger conflicts with sociability and it is only by due cultivation of the mind that our sociability can be fortified and enhanced.

3. Hutcheson and Archibald Campbell

The first of the major philosophers was Francis Hutcheson (1694–1746). His reputation rests chiefly on his earlier writings, especially An Inquiry into the Original of our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue (London 1725), Reflections upon Laughter and Remarks on the Fable of the Bees (both in the Dublin Journal 1725–1726), and Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions with Illustrations on the Moral Sense (London 1728). His magnum opus, A System of Moral Philosophy, was published posthumously in Glasgow in 1755. During his period as a student at Glasgow University (c. 1711–1717) Gershom Carmichael taught moral philosophy and jurisprudence there and there are clear signs in Hutcheson’s writings of Carmichael’s influence though it is not known whether he studied under Carmichael during his student days. In 1730 he took up the moral philosophy chair left vacant on Carmichael’s death. Hutcheson is known principally for his ideas on moral philosophy and aesthetics. First moral philosophy.

Hutcheson reacted against both the psychological egoism of Thomas Hobbes and the rationalism of Samuel Clarke and William Wollaston. As regards Hobbes, Hutcheson thought his doctrine was both wrong and dangerous; wrong because by the frame of our nature we have compassionate, generous and benevolent affections which owe nothing at all to calculations of self-interest, and dangerous because people may be discouraged from the morally worthy exercise of cultivating generous affections in themselves on the grounds that the exercise of such affections is really an exercise in dissimulation or pretence. As against Hobbes Hutcheson held that a morally good act is one motivated by benevolence, a desire for the happiness of others. Indeed the wider the scope of the act the better, morally speaking, the act is; Hutcheson was the first to speak of “the greatest happiness for the greatest numbers”.

He believed that moral knowledge is gained via our moral sense. A sense, as the term is deployed by Hutcheson, is every determination of our minds to receive ideas independently of our will, and to have perceptions of pleasure and pain. In accordance with this definition, the five external senses determine us to receive ideas which please or pain us, and the will does not intervene — we open our eyes and by natural necessity see whatever it is that we see. But Hutcheson thought that there were far more senses than the five external ones. Three in particular play a role in our moral life. The public sense is that by which we are pleased with the happiness of others, and are uneasy at their misery. The moral sense is that by which we perceive virtue or vice in ourselves or others, and derive pleasure, or pain, from the perception. And the sense of honour is that which makes the approbation, or gratitude of others, for any good actions we have done, the necessary occasion of pleasure. In each of these cases the will is not involved. We see a person acting with the intention of bringing happiness to someone else, and by the frame of our nature pleasure wells up in us.

Hutcheson emphasises both the complexity of the relations between our natural affections and also the need, in the name of morality, to exercise careful management of the relations between the affections. We must especially be careful not to let any of our affections get too ‘passionate’, for a passionate affection might become an effective obstacle to other affections that should be given priority. Above all the selfish affections must not be allowed to over-rule ‘calm universal benevolence’.

Hutcheson’s opposition to Hobbesian egoism is matched by his opposition to ethical rationalism, an opposition which emerges in the Illustrations upon the Moral Sense, where he demonstrates that his account of the affections and the moral sense makes sense of the moral facts whereas the doctrines of Clarke and Wollaston totally fail to do so. Hutcheson’s main thesis against ethical rationalism is that all exciting reasons presuppose instincts and affections, while justifying reasons presuppose a moral sense. An exciting reason is a motive which actually prompts a person to act; a justifying reason is one which grounds moral approval of the act. Hutcheson demonstrates that reason, unlike affection, cannot furnish an exciting motive, and that there can be no exciting reason previous to affection. Reason does of course play a role in our moral life, but only as helping to guide us to an end antecedently determined by affection, in particular the affection of universal benevolence. On this basis, an act can be called ‘reasonable’, but this is not a point on the side of the rationalists, since they hold that reason by itself can motivate, and in this case it is affection, not reason that motivates, that is, that gets us doing something rather than nothing.

If we add to this the fact, as Hutcheson sees it, that it has never been demonstrated that reason is a fit faculty to determine what the ends are that we are obliged to seek, we shall see that Hutcheson’s criticism of rationalism is that it can account for neither moral motivation nor moral judgment. On the other hand our natural affections, in particular benevolence, account fully for our moral motivation and our faculty of moral sense accounts fully for our ability to make an assessment of actions whether our own or others’.

Certain features of Hutcheson’s moral philosophy appear in his aesthetic theory also. Indeed the two fields are inextricably related, as witness Hutcheson’s reference to the ‘moral sense of beauty’. Two features especially work hard. He contends that we sense the beauty, sublimity or grandeur of a sight or of a sound. The sense of the thing’s beauty, so to say, wells up unbidden. And associated with that sense, and perhaps even part of it — Hutcheson does not give us a clear account of the matter — is a pleasure that we take in the thing. We enjoy beautiful things and that enjoyment is not merely incidental to our sensing their beauty.

A question arises here regarding the features of a thing that cause us to see it as beautiful and to take pleasure in it. Hutcheson suggests that a beautiful thing displays unity (or uniformity) amidst variety. If a work has too much uniformity it is simply boring. If it has too much variety it is a jumble. An object, whether visual or audible, requires therefore to occupy the intermediate position if it is to give rise to a sense of beauty in the object. But if Hutcheson is right about the basis of aesthetic judgment how does disagreement arise? Hutcheson’s reply is that our aesthetic response is affected in part by the associations that the thing arouses in our mind. If an object that we had found beautiful comes to be associated in our mind with something disagreeable this will affect our aesthetic response; we might even find the thing ugly. Hutcheson gives an example of wines to which men acquire an aversion after they have taken them in an emetic preparation. On this matter his position may seem extreme, for he holds that if two people have the same experience and if the thing experienced carries the same identical associations for the two people, then they will have the same aesthetic response to the object. The position is however difficult to disprove, since if two people do in fact disagree about the aesthetic merit of an object, Hutcheson can say that the object produces different associations in the two spectators.

Nevertheless, Hutcheson does believe aesthetic misjudgments are possible, and in the course of explaining their occurrence he deploys Locke’s doctrine of association of ideas, a doctrine according to which ideas linked solely by chance or custom come to be associated in our minds and become almost inseparable from each other though they are ‘not at all of kin’. Hutcheson holds that an art connoisseur’s judgment can be distorted through his tendency to associate ideas, and notes in particular that a connoisseur’s aesthetic response to a work of art is likely to be affected by the fact that he owns it, for the pleasure of ownership will tend to intermix with and distort the affective response he would otherwise have to the object. Hutcheson, it should be added, is equally sensitive to the danger to our moral judgments that is posed by our associative tendency. And in both types of case the best defence against the threat is reflection, understood as a mental probing, an examination and then cross-examination, whether of a work of art or of an action, and of the elements in and aspects of our situation that motivate our judgments, all this with a view to factoring out irrelevant considerations. Without such mental exercises we cannot, in his view, obtain what he terms ‘true liberty and self-command’. This position, which he presents several times, points to a doctrine of free will not otherwise readily discernible in his writings. Our free will, on this account, is a habit of reflection through which we form a judgment which we are in a position to defend. We stand back from the object of reflection, do not allow ourselves to be overwhelmed by it, but instead adjudicate it in the light of whatever considerations we judge it appropriate to bring to bear (Broadie 2016).

A philosopher of the early period of the Scottish Enlightenment with whom Hutcheson may helpfully be compared and contrasted is his close contemporary Archibald Campbell (1691–1756), professor of divinity and church history at St Andrews University. Both men studied at Glasgow University under John Simson, a professorial divine much harassed by conservative Reformists in the Kirk on account of his rejection of the Kirk’s doctrine that, since the Fall, human nature through the generations has suffered from total depravity. In due course Hutcheson and Campbell were both harassed by the Kirk on account of their claim that human beings are by nature inclined to virtue, for the Kirk took that claim to imply that the two men did not fully embrace the doctrine of total depravity. However, beyond this agreement Campbell opposes Hutcheson on certain essential points. Most especially, in his Enquiry into the Original of Moral Virtue (1733) Campbell rejects Hutcheson’s claim that for an action to be virtuous it must be motivated by a disinterested benevolence, and argues to the contrary that all human acts are and can only be motivated by self-love. From which Campbell concludes that all virtuous human acts also are motivated by self-love. This claim, though at first sight Hobbesian, is however not at all of a Hobbesian stripe, for Campbell holds that the self-love that motivates us to perform a virtuous act takes the form of a desire for esteem, where the desired esteem derives from our gratification of another person’s self-love. As well as writing against Hobbes and Hutcheson, Campbell also directs his fire at Bernard Mandeville, who held that a virtuous act must involve an exercise of self-denial, in the sense that to act virtuously we have to cut across, or frustrate our natural principles, whereas for Campbell, as also for Hutcheson, virtuous acts are performed in realisation of, and not at all in conflict with, our nature. The Kirk set up a committee of purity of doctrine to investigate the teachings of Campbell, a Kirk minister who painted such a distressingly agreeable picture of human nature. The conservatively orthodox Reformists on the Committee wished to move against him, but the Kirk’s General Assembly, which was already beginning to display an Enlightenment spirit, prevented such a move, and Campbell retained his professorship of divinity and his position as minister of the Kirk. Campbell’s ideas, till now neglected, are at last beginning to receive serious consideration (Maurer 2012, 2016).

4. Hutcheson, Hume and Turnbull

Hutcheson influenced most of the Scottish philosophers who succeeded him, perhaps all of them, whether because he helped to set their agenda or because they appropriated, in a form suitable to their needs, certain of his doctrines. In the field of aesthetics for example, where Hutcheson led, many, including Hume, Reid, and Archibald Alison, followed. But influences can be hard to pin down and there is much dispute in particular concerning his influence on David Hume (1711–1776). It is widely held that Hume’s moral philosophy is essentially Hutchesonian, and that Hume took a stage further Hutcheson’s projects of internalisation and of grounding our experience of the world on sentiment or feeling. For Hume agreed with Hutcheson that moral and aesthetic qualities are really sentiments existing in our minds, but he also argued that the necessary connection between any pair of events E1 and E2 which are related as cause to effect is also in our minds, for it is nothing more than a determination of the mind, due to custom or habit, to have a belief (a kind of feeling) that an event of kind E2 will occur next when we experience an event of kind E1. Furthermore Hume argues that what we think of as the ‘external’ world is almost entirely a product of our own imaginative activity. As against these reasons for thinking Hume indebted to Hutcheson there are the awkward facts that Hutcheson greatly disapproved of the draft of Treatise Book III that he saw in 1739 and that Hutcheson did his best to prevent Hume being appointed to the moral philosophy chair at Edinburgh University in 1744–1745. In addition many of their contemporaries, such as Adam Smith and Thomas Reid, held that Hume’s moral philosophy was significantly different from Hutcheson’s (Moore 1990).

One close contemporary of Hutcheson, who also stands in interesting relations to Hume, is George Turnbull (1698–1748), regent at Marischal College, Aberdeen (1721–1727), and teacher of Thomas Reid at Marischal. He describes Hutcheson as “one whom I think not inferior to any modern writer on morals in accuracy and perspicuity, but rather superior to almost all” (Principles of Moral Philosophy, p. 14), and no doubt Hutcheson was an influence on Turnbull in several ways. But it has to be borne in mind that the earliest of Turnbull’s writings, Theses philosophicae de scientiae naturalis cum philosophia morali conjunctione (Philosophical theses on the unity of natural science and moral philosophy), a graduation oration delivered in 1723 (Education for Life, pp. 45–57), shows Turnbull already working on a grand project that might be thought of as roughly Hutchesonian, but doing so several years before Hutcheson’s earliest published work (Turnbull [EL]). As regards Turnbull’s relationship with Hume, we should recall that the subtitle of Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature is “An attempt to introduce the experimental method of reasoning into moral subjects”. As with Hume’s Treatise, so also Turnbull’s Principles of Moral Philosophy, published in 1740 (the year of publication of Bk. III of the Treatise) but based on lectures given in Aberdeen in the mid-1720s, contains a defence of the claim that natural and moral philosophy are very similar types of enquiry. When Turnbull tells us that all enquiries into fact, reality, or any part of nature must be set about, and carried on in the same way, he is bearing in mind the fact, as he sees it to be one, that there are moral facts and a moral reality, and that our moral nature is part of nature and therefore to be investigated by the methods appropriate to the investigation of the natural world. As the natural philosopher relies on experience of the external world, so the moral philosopher relies on his experience of the internal world. Likewise, writing in Humean terms, but uninfluenced by Hume, Turnbull affirms: “every Enquiry about the Constitution of the human Mind, is as much a question of Fact or natural History, as Enquiries about Objects of Sense are: It must therefore be managed and carried on in the same way of Experiment, and in the one case as well as in the other, nothing ought to be admitted as Fact, till it is clearly found to be such from unexceptionable Experience and Observation” (Education for Life, pp. 342–3). It is, in Turnbull’s judgment, the failure to respect this experimental method that led to the moral scepticism (as Turnbull thought it to be) of Hobbes and Mandeville, whose reduction of morality to self-love flies in the face of experience and shocks common sense.

The experience in question is of the reality of the public affection in our nature, the immediate object of which is the good of others, and the reality of the moral sense by which we are determined to approve such affections. This moral sense, of whose workings we are all aware, is the faculty by which, without the mediation of rational activity, we approve of virtuous acts and disapprove of vicious ones; and the approval and disapproval rise up in us without any regard for self-love or self-interest. In a very Hutchesonian way Turnbull invites us to consider the difference we feel when faced with two acts which are the same except for the fact that one of them is performed from love of another person and the other act is performed from self-interest. These facts about our nature have to be accommodated within moral philosophy just as the fact that heavy bodies tend to fall has to be accommodated within natural philosophy.

Turnbull is committed to a form of reliabilism according to which the faculties that we have by the frame or constitution of our nature are trustworthy. It is not simply that we are so constructed that we cannot but accept their deliverances; it is that we are also entitled to accept them. Turnbull, a deeply committed Christian, believed that the author of our nature would not have so constituted us as to accept the deliverances of our nature if our nature could not be relied upon to deliver up truth. We are in the hands of providence, and live directed towards the truth for that reason. This doctrine has been termed ‘providential naturalism’, and bears a marked resemblance to the language and also to the substance of the position held by Turnbull’s pupil Thomas Reid.

5. Kames on aesthetics and religion

Henry Home, Lord Kames, likewise held a version of providential naturalism. In his Essays on the Principles of Morality and Natural Religion (1779) he has a good deal to say about the senses external and internal, treating them as enabling us, by the original frame of our nature, to gain access, without the use of reasoning processes, to the realities in the corresponding domains, including the moral domain. Kames’s moral sense has as much to do with aesthetics as with morality; or rather, for Kames, no less than for Hutcheson, virtue is a kind of beauty, moral beauty, as vice is moral deformity. Beauty itself is ascribed to anything that gives pleasure. And as there are degrees of pleasure and pain, so also there are degrees of beauty and ugliness. In the lowest rank are things considered without regard to an end or a designing agent. The possibility of greater pleasure, and of the ascription of greater beauty, arises when an object is considered with respect to the object’s end. A house, considered in itself, might be beautiful, but how much more beautiful is it judged to be if it is seen to be well designed for human occupancy.

Approbation, as applied to works of art, is our pleasure at them when we consider them to be well fitted or suited to an end. The approbation is greater if the end for which the object is well suited also gives pleasure. A ship may give pleasure because it is so shapely, and also give pleasure because it is well suited to trade, and also give pleasure because trade also is a fine thing. If these further things are taken into account the beauty of the ship is enhanced. Kames argues that these kinds of pleasure can also be taken in human actions, and that human acts can cause pleasure additionally by the special fact about them that they proceed from intention, deliberation and choice. In the case of, for example, an act of generosity towards a worthy person, the act is intentionally well suited, or fitted, to an end whose beauty is recognised by the agent. The fact that observation of acts displaying generosity, and other virtues, gives us pleasure is due to the original constitution of our nature. The pleasure arises unbidden, and no exercise of will or reason is required, any more than we require to use our reason to see the beauty of a landscape or a work of art.

Kames wrote extensively on revealed and natural theology. As regards the latter, he often has Hume in his sights, particularly Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion (1779), with whose contents Kames was familiar decades before the work’s publication. Hume held that in an inference from effect to cause no more should be assigned to the cause than is sufficient to explain the effect. In particular, if we argue from the existence of the natural world to the existence of God we should ascribe to God only such attributes as are requisite for the explanation of the world. And since the world is imperfect, why not say that we are not constrained by the facts in the natural order to ascribe perfection to God? Kames, on the other hand, holds that there are principles implanted in our nature that permit us to draw conclusions that reason alone does not sanction. If something is a tendency of our nature then we have to rely on it as a source of truth. Invoking just such a tendency Kames affirms that though we see both good and evil around us we do not conclude that the cause of the world must also be a mixture of good and evil: “it is a tendency of our nature to reject a mixed character of benevolence and malevolence, unless where it is necessarily pressed home upon us by an equality of opposite effects; and in every subject that cannot be reached by the reasoning faculty, we justly rely on the tendency of our nature” (Essays, p. 353). In any case Kames sees a world which is predominantly good even though it has ‘a few cross instances’. But the few cross instances might not look so cross, or even at all cross, if we had a fuller perspective, and Kames anticipates the time when that perspective will be granted us.

This latter position did not raise the hackles of the zealots among the Presbyterian clergy in Scotland, but Kames’s position on free will caused a furore and he had to defend himself from attempts to expel him from the Kirk. Kames, accepting the concept of history, natural and human, as the gradual realisation of a divine plan, believed in universal necessity. The laws ordained by God “produce a regular train of causes and effects in the moral as well as material world, bringing about those events which are comprehended in the original plan, and admitting the possibility of none other” (Essays, p. 192). On the other hand, if we are to fulfill our role in the grand scheme we must see ourselves as able to initiate things, that is, to be the free cause of their occurrence. God has therefore, according to Kames, concealed from us the necessity of our acts and he is therefore a deceitful God. Kames sought to explain how this divine deceit enables us to live as morally accountable beings, but this latter part of his philosophy did nothing to placate those in the Kirk for whom the affirmation of a deceitful God was a sacrilege. Kames, however, could not see any difference between the deception by which we believe ourselves to be free when in fact we are necessitated and the deception by which we believe secondary qualities, such as colours and sounds, to be in the external world and able to get along without us, when in fact they depend for their existence upon the exercise of our own sensory powers.

6. George Campbell on miracles

Kames did not dedicate an entire book to an attack on Hume on religion, but George Campbell (1719–1796) did. This interesting man, a student at Marischal College, Aberdeen, of which in 1759 he became Principal, was a founder-member of the Aberdeen Philosophical Society, the ‘Wise Cub’, which also included Thomas Reid, John Gregory, David Skene, Alexander Gerard, James Beattie and James Dunbar. It is probable that many of Campbell’s writings began life as papers to the Club. In 1763 he published A Dissertation on Miracles which was intended as a demolition of Hume’s essay ‘On miracles’, Chapter Ten in An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding. Miracles were commonly discussed in eighteenth century Scotland. On the one hand the Kirk required people to accept miracle claims on the basis either of eyewitness reports or of reports of such reports, and on the other hand the spirit of Enlightenment required that claims based on the authority of others be put before the tribunal of reason. Hume focuses especially on the credibility of testimony, and argues that the credence we place in testimony is based entirely on experience, the experience of the occasions when testimony has turned out to be true as against those experiences where it has not. Likewise it is on the basis of experience that we judge whether a reported event occurred. If the reported event is improbable we ask how probable it is that the eyewitness is speaking truly. We have to balance the probability that the eyewitness is speaking truly against the improbability of the occurrence of the event. Hume held that the improbability of a miracle is always so great that no testimony could tell effectively in its favour. The wise man, proportioning his belief to the evidence, would believe that the testimony in favour of the miracle is false.

Campbell’s opening move against this argument is to reject Hume’s premiss that we believe testimony solely on the basis of experience. For, according to Campbell, there is in all of us a natural tendency to believe other people. This is not a learned response based on repeated experience but an innate disposition. In practice this principle of credulity is gradually finessed in the light of experience. Once testimony is placed before us it becomes the default position, something that is true unless or until proved false, not false unless or until proved true. The credence we give to testimony is much like the credence we give to memory. It is the default position as regards beliefs about the past, even though in the light of experience we might withhold belief from some of its deliverances.

Because our tendency to accept testimony is innate, it is harder to overturn than Hume believes it to be. Campbell considers the case of a ferry that has safely made a crossing two thousand times. I, who have seen these safe crossings, meet a stranger who tells me solemnly that he has just seen the boat sink taking with it all on board. The likelihood of my believing this testimony is greater than would be implied by Hume’s formula for determining the balance of probabilities. Reid, a close friend of Campbell’s, likewise gave massive emphasis to the role of testimony, stressing both the innate nature of the credence we give to testimony and also the very great proportion of our knowledge of the world that we gain, not through perception or reason, but through the testimony of others. Reid’s comparison of the credence we naturally give to the testimony of others and the credence we naturally give to the deliverances of our senses, is one of the central features of his Inquiry into the Human Mind (1764).

7. George Campbell and the rhetorical tradition

A number of eighteenth century Scots, including James Burnett (Lord Monboddo), Adam Smith, Thomas Reid, Hugh Blair and James Dunbar, made significant contributions in the field of language and rhetoric. George Campbell’s The Philosophy of Rhetoric (London 1776) is a large-scale essay in which he takes a roughly Aristotelian position on the relation between logic and rhetoric, since he holds that convincing an audience, which is the province of rhetoric or eloquence, is a particular application of the logician’s art. The central insight from which Campbell is working is that the orator seeks to persuade people, and in general the best way to persuade is to produce perspicuous arguments. Good orators have to be good logicians. Their grammar also must be sound. This double requirement of orators leads Campbell to make a sharp distinction between logic and grammar, on the grounds that though both have rules, the rules of logic are universal and those of grammar particular. Though there are many natural languages there is but one set of rules of logic, and on the other hand different languages have different rules of grammar. It is against a background of discussion by prominent writers on language such as Locke and James (‘Hermes’) Harris that Campbell takes his stand with the claim that there cannot be such a thing as a universal grammar. His argument is that there cannot be a universal grammar unless there is a universal language, and there is no such thing as a universal language, just many particular languages. There are, he grants, collections of rules that some have presented under the heading ‘universal grammar’. But, protests, Campbell, “such collections convey the knowledge of no tongue whatever”. His position stands in interesting relation to Reid’s frequent appeals to universals of language in support of the claim that given beliefs are held by all humankind.

8. Common sense

Campbell was a leading member of the school of common sense philosophy. For him common sense is an original source of knowledge common to humankind, by which we are assured of a number of truths that cannot be evinced by reason and “it is equally impossible, without a full conviction of them, to advance a single step in the acquisition of knowledge” (Philosophy of Rhetoric, vol. 1, p. 114). His account is much in line with that of his colleague James Beattie: “that power of the mind which perceives truth, or commands belief, not by progressive argumentation, but by an instantaneous, instinctive, and irresistible impulse; derived neither from education nor from habit, but from nature; acting independently on our will, whenever its object is presented, according to an established law, and therefore properly called Sense; and acting in a similar manner upon all, or at least upon a great majority of mankind, and therefore properly called Common Sense” (An Essay on the Nature and Immutability of Truth, p. 40). We are plainly in the same territory as Reid’s account: “there are principles common to [philosophers and the vulgar], which need no proof, and which do not admit of direct proof”, and these common principles “are the foundation of all reasoning and science” (Reid [EIP]).

These philosophers do however disagree about substantive matters. In particular, Reid lists as the first principle of common sense: “The operations of our minds are attended with consciousness; and this consciousness is the evidence, the only evidence which we have or can have of their existence” (Reid [EIP], p. 41). Campbell on the other hand lists three sorts of intuitive evidence. The first concerns our unmediated insight into the truth of mathematical axioms and the third concerns common sense principles. The second concerns the deliverances of consciousness, consciousness being the faculty through which we learn directly of the occurrence of mental acts — thinking, remembering, being in pain, and so on. What is listed as a principle of common sense by Reid is, therefore, according to Campbell, to be contrasted with such principles. Aside from this, however, it is clear that Campbell is philosophically very close to Reid, even if Reid is unquestionably the greater philosopher.

9. Smith on moral sentiments

Reid and Hume both owed an immense debt to Hutcheson. So also did Adam Smith (1723–1790) who, unlike the others, studied under Hutcheson at Glasgow University. In 1751 Smith was appointed to the chair of logic and rhetoric at Glasgow and the following year transferred to the chair of moral philosophy that Hutcheson had occupied. Smith’s An Inquiry into the Nature and Causes of the Wealth of Nations appeared in 1776. Essays on Philosophical Subjects appeared posthumously in 1795. He also published an essay on the first formation of languages, and student notes of his lectures on rhetoric and belles lettres, and on jurisprudence have survived. But much his most important work in philosophy is the Theory of Moral Sentiments which appeared in 1759 and of which six authorised editions appeared during Smith’s lifetime. The second and sixth editions contain significant revisions and additions. Smith sets out to provide a theory that will address the weaknesses of existing systems of moral philosophy (critcised in Part VII of the Moral Sentiments). He does so by rejecting attempts to reduce morality to a single principle and instead seeks to provide an account of the operation of ordinary moral judgment that recognises the central role of socialisation.

The concepts of sympathy and spectatorship, central to the doctrine of TMS, had already been put to work by Hutcheson and Hume, but Smith’s account is distinct. As spectator of an agent’s suffering we form in our imagination a copy of such ‘impression of our own senses’ as we have experienced when we have been in a situation of the kind the agent is in: “we enter as it were into his body, and become in some measure the same person with the agent” (Smith 1790, p. 9). Smith gives two spectacular examples of cases where the spectator has a sympathetic feeling that does not correspond to the agent’s. The first concerns the agent who has lost his reason. He is happy, unaware of his tragic situation. The spectator imagines how he himself would feel if reduced to this same situation. In this imaginative experiment, in which the spectator is operating on the edge of a contradiction, the spectator’s idea of the agent’s situation plays a large role while his idea of the agent’s actual feelings has a role only in that the agent’s happiness is itself evidence of his tragedy. The second of Smith’s examples is the spectator’s sympathy for the dead, deprived of sunshine, conversation and company. Again Smith emphasises the agent’s situation, and asks how the spectator would feel if in the agent’s situation, deprived of everything that matters to people.

Smith relates sympathy to approval. For a spectator to approve of an agent’s feelings is for him to observe that he sympathises with the agent. This account is used as the basis of the analysis of propriety. For a spectator to judge that an agent’s act is proper or appropriate is for him to approve of the agent’s act. The agent’s act lacks propriety, in the judgment of the spectator, if the spectator does not sympathise with the agent’s performance.

Propriety and impropriety are based on a bilateral relation, between spectator and agent. Smith attends also to a trilateral relation, between a spectator, an agent who acts on someone, and the person who is acted on, the ‘recipient’ of the act. There are several kinds of response that the recipient may make to the agent’s act, and Smith focuses on two, gratitude and resentment. If the spectator judges the recipient’s gratitude proper or appropriate then he approves of the agent’s act and judges it meritorious, or worthy of reward. If he judges the recipient’s resentment proper or appropriate then he disapproves of the agent’s act and judges it demeritorious, or worthy of punishment. Judgments of merit or demerit concerning a person’s act are therefore made on the basis of an antecedent judgment concerning the propriety or impropriety of another person’s reaction to that act. Sympathy underlies all these judgments, for in the cases just mentioned the spectator sympathises with the recipient’s gratitude and with his resentment. He has direct sympathy with the affections and motives of the agent and indirect sympathy with the recipient’s gratitude; or in judging the agent’s behaviour improper the spectator has indirect sympathy with the agent’s resentment (Smith 1790, p. 74).

We have supposed, in each of these cases, that the recipient really does have the feeling in question, whether of gratitude or resentment. However, in Smith’s account the spectator’s belief about what the recipient actually feels about the agent is not important for the spectator’s judgment concerning the merit and demerit of the agent. The recipient may, for whatever reason, resent an act that was kindly intentioned and in all other ways admirable, and the spectator, knowing the situation better than the recipient does, puts himself imaginatively in the shoes of the recipient while taking with him into this spectatorial role information about the agent’s behaviour that the recipient lacks. The spectator judges that were he himself in the recipient’s situation he would be grateful for the agent’s act; and on that basis, and independently of the recipient’s actual reaction, he approves of the agent’s act and judges it meritorious. Here the spectator considers himself as a better (because better informed) spectator of the agent’s act than the recipient is.

As regards judgments of merit and demerit, Smith sets up a model of three people, but the three differ in respect of the weight that has to be given to their work, for the recipient does almost nothing. He is acted on by the agent, but apart from that he is no more than a place holder for the spectator who will imaginatively occupy his shoes and make a judgment concerning merit or demerit on the basis solely of his conception of how he would respond to the agent if he were in the place of the recipient. He does not judge on the basis of the actual reaction of the recipient, who might approve of the agent’s act or disapprove or have no feelings about it one way or the other.

Up to this point we have attended to the spectator’s moral judgment of the acts of others. What of his judgment of his own acts? In judging the other the spectator has the advantage of disinterest, but he may lack requisite information and much of the work of creative imagination goes into his rectifying the lack. In judging himself he has, or may be presumed to have, the requisite information but he has the problem of overcoming the tendency to a distorted judgment caused by self-love or self-interest. He must therefore factor out of his judgment those features that are due to self-love. He does this by setting up, by an act of creative imagination, a spectator, an other who, qua spectator, is at a distance from him.The point about the distance is that it creates the possibility of disinterest or impartiality, but it is still necessary to ask how disinterest or impartiality is achieved if it is the agent himself who imagines the spectator into existence.

Let us move to an answer by wondering who or what it is that is imagined into existence? Is it the voice of society, representing established social attitudes? At times in the first edition of The Theory of Moral Sentiments Smith comes close to saying that it is. In the second edition Smith is clear that this is not the role of the impartial spectator for the latter can, and occasionally does, speak against established social attitudes. Nor can the judgment of the impartial spectator be reduced to the judgment of society, even where those two judgments coincide. Nevertheless the impartial spectator exists because of real live spectators. Were it not for our discovery that while we are judging other people, those same people are judging us, we would not form the idea of a spectator judging us impartially.

Smith’s account of justice is built upon his account of the spectator’s sympathetic response to the recipient of an agent’s act. If a spectator sympathises with a recipient’s resentment at the agent’s act then he judges the act demeritorious and the agent worthy of punishment. In the latter case the moral quality attributed to the act is injustice. An act of injustice “does a real and positive hurt to some particular persons, from motives which are naturally disapproved of” (Smith 1790, p. 79). Since a failure to act justly has a tendency to result in injury, while a failure to act charitably or generously does not, a distinction is drawn by Smith, in line with Humean thinking, between justice and the other social virtues, on the basis that it is so much more important to prevent injury than promote positive good that the proper response to injustice is punishment, whereas we do not feel it appropriate to punish someone who does not act charitably or gratefully. In a word, we have a stricter obligation to justice than to the other virtues.

Though there are important points of contact between Smith’s account of justice and Hume’s, the differences are considerable, chief of them being the fact that Hume grounds our approval of justice on our recognition of its utility, and Smith does not. We do sometimes take it into account in coming to a judgment, but more often than not it is something of a quite different nature that wells up in us: “All men, even the most stupid and unthinking, abhor fraud, perfidy, and injustice, and delight to see them punished. But few men have reflected upon the necessity of justice to the existence of society, how obvious soever that necessity may appear to be” (Smith 1790, p. 89). There are a few cases where utility is plainly involved in our judgment, but they are few, and they are in a distinct psychological class. Smith instances the sentinel who fell asleep while on watch and was executed because such carelessness might endanger the whole army. Smith’s comment is: “When the preservation of an individual is inconsistent with the safety of a multitude, nothing can be more just than that the many should be preferred to the one. Yet this punishment, how necessary soever, always appears to be excessively severe. The natural atrocity of the crime seems to be so little, and the punishment so great, that it is with great difficulty that our heart can reconcile itself to it” (Smith 1790, p. 90). And our reaction in this kind of case is to be contrasted with our reaction to the punishment of ‘an ungrateful murderer or parricide’, where we applaud the punishment with ardour and would be enraged and disappointed if the murderer escaped punishment. These very different reactions demonstrate that our approval of punishment in the one case and in the other are founded on very different principles.

Smith extends the discussion of merit and demerit into a naturalised account of the development of religious belief. In his Essays on Philosophical Subjects Smith provides an account of early religious belief as a precursor to science and philosophy. In the case of both, the desire to explain the world is driven by anxiety created through novel experience. Here the appeal to heaven is a psychological coping mechanism that we develop to address injustices that go unrecognised in this world. Smith then argues that our views on the rules of justice more generally come to be associated with religion and this lends a further social sanction to morality.

10. Blair’s Christian stoicism

Smith devotes considerable space to the Stoic virtue of self-command. Another eighteenth century Scottish thinker who devotes considerable space to it is Hugh Blair (1718–1800), minister of the High Kirk of St Giles in Edinburgh and first professor of rhetoric and belles lettres at Edinburgh University. Blair’s sermons bear ample witness to his interest in Stoic virtue. For example, in the sermon ‘On our imperfect knowledge of a future state’ he wonders why we have been left in the dark about our future state. Blair replies that to see clearly into our future would have disastrous consequences. We would be so spellbound by the sight that we would neglect the arts and labours which support social order and promote the happiness of society. We are, believes Blair, in ‘the childhood of existence’, being educated for immortality. The education is of such a nature as to enable us to develop virtues such as self-control and self-denial. These are Stoic virtues, and Blair’s sermons are full of the need to be Stoical. In his sermon ‘Of the proper estimate of human life’ he says: “if we cannot control fortune, [let us] study at least to control ourselves.” Only through exercise of self- control is a virtuous life possible, and only through virtue can we attain happiness. He adds that the search for worldly pleasure is bound to end in disappointment and that that is just as well. For it is through the failure of the search that we come to a realisation both of the essential vanity of the life we have been living and also of the need to turn to God and to virtue. For many, the fact of suffering is the strongest argument there is against the existence of God. Blair on the contrary holds that our suffering provides us with a context within which we can discover that our true nature is best realised by the adoption of a life-plan whose overarching principle is religious.

11. Ferguson and the social state

One of Blair’s colleagues at Edinburgh University was Adam Ferguson (1723–1816). He succeeded David Hume as librarian of the Advocates’ Library in Edinburgh and then held in succession two chairs at Edinburgh University, that of natural philosophy (1759–1764) and of pneumatics and moral philosophy (1764–1785). His lectures at Edinburgh were published as The Institutes of Moral Philosophy (1769) and Principles of Moral and Political Science (1792). Ferguson advocates a form of moral science based on the study of human beings as they are and then grounds a normative account of what they ought to be upon this empirical basis. His most influential work is An Essay on the History of Civil Society (1767). There Ferguson attended to one of the main concepts of the Enlightenment, that of human progress, and expressed doubts about whether over the centuries the proportion of human happiness to unhappiness had increased. He believed that each person accommodates himself to the conditions in his own society and the fact that we cannot imagine that we would be contented if we lived in an earlier society does not imply that people in earlier societies were not, more or less, as happy in their own society as we are in ours. As against our unscientific conjectures about how we would have felt in a society profoundly unlike the only one we have ever lived in, Ferguson commends the use of historical records. He talks disparagingly about boundless regions of ignorance in our conjectures about other societies, and among those he has in mind who speak ignorantly about earlier conditions of humanity are Hobbes, Rousseau, and Hume in their discussions of the state of nature and the origins of society.

Hobbes and Rousseau in particular had a good deal to say about the pre-social condition of humankind. Ferguson argues, against their theories, that there are no records whatever of a pre-social human condition; and since on the available evidence humankind has always lived in society he concludes that living in society comes naturally to us. Hence the state of nature is a social state and is not antecedent to it. Instead of state of nature and contract theory, Ferguson advocates the use of history, of the accounts of travellers, and the literature and myths of societies to build an account of types of human society. Ferguson’s discussion of types of society, ideas of civilisation and civil society has seen him credited with an influential place in the development of sociology. This method is ubiquitous across the thinkers of the Scottish Enlightenment, with a particularly influential discussion of the method to be found in John Millar’s The Origin of the Distinction of Ranks (1779).

12. Dugald Stewart on history and philosophy

One colleague of Blair and Ferguson at Edinburgh University was Dugald Stewart (1753–1828), who was a student first at Edinburgh, and then at Glasgow where his moral philosophy professor was Thomas Reid. Stewart succeeded his father in the chair of mathematics at Edinburgh, and then in 1785 became professor of pneumatic and moral philosophy at Edinburgh when Ferguson resigned the chair. Stewart shared with Ferguson an interest in the kind of historical inquiry that explored how societies operate. In his Account of the Life and Writings of Adam Smith LL.D. Dugald Stewart says of one of Smith’s works, the Dissertation on the Origin of Languages (Smith [LRB], pp. 201–26), that “it deserves our attention less, on account of the opinions it contains, than as a specimen of a particular sort of inquiry, which, so far as I know, is entirely of modern origin” (Smith 1795, p. 292). Stewart then spells out the ‘particular sort of inquiry’ that he has in mind. He notes the lack of direct evidence for the origin of language, of the arts and the sciences, of political union, and so on, and affirms: “In this want of direct evidence, we are under a necessity of supplying the place of fact by conjecture; and when we are unable to ascertain how men have actually conducted themselves upon particular occasions, of considering in what manner they are likely to have proceeded, from the principles of their nature, and the circumstances of their external situation” (Smith 1795, p. 293).

For Stewart such enquiries are of practical importance, for by them “a check is given to that indolent philosophy, which refers to a miracle, whatever appearances, both in the natural and moral worlds, it is unable to explain” (Smith 1795, p. 293). Stewart uses the term ‘conjectural history’ for the sort of history exemplified by Smith’s account of the origin of language. Conjectural history works against the illegitimate encroachment of religion into the lives of people who are too quick to reach for God as the solution to a problem when extrapolation from scientifically established principles of human nature would provide a solution satisfying to the intellect. Knowing what we do about human nature, about our intellect and will, our emotions and fundamental beliefs, we ask how people would have behaved in given circumstances. Love and hate, anger and jealousy, joy and fear, do not change much through the generations. Much the same things, speaking generally, have much the same effect first on the emotions and then on behaviour. Dugald Stewart formulates the principle underlying conjectural history: it has “long been received as an incontrovertible logical maxim that the capacities of the human mind have been in all ages the same, and that the diversity of phenomena exhibited by our species is the result merely of the different circumstances in which men are placed” (Stewart 1854–58, vol. 1, p. 69).

As regards the credentials of Stewart’s ‘incontrovertible logical maxim’, if the claim that human nature is invariant is an empirical claim, it must be based on observation of our contemporaries and on evidence of people’s lives in other places and at other times. Such evidence needs however to be handled with care. The further back we go the more meagre it is, and so the more we need to conjecture to supplement the few general facts available to us. Indeed we can go back so far that we have no facts beyond the generalities that we have worked out in the light of our experience. But to rely on conjecture in order to support the very principle that forms the first premiss in any exercise in conjectural history is to come suspiciously close to arguing in a circle. The incontrovertible logical maxim of Dugald Stewart should probably be accorded at most the status of a well-supported empirical generalisation.

Conjectural history is certainly not pure guesswork. We argue on the basis of observed uniformities, and the more experience we have of given uniformities the greater credence we will give to reports that speak of the occurrence of the uniformities, whether they concern dead matter or living people and their institutions. In a famous passage Hume writes: “Whether we consider mankind according to the difference of sexes, ages, governments, conditions, or methods of education; the same uniformity and regular operation of natural principles are discernible. Like causes still produce like effects; in the same manner as in the mutual action of the elements and powers of nature” (Hume [T], p. 401).

For Hume the chief point about the similarity between ourselves and our ancestors is that histories greatly contribute to the scientific account of human nature by massively extending our otherwise very limited observational data base. Hume writes: “Mankind are so much the same, in all times and places, that history informs us of nothing new or strange in this particular. Its chief use is only to discover the constant and universal principles of human nature, by showing men in all varieties of circumstances and situations, and furnishing us with materials from which we may form our observations and become acquainted with the regular springs of human action and behaviour. These records of wars, intrigues, factions, and revolutions, are so many collections of experiments, by which the politician or moral philosopher fixes the principles of his science, in the same manner as the physician or natural philosopher becomes acquainted with the nature of plants, minerals, and other external objects, by the experiments which he forms concerning them” (Hume [E], pp. 83–84). On this account of history, it is perhaps the single most important resource for the philosopher seeking to construct a scientific account of human nature. Among the historians produced by eighteenth century Scotland were Turnbull, Hume, Smith, Ferguson and William Robertson. In light of Hume’s observation it is not surprising that so much history was written by men prominent for their philosophical writings on human nature.


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  • Szécsényi, Endre (ed.), 2016, Francis Hutcheson and the Origin of the Aesthetic (Journal of Scottish Thought, Volume 1), Aberdeen.
  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas, 2001, Thomas Reid and the Story of Epistemology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

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