The Incommensurability of Scientific Theories

First published Wed Feb 25, 2009; substantive revision Tue May 7, 2024

The term ‘incommensurable’ means ‘to have no common measure’. The idea traces back to Euclid’s Elements, where it was applied to magnitudes. For example, there is no common measure between the sides and the diagonal of a square. Today, such incommensurable relations are represented by irrational numbers. The metaphorical application of the mathematical notion specifically to the relation between successive scientific theories became controversial in 1962 after it was popularised by two influential philosophers of science: Thomas Kuhn and Paul Feyerabend. They appeared to be challenging the rationality of science and so were often considered to be among “the worst enemies of science” (Theocharis and Psimopoulos 1987, 596; cf. Preston et al. 2000). Since 1962, the incommensurability of scientific theories has been a widely discussed, controversial idea that was instrumental in the historical turn in the philosophy of science and the establishment of the sociology of science as a professional discipline.

1. Introduction

In the influential The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962), Kuhn made the dramatic claim that history of science reveals proponents of competing paradigms failing to make complete contact with each other’s views, so that they are always talking at least slightly at cross-purposes. Kuhn characterized the collective reasons for these limits to communication as the incommensurability of pre- and post-revolutionary scientific traditions, claiming that the Newtonian paradigm is incommensurable with its Cartesian and Aristotelian predecessors in the history of physics, just as Lavoisier’s paradigm is incommensurable with that of Priestley’s in chemistry (Kuhn 1962, 147–150; cf. Caamaño 2009 and Hoyningen-Huene 2008). These competing paradigms lack a common measure because they use different concepts and methods to address different problems, limiting communication across the revolutionary divide. Kuhn initially used incommensurability predominately to challenge cumulative characterizations of scientific advance, according to which scientific progress is an improving approximation to the truth, and to challenge the idea that there are unchanging, neutral methodological standards for comparing theories throughout the development of the natural sciences. Like in evolution, the process does not change toward some fixed goal according to some fixed rules, methods or standards, but rather it changes away from the pressures exerted by anomalies on the reigning theory (Kuhn 1962, 170–173). The process of scientific change is eliminative and permissive rather than instructive. In the process of confronting anomalies, certain alternatives are excluded, but nature does not guide us to some uniquely correct theory.

Kuhn developed and refined his initial idea over the following decades, repeatedly emphasizing that incommensurability neither means nor implies incomparability; nor does it make science irrational (e.g. Kuhn 2000 [1970], 155ff.). He focused increasingly on conceptual incompatibility as manifest in the structural differences used to classify the kinds whose relations are stated in laws and theories, such as chemical elements and biological species (Kuhn 2000, see especially chs. 3, 4, 5, 10 & 11). He used incommensurability to attack the idea, prominent among logical positivists and logical empiricists, that comparing theories requires translating their consequences into a neutral observation language (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 213–214). In the late 1990s, he explicated incommensurability in terms of ineffability, emphasizing that it became possible for scientists to make and understand certain new statements only after a particular theory had been introduced (in the older vocabulary the new sentences are nonsensical), just as it only becomes possible for historians to understand certain older statements by setting aside current conceptions that otherwise cause distortions (Kuhn 2000 [1989], 58–59; 2000 [1993], 244). Such ‘taxonomic incommensurability’ results in translation failure between local subsets of inter-defined terms due to the cross-classification of objects into mutually exclusive taxonomies. This can be distinguished from ‘methodological incommensurability’, according to which there is no common measure between successive scientific theories, in the sense that theory comparison is sometimes a matter of weighing historically developing values, not following fixed, definitive rules (Sankey and Hoyningen-Huene 2001, vii-xv). This makes rational disagreement about theory comparison possible, as scientists may apply different values (such as scope, simplicity, fruitfulness, accuracy) in evaluating and comparing particular theories, so that theory choice is not unequivocally determined throughout the scientific community.

Paul Feyerabend initially used the term ‘incommensurable’ in “Explanation, Reduction and Empiricism” (1962). By calling two rival theories incommensurable, Feyerabend meant that they are ‘deductively disjoint’ due to meaning variance in the concepts used to state them. For example, Feyerabend claimed that the concepts represented by ‘temperature’ and ‘entropy’ in kinetic theory are incommensurable with those of phenomenological thermodynamics (1962, 78); and the Newtonian concepts represented by ‘mass’, ‘length’ and ‘time’ are incommensurable with their relativistic counterparts (1962, 80). By calling two rival theories deductively disjoint (or ‘incommensurable’), Feyerabend meant that one cannot be deduced from the other, nor can any predictions deduced from one enter formal logical relations with any predictions deduced from the other. Because the rival theories give different meanings to the same observation sentences when they are used to corroborate them by being deduced from them, the new theory cannot explain (formally by deduction) the successful predictions deduced from the established theory, and successful predictions deduced from one cannot logically contradict unsuccessful predictions deduced from the other potentially falsifying it (1962, 94, fn. 115).

Feyerabend developed a model to illustrate how there can be crucial experiments between incommensurable rivals despite the impossibility of establishing formal relations between them and any of their corresponding predictions. He illustrated his test-model with an example borrowed from David Bohm: the corroboration of the kinetic theory (atomism) by the confirmation of Einstein’s predictions of the stochastic character of Brownian motion (Oberheim 2024). Feyerabend repeatedly used the idea of incommensurability and this test-model to challenge a wide range of forms of conceptual conservatism for unjustifiably favoring entrenched views over potential improvements, and to support his methodological argument for theoretical pluralism as it became the lynchpin of his normative philosophy from ERE (1962) through Against Method (1993). Incommensurable alternatives to well-established views should always be welcome because they may be necessary for showing those views should be replaced.

The entry is organized around the 1962 popularizations of the concept of incommensurability by Kuhn and Feyerabend and the basic ideas that influenced their developments of this concept. First, Kuhn’s notion of incommensurability as it was initially developed is characterized, as is its cause and its purported consequences. That is followed by an examination of Kuhn’s route to the idea, and then his subsequent development after 1962. The sections on Feyerabend’s notion of incommensurability mirror the same basic structure. They are followed by a brief comparison of Kuhn and Feyerabend’s views on incommensurability, especially its relation to theory comparison.

2. Revolutionary paradigms: Thomas Kuhn on incommensurability

Kuhn’s notion of incommensurability in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions misleadingly appeared to imply that science was somehow irrational, and consequently, it faced many challenges and caused much confusion. This led to many clarifications, and eventually to a substantial redevelopment of a more precise and restricted version of it over the following decades. Kuhn initially used the term holistically to capture methodological, observational, and conceptual disparities between successive scientific paradigms that he had encountered in his historical investigations into the development of the natural sciences (Kuhn 1962, 148–150). Later, he refined the idea arguing that incommensurability is due to differences in the taxonomic structures of successive scientific theories and neighboring contemporaneous sub-disciplines. Kuhn’s developing notion of incommensurability has received much attention, and it continues to provoke plenty of controversy (cf. Bird 2007, Demir 2008, Moreno 2009, Psillos 2008, and Soler, Sankey and Hoyningen-Huene 2008).

2.1 The Structure of Scientific Revolutions

In The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962), Thomas Kuhn used the term ‘incommensurable’ to characterize the holistic nature of the changes that take place in a scientific revolution. His investigations into the history of science revealed a phenomenon often now called ‘Kuhn loss’: Problems whose solution was vitally important to the older tradition may temporarily disappear, become obsolete, or even unscientific. On the other hand, problems that had not even existed, or whose solution had been considered trivial, may gain extraordinary significance in the new tradition. Kuhn concluded that proponents of incommensurable theories have different conceptions of their discipline and different views about what counts as good science; and that these differences arise because of changes in the list of problems that a theory must resolve and a corresponding change in the standards for the admissibility of proposed solutions (cf. Stillwaggon Swan and Bruce 2011). For example, Newton’s theory was initially widely rejected because it did not explain the attractive forces between matter, something required of any mechanics from the perspective of the proponents of Aristotle and Descartes’ theories (Kuhn 1962, 148). According to Kuhn, with the acceptance of Newton’s theory, this question was banished from science as illegitimate, only to re-emerge with the solution offered by general relativity. He concluded that scientific revolutions alter the very definition of science itself.

Changes in problems and standards come with corresponding conceptual changes, so that after a revolution, many (though not all) of the older concepts are still used, but in a slightly modified way. Such conceptual changes have both intentional and extensional aspects, which is to say that the same terms take on different meanings and are used to refer to different things when used by proponents of competing incommensurable theories. The changes in the intentional aspects of concepts result because the terms used to express a theory are inter-defined and their meanings depend on the theories to which they belong. For example, the meanings of the terms ‘temperature’, ‘mass’, ‘chemical element’, and ‘chemical compound’ depend on which theories are used to interpret them. Conceptual changes also result in the exclusion of some old elements of the extension of a concept, while new elements come to be subsumed by it so that the same term comes to refer to different things. For example, the term ‘Planet’ referred to the sun but not the earth in the Ptolemaic theory, whereas it refers to the earth and not the sun in the Copernican theory. Incommensurable theories use some of the same terms, but with different meanings, to refer to different sets of things. Two scientists who perceive the same situation differently, but nevertheless use the same vocabulary to describe it, speak from incommensurable viewpoints (Kuhn 1970, 201).

One of the most controversial claims to emerge from Kuhn’s assertions about the incommensurability of scientific theories is that the proponents of different paradigms work in different worlds (Kuhn 1962, 150; cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1990; 1993; 2021, 2022, 2023), but see also the metaphorical-psychological interpretation of world change in (Bird, 2012), pp. 869, 871). Drawing on experiments in the psychology of perception, Kuhn argued that the rigorous training required for admittance to a paradigm conditions scientist’s reactions, expectations and beliefs (Kuhn 1962, 128; 2000 [1989], 66–71), so that learning how to apply the concepts of a theory to solve exemplary problems determines scientists’ experiences. For example, where a proponent of the Newtonian theory sees a pendulum, an Aristotelian saw constrained free fall; where Priestley saw dephlogisticated air, Lavoisier saw oxygen; where Berthollet saw a compound that could vary in proportion, Proust saw only a physical mixture. Kuhn (and Feyerabend) used the analogy of a Gestalt switch to illustrate this point. In this way, one main source of the notion of incommensurability of scientific theories has been the development of Gestalt psychology.

According to Kuhn, these three interrelated aspects of incommensurability (changes in problems and standards that define a discipline, changes in the concepts used to state and solve those problems, and world change) jointly constrain the interpretation of scientific advance as cumulative. Scientific progress, Kuhn argued, is not simply the continual discovery of new facts duly explained. Instead, revolutions change what counts as the facts in the first place. When reigning theories are replaced by incommensurable challengers, the purported facts are re-described according to new and incompatible theoretical principles. The main goal of Kuhn’s Structure was to challenge the idea of scientific progress as cumulative, according to which what is corrected or discarded in the course of scientific advance is that which was never really scientific in the first place, and Kuhn used incommensurability as the basis of his challenge. Instead of understanding scientific progress as a process of change toward some fixed truth, Kuhn compared his suggestion to that of Darwin: scientific progress is like evolution in that its development should be understood without reference to a fixed, permanent goal (1962, 173).

2.2 Kuhn’s route to incommensurability

2.2.1 Kuhn’s discovery of incommensurability

According to Kuhn, he discovered incommensurability as a graduate student in the mid to late 1940s while struggling with what appeared to be nonsensical passages in Aristotelian physics (Kuhn 2000 [1989], 59–60). He could not believe that someone as extraordinary as Aristotle could have written them. Eventually, patterns in the disconcerting passages began to emerge, and then all at once, the text made sense to him: a Gestalt switch that resulted when he changed the meanings of some of the central terms. He saw this process of meaning changing as a method of historical recovery. He realized that in his earlier encounters, he had been projecting contemporary meanings back into his historical sources (Whiggish history), and that he would need to peel them away to remove the distortion and understand the Aristotelian system in its own right (hermeneutic history). For instance, when he encountered the word “motion” in Aristotle (the standard translation of the Greek kinesis), he was thinking in terms of the change of position of objects in space (as we do today). But to get more closely at Aristotle’s original usage, he had to expand the meaning of motion to cover a much broader range of phenomena that include various other sorts of change, such as growth and diminution, alternation, and generation and corruption, making the motion of an object in space (displacement or ‘locomotion’) just a special case of motion. Kuhn realized that these sorts of conceptual differences indicated breaks between different modes of thought, and he suspected that such breaks must be significant both for the nature of knowledge and for the sense in which the development of knowledge can be said to make progress. Having made this discovery, Kuhn changed his career plans, leaving theoretical physics to pursue this strange phenomenon. Some fifteen years later the term ‘incommensurable’ first appears in his classic The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962).

2.2.2 Conceptual replacement and theory-ladenness of observation: Ludwik Fleck

Of all the sources influencing Kuhn on incommensurability, at least one deserves special attention. In the foreword of The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, Kuhn acknowledged a deep debt to Ludwik Fleck, a bacteriologist who developed the first explicit sociology of science, anticipating many contemporary views about the social construction of knowledge. Around 1950, Kuhn was enticed by the potential relevance to his experience of incommensurability of Fleck’s paradoxical title: Entstehung und Entwicklung einer wissenschaftlichen Tatsache: Einführung in die Lehre von Denkstil und Denkkollektiv (1935) (Genesis and Development of a Scientific Fact, 1979). There and in other earlier works, Fleck had already used ‘inkommensurabel’ to describe different styles of thinking within the natural sciences as well as to discuss the ramifications of radical conceptual change in the history of science. For example, Fleck used the term ‘inkommensurabel’ to describe the differences between ‘medical thinking’ and ‘scientific thinking’. The former addresses irregular, temporally dynamic phenomena such as illness, while the latter addresses uniform phenomena (Fleck 1986 [1927], 44–45). Fleck also used the term ‘inkommensurabel’ to describe conceptual replacements in theoretical transitions within what he considered the most vital of the natural sciences, the medical sciences. For example, he claimed that an old concept of disease became incommensurable with a newer concept that was not a completely adequate substitute for it (Fleck 1979 [1935], 62). While Fleck’s program of comparative epistemology anticipates Kuhn’s ideas in many significant respects, it is also strikingly different in others (Harwood 1986; Oberheim 2006; Peine 2011). The most pervasive differences concerning incommensurability are that Fleck treats meaning and meaning change as a function of how concepts are received and developed by collectives, while for Kuhn it is individuals who develop and apply concepts that advance science. Moreover, for Fleck, meaning change is a gradual, continuous feature of scientific development, whereas Kuhn distinguishes normal scientific development that does not radically change meanings from revolutionary breaks that do.

Even so, Fleck had emphasized all three of the interrelated aspects of the shifts that Kuhn called scientific revolutions that result in ‘incommensurability’ (changes in problems and standards (1979 [1935], 75–76; 1979 [1936], 89), conceptual change (e.g. 1979 [1935]; 1979 [1936], 72, 83) and world change (e.g. 1986 [1936], 112). Fleck also argued that science does not approach the truth because successive thought-styles raise new problems and discard older forms of knowledge (Fleck 1986 [1936], 111–112; 1979 [1935], 19, 51, 137–139; cf. Harwood 1986, 177). Fleck emphasized that scientific terms acquire their meanings through their application within a particular theoretical context and that those meanings change when theories change in the course of advance, illustrating his point with the example of ‘chemical elements’ and ‘compounds’ repeated by Kuhn (Fleck 1979 [1935], 25, 39, 40, 53–54). Fleck emphasized the theory-ladenness of observation with explicit reference to Gestalt switches; stressing that a ‘thought-style’ determines not only the meanings of its concepts but also the perception of phenomena to be explained, illustrating his claims with examples from the history of anatomical representation (1979 [1935], 66; 1986 [1947]). Fleck (like Kuhn, Feyerabend, and Wittgenstein) acknowledged Wolfgang Köhler’s earlier work in the psychology of perception in this regard, see below (Oberheim 2006). Fleck concluded that scientific advance is not cumulative, that conceptual differences between members of different scientific communities cause communication difficulties between them (1979 [1936], 109), and later for historians trying to understand older ideas (1979 [1936], 83–85, 89). Fleck even emphasized that meaning change through scientific advance causes translation failure between theories, anticipating a central aspect of Kuhn’s later notion of taxonomic incommensurability (e.g. 1986 [1936], 83).

2.2.3 Gestalt psychology and organized perception

Another major source of Kuhn’s idea of the incommensurability of scientific theories is Gestalt psychology (Kuhn 1962, vi). Wolfgang Köhler had emphasized the active role of organization in perception and argued that in psychology one begins with Gestalten (organized, segregated wholes such as the objects of human perception or identifiable human behaviors) and then proceeds to discover their natural parts (and not vice versa, like in particle physics). In the opening sentences of the condensed English version of Köhler’s investigation of the relationship between the mental concepts of psychology and the material concepts of physics, Köhler wrote: “In order to orient itself in the company of natural sciences, psychology must discover connections wherever it can between its own phenomena and those of other disciplines. If this search fails, then psychology must recognize that its categories and those of natural science are incommensurable” (1938 [1920], 17).

2.2.4 The image of art and the image of science

In a preliminary draft, “The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, Chapter 1, What are Scientific Revolutions?” (dated 1958–1960, likely composed in late 1958) of the first chapter of his projected book, Kuhn initially used the idea of incommensurability to characterize stages of development in the arts in contrast to the traditional image of scientific progress as cumulative that he set out to challenge (see Pinto de Oliveira, 2017). Although this draft chapter was entirely rewritten as the introduction of Kuhn (1962), and was explicitly intended only to provoke exploratory discussion and not for publication, it strongly suggests that, at that time, Kuhn began to develop the idea of the incommensurability in science in reaction to the traditional (e.g. Sarton, Conant) contrast between development in the arts and cumulative progress in the sciences (see Pinto de Oliveira, 2017). In the draft, Kuhn announced his project as an attempt to reshape the image of science so as to make it closer to the image of art (see Pinto de Oliveira, 2017). He wanted to challenge the cumulative conception of scientific progress promoted by the old historiography of science, according to which “science appears to advance by accretion” and science is “an ever-growing edifice to which each scientist strives to add a few stones or a bit of mortar” (Kuhn 1958, 2, as cited in Pinto de Oliveira 2017, 748) in contrast to the image of art according to which “the transition between one stage of artistic development and the next is a transition between incommensurables” (Kuhn 1958, 3, as cited in Pinto de Oliveira 2017, 749).

A few pages later, Kuhn proceeds to apply the idea of incommensurability to science for the very first time, again while comparing scientific revolutions to the non-cumulative nature of progress in the arts: “Often a decision to embrace a new theory turns out to involve an implicit redefinition of the corresponding science. Old problems may be relegated to another science or may be declared entirely ‘unscientific’. Problems that, on the old theory, were non-existent or trivial may, with a new theory, become the very archetypes of significant scientific achievement. And, as the problems change, so, often, does the standard that distinguishes a real scientific solution from a mere metaphysical speculation, word game, or mathematical play. It follows that, to a significant extent, the science that emerges from a scientific revolution is not only incompatible, but often actually incommensurable, with that which has gone before. Only as this is realized, can we grasp the full sense in which scientific revolutions are like those in the arts” (Kuhn 1958, 17–18 as cited in Pinto de Oliveira 2017, 756). Kuhn concludes that “If we are to preserve any part of the metaphor which makes inventions and discoveries new bricks for the scientific edifice, and if we are simultaneously to give resistance and controversy an essential place in the development of science, then we may have to recognize that the addition of new bricks demands at least partial demolition of the existing structure, and that the new edifice erected to include the new brick is not just the old one plus, but a new building. We may, that is, be forced to recognize that new discoveries and new theories do not simply add to the stock of pre-existing scientific knowledge. They change it.” (Kuhn 1958, 7, as cited in Pinto de Oliveira 2017, 756).

2.3 Kuhn’s subsequent development of incommensurability

Kuhn continued to struggle with, develop, and then refine his understanding of incommensurability until his death in 1996. Although his development of incommensurability went through several stages (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 206–222), he claimed to have made a “series of significant breakthroughs” beginning in 1987 (Kuhn 2000 [1993], 228). They are described in several essays and published lectures that were collected in (Kuhn 2000, cf. chs. 3, 4, 5, 10 & 11), and an unfinished book entitled The Plurality of Worlds: An Evolutionary Theory of Scientific Development. Kuhn only wrote six out of nine planned chapters of the book that was published, together with other writings (Mladenovic, 2022). The relationships among Kuhn’s posthumously published writing that partly overlap have been analyzed in (Melogno, 2023). The nature of these developments is controversial. Some commentators claim that Kuhn’s incommensurability thesis underwent a ‘major transformation’ (Sankey 1993), while others (including Kuhn himself) see only a more specific characterization of the original core insight (Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 212; Kuhn 2000, [1983], 33ff.; Chen 1997). Kuhn’s original holistic characterization of incommensurability is now distinguished into two separate theses. ‘Taxonomic incommensurability’ involves conceptual change in contrast to ‘methodological incommensurability’, which involves the epistemic values used to evaluate theories (Sankey 1991; Sankey and Hoyningen-Huene 2001; see Section 2.3.2 below).

2.3.1 Taxonomic incommensurability

Kuhn continued to struggle with, develop, and then refine his understanding of incommensurability until his death in 1996. Although his development of incommensurability went through several stages (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 206–222), he claimed to have made a “series of significant breakthroughs” beginning in 1987 (Kuhn 2000 [1993], 228). They are described in several essays and published lectures that were collected in (Kuhn 2000, cf. chs. 3, 4, 5, 10 & 11), and an unfinished book entitled The Plurality of Worlds: An Evolutionary Theory of Scientific Development. Kuhn only wrote six out of nine planned chapters of the book that was published, together with other writings (Mladenovic, 2022). The relationships among Kuhn’s posthumously published writing that partly overlap have been analyzed in (Melogno, 2023). The nature of these developments is controversial. Some commentators claim that Kuhn’s incommensurability thesis underwent a ‘major transformation’ (Sankey 1993), while others (including Kuhn himself) see only a more specific characterization of the original core insight (Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 212; Kuhn 2000, [1983], 33ff.; Chen 1997). Kuhn’s original holistic characterization of incommensurability is now distinguished into two separate theses. ‘Taxonomic incommensurability’ involves conceptual change in contrast to ‘methodological incommensurability’, which involves the epistemic values used to evaluate theories (Sankey 1991; Sankey and Hoyningen-Huene 2001; see Section 2.3.2 below).

To help explicate incommensurability in terms of taxonomic classification, Kuhn developed the no-overlap principle. The no-overlap principle precludes cross-classification of objects into different kinds within a theory’s taxonomy. According to the no-overlap principle, no two kind terms may overlap in their referents unless they are related as species to genus. For example, there are no dogs that are also cats; no gold that is also silver, and that is what makes the terms ‘dogs’, ‘cats’, ‘silver’, and ‘gold’ kind terms (Kuhn 2000 [1991], 92). Such kind terms are used to state laws and theories and must be learned together through experience (2000 [1993], 230; cf. Barker et al. 2003, 214 ff.). There are two possibilities. Most kind terms must be learned as members of one or another contrast set. For example, to learn the term ‘liquid’, one must also master the terms ‘solid’ and ‘gas’. Other types of kind terms are not learned through contrast sets, but together with closely related terms through their joint application to situations that exemplify natural laws. For example, the term ‘force’ must be learned together with terms like ‘mass’ and ‘weight’ through an application of Hooke’s law and either Newton’s three laws of motion or else the first and third laws together with the law of gravity (2000 [1993], 231). According to Kuhn, scientific revolutions change the structural relations between pre-existing kind terms, breaking the no-overlap principle (2000 [1991], 92–96]. This is to say that theories separated by a revolution cross-classify the same things into mutually exclusive sets of kinds. A kind from one taxonomy is mutually exclusive with another if it cannot simply be introduced into it because the objects to which it refers would be subject to different sets of natural laws. This would result in conflicting expectations about the same objects, loss of logical relations between statements made with those concepts, and ultimately incoherence and miscommunication (Kuhn 2000 [1993], 232, 238). For example, Ptolemy’s theory classifies the sun as a planet, where planets orbit the earth, while Copernicus’ theory classifies the sun as a star, where planets orbit stars like the sun. A correct statement according to Copernican theory, such as “Planets orbit the sun” is incoherent in Ptolemaic vocabulary (2000 [1991], 94). It could not even have been made without abandoning the Ptolemaic concepts and developing new ones to replace (and not supplement) them.

Furthermore, Kuhn (in a move toward Feyerabend’s view) later claims that the same types of difficulties in communication that arise due to incommensurability between members of different scientific communities separated by the passage of time also occur between members of different contemporaneous sub-disciplines that result from scientific revolutions (Kuhn 2000 [1993], 238). This represents a significant change to his original phase-model of scientific advance, and a corresponding shift in his application of the notion of incommensurability. Kuhn no longer represents scientific advance as a linear progression from pre-normal science to normal science, through crisis to revolution that results in a new phase of normal science; and incommensurability is no longer restricted just to diachronic episodes of scientific advance in which two theories are separated by a revolution. Instead, scientific revolutions are compared to the process of speciation in biology, in that disciplines branch into sub-disciplines that resemble a phylogenetic tree in which contemporaneous sub-disciplines that result from scientific revolutions can also be incommensurable. This incommensurability derives from different training required to master the incompatible kind terms used to state their laws and theories. These shared kind terms cross-classify the same set of objects into different sets of kinds, resulting in mutually exclusive lexical taxonomies that break the no-overlap principle. Moreover, now not only are both processes (scientific progress and biological evolution) similar in that they are not fixed in advance by some set goal (i.e. truth), but driven from behind (i.e. away from anomalies that play an analogous role to selection pressure), but also the function of incommensurability between scientific theories is presented as analogous to the isolating mechanisms required for speciation (Kuhn 2000 [1991], 94–99).

Kuhn compared the function of lexical taxonomies to Kant’s a priori when taken in a relativized sense. Each lexicon makes a corresponding form of life possible within which the truth or falsity of propositions may be both claimed and rationally justified. For example, with the Aristotelian lexicon, one can speak of the truth or falsity of Aristotelian assertions, but these truth values have no bearing on the truth of apparently similar assertions made with the Newtonian lexicon (Kuhn 2000 [1993], 244). A lexicon is thus constitutive of the objects of knowledge (Kuhn 2000 [1993], 245); and consequently, Kuhn rejected characterizations of scientific progress according to which science zeros in on the truth: “no shared metric is available to compare our assertions … and thus to provide a basis for a claim that our (or, for that matter, his) are closer to the truth” (2000 [1993], 244). Instead, the logical status of a lexical structure, like that of word meanings in general, is that of convention, and the justification of a lexicon or of lexical change can only be pragmatic (2000 [1993], 244). Kuhn thus reaffirmed his earlier claim that the notion of a match or correspondence between the ontology of a theory and its real counterpart in nature is illusive in principle (1970, 206; 2000 [1993], 244). The implications that incommensurability has for scientific realism have been widely discussed and continue to be controversial (cf. Oberheim and Hoyningen-Huene 1997; Devitt 2001; Sankey 2009; Oberheim 2024).

A lexicon is not only prerequisite to making meaningful statements, it also sets limits on what can be meaningfully said within the community of speakers that share it: “There is, for example, no way, even in an enriched Newtonian vocabulary, to convey the Aristotelian propositions regularly misconstrued as asserting the proportionality of force and motion or the impossibility of a void. Using our conceptual lexicon, these Aristotelian propositions cannot be expressed — they are simply ineffable — and we are barred by the no-overlap principle from access to the concepts required to express them” (Kuhn 2000 [1993], 244; cf. 2000 [1989], 76). In this way, Kuhn’s later notion of the incommensurability of scientific theories is based on effability. The structure of the lexicon shared by a particular community determines how the world can be described by its members, as well as how they will misunderstand the history of their own discipline; that is, unless they learn to understand older terms according to the structure of the older lexicon. Where Kuhn had earlier likened the process by which historians come to understand antiquated science as a special type of translation, he retracted these claims, insisting that the process is one of language learning, not translation (2000 [1993], 238, 244). Kuhn often claimed that incommensurable theories are untranslatable (e.g. Kuhn 2000 [1991], 94). However, he also emphasized that translation is neither needed in the comparison of incommensurable theories, nor in the hermeneutic historical method necessary to understand antiquated sciences (Kuhn 2000 [1993], 237, 238, 244). To overcome the barriers posed by incommensurability to understanding antiquated sciences, and to understanding the special technical vocabulary used by contemporaneous, phylogenetically related sub-disciplines, it is neither necessary nor possible to translate between them. Rather, one must become bilingual, learning to use (and keep separate) the incongruently structured lexical taxonomies underwriting different laws and theories.

2.3.2 Methodological incommensurability

As Kuhn refined his notion of incommensurability as a special type of conceptual incompatibility, some commentators began to distinguish it from ‘methodological incommensurability’. Methodological incommensurability is the idea that there are no shared, objective standards of scientific theory appraisal, so that there are no external or neutral standards that univocally determine the comparative evaluation of competing theories (Sankey and Hoyningen-Huene 2001, xiii). This idea has also been recently discussed in detail under the rubric “Kuhn-underdetermination” (Carrier 2008, 278). The basic idea was developed out of Kuhn and Feyerabend’s rejections of the traditional view that a distinguishing feature of science is a uniform, invariant scientific method, that remains fixed throughout its development (Kuhn 1962, 94, 103; Feyerabend 1975, 23–32; cf. Farrell 2003). Feyerabend famously argued that every proposed methodological rule has been fruitfully violated at some point in the course of scientific advance, and that only by breaking such rules could scientists have made the progressive steps for which they are praised (1975). He concluded that the idea of a fixed, historically invariant scientific method is a myth. There are no universally applicable methodological rules. The only methodological rule that is universally applicable is ‘anything goes’, which buys its universality at the cost of being completely empty (1970a, 105). Kuhn challenged the traditional view of scientific method as a set of rules, claiming that the standards of theory appraisal, such as simplicity, accuracy, consistency, scope, and fruitfulness (1977, 322), depend on and vary with the currently dominant paradigm. He is often cited for having pointed out that as in political revolutions, so in choice of paradigm, there is no standard higher than the assent of the relevant community (1962, 94), and as having argued that there is “no neutral algorithm for theory choice, no systematic decision procedure which, properly applied, must lead each individual in the group to the same decision” (1970, 200). Kuhn developed the idea that such epistemic standards do not function as rules that determine rational theory choice, but as values that merely guide it (1977, 331). Different scientists apply these values differently, and they may even pull in different directions, so that there may be rational disagreement between scientists from incommensurable paradigms, who support different theories due to their weighing the same values differently.

3. Combating conceptual conservatism: Paul Feyerabend on incommensurability

In Feyerabend’s philosophy, incommensurability is a specific form of “conceptual disparity” that results in incompatible interpretations of reality (1970b, 222). For there to be incommensurability: “The situation must be rigged in such a way that the conditions of concept formation in one theory forbid the formation of the basic concepts of the other” (1970b, 222; 1978, 68; and 1975, 269), so that the new theory entails that “all the concepts of the preceding theory have zero extension” because the new theory introduces “rules that change the system of classes itself” (1965c, 268). Incommensurable theories are incompatible both conceptually and ontologically. They use incompatible sets of concepts to state mutually exclusive accounts of reality. They are conceptually incompatible because of meaning variance in the terms used to state the rival theories. They are ontologically incompatible because according to the new theory, the general descriptive terms used to state the established view do not in fact refer to real kinds of things; therefore, if one is true, then the other cannot be. According to Feyerabend, two theories are incommensurable because the meanings of the terms used to state them are determined by rival theoretical principles that govern their use, and these principles imply incompatible explanations of reality (1962, 58). Or put another way, two theories are incommensurable: “When the meaning of their main descriptive terms depend on mutually inconsistent [ontological] principles” (1965c, 227; cf. 1975, 269–270, 276), so that “a theory is incommensurable with another if [their] ontological consequences are incompatible” (1981a, xi).

With respect to normative methodology (Popper’s logic of scientific inquiry), the main consequences of incommensurability follow from the fact that incommensurable theories are deductively disjoint. Because the terms used to state the theories have different meanings, the main concepts of one can neither be defined based on the primitive descriptive terms of the other, nor formally related to them via correct empirical statements deduced from them (1962, 74, 90), so that for Feyerabend, incommensurability just means “deductive disjointedness, and nothing else” (1977, 365). By calling rival theories deductively disjoint or “incommensurable”, Feyerabend is claiming that in scientific revolutions, the established theory cannot be deduced from the new theory, nor can predictions deduced from the established theory enter formal relations with the new theory or any predictions deduced from it. Put more directly, if two theories are incommensurable, then one theory cannot be deduced from the other, nor can any of the predictions deduced from one theory be formally consistent or inconsistent with any predictions deduced from the other, or as Feyerabend put it, “incommensurable theories may not possess any comparable consequences, observational or otherwise” (1962, 94). Feyerabend often emphasizes that “this does not mean that a person may not, on different occasions, use concepts which belong to different and incommensurable frameworks. The only thing that is forbidden for him is the use of both kinds of concepts in the same argument; for example, he may not use the one kind of concept in his observation language and the other kind in his theoretical language” (1962, 83).

To explain incommensurability, Feyerabend develops what he took to be Wittgenstein’s views on meaning, specifically his nominalism and constructivism, with what he called a contextual theory of meaning, according to which a term does not have meaning independent of its use in a specific context, and its meaning is determined by the theory with which it is interpreted. This has the peculiar result, according to Feyerabend, that due to meaning variance in the terms used state rival theories, one sentence will covertly make two incompatible statements, when it is deduced from rival incommensurable theories and used to test them. Similarly, when two sentences that prima facia directly logically contradict each other (“The ball fell down”, “The ball did not fall down”) are deduced from incommensurable rival theories, even though they may look like they formally contradict each other, they cannot because of meaning variance in the terms from which they were deduced. Feyerabend argues that for predictions to count as evidence for or against a theory, they must be deduced from that theory, and therefore, the same experimental results must be given incompatible interpretations that can have no formal relations when they are when they are used to test incommensurable rivals. In Feyerabend’s example, the sentence ‘The ball fell down’ will mean ‘The ball was pushed down by its impetus toward its natural place’, or it will mean ‘it was pulled by gravity toward the Earth’s center of mass’, depending on whether an Aristotelian or Newtonian theory is used to interpret it (1962, 56, citing Clagett 1959). Similarly, the terms ‘mass’ and ‘space’ mean something different in classical mechanics and relativity theory, which imply incompatible accounts of reality. If one of these theories is true, then the other cannot be. Either objects have an absolute mass and move in space that is inert, or objects have a rest mass and a relative mass and move in space that can bend and stretch. Because the meanings of the terms used to state the rival theories vary, classical mechanics cannot be deduced from relativity theory; and predictions deduced from classical mechanics can neither be logically consistent with (nor can they logically contradict) any predictions deduced from relativity theory. For this reason, according to Feyerabend, relativity theory cannot explain the successful predictions deduced from Newton’s theory, nor can predictions deduced from relativity theory falsify Newton’s theory by logically contradicting predictions deduced from it (1962, 28–31, 93–95).

3.1 ‘Explanation, Reduction and Empiricism’ (1962)

Feyerabend’s landmark essay, “Explanation, Reduction and Empiricism” (1962), is an attempt to synthesize the best aspects of Popper and Wittgenstein’s views, while criticizing the worst aspects of each (Oberheim 2024). Feyerabend tries to analyze a problem with explanation (1962, 92, fn. 13) by developing the idea of incommensurability to criticize three views interpreted as normative methodologies, or accounts of the logic of scientific justification in the Popperian sense. Hempel’s account of explanation, Nagel’s account of reductionism, and Popper’s account of empiricism (also known as ‘falsificationism’); hence, the three-word title. Feyerabend argues that none of these three accounts can take comparing rival incommensurable theories empirically into account, and so they all dogmatically stifle the scientific progress that they should promote. Then, he generalizes his argument: Due to meaning variance that results from scientific revolutions, a formal account of explanation cannot be given (1962, 95). Put simply, today’s best theories cannot explain antiquated facts, because those facts cannot be deduced from them. Therefore, any methodology that implies that to be acceptable as a replacement for an established view, a new theory should have to explain the successful predictions deduced from it is antihumanitarian because it would stifle the progress it should promote.

According to Feyerabend, Hempel’s account of explanation implies that a statement is explained by an explanation by being deduced from it and that one explanation should replace another if it explains everything the existing theory explains plus more. According to Feyerabend, this is not possible whenever the rival explanations are incommensurable (‘deductively disjoint’) due to meaning variance in the terms used to state the explanations. If new proposed explanations should have to explain (by deduction) everything the established explanations explain (by deduction) to justify replacing the established explanation with the new proposal, then revolutionary scientific advances that result in meaning variance would never be justifiable. For this reason, Hempel’s account of explanation interpreted as a normative methodology has antihumanitarian consequences because it stifles the progress it should promote.

According to Feyerabend, Nagel’s account of reduction implies that the new theory should explain the established theory (or some form of it) by being shown to be deducible from it (as a limiting case), or in other words, the new theory explains (be deduction) the established theory in an explanation by ‘reduction’. According to Feyerabend, this is not possible if the rival theories are incommensurable. If new theories should have to explain established theories by showing that they (or some version of them) can be deduced from the new theory (or some version of it), then revolutionary scientific advances would never be justifiable. Moreover, as Popper has shown, according to Feyerabend, if the existing theory were a deductive consequence of the new theory, then the new theory could not predict – by deduction – a statement that falsifies the existing theory. Thus, Nagel’s account of reduction interpreted as a normative methodology also has antihumanitarian consequences because it stifles the progress it should promote.

According to Feyerabend, Popper’s account of empiricism implies that the new theory should falsify the established theory by meeting two conditions. First, it should predict (by deduction) all the statements the existing theory successfully predicted (by deduction) so that the evidence for the existing theory becomes evidence for the new theory and is explained by it (assuming that the new theory is true). Second, the new theory should correctly predict a statement that formally contradicts a statement deduced from the established view (1962, 91–93). According to Feyerabend, due to meaning variance in the terms used to state incommensurable rival theories, neither of these conditions can be met. The new theory cannot explain (by deduction) the predictions that were successfully deduced from the existing theory because of meaning variance (1962, 94), nor can a successful prediction deduced from the new theory falsify the existing theory by formally contradicting an unsuccessful prediction deduced from the existing theory (1962, 94, fn. 115). Feyerabend concludes that Popper’s methodology:

can well deal with all the problems that arise when T and T′ are commensurable, but inconsistent inside D′. It does not seem to me that it can deal with the case where T′ and T are incommensurable. (1962, 93)

According to Feyerabend, by inadvertently implying meaning invariance in the terms used to test rival theories, which would be required to establish formal relations between them, Popper’s empiricism is much closer to the dogmatic school philosophies, such as Platonism and Cartesianism, from which it tries to distance itself (1962, 30–31). Moreover, the reason traditional philosophical problems such as the mind-body problem, the problem of the reality of the external world, and the problem of other minds perpetually persist is that the disputants resist the kind of meaning change necessary for their dissolution (1962, 31, 90). Similarly, Wittgenstein’s genuinely philosophical (pseudo-)problems (not genuine philosophical problems) perpetually re-occur, because antiquated incommensurable theoretical principles continue to haunt contemporary everyday language use. This happens because we continue to use the same terms to mean radically different things based on incompatible ontological principles after scientific revolutions. Throughout the 1960s, Feyerabend’s papers adamantly argued that everyday language should be perpetually revised and corrected to reflect the ontological implications of our current best theories (Feyerabend 1962; 1964; 1969).

By calling two theories incommensurable, Feyerabend did not mean to imply that they were not empirically comparable or comparatively untestable. For Feyerabend, falsifiability is not synonymous with testability. Feyerabend developed an alternative test model for empirically comparing incommensurable rivals, which he illustrated with the example of Einstein’s prediction of the stochastic character of Brownian motion as a “crucial experiment” between two incommensurable rivals: the kinetic theory (and atomism) and classical phenomenological thermodynamics (and energeticism) (1962, 66). In Feyerabend’s test model, in contrast to falsificationism, the new theory is better corroborated than the existing theory because it predicts a novel phenomenon that cannot be explained by the existing theory. Moreover, the existing theory, by itself, could never even have discovered the fact that the phenomenon in question refutes it because the existing theory implies incorrect basic postulates that are incompatible with the basic postulates needed to explain the phenomenon and thereby prove that it refutes the existing theory. In this way, the new theory undermines its rival’s ontology without falsifying it by logically contradicting predictions deduced from it. Put more directly, in contrast to Popper’s conjectures and refutations, Feyerabend’s theoretical pluralism is based on conjectures and novel corroborations. It follows from Feyerabend’s view that universal framework theories are never formally falsified, because they can always be protected from direct refutations by ad hoc maneuvers (a lesson he had learned firsthand from his Ehrenhaft experience in the late 1940s), and they cannot be indirectly refuted by falsification due to meaning invariance (Oberheim 2024). Through to Against Method (1993), Feyerabend repeatedly used this test model to support a methodological argument for theoretical pluralism. Incommensurable proposals should always be welcome because they can increase the testability of established views. For example, without a new incommensurable theory that correctly predicts its stochastic character, Brownian motion could never have dethroned classical phenomenological thermodynamics by undermining its ontology. Feyerabend argues that this implies a contrastive account of a theory’s empirical content (in contrast to Popper’s deductive account of empirical content). Incommensurable alternatives together with the facts they can explain are part of each other’s empirical content in contrast to each other, as part of what they rule out (1962, 67; 1993, 27–28). For Feyerabend, in scientific revolutions, established theories and the concepts used to state them are not corrected and absorbed, and thereby legitimized by new theories; rather, they are rejected and replaced by better corroborated alternatives, so that: “Knowledge so conceived is not a process that converges toward an ideal view; it is an ever-increasing ocean of alternatives, each of them forcing the others into greater articulation, all of them contributing, via this process of competition, to the development of our mental faculties” (1965c, 224–225; cf. 1963).

3.2 Feyerabend’s route to incommensurability

Although Feyerabend first used the term ‘incommensurable’ to describe deductively disjoint scientific theories in 1962, he had been developing ideas about conceptual change for more than a decade. According to Feyerabend, he initially discussed these ideas with the Kraft Circle from 1949–1951, while working toward his doctoral thesis on protocol statements (Feyerabend 1951; 1958). In 1952, Feyerabend presented his notion of incommensurability to Popper’s seminar at the London School of Economics and also in Elizabeth Anscombe’s home in Oxford to Anscombe and other Wittgensteinians, including Peter Geach, H.L.A.Hart and Georg Henrik von Wright (1995, 92). In an “An Attempt at a Realistic Interpretation of Experience” (which a condensed version of his 1951 Ph.D. thesis), Feyerabend argued for “thesis I: the interpretation of an observation-language is determined by the theories which we use to explain what we observe, and it changes as soon as those theories change” (Feyerabend 1958a, 163; Feyerabend 1993, 211). For example, according to Feyerabend, the correct meaning of the term ‘temperature’ should not be determined by how it feels phenomenologically or by its everyday use, but by the principles of statistical thermodynamics according to which it is caused by molecular motion. Feyerabend argued that as older theories are replaced, the meanings of the observational terms used to test those theories change. This is an early version of his idea that conceptually incompatible theories are incommensurable due to meaning differences. In 1958, Feyerabend challenged an implicit conceptual conservatism in logical positivism with his early notion of incommensurability, criticizing the assumptions that theoretical terms derive their meaning solely through their connection with experience and that experience is a stable foundation on which theoretical meaning can be unequivocally based. Instead of such a bottom-up version of the relation of experience and theoretical knowledge, according to which experience determines the meanings of our theoretical terms, Feyerabend argued for a top-down version, according to which our best theories determine the meanings that we attach to our experiences. According to Feyerabend, experience cannot be taken for granted as a neutral basis for comparing theories, because what we experience depends on the theories that we bring to it.

Karl Popper had quickly become Feyerabend’s mentor after they met in 1948, and there has been much controversy concerning Feyerabend’s evolving relationship to Popper (cf. Collodel 2016), especially given its tumultuous trajectory, and Feyerabend’s break with the Popperian school in 1967 (Oberheim 2024). Many factors have complicated these controversies, including the revisions Feyerabend made concerning his debts to Popper in the reprints of his original papers (see Preston 1997; Oberheim 2006; Collodel 2016), informal accusations of plagiarism by Popper and Popperians (Collodel 2016), and Feyerabend’s subsequent increasingly vocal denials of his debts to Popper as he tried to distance himself from Popper and his methodology (Oberheim 2006, ch. 3.4). Many (including Popper) have interpreted Feyerabend’s conception of incommensurability as a rather misguided extension of falsificationism and/or Popper’s earlier use of ‘inkommensurabilität’ (Bschir 2015; Collodel 2016; Gattei and Agassi 2016). However, in 1962 Feyerabend explicitly tried to criticize Popper’s methodology as a dogmatic school philosophy with a limited validity (limited to testing commensurable theories empirically), not to extend it (Oberheim 2024). This marks the point that Feyerabend and Popper begin to part ways concerning their views on scientific progress and truth (Tambolo 2017). Moreover, Feyerabend’s 1962 criticism of Popper’s methodology eventually resulted in Feyerabend announcing his break from the Popperian school in late November 1967, as can clearly be seen in his correspondence with Imre Lakatos and John Watkins (Oberheim 2024).

Feyerabend’s route to the idea of incommensurability was influenced by several prominent individuals, who had been discussing a wide range of related topics. An investigation of the source of these ideas reveals some of the founding fathers of the notion of incommensurability in the contemporary history and philosophy of science (see Oberheim 2006, ch. 5).

3.2.1 Progress through meaning change: Pierre Duhem

Feyerabend drew heavily from Duhem’s The Aim and Structure of Physical Theory (1954 [1906]) in his development of the notion of incommensurability of scientific theories. Many of the main points Feyerabend emphasized by calling scientific theories incommensurable had been developed already by Duhem, who had argued that logic is insufficient for determining the outcome of theoretical disputes in the natural sciences, and who documented the difficulties historians have in understanding the development of the natural sciences due to meaning change. Duhem also already highlighted the communication difficulties between proponents of competing scientific theories because of these differences in meaning. For example, Duhem had claimed that what a physicist states as the result of an experiment is not simply the recital of some observed facts. Rather, it is the interpretation of these facts on the basis of the theories the scientist regards as true (1954 [1906], 159). It follows, according to Duhem, that in order to understand the meanings that scientists ascribe to their own statements, it is necessary to understand the theories that they use in order to interpret what they observe. Thus, Duhem had stated an early version of Feyerabend’s incommensurability thesis. Moreover, Duhem explicitly limited his discussion to non-instantial, physical theories, as opposed to mere experimental laws. This is very similar to the criteria that marks the most significant difference between Kuhn and Feyerabend’s development of the idea of incommensurability (see Section 4), and that also delimits Einstein’s use of ‘incommensurable’ while discussing the problems of theory comparison (see Section 3.2.3).

After explaining that the meaning of a term depends on the theory to which it belongs, and that a consequence of theoretical advance is meaning change, Duhem continued: “If the theories admitted by this physicist are those we accept, and if we agree to follow the same rules in the interpretation of the same phenomena, we speak the same language and can understand each other. But that is not always the case. It is not so when we discuss the experiments of a physicist who does not belong to our school; and it is especially not so when we discuss the experiments of a physicist separated from us by fifty years, a century, or two centuries” (1954 [1906], 159). Duhem continued: “How many scientific discussions there are in which each of the contenders claims to have crushed his adversary under the overwhelming testimony of the facts! … How many propositions are regarded as monstrous errors in the writings of those who have preceded us! We should perhaps commemorate them as great truths if we really wished to enquire into the theories which gave their propositions their true meaning” (Duhem 1954 [1906], 160–161). These passages make the same basic points that both Feyerabend and Kuhn made with their claims about incommensurability of scientific theories: Because older ideas are misunderstood, as a result of taking them out of their theoretical context, proponents of incommensurable scientific theories misunderstand each other, both claiming to have the facts on their side. Kuhn and Feyerabend both claimed that in such a situation, even empirical arguments can become circular (Feyerabend 1965b, 152; Kuhn 1962, 94).

3.2.2 The square root of 2 and complementarity: Niels Bohr

In his autobiography, Feyerabend acknowledged Niels Bohr’s direct influence on the development of his notion of incommensurability in the 1950s. Feyerabend recalled a conversation in which Bohr had talked about the discovery that the square root of two cannot be an integer or a fraction. According to Feyerabend, Bohr presented the event as having led to the extension of a concept of number that retained some properties of integers and fractions, but changed others; and claimed that the transition from classical to quantum mechanics was carried out in accordance with precisely this principle (1995, 78). Feyerabend also used the notion of incommensurability to argue that Bohr’s complementarity thesis is an example of an unjustified conceptual conservatism, taking issue with Bohr’s contention that all quantum mechanical evidence will always necessarily be expressed in classical terms (Feyerabend 1958b; cf. 1962). He presented Bohr’s defense of the principle of complementarity as based on the conviction that every experience must necessarily make its appearance within the frame of our customary points of view, which is currently that of classical physics. However, according to Feyerabend, even though classical concepts have been successful in the past, and even though at the moment it may be difficult, or even impossible, for us to imagine how to replace them, it does not follow that the classical framework could not one day be superseded by an incommensurable rival. Consequently, it does not follow that all our future microscopic theories will have to take the notion of complementarity as fundamental. Instead, according to Feyerabend, a theory may be found whose conceptual apparatus, when applied to the domain of validity of classical physics, would be just as comprehensive and useful as the classical apparatus, without coinciding with it. He claimed that such a situation is by no means uncommon, and he used the transition from Newtonian to relativistic physics to bolster his point. According to Feyerabend, while the concepts of relativity theory are sufficiently rich to state all of the facts captured by Newtonian physics, the two sets of concepts are “completely different” and bear “no logical relations” to each other (1958b, 83; 1961, 388; 1962, 88–89). On Feyerabend’s fallibilist view of empirical knowledge, no element of our knowledge can be held to be necessary or absolutely certain. In our search for satisfactory explanations, we are at liberty to change any parts of our existing knowledge, however fundamental they may seem, including the concepts of classical physics.

3.2.3 ‘Kant on wheels’ and universal theories: Albert Einstein

Albert Einstein used the term ‘incommensurable’ to apply specifically to difficulties selecting and evaluating scientific theories before Kuhn and Feyerabend, and there are very strong reasons to believe that Feyerabend’s use of the term “incommensurable” was directly inspired by Einstein’s use of the term (Oberheim 2016, Oberheim 2024). In his ‘Autobiographical notes’ (1949), Einstein attempted to explain that assessing the relative merits of universal physical theories involves making difficult judgments about their ‘naturalness’ that requires making judgments based on the reciprocal weighing of incommensurable qualities: “The second point of view is not concerned with the relation to the material observation but with the premises of the theory itself, with what may briefly but vaguely be characterized as the ‘naturalness’ or ‘logical simplicity’ of the premises (of the basic concepts and of the relations between these which are taken as a basis). This point of view, an exact formulation of which meets with great difficulties, has played an important role in the selection and evaluation of theories since time immemorial. The problem here is not simply one of a kind of enumeration of the logically independent premises (if anything like this were at all unequivocally possible), but that of a kind of reciprocal weighing of incommensurable qualities” (1949a, 23).

There are strong reasons for believing that these admittedly cryptic remarks directly inspired Feyerabend’s use and development of the idea of incommensurability. In his 1962 paper, Feyerabend cites from Bohr’s paper, which is in same edited volume as Einstein’s autobiographical notes (Schilpp 1949), and David Bohm had brought the Brownian motion example to Feyerabend’s attention, which is discussed by Einstein in those autobiographical notes (Oberheim 2024). Feyerabend’s main example illustrating that and how incommensurable theories can be compared based on a ‘crucial experiment’ was Einstein’s quantitative prediction, and Perrin’s subsequent confirmation, of Brownian motion. Feyerabend argued that although Brownian motion was already a well-known phenomenon, it became evidence for statistical thermodynamics and against classical thermodynamics only after kinetic theory was used to explain it. The crucial experiment between these two rival theories was based on theory-laden observations of Brownian motion that corroborated statistical thermodynamics, but because they are theory-laden, they cannot be stated in a neutral observation language.

There are striking similarities between Feyerabend and Einstein’s uses of the term. Both make a distinction between universal theories and lower-level theories that do not apply to the totality of all physical appearances and then use this distinction to limit the application of incommensurability in the same way that is to such universal theories (cf. Feyerabend 1962, 28 and Einstein 1949a, 23), and they both apply “incommensurable” directly to differences in the basic concepts used to state the theories. Furthermore, Einstein’s theoretical attitude is a form of dynamic Kantian realism, or “Kantian-on-wheels” – to use Peter Lipton’s apt expression (Lipton 2001) – very much like that of Feyerabend and Kuhn’s (Oberheim 2016). According to Einstein, his theoretical attitude “is distinct from that of Kant only by the fact that we do not conceive of the ‘categories’ as unalterable (conditioned by the nature of the understanding) but as (in the logical sense) free conventions. They appear to be a priori only insofar as thinking without the positing of categories and of concepts in general would be as impossible as is breathing in a vacuum” (Einstein 1949b, 374). This is the same basic perspective that both Kuhn and Feyerabend delineated when they developed their ideas of incommensurability. For example, Kuhn says, “I go around explaining my own position saying I am a Kantian with moveable categories” (Kuhn 2000 [1995], 264), an idea developed in detail by Hoyningen-Huene (1993). For his part, Feyerabend adopted such a ‘Kant-on-wheels’ approach in the introduction of ‘Explanation, Reduction and Empiricism’ (1962) to pursue the question: If universal theories determine all of our experiences of the world, how can experience still be used to test such theories? Feyerabend also defended his view that there is no fixed or universal scientific method (e.g. 1975, 10–11) citing Einstein: “The external conditions which are set for [the scientist] by the facts of experience do not permit him to let himself be too much restricted, in the construction of his conceptual world, by the adherence to an epistemological system. He therefore must appear to the systematic epistemologist as a type of unscrupulous opportunist” (Einstein1949b, 683ff.). Although Feyerabend’s development of the idea of incommensurability of scientific theories was received by the philosophic and scientific communities as propagating a radical, irrationalism about science, he was actually trying to develop ideas he had found in Einstein. In the preface to the German version of Against Method, Feyerabend wrote, “I want to emphasize yet again that the views in this book are not new – for physicist like Mach, Boltzmann, Einstein and Bohr they were a triviality. But the ideas of these great thinkers have been distorted [by positivist philosophers] beyond recognition” (1983, 12, our translation).

3.3 Feyerabend’s later notions of incommensurability

Feyerabend tried to clarify his idea of incommensurable scientific theories throughout the 1960s as it became the cornerstone of his peculiar brand of theoretical pluralism explicitly initially developed in contrast to Popper, Kuhn, Putnam and Bohm’s forms of theoretical pluralisms (1962, 32). In Against Method (1975), in addition to the incommensurability of scientific theories and the worldviews they imply, Feyerabend extended the application of this term to characterize the transition from the Greek archaic, aggregate worldview of Homer to the substance worldview of the Pre-Socratics (1975, 261–269). He characterized the wider notion of incommensurability as both historical and anthropological (1975, 271), and he tried to clarify incommensurability by suggesting that it involves major conceptual changes to both ‘overt’ and ‘covert classifications’ (in Whorff’s sense), so that incommensurability is difficult to define explicitly, and can only be shown (1975, 224–225). He also started using the term in much broader senses, discussing incommensurable frameworks of thought and action (1975, 271), incommensurability in the domain of perceptions (1975, 225, 271), incommensurable discoveries and attitudes (1975, 269) and incommensurable paradigms (1981b [1970], 131–161). For Feyerabend, all these cases share the common feature that incommensurability results from the replacement of some form of universal principles.

4. A comparison of Kuhn and Feyerabend on incommensurability

Initially, Feyerabend had a more concrete characterization of the nature and origins of incommensurability than Kuhn. Feyerabend claimed that the interpretation of an observation language is determined by the theories we use to explain what we observe. When our theories about reality change, what we experience as reality changes accordingly. Kuhn, by contrast, was initially much less sure about the exact meaning of his notion of incommensurability, especially regarding world change, which he saw as its most fundamental aspect. He frankly confessed to have been at a loss: “In a sense that I am unable to explicate further, the proponents of competing paradigms practice their trades in different worlds” (1962, 150). He suggested that “we must learn to make sense of statements that at least resemble these” (1962, 121), and then spent a great deal of effort attempting to do so.

Feyerabend’s discussion of incommensurability of scientific theories was much more restricted than Kuhn’s. For Kuhn, incommensurability had three prima facie heterogeneous domains, holistically bound: a change of problems and standards, a change of concepts used to state and solve them, and a change of worldview in which they arise. Feyerabend’s focus, on the other hand, was initially exclusively on concepts occurring in universal or ‘non-instantial’ theories realistically interpreted. Ironically, however, in developments after 1962, both authors move in opposite directions, converging toward the same views. Kuhn gradually eliminated everything from his notion of incommensurability that does not concern scientific concepts, and ended more or less where Feyerabend began (see Carrier 2001; Chen 1997; Hoyningen-Huene 1990, 487–488; Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 212–218; Hoyningen-Huene 2004, Sankey 1993; Sankey 1994, 16–30; Sankey 1997). Feyerabend, by contrast, increasingly emphasized aspects of perceptual change (1975, 225–229, 273–274; 1978, 68; 1988, 172–176), and also changes to the set of legitimate problems a discipline should handle (1975, 274–275), and in his later philosophy, he emphasizes one of Kuhn’s original points: the role of non-binding, epistemic values in theory choice that can result in ‘methodological’ incommensurability (cf. Farrell 2003).

Concerning the range of theories that are subject to incommensurability, again Feyerabend’s discussion was much more restricted than Kuhn’s. For Feyerabend, only universal, non-instantial theories interpreted realistically can be incommensurable (Feyerabend 1962, 28, fn. 1, 44; 1965b, 216; 1975, 114, 271, 284; 1975, 221–222; 1987, 272). Feyerabend was interested in such theories because he believed that only “such comprehensive structures of thought” have ontological implications that affect entire worldviews (Feyerabend 1962, 28; Feyerabend 1954; cf. Oberheim 2006, 157ff.). He restricted his discussion of incommensurability to non-instantial theories based on their test procedures. Generalizations of the form ‘All As are Bs’ are tested by inspecting instances. For example, Kepler’s first law makes claims about the planets, which can be tested directly by inspecting their motion. To test non-instantial theories, such as Newton’s theory of gravitation, laws or lower-level theories must first be derived from them, and only thereafter (and given additional auxiliary assumptions), can they be tested by inspecting instances (Feyerabend 1962, 28, fn. 1). Feyerabend was talking about relatively rare, large-scale revolutions that affect entire worldviews (1987, 272). In this way, his notion was also more Kantian than Kuhn’s, because Feyerabend (like Kant) was talking primarily about universal theories that determine the meaning of thinghood itself, whereas Kuhn was talking more widely about changes to the meaning of any set of kind terms that break the no-overlap principle. For this reason, Kuhn included a wider range of theories as candidates for incommensurability. For him, even smaller episodes, like unexpected discoveries, might be incommensurable with the earlier tradition (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 197–201). This difference in the range of incommensurability between Kuhn and Feyerabend’s versions finds its most striking expression in the way they regard the transition from the Ptolemaic to the Copernican theory. For Kuhn, the differences between these two theories comprise an exemplary illustration of incommensurability. For Feyerabend, however, because planetary theory lacks the quality of universality, there is no incommensurability (1975, 114). Furthermore, in his later work, Kuhn insisted that the version of incommensurability he championed had always been “local incommensurability,” a notion that restricts conceptual change to a few, typically interconnected concepts (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 213, 219). Thus, there may be empirical consequences of incommensurable theory pairs that can be immediately compared. For instance, the geocentric and heliocentric planetary theories are incommensurable in Kuhn’s sense, while predictions of the planetary positions of both theories are fully commensurable, and can be immediately compared regarding their empirical accuracy. By contrast, Feyerabend always thought of incommensurability more globally. Meaning variance in the terms used to state the theories affects the meanings of all statements derivable from those theories about anything and everything so that incommensurable rivals have no formally comparable consequences (1962, 93; 1965c, 117; 1965b, 216; 1975, 275–276; 1981a, xi).

Both Kuhn and Feyerabend have often been misread as advancing the view that incommensurability implies incomparability (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 218ff.; Oberheim 2006, 235). In response to this misreading, both Kuhn and Feyerabend repeatedly emphasized that incommensurability does not imply incomparability (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 236ff.). Theory comparison is merely more complicated than imagined by some philosophers of science. In particular, for Kuhn, it cannot fully be made ‘point-by-point’. It is not an algorithmic procedure (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 147–154; Feyerabend 1975, 114; 1981a, 238), nor one that requires translation into a neutral observation language. Different epistemic values, such as universality, accuracy, simplicity, fruitfulness may pull in different directions allowing for rational disagreement (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1992, 492–496; 1993, 150–154; cf. Feyerabend 1981a, 16; 1981c, 238). But even given that a full point-by-point comparison of incommensurable theories is impossible and that theory comparison does not have the status of a proof, a comparative evaluation of incommensurable theories is still possible (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 236–258; Carrier 2001) and rational in a means/ends or instrumental sense. For example, according to Kuhn it is rational to choose theories that are better problem-solvers because they better serve the ends of science. This property of theory choice makes the overall process of science both rational and progressive. With incommensurability, Kuhn was not challenging the rationality of theory choice, he was trying to make room for the possibility of rational disagreement between proponents of competing paradigms. In fact, according to Kuhn, “incommensurability is far from being the threat to rational evaluation of truth claims that it has frequently seemed. Rather, it’s what is needed, within a developmental perspective, to restore some badly needed bite to the whole notion of cognitive evaluation. It is needed, that is, to defend notions like truth and knowledge from, for example, the excesses of post-modernist movements like the strong program” (2000 [1991], 91).

The extent of the misreading of incommensurability as implying incomparability is even more dramatic in Feyerabend’s case. Feyerabend explicitly and repeatedly argued that developing incommensurable rivals offers a better means of testing established theories than merely testing them directly against their own predictions or by developing commensurable alternatives (Feyerabend 1962, 66; cf. Oberheim 2006, 235ff.). They offer a better means of testing because some observations can only be interpreted as refutations of an existing theory after an incommensurable alternative has been developed with which to interpret them (cf. Oberheim 2006, 240–245, Oberheim 2024). The misunderstanding that incommensurability implies incomparability conflates testability with falsifiability, as can be seen in Popper’s The Myth of the Framework (1994). However, Feyerabend was not arguing that universal theories are untestable. He was arguing that they are not falsifiable. He argues that because two incommensurable theories use qualitatively incompatible concepts to interpret quantitatively identical results, they will interpret the same quantitative sentences as different qualitative statements, concluding: “there may not exist any possibility of finding a characterization of the observations which are supposed to confirm two incommensurable theories” (1962, 94, italics inserted). This precludes the possibility of using a neutral observation language (such as Popperian basic statements) for comparing the empirical consequences of rival incommensurable theories by establishing formal relations between them and their corresponding predictions. However, Feyerabend did not conclude from this that they cannot be compared empirically, but rather that there is no need for a neutral observation language to establish formal relations for an empirical comparison, illustrating how with the example of Einstein’s prediction of the stochastic character of Brownian motion. Feyerabend also mentions other possibilities of comparing incommensurable theories and recognizes ‘methodological incommensurability’, although he did not call it that (Feyerabend 1965b, 217; 1970, 228; 1975, 284; 1978, 68; 1981a, 16).

Finally, there is a central, substantive point of agreement between Kuhn and Feyerabend that should be emphasized. Both see incommensurability as excluding the possibility of interpreting scientific development as an approximation to truth (or as an “increase of verisimilitude”) (Feyerabend 1965c, 107; 1970, 220, 222, 227–228; 1975, 30, 284; 1978, 68; Kuhn 1970, 206; 2000 [1991], 95; 2000 [1993], 243ff.; cf. Oberheim 2006, 180ff.; Oberheim 2024; Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 262–264). They reject such characterizations of scientific progress because they recognize that scientific revolutions result in changes to what we experience as real. In scientific revolutions, such changes cannot be just mere refinements of, or additions to, the established theory, such that these developments could be seen as cumulative additions. Rather, the new ontology replaces its predecessor. Consequently, neither Kuhn nor Feyerabend can correctly be characterized as a scientific realist who believes that science makes progress toward truth.


  • Barker, P., Chen, X. and Andersen, H., 2003, “Kuhn on Concepts and Categorization”, in T. Nickels (ed.), Thomas Kuhn, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 212–245.
  • Bird, A., 2007, “Incommensurability Naturalized”, in L. Soler, H. Sankey and P. Hoyningen-Huene (eds.), Rethinking Scientific Change and Theory Comparison, Berlin: Springer, pp. 21–39.
  • –––, 2012, “The Structure of Scientific Revolutions and its Significance: An Essay Review of the Fiftieth Anniversary Edition”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 63(4): 859–883.
  • Bschir, K., 2015, “Feyerabend and Popper on Theory Proliferation and Anomaly Import: On the Compatibility of Theoretical Pluralism and Critical Rationalism”, HOPOS: The Journal of the International Society for the History of Philosophy of Science, 5(1): 24–55.
  • Caamaño, M., 2011, “A Structural Analysis of the Phlogiston Case”, Erkenntnis, 70(3): 331–364.
  • Carrier, M., 2001, “Changing Laws and Shifting Concepts: On the Nature and Impact of Incommensurability”, in P. Hoyningen-Huene and H. Sankey (ed.), Incommensurability and Related Matters, Dordrecht: Kluwer, pp. 65–90.
  • –––, 2008, “The Aim and Structure of Methodological Theory”, in L. Soler, H. Sankey and P. Hoyningen-Huene (ed.), Rethinking Scientific Change and Theory Comparison: Stabilities, Ruptures, Incommensurabilites?, Berlin: Springer, pp. 273–290.
  • Chen, X., 1997, “Thomas Kuhn’s Latest Notion of Incommensurability”, Journal for General Philosophy of Science, 28: 257–273.
  • Clagett, M., 1959, The Science of Mechanics in the Middle Ages. Madison: University of Wisconsin Press.
  • Collodel, M., 2016, “Was Feyerabend a Popperian? Methodological issues in the History of the Philosophy of Science”, Studies in the History and Philosophy of Science, 57: 27–56.
  • Conant, J. and Haugeland, J., 2000, “Editors’ Introduction”, in J. Conant and J. Haugeland (ed.), The Road Since Structure, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, pp. 1–9.
  • Demir, I., 2008, “Incommensurabilities in the Work of Thomas Kuhn”, Studies in the History and Philosophy of Science, 39: 133–142.
  • Devitt, M., 2001, “Incommensurability and the Priority of Metaphysics”, in P. Hoyningen-Huene and H. Sankey (ed.), Incommensurability and Related Matters, Dordrecht: Kluwer, pp. 143–157.
  • Duhem, P., 1906 [1954], The Aim and Structure of Physical Theory, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Einstein, A., 1949a, “Autobiographical Notes”, in P. Schilpp (ed.), Albert Einstein: Philosopher-Scientist, La Salle: Open Court, pp. 3–95.
  • –––, 1949b, “Remarks Concerning the Essays Brought Together in this Co-operative Volume”, in in P. Schilpp (ed.), Albert Einstein: Philosopher-Scientist, La Salle: Open Court, pp. 665–668.
  • Farrell, R., 2003, Feyerabend and Scientific Values. Tightrope-Walking Rationality, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Feyerabend, P., 1951, Zur Theorie der Basissätze, Ph.D. thesis, University of Vienna, Universitäts Bibliothek Wien.
  • –––, 1954, “Physik und Ontologie”, Wissenschaft und Weltbild: Monatsschrift für alle Gebiete der Forschung, 7: 464–476.
  • –––, 1958a, “An Attempt at a Realistic Interpretation of Experience”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 58: 143–170.
  • –––, 1958b, “Complementarity”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 32 (Supplement): 75–104.
  • –––, 1961, “Niels Bohr’s Interpretation of the Quantum Theory”, in H. Feigl and G. Maxwell (ed.), Current Issues in the Philosophy of Science, New York: Rinehart and Winston, pp. 35–39.
  • –––, 1962, “Explanation, Reduction and Empiricism”, in H. Feigl and G. Maxwell (ed.), Scientific Explanation, Space, and Time, (Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Volume III), Minneapolis: University of Minneapolis Press, pp. 28–97.
  • –––, 1963, “How to Be a Good Empiricist: A Plea for Tolerance in Matters Epistemological”, in B. Baumrin (ed.), Philosophy of Science: The Delaware Seminar, New York: Interscience Press (John Wiley).
  • –––, 1965a, “On the ‘Meaning’ of Scientific Terms”, Journal of Philosophy, 62: 266–274.
  • –––, 1965b, “Problems of Empiricism”, in R. Colodny (ed.), Beyond the Edge of Certainty. Essays in Contemporary Science and Philosophy, Pittsburgh: Pittsburgh Center for Philosophy of Science, pp. 145–260.
  • –––, 1965c, “Reply to Criticism. Comments on Smart, Sellars and Putnam”, in R. Cohen and M. Wartofsky (ed.), Proceedings of the Boston Colloquium for the Philosophy of Science 1962–64: In Honor of Philipp Frank (Boston Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Volume II), New York: Humanities Press, pp. 223–261.
  • –––, 1967, “The Mind-Body Problem”, Continuum, 5: 35–49.
  • –––, 1969, “Linguistic Arguments and Scientific Method”, Telos, 2: 43–63.
  • –––, 1970a, “Against Method: Outline of an Anarchistic Theory of Knowledge”, in M. Radner and S. Winokur (ed.), Analysis of Theories and Methods of Physics and Psychology, (Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Volume IV), Minneapolis: University of Minneapolis Press, pp. 17–130.
  • –––, 1970b, “Consolations for the Specialist”, in I. Lakatos and A. Musgrave (ed.), Criticism and the Growth of Knowledge, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 197–230.
  • –––, 1975, Against Method. Outline of an Anarchistic Theory of Knowledge, London: New Left Books.
  • –––, 1977, “Changing Patterns of Reconstruction”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 28: 351–382.
  • –––, 1978, Science in a Free Society, London: New Left Books.
  • –––, 1981a, Realism, Rationalism and Scientific Method. Philosophical papers, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1981b, “Consolations for the specialist”, in Problems of Empiricism. Philosophical Papers, Volume 2, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 131–167.
  • –––, 1981c, “More clothes from the emperor’s bargain basement: A review of Laudan’s Progress and its Problems”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 32: 57–71.
  • –––, 1983, Wider den Methodenzwang, 2nd Edition, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.
  • –––, 1987, “Putnam on Incommensurability”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 38: 75–81.
  • –––, 1988, Against Method, revised edition, London: Verso.
  • –––, 1993, Against Method, 3rd edition, London: Verso.
  • –––, 1995, Killing Time: The Autobiography of Paul Feyerabend, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Fleck, L., 1935 [1979], Genesis and Development of a Scientific Fact, T. Trenn and R. Merton (ed.), Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • –––, 1927 [1986], “Some Specific Features of The Medical Way of Thinking”, in R. Cohen and T. Schnelle (ed.), Cognition and Fact: Materials on Ludwik Fleck, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, pp. 39–46.
  • –––, 1935 [1986], “Scientific Observation and Perception in General”, in R. Cohen and T. Schnelle (ed.), Cognition and Fact: Materials on Ludwik Fleck, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, pp. 59–78.
  • –––, 1936 [1986], “The Problem of Epistemology”, in R. Cohen and T. Schnelle (ed.), Cognition and Fact: Materials on Ludwik Fleck, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, pp. 79–112.
  • –––, 1947 [1986], “To Look, To See, To Know”, in R. Cohen and T. Schnelle (ed.), Cognition and Fact: Materials on Ludwik Fleck, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, pp. 129–151.
  • Gattei, S. and Agassi, J., 2016, “Introduction”, in S. Gattei and J. Agassi (eds.) Paul K. Feyerabend. Physics and Philosophy. Philosophical Papers Volume 4. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. x–xxix.
  • Harwood, J., 1986, “Fleck and the Sociology of Knowledge”, Social Studies of Science, 16: 173–187.
  • Hoyningen-Huene, P., 1990, “Kuhn’s Conception of Incommensurability”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science, 21: 481–492.
  • –––, 1992, “The Interrelations Between the Philosophy, History, and Sociology of Science in Thomas Kuhn’s Theory of Scientific Development”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 42: 487–501.
  • –––, 1993, Reconstructing Scientific Revolutions. The Philosophy of Science of Thomas S. Kuhn, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • –––, 2004, “Three Biographies: Kuhn, Feyerabend and Incommensurability”, in R. Harris (ed.) Rhetoric and Incommensurability, West Lafayette, IN: Parlor Press, pp. 150–175.
  • –––, 2008, “Thomas Kuhn and the Chemical Revolution”, Foundations of Chemistry, 10: 101–115.
  • –––, 2021, “The Genealogy of Kuhn’s Metaphysics”, in K. B. Wray (ed.), Interpreting Kuhn, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 9–26
  • –––, 2022, “Is Kuhn’s ‘world change through revolutions’ comprehensible?”, Epistemology and Philosophy of Science, 59(4): 55–72
  • –––, 2023, “The Plausibility of Kuhn’s Metaphysics”, in P. Melogno, H. Miguel, and L. Giri (eds.), Perspectives on Kuhn: Contemporary Approaches to the Philosophy of Thomas Kuhn, Springer, pp. 139–154.
  • Horwich, P. (ed.) 1993, World Changes: Thomas Kuhn and the Nature of Science, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Köhler, W., 1938 [1920], “Physical Gestalten”, in W. Ellis (ed.), A Source Book of Gestalt Psychology, London: Kegan Paul, Trench, Trubner, and Co., pp. 17–54.
  • Kuhn, T., 1957, The Copernican Revolution, John Hopkins University Press.
  • –––, 1962, The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, Chicago: University of Chicago Press. [Page references are to the second enlarged edition with new “Postscript—1969” published 1970, and unchanged in the third edition published 1996.]
  • –––, 1970, “Postscript—1969”, in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, Chicago: University of Chicago Press: 174–210.
  • –––, 1977, The Essential Tension, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • –––, 2000 [1970], “Reflections on My Critics”, in J. Conant and J. Haugeland (ed.), The Road Since Structure, Chicago: University of Chicago Press: 123–175.
  • –––, 2000 [1981], “What Are Scientific Revolutions?”, in Kuhn 2000, 13–32.
  • –––, 2000 [1983], “Rationality and Theory Choice”, in in Kuhn 2000, 208–215.
  • –––, 2000 [1989], “Possible Worlds in History of Science”, in Kuhn 2000, 58–89.
  • –––, 2000 [1991], “The Road since Structure”, in Kuhn 2000, 90–104.
  • –––, 2000 [1993], “Afterwords”, in Kuhn 2000, 224–252.
  • –––, 2000 [1995], “A Discussion with Thomas S. Kuhn”, in Kuhn 2000, 255–323.
  • –––, 2000, The Road Since Structure, J. Conant and J. Haugeland (eds.), Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Lipton, P., 2001, “Kant on Wheels”, London Review of Books, 23: 30–31.
  • Melogno, P., 2023, “Kuhn’s ‘The Natures of Conceptual Change’: the search for a theory of meaning and the birth of taxonomies (1980–1994)”, International Studies in the Philosophy of Science, 36: 87–103.
  • Mladenovic, B., 2022, The Last Writings of Thomas S. Kuhn: Incommensurability in Science, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Moreno, L. F. 2009, “Incommensurability: Between Reference Change and Untranslatability”, in G. Recio and J. Luis (ed.), Philosophical Essays on Physics and Biology, Hildesheim: G. Olms.
  • Oberheim, E., 2006, Feyerabend’s Philosophy, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • –––, 2016, “Rediscovering Einstein’s legacy. How Einstein anticipates Kuhn and Feyerabend on the nature of science”, Studies in the History and Philosophy of Science, 57: 17–26.
  • –––, 2024, “The Limited Validity of Falsificationism. Feyerabend’s theoretical pluralism and its relation to Popper, Wittgenstein, and Bohm”, Philosophical Aspects of Origin
  • Oberheim, E. and Hoyningen-Huene, P., 1997, “Incommensurability, Realism and Meta-Incommensurability”, Theoria, 12: 447–465.
  • Peine, A., 2011, “Challenging Incommensurability: What We Can Learn From Ludwik Fleck for the Analysis of Configurational Innovation”, Minerva, 49(4): 489–508.
  • Pinto de Oliveira, J.C., 2017, “Thomas Kuhn, the Image of Science and the Image of Art: The First Manuscript of Structure”, Perspectives on Science, 25: 746–765.
  • Preston, J., Munévar, G. and Lamb, D. (ed.), 2000, The Worst Enemy of Science? Essays in Memory of Paul Feyerabend, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Psillos, S., 2008, “Carnap and Incommensurability”, Philosophical Inquiry, 30: 135–156.
  • Sankey, H., 1993, “Kuhn’s Changing Concept of Incommensurability”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 44: 759–774.
  • –––, 1994, The Incommensurability Thesis, London: Ashgate.
  • –––, 1997, “Taxonomic Incommensurability”, in H. Sankey (ed.), Rationality, Relativism and Incommensurability, London: Ashgate, pp. 66–80.
  • –––, 2009, “Scientific Realism and the Semantic Incommensurability Thesis”, Studies in the History and Philosophy of Science, 40(2): 196–202.
  • Sankey, H. and Hoyningen-Huene, P., 2001, “Introduction”, in P. Hoyningen-Huene and H. Sankey (ed.), Incommensurability and Related Matters, Dordrecht: Kluwer: vii–xxxiv.
  • Schilpp, P. (ed.), 1949, Albert Einstein: Philosopher –Scientist. La Salle: Open Court.
  • Soler, L., Sankey, H. and Hoyningen-Huene, P. (eds.), 2008, Rethinking Scientific Change and Theory Comparison, Berlin: Springer.
  • Stillwaggon Swan, L. and Bruce, M., 2011, “Kuhn’s Incommensurability Arguments”, in M. Bruce and S. Barbone (ed.), Just the Arguments: 100 of the Most Important Arguments in Western Philosophy, Wiley–Blackwell.
  • Tambolo, L., 2015, “A tale of three theories: Feyerabend and Popper on progress and the aim of science”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science, 51: 33–41.
  • Theocharis, T., and Psimopoulos, M., 1987, “Where science has gone wrong”, Nature, 329: 595–598.
  • Wolf, M., 2007, “Reference and Incommensurability: What Rigid Designation Won’t Get You”, Acta Analytica, 22(3): 207–222.

Other Internet Resources

Copyright © 2024 by
Eric Oberheim <>
Paul Hoyningen-Huene <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free