Scientific Reduction

First published Tue Apr 8, 2014; substantive revision Wed Mar 6, 2024

The English verb ‘reduce’ derives from the Latin ‘reducere’, whose literal meaning ‘to bring back’, informs its metaphorical use in philosophy. If one asserts that the mental reduces to the physical, that heat reduces to kinetic molecular energy, or that one theory reduces to another theory, one implies that in some relevant sense the reduced theory can be brought back to the reducing theory, the mental can be brought back to the physical, or heat can be brought back to molecular kinetic energy. The term ‘reduction’ as used in philosophy expresses the idea that if an entity \(x\) reduces to an entity \(y\) then \(y\) is in a sense prior to \(x\), or is more basic than \(x\), or is more fundamental than \(x\). This is a necessary, not a sufficient condition for reduction. One may accept that some physiological state is more fundamental than, or prior to some mental state, like a pain experience, but deny that this mental state is reducible.

J.J.C. Smart provided an influential, tentative description of the reduction relation according to which an entity \(x\) reduces to an entity \(y\) only if \(x\) does not exist ‘over and above’ \(y\) (Smart 1959: 143). Smart frames the question as one of existence, an ontological question: What really exists? How many basic kinds of things exist? Approaching the issue from a different slant, the philosophical notion of ‘reduction’ can be cashed out in terms of an explanatory relation. If \(x\) reduces to \(y\), then it can in a relevantly strong sense be explained in terms of \(y\). Take an example from Ernest Nagel. Describing the reduction of headaches, he writes that when

the detailed physical, chemical, and physiological conditions for the occurrence of headaches are ascertained … an explanation will have been found for the occurrence of headaches (Nagel 1961: 366)

Alternatively, reductions can be conceived of as consisting in a specific form of assimilation—a description that can also be found in Nagel (1961):

[In a reduction, a] set of distinctive traits of some subject matter is assimilated to what is patently a set of quite dissimilar traits. (Nagel 1961: 339f.)

Reductivists are generally realists about the reduced phenomena and their views are in that respect conservative. They are committed to the reality of the reducing base and thus to the reality of whatever reduces to that base. If thoughts reduce to brain states and if these brain states are real, then so too are thoughts. Though conservative realism is the norm, some reductionists take a more anti-realist view. In such cases the reducing phenomena are taken to replace the prior phenomena which are in turn eliminated. The idea of mental illness as a type of psycho-neural disorder replaced the idea of demon possession. Demons and their voices have no role or reality in the new theory. The oxygen theory of combustion replaced the phlogiston theory and phlogiston was eliminated.

Whether to count such eliminativist views as a variety of reduction is a matter of terminological choice. Replacement has sometimes been classed as a form of reduction (Kemeny & Oppenheim 1956), and it corresponds to an everyday sense in which theories are described as ‘reductive’. There is clearly a reductive aspect to the eliminativist’s claim that nothing is real other than the replacing phenomena, e.g., that when it comes to mental phenomena, there is nothing real other than brain states. Nonetheless most reductive views are realist, so ‘reduction’ hereafter should be understood in the conservative sense that entails the realism of the reduced phenomena unless otherwise noted.

Though the term ‘reduction’ in this use may not correspond to everyday use nor to its use in scientific discourse, its technical meaning is not fixed by mere stipulation. ‘Reduction’ is a term of ordinary language, and, building upon its common metaphoric meaning philosophers use it to designate relations of particular philosophical importance in a number of closely related fields, especially in the philosophy of science, the philosophy of mind, and metaphysics. To make this idea more precise, it has been suggested, from a metaphysical perspective, that reduction is linked to constitution, identity, supervenience, or ground. From a philosophy of science perspective, ontic reduction talk has sometimes been regarded with suspicion. Here, reduction is often reconstructed as an inter-theory relation.

Different accounts of scientific reduction have shaped debates about diverse topics including scientific unification, the relation between (folk-)psychology and neuroscience, the metaphysics of the mind, the status of biology vis à vis chemistry, and the relation between allegedly teleological explanations and causal explanations. Understanding the relevant notions is thus a prerequisite for understanding key issues in contemporary analytic philosophy. Moreover, the notion of reduction itself has become a target of recent philosophical discussion, especially in the philosophy of science and in metaphysics.

1. Historical background

Conflicts between reductionist views and their monist, dualist and pluralist metaphysical rivals have loomed large in the history of philosophy. The classical debate between materialism and mind-body dualism is the most familiar of many such disputes. The Cartesian dualist is committed to distinct types of substances (minds and bodies) each with its own essence. Different versions of dualism—interactive, epiphenomenal, parallelist – disagree about whether the two causally interact, but they all assert the ontological difference between the mind and the body. Neither reduces to the other. They are distinct, and both are real. In contrast to dualism, reductionism, thus construed, is a form of monism. Reductive physicalists are monists in that they accept only physical entities, properties or states. But not all monists are reductionists. Unlike reductionism, neutral monism does not privilege mind or matter.

Most contemporary reductionists and eliminativists are committed to materialism or physicalism—the view that the physical or material provides the fundamental reductive base. However reductionism per se is ontologically neutral, it does not entail any specific ontological positions. Indeed reductionism could be true in a nonphysical world as long as this world had some base and everything in that world reduced to that base. Some historical reductivists have been resolutely opposed to materialism and physicalism. According to Bishop Berkeley’s phenomenal idealism things like ordinary tables and chairs reduce to collections of ideas; he denied the existence of matter. On Berkeley’s reductive view everything real reduces to minds and ideas. Idealism, as proposed by Fichte (cf. Lachs 1972) can also be given a reductive interpretation. On this view, the non-mental does not exist over and above the mental. The non-mental can be fully explained in terms of the mental (in the case of Fichte: the self), and it can be ultimately assimilated to the mental. According to this interpretation, everything is ultimately mental. Idealists are reductionists whose reductive base is mental.

Idealism does not have many contemporary supporters, but there are current reductive theories that are logically independent of physicalism though consistent with it. Nominalism, for example, can be regarded as a reductive theory about kinds. The nominalist argues that the supposed reality of abstract objects—whether properties and kinds or numbers and sets—can be reduced to facts about concrete objects and our ways of talking about them. French structuralists can be seen as reductionists about subjects, or subjectivism; they suggest that the functioning of individual intentions and goals reduces to the inner workings of larger discourses. And perhaps, some forms of panpsychism, which take complex objects (or concepts of such objects) to reduce to fundamental objects (or concepts of such objects), are similar to idealism in that they postulate mental properties, objects or concepts to be fundamental (cf. Chalmers 2020 for a discussion of the relation between panpsychism and idealism). 

In sum, though most contemporary reductionists are also physicalists, there are many actual reductionist positions that are independent of materialism and physicalism. Such positions have played an important role in the history of philosophy, and some are actively supported today even as forms of scientific reduction.

Modern debates about reduction have several sources. They go back to the early years of logical empiricism. Neurath (1931) and Carnap (1934) described reduction as a relation of translation, or at least of unification of all knowledge within one common language. This unificationist program was endorsed due to general semantic, epistemic and logical considerations. Philosophers of science have proposed several explications of the notion of reduction, often with an eye on broader conceptions not only of unification, but also of explanation and scientific change. Today, it is widely acknowledged that general scientific unification by reduction is not something we can hope for in the near future. Perhaps, though straightforward reductions are rare, reductionism might still play a role as a regulative ideal (Schaffner 1993); the notion of reduction can, on this view, be used to characterize one extreme of a spectrum of possible relations between different stages of scientific developments. It comes with a specific normative power: If a reduction can be effected, it should be effected.

Materialist explications of and arguments for reduction differ. Philosophers of mind concerned with specific questions about whether the mental just is physiological or even physical in nature have asked what notions of reduction might be relevant and how they might apply to particular cases in psychology and neuroscience. They have tried to defend the view that ultimately, we will be in a position to explain mental facts in terms of physiological facts. Smart (1959) argued that we should endorse a form of reductionism about the mental:

because of Ockham’s razor. It seems to me that science is increasingly giving us a viewpoint whereby organisms are able to be seen as physicochemical mechanisms. (Smart 1959, 142)

This view became highly influential in the second half of the 20th century, due to considerations about artificial intelligence and progress made in the neurosciences. Materialist critics of reductionism (non-reductive physicalists) have argued that the classifications, properties, or kinds of the mind-sciences (and perhaps other special sciences) cannot successfully be reduced, although all actual occurrences or tokens of these kinds are identical to material objects, or events involving material objects and processes only.

The philosophy of science strand is the topic of section 2, and the philosophy of mind debate is discussed in section 3.

More recently, philosophers of science have adopted a different approach entirely, discussing reduction and related topics – in particular: emergence – from a more science-oriented perspective. This difference in perspective raises subtle questions about topic identity, that is: whether the topic of reduction remains the same across these debates. We will return to a more science-oriented perspective and its implications in the final section 6. Until then, we will neglect this difference even when presenting positions that have been inspired by a science-oriented perspective.

2. Models of scientific reduction in the philosophy of science

The philosophical discussion of reduction-relations in the sciences was inspired by cases such as the alleged reduction of Newtonian mechanics to relativity theory, of chemistry to atomic physics, and of gas laws to statistical mechanics. However, in what respects these actual episodes of theory change count as reductions is a complex matter. Many factors might be relevant, not merely logical and metaphysical relations but also epistemic, psychological, and pragmatic ones. Questions also arose about the generalizability of these cases and their role in scientific progress or change, which led to the idea that an appropriate model of reduction should mainly focus on cases of actual theory succession. The main target in the reduction debate within the philosophy of science, however, was not a reconstruction of the process of scientific change, but rather an explication of the relation between successive theories that justified the relevant change, i.e., relations alleged to hold between pairs of theories such as Newtonian mechanics and relativity theory, or thermodynamics and statistical mechanics. In this context, the relata of reductions were conceived of as theories or models, rather than properties, events, or kinds. Thus, they are often referred to as ‘theory reductions’.

2.1 Reduction and theory-succession

The term ‘reduction’ oscillates between two different uses (at least). Kemeny and Oppenheim (1956) regard the idea that reductions somehow relate to scientific progress as being crucial for understanding reduction. According to this use of the term, reduction is a relation of actual theory-succession, such that reductions happen at a certain time, namely, when scientists reduce one theory to another. Trivially, whether or not a theory actually becomes the successor of another theory will depend not only on logical and metaphysical features of the respective theories, but also on pragmatic and epistemic aspects. The most relevant of these aspects are to be captured in a rational reconstruction, which plays a major role in some models of reduction.

When discussing the status of bridge-principles (intuitively, statements that connect the vocabulary of the reducing theory to the reduced theory), Ernest Nagel suggested that they might play different roles in the discovery of reductions than in after the fact analyses. They may function as hypotheses to be tested, or they may rely on empirical evidence already gathered. Similarly, Kenneth Schaffner suggests that an appropriate model of reduction should take into account not only logical or metaphysical aspects regarding the reduced and the reducing theory. Rather, it should also be sensitive to pragmatic and epistemic aspects underlying the actions of scientists who carry out reductions (Schaffner 1993: 515f.)—an idea he labels ‘logical pragmatism’. New Wave reductionists criticized other models, especially Nagel’s, for not being sensitive to how reductions are actually carried out, a point also made by Ager, Aronson, and Weingard (1974).

The distinction between reduction as an activity and reduction as a relation that is independent of what scientists actually do is tentatively captured by the distinction between diachronic and synchronic reduction.

The main idea of diachronic reduction is not merely that reduction is a temporal affair but that reductions consist in the replacement of one theory by another theory, such that one theory (the reducing one) becomes the successor of the reduced theory (Dupré 1993; Rosenberg 2006). It is also often described as a sort of theory-improvement or scientific progress: particularly one in which the laws of the prior theory apply to a proper subset of the cases covered by the laws of the succeeding theory (Dizadji Bahmani et al. 2010). Here, the focus is on epistemic progress. Hence, this form of reduction has been described as “epistemological reduction” (Scerri & McIntyre 1997; Esfeld & Sachse 2010).

The notion of reduction as a scientific activity, or as an event of scientific change, is discussed in the entries scientific revolutions and scientific progress. The remainder of this entry will deal with “synchronic” aspects of reduction.

2.2 Nagelian models of reduction

Recent reduction debates in the philosophy of science were initiated by Ernest Nagel’s model of theory reduction (Nagel 1949, 1961, 1970), which has also received considerable attention in the philosophy of mind (see, e.g., Fodor 1981: 150; Kim 1993: 150, 248). More recent approaches to reduction depart from or were developed in opposition to the Nagel model (Hooker 1981; Churchland 1985; Schaffner 1993; Bickle 1998, 2003; Dizadji-Bahmani, Frigg, & Hartmann 2010; van Riel 2014), though it has been argued that most of these approaches merely echo the Nagel model instead of proposing fundamentally new interpretations (Endicott 1998, 2001; Dizadji Bahmani et al. 2010).

2.2.1 Nagel’s model

Nagel describes his model as follows:

A reduction is effected when the experimental laws of the secondary science (and if it has an adequate theory, its theory as well) are shown to be the logical consequences of the theoretical assumptions (inclusive of the coordinating definitions) of the primary science. (Nagel 1961: 352)

The basic idea is simple: Reduction is (i) a kind of explanation relation, which (ii) holds between two theories if and only if (iii) one of these theories is derivable from the other, (iv) with the help of bridge laws (or “coordinating definitions”). The basic model covers two sorts of reduction, one in which bridge laws are not required (homogeneous cases) and one in which they are (for a presentation of homogeneous cases of reductions and the question of whether or not alleged cases of reductions really should count as reductions in the Nagelian sense, see the entry on intertheory relations in physics). Importantly, Nagel added several “non-formal” conditions on interesting reductions (1961: chap. 11, Sec. III). For example, theories and bridge-laws should be well established rather than arbitrarily chosen, and the reducing theory “must also be fertile in usable suggestions for developing the secondary science … and augment or correct its currently accepted body of laws.” (Nagel 1961: 360) Putnam (1965: 206ff., esp. n. 3), Nagel (1970: 120–21, 133), Schaffner (1993: chapter 9) and Endicott (1998) have argued that augmentation and correction can be achieved by approximation and introduction of boundary conditions for bridge-laws.

2.2.2 Direct and indirect reduction

The Nagel model of reduction parallels the so called “deductive nomological model” (DN-model) of explanation according to which explaining some fact involves showing how its truth can be deduced from a set of other truths containing at least some laws. For example according to the DN model, one explains the acceleration of a falling body by showing how it can be deduced from Newton’s laws and statements describing initial conditions. The Nagel model of reduction thus seems to suggest that a reduced theory is directly explained by the corresponding reducing theory.

In this sense, Nagel reduction is sometimes (cf. Schaffner 1967: 137, 1993: 423) interpreted as a kind of direct reduction, in contrast with indirect reductions—those that hold in virtue of the fact that the reducing theory explains the occurrence of the phenomena of the reduced theory (rather than the reduced theory itself)—a view associated with Kemeny and Oppenheim (1956) and Friedman (1982), and captured as one variant of reduction by Schaffner’s model (Schaffner 1993).

However, some have argued that the distinction itself may not be viable (van Riel 2011). The examples Nagel discusses suggest that he believed his model to be indirect—an “explanation” of a theory in terms of derivation from a reducing theory amounts to using the reducing theory to explain the phenomena dealt with by the reduced theory. This should not come as a surprise: if the laws of the reducing theory explain the laws of the reduced theory (that is: why what these laws state is the case or approximately the case), and if the latter explain some set of phenomena, then by the transitivity of explanation, the former will explain this set of phenomena, too. But see Sarkar (2015) for a different view.

2.2.3 Bridge principles

Nagel’s major (and perhaps most controversial) contribution was the introduction of bridge principles. The notion of bridge principles, (also: ‘bridge laws’ and ‘coordinating definitions’) can be spelled out in several different ways. The most common way in accord with Nagel (1961: chap. 11, Sec. II.3) is to describe them syntactically as bi-conditionals linking terms in the vocabularies of the two theories. In the same context, however, Nagel describes them in terms of the ‘nature of the linkages postulated’ (Nagel 1961: 354). He distinguishes three such linkages:

  • The links mimicked by the bridge laws are ‘logical connections’ (1961: 354), which are understood as meaning connections.
  • The links postulated by bridge laws are conventions or stipulations (‘deliberate fiat’; 1961: 354).
  • The links postulated by bridge laws are ‘factual or material’ (1961: 354); that is, bridge laws state empirical facts (these truths are then described as empirical hypotheses).

There is a gap between having the form of a bi-conditional and postulating or mimicking a logical connection etc. Accordingly, the exact nature of bridge-laws in Nagel’s account is a matter of dispute. Some tend to suggest weaker notions, such as (nomologically necessary) co-instantiation or co-relation (Dizadji Bahmani et al. 2010, also discussed in Klein 2009 and Kim 1998: 90, 2008), whereas others suggest stronger interpretations in terms of nomic conections or identities (Sklar 1967; Schaffner 1993; Esfeld & Sachse 2007; van Riel 2011).

In Nagel 1970, he explicitly states that bridge-laws state identities of the properties signified by the relevant predicates or nomic relations among extensions. If bridge laws should thus be conceived of as stating identities or relations among the relevant terms’ extensions, then clearly reduction on such a view incorporates essential reference to the theories’ ontologies and is more than just a two-place relation holding among theories:

In … cases [of reduction in which the vocabularies of the two relata of the reduction relation differ], the distinctive traits that are the subject matter of the [reduced] science fall into the province of a theory that may have been initially designed for handling qualitatively different materials…. The [reducing] science thus seems to wipe out familiar distinctions as spurious, and appears to maintain that what are prima facie indisputably different traits of things are really identical. (Nagel 1961: 340)

Thus, Nagel-reduction is a relation that holds not just between theories but also between their ontologies. Sometimes, however, the Nagel model has been characterized as an epistemological model of reduction, because it is a model of theory-reduction (Sarkar 1992; Hoyningen-Huene 1989; Silberstein 2002), because it is a model of explanatory reduction (Sarkar 1992), or because bridge-laws are to be interpreted epistemologically (Fazekas 2009, following Klein 2009). One reason is that Nagel was not “sympathetic to a theory-independent realism about entities” (Sarkar 2015, 48).

Ideas similar to those of Nagel have been pursued, amongst others, by Robert Causey and Lawrence Sklar (Sklar 1967). Causey’s model of microreductions suggests that reductions are based in cross-theoretic identities and are, in a sense, decompositional (Causey 1972a,b). Kenneth Schaffner explicitly built upon Nagel’s model, extending it especially to cover cases of correction and replacement.

2.3 Problems for Nagelian models of reduction

Many criticisms have been raised against both the original Nagel model and its variants. The original Nagel model was faulted as too narrow because it allows only for theory reduction (Wimsatt 1972; Hull 1976; Darden & Maull 1977: 43; Sarkar 1992), whereas an appropriate model would cover cases of reduction of mere models and the like—sciences like biology and neuroscience should be regarded as being possible candidates for reduction, although they do not contain full-fledged theories (see also the entry on reductionism in biology; for a discussion of this and the following criticisms, see van Riel 2011).

In a more general sense, the Nagel model has been criticized as exemplifying all the shortcomings of the orthodox view on science. For example, it conceives of theories as syntactic entities, and it views reduction as explanation cashed out in terms of the DN model (Hempel & Oppenheim 1948), which has itself been challenged on many grounds, especially those regarding the asymmetry of explanation (for an overview that focuses on problems arising from reduction as explanation, see Craver (2007: chap. 2), and for problems concerning the DN model, see Salmon 1989).

The Nagel model describes reduction in terms of direct theory explanation, whereas an appropriate model of reduction should shape the notion in terms of indirect theory explanation, that is, in terms of explanation of the phenomena of a theory (Kemeny & Oppenheim 1956; Schaffner 1967; Friedman 1982).

Three formal worries of the Nagel model merit mention: if reduction is derivation plus (sometimes) bridge laws, then any theory would reduce to itself (because any theory is derivable from itself); moreover, any theory would reduce to any inconsistent theory; and contrary to what one might expect, reduction would not turn out to be an asymmetric relation—derivability does not entail asymmetry.

Feyerabend (1962, 1966), Churchland (1986), Schaffner (1993), and Bickle (1998), amongst others, have argued that Nagel’s model allows neither for correction in the reducing theory nor for replacement, and that, therefore, it is fundamentally misguided—which is based on a misrepresentation of Nagel (see above).

Finally, Nagel’s model has been criticized for the role it attributes to bridge-laws. New Wave reductionists in particular have argued that bridge-laws do not play the role they are supposed to play in discovering reduction-relations. Contrary to Nagel, we do not use bridge-laws when discovering for example that parts of chemistry reduce to atomic physics. Rather, we infer bridge-laws from the discovery of relevant similarities between the two theories (for the explanatory role of bridge-laws and identity statements, see also Marras (2005: 351) and Block & Stalnaker (1999: 28)).

In response to those critiques, some, like Schaffner and Dizadji-Bahmani et al. (2010) and Butterfield (2011a&b) have developed variants of the Nagel model that retain its spirit but avoid many of the problems faced by the original. Prominent suggestions concern refinements of the logical framework in which Nagelian reduction is described (Dizadji-Bahmani, Frigg, and Hartmann (2010) and Butterfield (2011a)) as well as a relaxation of the condition that reductions must be complete. Partial reductions are conceived of as “largely completed reductions containing exceptions or failures of attempted reductions” (Schaffner 2012: 563). An interpretation of partial reductions for sciences such as biology has been developed in Schaffner (2006) and further developed by Winther (2009).

Others have rejected the Nagel model and used different frameworks to account for reduction. The most relevant alternatives will be discussed in the next sections.

2.4 Structuralist models of reduction

One alleged problem of Nagelian models is that they start from a mistaken background view of science in that they conceive of theories as syntactic objects and rely on dubious notions about the nature of laws and theoretical terms. Structuralists tried to overcome these alleged problems (as well as others, such as the problem of incommensurability) by revising the notion of a theory.

Part of the classical structuralist program consists in the idea that philosophy of science, properly construed, pursues an ideal of rational reconstruction of science (cf. Stegmüller 1979; Balzer 1984: 331), which is to be understood as a reconstruction of actual scientific developments. Since it is common knowledge that cases of straightforward reductions are rare, if they exist at all, structuralists focused primarily on cases of mere replacement or on similarities between theories, which are cashed out in terms of approximation or (semantic counterparts of) derivation under ideal conditions (Moulines 1984; Scheibe 1999; Stegmüller 1979 & 1986: ch. 4).

According to the structuralist picture (Sneed 1971; further developed in: Stegmüller 1979), to give an account of a theory \(T\) is to define the predicate ‘_is a (model of) \(T\)’ in set-theoretical terms. A theory basically consists of a set \(M\), a set of potential models \(MP\), a set of potential partial models MPP and a set of intended applications \(I\), which is supposed to be “open”, or non-extensionally individuated. The relation between the different variants or stages of \(I\) is, as Stegmüller suggests, best thought of as being pragmatically fixed (Stegmüller 1979). It is worth noting that structuralists believe their models of reduction to be advantageous because they believed their concept of a theory to be more appropriate. The general status of structuralism is an important factor in assessing the problems these models of reduction seem to face.

2.5 Problems for structuralist models of reduction

Schaffner has argued that the structuralist notion of reduction is too weak a notion to be useful, and that (official) Nagelian reduction is a special case of paradigmatic structuralist models (for instance: Suppes 1967). Moreover, according to Schaffner, structuralist models cover cases that should not be covered, namely, arbitrary reductions (Schaffner 1967). The basic problem of these accounts has been described by Moulines (1984: 55) and a similar idea can be found in Hoering (1984). Moulines puts it as follows:

There is at least one further aspect of reduction that is overlooked by [the structuralist conception]. This is what I would like to call “the ontological aspect”. … [O]ne has to take into account some sort of relation between the respective domains. Otherwise … all we have is an ad hoc mathematical relationship between two sets of structures, perhaps by chance having the mathematical properties we require of reduction but not really telling something about “the world”. (Moulines 1984: 55)

This is a problem Nagelian models do not face if they describe bridge-laws in semantic terms, i.e., in terms of extensional or intensional relations among the relevant predicates or kind terms.

2.6 “New Wave”-models of reduction

New Wave reductionists take it that their models give an appropriate reconstruction of a specific kind of scientific development (Churchland 1986: 279ff.; Bickle 1998: chapter 1). At the same time, however, this movement is associated with a reductionist metaphysical position. Arguing that neuroscience reduces or eliminates psychology, some protagonists try to show that we should embrace an eliminative form of reductionism about the mind (e.g., Paul Churchland 1981, 1985; Patricia Churchland 1986; Bickle 1998). The so called New Wave model (or better: a family of similar models), which was developed in a series of articles and books by Clifford Hooker (1981), Paul Churchland (1979, 1985) and more recently John Bickle (esp. 1998), builds on some aspects of Schaffner’s current model (1993) and its original version (Schaffner 1967). Here is a formulation of Hooker’s definition:

Within \(T_B\) construct an analog, \(T^*_R\), of \(T_R\) under certain conditions \(C_R\) such that \(T_B\) and \(C_R\) entail \(T^*_R\) and argue that the analog relation, \(AR\), between \(T^*_R\) and \(T_R\) warrants claiming (some kind of) reduction relation, \(R\), between \(T_R\) and \(T_B\). Thus \((T_B \amp C_R \rightarrow T^*_R)\) and \((T^*_R \ AR\ T_R)\) warrants \((T_B \ R\ T_R)\). (Hooker 1981: 49)

The conditions, \(C_R\), will consist of limiting assumptions and boundary conditions that guarantee that if \(T_B\) is more comprehensive than TR, the application of elements of \(T_B\)’s vocabulary is restricted to the domain relevant for \(T_R\). Ronald Endicott (1998: 56) identifies four core aspects of New Wave reduction: (i) “New Wave construction”: the corrected version of the reduced theory is constructed within the vocabulary of the reducing theory; (ii) “New Wave deduction”: this corrected version is deduced from the reducing theory; (iii) “New Wave relation”: analogical relations play the role bridge-laws play within Nagelian models; (iv) “New Wave continuum”: these analogical relations may differ in degree of strength—reductions based on strong analogical relations justify a conservative stand towards the (ontology of) the reduced science, whereas reductions based on weak analogical relations justify elimination. Identity (a limiting case for the continuum), for example, ensures that the ontology of the reduced theory is preserved by the reducing theory.

According to Bickle (1998: 29 & 1992: 224) and Paul Churchland (1985: 11), avoiding reference to bridge-principles has a great epistemological advantage: The epistemological virtue of reduction does not depend upon knowledge of bridge-principles. Rather, comparison of reduced and reducing theories justifies identity claims.

New Wave reductionists typically allow for a great variety of relations backing up the analogical relation established between \(T_R\) and \(T^*_R\). Reduction is associated with a space of theory-relations ranging from “perfectly smooth” or “retentive” reductions to “bumpy” reductions, which are best understood as mere replacements (Bickle 1992: 223; Hooker 1981: 45). Bickle describes smooth reductions as follows: (‘\(I_N\)’ designates the derived image and ‘\(T_O\)’ designates the reduced or the “old” theory):

In cases lying at or near the retentive endpoint, the \(I_N\) is the exactly equipotent isomorphic image of the \(T_O\), and no counterfactual limiting assumptions or boundary conditions are required for the derivation of \(I_N\). (Bickle 1992: 223)

In this case, the pairing of the terms corresponds to identity of referents (Bickle 1992: 224) and \(I_N\) can be directly obtained from \(T_R\) (the reducing theory), whereas in cases on the opposite point of the spectrum, pairing is achieved only by reference to counterfactual limiting assumptions and boundary conditions. In this case, ontology is eliminated, as in the reduction of phlogiston-theory case.

2.7 Problems for “New Wave”-models of reduction

The main criticism raised against New Wave reductionism has been that it either misses the target of reduction, or that it is not new at all. Ronald Endicott argues that New Wave reductionists fail to recognize the important distinction between mere replacements on the one hand (that correspond to eliminativism, rather than reductionism), and proper reductions on the other (Endicott 1998, 2001). Insofar as New Wave reductionists conceive of reduction in terms of replacement, they just miss the target. If they conceive of reduction in terms of smooth reductions, then, basically, they repeat the Nagelian model in new dress (see also Dizadji Bahmani et al. (2010).

2.8 Reduction and mechanisms

The recent debate on mechanistic explanation took its point of departure in reflections on sciences other than physics. Most proponents of a mechanistic turn in the philosophy of explanation oppose a number of mainstream interpretations of core notions in the philosophy of science, especially that of a scientific explanation, a law, the layer-cake model of a hierarchy of sciences (Wimsatt 1976), and the notion of a theory. Most often, mechanistic explanation is characterized as (i) being related to the use of ‘by’ rather than ‘because’ (Craver 2007), (ii) being such that the functioning of a complex entity is explained in terms of the coordinated activation of its constituents, (iii) by being tied to a hierarchical order of local mechanisms, whose constituents can themselves become the target of a mechanistic explanation, and (iv) by the relevance of the notion of organization—mechanisms are organized to do something. This is how Craver puts it:

Mechanistic explanations are constitutive or componential explanations: they explain the behavior of the mechanism as a whole in terms of the organized activities and interactions of its components. (Craver 2007: 128)

A number of aspects concerning the relation between reduction and mechanistic explanation are dealt with in the entry on reductionism in biology. Thus, suffice it to say that some philosophers, like Craver, reject a reductionist interpretation of mechanistic explanation (Craver 2007), whereas others seem to suggest that a conservative form of reductionism may be compatible with mechanistic explanation (Bechtel 2007 and, especially, Schaffner 2006). Interestingly, the example of the reduction of headaches as described by Nagel (see above, Section 1) seems to suggest that he conceives of reductive explanation as mechanistic explanation. This is consonant with his first publication on reduction: In his early paper on reduction (Nagel 1935), he describes reduction as a constitution relation. Van Riel (2014) suggests that reductive explanation is a cognate of mechanistic explanation. We will return to a similar idea developed by Endicott (2022) when discussing functional reduction.

3. Models of scientific reduction in the philosophy of mind

Reductionist positions have gained attention within the philosophy of mind in four main respects. Firstly, type-identity theory was proposed as a reductionist position about the mind. Secondly, token-identity theories are sometimes conceived of as being reductionist in spirit as well. Thirdly, models of functional reduction have been intensively discussed. And, finally and corresponding to the previous distinctions, there are different conceptions of reduction that are discussed and rejected by non-reductive physicalism.

3.1 Type-identity theories

Type-identity theory claims that for types of some domain \(D_1\), (e.g., psychology) there are types of a domain \(D_2\) (e.g., neuroscience) such that for any member \(x\) of \(D_1\), there is a member \(y\) of \(D_2\) such that \(x=y\). This aspect is revealed in the theory’s name—it is type-identity theory. It is not just the items falling under the types that are said to be identical but also the types themselves; e.g., being a pain is said to be the very same type as being a certain pattern of neural firing. However, just to claim that for any type \(x\) of some domain \(D_1\), there is a type \(y\) of a domain \(D_2\) such that \(x=y\) does not make you a type-identity theorist. Rather, it is a specific reductionist as well as a naturalist stance that accompany these identity-claims that make them proper “type-identity” claims.

The main concern was to defend this position against various counterarguments. The question of what exactly makes this position reductive did not receive considerable attention. Primarily, this theory is a monistic theory; but monism is not identical to reductionism. Herbert Feigl gives the following characterization of type-identity theory when answering the question of “whether the mental and the physical can in some sense be identified”:

[I]t is proper to speak of “identification […]”. Concepts of molar behavior theory like habit strength, expectancy, drive, instinct, memory trace, repression, superego, etc., may yet be identified in a future psychophysiology with specific types of neural-structure-and-process patterns. (Feigl 1967: 77)

This quote suggests a connection between type-identity theories and models of theory-reduction: It suggests that reduction, understood as an inter-theory relation, is closely related to type-identity theory. The idea seems to be this: Within a future psychophysiology, the fact that mental types are identical to physiological types might be revealed, and the nature of mental states will ultimately be given in terms of psychophysiology, rather then in terms of psychology. Similar positions have been held by Place (1956), who primarily speaks of constitution rather than identity, whereas Smart explicitly stated this thesis in terms of identity (Smart 1959).

3.2 Token-identity theories

Type-identity theory was largely, though not completely, abandoned when arguments from multiple realizability were put forward to show that due to the fact that at least some mental kinds can be multiply realized—that is: instantiated in different physiological kinds—an identification of mental with physiological kinds is impossible. Still, this left space for token-identity theories, according to which any mental kind is physically instantiated. The identity is that of the objects or items that are of the two types or that possess the two relevant properties, even though the types or properties themselves are not identical; e.g., one and the same item might have both mental and neural properties. The bearers of those properties, i.e., the items falling under the types, are identical, but the properties or types themselves are distinct. Token-identity theory is still a reductionist position in that it opposes any form of interactionist substance-dualism, substance-parallelism, and substance-epiphenomenalism. Even though it is not a very common term, in the literature, we sometimes find variants of the expression ‘token reduction’ (Cartwright 1999: 32ff.; Hooker 1981: part III; Bickle 1998: 223ff.).

Token-identity theories perfectly match weak interpretations of theory reduction. If for reduction, bridge-laws that state correlations or merely extensional relations are sufficient (Richardson 1979), or if bridge-laws are not laws in any robust sense, (Klein 2009; Dizadji Bahmani et al. 2010) then token-identity may be sufficient for Nagelian theory reduction.

Token-identity theories also match theory-reduction according to Schaffner’s and the New Wave reductionist’s models. Within these models, token-identity theories do not back up strong or perfectly smooth cases of reduction, but they nevertheless support reductions that are stronger than those that are merely extreme cases of replacement, not involving correction in any robust sense.

3.3 Local reductions and disjunctive kinds

Anti-reductionist arguments based on the assumption that mental kinds are multiply realizable have been attacked on at least two different grounds.

Clapp (2001) and Walter (2006) argued that high-level kinds can be legitimately identified with disjunctive kinds. The high-level type is identical to a kind we can refer to by a term consisting of a disjunction of expressions each of which refers to one of the different low-level kinds that realize the high-level kind: \(Hx = (L_1 x\) or \(L_2 x\) or \(\ldots\) or \(L_n x)\). We may be able to specify the relevant term only in principle in cases where the disjunction is infinitely long. This strategy is also pertinent in Dizadji Bahmani et al. 2010.

An alternative strategy suggested by David Lewis (1969, 1972) and developed by Jaegwon Kim argues in favor of local reductions (Kim 1992). High-level kinds are multiply realized in virtue of the fact that different physical kinds play the required role in different organisms, systems or contexts. Thus, if we individuate the high-level kinds in a more fine-grained way, we can save a weaker form of type-identity theory. Even though kind \(K\) might be multiply realized by kinds \(P_1, P_2 , \ldots, P_n\), there are more specific contexts \(C_1, C_2, \ldots, C_n\), such that in each context \(C_i\), only one physical kind \(P_i\) plays the role of \(K\) in that context. Thus we make more local or contextual identifications. For example, pain in general may not be identical with any one neural kind, but we may be able to reductively identify human-pain with one neural kind, lizard-pain with a second neural kind and octopus-pain with a third. The relevant context could be species-specific, individual-specific or even specific for conditions of occurrence within an individual.

This idea was further developed by Brian Loar (1981: ch. 4), Jackson, Pargetter and Prior (1982), and Michael Esfeld and Christian Sachse (Sachse 2007; Esfeld and Sachse 2007). Esfeld and Sachse (2007) and Sachse (2007) describe how this insight can be accommodated within the high-level science by constructing fine-grained versions of the high-level types—so called ‘functional sub-types’—which can then be linked to the relevant low-level kinds, using the resources of high-level science.

3.4 Functional reduction

Functionalism about properties of a given sort is the view that such properties are functional in nature. For example: Functionalism about the mental is the view that mental properties are functional. Intuitively, a functional property is a property whose nature, essence or significance is fully captured by a description of the role it plays within a system. Versions of functionalism can be distinguished with respect to the sort of role they attribute to functional properties and the sorts of resources required to specify those roles. The relevant roles might be specified solely in terms of causal input-output relations. Alternatively, they can be conceived of in terms of relationally defined computational states (computational functionalism), or in terms of goal-directed interactions (teleological functionalism) (cf. Block forthcoming; Lycan 1987; Van Gulick 1980; Sober 1990).

‘Functional reduction’ signifies a family of models which are concerned with the reduction of such causal, computational, or goal-related properties. These models describe reduction as consisting of a relation between a functional property \(P\) and a structural or substrate property \(P^*\) that plays the role determined by the functional property \(P\), or at least does in a restricted class of systems or contexts.

Some functionalists assume that the functional property \(P\) and the property that plays the \(P\)-role, \(P^*\), are identical. On this view (also called ‘filler-’, ‘realizer’ or ‘occupant-functionalism’) a specification of the relevant role—typically obtained by a logical construction (the so called “Ramsey sentence”) from the theory containing a predicate that signifies this property—merely serves as a description to pick out the property that plays the functional role in the actual world. That is, ‘\(P\)’ refers to the underlying property that actually plays the role, namely \(P^*\). Others (so called ‘role-functionalists’) assume that the functional property \(P\) is a “higher order” property; it is simply the property of playing the relevant role and is not to be identified with any given underlying property \(P^*\) that does so. On this view, \(P^*\) merely realizes P; it is not identical with \(P\). Given its denial of property identity, this latter view seems less apt to a reductionist interpretation. However, there may be means by which the higher-order properties might be logically constructed from lower-order ones that count as reductive (Putnam 1970).

Thus functional reduction is primarily concerned with the connection between reduction and the metaphysics of specific properties, namely, functional ones. That is: prima facie, it is compatible (if compatible at all, cf. Block forthcoming) with various definitions of reduction. It can be incorporated within a Nagelian framework (Esfeld and Sachse 2007), and it matches New-Wave reductionist ideas. Occupant-functionalism can be regarded as being compatible even with classical type-identity theory. Thus, models of functional reduction do not give sui-generis models of reduction; rather, they can be regarded as yielding detailed theories about how functional properties behave with respect to reduction. In short, the question addressed under the heading of ‘functional reduction’ is this: How do functional properties fit into a reductionist perspective?

If the following three are true: mental properties are functional in nature, occupant-functionalism is correct, and the role of mental properties is played by physiological properties, then mental properties reduce in a straightforward sense to physiological properties. Alternatively, it has been suggested that even if identification of the functional property with its realizer is not always possible, a reduction of such properties can still be achieved, either by way of local reductions (Kim 1993), by way of the reduction to disjunctive kinds (Clapp 2001; Walter 2006), or by way of the reduction of functional sub-types (Esfeld and Sachse 2007).

Recently Endicott (2022), building on Kim (2005), has argued for what he calls part-based functional reduction. Even in cases of functional reductions where the reduced property is identical to the reducing property, one can and should add decompositional, part-whole explanations. The functional behavior of the reduced property is explained in terms of the properties of constituents of the base property and their properties. So, functional reductions become part of a larger explanatory project, where property identification is complemented by decompositional explanations, referring to part-whole relations.

Others have argued that functionalism best suits non-reductive physicalism in the following sense: It maintains the naturalist’s intuition that there is unity among the underlying property-realizers which are all ultimately physical; hence, token identity theory is true. Nevertheless, it opens the possibility to accommodate the threat of multiple realizability in a particular way: Functional kinds can be multiply realized, and, hence, they can be regarded as being distinct from the lower-level physical properties. Moreover, if a pragmatic dimension is incorporated in the conception of functionalism, functionalism seems to contradict reductionist interpretations; it may be impossible as a matter of practice to specify the relevant roles using only the resources of the lower-level theories (cf. Van Gulick 2010).

Thus, differing models of functionalism and functional reduction might be used to either justify or criticize various forms of reductionism.

4. Definitions of ‘_reduces to_’

As discussed above, the term ’reduction’ can be interpreted in many ways. These rival explications can be distinguished (i) with respect to how they conceive of the relata of the reduction relation, and (ii) with respect to how they conceive of the conditions the relevant relata have to meet in order to instantiate the relation. Often, an epistemic aspect complements these characterizations. This section groups the rival accounts with respect to the objects they offer as candidate relata, and with respect to the links they offer as candidates for the conditions the relata have to meet in order to instantiate the reduction relation. Three remarks are in place:

In what follows, only candidates for the primary relata of the reduction relation are listed; it is the primary relata with respect to which philosophers disagree. The distinction between primary and secondary relata can be explained by way of example: Patricia Churchland holds that

[s]tatements that a phenomenon \(P^R\) reduces to another phenomenon \(P^B\) are derivative upon the more basic claim that the theory that characterizes the first reduces to the theory that characterizes the second. (Churchland 1986: 278)

On this view, the relation signified by the reduction-predicate in its basic, or proper use is instantiated by pairs of theories only. A derivative notion of reduction (and, hence, a deviant use of the predicate) allows for statements of the form ‘\(a\) reduces to \(b\)’ to be true, even if the respective instances of ‘\(a\)’ and ‘\(b\)’ do not designate theories. The truth of this statement then depends upon a corresponding truth about theory-reduction. For example, if water reduces to H\(_2\)O, then on this view it does so only if, and if so: in virtue of the fact that folk-chemistry reduces to chemistry.

On the other side of the spectrum, those who view reduction in terms of real world entities rather than theories would not claim that statements of the form ‘\(a\) reduces to \(b\)’ are always false when the instances of ‘\(a\)’ and ‘\(b\)’ designate theories, and true only when they designate properties, or parts and wholes. Rather, they would hold that claims about theory-reductions are derivative upon claims about property-reductions or that the notion of theory reduction depends upon a notion of property reduction in a more ontological sense. Thus if folk-chemistry reduces to chemistry, it does so because water reduces to H\(_2\)O, and because Iron reduces to Fe, and so on.

Secondly, this way of conceiving of the primary relata of reduction suggests that the reduction-relation is a binary relation. Recall, however, the observation that on Nagel’s account, in heterogenic cases of reduction, no theory reduces to another theory simpliciter; it does so only with respect to certain bridge-laws and/or boundary conditions. Depending on how one counts the arity of a relation, i.e., the number of items it relates, this might suggest that even on the classical interpretation, reduction is not a binary relation. More recently, alternative explications have been suggested according to which reduction is of an arity higher than 2. Thus, the intuitive notion of primary relata should be tied to the designata of the expressions flanking the reduction predicate in true reduction statements.

Finally, talking about candidate relata, we talk about types of objects that possibly function as the relata of an instance of the reduction-relation, rather than these objects themselves.

4.1 Representational and ontological reduction

Many reductionist views seem to involve ontological claims. If one denies classical substance-dualism and advocates a version of reductionism rather than eliminativism for minds, persons and mental state, then one seems to assert that objects or substances reduce to objects. If one rejects any dualistic parallelism of mental and physical events and advocates a version of reductionism rather than eliminativism for events such as perceivings, willings or pain events, then one seems to assert that events may reduce to events. If one denies property-dualism, and advocates a version of reductionism regarding properties such as that of being a person or of being a pain, then one seems to be committed to the assumption that properties reduce to properties. These different candidate-relata share one important feature: They are non-representational in nature (ignoring cases of objects that are used as vehicles for representations); they are real world items, not representations about items in the world. Especially in the philosophy of mind, these candidate relata have received special attention.

In contrast, most classical explications of reduction developed in the philosophy of science treat the reduction relation to be primarily instantiated by representational entities, such as theories or models. Building on these two lines of thought, one can, following Van Gulick (2001), draw a distinction between representational and non-representational relata of the reduction relation, and accordingly between representational and ontological reduction. Representational reduction is reduction cashed out as a relation between representational devices, like theories or concepts; ontological reduction is a relation defined in terms of ontic links between the things theories or concepts are about. Representational reduction is sometimes referred to as “epistemological reduction” (Silberstein 2002, Sarkar 1992, Brigandt and Love 2012, Hoyningen-Huene 1989).

A brief survey of the candidate-relata should thus pair them with the candidate relations that best fit each in turn (Van Gulick 2001).

4.2 Theories

The most prominent candidates are theories. On the classical interpretation, theories are sets of sentences. In Nagel’s spirit:

Theory-Reduction I: \(x\) reduces to \(y\) if and only if \(x\) is a theory & \(y\) is a theory & \(\exists z\), such that \(z\) is a set of bridge-laws & \((y, z \vdash x)\)

Depending on how bridge-laws are characterized (epistemically, semantically, metaphysically, or syntactically), a full-blown characterization of the link might or might not be a purely syntactic affair: If, for example, appropriate bridge-laws state property-identifications, or relations among the predicates’ extensions, then the characterization of the reductive link contains a metaphysical aspect.

On a structuralist interpretation, theories are complex model-structures. Here, mapping-relations play the role derivation is supposed to play on the syntactic interpretation of theories. We thus get (schematically, since the relevant function \(f\) is left unspecified):

Theory-Reduction II: \(x\) reduces to \(y\) if and only if \(x\) is a theory & \(y\) is a theory & \((f_{(y)}=x)\)

The conditions on this function differ according to different accounts; however, the function is characterized solely in structural terms. It is supposed to capture a relevant similarity relation between the respective theories, such as a structural isomorphism (Suppes 1967; Sneed 1971). Moulines’ criticism that this picture of reduction lacks an ontological link to rule out arbitrary reductions (Moulines 1984) reflects the idea that bridge-laws shouldn’t be given a purely structural interpretation.

4.3 Models

The notion of a model is also used more widely outside structuralist interpretations of scientific theories. Given that the common interpretation of classical conceptions of reduction requires the relata to be fully fledged theories, it is not clear how sciences such as biology, psychology, and neuroscience fit into the picture. In these areas, such imperfect, highly idealized or merely approximately correct models dominate theorizing, and often model-descriptions are accompanied by visualizations, which might raise further questions as to the applicability of purely or mainly syntactic notions of reduction (Bechtel & Abrahamsen 2005). Definitions of reduction directed at model-based theorizing are often described in ontological terms: It is the mechanisms, or phenomena captured by the models that allegedly reduce. The models themselves reduce only in a derivative sense (a discussion of these and related issues is covered in the entry on reductionism in biology.)

If, on the other hand, structuralist reconstructions of “imperfect” theories are successful, then model-reductions might be covered by Theory-Reduction II. Moreover, it has been argued that Nagel’s model should not be interpreted too strictly; at least, it maybe was intended to cover model-reductions as well (van Riel 2011).

4.4 Concepts

Reduction may also apply to concepts, where concepts are conceived of loosely as whatever is expressed by a meaningful term, or as the cognitively significance of a linguistic representation, or in Fregean terms as the mode of presentation under which an object is given by a representation.

Whereas models and theories as candidate-relata for reduction received considerable attention in the philosophy of science, within the philosophy of mind reduction as a conceptual issue also played a major role.

4.4.1 Conceptual issues and analytic functionalism

One such view is tied to functionalism, although this connection is mainly implicit: If a functional description of a property can be obtained from an analysis of a functional concept, then conceptual issues play an important role in the epistemology of functional reduction. On one standard version of functionalism, it is conceptual analysis which provides the functionalist with the specification of the functional roles defining mental properties that are needed to carry out the reduction. The condition on analytic functional reduction is thus (schematically) this:

Analytic Functional Reduction: \(P_1\) reduces to \(P_2\) only if instances of \(P_2\) play role \(R\) and it is a conceptual truth (or analytic) that whatever instantiates \(P_1\) plays role \(R\).

4.4.2 Conceptual issues and the explanatory gap

Another motivation for believing that conceptual issues are crucial for reduction stems from the idea that the identity of properties or kinds expressed by two predicates \(P_1\) and \(P_2\) manifests in the fact that there is an a priori route from \(P_1\) to \(P_2\). This interpretation is implicit in the received view attacked early on by Smart (1959). It also plays a role in Levine 1993, 1998 and Chalmers 1996; the idea is that for reductions to be explanatory, they must not leave out any aspect of the phenomenon to be explained. If qualia-concepts or concepts of conscious states pick out mental states in terms of features that cannot be fully explained in terms of the vocabulary of the reducing science, the explanation and hence the reduction is not successful. Even if our mental terms and neural terms refer to the same states, if the former pick them out using mental concepts that cannot be neurally explained, we will not have reduced the mental to the neural. There will be a residual explanatory gap (Levine 1993, 1998).

Thus, even if two theories instantiate a relation of the sort required by Nagel’s model, we should not speak of proper reduction, if as a matter of epistemic possibility the connection between the domains of the two theories remains too loose to support the materialist claims. Levine (1993) gives this an epistemological interpretation; Chalmers (1996) seems to suggest that the epistemic possibility of two concepts coming apart implies that there is a metaphysical possibility of the two properties coming apart. Many (e.g., Block & Stalnaker 1999; Van Gulick 1999; Yablo 1999) have criticized this view.

This a priori link can, following Beckermann (2009: 162), be described as an a priori implication of the truth of the reduced science, theory, or framework by the truth of the reducing science, theory, or framework:

A Priori Reduction-1: \(P_1\) reduces to \(P_2\) only if the set of all truths about the relevant domain employing concepts of the \(P_2\)-framework conceptually implies the set of truth formulated using concepts of the \(P_1\)-framework.

This way of putting it relies on an intuitive understanding of different conceptual frameworks. Stronger versions require there to be a conceptual connection between pairs of properties (Jackson 2005). At least under some interpretations, this apriorist view has clear predecents in early considerations about the unity of science.

4.4.3 Conceptual issues and the unity of science

According to Carnap, scientific unification should be effected by way of a theory that has the same expressive power as the reduced theories, and, hence, by translation.

… science is a unity, [such] that all empirical statements can be expressed in a single language, all states of affairs are of one kind and are known by the same method. (Carnap 1934: 32)

The notion of translation relevant here is not particularly precise; however, as long as the notion of expressing the same thing is not fully captured by that of designating the same thing, then reference to conceptual aspects of language obviously plays a role for this view on reduction. A particularly strong version, though apparently not Carnap’s, is this (this schematic conditional is restricted to properties signified by predicates, which makes the condition easier to formulate):

A Priori Reduction-2: The property signified by the predicate ‘_\(F\)’ reduces to the property signified by predicate ‘_\(G\)’ only if it is conceptually necessary that whatever is \(F\) is \(G\), and vice versa.

The demand for conceptually necessary links echoes the position of Smart’s (1959) anonymous opponent who claims that if a type \(T\) is identical to a type \(T^*\), then a corresponding conceptual relation holds between expressions signifying these types. Oppenheim and Putnam (1958) seem to think if this kind of reduction when they describe what they call “epistemological reduction” as reduction “true in virtue of the meanings of the terms involved”. (1958: 3)

4.4.4 Conceptual issues and the pragmatic dimension of reductions

Van Gulick (1992, 2010) highlights another aspect of the relevance of conceptual considerations for models of reduction. He suggests that conceptual issues might play a role for reduction insofar as their pragmatic function is concerned. People use representational devices, such as concepts, but also theories, models, and expressions, in order to successfully deal with objects in specific contexts. The directedness of a representation is not exhausted by the object it represents; a representation is typically embedded in a context in which it is used for a certain purpose. The way the first-person perspective enables us to evaluate and deal with our mental states seems to be radically different from ways in which a third person perspective could enable us to deal with these states.

4.4.5 Conceptual issues and the a posteriority requirement

The idea that reference to concepts is required by any appropriate explication of the reduction-predicate is also implicit in Nagel’s work (Nagel 1961): Nagel describes bridge-laws as being a posteriori, thereby opposing any sort of analytic or other a priori reductionism. It has been argued that this might be crucial for fully understanding the concept of reduction. If so, then reduction turns out to be a four-place relation, involving not only entities but also the concepts by which they are picked out or referred to. Truth conditions for sentences of the form ‘\(a\) reduces to \(b\)’, where the expressions ‘\(a\)’ and ‘\(b\)’ designate properties, events, phenomena or the like, are sensitive not only to what ‘\(a\)’ and ‘\(b\)’ designate but also to how they do so, i.e., to the concepts or modes of presentation ‘\(a\)’ and ‘\(b\)’ express (van Riel 2010, 2013 & 2014; Jenkins 2011). But perhaps, reduction, construed as a more general phenomenon, including foundationalism in mathematics and decompositional conceptual analysis, is neutral in this respect. Then, a posteriori reductions could be characterized by the fact that the concepts representing the primary relata in a reduction statement present them in a way that makes an a priori reduction impossible (for us). If heat reduces to molecular kinetic enegry, then whatever the relation between the kind heat and molecular kinetic energy, the concepts employed in this statement are not transparent with respect to the fact that heat reduces to molecular kinetic energy.

4.5 Properties

Consider the example of pain reducing to C-fiber stimulation. Under one interpretation, the expressions ‘pain’ and ‘C-fiber stimulation’ pick out abstract objects, namely natural kinds, properties or types. On this reading of ‘pain reduces to C-fiber stimulation’, the primary relata of reduction should be conceived of as properties or types. This view has played an important role in the philosophy of mind, underlying classical versions of type-identity theory and being the main target of anti-reductionist’s counter-attacks (Putnam 1967; Fodor 1974, 1997).

4.5.1 Property-identity

What sort of reductive link might suit those who assume that the primary relata of reduction are properties? Doing justice to the idea that if some \(a\) reduces to some \(b\), then \(a\) does not exist over and above \(b\), one might tend to assume that property-reduction requires identity:

Identity reduction: \(P_1\) reduces to \(P_2\) only if \(P_1 = P_2\).

This condition is, under a certain interpretation, what underlies Nagelian bridge-principles (van Riel 2011, see however Sarkar 2015 for a different interpretation). It is also explicitly endorsed by Robert Causey (1972a, b, 1977), who connects it to theory reduction via micro-reductions. Just as in the writings of Smart (1959, 1963), the idea is that the relevant identities are not a priori. In addition, he suggests that by identifying the relevant kinds, attributes and properties of the reduced theory with kinds, attributes and properties of the reducing theory, we arrive at explanatory reduction because the laws of the respective theories will thereby be shown to be nomologically equivalent (Causey 1974: 5).

Identity Reduction is, at the same time, obviously compatible with various sorts of a-priorism. Moreover, it has been suggested that it offers a possible way to escape the explanatory gap: If some mental state just is some physical state, then there is nothing to be explained about how “these states” connect; it is a sheer misunderstanding to ask for more than just the identity-statement. Identity claims are basic in the sense that they cannot be successfully explained in the relevant sense (Block & Stalnaker 1999). As is well known, it is often hard to decide whether or not we are faced with identity or mere correlation; Wimsatt (1976: 697ff) argues that when we conceive of reduction as a scientific process, we are well advised to interpret apparent correlations as identities.

van Riel (2014) has argued that the idea that reduction is relevantly tied to identity generates a puzzle: Intuitively, identity seemingly contradicts the directionality, or what is sometimes called ‘asymmetry’ of reduction. The suggested solution is that ‘_reduces to_’ generates hyper-intensional contexts, and that this is best explained by the idea mentioned above: For \(a\) to reduce to \(b\), two conditions must be satisfied: (i) \(a=b\) and (ii) ‘\(a\)’ expresses a conceptual content that relevantly differs from the conceptual content expressed by ‘\(b\)’. Another option would consist in giving this a pragmatist reading as in (Van Gulick 1992, 2010), or giving up on the idea that identity is required for (property-)reduction.

4.5.2 Alternatives to property-identity

There are three rival suggestions on the market, all of which argue that weaker notions of reduction still serve the purpose of the reductivist: The reductive link could be spelled out in terms of supervenience (Kim 1982, 1990), causation (Enç 1976) and realization (Kim 1998; Melnyk 2003; Shoemaker 2007. Whereas usual stipulations of supervenience do not rule out the possibility that \(a\) supervenes on \(b\) and, at the same time, \(b\) supervenes on \(a\), at least causation seems to be relevantly directional and so do justice to the directionality of reduction. Nevertheless, causation is probably not what is required: the occurrence of water is not caused by the occurrence of H\(_2\)O (in the usual meaning of the term ‘causation’); there is no temporal component involved, what is, on most accounts, required by causation.

4.5.3 Supervenience

Supervenience does not fare better, though for different reasons: It seems to be too weak a notion to capture the idea that guided reduction-talk, although it surely is a necessary condition for reduction. In a sense, if mental states merely supervene on physiological states, they exist in a straightforward sense over and above the latter. Such supervenient states are dependent; but being dependent is not enough for reduction (Kim 1998). Note that this is, up to a certain point, a matter of stipulation. However, the stipulation is driven by an intuition: An appropriate definition of the reduction-predicate should adequately mimic the intuitions that guided the use of the term. If, for example, one hope was to formulate a strictly monist position, then relying on supervenience does not serve this goal: Supervenience makes room for a weak form of dualism. For example, it is compatible with emergent property dualism. The emergent properties on such a view are something over and above the physical, but in so far they emerge from the physical base according to natural laws of emergence, they would supervene on that base. Any two cases in which the physical bases were the same would also agree in their emergent properties. Thus supervenience is generally not judged sufficient for reduction. However, many regard it as consistent with reduction or even required.

4.5.4 Realization

Realization, which has figured prominently in recent versions of non-reductive physicalism may seem too weak a relation to support a reduction claim, but nonetheless strong enough to guarantee ontological unity on the token level that underlies physicalism. Realization can be described in terms of dependence; e.g., for a particular physiological event-type to realize pain is for it to be such that in virtue of its physiological organization, its instances play the pain-role. This obviously suits the (role-) functionalist interpretation of higher-level properties; these higher-level properties are realized by lower level ones in the sense that instances of the latter play the role of the former in virtue of their physical organization.

Most functionalists, being opposed to type-identity theory, regard the realization-relation as too weak a relation for reduction. Given a strong interpretation of what reductionism consists in—e.g., the type-identity of properties – the realization-interpretation might not suffice to guarantee reduction. It might ensure reductionism at the token-level, but it might, at the same time, be committed to dualism at the property level—though perhaps only a relatively innocent form of dualism. Options to reconcile role-functionalism with reductionism have been introduced in Section 3.4.

4.6 Wholes and their parts

The idea that reduction is tied to part-whole relations is frequently alluded to in the literature (Schaffner 1993; van Riel 2014; Gillett 2016; Endicott 2022). The most elaborate version of this assumption forms part of Causey’s more general picture of scientific unification. Intuitively, and abstracting away from numerous details of his elaborate model (described in terms of theory-reduction), a micro-reduction in Causey’s sense relies on an identification of a property \(P_1\) with a property \(P_2\), where the syntactical arrangement of the terms forming the complex term ‘\(P_2\)’ reflect the mereological composition of \(P_1\), whereas ‘\(P_1\)’ does not. ‘\(P_1\)’ simply refers to the whole without explicitly referring to its parts as ‘\(P_2\)’ does, but they in fact refer to the same complex. Whereas mereological relations alone are compatible with emergentist or dualist interpretations combining mereological composition and identity seems to ensure a link strong enough to count as a reductive link.

Another way of connecting reduction to composition is this: one could try to describe reduction as a one-many relation. In one use of the term ‘composes’, a given object \(a\) may be composed out of several objects \(b_1, b_2, b_3, \ldots, b_n\). At least at the face of it, there is nothing in the use of ‘reduction’ that should prevent us from, say, stating that a whole reduces to its parts.

Recently, Carl Gillet (2016) has offered an account of reduction and emergence using a bottom-up strategy: developing a general framework of analysis for compositional explanations offered in the sciences, he not only argues that the reduction debate should be reconstructed paying close attention to actual explanations offered in the sciences, but also that reductionism and emergentism are both live options.

4.7 Mechanisms

One solution to this problem would be to connect reductive explanation to mechanistic explanation, even though mechanistic explanation is often described by its proponents as non-reductivist in spirit (Kauffmann 1970; Cummins 1975, 1983, 2000; Bechtel & Richardson 1993; Bechtel 1994; Glennan 1996; Machamer et al. 2000; Craver 2005, 2007).

The proposal would be to define a phenomenon \(a\) as reductively explained by a phenomenon \(b\) iff \(a\) is mechanistically explained by \(b\). Mechanistic dependence might be distinguished from a mereological relation, if mechanisms are not the sorts of things that have parts in the ordinary sense of the term as some have claimed (Craver 2005).

5. Unresolved issues

The mainstream in the philosophy of mind is, apparently, one version or another of non-reductive physicalism. The majority within the philosophy of science has nowadays abandoned the unificationist program, to which reduction was intimately connected right from the start. However, as became apparent only in recent years, some questions regarding the concept of reduction have not successfully been accounted for yet, and recent developments in metaphysics in connection with metaphysical grounding may shed new light on the concept of reduction.

5.1 A priori reductions

Canonical examples from the philosophy of mind and the philosophy of science suggest that reductions are not an a priori affair. However, the question of whether, and if so, how reduction statements might be knowable a priori raises subtle issues in different contexts.

Carnap tied reductivist unification to translation, and, thus, meaning. If, first, reduction is, or can be, effected by translation, and if, second, translation preserves meaning, and if, third, meaning-preservation is sufficient for a priori accessibility (perhaps because it ensures analyticity), then reduction can in principle be based on a priori reasoning. It should be noted, however, that tying reduction to translation does not ipso facto commit one to an a priory approach to reduction. It does so only if the concept of meaning is relatively demanding. Carnap was very clear about the fact that reductive unification may be achieved by something less than definability: conditional reduction statements determine application conditions for reduced terms under specific, typically experimental circumstances (Carnap 1938 [1991], 397f.). It is not clear whether these reduction statements are a priori. And on some truth-conditional or Russellian accounts of meaning, the sentence “This is a glass filled with H\(_2\)O molecules” may turn out to be a translation of the sentence “This is a glass filled with water”. Then, translation ensures neither analyticity nor a priori access.

The term ‘reduction’ has been employed in other areas as well, for instance in the philosophy of mathematics and in meta-philosophy. Foundationalism in mathematics can be regarded as reductionist in spirit; and decompositional conceptual analysis (as in: knowledge is nothing but justified true belief) can be described as conceptual reduction. Prima facie, these kinds of reduction differ from reductions in the sciences and in the philosophy of mind in precisely this respect: if successful, they can be carried out on an a priori basis. In contrast, the reduction of heat to molecular kinetic energy requires empirical investigation, just like the reduction of pain to some complex physiological state.

Unlike foundationalism in mathematics and reductive conceptual analysis, the doctrine of a priori physicalism does not take the process of discovering reduction statements to be an a priori project. Roughly, according to a priori physicalism, every true proposition about the empirical world is the consequence of at least one true conditional that fulfills two conditions: it is knowable a priori and its antecedent is a proposition about a (complex) physical or fundamental material fact. A priori comparison of mathematical structures, however, may suffice to determine an interesting relationship between theories, which is sometimes labeled ‘reduction’. Rosaler (2019) has recently argued that to achive proper reductions within physics, this kind of a priori reasoning has to be complemented by empirical observation so as to arrive at successful reductions.

5.2 Reduction and explanation

Philosophers do not agree upon the relation between reduction and explanation. Some argue that the concept of reduction is on a par with concepts such as causation in that it is intimately tied to certain ‘because’, ‘in virtue of’ or ‘by’ statements, or that there is no fundamental split between explanatory and ontological models of reduction (van Riel 2011; McCauley 1981). Others have held that not only is there a difference between explanatory reduction, which is an epistemological matter, and ontological reductionism, but that there might even be a difference between explanatory reduction and derivation-based models of theory reduction (see the entry on reductionism in biology; see also Klein 2009; Dizadji-Bahmani et al. 2010).

For notions of reduction that are connected to explanation, the different options are, apparently, these:

  1. The notion of reduction is itself an explanatory concept, in the sense that it is a concept which is to be cashed out in terms of explanatory concepts: stating that \(a\) reduces to \(b\), one states that \(b\) is explanatorily tied to \(a\).
  2. The reduction relation is an explanatory relation, despite the fact that the concept is not to be cashed out using explanatory notions: that \(a\) reduces to \(b\) merely implies that \(b\) is explanatorily tied to \(a\).

If the concept of reduction is an explanatory concept, then a definition of it is either of the form [… because …], or it relevantly involves an analysis of explanatory notions. If it is not, but still is such that the relation is explanatory, then a definition would at least imply the truth of a corresponding explanation.

Given this broad outline, it seems reasonable to assume that most models of reduction are concerned with explanation in one of these senses (sometimes also called “epistemological reduction”, cf. Sarkar 1992). Possible exceptions would include models that highlight replacement issues, where an apparent phenomenon is not explained but rather “explained away”, and perhaps some more technical notions of reduction that are guided neither by intuitions of the “nothing over and above” sort, nor by any metaphysical positions such as functionalism (e.g., Dizadji-Bahmani et al. 2010; Bickle 2008; Butterfield 2011a&b).

5.3 Reduction, Ground, and Fundamentality

Recently, explanatory connectives, such as ‘because’ and ‘in virtue of’ have attracted considerable attention in the study of metaphysical ground. Very briefly, the term ‘ground’ is used to articulate dependence claims, without commitment to specific modal or counterfactual interpretations of various sorts of metaphysical dependence. Intuitive characterizations of a necessary condition on reduction which we we alluded to above—if \(x\) reduces to \(y\), then \(y\) is prior to \(x\)/then \(y\) is more fundamental than \(x\)—suggest that there may be an interesting link between reduction and ground. The notion of ground is  characterized in terms of priority, and closely connected to conceptions of fundamentality. Let us first provide some background and then hint at possible connections between reduction and ground.

5.3.1 A very short introduction to ground

Following Schaffer (2009), one can draw a distinction between two types of metaphysics in terms of their alleged subject matter. Quinean metaphysics deals with existence questions. It asks: What exists? What is part of the ontology of a given theory, such as physics? In contrast, (Neo-)Aristotelian metaphysics is permissive regarding existence. It is mainly concerned to identify what is fundamental and what depends on the fundamental. In Schaffer’s terms, it is concerned with “what grounds what” (Schaffer 2009). Examples of dependence claims the Neo-Aristotelian is concerned with include:

  1. The mental depends on the physical.
  2. Mechanisms depend on their constituents and these constituents’ interactions.
  3. The whole depends on its parts.
  4. Sets depend on their elements.
  5. The hole in the Swiss cheese depends on the cheese.

Until recently, metaphysics did not provide the means to address these claims properly, says the defender of ground. Consider the claim that the mental depends on the physical. Until recently, metaphysicians would have suggested that this claim is to be cashed out in modal or counterfactual terms. The claim could be given an interpretation in terms of supervenience: Any shift in mental properties necessitates a shift at the level of physical properties. Any analysis along these lines will leave the grounding theorist dissatisfied. One reson to be skeptical about an analysis of dependence in terms of supervenience is that supervenience is neither irreflexive nor asymmetric (unless by way of stipulation). In contrast, the sort of dependence grounding theorists are after when claiming that the mental depends on the physical requires that the physical does not depend on the mental, neither in whole nor in part.

The concept of ground is supposed to do the trick. Ground is regarded as a primitive (Fine 2001), characterized in terms of structural features – it is transitive, irreflexive, asymmetric, and it generates hyper-intensional contexts (Fine 2012; see also the contributions in Correia and Schnieder 2012). But if this notion is primitive, how do we get access to it? After all, ‘ground’ is, like ‘reduction’, a philosophical term; reflection on ordinary usage will not give access to its meaning in philosophical contexts.

One influential idea is that explanatory connectives such as ‘because’ or ‘in virtue of’ introduce a basic notion of ground (Fine 2012). ‘Because’ and ‘in virtue of’ are arguably asymmetric and irreflexive, and they generate hyper-intensional contexts (Schnieder 2011). They are part of ordinary discourse, and we are competent in using these expressions. Construed non-causally, they may give access to ground. Alternatively, one could give an ostensive definition (Schaffer 2009).

There are two very general reasons to regard reduction as a particular variant of ground (5.3.2). At the same time, there appears to be a tension between reduction and ground. Either, reduction turns out to be distinct from ground, or the structural features of reduction may shed light on the nature of ground (5.2.3). Third, one may want to resist an assimilation of reduction to ground, based on a general skepticism towards the philosophical significance of grounding talk (5.2.4).

5.3.2 Reduction and ground linked

There are two paths leading from reduction to ground. First, reductive interpretations of paradigmatic dependence claims may inspire a reconstruction of reduction in terms of ground. Reductionists about the mental argue that mental states, like pain, reduce to certain physiological states and are, hence, identical to the latter. Eliminativists argue that mental states or properties just do not exist. Anti-reductionists maintain that pains exist and are different from corresponding physiological states. Some naturalists employ various notions of dependence to capture the priority of the natural while acknowledging a plurality of layers of reality. The debate thus centered on questions of existence and, often, various dependence relations, ranging from emergence to ruthless reduction. It appears, then, that the reductionist about the mental maintains that the mental reductively depends on the physiological.

By these lights, it may seem plausible to reconstruct reduction claims in terms of ground (if we accept that grounding talk is fruitful). Above, we have noted that the primitive concept of ground may be introduced by way of examples, or by lists of paradigmatic dependence claims. Theories of reduction may offer a viable interpretation of at least some of these dependence claims. Hence, it should not come as a surprise that some maintain that redution is sufficient for ground, so that if \(a\) reduces to \(b\), then \(b\) grounds \(a\) (Rosen 2010, 124f., Schaffer 2009, 378, van Riel 2014). In a similar spirit, one may suggest that grounding talk offers a fruitful reconstruction of the idea that some things do not exist over and above other things, an idea frequently invoked in the reductio debate (cf. Wilson 2014 for an extensive discussion). It seems that on this conception, reduction turns out to be a particular variant of grund, perhaps among others.

Second, conceptions of reduction in the philosophy of science, which draw on explanatory notions, are committed to the assumption that there is a tight connection between reduction and ground, conditional on the assumption that explanatory vocabulary (interpreted non-causally) does in fact introduce a notion of ground, as some grounding theorists would have it. A concept of ground is often introduced by reference to explanatory connectives, such as ‘because’, and ‘in virtue of’. On this interpretation, there is a close link to conceptions of reduction in the philosophy of science. Within this strand of the reduction debate, reduction has been conceived of as an explanatory connection (see above). Of course, a robust metaphysical interpretation of explanatory links in terms of ground stands in stark contrast to some standard conceptions of explanation within the philosophy of science. Realists have mainly focused on causal explanation (Salmon 1989); only recently, philosophers of science have turned to non-causal, mechanistic dependence (cf. Machamer et al. 2000, Craver 2005, 2007). Others have taken explanation to be primarily an epistemic or pragmatic affair (Kitcher 1989, Achinstein 1983, van Fraassen 1980). Nevertheless, it is worth noting that it is an open question whether (non-causal) explanation can be construed pragmatically or epistemically, or whether it requires a metaphysically robust interpretation. If it turns out that explanation does require a metaphysically robust interpretation, the fact that reduction has been construed as an explanatory notion in the philosophy of science may be seen as an indicator that claims of reduction are, properly construed, claims of ground.

An early defender of the view that reduction involves a kind of ontological “generative” relation is Enç (1976). He describes this link as “causation”— most likely in the traditional sense (a fact which Schaffner (1993) who criticizes Enç seems to have overklooked).

5.3.3 A possible problem

Yet, there is a problem. Above, it has been pointed out that claims of reduction are often taken to imply corresponding identity claims. Recall Identity Reduction (4.5.1):

Identity reduction: \(P_1\) reduces to \(P_2\) only if \(P_1 = P_2\).

As a consequence, reduction is taken to have the “structural features of identity”, such as reflexivity and symmetry, as Trogdon maintains (Trogdon 2013, similarly: Audi 2012), but also intensionality. Then, it is not clear how reduction could possibly exhibit the structural features of ground – irreflexivity, asymmetry, and hyper-intensionality. (This observation seems to parallel the tension between supervenience and dependence noted above.) Philosophers have reacted in different ways. Some take these observations at face value and conclude that reduction is distinct from ground (Audi 2012, Trogdon 2013). Others have argued that it would be short-sighted to construe reduction in this way. From Identity Reduction, it simply does not follow that reduction has the structural features of identity. Recall the puzzle of reduction discussed above: Although reduction requires identity, identity is not sufficient for reduction. In fact, if \(a\) reduces to \(b\), it follows, by the asymmetry of reduction, that \(b\) does not reduce to \(a\). For this and similary reasons, it has been suggested that reduction generates hyper-intensional contexts, and that reduction statements are sensitive to the modes of presentation expressed by the terms flanking the reduction predicate (Jenkins 2011, van Riel 2013, 2014). On this view, reduction may turn out to be a variant of ground.

Of course, there may be very general reasons to reject grounding talk altogether (see the discussion in the entry Metaphysical Grounding). In the present context, one criticism deserves close attention. Wilson (2014) maintains that reference to a primitive metaphysical relation in articulations of various dependence claims does not constitute philosophical progress.

5.3.4 Reductionism and Fundamentality

Finally, it would be interesting to see whether identity-reductionists are, qua reductionists, committed to the view that there is an absolutely fundamental level of reality. In the introduction, we have used a preliminary and partial characterization of reduction, according to which if \(x\) reduces to \(y\), then \(y\) is more fundamental than \(x\). Perhaps, by the lights of recent theorizing about fundamentality, this intuitive notion may turn out to be fruitful in a characterization of reduction (Fine 2001, Cameron 2008, Paul 2012, Thako 2018). Schaffer (2003) suggests that fundamentalism is characterized by a hierarchical picture of nature, the idea that there is some bottom level in this hierarchy, and by an “ontological attitude according to which the entities of the fundamental level are primarily real, while any remaining contingent entities are at best derivative, if real at all.” (Schaffer 2003, 498) Reductive physicalists seem to accept that only physical reality is really real, and some of them may endorse the view that there is a hierarchy, perhaps not in reality, but in nature, or at least: in how nature appears to us, or how we theorize about nature. So, they would turn out to be fundamentalists. And reductionists, as opposed to epiphenomenalist, non-reductive physicalists or eliminativists, do not deny that things like mental properties are real, as long as they are reducible, that is: identical to fundamental things. Reductionism, in this sense, would then amount to the view that there is only a fundamental level, and that everything that is reducible at all reduces to this fundamental level. (For a general discussion of this concept, see the entry on fundamentality.)

6. Perspectives on reduction

Scientific reduction became an important topic in the philosophy of science within the context of a general interest in the unity of science, and it was inspired by specific cases of what seemed to be successful reductions. The most prominent argument against reductionism stems from the observation that straightforward reductions hardly ever occur. Hence, reductionism cannot be regarded as yielding a coherent picture of what actually goes on in science. As long as reductionism is supposed to be more than a purely metaphysical position and is intended to say something significant about scientific change or norms, the value and relevance of the notion of reduction seems to depend in part upon how well the reductionist positions fit the facts, which their critics argue they do not (see, for example, Sarkar 1992; Scerri & McIntyre 1997).

Proponents of reduction have responded in different ways. Some have suggested more flexible and liberal interpretations of reduction (Wimsatt 1976; Schaffner 1993; Dizadji-Bahmani et al. 2010, Schaffner 2006, 2012, Winther 2009), to ensure that the term ‘reduction’ still serves a purpose in describing actual scientific practice. Bickle has recently suggested that philosophical theorizing about reduction should best be construed as reconstructing whatever cases scientists judge to be reductions (Bickle 2008). Some form of orientation towards actual scientific practice can be found in perhaps the majority of recent publications on the topic of reduction. Batterman (2014) proposed a challenge to particular reductivist interpretations of inter-theory relations in physics, arguing that naive conceptions of reduction and emergence fail to do justice to the details of bridging micro- and macro-scales. Carl Gillett (2016) has explicitly argued that the reduction debate suffers from the defect that it does not pay close attention to explanations offered in the sciences, and he reconstructs a general reduction-emergence framework from explanations given in the sciences. Palacios (2023), developing an idea suggested by Torretti (1990), focuses on the different epistemic and ontological functions paradigmatic cases of reductions in physics seem to play, including, amongst others, not only explanation, but also justification, acceptance, and correction. She then distinguishes models of reduction in terms of how they capture these functions and suggests a pluralist view. In her (2022), she argues that by the lights of these models, some reductions in physics turn out to be compatible with emergence (if interpreted appropriately).

It is difficult to assess the exact relation between these discussions and traditional, generalist philosophical discussions of reduction and emergence. Although questions of a proper theory of topic-identification transcend the boundaries of this entry, it seems plausible to assume that debates driven at least partly by the goal to adequately model scientific practice are not primarily concerned with traditional questions of scientific or ontological unification, or the relation between phenomenal qualities and physiological goings-on in the human brain or body. The difference in perspective is paralleled by the ways in which definitions or explications of reduction are treated. Whereas Kim (1998) argues that Nagel’s characterization of reduction does not capture reduction, properly construed, philosophers of science often take Nagel’s definition at face value, as a stipulation, which can then be employed to identify interesting actual inter-theory relations. Nagel himself offered his model as an explication of some general idea oriented towards a set of candidate explanations ranging from the explanation of headaches to explanatory inter-theory relations in physics. He couched it in terms of the instrumentalism he endorsed on independent grounds. Today, the model has taken up a life of its own. Although the various reduction debates are clearly related, it is sometimes difficult to assess whether people talk about the same thing when employing the term ‘reduction’.


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