Notes to Kant’s Philosophy of Mathematics

1. Kant’s definition of trapezium cited here is consistent with current usage in the United States and Canada, according to which a trapezium is a quadrilateral with no sides parallel and a trapezoid is a quadrilateral with one pair of parallel sides. Current British usage of the two terms reverses these definitions.

2. Most commentators take Kant to have had a reasonably sophisticated understanding of the mathematical developments of his time. Paul Rusnock (2004) has argued provocatively against this common view, claiming that because of his lack of technical sophistication, Kant did not have the resources to develop a philosophically interesting account of mathematical practice, and so that his philosophy of mathematics is inadequate even in light of its historical context.

3. Jaakko Hintikka defends a contrary thesis with respect to the relation between the Discipline of Pure Reason in its Dogmatic Employment and the Transcendental Aesthetic according to which the Discipline expresses Kant’s “preliminary” theory of mathematics, and the Transcendental Aesthetic his “full” theory. According to Hintikka, the former is the “background and the starting-point of” the latter (Hintikka 1969, p.49). Hintikka argues thereby that the “preliminary” theory is independent of the “full” theory, and so that Kant’s philosophy of mathematics as he interprets it can be defended without a commitment to Kant’s theory of intuition and Transcendental Idealism.

4. Indeed, the relevant passage from the Preamble to the Prolegomena about the synthetic apriority of mathematical judgments is added almost verbatim to the B-edition of the Critique of Pure Reason.

5. It is, of course, the use of such a science of arithmetic that is more general than a science of time. The individual propositions of arithmetic, or what Kant calls “numerical formulas,” are in fact singular, which is why he claims that arithmetic does not have axioms as geometry does. (A164/B205)

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