Kant’s Philosophy of Mathematics

First published Fri Jul 19, 2013; substantive revision Wed Aug 11, 2021

Kant was a student and a teacher of mathematics throughout his career, and his reflections on mathematics and mathematical practice had a profound impact on his philosophical thought (Martin 1985; Moretto 2015). He developed considered philosophical views on the status of mathematical judgment, the nature of mathematical concepts, definitions, axioms and proof, and the relation between pure mathematics and the natural world. Moreover, his approach to the general question “how are synthetic judgments a priori possible?” was shaped by his conception of mathematics and its achievements as a well-grounded science.

Kant’s philosophy of mathematics is of interest to a variety of scholars for multiple reasons. First, his thoughts on mathematics are a crucial and central component of his critical philosophical system, and so they are illuminating to the historian of philosophy working on any aspect of Kant’s corpus. Additionally, issues of contemporary interest and relevance arise from Kant’s reflections on the most fundamental and elementary mathematical disciplines, issues that continue to inform important questions in the metaphysics and epistemology of mathematics. Finally, disagreements about how to interpret Kant’s philosophy of mathematics have generated a fertile area of current research and debate.

1. Kant’s Pre-Critical Philosophy of Mathematics

In 1763, Kant entered an essay prize competition addressing the question of whether the first principles of metaphysics and morality can be proved, and thereby achieve the same degree of certainty as mathematical truths. Though his essay was awarded second prize by the Royal Academy of Sciences in Berlin (losing to Moses Mendelssohn’s “On Evidence in the Metaphysical Sciences”), it has nevertheless come to be known as Kant’s “Prize Essay”. The Prize Essay was published by the Academy in 1764 under the title “Inquiry Concerning the Distinctness of the Principles of Natural Theology and Morality” and stands as a key text in Kant’s pre-critical philosophy of mathematics.

In the Prize Essay, Kant undertook to compare the methods of mathematics and metaphysics (Carson 1999; Sutherland 2010). He claimed that “the business of mathematics…is that of combining and comparing given concepts of magnitudes, which are clear and certain, with a view to establishing what can be inferred from them” (2:278). He claimed further that this business is accomplished via an examination of figures or “visible signs” that provide concrete representations of universal concepts that have been synthetically defined (Dunlop 2014, 2020). For example, one defines the mathematical concept <trapezium> by arbitrary combination of other concepts (“four straight lines bounding a plane surface so that the opposite sides are not parallel to each other”[1]), accompanied by a “sensible sign” that displays the relations among the parts of all objects so defined. Definitions as well as fundamental mathematical propositions (that space can only have three dimensions, for example) must be “examined in concreto so that they come to be cognized intuitively”, but such propositions can never be proved since they are not inferred from other propositions (2:281). Theorems are established when simple cognitions are combined “by means of synthesis” (2:282), as when, for instance, it is demonstrated that the products of the segments formed by two chords intersecting inside a circle are equal. In the latter case, one proves a theorem about any and all pairs of lines that intersect inside a circle not by “drawing all the possible lines which could intersect each other within [the circle]” but rather by drawing only two lines, and identifying the relationship that holds between them (2:278). The “universal rule” that results is inferred via a synthesis among the sensible signs that are displayed, and, as a result, among the concepts that the sensible signs illustrate.

Kant concludes that the mathematical method cannot be applied to achieve philosophical (and, in particular, metaphysical) results, for the primary reason that “geometers acquire their concepts by means of synthesis, whereas philosophers can only acquire their concepts by means of analysis—and that completely changes the method of thought” (2:289). Yet at this pre-critical stage, he also concludes that, even lacking synthetic definitions of its primary concepts, “metaphysics is as much capable of the certainty which is necessary to produce conviction as mathematics” (2:296). (Later, in the critical period, Kant will expand the notion of synthesis to describe not only the genesis and combination of mathematical concepts, but also the act of unifying manifold representations. He will also, of course, use the terms “synthetic” and “analytic” to distinguish two mutually exclusive ways in which the subject and predicate concepts relate to one another in distinct judgments of any kind, and he will emphasize an expanded sense of this distinction that encompasses a methodological contrast between two modes of argumentation, one synthetic or progressive and the other analytic or regressive. These various senses of the analytic/synthetic distinction will be addressed briefly, below.)

In the essays “Concerning the Ultimate Ground of the Differentiation of Directions in Space” and “On the Form and Principles of the Sensible and the Intelligible World [Inaugural Dissertation]” of 1768 and 1770, respectively, Kant’s thoughts about mathematics and its results begin to evolve in the direction of his critical philosophy as he begins to recognize the role that a distinct faculty of sensibility will play in an account of mathematical cognition (Carson 2004; Carson 2017; Posy 2020). In these essays, he attributes the success of mathematical reasoning to its access to the “principles of sensitive form” and the “primary data of intuition”, which results in “laws of intuitive cognition” and “intuitive judgments” about magnitude and extension. One such judgment serves to establish the possibility of an object that is “exactly equal and similar to another, but which cannot be enclosed in the same limits as that other, its incongruent counterpart” (2:382) (Buroker 1981; Van Cleve and Frederick 1991; Van Cleve 1999). Kant invokes such “incongruent counterparts” in “Directions in space” to establish the orientability and actuality of a Newtonian-style absolute space, the object of geometry as he then understands it. He invokes the same example in the “Inaugural Dissertation” to establish that spatial relations “can only be apprehended by a certain pure intuition” and so show that “geometry employs principles which are not only indubitable and discursive, but which also fall under the gaze of the mind.” As such, mathematical evidence is “the paradigm and the means of all evidence in the other sciences” (2:403). (Later, in the critical period’s Prolegomena, he will invoke incongruent counterparts to establish the transcendental ideality of space, thereby disavowing his earlier argument in support of absolute space.)

2. Kant’s Critical Philosophy of Mathematics

2.1 Kant’s theory of the construction of mathematical concepts in “The Discipline of Pure Reason in Dogmatic Use”

Kant’s critical philosophy of mathematics finds fullest expression in the section of the Critique of Pure Reason entitled “The Discipline of Pure Reason in Dogmatic Use”, which begins the second of the two main divisions of the Critique, the “Transcendental Doctrine of Method.” In previous sections of the Critique, Kant has subjected pure reason “in its transcendental use in accordance with mere concepts” to a critique in order to “constrain its propensity to expansion beyond the narrow boundaries of possible experience” (A711/B739). But Kant tells us that it is unnecessary to subject mathematics to such a critique because the use of pure reason in mathematics is kept to a “visible track” via intuition: “[mathematical] concepts must immediately be exhibited in concreto in pure intuition, through which anything unfounded and arbitrary instantly becomes obvious” (A711/B739). Nevertheless, the practice and discipline of mathematics does require an explanation, in order both to account for its success at demonstrating substantive and necessary truths, and also to license its invocation as a model of reasoning. Kant thus directs himself, as he did in the pre-critical period, to the question of what accounts for the “happy and well grounded” mathematical method, and also of whether it is useful in any discipline other than mathematics. To answer this latter question in the negative, Kant must explain the uniqueness of mathematical reasoning.

The central thesis of Kant’s account of the uniqueness of mathematical reasoning is his claim that mathematical cognition derives from the “construction” of its concepts: “to construct a concept means to exhibit a priori the intuition corresponding to it” (A713/B741) (Friedman 1992, 2010; Shabel 2006). For example, while the concept <triangle> can be discursively defined as a rectilinear figure contained by three straight lines (as is done in Euclid’s Elements), the concept is constructed, in Kant’s technical sense of the term, only when a corresponding intuition is exhibited; in this case, the corresponding intuition is a singular and immediately evident representation of a three-sided figure. Kant argues that when one so renders a triangle for the purposes of performing the auxiliary constructive steps necessary for geometric proof, one does so a priori, whether the triangle is produced on paper or only in the imagination. This is because in neither case does the object displayed borrow its pattern from any experience (A713/B741). Moreover, one can derive universal truths about all triangles from such a singular display of an individual triangle since the particular determinations of the displayed object, e.g., the magnitude of its sides and angles, are “entirely indifferent” to the rendered triangle as an exhibition of the general concept <triangle> (A714/B742). Kant’s account must thus be defended against the commonly held position that universal truths cannot be derived from reasoning that depends on particular representations (Friedman 2012, 2020). Relatedly, the less than perfectly straight sides of an empirically rendered triangle are similarly “indifferent” to the general concept <triangle> and so such an empirical intuition is considered adequate for geometric proof. This raises questions about how one can be sure that an intuition adequately displays the content of a concept (Dunlop 2012); the relation between pure and empirical intuition (Friedman 2012; Shabel 2003); and, in particular, which of the intuitively displayed features can safely be ignored (Friedman 2010, 2012). These features of Kant’s theory of construction also invite discussion about the acquisition conditions of mathematical concepts (Callanan 2014); the role of construction in indirect reductio proofs (Goodwin 2018); the relation between construction and definition (Heis 2014, 2020; Nunez 2014); and the role of imagination in construction (Land 2014).

Ultimately, Kant claims that it is “only the concept of magnitudes” (quantities) that can be constructed in pure intuition, since “qualities cannot be exhibited in anything but empirical intuition” (A714/B742) (Sutherland 2004a, 2004b, 2005a, 2021). This leads to a principled distinction between mathematical and philosophical cognition: while philosophical cognition is confined to the results of an abstract conceptual analysis, mathematical cognition is the result of a “chain of inferences that is always guided by intuition”, that is, by a concrete representation of its objects (Hintikka 1967; Parsons 1969; Friedman 1992; Hogan 2020). Kant strains somewhat to explain how the mathematician constructs arithmetic and algebraic magnitudes, which are distinct from the spatial figures that are the object of geometric reasoning. Drawing a distinction between “ostensive” and “symbolic” construction, he identifies ostensive construction with the geometer’s practice of showing or displaying spatial figures, whereas symbolic construction correlates to the act of concatenating arithmetic or algebraic symbols (as when, for example, “one magnitude is to be divided by another, [mathematics] places their symbols together in accordance with the form of notation for division…”) (A717/B745) (Brittan 1992; Shabel 1998).

Kant claims further that the pure concept of magnitude is suitable for construction because, unlike other pure concepts, it does not represent a synthesis of possible intuitions, but “already contains a pure intuition in itself.” But since the only candidates for such “pure intuitions” are space and time (“the mere form of appearances”), it follows that only spatial and temporal magnitudes can be exhibited in pure intuition, i.e., constructed. Such spatial and temporal magnitudes can be exhibited qualitatively, by displaying the shapes of things, e.g. the rectangularity of the panes of a window, or they can be exhibited merely quantitatively, by displaying the number of parts of things, e.g., the number of panes that the window comprises. In either case, what is displayed counts as a pure and “formal intuition”, inspection of which yields judgments that “go beyond” the content of the original concept with which the intuition was associated. Such judgments are paradigmatically synthetic a priori judgments (to be discussed at greater length below) since they are ampliative truths that are warranted independent of experience (Shabel 2006).

Kant argues that mathematical reasoning cannot be employed outside the domain of mathematics proper for such reasoning, as he understands it, is necessarily directed at objects that are “determinately given in pure intuition a priori and without any empirical data” (A724/B752). Since only formal mathematical objects (i.e. spatial and temporal magnitudes) can be so given, mathematical reasoning is useless with respect to materially given content (though the truths that result from mathematical reasoning about formal mathematical objects are fruitfully applied to such material content, which is to say that mathematics is applicable to and a priori true of the appearances (Shabel 2005). Consequently, the “thorough grounding” that mathematics finds in its definitions, axioms, and demonstrations cannot be “achieved or imitated” by philosophy or physical sciences (A727/B755).

While Kant’s theory of mathematical concept construction can be thought of as providing an explanation of mathematical practice as Kant understood it[2], the theory is intertwined with Kant’s broader commitments to strict distinctions between intuitions and concepts, as modes of representation (Smyth 2014); between synthetic and analytic judgments (Anderson 2004, 2015; Hogan 2020); between the roles of different cognitive faculties (Land 2014; Laywine 2014); and between a priori and a posteriori evidence and reasoning (Anderson 2015). Ultimately, the picture of mathematics developed in the “Discipline of Pure Reason in Dogmatic Use” depends on the full theory of judgment that the Critical philosophy aims to provide, and crucially on the theory of sensibility that Kant offers in The Transcendental Aesthetic (Parsons 1992; Carson 1997; Risjord 1991), as well as in corresponding passages in the Prolegomena’s Main Transcendental Question, First Part, where he investigates the “origin” of the pure sensible concepts of mathematics, and the “scope of their validity” (A725/B753).[3]

2.2 Kant’s answer to his question “How is Pure Mathematics Possible?”

Kant asks two related leading questions of his critical philosophy: (1) How are synthetic judgments a priori possible?; and, (2) How is metaphysics possible as a science (B19; B23)? Mathematics provides a special avenue for helping to answer these questions by providing a model of a codified scientific discipline the possibility of which is clear and, moreover, guaranteed by its own achievement of cognition that is both synthetic and a priori (Anderson 2015). In other words, an explanation of how synthetic a priori judgments are affirmed in mathematical contexts, together with the resulting and related explanation of how a systematic body of demonstrable knowledge comprises such judgments, allow mathematical truth to be invoked as a paradigm of the substantive yet necessary and universal truths that metaphysics hopes to achieve. Kant’s theory of mathematical concept construction (discussed above) can only be fully appreciated in conjunction with his treatment of such broader questions about the very nature and possibility of mathematical and metaphysical knowledge (Jauernig 2013).

In both the Preamble to the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics and the B-Introduction to the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant introduces the analytic/synthetic distinction, which distinguishes between judgments the predicates of which belong to or are contained in the subject concept and judgments the predicates of which are connected to but go beyond the subject concept, respectively. In each text, he follows his presentation of this distinction with a discussion of his claim that all mathematical judgments are synthetic and a priori.[4] There he claims, first, that “properly mathematical judgments are always a priori judgments” on the grounds that they are necessary, and so cannot be derived from experience (B14). He follows this with an explanation of how such non-empirical judgments can yet be synthetic, that is, how they can serve to synthesize a subject and predicate concept rather than merely explicate or analyze a subject concept into its constituent logical parts.

Here Kant famously invokes the arithmetical proposition “7 + 5 = 12” and argues that such a judgment is synthetic. He argues negatively, claiming that “no matter how long I analyze my concept of such a possible sum [of seven and five] I will still not find twelve in it”, and also positively, claiming that “One must go beyond these concepts [of seven and five], seeking assistance in the intuition that corresponds to one of the two, one’s five fingers, say…and one after another add the units of the five given in the intuition to the concept of seven…and thus see the number 12 arise” (B15). He takes it to follow that the necessary truth of an arithmetic proposition such as “7 + 5 = 12” cannot be established by any method of logical or conceptual analysis (Anderson 2004, 2015), but can be established by intuitive synthesis (Parsons 1969). Recently, discussions of Kant’s theory of arithmetic have shifted focus from questions about the syntheticity and apriority of arithmetic judgments to investigations into Kant’s account of number. Topics that arise here include ordinality and cardinality (Sutherland 2017, 2020); real numbers (Tait 2020; van Atten 2012); finitism (Tait 2016; Sieg 2016); infinity and infinitesmals (Brittan 2020; Smyth 2014, 2021; Warren 2020); and the centrality of the concept of number in Kant’s conception of the possibility of experience (Carson 2020).

Kant follows his discussion of arithmetic reasoning and truth with corresponding claims about Euclidean geometry, according to which the principles of geometry express synthetic relations between concepts (such as between the concept of the straight line between two points and the concept of the shortest line between those same two points), neither of which can be analytically “extracted” from the other. The principles of geometry thus express relations among basic geometric concepts inasmuch as these can be “exhibited in intuition” (Shabel 2003; Sutherland 2005a). Elsewhere, Kant also includes geometric theorems as the sorts of propositions (in addition to geometric principles) that count as synthetic, and offers thoughts about geometric proof (A716–7/B744–5) (Friedman 1992, 2010; Shabel 2004). One way to understand the syntheticity of geometric theorems is by recognizing an indispensable diagrammatic role for intuitions in geometric proof (Shabel 2004, 2004).

Notably, the scope of Kant’s claim that geometric theorems are synthetic is not transparent. Having denied that the principles (Grundsätze) could be cognized analytically from the principle of contradiction, he admits that mathematical inference of the kind needed to establish geometric theorems does proceed “in accordance with the principle of contradiction”, and also that “a synthetic proposition can of course be comprehended in accordance with the principle of contradiction” though “only insofar as another synthetic proposition is presupposed from which it can be deduced, never in itself” (B14). So, while he is clear that all mathematical judgments, including geometric theorems, are synthetic, he is less clear about exactly what it means for such propositions or the inferences that support them to “accord with” the principle of contradiction, derivability from which he takes to be the paradigm test of analyticity (Hogan 2020). This leads to an interpretive disagreement as to whether demonstrable mathematical judgments follow from the synthetic principles via strictly logical or conceptual inference—and so in strict accordance with only the principle of contradiction—or whether they are deduced via inferences that are themselves reliant on intuition, but which do not violate the law of contradiction. There is thus disagreement over whether Kant is committed merely to the syntheticity of the axioms of mathematics (which transmit syntheticity to demonstrable theorems via logical inference), or is also committed to the syntheticity of mathematical inference itself. The former interpretive position is originally associated with Ernst Cassirer and Lewis White Beck; the latter position with Bertrand Russell (Hogan 2020). Gordon Brittan (Brittan 2006) conceives both such positions “evidentialist”, which is his label for any interpretation according to which intuitions provide indispensable evidence for the truth of mathematics, whether that evidence is provided in support of axioms or inferences, or both (Brittan 2006).

Attention to this interpretive issue in Kant’s philosophy of mathematics is vital for the light it sheds on the more general question of what makes synthetic a priori cognition possible, the central question of Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason. With respect to this more general question, it is important to differentiate Kant’s use of the terms “analytic” and “synthetic” to mark a logico-semantic distinction between types of judgments—which Kant uses to defend the distinctive thesis that mathematical cognition is synthetic a priori—from his use of the same terms to mark a traditional mathematical distinction, between analytic and synthetic methods. He deploys the latter distinction in order to identify two distinct argumentative strategies for answering the question of the “possibility of pure mathematics.” The analytic method is characterized by reasoning that traces a given body of cognition, such as mathematics, to its origin or sources in the mind. By contrast, the synthetic method aims to derive real cognition directly from such original cognitive sources, which sources or powers are first explicated independently of any particular body of cognition (including mathematics) that the powers might ultimately produce. Kant adopts the former method in his Prolegomena, arguing from the synthetic and a priori nature of mathematical judgment to the claim that space and time are the forms of human sensibility; he adopts the latter method in the Critique of Pure Reason, arguing that the forms of human sensibility, space and time, provide the basis from which to derive synthetic and a priori mathematical judgments (Shabel 2004). These arguments, together with the details of his account of the synthetic and a priori nature of all mathematical judgment, provide an answer to the question of the possibility of mathematics: the practices that yield the paradigmatically synthetic and a priori judgments of the science of mathematics are grounded in and explained by the very nature of human sensibility, and, in particular, by the spatio-temporal form of all (and only) the objects of human experience (Van Cleve 1999). But, this answer raises further questions, in particular about how to distinguish between metaphysical and geometric representations of space (Carson 1997; Friedman 2000, 2015, 2020; Onof and Schulting 2014; Tolley 2016).

2.3 Kant’s conception of the role of mathematics in Transcendental Idealism

Kant’s theory of mathematical practice connects not only with his theory of intuition and sensibility (as described above) but also with other aspects of the doctrine of Transcendental Idealism, as it is articulated throughout Kant’s critical works.

In the Transcendental Analytic, Kant deduces the table of twelve categories, or pure concepts of the understanding, the first six of which he describes as “mathematical” (as opposed to “dynamical”) categories because of their concern with objects of intuition (B110). The concept of number is treated as “belonging” to the category of “allness” or totality, which is itself thought to result from the combination of the concepts of unity and plurality (Parsons 1984; see 2.2 above for other topics related to Kant’s account of number). But, Kant claims further that difficulties that arise in the representation of infinities—in which one allegedly represents unity and plurality with no resulting representation of number—reveal that a concept of number must require the mediation of “a special act of the understanding” (B111). (This special act is presumably the synthesis that Kant describes as a function of both imagination and understanding, and which it is the business of the full theory of judgment—including the Transcendental Deduction and the Schematism—to explain (Carson 2017; Longuenesse 1998).) So, though he also claims that arithmetic “forms its concepts of numbers through successive addition of units in time” (4:283), it is misleading to infer that arithmetic is to time as geometry is to space, since a formal intuition of time is inadequate to explain the general and abstract science of number.[5] In fact, Kant declares mechanics to be the mathematical science that is to time what geometry is to space (Sutherland 2014).

In the Schematism, Kant undertakes to identify the particular mechanism that enables the pure concepts of the understanding to subsume sensible intuitions, with which they are heterogeneous. The categories must be “schematized” because their non-empirical origin in pure understanding prevents their having the sort of sensible content that would connect them immediately to the objects of experience; transcendental schemata are mediating representations that are meant to establish the connection between pure concepts and appearances in a rule-governed way. Mathematical concepts are discussed in this context since they are unique in being pure but also sensible concepts: they are pure because they are strictly a priori in origin, and yet they are sensible since they are constructed in concreto. (Kant further complicates this issue by identifying number as the pure schema of the category of magnitude (Longuenesse 1998).) There arises an interpretive question as to whether mathematical concepts, whose conceptual content is given sensibly, require schematization by a distinguishable “third thing”, and, if so, what it amounts to (Leavitt 1991; Young 1984). More broadly, the question arises as to how the transcendental imagination, the faculty responsible for schematism, operates in mathematical contexts (Domski 2010).

Finally, in the Analytic of Principles, Kant derives the synthetic judgments that “flow a priori from pure concepts of the understanding” and which ground all other a priori cognitions, including those of mathematics (A136/B175). The principles of pure understanding that are associated with the categories of quantity (i.e., unity, plurality and totality) are the Axioms of Intuition. Whereas mathematical principles proper are “drawn only from intuition” and so do not constitute any part of the system of principles of pure understanding, the explanation for the possibility of such mathematical principles (outlined above) must be supplemented by an account of the highest possible transcendental principles (A148–9/B188–9) (Shabel 2017). Accordingly, the Axioms of Intuition provide a meta-principle, or principle of the mathematical principles of quantity, namely that “All intuitions are extensive magnitudes” (A161/B202). Most commentators interpret Kant here to be indicating why the principles of mathematics, which have to do with pure space and time, are applicable to the appearances: the appearances can only be represented “through the same synthesis as that through which space and time in general are determined” (A161/B202). So, all intuitions, whether pure or empirical, are “extensive magnitudes” that are governed by the principles of mathematics. (For an alternative view of the Axioms, see Sutherland 2005b).

It is also notable that key passages in the Critique of the Power of Judgment deal with mathematics and the “mathematical sublime” (Fugate 2014; Breitenbach 2015). See especially [5:248ff].

3. Commentary on Kant’s Philosophy of Mathematics

3.1 History of the Field

Kant’s conception of mathematics was debated by his contemporaries; influenced and provoked Frege, Russell and Husserl; and provided inspiration for Brouwerian Intuitionism. His conception of mathematics was rejuvenated as worthy of close historical study by Gottfried Martin’s 1938 monograph Arithmetik und Kombinatoric bei Kant (Martin 1985). Despite the very different positions that contemporary commentators develop as to how best to understand Kant’s thought, they are broadly united in opposing a long-standard story (perhaps originally promoted by Bertrand Russell in his Principles of Mathematics and by Rudolph Carnap in his Philosophical Foundations of Physics) according to which the development of modern logic in the 19th and 20th centuries, the discovery of non-Euclidean geometries, and the formalization of mathematics renders Kant’s intuition-based theory of mathematics and related philosophical commitments obsolete or irrelevant. Contemporary commentators seek to reconstruct Kant’s philosophy of mathematics from the vantage of Kant’s own historical context and also to identify the elements of Kant’s philosophy of mathematics that are of eternal philosophical interest (Parsons 2014).

English language scholarship in the analytic tradition on Kant’s philosophy of mathematics (the focus of this article) has been influenced most strongly by an enduring debate between Jaakko Hintikka and Charles Parsons over Kant’s view of the role of intuition in mathematics, leading to what have come to be known as the “logical” and “phenomenological” interpretations; by Michael Friedman’s seminal book, Kant and the Exact Sciences (Friedman 1992), as well as his now classic articles “Kant’s Theory of Geometry” and “Geometry, Construction and Intuition in Kant and his Successors” (Friedman 1985, 2000); and by the papers collected in Carl Posy’s volume Kants Philosophy of Mathematics: Modern Essays (which includes contributions by Hintikka, Parsons and Friedman, as well as by Stephen Barker, Gordon Brittan, William Harper, Philip Kitcher, Arthur Melnick, Carl Posy, Manley Thompson, and J.Michael Young, all of which were published more than twenty five years ago (Posy 1992).)

3.2 Interpretive Debates

The interpretive debate over how to understand Kant’s view of the role of intuition in mathematical reasoning has had the strongest influence on the shape of scholarship in Kant’s philosophy of mathematics; this debate is directly related to the question (described above) of the syntheticity of mathematical axioms, theorems and inferences. In his general discussion of mental representation, Kant implies that immediacy and singularity are both criteria of non-conceptual, intuitive representation, the species of representation that grounds synthetic judgment. In a series of papers, Charles Parsons (Parsons 1964, 1969, 1984) has argued that the syntheticity of mathematical judgments depends on mathematical intuitions being fundamentally immediate, and he explains the immediacy of such representations in a perceptual way, as a direct, phenomenological presence to the mind. Jaakko Hintikka (Hintikka 1965, 1967, 1969), developing an idea from E.W. Beth’s earlier work, counters that the syntheticity of mathematical judgments instead depends only on the singularity of their intuitive constituents. Hintikka assimilates mathematical intuitions to singular terms or particulars, and explains the use of intuition in a mathematical context by analogy to an application of the logical rule of existential instantiation. These two positions have come to be known as the “phenomenological” and “logical” interpretations, respectively.

Michael Friedman’s original position (Friedman 1985, 1992) with respect to the role of intuition in mathematical reasoning descends from Beth’s and Hintikka’s, though it is substantially different from theirs and has been modified in his most recent writings. In his Kant and the Exact Sciences (Friedman 1992), Friedman takes the position that our modern conception of logic ought to be used as a tool for interpreting (rather than criticizing) Kant, noting that the explicit representation of an infinity of mathematical objects that can be generated by the polyadic logic of modern quantification theory is conceptually unavailable to the mathematician and logician of Kant’s time. As a result of the inadequacy of monadic logic to represent an infinity of objects, the eighteenth-century mathematician relies on intuition to deliver the representations necessary for mathematical reasoning. Friedman explicates the details of Kant’s philosophy of mathematics on the basis of this historical insight.

Friedman has modified his original position in response to criticism from Emily Carson (Carson 1997), who has developed an interpretation of Kant’s theory of geometry that is Parsonsian in its anti-formalist emphasis on the epistemological and phenomenological over the logical role for intuition in mathematics. In recent work (Friedman 2000, 2010), Friedman argues that the intuition that grounds geometry is fundamentally kinematical, and is best explained by the translations and rotations that describe both the constructive action of the Euclidean geometer and the perceptual point of view of the ordinary, spatially oriented observer. This account provides a synthesis between the logical and phenomenological interpretive accounts, in large part by connecting the geometrical space that is explored by the imagination via Euclidean constructions to the perspectival space that is, according to Kant, the form of all outer sensibility. More specifically, Friedman reconciles the logical interpretation with the phenomenological by “[embedding] the purely logical understanding of geometrical constructions (as Skolem functions) within space as the pure form of our outer sensible intuition (as described in the Transcendental Aesthetic)” (Friedman 2012, n.17). Additionally, Friedman has argued against diagrammatic interpretations of Kantian intuition (Friedman 2012) and has marshalled evidence from the B-Deduction to support his understanding of the connections among geometrical construction, the space of perception, and physical space (Friedman 2020), and the relation between geometry and experience (Friedman 2015).

3.3. Current State of the Field

New generations of scholars contribute to a lively, fertile and ongoing discussion about the interpretation and legacy of Kant’s philosophy of mathematics that originated with the literature mentioned in 3.1 and 3.2, above. However, recent work is not easily categorized as landing on either side of one or another interpretive debate; most scholars are using the field’s foundational discussions as a springboard from which to explore the variety of ways in which mathematics plays a role in the critical philosophy. In 2020, Carl Posy and Ofra Rechter published the first volume of a two-volume successor to Posy’s 1992 collection, entitled Kants Philosophy of Mathematics, Volume I: The Critical Philosophy and Its Roots. This first volume includes twelve essays on topics that range from the pre-critical origins of Kant’s philosophy of mathematics to his critical thoughts on mathematical method, logic, geometry and arithmetic. The essays in the forthcoming second volume will focus on the reception and influence of Kant’s philosophy of mathematics. Also notable is a collection of articles first published in a special issue of the Canadian Journal of Philosophy, Kant: Studies on Mathematics in the Critical Philosophy, edited by Emily Carson and Lisa Shabel (Carson and Shabel 2014). The nine contributions collected here aim to explore the centrality of mathematics in Kant’s overall philosophical system. Daniel Sutherland has recently written a book-length treatment of Kant’s philosophy of mathematics, Kants Mathematical World: Mathematics, Cognition, and Experience (Sutherland 2021), in which he focuses on Kant’s theory of magnitudes as the key to Kant’s account of our cognition and experience of the world. A second volume is forthcoming.


References to Kant’s texts follow the pagination of the Academy edition (Gesammelte Schriften, Akademie der Wissenschaften (ed.), Berlin: Reimer/DeGruyter, 1910ff.) References to the Critique of Pure Reason employ the usual A/B convention. Translations are from the Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant.

  • Anderson, R. L., 2004, “It Adds Up After All: Kant’s Philosophy of Arithmetic in Light of the Traditional Logic”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 69 (3): 501–540.
  • –––, 2015, “Ineliminable Synthetic Truth in Elementary Mathematics”, in R.L. Anderson, The Poverty of Conceptual Truth, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 209–266.
  • Barker, S., 1992, “Kant’s View of Geometry: A Partial Defense”, in Posy 1992, pp. 221–244.
  • Breitenbach, A., 2015, “Beauty in Proofs: Kant on Aesthetics in Mathematics”, European Journal of Philosophy, 23 (4): 955–977.
  • Brittan, G., 1992, “Algebra and Intuition” in Posy 1992, pp. 315–340.
  • –––, 2006, “Kant’s Philosophy of Mathematics”, in G. Bird (ed.), A Companion to Kant, Malden, MA: Blackwell, 222–235.
  • –––, 2020, “Continuity, Constructibility, and Intuitivity”, in Posy and Rechter 2020, pp. 181–199.
  • Buroker, J. V., 1981, Space and Incongruence: The Origin of Kant’s Idealism, Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
  • Butts, R., 1981, “Rules, Examples and Constructions Kant’s Theory of Mathematics”, Synthese, 47 (2): 257–288.
  • Callanan, J., 2014, “Kant on the Acquisition of Geometrical Concepts”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 44(5/6), 580–604; reprinted in Carson and Shabel 2016.
  • Capozzi, M., 2020, “Singular Terms and Intuitions in Kant: A Reappraisal”, in Posy and Rechter 2020, pp. 103–125.
  • Carson, E., 1997, “Kant on Intuition in Geometry”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 27 (4): 489–512.
  • –––, 1999, “Kant on the Method of Mathematics”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 37 (4): 629–652.
  • –––, 2002, “Locke’s Account of Certain and Instructive Knowledge”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 10 (3): 359–378.
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