Kant’s Philosophy of Science

First published Tue Oct 21, 2003; substantive revision Mon Sep 18, 2023

Kant’s philosophy of science has received attention from several different audiences and for a variety of reasons. It is of interest to contemporary philosophers of science because of the way in which Kant attempts to articulate a philosophical framework that places substantive conditions on our scientific knowledge of the world while still respecting the autonomy and diverse claims of particular sciences. Of enduring interest is also his doctrine of laws, including those of scientific theories.

Kant’s scientific writings are also of interest to historians of modern philosophy, historians of science, and historians of philosophy of science. Historians of modern philosophy are especially interested in determining how Kant’s views on science might complement or clarify his distinctive metaphysical and epistemological doctrines (e.g., as expressed in the Critique of Pure Reason). Historians of science reflect on how Kant’s position fits in with the views of other natural philosophers of the period, such as Newton and Leibniz. Historians of philosophy of science investigate, among other things, Kant’s work in the conceptual foundations of physics — in particular, his matter theory, his theory of motion, and his account of the basic laws of mechanics.

Because physics was Kant’s primary (though not exclusive) focus over the course of his lengthy career, his views on physics during his pre-Critical (1746–70), Critical (1781–90), and Post-Critical periods (after 1790) will be discussed in separate sections. Subsections will be devoted to each of the chapters of Kant’s most influential work in philosophy of science, the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (1786). Kant’s basic positions on other sciences, including psychology, chemistry, and history, will be presented thereafter.

1. Physics: The Pre-Critical Period

Kant’s early pre-Critical publications aim to solve a variety of broadly cosmological problems, and to develop an increasingly comprehensive metaphysics that would ground the matter theory required by the solutions to these problems. Kant’s first publication, Thoughts on the True Estimation of Living Forces (1746), explicitly attempts to solve the vis viva controversy, which had been hotly contested ever since Leibniz’s 1686 attack on Descartes’ laws of motion. While Kant attempts to occupy an intermediary position between the Cartesian and Leibnizian positions by maintaining that both mv and mv² could be conserved in different contexts, what is of particular note is how his solution in Parts II and III rests on the conception of force developed in Part I. According to this conception, force is understood in terms of the activity of substances, an activity that Kant then uses to explain how the motions of bodies are generated, to solve the mind-body problem, and to account for both the possibility of other, actually existing worlds and the three-dimensionality of space.

His solution to the vis viva dispute is especially interesting, because it presages his later approach to philosophical controversy. Rather than offering a conclusive argument in favor of one position, Kant seeks to mediate between the two parties, Leibnizian and Cartesian. He argues that each measure of force is correct, but in different contexts. Kant distinguishes two ways of studying bodies, “mathematical” and “metaphysical,” and claims that they presuppose distinct conceptions of body. According to mathematical mechanics, a body cannot accelerate unless an external cause acts on it; for that reason, Kant declares, the Cartesians’ quantity mv is the only one appropriate measure of force in this context. “Natural bodies,” in contrast, have features that mathematics brackets. One such feature is a capacity for “vivification,” whereby a body increases by itself the force of motion that an external cause merely “awakens.” In light of that, Kant concludes, the Leibnizian quantity mv2 is the correct measure of force in metaphysical considerations of “natural bodies” (1:140f).

Kant develops his account of the nature of substance in greater detail in A New Elucidation of the First Principles of Metaphysical Cognition (1755). While the first two sections of this work undertake revisions of Wolff’s principles of non-contradiction and sufficient reason, the third section argues for two substantive principles that are alleged to follow from the principle of sufficient (or rather, following Crusius, determining) reason, namely the principles of succession and coexistence. The main thrust of the principle of succession is directed against Leibnizian pre-established harmony, arguing that only causal connections between substances can bring about changes in their states. Kant’s position appears to be designed to account primarily for changes of bodily states (with changes in mental states being parasitic upon them, as was explicitly asserted in the True Estimation). For he maintains that mutual changes of state require mutual interaction, where it is clear that changes in motion are precisely the kind of mutual change that he has in mind (since one body cannot move closer to another without the other body moving closer to it). The principle of coexistence then argues that harmonious causal interaction between otherwise isolated, independently existing substances is possible only by means of God’s coordination (just as Leibniz thought was required for harmonious relations between the states of such substances).

Kant’s Physical Monadology (1756) articulates a theory of matter that can reconcile the infinite divisibility of space, as maintained in geometry, with the simplicity of substances, which Kant believes is required in metaphysics. As was the case with his earlier works, the essential feature of his reconciliation lies in the way in which his matter theory is supported by his metaphysical views. Specifically, Kant asserts that simple substances fill space not by means of their mere existence, but rather in virtue of their spheres of activity. As a result, any division of the relevant spheres of activity does not compromise the simplicity of the substances themselves, since the spatial properties of substances (including the infinite divisibility of space) arise from the interaction between their activities rather than from their intrinsic features. In the course of the Physical Monadology, Kant also argues for the necessity of attractive and repulsive forces and attributes a significant role to the force of inertia. Kant’s acceptance of such Newtonian principles represents an important change of position over the True Estimation, where Kant rejects the principle of inertia and pursues a dynamical theory much more in line with Leibniz’s views.

Later in his pre-Critical period (1763–70), Kant attempts to build a comprehensive metaphysical account on the basis of the framework that he had established in his first works. Thus, in his The Only Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God (1763) he attempts to extend his reasoning to fundamental issues in both philosophical theology and teleology, presenting, for the first time, his now famous criticisms of the three traditional arguments for the existence of God, while developing a new theistic proof, based on the idea that God is necessary as a real ground of the possibilities of things. After reading Hume’s Enquiry concerning Human Understanding in German translation sometime after 1755, Kant distinguishes between real and logical grounds/opposition in his Attempt to Introduce the Concept of Negative Magnitudes into Philosophy (1763) to avoid Hume’s objection that there is no logical contradiction in the existence of one thing not following the existence of another. But in this work he is also interested in exploring the notion of a real ground/opposition further by applying it more widely, e.g., to bodies, mental states, etc. Also relevant is Kant’s Concerning the Ultimate Foundation of the Distinction of the Directions in Space (1768) which modifies his earlier account of space insofar as he seems to hold that certain spatial properties — viz., chirality, or handedness — may not be able to be explained entirely in terms of direct relations between material substances. In his so-called Inaugural Dissertation (1770), Kant continues to develop a more comprehensive philosophical system, which would encompass the principles of both the sensible and the intelligible world, and in so doing modifies his account of space and time even further. Over the course of the next ten years, during which he published almost nothing, Kant would revise his views more systematically, with the publication of the Critique of Pure Reason in 1781 representing the first major step in his “critical turn.”

Adickes (1924), Harman (1982), Friedman (1992), Laywine (1993), Schönfeld (2000), Kuehn (2001), Lefevre & Wunderlich (2000), and Watkins (1997, 2001, 2003, 2006, 2013) have emphasized the importance of scientific issues in the development of Kant’s thought during his pre-Critical period, as he reacted to Leibniz, Newton and other, more immediate predecessors (such as Christian Wolff, Chr. A. Crusius, Leonhard Euler, Maupertuis, and Martin Knutzen). Smith (2013) reconstructs Kant’s picture of matter in the Physical Monadology.

2. Physics: The Critical Period (Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science)

Though Kant discusses issues relevant to physics in various works throughout the Critical period (esp. the Critique of Pure Reason), his views on this topic are developed most explicitly in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (1786), which consists of a preface and four chapters.

2.1 Preface

In the Preface to the Metaphysical Foundations Kant (i) analyzes the concepts of nature and science so as to establish what conditions must be met for a body of knowledge to constitute natural science in the proper sense, (ii) explains why science so understood requires “a pure part” (4:469) and what criteria would have to be satisfied for such a pure part to exist, (iii) argues that chemistry and psychology cannot at present meet these criteria, and (iv) describes what procedure should be followed to satisfy these criteria and thus to provide the “pure part” that science proper requires.

The feature of Kant’s conception of natural science proper that is most immediately striking is how restrictive it is. It requires that cognition (i) be systematically ordered (ii) according to rational principles and (iii) be known a priori with apodictic certainty, i.e., with “consciousness of their necessity” (4:468). Because properly scientific cognition must satisfy these strict conditions, it requires “a pure part on which the apodictic certainty that reason seeks can be based” (4:469). But since Kant identifies pure rational cognition that is generated from concepts with metaphysics, it follows that science proper requires a metaphysics of nature. He then specifies that such a metaphysics of nature could consist in either a “transcendental part,” which discusses the laws that make possible the concept of a nature in general — “even without relation to any determinate object of experience” (4:469) — or a “special metaphysical” part, which concerns a “particular nature of this or that kind of things” for which an empirical concept is given.

Kant’s very conception of natural science proper thus immediately gives rise to several systematically important questions. First, if the “transcendental part” of the metaphysics of nature can be identified with the results of the Critique of Pure Reason, then the Metaphysical Foundations is a work in special metaphysics. But what exactly is a special metaphysics? In particular, what particular natures or kinds of things could be its object? And how precisely can an empirical concept of such things be given without compromising the necessity required of the pure part of natural science? Second, how is the special metaphysics provided by the Metaphysical Foundations supposed to be related to the transcendental part of the metaphysics of nature that was established in the Critique of Pure Reason? Does the former presuppose the principles of the latter or are they logically independent, but still related to each other in some other way? Another question concerns the method of special metaphysics. Is that method the conceptual analysis (of the notion of matter), the transcendental investigation of the presuppositions of the mathematical science of nature, or something else entirely?

First, Kant suggests that in special metaphysics the principles of the transcendental part “are applied to the two species of objects of our senses” (4:470). Thus, the particular kinds of things that could be investigated in a special metaphysics are (i) the objects of outer sense, i.e., matter, and (ii) the objects of inner sense, i.e., thinking beings, which would thus result in a doctrine of body and a doctrine of soul. Kant then argues that because “the possibility of determinate natural things cannot be cognized from their mere concepts … it is still required that the intuition corresponding to the concept be given a priori, that is, that the concept be constructed” (4:470), which is a task that requires mathematics. This is Kant’s justification for his famous claim that “in any special doctrine of nature there can be only as much proper science as there is mathematics therein” (4:470). This argument suggests that the necessity required of the pure part of natural science derives from the necessity of the rules by which the mathematical construction of determinate things must proceed.

Kant then uses the claim that science proper requires the construction of the concept of the object in a priori intuition to exclude the possibility that chemistry and psychology, at least as they were practiced at that time, could count as science proper. In the case of chemistry, the problem is that “no law of the approach or withdrawal of the parts of matter can be specified according to which … their motions and all the consequences thereof can be made intuitive and presented a priori in space (a demand that will only with great difficulty ever be fulfilled)” (4:471). Since its principles are “merely empirical,” it can, at best, be a “systematic art” (ibid.). The case of psychology is more complex, since Kant provides (at least) two separate reasons in the Preface for denying it the status of natural science proper. First, Kant claims that mathematics is inapplicable to the phenomena of inner sense and their laws, though he grants that the law of continuity (discussed, e.g., at A207–209/B253–255 and A228–229/B281 in the Critique of Pure Reason) ought to apply to changes in our representations as well. He downplays the significance of this application of the law of continuity, however, by noting that time has only one dimension, which does not provide enough material to extend our cognition significantly. Second, Kant also complains that empirical psychology cannot separate and recombine the phenomena of inner sense at will; rather, our inner observations can be separated “only by mere division in thought” (4:471). Kant’s fuller views on chemistry and psychology will be discussed further below.

Second, in explaining how mathematics can be applied to bodies Kant asserts that “principles for the construction of the concepts that belong to the possibility of matter in general must first be introduced. Therefore a complete analysis of the concept of a matter in general [must be provided in which it] makes use of no particular experiences, but only that which it finds in the isolated (although intrinsically empirical) concept itself, in relation to the pure intuitions in space and time, and in accordance with laws that already essentially attach to the concept of nature in general” (4:472). Kant then explains that this means that the concept of matter must be determined according to the Critique of Pure Reason’s categories of quantity, quality, relation, and modality (4:474–476). Further, Kant holds that “a new determination” (4:476) must be added to the concept of matter in each chapter of the Metaphysical Foundations. This suggests not only that the principles argued for in the Metaphysical Foundations are to be developed “in accordance with” the principles defended in the Critique of Pure Reason, but also that both the concept of matter and the Metaphysical Foundations itself is structured according to the Critique of Pure Reason’s table of categories.

Unfortunately, these points of clarification do not resolve all of the issues that are immediately raised by Kant’s pronouncements about what is required for natural science proper. One further issue that is relevant here concerns the concept of matter that is at the heart of the Metaphysical Foundations. Kant introduces it in the Critique of Pure Reason (A847–848/B875–876) as the concept of something that is impenetrable, extended, and inert. Yet, in the beginning of the Preface of the Metaphysical Foundations, he describes it as whatever is an object of outer sense, and later he argues that the “basic determination of something that is to be an object of the outer senses had to be motion, because only thereby can these senses be affected” (4:476). Whatever weight one accords Kant’s justification of the connection between matter, outer sense, and motion, one faces a dilemma. If the concept of matter, most fundamentally, is simply the concept of any object of outer sense, then how is it still empirical in any genuine sense (and what has become of the structural difference Kant draws between the Critique of Pure Reason and the Metaphysical Foundations)? If, by contrast, impenetrability, extension, and movability are deemed the basic traits of the concept of matter, then how can one know a priori that any object we might encounter in outer sense must behave in accordance with the laws that would govern matter so defined?

Moreover, even if one can find an appropriately nuanced sense in which the concept of matter is empirical while still allowing for an appropriate kind of necessity, questions can still be posed about the “new determinations” that are to be added to that concept in each chapter of the Metaphysical Foundations. For example, what is the justification for each specific determination that is added when one thinks of matter as having a quantity, a quality, etc.? Also, what is the relationship between each new determination of matter and the various claims that Kant makes in each chapter of the Metaphysical Foundations? In particular, when Kant explicitly invokes principles for constructing concepts belonging to the possibility of matter, is his idea that these principles are required insofar as they make experience of the relevant “new determination” of matter possible (so that Kant would be developing a transcendental argument in the Metaphysical Foundations similar in many respects to the Critique of Pure Reason)? Answers to these questions depend on how one interprets the arguments Kant develops throughout the Metaphysical Foundations.

The conception of science that Kant presents in the Preface has been the focus of considerable attention over the past several decades. In the German literature, the issues raised above have been discussed at length by Plaass (1965), Cramer (1985), and others. Pollok (2001) has recently produced a detailed and comprehensive textual commentary on the Metaphysical Foundations. Important work has also been done in the English literature by Walker (1974), Brittan (1978), Buchdahl (1968, 1969, and 1986), Parsons (1984), Butts (1986), and Watkins (1998a). Friedman (1992, 2001, 2002 and 2013) has been especially influential on these issues as well. Several chapters (by Sturm, Breitenbach, and Friedman, respectively) in McNulty 2022 add to our understanding of this aspect in Kant’s thought.

2.2 Phoronomy

The first chapter of the Metaphysical Foundations, the Phoronomy, considers the quantity of motion of matter and how it is to be constructed in intuition a priori (so as to produce the kind of rules that are necessary for our experience of matter in motion). Since extension and impenetrability are not directly relevant to how different magnitudes (or degrees) of motion can be represented, Kant restricts his discussion in this chapter to matter considered as a point. Since the motion of a point in space can be represented straightforwardly, the main issue is how to represent the composition of two different motions. Kant’s primary claim in this chapter is that due to the relativity of space (i.e., the fact that every motion can be viewed arbitrarily as either the motion of a body in a space at rest, or as a body in a state of rest in a space which is in motion in the opposite direction with the same velocity) “the composition of two motions of one and the same point can only be thought in such a way that one of them is represented in absolute space, and, instead of the other, a motion of the relative space with the same speed occurring in the opposite direction is represented as the same as the latter” (4:490). The proof of this Theorem considers the three possible cases for the composition of two motions: (i) The two motions are in the same direction; (ii) the two motions are in opposite directions; (iii) the two motions enclose an angle. Kant then shows how one can construct a priori in intuition a single motion out of the two motions described in cases (i)-(iii). The synthetic a priori outcome of this constructive procedure is a composition theorem that covers two fundamental results of classical physics: the parallelogram rule for velocity addition, and the Galilean kinematic transformations. The theorem is needed for architectonic reasons too, not just as a foundation for science. Kant uses the composition theorem as a premise in his Dynamics, so as to infer a priori to forces from the composite motions they cause (e.g., 4:497). And, he invokes the theorem explicitly in his Mechanics, in the course of “constructing the communication of motion,” i.e. deriving the laws of impact (4:546).

Until recently, very little has been written directly on Kant’s Phoronomy. Pollok (2001) is a historically rich commentary. Friedman (2013) untangles the complex strands of thought in Kant’s chapter. His leading idea is that Kant’s categories of quantity (of the First Critique) guarantee that motion is a magnitude, hence mathematics is applicable to the motions of bodies—as kinematics. Two chapters (by Dunlop and Stan, respectively) in McNulty 2022 add to our understanding of this aspect in Kant’s thought.

2.3 Dynamics

The second chapter of the Metaphysical Foundations, the Dynamics, considers how it is possible to experience matter as filling a determinate region in space. Propositions 1–4 are devoted to exhibiting the nature and necessity of repulsive forces. In Proposition 1 Kant argues that repulsive force is required for matter to fill space, since solidity, understood by “Lambert and others” as the property matter would have by means of “its mere existence” (4:497), cannot truly explain how one matter resists another matter’s attempt to penetrate it. Kant then specifies several central features of repulsive forces in Propositions 2 and 3. Repulsive forces admit of degrees to infinity, since one must always be able to think of a slightly greater or lesser force, and although matter can be compressed to infinity, it can never be penetrated, since that would require an infinite compressing force, which is impossible.

In Proposition 4 Kant draws an important consequence from his characterization of repulsive forces, namely that matter is infinitely divisible (4:503). What is especially striking about this point is that it represents a significant departure from his own earlier Physical Monadology, where he had accepted attractive and repulsive forces, but denied the infinite divisibility of what ultimately constitutes matter, namely physical points or monads. It is true that part of Kant’s rationale for his change of position on this point stems from the “critical turn” undertaken in the Critique of Pure Reason (and in its Second Antinomy in particular). For once one recognizes that both space and spatial properties such as divisibility are not properties of things in themselves but rather only appearances, one can reject the proposition that seems to necessitate the acceptance of simple substances, namely the idea that simple substances must precede the wholes they compose (4:506). However, Kant’s proof also seems to depend, in its details, not merely on the idea that every space is filled by means of some repulsive force or other, but on the stronger claim that every space is divisible into smaller spaces that are filled by different repulsive forces.

Propositions 5–8 are all devoted to attractive force. In Proposition 5 Kant argues that matter must have an attractive force in order to fill space. Kant’s argument is that if there were only repulsive forces, then matter “would disperse itself to infinity” (4:508) since neither space nor other matter could limit it. Proposition 6 argues that both attractive and repulsive forces must be considered essential to matter. That is, attractive forces alone are not sufficient to account for matter filling a space, since if matter consisted solely of attractive forces, there would be no force to counteract the attractive force being exercised and the universe would collapse into a single point. Together, Propositions 5 and 6 make up a ‘balancing argument’, which Kant had already used in the earlier Physical Monadology. (A balancing argument is an existence proof for a type of force. Its premises are (1) an accepted universal fact, viz. that a certain stable configuration obtains; and (2) a type of force independently known to exist. The argument seeks to prove that the stability in question is impossible unless a second kind of force exists to balance the first kind. In Kant’s particular version of the balancing argument, the universal fact is the constancy of mass density in a control volume; and the given force is “original repulsion,” whose existence he proves in Proposition 4.) Proposition 7 then specifies how attractive forces are to be understood, namely as the immediate action of matter on other matter through empty space (and therefore at a distance). Kant thus directly confronts the metaphysical question of how to understand attraction that Newton attempted to avoid by positing it merely mathematically. As Kant interprets the situation, Newton “abstracts from all hypotheses purporting to answer the question as to the cause of the universal attraction of matter … [since] this question is physical or metaphysical, but not mathematical” (4:515). In response to the “most common objection to immediate action at a distance,” namely “that a matter cannot act immediately where it is not” (4:513), Kant argues that action at a distance is no more problematic than action by contact (whether it be by collision or pressure), since in both cases a body is simply acting outside itself. Proposition 8 concludes by arguing that attractive forces act immediately to infinity and by adding a “preliminary suggestion” (4:518) as to how one might be able to construct the concept of cohesion (which Kant understands as attraction that is restricted to contact).

In the General Remark to Dynamics Kant addresses two main issues. First, Kant considers how it is that the specific varieties of matter (e.g., water as different from mercury) might be reduced, at least in principle, to the fundamental forces of attraction and repulsion. The second issue concerns the fundamental distinction between the “mathematical-mechanical” and the “metaphysical-dynamical mode of explanation”. The former mode of explanation, which is associated with the postulation of atoms and the void, employs nothing more than the shapes and motions of fundamental particles and empty interstices interspersed among them. It contrasts with the metaphysical-dynamical mode, which employs fundamental moving forces (e.g., attraction and repulsion) in its explanations. Kant grants that the mathematical-mechanical mode has an advantage over the metaphysical-dynamical mode, since its fundamental posits can be represented (indeed, “verified” (4:525)) mathematically, whereas he repeatedly admits that the possibility of fundamental forces can never be comprehended, i.e., their possibility can never be rendered certain. However, Kant thinks that this advantage is outweighed by two disadvantages. First, by presupposing absolute impenetrability, the mathematical-mechanical mode of explanation accepts an “empty concept” at its foundation. Second, by giving up all forces that would be inherent in matter, such a mode of explanation provides the imagination with more freedom “than is truly consistent with the caution of philosophy” (4:525).

Given that the bulk of Kant’s matter theory is presented in the Dynamics, it is unsurprising that it has received the greatest amount of attention in the literature. Of particular note are discussions by Buchdahl (1968, 1969), Brittan (1978), Kitcher (1983), Butts (1986), Carrier (1990), Friedman (1990), Malzkorn (1998), Warren (2001, 2010), Pollok (2002), Holden (2004), and Engelhard (2005). Friedman (2013) is an extensive commentary, under the overarching theme that Kant in the Dynamics aims to explain how certain features of body – density, volume, static weight – become mathematizable, as Newton’s dynamics illustrates paradigmatically. Two chapters (by McNulty and Warren, respectively) in McNulty 2022 add to our understanding of this aspect in Kant’s thought.

2.4 Mechanics

The third chapter of Kant’s Metaphysical Foundations, the Mechanics, concerns how it is possible to experience matter as having a moving force, that is, how one matter communicates its motion to another by means of its moving force. Kant begins, in Proposition 1, by clarifying how the quantity of matter is to be estimated before stating, in Propositions 2–4, three Laws of Mechanics.

After first defining the quantity of matter and the quantity of motion (or, in contemporary terms, impulse, i=mv), Kant asserts that the quantity of matter, in comparison with every other matter, can be estimated only by the quantity of motion at a given speed (4:537). Kant’s proof proceeds by way of elimination. The quantity of matter, which is the aggregate of the movable in a determinate space, cannot be estimated by counting the number of parts it has, since, as was established in the Dynamics, every matter is infinitely divisible. Nor can one estimate the quantity of matter merely by considering its volume, since different matters can have different specific densities. As a result, the only universally applicable way of estimating the quantity of matter is to hold the velocity of matter constant.

In Proposition 2, Kant states his First Law of Mechanics: the total quantity of matter remains the same throughout all changes in matter (4:541). His proof seems to rely (i) on the principle of the First Analogy of Experience that no substance arises or perishes throughout any change in nature and (ii) on the identification of what in matter must be substantial. On this latter point, Kant quickly assumes that the ultimate subject of all accidents inhering in matter must be the movable in space, and that its quantity is the aggregate of the movable in space. In his remark to this proposition, Kant explicitly notes that there is a crucial difference between spatial and non-spatial substances, since the latter, unlike the former, could gradually fade away by degrees. (Kant cites the possibility of consciousness as a concrete example.) Kant uses this difference to argue that since the quantity of matter consists in a plurality of real things external to each other that cannot fade away (as consciousness might), the only way to decrease its quantity is by division.

Kant’s Second Law of Mechanics, stated in Proposition 3, is that every change in matter has an external cause. (Immediately after this principle, Kant adds in parentheses a version of the law of inertia that is much closer to Newton’s: “every body persists in its state of rest or motion, in the same direction, and with the same speed, if it is not compelled by an external cause to leave this state” (4:543). Since Kant’s Second Law of Mechanics is not identical to Newton’s law of inertia, it would require argument to show that, and by means of what additional assumptions, the former entails the latter.) The proof of the main principle depends on the Second Analogy of Experience (which asserts that all changes occur in accordance with the law of cause and effect and thus entails that every change in matter has a cause) as well as on the further assumption that matter has no internal grounds of determinations (such as thinking and desiring), but rather only external relations in space. In his remark to this proposition, which clarifies this “law of inertia,” Kant explains that inertia is to be contrasted with life or the ability of a substance to determine itself to act from an internal principle. Thus, a body’s inertia “does not mean a positive striving to conserve its state” (4:544), but rather what it does not do, its lifelessness.

Kant also asserts that the very possibility of natural science proper depends on the law of inertia, since the rejection of it would be hylozoism, “the death of all natural philosophy” (4:544). In a later remark in the Mechanics, Kant explicitly objects that “the terminology of inertial force (vis inertiae) must be entirely banished from natural science, not only because it carries with it a contradiction in terms, nor even because the law of inertia (lifelessness) might thereby be easily confused with the law of reaction in every communicated motion, but primarily because the mistaken idea of those who are not properly acquainted with the mechanical laws is thereby maintained and even strengthened” (4:550). Kant goes on to point out that if inertia were to entail an active force of resistance, then it would be possible that when one moving body hits another, the moving body has to apply part of its motion solely to overcome the inertia of the one at rest and might not have any motion left over, as it were, to set the body at rest into motion, which is contrary to experience (and Proposition 2).

Kant’s Third Law of Mechanics, expressed in Proposition 4, asserts the equality of action and reaction in the communication of motion. Kant formulates a version of the Third Analogy of Experience (according to which all external action in the world is interaction) and suggests that the main point at issue in mechanics is establishing that mutual action is necessarily reaction. Kant’s argument for this law is based on the following line of thought: (i) if all changes of matter are changes of motion; (ii) if all changes of motion are reciprocal and equal (since one body cannot move closer to/farther away from another body without the second body moving closer to/farther away from the first body and by exactly the same amount); and (iii) if every change of matter has an external cause (a proposition that was established as the Second Law of Mechanics), then the cause of the change of motion of the one body entails an equal and opposite cause of a change of motion of the other body or, in short, action must be equal to reaction.

Kant’s Laws of Mechanics have been discussed widely in the secondary literature. Especially helpful discussions are Friedman (1989, 1992), Brittan (1995), Westphal (1995), Carrier (2001), and Watkins (1997 and 1998b). The most sustained and through discussion of them is in Watkins (2019). Much of the modern tradition of scholarship used to regard Kant’s laws of mechanics as derived from, or even identical with, Newton’s three laws in the Principia. Watkins (2019) shows that Kant’s formulation and justification of his laws was strongly influenced by a philosophy of nature stemming from Leibniz, not Newton. Stan (2013) further corroborates these findings. As a result, it is safe to say that Kant’s foundations of mechanics were significantly shaped by post-Leibnizian rationalism too, not just Newton’s mechanics. This fact is now reflected in Friedman (2013), the most recent and detailed account of Kant’s interpretation of the conceptual foundations of mechanics. Stan (2014) examines the conceptual link between Kant’s theory of matter and his laws of mechanics.

2.5 Phenomenology

The final chapter of the Metaphysical Foundations, the Phenomenology, focuses on how the motion of matter can be experienced modally. Specifically, Kant spells out conditions for us to judge legitimately that a body possibly moves; is really in motion; or that its motion is necessary. Its three Propositions specify (in accordance, Kant suggests, with the results of the three previous chapters) that (i) rectilinear motion is a merely possible predicate of matter, (ii) circular motion is an actual predicate of matter, and (iii) the equal and opposite motion of one matter with respect to another is a necessary motion of that matter. In the General Remark to the Phenomenology, Kant discusses the status of absolute space, which had been presupposed by the possible, actual, and necessary motions of matter at issue in the three main propositions, and explains that since it is not itself an object of experience, it must be represented by means of an idea of reason (in Kant’s technical sense of “idea,” namely, as a concept for which a corresponding object could never be given to us in intuition). Though we can never know absolute space, it nonetheless functions as a regulative principle that guides us in our scientific practice by forcing us to look for further conditions for the conditioned objects we meet with in experience. Kant’s view that ideas of reason can function as regulative principles is developed in the Appendix to the Transcendental Dialectic in the Critique of Pure Reason.

Friedman’s interpretation of the Phenomenology deserves special mention. According to him, in light of Kant’s rejection of Newton’s absolute space and time, he must give an account of the concept of true motion – as change of true place over time – presupposed by classical mechanics. To this end, Kant “views the laws of motion as definitive or constitutive of the spatio-temporal framework of Newtonian theory,” hence these laws “count as a priori” for him (1992, 143). The reason Kant takes them as constitutive is the following. In Kant’s Phenomenology, the three Newtonian laws define a concept of true motion: the true motions of bodies just are those that obey the dynamical laws. Moreover, the concept must be given “objective meaning in experience,” viz. measured empirically. To do so, Kant views Newton’s three laws as holding primarily in a privileged system of reference, namely the center-of-mass (CM) frame of the system of the world, which the CM-frame of our Solar System approximates to a very good degree. Thus, by measuring the motions of bodies relative to this frame, we produce objective experience of these motions. However, this frame must first be located. To do so, Kant thinks, we must likewise count the law of universal gravitation as a priori, not empirical-inductive. If we know a priori that all bodies in the Solar System necessarily attract each other, from their observable, mutually-induced accelerations we can infer their masses. In turn, knowing their masses will enable us to locate the CM-frame of the system. (In a system of bodies, the center of mass is the point relative to which the bodies’ distances are in inverse proportion to their masses.) With respect to this distinguished frame, the motions of bodies count as their true motions, Friedman claims. However, the CM-frame of the Solar System is just approximately an inertial frame. Scientific inquiry must ultimately look beyond it, to better and better approximations of an inertial frame. And, Kant’s absolute space is just the concept that directs our search for such approximations. More recently, Friedman updated and expanded his interpretation in (2013). In view of recent scholarship, Friedman has now made a convincing case that it is Kant’s laws of mechanics – not Newton’s three laws, as claimed in (1992) – that define the privileged frame (Kantian absolute space) relative to which bodies have true motions, in the Phenomenology.

Prior to Friedman’s interpretation, there is relatively little secondary literature that discusses Kant’s Phenomenology. Carrier (1992) gave an alternative to Friedman’s account of Kant on absolute space. Two chapters (by De Bianchi and Massimi, respectively) in McNulty 2022 add to our understanding of this aspect in Kant’s thought. Stan (forthcoming) assesses the Phenomenology in its early-modern context.

3. Laws

The Scientific Revolution ushered in a new type of knowledge, based in laws of nature. Kant’s natural philosophy thus gave that notion a central place. In particular, he analyzed it, he used it to single out certain laws as fundamental, and he weaved it into his picture of systematic science. We go over these aspects in turn.

Nomic import. For the Critical Kant, a law is a judgment, or proposition, that is necessary and imposed by a faculty of the mind—specifically, the understanding or reason. In the realm of theoretical knowledge, laws determine the object they govern. (In contrast, laws of practical reason bind their subjects, by mandating an action or a maxim for behavior.) There are several classes of Kantian laws: transcendental (e.g., the pure principles of the understanding); metaphysical (such as his three laws of mechanics); and empirical (in particular, the laws of chemistry).

The above picture, which Watkins 2019 articulates and defends in detail, gives center stage to the thought that laws are partially grounded in the natures of knowers like us—specifically, in the faculties (and their a priori structures) that Kant investigated in the First Critique. Other construals leave this key element out, and rely on other resources from his theoretical philosophy. Some have proposed a ‘necessitarian’ account, in which Kantian laws are grounded in the natures of the things they are about, thus natures—the bodies’ essential properties and powers—are their necessity-makers (Messina 2017, Massimi 2017, Engelhard 2018). Others think that certain propositions, or judgments, count as laws in virtue of their place in a best-system ordering of our knowledge as directed by Kant’s ideas of reason (see, e.g., Kitcher 1986 or Breitenbach 2018). These two interpretive approaches turn Kant into a precursor of two major contemporary notions of law, by Fred Dretske and David Lewis, respectively. Watkins argues that, if read carefully, Kant in fact offers a view that combines the strengths of the two pictures above: it retains the necessitarian dimension while emphasizing the role of our acts—of us qua spontaneous epistemic subjects—in regard to nature as the object of unified experience (Watkins 2019, esp. Chapter 2).

In philosophy of physics, Kant privileged three laws: Conservation of Mass, the Law of Inertia, and the Equality of Action-Reaction. He regarded them as fundamental for mechanics as he understood it, viz. qua theory of momentum exchanges, or ‘communication of motion.’ And, these laws lie closest—explanatorily and evidentially—to the Analogies of Experience, the most general principles of theoretical knowledge, in his system. Specifically, the Second Analogy is a key premise in his derivation of his ‘second mechanical law.’

Though somewhat intermittently, Kant reflected as well on empirical laws, viz. nomic judgments that govern some restricted class of objects or properties given a posteriori. He thought that, to count as a rational science, a body of knowledge must include empirical laws systematically connected. In the last decade, this long-neglected aspect of his doctrine has began to receive the attention it deserves. Scholarship has tended to concentrate on two main aspects. One is Kant’s basis for counting certain propositions as empirical laws. Some see them as earning that status in virtue of their place in a best-system organization of our knowledge; others think they become laws at a certain stage in the process of inquiry (provided the inquiry is guided by specific normative Kantian principles, e.g. his Postulates of Empirical Thinking). The other aspect is whether empirical laws count as knowable by Kant’s lights. Here too, the field appears divided in two camps. Some think that, pace his positive account of empirical laws, knowledge of them is beyond our reach (see, for instance, Kreines 2017). Others have argued that, under the right conditions, research can lead to the discovery of empirical laws in that particular domain, e.g. chemical phenomena (see, for instance, McNulty 2015 and Cooper 2023).

Hypotheses. Natural science after 1650 often relied on ‘hypotheses,’ or knowledge claims for which evidence was less than conclusive. In optics, electricity, magnetism, heat science, chemistry, and natural history hypotheses were rampant. Accordingly, some early-modern figures (e.g. Christian Wolff and Emilie du Châtelet) developed doctrines to address this fact about science then. Kant did too. In particular, he sought to identify normative criteria for acceptable hypotheses, viz. thresholds that candidate hypotheses must meet if theorizing from them is to count as legitimate. He defended for three such criteria in his ‘Discipline of Pure Reason in regard to Hypotheses,’ a part of the First Critique. The first is that a candidate hypothesis has to be about things that are ‘really possible’ in Kant’s sense; namely, spatio-temporal objects and properties. (This rules out, for one, hypotheses about God being the ‘cause of gravity,’ which some Newtonians had peddled in the early 1700s). The second is that a hypothesis must be about objects and processes causally connected—more broadly, connected via the categories of relation—to “that which is actually given, and so is certain” (B798). Helpful studies of Kant’s account of hypotheses in their scientific and philosophical context are Leduc 2013, Vanzo 2013, McNulty 2015, Cooper 2023, and Demarest & van den Berg 2022.

4. Physics: The Post-Critical Period (Opus postumum)

Kant’s interest in physics continued after the publication of the Metaphysical Foundations, in fact, until the very end of his productive years. Though Kant never completed a manuscript that could be put forward as a publication, the various notes, sketches, and drafts on topics in physics that he was working on intensively during this time (especially after 1796) were gathered together over a century after his death and published as his so-called Opus postumum. It is a highly fragmentary work where Kant’s thoughts remained in flux through the final parts, written ca. 1802. Accordingly, scholarship has sought to recover the evolution, background and import of his reflections, rather than some stable doctrine, which it mostly lacks. Below we touch on his reason for writing the Opus at all; two major themes relevant to philosophy of science; and some implications for his natural philosophy.

Why did Kant around 1796 begin to draft a new work? Most interpreters agree that he thought the Opus aimed to fill a ‘gap’ of sorts. In letters from 1798, he speaks cryptically about there being a ‘gap’ in his Critical philosophy. Many have concluded the Opus aimed to fill this gap, and so they turned their attention to identifying it. Some claimed it was a gap in Kant’s theory of matter above (in particular, his accounts of mass and density); others saw it between his constitutive and regulative approaches to metaphysical foundations for science; yet others have said it was a lacuna in his schematism of the categories. Lately, Howard (2023) has argued that it was a missing part in the ‘system of philosophy’ as a whole (hiatus in systemato, 21:476). He reads that as the need to mediate—by devising a bridge doctrine—between Kant’s metaphysical foundations of natural science and ‘physics as a system.’

This reading elucidates two obscure parts in the Opus. One is Kant’s repeated attempts to articulate a ‘transition.’ In the picture that Howard sketches, the transition would be the very mediating doctrine above: between a theory in metaphysics and a body of empirical knowledge. The other is Kant’s repeated attempts there to define physics such that he can defensibly say it counts as systematic science. For instance: “Physics is systematic investigation of nature through empirically given forces of matter insofar as they are connected to each other in a system” (22:298). Note just how broad his definition is—it makes the various ‘forces’ theorized by early-modern chemistry, heat science, botany and animal physiology count as part of physics qua organized doctrine.

A central theme in the Opus is Kant’s attempt to give an a priori proof that a certain entity must exist. He calls it the ‘ether,’ and also ‘caloric.’ He thought of it as a sort of universal substrate—a fluid-like medium that fills all of physical space, supports ‘moving forces,’ and carries their actions from one place to another (much like pressure applied at a point in an incompressible fluid travels across it to other locations). Kant saw it as his task to give a ‘deduction’ of this medium, viz. a species of non-empirical evidence that it exists. Generally interpreters take his Ätherbeweis to be an actual deductive argument, which they have tried to reconstruct (see, e.g., Förster 2000 and Hall 2006).

Another major theme there is Kant’s quest for an ‘elementary system of the moving forces’ of nature. He means a methodic, or well-ordered, derivation of the ‘specific’ properties of matter. They are specific in that none counts as general, or common to all matter; but none is too particular or transient either. Rather, each is a feature of some broad class of material behavior. Among the properties Kant ponders at this juncture are ‘heat,’ ’weight,’ ’elasticity,’ ’solidity,’ and the like. He takes these properties to be associated with ‘moving forces’: they result from some force being exerted (e.g., gravity induces weight) or they cause some force of motion (e.g. elastic rebound pushes back the body that compressed an elastic material). So, an elementary system of properties will be ipso facto a system of forces as well. In regard to it, Kant sought a rational heuristic: a recipe or criterion for a taxonomic account (of these broadly-specific properties) that is a priori, viz. inferable before they are empirically discovered.

Lastly, what did Kant think his ether—and, alternatively, his ‘elementary’ system—would achieve? Here too, scholarship is somewhat divided. Older accounts thought the ‘ether, or caloric’ was Kant’s basis for the bridge doctrine, or transition, between metaphysics and empirical physics. More recently, Howard (2023) has argued for a different line. Namely, that Kant saw the ether deduction (and the taxonomy of ‘elementary’ forces) as the basis for an account of what makes empirical physics a systematic body of knowledge—or would make it so in the long run, if properly pursued.

The Opus postumum has long been a topic of interest especially insofar as it offers the hope of clarification and development of central issues in Kant’s Critical philosophy. Much scholarship on it was in German (Adickes 1920, Hoppe 1969, Tuschling 1971, Blasche 1991, and Emundts 2004). Then it received increased attention in English, with discussions by Friedman (1992, chapter 5), Förster (2000), Edwards (2000), Guyer (2001), and Hall (2006, 2009). Recent views on the Opus and its reception are presented in Basile (2013) and Basile & Lissy (2022). Howard (2023) is an overview of its key issues, and a novel reading of the natural-philosophical issues Kant tackled there.

5. Biology

Kant was interested not only in the inanimate bodies studied by physics, but also in living organisms, which he viewed as deserving of additional philosophical scrutiny due to their special status, for two reasons. First, the symmetries and regularities of their structure and workings make them “in the highest degree contingent” (5: 360) and “mechanically inexplicable.” Second, organisms come from their own kind; grow their own functional parts, or organs, and repair them if they become damaged; and do in general exhibit homeostasis. These facts about them prompt Kant to claim that an organism is “cause and effect of itself” (5: 370). In a sense, a living entity is self-caused, and indeed by a causality that we can grasp solely “under the idea of purposes as a principle” (5: 383). Organisms, in other words, are “natural purposes,” or naturally occurring ensembles of parts purposefully fitted and working in unity.

It is just these peculiarities that create philosophical challenges not met with in physics and chemistry. Kant tackles them in the latter half of his third magnum opus, the Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790). In particular, he claims that attempting to explain organisms creates an inevitable conflict within reflective judgment, the faculty we employ in empirical concept formation, taxonomic classification, and the explanatory unification of particular laws. Kant describes that conflict in the Antinomy of Teleological Judgment (CJ §§ 69–78; 5: 385–415). The Antinomy obtains between two regulative principles, herein prefixed by an ‘R’ to distinguish them from two similar constitutive principles that Kant briefly discusses in the same place:

All generation of material things and their forms must be judged as possible in accordance with merely mechanical laws.

Some products of material nature cannot be judged as possible according to merely mechanical laws (judging them requires an entirely different law of causality, namely that of final causality) (5: 387).

A great deal of scholarship has aimed to elucidate this antinomy, and in the last decade these interpretive efforts have gained new momentum (see also the entry “Kant’s Aesthetics and Teleology” in this encyclopedia). In particular, sustained attention has been given to three questions: In what sense are organisms inexplicable mechanically, for Kant? What exactly is the contradiction that generates the Antinomy? And precisely how does Kant solve it?

First, clarification is needed about Kant’s claim that organisms cannot be explained ‘mechanically.’ In the Enlightenment, ‘mechanical’ was used in at least two senses: broadly, to denote explanation by physico-chemical laws of efficient causation; and narrowly, restricted to the theory of ‘compound machines,’ or assemblies of movable parts used to displace loads or transfer momentum, e.g. engines and watches. McLaughlin (1990) takes Kant to mean ‘mechanical’ in this latter sense. In artificial machines, parts precede the whole temporally, and determine it: the machine’s configuration results from summation over the parts; and its laws of operation are the same as those governing the parts. But organisms are different: the whole precedes its parts, or organs; and it has functions and aim-directed behaviors not present in them. Hence, organisms are mechanically inexplicable. Ginsborg (2004) construes Kant’s claim along different lines, in two senses. According to one, to explain something mechanically is to show that its production results, or would result, from the “unaided powers of matter as such,” i.e. Newtonian forces of attraction and repulsion, and “crude unorganized matter,” or arbitrary initial conditions such as masses, charges, configurations and motions. Organisms are inexplicable in this sense because their arising would be “in the highest degree contingent.” This is the notion operative in the Antinomy of Teleological Judgment, Ginsborg contends. But, she has argued, there is a second, stronger sense. Not only are organisms inexplicable by reduction to the structure and powers of their organs—rather, their symmetries and regularities and powers are not explicable from the “moving forces” of their inorganic particles either. Organism-level powers are not vector sums or integrals of physico-chemical forces that accelerate or reconfigure sub-visible particles.

Second, interpreters have also scrutinized the exact nature of the Antinomy. Insofar as the thesis and the antithesis are regulative principles, they may be seen as research policies, and those can be pursued separately, at different times, hence with no contradiction. Then why are they antinomic? Watkins (2009, § 2.2) explains that the two theses do not just recommend explanatory policies but express commitments to judging in a determinate way about biological phenomena. As such, they would be contradictory commitments: to judge organisms purely mechanistically and to judge them non-mechanistically. Teufel (2011) reads the two theses as hypothetical imperatives, imposed upon reflective judgment by practical reason. The Antinomy ensues, he contends, because they demand contradictory courses of cognitive conduct: to judge that mechanistic laws suffice to explain organisms and that they are insufficient for that task.

Moreover, for each antinomy in the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant derives both thesis and antithesis by deductive argument from alleged a priori premises. But, in the Antinomy of Teleological Judgment, he does not take that route. This makes quite pressing the question of his justification for the two R-claims above. As to the R-thesis, one might think that it can be easily deduced from Kant’s three Laws of Mechanics. However, we must remember that those laws are constitutive principles, whereas the R-thesis is regulative. A better interpretive avenue is that Kant’s three laws constrain the spectrum of particular empirical laws, including laws for biology, that scientists may seek. The constraint is that the Laws of Mechanics are basic: no other laws of material nature explain or ground them, while they must explain all other laws, directly or indirectly. So, for biological regularities to be turned into genuine laws, they must be integrable with the system of already known mechanical laws, and ultimately explained by the three Laws of Mechanics, the basis for all “interconnected experiential cognition” (5: 386). Even less well understood is Kant’s justification for the R-antithesis. Not only is there no official proof, it is not easy to know what the proof must establish. The R-thesis strongly implies that at issue is the origin of organisms; in contrast, the R-antithesis is about judging their possibility, which has to do with structure and functioning not production (Ginsborg 2001, 236). These are different aspects of organisms, and proving that they are mechanically inexplicable would require different arguments.

Third, Kant’s solution to the Antinomy has received sustained attention. In the first two Critiques, his general approach is to argue, for each antinomy, that both thesis and antithesis presuppose Transcendental Realism, insofar as they make claims about things in themselves; and to adduce Transcendental Idealism as the vantage point from which the initial contradiction is solved. However, that is not Kant’s approach to the Antinomy of Teleological Judgment. Accordingly, interpreters have sought to reconstruct a different solution on Kant’s behalf. Quarfood (2004) and Förster (2008) take the notion of an intuitive understanding (expounded at 5: 401–10) as the key to Kant’s answer. In particular, Förster explains, intellects like ours are discursive: they grasp objects through concepts as ‘parts’ assembled in temporally-extended judgments, and so mechanistically, he alleges. Hence, we need the concept ‘purpose’ to judge organisms solely because we have discursive intellects. However, an intuitive understanding could grasp organisms without purpose-concepts and regulative principles about judging teleologically. Hence, for this understanding, the R-thesis and R-antithesis need not be true, and so no antinomy arises. Breitenbach (2008) contends that the Antinomy is solved, or rather dissolved, if we note that thesis and antithesis are not really contradictory but complementary. They govern (reflecting) acts of judging in different contexts: the mechanistic R-thesis regulates explanatory conduct in empirical biology, whereas the R-antithesis governs ordinary judging about living nature as experienced in everyday, pre-theoretical encounters with it. The two principles epitomize “two different views on nature,” and are compossible (466). They just appear to be in contradiction; in fact, they complement each other, indispensably. McLaughlin (1990) submits that the Antinomy does not arise simpliciter but only under a special assumption, viz. that everything in nature is objectively explainable by us (162). Reject the assumption, and the contradiction vanishes, insofar as the R-thesis and the R-antithesis can both be true, but for different domains: the former holds for phenomena explainable by us, the latter for phenomena not so explainable. McLaughlin does not offer a general criterion for ‘explicability by us’ attributable to Kant, however, apart from mechanical explicability. Ginsborg (2008) focuses on how the contradiction might be resolved in the context of scientific investigation rather than in abstract, general philosophical terms. Building on Kant’s remark about subordinating mechanism to teleology (5: 414), Ginsborg contends that natural historians and physiologists may well explain the origin and workings of organisms ‘mechanistically,’ purely by physico-chemical laws, provided they apply them not to “crude” but to “organized” matter, i.e. organic stuff already endowed with a “formative drive,” a generic disposition to grow, reproduce and self-maintain. In turn, this organized matter itself is unintelligible without appeal to purpose and design terms. Thus, biologists ‘subordinate’ mechanism to teleology, and so the antinomic conflict between them is removed.

While these interpretive proposals collectively advance our understanding of how the Antinomy might be defused, each has its share of philosophical difficulties, as spelled out in Watkins (2009). Moreover, few of these construals heed close to Kant’s words, which suggest strongly that his solution relies indispensably on a “supersensible ground” (5: 413), or explanatory principle located in the noumenal world. That ground could unite both mechanism and teleology, by making both antinomic theses jointly derivable or explainable from it. However, since humans can have “no positive determinate” knowledge of any supersensible entity, the Antinomy is solvable in principle rather than solved in fact. Kant (at least in his official solution) does not seem to provide the details for an actual account of how the conflict at the heart of biological explanation is removed. The limitations that beset our understanding of Kant’s philosophy of biology so far, some of which we have expounded above, continue to drive interpretive efforts to cast more light on that part of his doctrine, as exemplified in Goy and Watkins (forthcoming).

In addition to the works mentioned above, Kant’s Antinomy of Teleological Judgment has been usefully discussed in Allison (1991), Cohen (2004), Ginsborg (2001), Kreines (2005), Steigerwald (2006), Zanetti (1993) and Zumbach (1984); see also the entry “Kant’s Aesthetics and Teleology” in this encyclopedia.

6. Chemistry

Kant draws a distinction between ‘proper’ and ‘rational’ science. The former denotes any discipline that is strongly mathematized and relies on ‘apodictic’ laws, supported by conclusive evidence; Newton’s gravitation theory is the epitome of that. The latter indicates a body of propositions that is systematic, viz. explanatorily integrated, and includes laws. Kant counted chemistry as a poster child for it. He lived through a watershed change in that discipline—from Georg Stahl’s phlogiston theory to Lavoisier’s renovation of chemistry, its core processes, and taxonomy of stuffs.

In Metaphysical Foundations, Kant argued that, in a ‘proper’ science, its basic concepts correlate with mathematical notions, and the warrant for that correlation comes from metaphysics, e.g. via a picture of the essence of matter. Thereby, metaphysics supplies principles for the construction’ of the domain-specific concepts of that science. But, he continued, no such metaphysical warrant is available for correlating basic chemical concepts with mathematics; when such correlations occur, they are known a posteriori. (He was aware, of course, that chemical practice in his time had discovered quantitative facts, e.g. about the ratios of reagents in a specific reaction.) Thus, he concluded, not only is chemistry not a proper science, but it is not likely to become one ever (4:471).

Still, he counted it as a ‘rational’ science: he thought chemistry owes its systematic order to ideas of reason. Specifically, to certain domain-specific artificial concepts introduced for the sake of descriptive and explanatory unification of many local regularities established empirically. For instance, that all solid metals then known ‘calcinate,’ i.e. form heavier compounds when heated in air; and can be obtained from these compounds, under the right laboratory conditions.

After 1790, Kant apparently moved to endorse Lavoisier’s new taxonomy of chemical substances, and also his picture of the ‘caloric,’ or ‘ether’—a species of ‘imponderable fluid’ endowed with causal properties relevant to, among others, heat exchanges, ‘combustion’ (oxidoreduction) and phase transitions. And yet, as recent research has established, even in the post-Critical years Kant held fast to his above requirements for a science to count as proper. In light of that, late-Enlightenment chemistry—Lavoisier’s great transformation and Kant’s ‘ether deduction’ notwithstanding—still counted for him as a rational, but improper, science.

Interest in Kant’s philosophy of chemistry has surged in the last decade. McNulty (2014, 2015, 2016) is an especially helpful and clear series of studies of Kant’s engagement with that rapidly-changing science. Blomme (2023) contributes to the question of what chemistry was, for Kant. Older discussions of his views on the topic are Carrier (1990, 2001) and Friedman (1992).

7. Psychology

Kant’s views on psychology are intimately bound up with his more general position in the philosophy of mind (see the separate entry on this topic.) He distinguishes between rational and empirical psychology and, in the Critique of Pure Reason’s Paralogisms, denies that rational psychology contains arguments that could justify any substantive principles (especially concerning our immortality). Thus, only empirical psychology, it seems, could be possible as a science. However, if Kant continues to maintain that science requires a pure part, and denies that rational psychology contains any substantive knowledge that might constitute the pure part of psychology, then it follows that empirical psychology cannot qualify as science proper either.

And yet, he did not count it as a proper science either. If we ask why, we can discern two broad answers in the secondary literature. Older interpretations thought it was because mathematization (a mark of ‘proper’ science) is not feasible in psychology. Supposedly, it is because psychic phenomena are in time—it is their ordering structure, or a priori form—and time qua form lacks enough features to support strong mathematization. (It is a 1-dimensional manifold representable as a line: too narrow to support constructions in pure intuition, which mathematization would require.) A more recent construal has it that empirical psychology lacks genuine laws. Kant leaves open the prospect for it coming to have ‘laws of association,’ viz. knowledge of patterns of constant conjunction between some of our inner representations. Such patterns, discoverable by introspection, may resemble laws properly so-called. But, as some have argued recently, that is not enough. Genuine laws require stronger warrant—primarily, evidence from successful prediction confirmed by experiment or from precise observations. That sort of evidence, interpreters believe, is not available in empirical psychology. Which makes it an improper science by Kant’s lights: even more improper than chemistry, which arguably does avail itself of genuine laws explicated as above. A scholar who endorses the first reading above is Hatfield 1992; for the second, see especially McNulty 2014.

Unsurprisingly, Kant influenced empirical theory in early 19th-century Germany. (However, it was his transcendental psychology in the Critique of Pure Reason, not his views on empirical psychology, that proved to be most influential.) In particular, his doctrine of space and time as forms of sensibility was given a naturalistic construal in the physiology and psychology of perception. Since for Kant an a priori form of intuition need not be innate, it could unfold in the course of sensory experience. This led J.G. Steinbuch (1811) and C. Th. Tourtual (1827) to investigate empirically how spatial representation arises—specifically, how particular subjects become able to see things as arrayed in space, perceive objects as three-dimensional, and represent spatial structures more generally.

Hatfield (1990, Chapter 4) surveys these post-Kantian developments in more detail. Kitcher (1990) presents a detailed argument for the role of transcendental psychology within Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason. Sturm (2001) argues that Kant’s critical comments about psychology are primarily directed against introspection-based conceptions of psychology.

8. Other Sciences: History, Physical Geography, and Anthropology

Though Kant is sometimes quite strict about what qualifies as science “proper,” we have seen that he clearly accepts that other disciplines, such as chemistry and psychology, can be scientific in some other sense. (Kant is also extremely interested in providing an explanation of the nature and origin of organisms, which is central to an account of biology. For a more detailed description of Kant’s stance on biology, see the entry on his views on aesthetics and teleology.) However, his explicit reflections about science (taken broadly so as to encompass not only “Wissenschaft” but any kind of “Lehre” or “Kunde”) extend even further so as to include bodies of cognition such as history, physical geography, and anthropology. (Even in the Metaphysical Foundations Kant leaves room for such “scientific cognition” by dividing the doctrine of nature into natural science — e.g., physics — and the historical doctrine of nature, which is separated further into natural description and natural history, 4:468). In the case of historical sciences, Kant views its cognitions as related not by subordination (as is the case in physics), but rather by coordination, since historical facts cannot be derived from each other, but rather merely related to each other in space (geographically) and time (chronologically). Kant views anthropology as overlapping to some extent in subject matter with empirical psychology. What enables the coordination of facts in each of these domains is not a theoretical, but rather a practical idea. In the case of history, it is the idea of reason (or freedom) that provides a guiding principle of coordination (cf. Kant’s “Idea for a Universal History from a Cosmopolitan Point of View”), while anthropology is framed by the cosmopolitan moral ideal of the world-best. Thus, it is clear that Kant’s emphasis on physics throughout his career did not blind him to the value of other sciences, nor did it keep him from reflecting creatively on how best to account for them from the perspective of his Critical philosophy.

Kant’s views on history are discussed by Yovel (1980) and, more recently, Kleingeld (1995 and 1999). Kant’s Physical Geography has been discussed by Adickes (1911). Brandt (1999), Wood (1999), and Makkreel (2001) have recently published important discussions of Kant’s anthropology. Sturm (2009) is a comprehensive monograph on Kant’s philosophy of psychology and anthropology.


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