Kant’s Philosophical Development

First published Mon Nov 3, 2003; substantive revision Fri Nov 22, 2019

Modern philosophy begins with Kant, and yet he marks the end of the “Modern” epoch (1600–1800 CE) in the history of philosophy.[1] The appearance of the Critique of Pure Reason in 1781 marks the end of the modern period and the beginning of something entirely new. Today his texts are read on all continents, and his thought has had a profound impact on nearly all subsequent philosophical discussions. The 2004 bicentennial of his death, for instance, was reflected in conferences in Austria, Canada, China, France, Germany, Hungary, Japan, Iran, Italy, Mexico, New Zealand, Paraguay, Poland, Portugal, Russia, Senegal, Spain, Sweden, Taiwan, and Turkey.

Like other watershed figures, Kant has contributed to the shape of world civilization, and the conceptualization we have of the world today. His practical ideas, such as the Categorical Imperative and its implications (1785), informed the Universal Declaration of Human Rights (1948), the Political and Economic Covenants (1966), and the International Criminal Court (2002). His exploration of natural sciences and his metaphysical ideas, particularly those of his pre-critical period (1747–1770), are stunning. Kant gave the first account of the evolutionary reciprocity of spacetime and momentum-energy, and formulated the first general law of free field radiation (1747). He suggested the conceptual solution of the three body problem, which emerges in the interplay of Earth, Moon, and Sun (1754). He was the first to construct a detailed evolutionary cosmology (1755). His ideas on biospherical dynamics allowed him to predict the rhythms of the monsoon and the oscillation of coastal winds (1755–1757). He suggested that the building blocks of matter are energy bubbles (1756)—an idea that is useful today in superstring theory in the guise of Calabi-Yau manifolds.

A number of recent findings have helped to shed more light on Kant’s philosophical development.

First, in terms of science, it now appears that his metaphysics has withstood the test of time. While traditional scholars largely dismiss his holistic ontology prior to the Critique, innovations in the environmental and physical sciences have validated Kant’s claims as realistic insights in the workings of nature. His evolutionary theory of the universe is now seen as “the essence of modern models” in cosmology (Coles 2001: 240), and his natural philosophy is seen as the last milestone of western philosophy prior to its “comedown” to skepticism (Hawking 2003, 166). In light of climate change, it stands to reason that Kant’s grasp on biospherical dynamics and sustainable policies may well spur a philosophical return to Kant in the near future.

Second, in terms of religion, important recent scholarship indicates an ambivalence, if not dislike of Christianity—something that his early biographers, all of them Lutheran theologians, took pains to avoid revealing.[2] Kant can be seen as defending pantheism, naturalism, evolution, cosmic expansion theory and holism, even when doing so was incompatible with an academic career.

In the 18th Century university system defending such views often led to dismissal and/or lack of promotion. Kant, himself, was always cautious when writing on such topics. In the context of censorship, writers tend to become circumspect. To avoid trouble, they may publish something anonymously; or they may make oblique remarks instead of direct statements; or they may have second thoughts and retract earlier statements. Kant did all three things. But, for later readers in increasingly secular ages, it is easy to miss Kant’s subtleties and implications.

Third, in terms of culture, Kant’s early views may be placed in a global rather than a purely Western context. Recent research suggests that key ideas of Kant’s natural philosophy also have sources in Taoist, Buddhist, Hindu and Confucian thought, which were disseminated in continental Europe by Jesuits based in China, popularized by Leibniz and Wolff, and further developed by Wolff’s Sinophile student Bilfinger.[3] One example is the idea of dialectics that Bilfinger found in the Chinese classics, and which Kant encountered in the proceedings of the Russian academy. Importation and serious consideration of eastern thought was in its infancy during the end of the modern period, and Kant was unaware of the Far Eastern roots of the notions that influenced him. The historical irony is that he dismissed nonwestern cultures while being deeply influenced by their insights.

Scholars split Kant’s development into stages:

  1. the pre-critical period (1745–1770), during which Kant works within the tradition of Leibniz/Wolff and writes his impressive early works on natural phenomena;
  2. “silent decade” (1770–1781), during which Kant refrained from publishing texts other than advertisements and endorsements for classes;
  3. the critical period (1781–1791), which marks the time of insights or “the astonishing decade” (Beck 1969: 433) of his critical philosophy; and
  4. the post-critical period (1798–1802), often cited as works of old age.[4]

Recent studies indicate that Kant’s philosophical development was far more unified (Schönfeld 2000), and, in terms of its stages, involved deeper continuities (Edwards 2000) than previously recognized. From the start, Kant was pushing quite a unique agenda. Recent scholarship contends Kant’s earliest works are not only commensurate and continuous with his late claims, but also offer insight into some oddities of the critical period, such as the Third Analogy of the Critique.[5] The new picture of Kant’s development indicates that his intellectual trajectory was not as fractured and erratic as scholarship used to assume, and it also indicates that Kant was not a late bloomer, but, rather, that he was innovative from the start.

The following account covers Kant’s development from his upbringing to the critical period. Its theme is his intellectual formation: the influences in his youth and education; his views on natural philosophy, ontology and cosmology shaped during his early adulthood; the questions subsequently pursued; and the historical fate of his answers.[6]

1. Childhood: “The Starry Sky Above Me and the Moral Law Within Me”

Immanuel Kant was born April 22, 1724 in Königsberg, East Prussia (now Kaliningrad, Russia), as the eldest son of Anna Regina Kant, née Reuter, (1697–1737) and Johann Georg Kant (1683–1746). The Reuters were shoe- and harness-makers; the Kants were harness-makers (Riemer, a guild similar to saddlers). Originally, the Reuters were from Nuremberg in Bavaria; the Kants were from not-too-distant Tilsit (now Sovietsk, Oblast Kaliningrad; Russia). The union of Kants and Reuters provided an initial economic, emotional and religious stability for Kant during his early years. His grandfather and father were competent businessmen, initially flourishing and respected in their strata of society. Anna was Lutheran and fit well into the like-minded Königsberg culture.

Immanuel’s early childhood seems to have been idyllic. The family was rather well off. The parents got along and loved their son. Johann Kant appears to have been a gentle and hardworking man. Anna Kant, who took care of the family’s paperwork, was well educated. Little Immanuel was her constant company, and her influence on him was considerable.

After “Manelchen” could walk, Anna Kant took him out for walks in the meadows and fields. She taught him what she could, of the seasons, the plants and animals, and the sky. Her little son responded eagerly with questions; and the mother encouraged his outdoor curiosity with praise, patience, and more information (Wasianski 1804: 247).

These details of nature provided a formative background for Kant’s interest in natural philosophy, and the child grew up in an encouraging environment for early explorations. Königsberg enjoys a cool and gentle climate; typical of high latitudes, the flat Baltic terrain has not much biological diversity, and its biomes—meadows, moors, deciduous and conifer forests—are not hostile. At Kant’s time, bears and wolves were common along with other local fauna, but these posed no serious threat to Kant’s earliest encounters with nature. Walks, as the ones he enjoyed at the edge of town, were fun and perfectly safe. For Prussians at the time, excursions into nature also had a spiritual subtext. Like Japanese Shinto, German tradition invests natural places with meaning. The late and superficial conversion of the Baltic lands to Christianity, after the fourteenth century, coupled with the fact that persecution drove pagan faiths temporarily underground instead of eliminating them altogether, allowed the ancient nature-worship to prevail in forms inoffensive to the clergy, under the guise of outdoor walks. Thus people used to attend Sunday service—before heading out for their Sonntagsspaziergang.

During Kant’s earliest years, the local influence of Pietism grew. This Christian movement, founded by Jakob Spener (1635–1705) and promoted by August Hermann Francke (1663–1727), had spread north from Dresden, Leipzig, and Halle. It reached Königsberg at the turn of the century, making inroads with the creation of schools and orphanages. As Luther’s Reformation had been the effort to return Roman Catholicism to a purer faith, Pietism tried to purify Lutheranism, stripping it of dogma and detail. The Protestant Church avoided a schism in Prussia, but at the price of friction between the Lutheran mainstream, orthodoxy, and the Pietist firebrands. Pietism stressed literal exegesis, quiet humility, and charitable deeds. It allowed believers to practice a spirituality of mystical intensity—but as the purge of Halle University (1723) illustrates, it had a totalitarian streak.

The local authorities frowned on the movement, but the Pietists enjoyed protection of King Friedrich Wilhelm I (reign 1713–40) and thus persisted. In 1731, the field chaplain Franz Albert Schulz came to town, rising to become the local leader of the movement. He was appointed to director of the Pietist high school (the Collegium Fridericianum) and later to professor of theology. One of his early converts was Immanuel’s mother, who brought her children to his bible sessions.

Schulz’s brand of Pietism differed from either Spener’s or Francke’s and “was fraught with deep ambiguities, having a component that was seen elsewhere as contrary to the basic tenets of true faith”(Kuehn 2001a: 39). Schulz’s Pietism straddled the line between Wolffian, rationalistic philosophy and enthusiastic religious sentiment. It stood for the equality of all to interpret the Bible and a practical faith through charitable acts, while at the same time endorsing the political ambitions of Frederick I. It was a grassroots movement that the emphasized the personal nature of religion in contrast to establishment orthodoxy; politically, it allied itself with the common citizen over the nobility. In Königsberg it was a divisive influence that was in constant struggle with local authorities. In Kant’s formative years, Königsberg was a place of religious upheaval, Pietists vs Orthodox Lutheranism, and this marked, local conflict, in addition to the more widespread decimation of the 30 Years War, was to inform his position of religious toleration and a separation of religion and philosophy.

According to Kant’s later judgment (Wasianski 1804: 246; tr. Kuehn 2001a: 31), his mother lived out a positive form of Pietism, blending love, tolerance, and spirituality into a faith that was “genuine” and “not in the least enthusiastic” (‘enthusiasm’ or Schwärmerei means fundamentalism). The child’s formation was apparently not hurt by Anna’s piety; instead of turning into an intolerant zealot, as many Pietist’s “enthusiasm” did, she instilled a reverence for nature and spiritualism, a plausible sense of right and wrong, and always respected him as a person.

Kant is said to have claimed,

I will never forget my mother, for she implanted and nurtured in me the first germ of goodness; she opened my heart to the impressions of nature; she awakened and furthered my concepts, and her doctrines have had a continual and beneficial influence in my life. (Jachmann 1804: 169; tr. Kuehn 2001a: 31)

Later, he would develop a metaphysics whose claims would anticipate scientific discoveries, and an ethics that culminated in the Categorical Imperative. His friends chose the dictum from the Critique of Practical Reason (1788) for his tombstone:

Two things fill the mind with ever new and increasing admiration and awe, the more often and steadily we reflect upon them: the starry heavens above me and the moral law within me. (5:161.33–6; tr. Guyer 1992: 1)

Had it not been for his sensitive and intelligent mother, his life might well have taken an entirely different course.

2. Youth: “In the Servitude of Fanatics”

As Immanuel grew older, hardships befell the family. After the death of his maternal grandfather (1729), the Kants suffered from a series of events that would eventually ruin the family. The death left the harness-shop downtown without leadership and Anna’s mother without a provider. To compensate, the Kant’s moved into the home of Anna’s mother on the outskirts of the city, in the Sattlerstrasse, the saddler-street, a less prosperous part of the city. The saddlers, a guild distinct from harness-makers while producing similar goods, did not welcome the competition. Johann Kant became the target of the saddle-makers’ hostility, and the business failed to prosper in the new location. Income steadily declined, and further hardship occurred with the death of Anna Regina (1737). Just thirteen years old, Immanuel must have keenly felt the loss of his first tutor regarding nature and religious sentiment.[7]

When Immanuel was six or seven, he went to the Hospitalschule, a grammar school at the local clinic, whose teacher was a Pietist candidate in theology. In 1732, Pastor Schulz, who knew the child through Anna, arranged for Immanuel, now eight, to continue his education at the Collegium Fridericianum. For a child of working-class parents, such as Kant, this was a fortunate opportunity. Instead of the traditional path, apprenticeship at his father’s shop and the eventual inheritance of the workshop, Immanuel was given the opportunity for higher education, under the assumption he would pursue a religious or civil vocation. Practically speaking, this would raise Kant in the eyes of society and offer him the opportunity to raise himself above the rank and economics into which he was born. One might conjecture that the sensitive and bright Kant would look forward to the possibility of advancement. Unfortunately, the tutelage he received there was a rather more stringent form of Pietism than the one he found at home under the instruction of his mother.

Kant would later judge the time of youth as the hardest years of life, ruled by discipline, loneliness, and lack of freedom (Lectures on Pedagogy, w. 1776–87, p. 1803; 9:485.13–17). School, at the Collegium, was held six days a week. Sundays were spent with homework and prayer. Primary subjects of instruction were Latin and religion. Only male pupils were admitted; there was no way to meet girls or socialize, and, as the son of a harness-maker, Kant was already at a significant social disadvantage. The later stages of his primary education (what we would call high school) definitely changed his life for the worse. Immanuel was to attend high school until 1740, when he was sixteen.

Moreover, the education was not even of great quality. Only rather elementary math was offered, and natural philosophy (biology, chemistry, geology, physics, and astronomy) was not taught at all. Pupils were groomed for administrative and clerical careers, so science was considered a luxury not to be indulged. The sciences were also suspect from the theological perspectives of his instructors. Pietist indifference to inquiry and fundamentalist denial of facts resulted in contemptuous hostility toward science. As late as the 1750s, the clergy rejected the heliocentric system and frowned on Newton’s celestial mechanics as fiction. Pietist theologians such as Franz Budde (1667–1729), Joachim Lange (1670–1744), and Andreas Rüdiger (1673–1731) argued that the Bible teaches everything worth knowing of nature. The later Pietist thinker Christian August Crusius (1715–75) essentially concurred. For Pietism, particularly in its Saxon center, Halle, education was for practical management of life’s affairs, not an endeavor with intrinsic worth. Mathematics was useful for bookkeeping but worthless for describing reality. Physics was acceptable as long as its findings did not undermine the Bible. As independent research programs, however, the sciences were deemed wellsprings of heresy.[8] Standard curriculum included a heavy dose of theology, catechism memorization and biblical stories. Although the school did offer a variety of topics: Latin, Greek, Hebrew, logic, history (both church and philosophy) and geography, the primary use of this instruction was in preparation for further theological study at the university. Education at the Collegium was always in the service of the Pietist programmatic, conversion and salvation of souls.

In Halle, Pietism found its epicenter and religious temperament. In Königsberg, however, Pietism—at the extent of its influence in the 1730s—was moderated by the task to proselytize to the mainstream. Under Schulz’s guidance, ideological fervor was reined in by the need for flexibility when making converts. Thus in Königsberg, it was not as monolithic as further south. With his earliest education at the Collegium, Kant was to suffer from the more severe form of pedagogical ideals. During his university years, he would enjoy more moderate educational ideals, as Kant’s later university teacher, Martin Knutzen (1713–51), illustrates. A passionate Pietist, Knutzen studied Newton and discussed the ideas of Leibniz and Wolff—possible for Pietists in East Prussia, but impossible for Pietists in Central Prussia and Saxony.

During high school this moderation was not felt. The instructors at the Collegium were stern. Pietist schooling involved a rigorous schedule, strict adherence to religious dogma, and instruction by repetitive drills. The school’s goals were two-fold, to save it’s pupils from “religious corruption” and to improve their “worldly well-being” (Kuehn 2001a: 46). Strict adherence to regimen, dogma and practical applications were essential to these two goals. A former classmate, David Ruhnken, criticized the “discipline of the fanatics” (letter to Kant 10 Mar. 1771; 10:117.15); another classmate and life-long friend, Theodor Hippel (1741–96), spoke of Kant’s “terror and fear” whenever Kant would later recall the “slavery of his youth” (Malter 1992: 95; tr. Kuehn 2001a: 45).

Typical penalties for infractions, next to physical punishment, were what would be called “guilt trips” today. In contrast to Catholicism (where sins are forgiven in confession), Protestant salvation depends on grace. The faithful cannot rely on a ritual for exoneration; non-Catholic Christians steadily collect sins. They can only do their best and better their odds for deliverance by remorseful introspection. Pietism honed remorse into a fine art. Essential to salvation is a sense of guilt—more an emotion, actually, than a sense (Schuldgefühl). God’s grace will wipe the slate clean, but grace is neither predictable nor verifiable. The only measure, if there is any, is the intensity of shame—the stronger the cultivated feelings of guilt, the better the chances for salvation. The education at the Collegium institutionalized this guilt and sought to properly instruct its charges with a contrite spirit and sense of conservative propriety. One should feel an enthusiastic guilt and sense of turpitude in an effort to become a better citizen, both spiritually and practically.

With the exception of a certain Heydenreich, a friendly Latinist who introduced Kant to Lucretius’s De rerum natura (Borowski 1804: 38–9), high school stunted Kant’s growth. He excelled at Latin, an emphasis at the school, and Greek, but struggled with theology and arithmetic. He appears to have enjoyed classic authors under the guidance of Heydenreich and many thought he would take up classics at university.

The lack of scientific training would hamper his later explorations of nature. He tried to make up for it at the university in 1740, but his mathematics instructor, Privatdozent Christian Ammon (1696–1742) was ignorant of the calculus (Kuehn 2001b: 13–16)—an essential tool for understanding the cutting-edge physical research of the day. Kant’s quantitative skills were to remain substandard; when he calculated, the results usually came out all wrong (Adickes 1924a: 73–83; 1924b: 1:38–9). This lack in mathematical training played into his belated comprehension of Newton’s work, yet did not harm Kant’s appreciation for him. Such a substandard education in arithmetic, philosophy and the sciences were the norm at the Collegium Fridericianum, and Kant would have to continually work to make up for this early deficit.

Hence Kant’s later contributions to natural science would have to remain of a conceptual sort. They amounted to brilliant aperçus—but it was later physicists, not Kant, who articulated them rigorously and substantiated them empirically.

High school may have also affected the development of Kant’s ethics. In the absence of data, this effect is conjectural. Still, common sense suggests that his later interest in dignity and the value of autonomy might have been influenced by the treatment he suffered and witnessed in school. It makes sense that a thinker who recalls the “slavery of his youth” with “terror and fear” would insist that treating humanity as an end, instead of a means only, is a Categorical Imperative.

Moreover, these experiences may also explain Kant’s exclusion of emotion from ethics; a curious exclusion, given his emphasis of the importance of the good will (Foundations of the Metaphysics of Morals 1785; 4:393–5). Anna Kant died in 1737, when Immanuel was thirteen. From then on, the sensitive teenager associated “morality under the guidance of feeling” only negatively. This may be due, in part, to the daily exposure to the guilt associated with the doctrines of morality to which Immanuel was exposed at the Collegium. And without a mother as an affectionate and sane counterweight, the oppressiveness and negative associations of guilt and morality must have taken its toll. He suffered the pious whim of teachers, eager to instill feelings of guilt for the sake of salvation. His later contempt for emotion is arguably unjustified, but his upbringing suggests an explanation.

3. Student Years: “Marking Out the Path to Be Taken”

When Kant entered the University of Königsberg in 1740, he was sixteen. Financial considerations at home left much to be desired. His widowed father filed his taxes as a pauper. But, a maternal uncle, shoemaker Richter, supported Immanuel’s studies. In addition, Immanuel supplemented his uncle’s beneficence by working as a tutor to fellow students. Often he did so for free, but, on occasion, Kant would accept luxuries to supplement his modest means. He was a sober and quiet student, not engaging in the frivolous activities common to university students.[9] Yet Kant was no drudge either. He enjoyed playing billiards, and did so with such skill that he and his companions often won small sums of money to help defray the cost of living. As a member of the university, Kant had risen to a new rank within society. In so doing, he enjoyed privileges of this class and exemptions from duties e.g., military service/conscription, to which the lower classes were susceptible. For a person of slight build and fragile constitution, Kant’s upward social status concomitant exemptions very likely saved his life.

Pastor Schulz had hoped the university student Kant would pursue a church career, but instead he took courses in logic, ethics, metaphysics, natural law, and mathematics. Martin Knutzen (1713–1751), Kant’s advisor, introduced him to the Principia (1687) and the Optics (1704), and probably led him to think about natural philosophy. Additionally, Kant attended classes with Johann Gottfried Teske (1704–1772), whose courses on electricity and experimental physics would inspire Kant’s doctoral dissertation De Igne or Meditations on Fire (1755).

Four years into his university education, the Kant family suffered another set-back. In 1744, Kant’s father, Johann, suffered a stroke. Immanuel, twenty years old and now the head of the family, attended to his father’s health and stopped attending classes the following year. He started writing on natural philosophy around this time, trying to determine the properties of force, a theme much in currency at the time. In 1746, he buried his father, wrote the bulk of his first work, submitted it to the censor, and secured a publisher. A year later, in 1747, he completed the Thoughts on the True Estimation of Living Forces, settled the family’s affairs, found homes for his younger brother and three sisters, and moved in with another student. The Living Forces is his first known text, first publication, and first book.

But when Kant completed it, he withdrew from the university. In 1748, he left town, without a degree, to work as a tutor for a noble family in the countryside.

It is tempting to explain Kant’s academic failure with financial reasons—his parents were deceased and the children had no savings. Ostensibly Kant was responsible for not merely himself, but for his siblings as well. Finances were tight, at the very best. However, the Kant family did have a benefactor, their uncle Richter, who paid his course fees when Kant was enrolled and financed his publication (Borowski 1804: 46; Lasswitz 1902: 521). Richter would keep supporting him and paid the printer for his second book (1755), too. Poverty was thus not likely the reason for his withdrawing. Nor was it the lack of a thesis. The Living Forces is a technical tract, 256 pages in the 1749-edition, more than enough for a Magister-degree.

Yet Kant wrote the book in German, not in the Latin required for academic theses, although high school had provided him with excellent philological skills. Apparently he had not intended to submit the Living Forces as his Master’s thesis. Why?

The contents supply the key. He declares that he shall criticize Leibniz and Wolff (ii, 1:7). He rejects the doctrine of pre-established harmony according to which substances do not interact, rejecting Leibniz’s claim (Monadology 1714: sec. 7) that substances have no “windows”. For Kant, they do. Following Knutzen (who had earned his doctorate with a similar critique in 1735) he says that substances change each other’s states by their mutual actions (#4, 1:19). He also rejects Wolff’s notion of a “moving force”. Kant argues (#3, 1:18) that force and motion have little to do with one another. Force is not so much about motion and more about being. So a “moving force” is a misnomer. For Kant, living forces are better described as the dynamic source for nature, an “active force” or a vis activa.

That Kant criticized Leibniz and Wolff should have improved his chances at graduation. Knutzen questioned their views, too. And critically evaluating Leibniz and Wolff was the righteous thing to do, even in the moderate Pietist atmosphere of Kant’s university. The theologian Lange in Halle had orchestrated Wolff’s expulsion from Prussia (1723) and triggered a furious row over Wolff’s Leibnizian leanings (1723–40). Other Pietists followed suit and rejected Wolff because his support of Leibnizian harmony. This, combined with his view of the world as a network of uniform substances, smelled of heresy. Wolff was considered a dangerous radical. But Kant’s reasons for criticizing Wolff were different—Wolff was not radical enough.

Kant lays out his view in the first ten sections. Everything begins with force. It is even prior to extension, as Leibniz had already said (#1; 1:17). Here Leibniz is right, Kant thinks, and praises him for having shed light on the Aristotelian concept of the entelechy, and Leibniz’s recovery of the basis for substantial forms. Yet Leibniz does not go far enough. Nature’s units are active forces (#1–3; 1:17–18). Their action is constructive; they make and sustain the fabric of nature. The world is a tapestry of energy concentrations. Forces rule everything, not only bodily motions (#2; 1:18.6–8), but all activities (#3; 1:18.27–36). This includes mind-body interaction—materially produced ideas and mentally intended actions (#6; 1:20.35–21.1; 21.14–16).

Dynamic action is absolutely fundamental. Force has effects by acting externally (ausser sich wirken; #4; 1:19.5), and, in the full sense of the word, external action locates force (#6; 1:20.36–1:21.1). A force acts by radiating its action; it spreads its effects out (ihre Wirkungen von sich ausbreiten; #10; 1:24.23), and this spread determines its source as being inside it, locating force in virtue of its action. With action comes location (Ort), with location space (Raum), and with space the universe (Welt)—and none of this would be without force. Localized forces weave the world (#8) such that their interaction forms networks (#7), braiding relation, order, and space (#9, 1:23.5–9). Force is the primum, knitting space and everything within.

As one source acts on what is outside of it, multiple sources act on one another. They do so when their fields meet. For example, throw two pebbles into a pond and watch the interfering ripples: first, point sources encounter each other’s activities at the boundary of their expanding radiations; next, these pulses, when striking each other, are modified when struck. External modifications of a radiation affect its internal makeup. Since force is an active pulse, and since activity, for Kant, describes force better than anything else, a collision with another field has constitutive effects on the original activity. (Consider weather—when air masses collide, they affect each other’s dew point, temperature, or pressure.) Hence Kant concludes that the action of force-points amounts to mutual changes of their internal states (#4; 1:19.4–6).

Dynamic expansion and interaction through location makes space, and reciprocal action creates structure. Force-points stretch, grip, and take hold, and the mutually modifying engagements constitute their connections (#7; 1:21.30–33). This has consequences. That force, in virtue of its action, is put “somewhere” suggests a bond of force and space. This interactive bond is constitutive of reality.

These bold ideas doomed the text. A Christian advisor, even an open-minded one, could never approve it. The dynamic ontology in chapter 1 contradicts the genesis account found in the Bible. According to the Bible, God is the creator of everything. But Kant suggests that force creates everything—force, not God, is the creator of nature. Worse, force can be modeled mathematically, as he argues in chapter 2, and it can be jointly determined by two quantities, as he argues in chapter 3. “God” is merely a placeholder for the cause of force itself.

Now Kant speaks of God as possible maker of multiple universes (#8; 1:22), as engineer of dimensions (#11; 1:25), and as sealing off this world from improbable others (ibid.). But in the same breath (#7–10), he makes force responsible for these tasks. And he already showed his hand in his praise for the entelechy. Entelechies are programs of the self-organization and sustenance of things—in Aristotle’s words, a dynamis put en ergon or put in action; i.e., energeia.

Kant’s waffling over God and force permits only two readings. Neither of them would be palatable to any Christian worth his salt: either God is creative force, or God created creative force. By Kant’s account, the former would mean that God is describable as a physical quantity. The latter would imply that force, not God, created the universe. Whoever suggests either is not a believer and does not deserve to graduate under a Pietist advisor, not even a liberal one.

So Kant was passed over. Knutzen never recommended him, and in Knutzen’s letters to Leonard Euler (1707–83), he is not on the list of excellent students (Waschkies 1987: 20). The professor had more regular favorites, such as Johann Weitenkampf (b. 1726) and Friedrich Buck (1722–86), who succeeded to Knutzen’s chair (Pozzo 1993: 283–322; Kuehn 2001b: 23).

Kant took resort to irony (#4; 1:21.3–8) and avenged himself by not mentioning his teacher—ever. Many years later (1770), after Knutzen’s death, when Kant finally enjoyed some public recognition, he would secure his long-desired professorship by striking a deal with the administration to snatch Knutzen’s chair from Buck, pushing the pet student to another post without even asking.

A word by Seneca sets the tune for Kant’s debut—“Nothing is more important than to go where one ought to go, instead of following the herd, like cattle, and go where they went”.[10] Kant expresses the hope that “the freedom I take of contradicting great men won’t be construed as a crime” (1:7.6–9). He needed hope because he had made up his mind. He knew what he was doing, and he was defiant. “My basis is as follows,” he writes (1:10.25–7), “I have already marked out the path that I shall take. I shall set out on my course, and nothing shall stop me from proceeding along it”.

4. Dynamic Debut: “Radiation in the Inverse Square”

Kant’s own intent was to understand the powers of nature and he set out to solve the puzzle of force. The Thoughts on the True Estimation of Living Forces was a contribution to the so-called vis-viva-controversy; its goal was to settle the issue once and for all. The issue was as simple as it is profound: what is force, and how can it be measured?

The controversy had begun in the previous century and was rife through the entirety of the modern period. Following the implications of his mechanical description of physical substances, Descartes argued that force is reducible to the mathematical quantity of motion observable in matter. Descartes contended that this quantity is conserved in the universe. Nature is matter in motion, and motion is the explanatory principle. “Force” is the product of mass and velocity (mv), a quantity called “quantity of motion” or “dead pressure” then and momentum now.[11] Beyond this, for Descartes, “force” has no further meaning. Cartesian essence can be isolated to physical and mental substances and force is neither of these. Force is not a dynamic essence, nor an essence at all. It is merely a quantity of motion calculable in another substance. By his rendering, Descartes reduced physics to kinematics.

Leibniz rejected the Cartesian formulation. When examining rising and falling bodies, he recognized that their behavior reveals a different quantity, derived from Galileo’s law of fall, which is the product of mass and velocity squared (mv²). Leibniz thought this implied Descartes’s quantity to be false and that only mv², not mv, is conserved. Leibniz called this new quantity “living force” (vis viva); we call it kinetic energy now. Force is real, he argued, and it is more than a quantity (mv of Decartes)— it is the basic quality of nature and its activity can be observed in nature. Leibniz expanded physics to a dynamics.

Leibniz was correct about rising and falling bodies, but the Cartesians (Descartes had died in 1650) pointed to other experiments in support of the mv-formula. Unfortunately for the early debate, the issue could not be decided—because both sides had been right; there is both momentum and kinetic energy. So the arguments continued for decades. After Leibniz’s death (1716), the controversy continued through his followers, who quarreled with the current crop of French Cartesians. Newtonians were split over vis viva; Newton and his British fans rejected it, while continental Newtonians accepted it. After Newton’s death (1727), in the 1740s, the issue was settled—in Newton’s favor. D’Alembert proved that there is a place for both quantities in physics (1743). Before that, Euler (1737) had already found out that Descartes’s momentum is Newton’s force acting over time, and Leibniz’s kinetic energy is Newton’s force acting through space. It did take, however, a while before this information spread and became generally accepted. The debate died down around the time Kant published the Living Forces (1749).

Kant’s debut was one of the many attempts at settling the dispute, but for all practical purposes, it was a failure. The Living Forces appeared too late to make any difference, and Kant was unaware of d’Alembert’s and Euler’s research. But what doomed the book in the public eye was that Kant seemed to have bet on the wrong team of horses. He argued for a synthesis of Cartesian kinematics and Leibnizian dynamics, and did so at the expense of Newtonian mechanics. At the time he grasped Newton’s ideas only partially. He did not yet understand that motion, like rest, is a state (something Galileo had discovered) and that force is needed only for changing, not for keeping a state (which is Newton’s first law of motion). He not only implicitly rejected Newton through such mistakes, but also explicitly questions his authority (preface, 1:7). Later in the book, he criticizes the first law of motion (#50–51, #97–8), suggests an alternative to Newtonian inertia (#124–5, #132–3), and dismisses as a “desperate excuse” Newton’s view that loss of motion reveals nature’s entropic tendency (#50; 1:59). He tried to determine force without even mentioning the second law of motion that defines it as the product of mass and acceleration. For Kant, Newtonian mechanics was irrelevant. While there are hundreds of references to Descartes and Leibniz in the book, the references to Newton can be counted on the fingers of one hand.

In fact, however, Kant was not as mistaken as it seemed at the time. For one thing, he arrived essentially at the same conclusion as d’Alembert and Euler: both mv and mv² are legitimate, determinable quantities. More importantly, he proposed a deep connection. While showing in chapter 2 that Descartes’s quantity is empirically well supported, he argued in chapter 3 that Leibniz’s quantity must be factored in to arrive at a full qualitative understanding of force. “Active force” is jointly measurable as “dead pressure” and “living force”—the full account of force requires a synthesis of Cartesian kinematics and Leibnizian dynamics, notwithstanding their conflicts.

That is, Kant not only regarded momentum and energy as relevant quantities, as d’Alembert had done, but he grasped that their union points to the universal nature of force. This was sharper than even Euler’s insight. Euler had discovered that these quantities are derivable from Newtonian force and that there is accordingly a quantitative connection among them. But Kant invested this connection with qualitative meaning, arguing that the structure of nature must be understood in dynamic terms, and that Newton really misses the point. The title of the book, “Thoughts on the True Estimation of Living Forces” is no idle boast, for Kant’s “true estimation” is the insight that “living force” and “dead pressure” are two sides of the same coin. Throughout the book, he wrestles with the harmony of opposites, Cartesian kinematics and Leibnizian dynamics, trying to marry momentum and energy—while having the audacity to criticize Newton. This is the thrust of the work. Taken as a prediction, it is superb. With his first publication, Kant intuited not only that matter is ultimately energetic, but also that its dynamic measure is momentum-energy.[12]

This aperçu was no lucky guess. Kant understood what force involves. He argues that force is the essence of action (#4). This action is a pulse that “broadens out” (#9–10). Out-broadening of force (ausbreiten; 1:24.23) is an out-stretching of space (Ausdehnung; 1:24.6). Force makes the continuum, being governed, in turn, by the created structure (#10). This shift in understanding the nature of force correspondingly alters the nature one must think of material objects and dynamic interaction. The origin and source is force, and not substance, as the Cartesians had insisted. Force is responsible for substance, quantification and laws of nature—not the other way around. In this bold thesis Kant anticipates his more famous “Copernican turn”—an inversion of the way we view nature—but in this context he is still working in the field of natural philosophy of his day. Dynamic interaction turns force into a field and the void into a plenum. Kant anticipated that momentum-energy is the substantial correlate of spacetime. Bypassing Newton, he caught up with Einstein.[13]

Connected with this apercu is the proposed bond of force and space—“force” understood as momentum-energy, Kant’s active essence of substance, and “space” defined as Kant’s dimensional continuum. For Kant, force grips the void, holding it as a dimensional presence that localizes the original pulse. Force extends space, ordering it, and space places force, governing it. Space dynamically expands; force structurally acts. Each needs the other. Without force, space would lack structure (Abmessungen or Dimensionen, #9–10) and could not place a world (#7–9, 11). Without space, force could not be a field (#10). Force is spaced and space is forced. This is their bond (1:23–4). Indeed: mass stretches spacetime, and spacetime grips mass.

In fact, Kant caught up with modern physics in several regards. Another of his insights is so basic that it is easy to miss. He defended force as the interactive matrix of nature and insisted on the importance of dynamics. The dynamic ontology of the Living Forces was ridiculed in its day, for Newton’s mechanics had digested Kepler’s celestial dynamics and marginalized Leibniz’s physical dynamics. Yet Kant’s stance would mark out the future course of science. We do not regard nature as a collection of particles and forces in empty space anymore, but instead as a system of energy-pulses interacting in fields. Dynamics has turned out to be fundamental.

When examining the force-space bond in detail (#10), Kant discovered the law of free point source radiation (1:24.19–23), historically the first generalization of the individual inverse-square laws in natural philosophy:

The pressure of any point-source radiation in a free field drops at a rate that is inversely proportional to the square of the propagated distance.[14]

Kant’s generalization unites Kepler’s law of photo measurement (1604), Newton’s law of universal gravitation (1697), and Coulomb’s later law of electrostatic force (1785) as instantiations of the spread of energy.[15] Kant’s law governs multiple forms of free radiation, not just light, gravity, and electrostatic force, but also radioactivity, radio waves, and sound. Its most famous application, in its first, Keplerian, instantiation, was Hubble’s measure of the luminosity of distant variable stars (1924)—which led to the discoveries of cosmic expansion and the Big Bang.

In the concluding reflection of the pivotal tenth section of the Living Forces, Kant recognized the contingency of the pressure-propagation ratio (1:24.26–8), inferred that other ratios would generate continua with other dimensions (1:24.28–30), and surmised that a science in command of the dimensional range would be the highest geometry achievable (1:24.31–3). In light of quantum geometry and its modern guises—superstring and M-theories—this last remark might well have been Kant’s most far-sighted prediction. Despite suffering from insufficient scientific training, the rejection by his advisor, the academic failure, and the catastrophe in his family, Kant’s philosophical debut in 1749 reveals the mark of genius.

5. Newtonian Stargazing: “The Splendor of a Single Universal Rule”

For the next seven years, Kant’s life would be quiet. He was now teaching children in the Baltic countryside. As a Hofmeister (private teacher), he educated the sons of Pastor Andersch, from 1748 to 1751, in the French settlement Judtschen, half a day’s walk from Königsberg. Next he taught the sons of Knight von Hülsen at his Arnsberg estate until about 1753, a two-day day ride from Königsberg. Finally he worked as a tutor for Count Keyserlingk until 1754. This in Kant’s life is marked by social engagements, dinners and convivial living. During this time Kant’s finances improved, which left him more time to attend to his tutoring and his own research.

When Kant left town, the main influence on his thought had been Georg Bernhard Bilfinger[16] (1693–1750), Wolff’s former assistant at Halle. Bilfinger’s heuristic method had inspired the project of Living Forces. This rule for finding truth is to identify an intermediate position when experts advance contrary views, provided ulterior motives are absent (1:32.7–13). Bilfinger’s rule had guided Kant to reconcile Leibniz and Descartes over force. This method was to characterize nearly all of his critical writings as well.

In the countryside, Kant realized that his debut had met with no success, despite its inspiration. His middle way of synthesizing Leibniz and Descartes was ignored. Having criticized Newton, Kant now reconsidered his stance on Newtonian physics. When Kant published his second work, the Spin-Cycle essay (1754), his misgivings had turned into admiration. As its title states, it is an

investigation of the question whether the earth in its axial rotation, whereby it causes the change of day and night, has experienced any change since the earliest times of its origin, and how one could answer this question, announced for the current year’s prize, by the Royal Academy of Sciences in Berlin. (1:183.1–12)

Kant describes gravitational attraction there as “nature’s universal engine” (das allgemeine Triebwerk der Natur), which allowed Newton to reveal the secrets of nature in a manner that is “as clear as it is indubitable” (1:186.35–7). In the essay, he also announces his next book (1755) with the working title,

Cosmogony, or attempt to deduce the origin of the cosmos, the constitution of celestial bodies, and the causes of their motions, from the general laws of motion of matter according to Newton’s theory. (1:191.4–8)

Kant’s Newtonian conversion would be completed while working on the Spin-Cycle essay. The early drafts still involve discussions of Huygens’s dynamics (23:5–7). But published argument is sharpened to a Newtonian point—no other natural philosopher is even mentioned. Newton had become Kant’s authority and his sole scientific point of reference.

Little is known of Kant’s actual conversion. Only start and finish—Living Forces and Spin-Cycle—are present. But it does not take much imagination to fill in the blanks. In 1749, Kant promoted his book and waited for a reaction. When keeping track of the relevant journals, it could not have escaped him that Newton was the winner, nor that Leibnizian dynamics was on the wane and that support for Cartesian kinematics had all but collapsed. Force was Newtonian force. Newtonian physics had become the new paradigm of natural philosophy.

By his own account, Kant was not enthusiastic about his employment, but he did not hate it either. Some of his charges affectionately stayed in touch and later sought him out in the city. He was on good terms with Andersch and Hülsen, and the work for the Keyserlingks was the start of lifelong friendships. So his tutoring responsibilities were not too great a burden. Afterwards, he would churn out publications at breath-taking speed—two tracts, one book, a Master’s thesis, and a dissertation; each of them on a different topic, and all of them in little more than one year (from June 1754 to September 1755). The timing suggests that he had written some of it already in the countryside.

This means he had leisure. He taught, but also pursued his own interests. Remarkable about his Newtonian conversion is not the change of heart, but the change in competence. His first publication, despite its brilliance, reveals his confusions over basic mechanics and a remedial grasp of the mathematics needed to understand Newton. His next group of works displays a firm grasp of celestial mechanics and a growing appreciation of the Principia. Digesting its contents, particularly in the given form (in fluxion instead of normal calculus) could have taken months, if not years.

The context in which Kant found himself may have lent itself to a more holistic engagement with Newton. Rural life is life in daylight. Kant had to adapt to his employers and attended to his charges during the day. Because his leisure would have been after dinner (sundown) or before breakfast (sunrise), he probably read the Principia at night. Nights before the industrial revolution were different than they are now. Nights were dark, and when there was neither clouds nor a full moon, stars would blaze with intensity unfamiliar to us today. The starry skies must have been awe-inspiring. We can conjecture that Kant, studying the Principia, would occasionally step outside and look up. He was reading about celestial mechanics—and then he would see it. Kant’s subsequent publications reveal his exuberance about the stars and the laws they display; just as they reveal his grasp of the planetary dance and his recognition of Newton’s achievement. Kant’s employment in the countryside can certainly be understood as a boon to his study of Newton.

Kant’s earlier work had sensitized him to the dynamics of nature, and this would have made it all the easier to marvel over celestial mechanics while stargazing. Thinkers with a dynamic bent, from Pythagoras to Kepler, listened to the music of the spheres. As Kepler’s Harmonice Mundi (1619) shows, the music of the spheres is not a poetic delusion but a heuristic device.[17] It turns one’s attention on cosmic patterns, the harmonies and beats that point to laws. As the Spin-Cycle essay illustrates, Kant followed in the footsteps of such thinkers. Listening to the music of the spheres would generate the astonishing discoveries of the 1750s.

On the face of it, it seems inexplicable how Kant could apply Newton’s theory of the tides to the fate of Earth’s axial rotation. But in the Spin-Cycle essay (1754), Kant arrived at the right result for the right reasons. Newton showed that the primarily lunar gravity acts on ocean tides. This action, Kant argues, constitutes a retarding moment on the Earth’s surface (1:187); this retardation, he infers, slows down the Earth’s rotation (1:188); and the lunar brake only lets go, he concludes, when days are as long as lunar months (1:190). He found the solution despite multiple handicaps: minimal data, unimpressive formal skills, and no instruments.

But if the planet’s rotational fate is modeled as music, the solution will be loud and clear. The gravitational pulls beat out different rhythms. Daily terrestrial rotation and monthly lunar revolution are not in sync. The resonance of their two spheres rattles with a noise—drumming a syncopated beat, the lows and highs of oceanic tides. This tidal noise distracts from the rotating rhythm. The tidal taps, every six hours, weaken the Earth’s beat. Syncopates are dissonant; they are mechanical wobbles, and they will eventually cease. Undermining the cosmic beat, the dynamic opposites slow the Earth’s spin down until they dissolve in harmony. When, in the far future the Moon always shines over the same spot, the Earth will have found its rhythm, sans tidal cacophony, and be in sonic step with its celestial neighborhood, and the rotation of the Earth will be slowed. Thus Kant’s astrophysical essay was possible.

In retrospect, Newton had clarified to Kant the force-space bond of the Living Forces. In its new guise, the bond is so useful that its implications go beyond the Earth-Moon system. Its pulse, the pulls and pushes, is the rhythm of the cosmos. The lesson of the Living Forces is that matter is energy, and that forces act and interact with space. Aristotle’s entelechy reveals that an initial dynamic push produces material order when put into action. This action involves Bilfinger’s dialectical harmony of opposites, but it is Newton who reveals its actual and precise mechanics.

Cosmic action turns on gravitation, the reciprocal attraction of masses. When drawn together, masses collide, crash, and are laterally deflected. The angular momentum of deflections generates a counterforce to centripetal gravitation—centrifugal repulsion. Applying Newton to the bond, in his second book Universal Natural History and Theory of the Sky (1755), Kant sees that the dynamics of force, its push and pull, are attraction and repulsion. Matter is then all you need, he says, and you can start building a world (1:229.10–11).

This is far more radical—and more consistent—than Newton’s approach. Gravity will not do the trick of world building. However, the cosmic harmony of dynamic opposites, attraction and repulsion, can do the conceptual work, provided one assumes a random distribution of particles. This proviso marks a step beyond the Living Forces. There, in the first book, Kant had explained space by the outward action of force, but had glossed over the individuation of multiple dynamic presences, necessary for cosmic evolution. Here, in the second book, he assumes an initial material chaos and explains its growth into ordered complexity by the interaction of forces.

Kant’s two cosmological starting points—dynamic stretch into the void in the 1740s, and homogeneous material chaos in the 1750s—are not contradictory. The reflections in his first book begin with the very beginning, with existence prior to extension. The reflections in his second book proceed from the next stage, existence in extension. Kant’s initial cosmogony starts with force stretching out into a void, creating a field. His next theory begins with the extended field sedimenting into a scattering of particles. He does not replace a dynamic by an atomistic theory, or switch from active forces to inert matter. Matter always remains the guise and result of energetic interactions. As he would stress in his professorial thesis, the Physical Monadology (1756), particles are force concentrations, whose solidity is due to dynamic interplay.

In light of present knowledge, his reflections were largely correct, and the gap in his cosmic history—the interval from dynamic extension to material particles—remains subject to debate today. Cosmologists are not unanimous on what happened in this period. Nonetheless, they have substantiated that force came first and that material chaos followed next. The universe did start dynamically as a singularity, whose first outward-bound and energetic action—the Big Bang—wove a dimensional structure in its wake. The continuum (the disentangling of space and time) emerged 10−51 years and the chaos (the formation of atomic nuclei) 10−5 years after the Big Bang—followed by the creation of atoms, of stars, the Sun, and the Earth. Within the expanding bubble of the Bang is the universe today.

As soon as material chaos is assumed, everything happens on its own. Kant contends in the Universal Natural History that nature’s flourishing toward well-ordered complexity is explicable through an “essential striving” (1:226.8–12). No Newtonian “hand of God” needs to stave off perceived loss of motion (1:222–225); he had already stated earlier that appealing to lost motion is a “desperate excuse” (Living Forces #50; 1:59). As he explains now—taking nothing back from the stance that cost him his graduation—God does not function in nature’s development because creation is self-organization. Fully convinced of this, he warns fundamentalists against opposing science; if they did, they would be defeated (1:222.32–35; 225.2–5).

The push and pull of the bond explains cosmic self-organization, and in the Universal Natural History Kant shows how the chaos evolved to the starry skies visible now. It should be possible to do the same for organisms, but science at the time did not explain the formation of life. How life unfolds we do not know (1:230.14–20); we only know that it does. Kant believes (science agrees) that star birth is easier to determine than the creation of life (1:230.20–26).

With his famous nebular hypothesis, Kant discerned how planets, stars, and galaxies form. Their birth is a process of titanic power. Attractive forces contract particles into clouds, but repulsive forces deflect them up close. Continued accretion increases deflection, imparting angular momentum on the ever quicker rotating cloud. Rotation generates centrifugal forces, pulling the cloud’s equators outwards, crushing the poles, until the out-bulging yet in-falling sphere, revolving ever faster around its center, flattens into a disc. The bond, in Newton’s model of universal gravitation, continues coalescing in momentum and spin, until the center of the cosmic disc is so energized that it combusts. Increased energy translates into increased structure, organizing the ecliptic plane into lumpy coalescence. When the disc plane sediments into spinning bands, the lumps grow massive, while caroming along their orbits. The moving masses vacuum their paths and grow into planets strung along an ecliptic plane, orbiting a sun in now empty space—or, on a higher order of magnitude, into suns majestically revolving around a brightly lit galactic center. Whether suns in spiral galaxies, or planets in solar systems, the orbiting satellites sweep out equal areas in equal times, with their periods in sync with their distances from the gravitational centers.[18]

With this essay, Kant synthesizes Newton with his own theory of forces, leading Kant to the cutting edge of current knowledge. Nature, in the Universal Natural History, streams outward in a wavefront of organization (1:314.1–2), generating worlds (1:314.8), biospheres and sentience (1:317.5–13, 352–3), and finally reason, human and otherwise (1:351–66). Organization is fragile, and spontaneity, pushed far enough, invites chaos. Mature cosmic regions decay, chaos sets in, and entropy follows in the wake of complexity. But entropy provides the very conditions that allow the cosmic pulse to bounce material points back to order. Thus the expanding chaos coalesces at its center into order, followed by chaos, by order, by chaos. Like a rising and burning phoenix, nature cycles between life and death (1:312.13).

For creatures, the cosmic phoenix is a problem. Humans are just feathers on its wings. Humans grow only to burn to ashes; they are not exempt from the cosmic law (1:318.17–18). As the pulsing cosmic vector governs everything, order emerges on all orders of magnitude, from the repetitive birth of the phoenix to the elements to life and to inevitable collapse—only to begin anew again. The force-space bond unfolds in the interactive harmony of dynamic opposites, an interaction governed by Newton’s universal gravitation, churning out galaxies, suns, planets, life, and minds. Thus, as Kant writes, a “single universal rule” guides natural evolution in an absolutely glorious way (1:306.18–23).

6. Systematic Cosmology: “All Things in the Universe Interactively Connect”

When Kant returned to Königsberg in early autumn 1754, his prospects had improved. King Friedrich II (Frederick the Great, reign 1740–86), like Kant a victim of a fundamentalist education, had instituted liberal policies in Prussia that were making themselves felt in the province. Kant’s former advisor Knutzen had died (1751), and a freer atmosphere now pervaded the university. Kant had saved some money, supplemented his formal education with his own studies, and was prepared to return to school. He would now complete his studies and start his academic career.

He dedicated the Universal Natural History to Frederick the Great and published it in spring 1755. With this publication, Kant cautiously published anonymously. The problem was not risking religious opposition by endorsing Newton. Rather, it was that Kant had sharpened celestial mechanics to a secular and dynamic cosmology, while replacing Newton’s Christian view of natural design with a non-anthropocentric and naturalistic teleology. He supported Newtonian mechanics and cosmology, but to the detriment of biblical creation stories.

Newton had thought that cosmic organization required the hand of God, but Kant eliminated any need for divine interference. Newton had supposed that God regularly infuses nature with new motion to keep the world machine from running down due to entropy; he had accepted the notion of final causes as ways in which God makes himself known; and he had appealed to God’s miraculous adjustments whenever physical explanations failed him, as in the case of the ecliptic plane.[19] Newton could not explain the coplanar orbits of planets and surmised, “such a wonderful uniformity in the planetary system must be allowed the effect of choice” (1979 [1730]: 402).

Kant discovered in the Universal Natural History that the planetary arrangement on the ecliptic plane results from forces acting on particles that accrete in a spinning cloud. Hence there was no need to follow Newton and appeal to God. Nor was there any compelling metaphysical reason to do so. Force is goal-directed and its energy unfolds the cosmos. The term Kant employs for this unfolding, Auswicklung der Natur (1:226.8), is the “out-wrapping” of nature, from primal force to complex structure. “Out-wrapping” is both process and purpose. Purpose is not imposed by a supernatural God, but, instead, woven into the natural fabric. Teleological ends and means are natural in the development of forces, location, space and particles; the interplay of forces is the vehicle of final causes, and the telos of nature is its own fulfillment. (1:223, 263, 332). Even in its simplest state, matter has the urge to develop itself. (1:228, 262–3, 314). The rise of order and abundance—or biological diversity, in our terms—marks nature’s quest toward fulfillment, and this process, fueled by the incessant pulse of attraction and repulsion, generates harmony and beauty.

Following this cosmic model, in which Kant rejects extrinsic teleology for an immanent version, everything is connected. Taking his cue from Pope’s “chain of being”, Kant likens the universe to a Kette der Natur, the “chain of nature” (1: 308, 365).[20] Humans are merely links in the greater chain of being. Dismissing the anthropocentric teleology of Wolff, Derham, and the physico-theologians, Kant finds the claim that the universe was created for human purposes exaggerated—and provincial.[21] An intelligent louse, he says, might as well imagine that the scalp it lives on and the forest of hair that surrounds it were created just for the sake of its happiness; from a louse’s point of view, things surely look that way (1:353–4). In the chain of nature, all beings are equal. Nature does not play favorites, none of the organic links, whether it be an insect or a rational being, is more important than another (1:354). As the goal of force is complexity, the goal of nature (commonly understood) is biodiversity, the goal of planets is to sustain biospheres, the goal of terrestrial existence is to increase biota—the telos of nature is life (1:353), at least until it reaches maximum density and begins to fracture in cosmic collapse.

What kind of life? Ultimately, Kant argues, planets aim to sustain intelligent life. Inspired by Fontenelle’s vision of inhabited worlds, he conjectures that there may well be extraterrestrial life.[22] Nothing, however, guarantees that humans are the crowns of creation nor even atop the chain of being. Humans, Kant conjectures, occupy a “middle rung” on the ladder of creatures (1:359.29)—and are possibly infinitely distant from the top tier of intelligent beings (1:353.35–6). A sober look at ourselves shows that we are on a risky course (gefährliche Mittelstrasse, 1:366.7) halfway between wisdom and irrationality. We are cosmically mediocre.

A theme of Kant’s thought, dominant in the pre-critical period, integral to the critical period, and to which he returns in old age, is that humans are part of nature. He was too familiar with the philosophy of Descartes and its problems to subscribe to a mind-body dualism of distinct substances, the one thinking, the other extended. Instead he followed Bilfinger’s heuristic, and already in the Living Forces he had solved Descartes’s puzzle of mind-body interaction by arguing that minds are spatially located within their bodies, and that both are energetic structures that influence each other (1:20–21). In the later Prize Essay (1764), he would judge the Christian notion of immaterial souls as indemonstrable (2:293), an argument he re-echoes in his critical writings as well (A339/B397–A405/B432). Although minds are not necessarily matter in a literal sense, he would argue there that they are probably some kind of energy-bundles commensurate with the material framework of nature. Here in the Universal Natural History, he describes humans as material beings; the makeup of rationality is linked to the constitution of matter as a product of dynamic force (1:335).

All things interactively connect, and as minds shape matter, matter shapes minds. Coarse matter makes mental fibers inflexible (1:356). The IQ-constraining coarseness is proportional to density. In cosmic terms, this means that rational force depends on spatial location. In the stellar nebula (the embryonic solar system), matter, consisting of elements with varying density, was randomly distributed. But as soon as an interactive forces pulls the material cloud in and sets it spinning, denser particles will not be as easily pushed around as lighter ones; when unequal bits collide, lighter ones bounce off while denser ones remain on track. Denser elements, deflected later, cruise on lower orbits; lighter elements, deflected sooner, orbit higher up. Orbital height is inversely proportional to material density (1:270); hence orbital bands form denser planets the closer they are to the Sun (1:277; Kant’s “static law”). Kant speculates that really superior intelligence will only emerge in the rarefied matter of outer planets (1:359). The denser a planet is (as Earth, close to the Sun) the denser, unfortunately, are its inhabitants.

The anonymous publication of the Universal Natural History was prudent but not without risk. The dedication indicates Königsberg as the place of composition; the publisher Petersen was a local company, and eventually the identity of the author would have come out.[23] Petersen went bankrupt just when copies of the Universal Natural History were off the press and in a warehouse. The warehouse was sealed—and then mysteriously burned down, which allowed Petersen to collect insurance and pay off creditors. Bankruptcy and fire prevented the book’s distribution (Rahts 1902: 545–6; Krafft 1971: 193). But this was not necessarily a bad turn for Kant. As the fates of Spinoza, Tschirnhaus, or Toland illustrate, you cannot be a dynamic freethinker and a professor in the conservative university system at the same time. Considering Kant’s goals, the misfortune over the book was a blessing in disguise.

Undaunted, he set out to write his Master’s thesis. According to the ideas articulated so far, Kant envisioned a radiating essence that organizes itself in cosmic expansion. The core stretches out as interactive complexity, emerging in biospheres populated by organisms, while eventually pulling back into itself, like a phoenix of nature, burning up only to rise from the ashes. The cyclic “out-wrapping of nature” generates structures, some of them animated, a few of them intelligent. By their harmonic development, the natural structures will eventually allocate force without lateral boundaries, setting the cosmic vector free. When this is a universal condition, the energy flow is uniform in reiterative patterns across magnitudes. It is then entropic. Overcoming the last boundary, the vertical order of magnitudes, force rushes into itself, concentrating its pulse once more to a singularity before the next cosmic upsurge.[24]

In order to understand the dynamics of force at the inception of cosmoi, the pulse of the bond, flaring out structure, may be visualized as fire. Fire is an exemplar of the interplay of forces. It is no surprise that the author of Living Forces and Universal Natural History would want to investigate it, for doing so might lead to more insights about the cosmic matrix. He chose Johann Gottfried Teske (1704–72), a professor of physics interested in electricity and lightning, as his advisor and graduated with A Succinct Outline of Some Meditations on Fire.

Hence Kant, who would later soar to the heights of the Critiques and the Categorical Imperative, earned his philosophy degree with a Master’s thesis on the structure of fire (1755).

On Fire is an elaboration of the energetic model of matter. Kant argues there that all bodies, solid, liquid, and gaseous types, consist of dynamic particles or molecules (moleculae, 1:372.24 and passim). He contends that the particles cohere in an elastic medium. This medium, the ether, permeates the molecular interstices of bodies (prop. 3, 1: 372). He calls this ether “fire-matter” and identifies it as the carrier of warmth and light. Heat results from wave-like vibrations of this materia ignis among the molecules (prop. 8, 1:377). As it is known today, heat is a symptom of molecular vibration, which in turn depends on the energy-state of a body.

After being awarded with Master’s degree, Kant wrote his dissertation, the New Elucidation of the First Principles of Metaphysical Cognition (1755). At first glance, this work has little to do with his previous research on force, cosmos, and fire. It is about the principles of ontology, specifically the conceptual tools for metaphysical investigations. In fact, however, it was only a matter of time until he would write such a work. Now he would explore the cognitive access to dynamic interactivity and the causal structure of human integration into nature. Quite naturally, Kant moved from cosmic origins to nebulae to solar systems to planets and biota, and then to rational life. With his doctoral dissertation, Kant hoped to get to the bottom of the things that interested him most.

Commonsensically understood, humans are parts of nature. Their actions are free, yet natural processes are mechanical and predictable. One pressing question then becomes: How do human actions and natural processes relate? If nature is the out-wrapping of force, and intelligent beings are products of the cosmos, how is their free action possible in a lawful natural matrix? In the New Elucidation, Kant argues for a compatibilist view—both human freedom and natural necessity are real, and neither is reducible to the other. As Kant’s thematic continued to develop, their seeming conflict finds a dynamic resolution. Everything in nature happens for a prior reason (1:396.8–9), and this rule applies to both necessary events and free actions. Both process-types share the fact of causal connectivity, but they connect to causes in different ways (1:400.30–7). Causation types concern the degree of power by which they are influenced, and this is what distinguishes between the two. The opposites, free acts and mechanical events harmonize over force. A free will is not something being pushed around, but is instead a “determining power” (determinandi potestas; 1:404.8). By its power, a will can withstand impulses (motivi) without being always forced by them (1:404.10–14, 34–9). Those events that do not have sufficient power to withstand force are seen as natural and necessary consequents, those events that possess sufficient ability to withstand forces are seen as free acts. Thus freedom/ spontaneity is naturally possible.

Later, in the Foundations of the Metaphysics of Morals (1785), Kant would distinguish between “things” and “persons” (4:428), describing the former as natural means and the latter as rational ends. Persons are free; what distinguishes them is their will, a faculty of determining oneself to action (4:427). Self-determination is the basis of freedom; necessitation is the mark of nature. The New Elucidation supplies the unified ground for this dichotomy. Autonomy and heteronomy are a matter of dynamic degree. Persons and things alike are energetic bundles of collocated forces, but the superior rational force of persons can resist others and is capable of autonomy.

As the title of the New Elucidation of the Principles of Metaphysical Cognition indicates, it is a new attempt to clarify the cognitive principles needed for understanding the structure of reality. The force-space bond in Kant’s first book, as well as the attractive-repulsive interplay in his second, reveal that dynamic interactivity is the generative matrix of nature. Interaction is not “one” thing but involves at least two poles that engage with one another. Because the dynamic “between”—their link—is fundamental, the cognitive tool for capturing the ultimate reality cannot be “one” principle. It cannot even be a basic principle of identity (a = a). Interaction is a relation of distinct items that grip one another—if they were not distinct, the event would be an action, not interaction. But it is dynamic interactivity that is the thing in itself.

Hence the New Elucidation does not begin with the principle of identity, like other ontological templates. Kant states that “there is no unique, absolutely first, universal principle of all truths” (prop. 1, 1:388.11–12). Instead, the identity-pair of opposites is absolutely primary (absolute prima): “whatever is, is, and whatever is not, is not” (prop. 2, 1:389.3–6). Affirmative and negative identity, when juxtaposed, suggest contradiction. This means that contradiction is a derivative of the primary identity-pair.[25] It also means that contradiction is governed by a prior (prae) identity (prop. 3, 1:390.30–2). Just consider any real knowledge: truth rests on an intuition of its ground (intuiti niti, 1:394.3–4), and if one wants to go beyond tautological transformations, ground of truth will differ from truth grounded. Analogously, actual states of affairs are grounded in other events (prop. 6, 1:394.10–11). Hence distinct antecedent reasons determine truths; distinct prior grounds determine things. At the same time, the truths determined give meaning to the antecedent as their reason, and the things determined give context to the prior as their ground. Reality emerges as soon as the dynamic center patterns alterity, while being placed and defined by the patterned alterity when doing so. The resulting interaction is essential. And it is accessible. Metaphysical cognition begins with communal identity (communiter principium identitatis) governing contradiction (prop. 2, 1:389.3–6).

As the communal identity of opposites is the universal grounded, the ultimate ground must be identity as such. Now the simple unit appears. It is outside our grasp but absolutely necessary (prop. 7, 1:395.4–6). The necessary existing unit is called “God” (ibid.). From it everything follows (prop. 8, 1:396.8–9). Specifically, what follows, and now once more within cognitive reach, is change (mutatio, 1:410.18). Kant’s Principle of Succession makes change intelligible: change occurs because of substantial connections ([substantiae] cum aliis connexae sunt); the mutual dependency of substances determines mutual alterations (prop. 12, 1:411.18–200). A bond governs change and thus reality. This dynamic-structural bond is a reciprocal, harmonious dependency. Metaphysical cognition ends with reciprocal commercium or interactivity, Kant’s Principle of Coexistence (prop. 13, 1:412–13).

That such a dynamic harmony can exist is so amazing that it has to be divinely sustained (1:413.10–15). Thus the New Elucidation ends with the marvel over interaction. He writes:

… Since we find all things in the universe to be interactively connected … we must admit that this relation depends on a joint cause, on God, the universal principle of beings. …The same pattern of the divine understanding, which generates existence, also establishes the relations of things to each other, by conceiving their existences as correlated with each other. From this it is evident that the universal interaction of all things must be due to this … divine idea. (1:413.13–20)

Kant confidently concludes that his system of universal interaction is certainly (certe) better than the pedestrian theory of physical influence. The reason, he explains, is that universal interactivity (systema universalis substantiarum commercium, 1:415.40) reveals the origin of the connection governing things, an origin that completely escapes ordinary physical influence because this theory looks at substances in isolation (1:416)—ignoring what happens among them, the dynamic “between”.

Kant was on a roll. He turned to writing his professorial thesis or habilitationsschrift, the Physical Monadology (1756). Have established the fundamentality of “the between” for both free events and mechanical causality (and their compatibility), Kant then turns to discuss what the “between” means with regard to the structure of matter—the physical manifestation of forces. Material things are extended—they take up space. The terminal units of nature must be point-entities, for if they weren’t, they would be further divisible and not be the final constituents. Ontology suggests that spatial objects consist of final elements. Logic requires that final elements are indivisible, hence points. Geometry warns that points never fill a volume, regardless how many are used. So how can points make up the spatial things in nature? On the matrix-level, what happens “between” the points?

Building on his earlier works, Kant continues to expound that force is prior to extension; everything comes about through the dynamics of force, pushes and pulls; and even on the smallest scale the attractive-repulsive interplay must structure space (determinata volumina, 1:484.10–12). Bodies are coherent webs of force-points. The dynamic point-entities are intelligible as mathematical centers, but dynamically, they are centers of active radiation fields that mutually confine each other. Physical monads are thus elementary energy spheres (sphaera activatis or ambitum activitatis; 1:481.9–10, 37). They are points and, as such, indivisible—but they radiate and in doing so create extension. Hence non-extended points constitute extended composites. We must think in dynamic terms, because corpuscular interpretations of nature do not work, not even for the ether (1:486.5–35). As he writes at the end of the Physical Monadology, the ether is energetically structured space or “fire matter” (aether seu materia ignis; 1:487.18), woven by elastic bonds (iunctae elasticitates; 1:487.12).

The professorial thesis has the full title, “the use in natural philosophy of the synthesis of metaphysics and geometry, whose first sample contains the physical monadology”. Kant argues that the combination of metaphysics and geometry can produce good philosophy (1:473). According to him, it seems easier to mate griffins with horses than to join exact science and conjecture (1:473.22–4), but truth is found in pursing just his course, the “physical monadology” is a case in point.

The ultimate units, Kant’s sphaera activatis, are terminal concentrations of energy that stretch out as active dimensional spheres. This insight matches current theoretical physics. In current particle physics, string theory conceives of force-points as closed vibrating loops that whip their exteriors into dimensional shape. Force generates extension—even on the level of elements. From what science can tell today, the resulting dynamic spacelets, so-called Calabi-Yau spaces, are the smallest extension units of reality.

Geometry and conjecture lead to the origin of physical extension. Calabi-Yau spaces, the modern-day correlates to Kant’s spheres, are approximated through quantum geometry. The units, superstrings (the branes of M-theory seen on edge), are smaller than the empirical threshold, the Planck length. Kant contended that the units are beyond the measure of the sensible. Modern cosmologists would agree, both in that investigating the absolutely large, the cosmos, necessarily leads to the investigation of the absolutely small, and in that this path leads from the empirical to the rational. The quest has become formal, and its physical pioneers are mathematicians. Beyond the scope of experiments, the explorers of strings and branes today do conceptual work. And like Kant, they stress the intelligible beauty of nature.

This conceptual work is guided by logical and aesthetic criteria, by elegance and simplicity. By Kant’s own testimony, the contemplation of nature was for him an intensely aesthetic encounter. In the Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and the Sublime (1764), his greatest public success before the Critiques, he would develop a phenomenology of beauty. Depending on the intensity of the experience, an aesthetic encounter can be either with beauty, exciting pleasure—or with the sublime, striking awe, sensual overload, even terror (2:208–9). Later, in the Critique of Judgment (1790), he would argue for the heuristic value of aesthetic notions such as design and unity.

When Kant was still working on the Physical Monadology, a tsunami shattered the coastal city Lisbon (1 November 1755). Fires broke out in the chaos that merged into a firestorm incinerating the rubble. It was the worst earthquake recorded up to this point in Western history; 70,000 people died. It struck on Sunday, which happened to be a holiday (All Saints Day, Allerheiligen for Kant). The twelve-meter (40 ft) high waves slammed at the city churches just when the flocks had gathered. The impact destabilized the towers, which collapsed backwards for static reasons, crashing through roofs and crushing whoever prayed below. The brothels, located further up in the hills, were spared. The faithful died, and the sinners survived. This posed a theological challenge.

Kant wrote three papers on the catastrophe. The first, On the Causes of the Terrestrial Convulsions (1756), was an essay on the physical dynamics of earthquakes; Kant speculated that there are giant caves underneath mountain ridges (1:419–20). Sometimes gases in the caves form combustible mixtures. When the gases release, the caves collapse, shaking the earth (1:422). Although Kant’s conjecture is false (quakes are usually due to plate tectonics), it is methodologically beyond reproach, employing known data (mining explosions) to formulate a testable hypothesis. The second tract, History and Natural Description of the Most Curious Occurrences associated with the Quake (1756), is a report on what happened in Lisbon. The third, Further Observation on the Terrestrial Convulsions (1756), is a refutation of superstitious causes such as invidious astrological conjunctions.

In all three essays, Kant insists on secular explanations. Earthquakes are terrible, but they are merely events in nature (1:420). We do not know what they mean in the larger frame of things, and to interpret the Lisbon earthquake as a divine punishment is naïve anthropocentrism.

Kant was interested in earthquakes not only because of the singular event in Portugal, but also for the reason he wrote on winds, the Theory of Winds (1756), and the West-Wind essay (1757). The most dramatic human encounters with natural forces are fire, storms, and earthquakes. Anyone intrigued by force would want to study these phenomena. Fire is pure energy. Earthquakes are the brutal action of force. And winds are the best examples of force moving through space. Meteorological phenomena in particular were an opportunity to apply the hypothesis of the force-space bond, the idea that active, dynamic forces modify each other and that external modifications of a radiation will affect the internal constitution of them. Air masses can be modeled as these fluctuations, and weather involves a clear instantiation of dynamic interactivity.

Kant discovered that the direction-patterns of coastal winds are the result of rhythmic thermal expansions and contractions of air columns over coastal and marine surfaces (1:223–4; 1:492–4). But weather is not only due to the push and pull of energies, the interaction of force (thermal radiation) and space (air columns over surface). As winds are motions in space, other motions may drive them on. Rotational forces—investigated in the earlier Spin-Cycle essay—are especially important. They were Kant’s key for his discoveries, later confirmed, of the dynamic weather cycles responsible for trade winds, equatorial winds, and the monsoon.

After a hiatus of several years, in which high teaching loads permitted him to write only little, Kant turned to what would be the culmination of his systematic cosmology. As the New Elucidation had already shown, the analysis of the interactive natural community points to an absolute and transcendent ground. The contemplation of nature inexorably leads to a reflection over the absolute. Kant examined the perfection of dynamic interactivity and its sustaining divine unit in the Essay on Optimism (1759), arguing that relative natural perfection amounts to the harmony of a manifold with a rule, and that absolute divine perfection is such that its manifold contains within itself the ground of reality (2:30–31note). Their difference, in terms of reality or perfection, is just a matter of degree (2:31.16)—the thrust and limit of the cosmic vector. In 1762, now pushing forty, Kant resumed this line of inquiry and wrote what would be his third book, Only Possible Ground of a Demonstration of God’s Existence (1763). Kant explores there the divine limit of the natural vector. “God” is defined as the necessary, unified, and constant being.

The first part of the Only Possible Ground contains an ontological argument of the divine bond. Instead of regarding existence as a predicate (2:70–4), Kant derives necessary existence from possibility (2:77–84)[26] The bond governing nature is derivable from its intelligible possibility, and not from any anthropological story nor from the notion of a necessary being. The bond Kant describes is considered divine, but should not be confused with standard anthropological descriptions. One may employ and ontological argument, but one should be clear on just what one is describing as a necessary bond.

The second part contains a teleological argument. Here Kant restates parts of the Universal Natural History (2:93–100, 123–51). Since few copies of that book had survived the publisher’s bankruptcy, he wanted to repeat once more its salient points—while toning down, or omitting altogether, its more provocative insights. Relevant for the topic was the immanent teleology of nature found in the Universal Natural History. In virtue of its own forces acting on matter, nature emerges as a uniform system that evolves to ever increasing order, diversity, and complexity. The divine and active bond is the cosmic vector, and we can observe its design in nature’s evolution. And since the design derives from the “inner possibility” of objects (2:91–2), both conceptual and teleological arguments share the same ground.

The divine bond is the unified and indispensable dynamis. The corresponding traits of cosmic structure—unity and harmony—make Kant’s argument from design possible. The third and final part of the Only Possible Ground contains his assessment of the ontological and teleological arguments. Only the former qualifies, strictly speaking, as a proof (2:161–1). A comparison reveals their differences. The one is a rigorous and conceptual demonstration, while the other is its probabilistic and empirical application. But truth is to be found in their harmony; both are rooted in the same key notion, possibility. Since empirical design is built into the intelligible dynamis of objects, both arguments harmonize over the essence of the bond. This is why the book has its peculiar structure: two arguments (Beweise) but one ground (Beweisgrund), which is possibility, Kant’s Möglichkeit or Aristotle’s dynamis.

7. Crisis and Critique: “Groping Among Mere Concepts”

But when Kant was reflecting on the divine ground of nature, he was assailed by doubts. Studying force in nature is one thing, but deducing God’s existence is quite another. Can one identify God in the rigorous and comprehensive way suggested in his third book? Here the ultimate task clashes with ultimate method. Determining the absolute by means of formal demonstration and empirical evidence is too bold. How could Kant be certain that he was not kidding himself?

The preface of the Only Possible Ground reveals his inner torment. Providence, he writes there, already imparted to common sense the notion that God exists, hence the project of a demonstration is redundant (2:65). The insight that God exists does not need “the sophistry of subtle inferences” (ibid.). In theory, such a demonstration might illuminate much else in this object, but “to achieve this purpose, however, one must venture into the bottomless abyss of metaphysics” (2:65.25–66.1). And what is metaphysics? A dark ocean without shore and lighthouse, Kant says, on which it is all too easy to lose one’s way (2:66.1–6).

This is followed by a startling retraction: he writes that his ontological proof, of all things, should not be mistaken for a demonstration (2:66.12–13). But if it were not a demonstration, what else could it be? What he wanted to do, he says, was to supply “just an argument in support of a demonstration”; a construction kit (Baugerät) for a future proof (2:66.9–10). This kit has been assembled with “great difficulty” (ibid.), and even so, he owes the reader an apology, for the kit is incomplete—frankly, it is bad (schlecht; 2:66.28).

Two years before Kant’s loss of heart, in 1761, the Prussian Academy had announced a question for the public competition of 1763. The question was whether metaphysical principles, specifically the principles of natural theology and morals, could be proven with the same clarity and precision as the truths of geometry. King Frederick II had invited foreign intellectuals and scientists, such as Maupertuis, d’Alembert, La Mettrie, Voltaire, Lagrange, and Euler to the academy, and they had little patience with their speculative German colleagues. Newton’s star kept rising, and the tough-minded foreigners put the metaphysicians in Berlin on the spot. The prize question was the result.

While Kant was writing the Only Possible Ground, he prepared a submission to the contest, the Inquiry Concerning the Distinctness of the Principles of Natural Theology and Morals (1764). The treatise is known as the Prize Essay, although Kant only received second prize, behind Mendelssohn. Work on the Prize Essay put Kant in a stressful situation, not only because he had to meet the contest deadline, but also because he forced himself to engage with metaphysics on two levels—in the book, he pursued a first-order question on God’s existence, and in the essay, he examined the second-order question of whether such a pursuit is actually feasible. This forced Kant to question himself and the project of his book.

The Prize Essay was a step toward the issue that would later acquire obsessive importance for Kant, the problem of the possibility of metaphysics as a system of conceptual (a priori) judgments that are synthetic—that really generate true knowledge claims, instead of just paraphrasing what is “known” through common sense. But, in contrast to the Critique of Pure Reason (1781), the Prize Essay contains still a modicum of hope. Its concern was not whether, but how metaphysics can be possible. Asking “how” suggests that metaphysics is feasible, and that the task is only a matter of determining its right method.

As a model of method, the Principia suggested itself. No other work in recent history had had such an impact on knowledge; no other book had revolutionized the understanding of nature as much as Newton’s masterpiece; and no other book contained so many discoveries in such rigorous form. Such rigor, it appeared, was the key to the extraordinary quality of its contents. Kant, who had studied Newton’s insights a decade earlier, now studied his guidelines, spelled out not only in the “Rules of Philosophy” of the Principia but also in the queries of the Opticks. In the final query (1979 [1730]: 404–5), Newton suggests the research strategy of an analysis of wholes into parts, followed by a synthesis of the identified causes into explanatory principles.

Accordingly, Kant’s methodological proposal in the Prize Essay is a case for a conceptual analysis as the starting point of metaphysics. Synthetic reasoning is premature as long as the concepts involved are ambiguous. Eventually metaphysics should turn into a synthetic discipline, but its current limitations require a mandatory analytic phase first (2:290).

This proposal allowed Kant to present himself as a thinker with exacting standards, and his Prize Essay was a reality-check on the overly optimistic winner, Mendelssohn’s Treatise on the Evidence in the Metaphysical Sciences (1764). The Prize Essay was a critique: metaphysics can be salvaged, but only by rebuilding it from scratch.

By drawing this conclusion Kant sawed off the branch he had been sitting on since 1745. Is conceptual philosophical inquiry into reality capable of certainty? Kant’s answer was “not yet”. But conceptual inquiry had been his work to date, from the Living Forces to the Only Possible Ground. Hence everything he had done suddenly appeared to him as terribly premature. Suddenly, Kant was in a crisis.

Things came to a head a year later, in 1765, when he, now forty-one, read the Swedish mystic Emmanuel Swedenborg (1688–1772). In Heavenly Secrets (8 vol., 1749–56), Swedenborg relates his visions of angels, describing their spiritual world in detail. Kant had been intrigued by the hearsay of the clairvoyant’s exploits, but when he read the work, he recognized it as a fraud.

Kant wrote a scathing satire, the Dreams of a Spirit-Seer (1766). In it he denounces Swedenborg as the “arch-spirit-seer of all spirit-seers” (2:354.20), whose works are “fantasies” (2:363.36), “wild figments of the imagination” (2:366.11), “eight tomes of nonsense” (2:360.15), and the results of “hypochondriacal winds” that result in effluence when raging in the guts, and in heavenly visions when raging in the mind (2:348.25–9).

What disturbed Kant was that he saw in the farting mystic a parody of himself (Laywine 1993: 71). The visionary’s world of angels is the reductio of dynamic cosmology—the absurd final consequence of Kant’s own contentions. He had always assumed that reality is radically coherent. Science and metaphysics join hands in its investigation because the cosmos involves an intelligible as well as an empirical side: humans are unqualified parts of nature; mind and body are energetic interacting presences; rationality depends on matter; freedom in nature is just a question of resisting force; and so forth. There is only force, and its product, nature. Kant’s ideas had amounted to a dynamic parallelism of the corporeal and the mental—just like Swedenborg’s philosophy of heaven.

The Dreams of the Spirit-Seer was thus also a self-critique. He wrote Mendelssohn that to preempt mockery by others, he found it wisest to mock himself, which was honest and something he had to do because his mind “is really in conflict on this issue” (10:70.2–5). The problem, he explains, is the presence of the mind in the material world, and that analogies between spiritual and material substances are flights of fancy unhindered by data (10:71–2). With this admission, in the letter on April 8, 1766, before his forty-second birthday, the entire pre-critical project Kant had worked on since he was twenty had come to a crashing halt.

Kant’s first response to this devastating outcome was to overreact. When a position as a professor at Königsberg University was available, he had to write yet another thesis for the application portfolio, On the Form and Principles of the Sensible and the Intelligible World (1770), the so-called Inaugural Dissertation. Since the problem handed to him by the mystic had been the dynamic unity of a jointly sensible and intelligible reality, the solution must be, according to Kant, their divorce. In the Inaugural Dissertation, he slashed through the Gordian knot by cutting nature into two halves, the mundus intelligibilis of metaphysics and the mundus sensibilis of science.

His second response was more considered and very courageous. He confronted his long-held convictions and examined them on possible flaws, by which meant to determine which of the claims previously advanced hold up and those that do not. This soul-searching amounted to a second-order investigation—not an examination of the conceptual contentions as such, but an examination of their knowability. This turned out to be an intense task that consumed more than a decade of his life, and which resulted in his greatest work, the Critique of Pure Reason (1781).

Among its findings, which historically changed the face of philosophy, are that traditional metaphysics is over (Aviii–x, Axix–xx, Bxiv–xv), and that proofs for God’s existence are done with (A631–42/B659–70). Discoveries later made in neuroscience confirm Kant’s insights and affirm that perception results from interaction, whereby pathways organize affecting data (B1, A15/B29, A50–51/B74–5, B113, B148–9), and that the subject of organized experience—the synthetic unity of apperception—poses the hard problem of consciousness (B154–9).

At the same time, Kant qualified there his previous split of the sensible from the intelligible; and it was good that he did, because as his early insights illustrate, his dynamic ontology, albeit premature, had always been on the right track. Thus interactivity entered the Critique as a cognitive device for ordering data (the disjunctive relation or community; A70/B95 and A80/B106) and for perceiving spatial objects (the principle of coexistence; A211/B256–A215/B262). The energy field (force stretched out as space) returns there as well, as the only exception to Kant’s critical rule not to talk about the intelligible features of mind-independent nature. But the rule had to be broken, he realized, because the energy-field sustains the interactive experience of spatial things (A211/B257–A213/B260).

Later, there would be even more qualifications of the split, and Kant’s return to his original themes with the Opus Postumum would turn the former divorce of intelligible and sensible into a merely episodic division to be overcome. But by 1781, he had found his way: the continued quest for the big questions, but now tempered by critical caution.


References to Kant’s texts follow the Academy edition (Gesammelte Schriften, ed. Akademie der Wissenschaften, Berlin: Reimer, later DeGruyter, 1910ff.) by volume, page, and, if useful, by line. References to the Critique of Pure Reason are to the first (A) and second (B) editions.

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  • Böhme, Hartmut and Gernot Böhme, 1983, Das Andere der Vernunft. Zur Entwicklung von Rationalitätsstrukturen am Beipsiel Kant, Frankfurt: Vittorio Klosterman.
  • Borowski, Ludwig, 1804, Darstellung des Lebens und Charakters Immanuel Kants, Königsberg: Nicolovius.
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  • Geier, Manfred, 2003, Kant’s Welt: eine Biographie, Reinbeck bei Hamburg: Rowohlt.
  • Guyer, Paul, 1992, “Introduction: the starry heavens and the moral law” in P. Guyer (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Kant, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Goldman, Avery, 2012, Kant and the Subject of Critique: On the Regulative Role of the Psychological Idea, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Hawking, Stephen, 2003, The Theory of Everything: the Origin and Fate of the Universe, Beverly Hills: New Millennium.
  • Hawking, Stephen and Roger Penrose, 1996, The Nature of Space and Time, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
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  • Kepler, Johannes, 1937, Gesammelte Werke, 19 vols., M. Caspar (ed.), Munich: C.H. Beck.
  • Krafft, Fritz, 1971, “Analogie—Theodizee—Aktualismus. Wissenschaftshistorische Einführung in Kants Kosmogonie”, in F. Krafft (ed.), I. Kant: Allgemeine Naturgeschichte und Theorie des Himmels, Munich: Kindler.
  • Kuehn, Manfred, 2001a, Kant: A Biography, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2001b, “Kant’s Teachers in the Exact Sciences” in E. Watkins (ed.), Kant and the Sciences, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lasswitz, Kurd, 1902, “Anmerkungen zu Gedanken von der wahren Schätzung der lebendigen Kräfte”, in Kant, Akademie Edition, 1: 521–33.
  • Laywine, Alison, 1993, Kant’s Early Metaphysics and the Origins of the Critical Philosophy (NAKS Studies in Philosophy 3), Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview.
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  • Newton, Isaac, 1953, Newton’s Philosophy of Nature. Selections from His Writings, H.S. Thayer (ed.), New York: Hafner.
  • –––, 1972 [1726], Philosophiae Naturalis Principia Mathematica. The third edition with variant readings A. Koyré and I.B. Cohen (eds.), 2 volumes, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1979 [1730], Opticks, or A Treatise of the Reflections, Refractions, Inflections and Colours of Light, 4th edition. A. Einstein, E. Whittaker, et al. (eds.), New York: Dover.
  • Paulson, Friedrich, 1902, Immanuel Kant: His Life and Doctrine, New York: Scribner’s Sons.
  • Pozzo, Ricardo, 1993, “Kant e Weitenkampff”, Rivista di storia della filosofia, 48: 283–322.
  • Rahts, Johannes, 1902, “Anmerkungen zur Allgemeinen Naturgeschichte und Theorie des Himmels”, in Kant, Akademie Edition, 1: 545–558.
  • Rockmore, Tom, 2001, “Introduction” in Tom Rockmore (ed.), New Essays on the Precritical Kant, Amherst, NY: Humanity Books.
  • Robinson, Daniel N., 2012, How is Nature Possible?: Kant’s Project in the First Critique, New York: Bloomsbury Publishing.
  • Schönfeld, Martin, 2000, The Philosophy of the Young Kant: the Precritical Project, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2006a, “Kant’s Early Dynamics”, in Bird 2006: 33–46.
  • –––, 2006b, “Kant’s Early Cosmology”, in Bird 2006: 47–62.
  • ––– (ed.), 2006c, Kant and Confucianism, Special Issue, Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 33(1): 1–157.
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