Legal Rights

First published Fri Jan 27, 2023

[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by Ori Herstein replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

Legal rights are some of law’s most basic and pervasive building blocks. This entry elucidates “legal right” as a general concept, covering features common to all rights (legal, moral, or otherwise) and demonstrating how those general features manifest in the particular instance of legal rights (Sections 3–5). Moreover, the entry elaborates on some features and types of rights unique or particularly salient to legal rights (Sections 1–2, 6–10). While relying on examples of specific rights from the law, this entry does not canvas which specific rights populate or ought to populate positive law.

1. The Legal Validity and Justification of Legal Rights

Legal rights are creatures of the law. As such, their legal validity—that is, a right’s status as legal—typically flows from other legal norms or from a source of law (MacCormick 1977: 189 & 206; Sumner 1987: 68–70; Raz 1994: 263–268).

Broadly speaking, there are two primary legal mechanisms for the creation (or detraction) of (valid) legal rights. One is “acts of law”, that is legal rules or judicial decisions directly bestowing rights. A second mechanism involves the legal recognition of certain actions intended to create certain legal rights as in fact constitutive of those rights, be those actions unilateral (typical of gifts, forfeiture, consent, appointment, last will and testament) or agreements (typical of contracts) (Fitzgerald [Salmond] 1966: 333–341; Paton 1972: 319–320 & 433–485).

These legal mechanisms can create rights explicitly (Raz 1994: 268). For example, according to the Fourth Amendment of the U.S. Constitution:

The right of the people to be secure in their persons, houses, papers, and effects, against unreasonable search and seizure, shall not be violated…. (emphasis added)

Legal rights are also created implicitly (Raz 1994: 268). For instance, by establishing legal relations exhibiting the forms and functions of a right, a legal rule can thereby vest a legal right without explicitly mentioning the term “right” (MacCormick 1977: 191–92). Take for example the First Amendment of the U.S. Constitution, widely recognized as establishing legal rights to freedom of religion and speech—even though the amendment only mentions “free exercise” and “freedom”, not “right”.

Moreover, in holding certain conduct to be wrongful to X and/or in granting X a corresponding right to a remedy, legal rules can arguably grant X a legal right against such conduct. For example, the American common law tort of battery involves an intentional, unlawful, and harmful or offensive contact with the person of another, never mentioning a “right against battery”. Yet, in laying down a rule against battery and in recognizing battery as wrongful, the law thereby arguably grants a legal right against it (Goldberg & Zipursky 2020: 92–98). Moreover, following the logic of “where there’s a remedy, there’s a right” (ubi remedium ibi jus)—law’s granting victims of battery remedial rights (or rights of action) against the persons who battered them, is at least suggestive that law also grants a legal right against battery—a right that, if violated, is what legally justifies the remedy (Raz 1994: 266–267).

Legal justification is a matter of legal normativity, not validity. Typically, justification involves a legal norm grounding—as a matter of law—other legal norms. (Raz 1970: 175–183; MacCormick 1977: 189; Raz 1994: 258–263; Wellman 1995: 24–29). For instance, given that Joseph is a person, that “Joseph holds a legal right in his good name” is justified by the more general rule “every person has a right in his/her good name”. Now, whether or not Joseph’s right in his good name is legally valid turns on whether, for example, the courts or legislature recognize it. Yet, whether or not the courts or legislator are correct—as a matter of law—in recognizing Joseph’s right is a question of legal justification, such as whether the right is entailed by another more general legal norm or principle, or whether it passes constitutional muster. Therefore, as demonstrated in judicial errors of law, it is possible for rights to be valid yet not justified, as well as justified yet invalid (see generally Hart 1961: 141–147).

Legal rights can justify other legal rights (Raz 1994: 268–269; Wellman 1995: 25–29). For instance, courts may find that one right derives from another (Raz 1986: 168–170). Such derivation can flow from the content of the justifying core right, such that the derivative right falls within the scope of the more general right from which it derives. For example, the U.S. Supreme Court held that the right to marry is a fundamental right inherent to the more general constitutionally protected liberty of the person (Obergefell v. Hodges, 576 U.S. 644 [2015]).

Rights can also justify other rights when the successful exercise and implementation of the latter is dependent on the former (Wellman 1995: 26–27). The stronger the dependency, the stronger the justification (Nickel 2007: 87–88). Consider, for example, the U.S. Supreme Court’s holding in Griswold v. Connecticut (1965) that:

The right of freedom of speech and press includes not only the right to utter or to print, but the right to distribute, the right to receive, the right to read … and freedom of inquiry, freedom of thought, and freedom to teach … Without those peripheral rights, the specific rights would be less secure. (482–483)

Notice that this conception of legal validity and justification flows from the tradition of legal positivism in general jurisprudence. That said, the elucidation that follows of the concept of “legal rights” is mostly compatible with other jurisprudential traditions as well.

2. What Rights Are: Methodology

A (valid) legal norm is a legal right if and only if it exhibits the form (Section 3) and function (Section 4) of the more general category of a “right”. Accordingly, a legal norm labeled a “right” not exhibiting these features is arguably mislabeled. Theories identifying the form (the normative structure) and “function” (i.e., what rights are for) of rights oscillate between and at times combine two approaches. One is descriptive, distilling and systematizing primary features permeating the common understanding and the core of “rights” discourse (be it legal, moral, or social). Second, rights theories are also purificatory and even prescriptive, injecting rationality, coherence, and value into their account of what a right is, even if partially revisionary and to the exclusion of some of the discourse. For reflections on the methodology of rights theory see Hart (1982: 188–193), Raz (1986: 165–168); Kramer (1998: 22–35); Wenar (2008: 251–267); and, Van Duffel (2017: 187–202).

3. What Rights Are: Form

3.1 The Hohfeldian Analysis of Rights

Later refined by others and echoing ideas from Bentham and other predecessors, Wesley Newcomb Hohfeld’s analysis of rights is by far the most widely followed and influential systemization of the form of rights (Hohfeld 1919: 35–64). Some noteworthy introductions and elucidations of the Hohfeldian analysis include Fitzgerald [Salmond] (1966: 221–233); Wellman (1985: 7–15); Sumner (1987: 18–31); Jones (1994: 12–25); Kramer (1998: 7–60); Edmundson (2004: 87–102); Wenar (2005: 224–237; 2005 [2021] the SEP entry on rights); and Harel (2005: 192–193).

Writing specifically on the law, Hohfeld distills four different legal positions residing under the term “right” as it is used in law: claim, privilege, power, and immunity. Each position designates a type of normative relation between a right-subject and a right-object (Raz 1970: 176). “Right-subject” denotes a right’s holder. “Right-object” denotes the party the right is held over or against. Finally, a right’s “content” denotes the normative component of the right; that is, the specific normative relation obtaining pursuant to the right between the right’s subject and its object (Sumner 1987: 24). As normative relations, each one of the four Hohfeldian positions held by right-subjects correlates to a certain type of normative position in the right-object. Altogether, Hohfeld identifies four pairs of correlatives: claim/duty; privilege/no-claim; power/liability; and, immunity/disability. For example, X (right-subject) can hold a contractual claim against Y (right-object) that Y paint X’s house, where Y is under a correlative duty to X to paint her house (right-content).

Claims and privileges are first-order norms, respectively determinative of what the relevant parties ought to do or may do. Powers and immunities are second-order norms (that is pertaining to other norms), respectively determinative of whether parties are able or unable to change certain norms (Sumner 1987: 27–29). Some Hohfeldian positions are active while others passive (Lyons 1970; Sumner 1987: 29–31). Rights that are actively exercised determine what right-holders may do (privilege-right) or can do (power-right). Rights which right-holders enjoy passively, determine what right-objects ought to do (claim-right) or cannot do (immunity-right).

3.1.1 Claim-Right

While law deploys the term “right” to refer to all four Hohfeldian positions, “rights” are typically most associated with claim-rights, which Hohfeld denotes as right “in its strictest sense”. A “claim” is a type of entitlement (Kamm 2002: 476). X has a claim-right against Y with respect to some φ if and only if Y is under a duty to X to φ. Claim-rights are, therefore, “directed”—the claim of the right-subject is directed at the right-object, whose correlative duty is owed to (directed at) the right-subject. Claim-rights correlate either to “negative” duties not to impede one’s φ-ing (e.g., the right not to be defamed) or to “positive” duties to actively further one’s φ-ing (e.g., the right to receive state welfare benefits) (Fitzgerald [Salmond] 1966: 234–235). Examples of legal claim-rights are property owners’ rights against others not to trespass on their land, or promisees’ contractual rights that promisors do as they promised.

3.1.2 Privilege (or Liberty)

That X holds against Y a privilege to φ entails that X is not under a duty to Y not to φ and, correlatively, that Y does not hold a claim against X not to φ. Put differently, a privilege to do something is a directed liberty or permission to do so. Accordingly, the Hohfeldian opposite of a privilege to φ is a duty not to φ. Similarly to claim-rights, a privilege can be positive—that is liberty to act—or negative—that is liberty to omit from acting—or both. In the literature, Hohfeld’s term “privilege” is often exchanged for “liberty”, terms here used interchangeably.

Are privileges (or liberties) genuine “rights”, as Hohfeld posits? In some respects, a liberty is the paradigm of a right (e.g., Hobbes 1651: ch. XIV). Yet, at least in law, there is something misleading in the Hohfeldian notion that standalone privileges (“naked privileges”) qualify as “rights”. After all, how does a privilege to φ count as a legal right, if the privilege-holder does not also hold some accompanying legal claim or other form of legal insolation against interference with her φ-ing? (Hart 1982: 173; Sumner 1987: 35; Raz 1994: 275). In fact, stand-alone liberties to φ are compatible with others’ liberties to interfere with one’s φ-ing (Hart 1982: 166–167; Jones 1994: 18–19). It is not clear, therefore, what stand-alone liberties do for putative right-holders; at least not in legal system in which liberty is the default legal position (that is, unless positively forbidden, φ-ing is permitted).

Regardless, in practice, legal privileges to φ are mostly (even if not necessarily) secured by a measure of legal protection against interference. Firstly, occasionally there are explicit legal claim-rights to φ accompanying privileges to φ. Secondly, privileges are regularly secured by a “protective perimeter” of legal prohibitions and claim-rights (other than to φ) effectively securing significant aspects of one’s freedom to φ (Hart 1982: 167 & 171–173; Steiner 1994: 75–76; Kramer 1998: 11–12). For example, even if one does not have a specific legal claim-right to “walk on a public street”, one’s privilege to do so is largely secured by various legal prohibitions on conduct that could interfere with one’s enjoying that privilege, such as crimes and torts of assault, privacy, harassment, battery, and false imprisonment.

Moreover, normally liberty-rights to φ are considered as more than mere “lack of duties” to φ. Liberties are thought of as “full-liberties”—that is, liberties to φ or to not φ—rather than as “half-liberties”—that is, liberties to φ without the liberty to not φ. Accordingly, “mandatory rights”, such as children’s liberty to attend school or a conscript’s liberty to enlist in the army (that is, a lack of duty not to attend or not to enlist) may be labeled “half-rights” or “half-liberties”, given that while they involve liberty to attend school or to enlist, they do not provide liberty not to do so (Feinberg 1980: 157, 237; See also Hart 1982: 166–167).

3.1.3 Power

Loosely, a normative power is the ability to alter (through volitional action) the normative landscape; and in law, legal power is the legally recognized ability to change or create legal positions, relations, and norms (e.g., Hohfeld 1919: 50–57). The opposite of holding a power is normative disability. Correlative to X’s power over Y to alter an aspect of Y’s normative position is Y’s liability to X’s respective power. While “public powers” are vested in the state or persons in their capacity as an agent or officer of the state, “private powers” are vested in private persons (or corporations) ((Fitzgerald [Salmond] 1966: 229–230). For example, parliament holds a legal power over the citizenry to enact laws that bind them, and citizens are correlatively liable to that legislative power; prosecutors hold the power to prosecute criminal defendants; and, in private law, owning property typically includes the power to gift or bequeath title to others; estate law empowers people to create wills; contract law provides power to enter into contractual obligations; and agency law empowers to appoint others to take legal actions in one’s stead.

But are powers indeed legal rights in themselves, as is Hohfeld’s view? Arguably not. At least not when divorced of privilege to exercise or to refrain from exercising that power. For instance, under the market overt rule, a thief seemingly holds a legal power to sell stolen goods but it would be odd to describe the thief as holding a legal “right” to do so (Raz 1972: 82). Similarly, if a judge is under a duty to rule in a certain way on a certain issue, it would be odd to describe her as holding a “right” to rule in that way, even if she holds the power to do so.

In any case, Hohfeld’s account of legal power as ability to alter legal relations via volitional conduct (Hohfeld 1919: 50–51), seems too broad. For example, the commission of a tort or crime entails changes to legal positions (mostly one’s own) and typically involve volitional conduct, yet do not appear exercises of legal power (MacCormick 1981 [2008: 98–100]). Refining Hohfeld’s account, some offer narrower conceptions of legal power (Halpin 1996; 142–147). For instance, emphasizing acting with intent to thereby alter a legal position, as a condition for exercising a power to do so (Fitzgerald [Salmond] 1966: 229; MacCormick 1972: 63; 1981 [2008: 97–98]). Although, arguably this refinement is also too broad (e.g., homeless persons intentionally committing crimes as a means of exchanging the street for prison; or, a person moving house, thereby incurring obligations not to cause a nuisance to her new neighbors) as well as too narrow (e.g., unintentionally entering a contract). Another approach is that φ-ing only counts as an exercise of a legal power if φ-ing brings about a certain legal change L and law’s reasons for acknowledging φ-ing as resulting in L is that people are reasonably expected to φ only for the purpose of effecting L (Raz 1972: 80–81; 1975: [1999: 98–104]. For example, forming a contract by signing it (for a critical assessment of Raz’ view see Halpin 1997: 61–65).

3.1.4 Immunity

X holds an immunity against Y in respect of some aspect of X’s normative position, if Y is disabled (lacks power) to alter that position. Correlative to X’s immunity is Y’s respective disability. The Hohfeldian opposite of an immunity is liability (vulnerability to power). An example of a legal immunity is judges’ immunity from civil liability for actions performed in their judicial capacity. Other examples include the immunities of competent adults from others unilaterally transferring title to their property or changing the terms of their contracts, the immunity from being divorced by one’s spouse (in legal systems that do recognize divorce) and, the immunity of witnesses in judicial proceedings from defamation liability.

Like in the case of privileges and powers, it is not obvious that all stand-alone powers are in fact naturally identified as “rights”. Take for example a municipality’s lack of legal power to bestow a benefit, such as a permit or pension. While such a disabling legal rule perhaps bestows an immunity (namely, an immunity from receiving a legal permission or entitlement), it does not naturally appear to grant a “right” to the person “enjoying” the immunity (Hart 1982: 191).

3.1.5 Complex Hohfeldian Rights

Legal rights are typically composites of more than one Hohfeldian position. In fact, as demonstrated above, some argue that at least certain Hohfeldian positions do not necessarily count as genuine rights when appearing in isolation from certain other Hohfeldian positions (Sumner 1987: 34–53; Steiner 1994: 61–80). In any case, breaking legal rights down into Hohfeldian positions is an excellent clarificatory tool, providing a precise picture of the legal relations at play. For instance, the constitutional right to free speech involves: claim-rights (such as against censure); (full) privileges (such as the permission and lack of duty to express or not to express one’s opinion); and, immunities (such as the legislators’ disability to expunge one’s free-speech claim-rights, immunities, and privileges). Looking to private law, creditors, for instance, hold claims against debtors to the payment of their debts; privileges to collect or not to collect debts; power to forgive debts; and, immunities from other private parties unilaterally waiving or annulling those respective claims, privileges, and powers.

3.2 Legal Rights to Do Legal Wrongs

One particularly puzzling combination of Hohfeldian relations is a “right to do wrong”. There is of course nothing puzzling in rights of one normative kind to violate duties of another normative kind. For example, legal rights to do that which one has a moral duty not to do are not uncommon (such as exploiting tax havens). Yet, the idea of a right of one normative kind to do wrong of the same normative kind can seem oxymoronic.

And still, for many an essential feature of rights is providing for doing even what one ought not to do. Dworkin, for example, explains that:

… when I say you have the right to spend your money gambling, though you ought to spend it in a more worthwhile way. I mean that it would be wrong for anyone to interfere with you even though you propose to spend your money in a way that I think is wrong. (1977: 188)

And Raz claims that “[t]o show that one has a right to perform the act is to show that even if it is wrong he is entitled to perform it” (1979: 274).

Conceptually, the Hohfeldian analysis of rights as well as the “functions” of rights (see Section 4) seem to allow for rights to do wrong (Waldron 1981; Kramer 1998: 14–17; Enoch 2002). X holds a right to do wrong if X has a claim against Y (and Y is under a correlative duty to X) that Y somehow facilitate or not interfere with X doing something that X has a duty not to do. In Hohfeldian terms, rights to do wrong are claim-rights without privileges (Waldron 1981; George 1993: 118–122). To dispel the sense of contradiction in the term “right to do wrong”, one needs to recognize that a right (claim-right) to do wrong does not bear on the rightness or the wrongness (lack of privilege) of that which one has a (claim-)right to do. Arguably, immunities can also function as rights to do wrong, as they secure a measure of freedom (relative to others) from intervention with one’s doing that which one has duty not to do (Herstein 2014: 37–45).

Moving from conceptual possibility to morality, while clearly there is no blanket moral right to do moral wrong, some argue that such rights are not a mere conceptual possibility. For example, even if one has a moral duty (lack of privilege) not to join a bigoted association, arguably one enjoys a moral claim protective of one’s (wrongful) choice to do so. Among the values claimed to ground such rights are personal autonomy (Waldron 1981: 34–35; 1983: 325–337; Enoch 2002: 379–380; Herstein 2012: 354–357); personal integrity (George 1993: 124–125); moral constitution of self (Herstein 2012, 357–364); and of conscience (Brownlee, 2012: 126–128). In contrast, others deny morality contains rights to do wrong (Galston 1983; Øverland 2007; Bolinger 2017).

Now to law. The concept of “legality” does not seem to rule out legal rights to do legal wrongs (Herstein 2014: 27–31; Laborde 2021: 6–7). And, as a conceptual matter, there can be legal rights providing legal protections (claims, immunities) to do that which the law forbids (Kramer 1998, 15–17; Herstein 2014: 32–45). In contrast, Laborde argues for a “toleration” conception of legal rights to do legal wrong, wherein right-holders are exempt (privilege) from legal prohibition on φ-ing, yet remain vulnerable to expressive sanctions for φ-ing (2021). Examples offered in the literature of legal rights to do legal wrong include diplomatic immunity (Herstein 2014: 43–44) and ministerial exemptions (Laborde 2021).

3.3 Claim-Rights Without Correlative Duties

Hohfeldian correlativity suggests that (claim-)rights are analytically or formally equivalent with duties, so that a (claim-)right of one person entails a correlative duty of another (Feinberg 1973: 63–64; Sumner 1987: 24–25). It is not clear, however, whether this is in fact true. Namely, claim-rights do not always seem to correlate with a duty (Honoré 1960: 456–457; Feinberg 1973: 64–67; Raz 1970: 175–183; Lyons 1970: 45–55; MacCormick 1977: 199–202; 1982: 161–162; Lyons 1994: 32–34; Kamm 2002: 480).

For instance, law regularly recognizes rights even when it is unclear or underdetermined what duties give those rights effect (MacCormick 1982: 163). At other times, the duty correlating to a right is conditioned on certain states of affairs, so that the duty only vests once the factual condition is met (Raz 1970: 226). MacCormick’s example is of a law granting the surviving children of a decedent a right in the estate. The right is against the estate’s executor for a portion of the estate (once all debts and existing claims are satisfied). Thus, at the time of its vesting, the right does not correlate to any vested duty. It is only once an executor is appointed by the courts that such duties form (MacCormick 1977: 200–203).

Accordingly, it is arguably both conceptually possible and practically not unheard off for claim-rights to obtain without correlative duties. Thus, even if a right is a (valid) claim—that is, a legal entitlement to something—rights arguably do not necessarily entail some correlative duty in others (Feinberg 1973: 65–67; Feinberg 1980: 139–141). This seems to be in tension with Hohfeldian correlativity when it comes to claim-rights, although some disagree (Kramer 1998: 27–30).

3.4 Rights “In Personam” and Rights “In Rem

Claims, privileges, powers, and immunities can manifest as either rights in personam or in rem. Rights in personam are rights the content of which designates a specific and definite right-object. These rights are typically associated with the law of obligations (contracts, trusts, and parts of torts), wherein rights are expressly held against a specific person or persons, such as a promisor, trustee, or tortfeasor.

In contrast, the content of rights in rem explicitly designates a “thing” that one holds the right over, not against whom specifically that right is held. Accordingly, such rights are not held against a definitive individual(s), but against an indefinite set of right-objects. If you will, rights in rem are held against every eligible individual yet, against no one specifically (Hohfeld 1919: 68–114; Fitzgerald [Salmond] 1966: 235–237). Thus, rights in rem are describable as normative relations between right-holders and everyone else (as individuals, not a group) in relation to a certain “thing” (Ross 1953: 230–231). Most commonly, rights in rem are associated with property law, such as one’s rights to possess or to reasonably use and enjoy one’s land, which is held against every person (Radin 1938: 1155–1156; Kramer 1998: 10 f2). Yet, the “things” over which rights in rem are held include not only property (real, personal, or intellectual), but also, for example, other rights, the integrity of one’s person, emotions, and reputation (Hohfeld 1919: 85–86; Fitzgerald [Salmond] 1966: 224).

The distinction between these two types of rights tracks a difference typical to their respective moral roles. Namely, rights in personam seem designed to give legal effect to significant relationships between specific individuals, while rights in rem are typically oriented towards the value that exclusive access, control over, security in, integrity of (etc.) certain “things” have for right-holders (Fitzgerald [Salmond] 1966: 237–238). Moreover, given the association between the two types of right with different branches of law, the distinction between rights in rem and rights in personam emphasizes an affinity between those legal branches and the two different moral roles of each type of right. That is, much of the law of obligations in about obligations between specific individuals, while property law is focused more on securing the affinity between individuals and certain “things”.

Finally, the way rights in rem and rights in personam are deployed impacts the measure of freedom allowed in a legal system. Broadly speaking, negative claim-rights are more conducive to the personal liberty of right-objects than positive duties. Negative claim-rights forbid a set of actions, leaving all other options open. In contrast, positive claim-rights require certain actions, thereby forbidding all other incompatible options. Unsurprisingly, therefore, legal system that prize personal liberty tend to adopt in rem negative claim-rights (e.g., the tort right against interference with contract) and in personam positive claim-rights (e.g., a contractual right to receive a service). There are, of course, exception to this rule of thumb, such as the in rem positive claim-right to a rescue found in Good Samaritan laws (Jones 1994: 15–16).

4. What Rights Are: Function and Value

Given that, as explained above, “rights” take different forms and combine in a variety of configurations (as well as greatly vary in content), what unites them under the single category of “right”?

The beginning of the answer is that rights are typically for or in some sense entitle right-holders. Notice first that not all legal norms exhibiting Hohfeldian forms are legal rights. For example, an immunity from inheriting property rights on the grounds of one’s gender hardly seems to qualify as a “right” (Lyons 1994: 11); or, imagine a claim-“right” to be persecuted by state authorities; or, consider a claim-right to die of starvation (Jones 1994: 29). As these examples suggest (as do the counter-examples offered above to the notion that stand-alone privileges, powers, and immunities necessarily qualify as “rights” in normal discourse [Sections 3.1.2—3.1.4]), a feature seemingly differentiating rights from other norms exhibiting Hohfeldian forms is somehow entitling or fulfilling a certain function vis-à-vis the right-holder. What, then, is this “function” of rights? How, in other words, do rights entitle right-holders?

But, before discussing the primary answers to this question, a few preliminary comments are in order. First, beyond clarifying our analytic understanding of the idea of “right”, the theories of the function of rights are justificatory. That is, they are typically value-laden, describing the uniting overarching feature or function of rights in terms of value to right-holders; thereby explaining a moral value putatively inherent to all rights, qua rights. Thus, although none of the theories on offer manages to capture the entire scope of rights discourse, they do capture core cases of rights, fleshing out what is inherently morally appealing about them. Succinctly, in one way or another, all these theories share the insight that a legal system committed to rights is oriented towards the ideal of treating the individual person as law’s primary unit of concern. To paraphrase Thomas Hardy, if “poetry is emotion put into measure”, then rights are liberal values put into law.

Second, this entry focuses on functions of legal rights as such, independent of the content of any specific right. This is not to deny that different legal rights (e.g., rights to freedom, property, against self-incrimination) are uniquely valuable to right-holders. Only that such right-specific values are not the focus of this entry.

Third, any necessary function that rights fulfill qua rights vis-à-vis right-holders sets a condition for right-holding. For example, under the Interest Theory, rights broadly speaking benefit right-holders (see Section 4.2). Thus, if a right does not benefit X, X does not hold that right. Relatedly, as demonstrated in the supplement to this entry (referenced below), the function of rights is intimately connected with the matter of what types of entities can or cannot as a general matter hold rights (see Jones 1994: 67–71; Kramer 2001: 29–58; Kurki 2019: 62–88). For example, under the Interest Theory, if X is not the sort of entity that has interests, then X categorically cannot hold any rights (e.g., Raz 1986: 166).

There are several competing theories on the function of rights. This entry focuses primarily on the two leading theories: the “Will (or Choice) Theory” and the “Interest Theory”. Some attention is also given to “Demand Theories”. Other approaches include Kamm’s view that rights can protect right-holder’s status as persons, such as respecting their agency or equal moral worth, regardless of their interests (2002: 485–487); “Hybrid Theories”, combining elements from the interest and the Will Theories (Sreenivasan 2005: 267–274; 2010: 484–494; McBride 2017a); Wenar’s “Multi-Function Theory”, denying rights have only a single function (2005: 246–251), and his “Kind Desire Theory” arguing that the function of rights turns on what role-bearers desire in their capacity as bearers of that type of role (2013; Schaab 2018); And, Cruft’s “Addressive Theory”, emphasizing the second-personal aspects of directed-duties (2019: 44–70).

The debate over the theories of the function of rights revolves heavily on the theories’ extensional adequacy (that is, to what degree a theory adequately captures the discourse of “rights”). While each of the leading two theories captures important instances of rights, neither manages to encompass the full parameters of rights discourse. The debate remains unsettled, with ever-growing nuance and ingenuity. See the supplementary document:

Extensional Adequacy of Theories of Rights

for further details on some of this debate, including the primary challenges and related refinements of the Will and the Interest Theories.

4.1 The Will Theory

According to the Will (or Choice) Theory, rights provide right-holders a measure of normative control over themselves or others, functioning to make right-holders “small-scale sovereign[s]” over certain domains (Hart 1982: 183; 1983: 35). Most prominently, right-holders control as a matter of choice the duties owed to them by others, holding the Hohfeldian power to annul, waive, enforce, or transfer such duties (Hart 1982: 183–4). The Will Theory also fits with Hohfeldian privileges, providing options for how one may choose to act or to exercise one’s powers (MacCormick 1977: 193–194). Moreover, claim-rights and immunities function to protect the free exercise of such privileges (Hart 1982: 172; Simmonds 1998: 218–220) and powers. Prominent proponents of the Will Theory include Kant, Hart, Wellman, Steiner, Sumner, and Ripstein.

The branch of law most hospitable to the Will Theory is private law. Be it the law of contract, property, torts, or trusts, right-holders typically wield considerable—although by no means complete—control over Hohfeldian positions that they stand in in relation to others. For instance, within limits and subject to various exceptions, holders of private law rights are empowered to waive compliance with certain obligations owed to them, forgo remedial rights, and annul or transfer some such claims, as well as certain private law powers, liberties, and immunities (see, e.g., Stevens 2007: 17–19).

From a justificatory perspective, emphasizing right-holders’ choice and control, the Will Theory stresses the affinity between rights and values that are related to an individual’s control over his/her lives, including personal liberty, self-realization, agency, and autonomy. Thereby demonstrating how rights can neatly fit political moralities concerned with such values (Kramer 1998: 75; Sumner 1987: 47).

That said, coupling claim-rights and powers over those claims (and their correlative duties) can also make rights attractive to certain political moralities that, at best, value human agency, autonomy, and freedom not intrinsically, but instrumentally (Kramer 1998: 76–77). For instance, viewing law as a vehicle for wealth maximization invites markets in legal entitlements, thereby requiring the liberty and power to waive and transfer rights.

Arguably, the justificatory virtues of rights as fleshed out by the Will Theory can be subsumed under the Interest Theory. If so, this is because values such as autonomy, freedom, and control secured by holding power over the duties owed to one, are arguably themselves in the interest of right-holders (MacCormick 1977: 207–208; Raz 1994: 149–50; Kramer 2001: 61; Edmundson 2004: 127).

4.2 The Interest Theory

According to the Interest Theory, speaking broadly, rights protect or further right-holders’ interests. Accordingly, unlike Will Theorists, Interest Theorists tend to emphasis claim-rights more than powers (Kramer 2013: 246; 2017: 49). Still fitting the Interest Theory, holding liberties, powers, and immunities is often also in the service of one’s interests (MacCormick 1977: 205). Prominent proponents of the Interest Theory include Bentham, Austin, Mill, Lyons, MacCormick, Raz, and Kramer.

A canonical version of the Interest Theory is Joseph Raz’s, positing that rights are protected interests and that X has a right if and only if

an aspect of X’s well-being (his interest) is a sufficient reason for holding some other person(s) to be under a duty. (1986: 166; 1994: 266–269)

Under this view, X holds a legal right if the law holds X’s interest “to be sufficient ground to hold another to be subject to a duty” (1994: 268).

Prescriptively, in demonstrating that rights are protective of right-holders’ interests, the Interest Theory fleshes out how rights are attractive to political moralities prizing individual well-being and welfare.

It is not obvious, however, that all legal norms identified as “rights” under the Interest Theory indeed exhibit these appealing features. First, it is not uncommon for legal rights to be held by entities other than people. For instance, legal rights have been extended to animals, plants, corporations, and even natural phenomena (e.g., rivers or nature preserves). Depending on one’s conception of “interest”, the interest-theory can comfortably capture at least some such rights (Kramer 2001: 29–46). For example, it seems obvious that certain animals, groups, corporations, and even plants have interests and, as such, can be made better or worse off and, therefore, can in that sense hold rights.

Yet, an account of such rights as inherently morally favorable in terms of benefiting right-holders would have to rely on values other than individuals’ well-being or welfare. Which in certain instances seems unproblematic, such as in the case of animal rights. Yet, in other cases, such as in the case of corporate entities, the interests of which do not seem of inherent moral value, the notion that in protecting interests all rights—qua rights—share something morally appealing comes under pressure.

Second, arguably even in the case of individuals not all rights-protected interests are of any moral value. For instance, the Iraqi Penal Code of 1969 provides husbands the “legal right” to “punish” their wives, to the exclusion of crimes such as battery (such laws are, regretfully, not atypical; similar laws existed in the West for centuries). Even if such legal rights in some sense serve certain prudential or subjective interests of husbands, and assuming the Interest Theory were to incorporate such interests and identify norms protective of such interests as “rights”, it is not clear in what sense protecting such interests makes rights—qua rights—morally attractive. And remember, a primary motivation for developing theories of the function of rights is ideally not to find just any uniting feature of all “rights”, but to identify one that is of value. For a related discussion on how the Interest Theory may arguably incorporate odd and seemingly valueless interests, and even subjective interests that are objectively bad for one, see Kramer (2001: 81–89).

4.3 The Demand Theory

Focusing on claim-rights, Joel Feinberg and Stephen Darwall are the most prominent defenders of a third theory of the function of rights sometimes referred to as a “demand theory of rights”—emphasizing the capacity or power of right-holders to claim or demand. (Feinberg 1970; 1980: 130–158; 1992: 155; Darwall 2006: 18–19; 2007: 60–65; 2010; 2011; see also Skorupski 2010: 310–311; Gilbert 2018). Imagine a legal system comprising just and reasonable duties to respect and safeguard others. Yet, these duties are public duties not owed to those individuals that they are designed to benefit. It is, therefore, a legal system of just duties without correlative rights (at least non held by individual beneficiaries). Feinberg finds such law morally wanting. In a world without rights no one is legally owed justice, benevolence, or care, and, therefore, no one is in a position to claim or demand just treatment under the law. Accordingly, the unique moral function of legal rights for right-holders is not to secure them just treatment as such, but to provide them with claims for such treatment. Feinberg finds this function morally precious, even in a world of benevolent and law-abiding people who act justly towards others regardless of whether they owe it to them or not. For Feinberg, holding claims is intimately related to human dignity, as it engages people’s agency and capacity to make claims and provides them with a sense of self-worth as creatures who are not only recipients of moral regard, but are also owed it (Feinberg 1970: 252).

5. Criticism: Rights’ Disvalue to Right-Holders

The assumption that rights are inherently for right-holders has been challenged. This entry only scratches the surface of this rich critical terrain, which has much of its foundation in Karl Marx’s 1844 essay “On the Jewish Question”.

Marx thought that legal rights at most provide right-holders with formal justice and civic emancipation, not with freedom from material need or social and economic control. For Marx, moreover, society’s primary legal and political institutions serve economic production, with legal rights functioning as a primary mechanism for the facilitation and enforcement of a social structure that prizes not the interests, agency, welfare, or dignity of right-holders but rather economic growth and the interests of the economically powerful (see Waldron 1987b: 126–127). Thus, rights’ liberal façade is deceptive, concealing rights’ role in economic exploitation and social control (see, e.g., J. Cohen 1983).

This line of criticism can, however, go too far. Firstly, civil liberties do benefit right-holders, to some degree. Moreover, even if imperfect, rights (certainly in their more modern manifestations) can and do provide a measure of social and economic freedoms, entitlements, and justice (Waldron 1987c: 156–159), and have occasionally facilitated social change and progressive politics.

A second influential Marxist critique is that legal rights promote egoism and social atomism. A criticism that also echoes in communitarian and conservative traditions in political theory. In a nutshell, by ordering people’s relations based on directed claims, duties, and powers, rights distance and separate people, promote conflict and competition, invite antisocial behavior, structure relationships based on economic roles, and foster selfish and self-absorbed practices and unvirtuous character. All at the cost of interpersonal relationships, social solidarity, duties to one’s community, acceptance of responsibilities, a sense of belonging, and ties of fraternity and community. (Marx 1844 [1987: 140–142, 146–147]; Taylor 1985: 187–210; Gutmann 1985; Waldron 1987b: 128–129; 1987c: 188).

In response, the protections, liberty, and empowerment that rights provide become crucial to right-holders exactly when social and interpersonal ties and solidarity break down, or turn discriminatory, or oppressively collectivist, or predatorial (Waldron 1987c: 189–190; Waldron 1993: 370–391). Rights in this respect do not derail community as such, but rather partake in forming communities that are morally legitimate (Finnis 2011: 210–218; Jones 1994: 209–211).

6. Legal Rights in Legal Justification and Reasoning: Outcomes and Reasons

Rights figure in legal reasoning in two very different ways. At times, legal rights are part of legal justification and reasoning, functioning as legal reasons in favor of a certain legal holding or rule. In other instances, legal rights are themselves the outcome or the “bottom line” of legal reasoning, embodying a legal holding or a rule justified by reasons other than the right itself.

Consider the Universal Declaration of Human Rights (Finnis 2011: 210–213). Some of the Declaration’s articles secure all persons with certain rights (e.g., to liberty, life, own property), yet those rights are subject to limitations given conflicting values, such as for the purpose of securing the rights of others, general welfare, and public order (Article 29 [2]). Accordingly, such rights appear set up as reasons in favor of certain legal positions, to be assessed against other competing considerations. In contrast, other articles of the Declaration state rights as prohibitions, such as in terms of “no one shall be subject to”, for example, torture or servitude, or “no one shall be deprived of”, for example, property or liberty. Some of these prohibitions are qualified, while others are not. Regardless, where applicable, these articles provide rights that appear conclusory.

A right can figure both as outcome and a reason, even in the same legal decision or legal context. As such, rights can seem “intermediate conclusions” (Raz 1986: 181). As “outcomes”, rights are legal norms resulting from or justified by the intersection or counter-weighting of different reasons. Yet, under this view, such outcomes are not legal bottom lines but rather “intermediate” outcomes, which are themselves reasons for legal duties or other legal positions. For instance, a judge may hold that a litigant’s interest in φ justifies her right to φ, and then further deliberate whether or not to give effect to that right by imposing a remedial duty grounded in one’s right to φ.

7. Legal Rights as Outcomes

Legal rights are often expressions of conclusions of law (Hart 1953: 15–17). For instance, civil rights are regularly treated as articulations of the parameters of government power as it relates to the liberties of individuals; parameters set by legal officials, ideally based on assessing the various relevant considerations. Once said assessment is completed, officials such as judges pronounce their ruling in terms of the parties’ “rights”. “Right as outcome” is comfortable within the Hohfeldian picture of rights. Because if rights embody legal relations, they arguably entail correlatives as a conceptual matter, relying on other reasons for the matter of their justification (Halpin 1997: 31–32).

For example, the American Supreme Court’s decision in Roberts v. United States Jaycees (1984) involved a national nonprofit organization which limited full membership to males aged 18–34. This appeared in friction with the State of Minnesota’s Human Rights Act on account of discrimination on the basis of sex. The U.S. Supreme Court framed the legal matter as

a conflict between a State’s efforts to eliminate gender-based discrimination against its citizens and the constitutional freedom of association. (612)

Ruling against United States Jaycees, the court held that the organization’s rights under the First Amendment did not extend to its discriminatory practice, reasoning that the organization’s interests in freedom of association were outweighed by the State’s interest. Another example involves courts bestowing legal status. Court may appoint individuals to various roles, such as guardian, trustee, receiver, or executive of an estate. These appointments, along with the powers, liberties, claims, and immunities attached to them, are legal rights granted not on the grounds of the rights themselves, but as the conclusion of judicial deliberation involving other reasons.

Notice that even when legal rights are indeed outcomes, the same is not necessarily true of the valuable functions such rights would serve (Section 4). For instance, the relevant interests that a right—if recognized—would further and protect for the right-holder, can and do play a role in the justification and in determining the scope of that right. In fact, very often it is the interests or dignity of the parties to a legal dispute that guides courts in reaching a ruling; which is then expressed in terms of the scope of the parties’ relevant legal “rights”.

A virtue of “right as outcome” is that once the scope of a right is determined, from that point on that right can serve as a marker of the balance of the potentially complex legal reasoning underlying it; thereby providing legal guidance and certainty as to what people can roughly expect as a matter of right, and avoiding the need for repetitive ad hoc decision-making in subsequent similar cases.

Jurisprudentially, “right as outcome” is hospitable to skeptics of legal formalism. In a nutshell, formalism is the view that legal determinations are governed by a logic internal to law itself, without referencing or relying on extra-legal reasons or considerations (for example moral, social, ideological, or self-interested). A criticism of formalism typical to “legal realists”, is that the canons of legal interpretations and the language and categories of the law—such as “rights”—cannot fully determine law’s edicts. In reality, the criticism continues, extra-legal forces and reasons are often (if not always) explicitly or implicitly incorporated into determinations of what the law is (see Leiter 2005: 50–53). The more skeptical one is of the notion of legal reasons, the more likely it is that one would view “legal rights” as empty formalistic rhetoric and less as genuine reasons for legal determinations (e.g., F. S. Cohen 1935). As such, it makes sense to transform law’s language of “rights” into mere legalistic expression of the culmination of the extra-legal considerations determinative of what law is and what it ought to be.

Normatively, over the centuries many have thought of legal rights as (at least ideally) reflective of natural rights, that is of moral rights not depended on enforcement or social convention, or recognition; a view rooted in the natural law tradition. Legal rights are also often associated with deontological principles, eschewing considerations of utility and policy.

The more dominant such views on the content of legal rights, the more likely are those dismissive of natural rights and deontology to grow hostile to treating legal rights as reasons. Accordingly, given the influence (especially over the past 150 years) of approaches to political morality based on consequentialist considerations of utility, public policy, or the common good, it is not surprising to find occasions of legal rights relegated from weighty legal reasons to mere vessels for the legalistic expression of underlying public policy. A key philosophical figure in this regard was Jeremy Bentham (1843b: 490–534; see Hart 1962: 311–314; Edmundson 2004: 51–59). Bentham advocated the view that law ought to promote good social consequences, as opposed to reflecting what he viewed as vague, dogmatic, antiquated, and moralistic notions of natural rights, famously branding the transplanting of natural rights into law as a form of “mischievous nonsense” (Bentham 1843b: 501).

8. Legal Rights as Reasons

As explained, rights often figure in law as legal reasons in favor of certain legal holdings and rules (including other legal rights). Most obviously, legal officials incorporate legal rights in their deliberations as to what the law is in a particular case. As such, under the view of “right as reason”, legal rights are not the outcomes of legal deliberation on what the law is, but rather are among the legal reasons for such outcomes. Take for example the case of Gannett Co. v. DePasquale (1979). Weighing the First Amendment right to freedom of the press against considerations of the common good and defendants’ rights to a fair trial, the court held that:

[t]he right of access to courtroom proceedings, of course, is not absolute. It is limited both by the constitutional right of defendants to a fair trial … and by the needs of government to obtain just convictions and to preserve the confidentiality of sensitive information and the identity of informants. (398)

8.1 Legal Rights as Preemptory Reasons

Rights are preemptory. A preemptory reason to φ is reason to block considering or acting on certain other reasons pertaining as to whether or not to φ (Hart 1982: 86, 253–254). Rights, therefore, enjoy a measure of qualitative precedence over certain other reasons, which is why rights are reasons that, in a sense, “punch” above their normative weight (see, e.g., Nozick 1974: 171–173). That is, when in conflict with other even weightier reasons, rights can still prevail—not by quantitatively outweighing those competing reasons but by qualitatively preempting them. Indeed, it is not uncommon that an infringement of a legal right is impermissible even if in furtherance of the overall good or utility (Dworkin 1977: 190–192; Lyons 1982: 113–118).

Trying to capture the preemptory quality of rights, Dworkin borrows a metaphor from the game of bridge (and other card games), referring to rights as “trumps” (Dworkin 1984: 153–167). In bridge, a card that is a member of the “trump suit” defeats cards not in the suit, regardless of the cards’ numerical values. Similarly, rights override conflicting reasons as a matter of category, regardless of the relative normative weight or strength of those other reasons.

Another prism for capturing the preemptory quality of rights are “exclusionary reasons” (Raz 1975 [1999: 35–48]. An exclusionary reason counts in favor of refraining from acting on another reason. Viewed in these terms, the preemptory nature of rights is explained not in terms of the weight or force of rights, but in terms of rights’ exclusionary nature (Kamm 2002: 488). Under this view, a right to φ is not only reason to φ but also reason to exclude and not to act on or rule based on at least certain reasons not to φ—even if the relative weight of those conflicting reasons is greater than that of the reasons counting in favor of φ-ing.

8.2 The Stringency of Rights: Absolute or Defeasible?

If legal rights are indeed legal reasons, are they absolute or defeasible? A legal right is inviolable or absolute if, as a matter of law, it preempts or otherwise overcomes all possible conflicting legal reasons.

In principle, legal rights’ preemptory force can be absolute. An example from international law is the human right against torture enshrined in Article 5 of the Universal Declaration of Human Rights, proclaiming that “[n]o one shall be subjected to torture or to cruel, inhuman or degrading treatment or punishment”. Another example is Justice Hugo Black’s First Amendment jurisprudence. The Amendment states:

Congress shall make no law respecting an establishment of religion, or prohibiting the free exercise thereof; or abridging the freedom of speech, or of the press; or the right of the people peaceably to assemble, and to petition the Government for a redress of grievances.

According to Justice Black,

“no law … abridging” means no law abridging … The First Amendment, which is the supreme law of the land, has thus fixed its own value on freedom of speech and press by putting these freedoms wholly “beyond the reach” of federal power to abridge … Consequently … I do not believe that any federal agencies, including Congress and this Court, have power or authority to subordinate speech and press to what they think are “more important interests”. (Smith v. United States [1959], 157–158)

The view that rights are absolute is often associated with Dworkin’s metaphor of “rights as trumps”. Yet, while Dworkin was of the view that rights trump certain utilitarian concerns as well as considerations that are illegitimate in public policy (such as racism) (1984; 1986: 388), he did not argue for the absolutist position (Dworkin 1977: 93, 190–191; see Waldron 2000). Focusing not on legal but on moral rights, Nozick comes close to rights absolutism, yet even he may have had some doubts (Nozick 1974: 28–33; see Thomson 1977 [1986: 55–65]).

In fact, preemptoriness does not necessarily entail absoluteness. And while there are, arguably, some absolute rights (see Gewirth 1981), such rights are not easy to come by in law or in morality (Feinberg 1973: 79–83, 94–97). Perhaps this is because when confronted with extreme cases, or with great human need, or with conflicting weighty rights, or with overwhelming public concerns, absolutism is morally implausible. Moreover, were legal rights absolute, the law would run the risk of becoming mired in intractable contradictions between various conflicting yet absolute rights.

That said, one path towards turning absolutism more plausible begins with noticing that absoluteness does not denote scope (Feinberg 1973: 80–83; Dworkin 1977: 261; Schauer 1979: 903–905; Gewirth 1981: 3–4). Accordingly, if construed more narrowly in scope, or if oriented towards narrow core cases, or if tempered through exceptions, legal rights can sidestep clashes with other legal rights and with highly weighty conflicting moral considerations, thereby keeping their absoluteness while avoiding moral implausibility and legal intractability.

Yet, under such an approach much of what determines what the law is are considerations not of right but of the parameters of rights, shrinking the role of legal rights as legal reasons and pushing them closer to “right as outcome”. Moreover, a legal system of absolute rights of a narrow scope would likely entail highly convoluted rights, rife with numerous exceptions and qualifications to the point of impracticality. In fact, constructing a working frictionless system of absolute legal rights that are harmonious with each other as well as with any other weighty consideration, is practically impossible.

Accordingly, rights’ preemptory quality is likely more accurately described not in terms of “trumping” but as setting normative “thresholds”—excluding many, yet rarely all possible conflicting considerations (Lyons 1994: 152; Griffin 2008: 76). Thus, legal rights are mostly defeasible—certainly in principle and at times also in actual legal practice (Jones 1994: 50–56; Wellman 1995: 251–255).

“Stringency” stands for the extent of a right’s peremptoriness. For instance, an absolute right is infinitely stringent (Thomson 1977 [1986: 55]). A right’s stringency is a function of the scope of conflicting reasons that the right trumps or excludes, and of how demanding are the duties grounded in the right (Kamm 2002: 489).

The type of reasons that rights can clash with are varied, and can include reasons such as other rights, justice, and welfare (for a discussion in the context of moral human rights see Griffith 2008: 58–66).

In law, rights vary in stringency. The most stringent legal rights are typically those rights the law deems “fundamental” or “core”, or rights protective of particularly significant interests or values. These regularly include civil and human rights. The extent of a right’s stringency and the legal doctrines for determining it are matters of normative jurisprudence, political and constitutional theory, and judicial practice. The same is true of the weight of rights, discussed in the section below. Common considerations relevant to such assessments include the ingredients of the legal right’s moral justification, background social and political values and commitments, expediency, and institutional considerations.

8.3 Legal Rights as Straightforward (Non-Preemptory) Reasons

A right to φ is not only preemptory of certain reasons not to φ, but is in itself reason to φ. Were this not the case, a right to φ would be wholly negative, excluding reasons against φ but not counting in its favor. For instance, one’s right to privacy in one’s home is not only reason not to act on certain (even if weighty) reasons favoring invading people’s homes, but also a reason not to do so. This dual reason-giving nature of rights is captured in Dworkin’s “trumping” metaphor.

Accordingly, even if a right to φ is not sufficiently stringent to exclude certain conflicting reasons, it remains a (non-exclusionary) reason to φ, to be straightforwardly weighed along with other relevant reasons that the right does not trump. Moreover, the outcomes of such weighing can involve compromises and partial consideration of the different conflicting reasons (Aleinikoff 1987: 946).

It is here where jurists sometimes get rights wrong. That a right is also a straightforward reason to be balanced against other reasons on the basis of their respective weight does not entail rights are wholly non-preemptory. Treating rights only as straightforward reasons distorts the primary role that rights occupy within practical and legal reasoning—that is, rights’ preemptory quality.

8.4 Rights as Reasons for Duties

At times, rights justify correlative duties (MacCormick 1977: 199–208; Dworkin 1977: 171; Raz 1986: 167; Feinberg 1992: 156). That is, claim-rights are reasons for duties as well for excluding reasons against them. And, in the absence of countervailing reasons, rights justify such duties (Raz 1970: 226–227; 1986: 171). Some argue that in duty-based normative systems (for example Jewish law, see Cover 1987), the direction of the justification—from right to duty—can, in principle, run in reverse, that is from duty to right (Waldron 1990: 69–73; Kramer 1998: 37–39). In any case, the normative priority of rights over duties may (Waldron 1984a: 12; 1990: 84) or may not (Kramer 1998: 35–40; Simmonds 1998: 158–165) refute Hohfeldian correlativity.

Relatedly, the same claim-right seemingly can count in favor of different and changing duties, for instance given changes in factual circumstances. For example, the right to education is a reason for different duties in the twenty-first century than it counted in favor of in the nineteenth century. Moreover, in practice legal rights are often the instruments of legal change, justifying new previously unrecognized duties (Raz 1970: 225–227; 1994: 269). This dynamism arguably cuts against the seemingly more frozen view of the normative relation between rights and duties implied by Hohfeldian correlativity (Raz 1970: 226; 1986: 185–186). In addition, right-dynamism undercuts the Hohfeldian notion that what individuates any specific claim-right is the content of its specific correlative duty. Among possible responses on behalf of Hohfeldians is that so called “dynamic rights” are in fact only inchoate rights (Kramer 1998: 41–48).

8.5 Conflicts of Rights

As reasons, rights can conflict within practical reasoning (Wellman 1995: 202–203). The paradigm of a conflict of rights involves incompatible claims (Waldron 1993: 206; Kamm 2002: 499–500). Moreover, rights can conflict when the practical conditions for their application are incompatible (Wellman 1995: 200–202). Thus, Wellman contends that “two rights conflict when both cannot be exercised and enjoyed fully in any given situation” (1995: 202).

A helpful distinction in this context is between “abstract rights”, which are rights expressing broad aims, and “concrete rights”, which are specific as to their application to concrete cases (Dworkin 1977: 93–94). At high levels of abstraction, it is largely unproblematic that legal rights are at least seemingly incompatible; as such rights tend to imply rather vague and not fully determined demands (Feinberg 1973: 71). For example, although people’s right to freedom can appear to conflict with others’ right to equality, these two rights can co-exist relatively peaceably in the same legal system. It is when making more concrete prescriptions that conflicts of legal rights pose more of a challenge (Feinberg 1973: 69, 72). While the distinction between “abstract” and “concrete” is a matter of degree, a clear case of conflicting concrete rights is of two legal rights for the exclusive possession of the same item at the same time.

Conflicts of rights are sometime dissolved by redrawing the scope of the conflicting rights so as to avoid overlap (Feinberg 1973: 72–73; Wellman 1995: 202–210). Yet, law and morality can at times resist such harmonizing via adjustment in scope (Wellman 1995: 211–215).

To resolve these conflicts, law can designate a hierarchy or priority among types of rights—so that some rights, at least under certain conditions, preempt others (Feinberg 1973: 76–79; Wellman 1995: 215). For example, in Marsh v Alabama (1945) the U.S. Supreme Court held that:

When we balance the Constitutional rights of owners of property against those of the people to enjoy freedom of press and religion, as we must here, we remain mindful of the fact that the latter occupy a preferred position … As we have stated before, the right to exercise the liberties safeguarded by the First Amendment “lies at the foundation of free government by free men”, and we must in all cases “weigh the circumstances and … appraise the … reasons … in support of the regulation of (those) rights”. (509)

When no such hierarchy obtains, conflicts are resolvable through some form of balancing of the rights’ respective normative weight or force. For instance, Thomson suggests balancing the interests protected by the competing rights (Thomson 1990: 149–175). Relatedly, Waldron suggests that when conflicting rights promote related interests, the right that best promotes that type of interest ought to prevail (Waldron 1993: 222–223). In fact, courts often resolve conflicts of rights by balancing the respective interests that those rights protect as well as each rights’ other respective justifying reasons (Wellman 1995: 209–210). Critical of both Thomson and Waldron, Kamm offers tests of her own for settling conflicts of rights (2001: 251–255; 2002: 500–506; 2007: 263–272), as does Gewirth (1978).

8.6 Violated and Infringed Legal Rights as Reasons

Even if infringed, rights remain reasons. To understand how, it is helpful to distinguish between “infringing” on a right and “violating” it. X’s right that Y φ is infringed on if Y fails to φ; yet an infringement is not necessarily also a violation. As Judith Jarvis Thomson clarifies, X’s right is violated if and only if it is infringed wrongfully (Gewirth 1981: 2; Thomson 1977 [1986: 51–52]; 1990: 122). Accordingly, if a right is overridden (preempted or outweighed) by competing reasons, it follows that acting against that right is permissible, or justifiable, or even required. That right is, therefore, infringed on, yet it is not violated (Gewirth 1981: 2; Thomson 1977 [1986: 50–52]; Thomson 1990: 100–104, 151–166).

Violated rights (or their underlying reasons) continue, in one way or another, to project normative force, thereby still counting as legal reasons. This is prominently manifested in remedial rights and correlative remedial duties justified by the violation of other rights (see Section 10.4; Weinrib 1995: 133–144; Raz 2004: 189–193; Gardner 2011: 28–37, 45–46; Ripstein 2016: 233–262; Steel 2020). It is, however, worth noting that violated rights do not always succeed in grounding a remedy and can be overridden by other considerations in this regard. For example, in Newfoundland Treasury Board v. N.A.P.E. (2004) the Supreme Court of Canada found that the defendant had violated the plaintiffs’ Equality Rights under the Canadian Charter of Rights and Freedoms by paying them less than their male colleagues. Yet, the Court affirmed granting the plaintiffs only a partial and belated remedy due to the dire fiscal circumstances of the government employer.

Interestingly, when overridden, infringed rights arguably also continue to project normative force, as a kind of residual legal reason. When a right is overridden, infringing on it is not wrongful, but it is still in a sense a wrong to the right-holder. Infringed overridden rights are neither expunged nor normatively inert (for a discussion in the context of moral rights, see Jones 1994: 195–198); in fact, they can even justify legal outcomes, even if not the outcome that they are a right for. A legal example is the classic case of Vincent v. Lake Erie Transp.Co. (1910). One reading of the case is that although the defendant had a “necessity” defense and, therefore, was justified in trespassing on the plaintiff’s land (thereby infringing on his property rights), the defendant was still legally required—on the grounds of the infringement—to compensate the plaintiff not for the trespass itself (i.e., the infringement) but for the damages caused by the (legally justified) infringement (Thomson 1990: 103–104).

9. The Moral Justification of Legal Rights

The moral justification of a legal right is the justification of the normative category detailed thus far: a preemptory (Section 8) or conclusory (Section 7) legal norm that has the form (Section 3) and function (Section 4) of “right”. The moral justification of legal rights is not self-evident. A right’s legal validity (Section 1) does not guaranty its moral justification. Indeed, it’s hard to deny that positive law can contain rights that are morally unjustified (Lyons 1982: 113; 1994: 154). There is a voluminous and diverse literature on the moral justification of legal rights, and advocating what the normative content of legal rights ought to be. Mostly, these involve matters of political philosophy and normative jurisprudence, extending beyond the scope of this entry; yet, some issues cut closely to the elucidation of the concept of “legal right” itself, warranting attention here.

9.1 The Function of Rights and the Moral Justification of Legal Rights

Accepting that rights typically further interests, or choice, or agency, or dignity of right-holders, and accepting that these functions are at least typically valuable in how they favor or entitle right-holders, are those values sufficient to justify the legal rights that realize and further them?

At least sometimes they are. Plausible examples are the legal rights to life, bodily integrity, autonomy, and freedom, which are arguably grounded in those values to right-holders (Raz 1994: 48–49). The same seems true of certain social rights, such as the right to adequate healthcare or to minimum wage. In fact, often the moral value of a right vis-à-vis the right-holder justifies the right, even when in conflict with the interests of others or with the common good.

Yet, this is not always the case. First, as intimated above (Section 5.2), even if rights always in some sense entitle or are in some way for right-holders, it does not necessarily follow that this value to right-holders has any intrinsic justificatory force in favor of the right (even if it often does). For instance, groups, corporations, or individuals in their capacity as public officials have a will and interests, as well as hold-rights protective of them. Yet, such will or interests are not of intrinsic moral value and, therefore, do not have intrinsic justificatory force in favor of their protection. Moreover, arguably legal rights can protect right-holders’ immoral interests. Such as, for example, the self-serving interests of predatory slumlords, sometimes protected by legal property rights. Therefore, if justified, the moral justification of such legal rights must derive from reasons other than the (amoral or immoral) interests that those rights protect (Raz 1995: 31–32).

Second, even in the common case wherein the function of a legal right vis-à-vis the right-holder does indeed morally count in favor of the law adopting that right, at times there is a justificatory gap between the value of that function and the right’s justification. Here the contribution of the right’s function to the right’s justification is, on its own, insufficient, suggesting that if morally justified, it is by reasons not exclusive to the value of the right’s function (Raz 1994: 48–49). Surprisingly, a common misstep in the discourse on the justification of rights is confusing interest with right. As if the mere demonstration that X has a weighty interest in φ directly entails X morally ought to have a legal right to φ. Yet, the fact is that X’s interest in φ perhaps counts in favor of X holding a legal right protective of that interest, but it does not necessarily justify it and it is certainly not its equivalent.

Such justificatory gaps are often bridged by reasons of the common good (or public interest) or the interests of other individuals counting in favor of X holding a certain legal right (Raz 1994: 49–55; 1995: 33–34; Harel 1994: 704–714). Examples are plentiful. For instance, arguably parents’ rights for tax breaks and welfare benefits are predicated not only on the interests of the parents’ themselves (the right-holders) in the means to care for their children, but also on the interests of the children and on the public’s interest in the fulfillment of these parental interests. The same is true of patent law, wherein intellectual property is granted not only on the grounds of innovators’ interests in controlling their inventions and in enjoying their proceeds, but perhaps more so to incentivize future innovators and investors by the means of satisfying those interests, thereby serving the overall social interest in innovation. The same form of argument is likely applicable, for example, to other types of property rights (Raz 1995: 33–34) as well as to corporate rights (Raz 1986: 179; 1994: 275). Even the right to free speech finds much of its justification in its contribution to the common good (e.g., promoting critical thought, bolstering democracy, enriching public discourse, promoting innovation) or to the interest of third parties (such as “listeners”), the moral significance of which often greatly exceeds any benefits that most individual right-holders derive (at least directly) from the protections their free-speech rights afford them (Raz 1986: 178–179; 1994: 54–55; Harel 1994: 704–714; 1998; 2005: 196).

9.2 Legal Rights and the Common Good (or Public Interest)

Rights and the common good are often considered antagonistic (Lyons 1982; 1994: 147–176; Kamm 2002: 489–497; for a discussion, see Jones 1994: 50–61). For example, characterizing rights as “deontological side-constraints” on the promotion of the common good (Nozick 1974: 28–35); or, the view that rights vest when collective goals are insufficient to justify depriving or harming an individual person (Dworkin 1977: xi, 91, 190–192, 269; 1984: 153).

More specifically to legal rights, something in the individualistic spirit of views such as those of Nozick and Dworkin rings true. Legal rights certainly can function as bastions of individual right-holders’ interests, agency, dignity, autonomy, control, and liberty even in the face of utilitarian ideals or, more generally, the common good (Lyons 1982; 1994: 147–176). In contrast, at times the common good is found to override certain individuals’ legal rights (Wellman 1995: 251–255). Nowhere is this tension more apparent than in the case of constitutional or “fundamental” rights, which are often couched in terms of limitations on state power over individual citizens. Yet, this tension also manifests in more mundane clashes, such as in the case of wasteful and inefficient use of personal property, which is often protected by the legal right to property (Lyons 1982: 115–118).

Is this individualism, which is typical of legal rights, compatible with the view that the moral grounds of legal rights can and arguably often do include reasons of the common good (see Section 9.1)? Arguably yes.

Firstly, taken in aggregate, certain legal rights provide for the various aspects of individuals’ well-being; and, if such rights are enjoyed by all—securing people’s dignity, liberty, welfare etc., then rights thereby secure a significant measure of the common good (Finnis 2011: 2010–218).

Secondly, some legal rights are group rights, ideally furthering the individual interests of the members of the group as members of the group (Raz 1986: 207–209). Such rights can, therefore, align with the common good (so long as all relevant parties are members of the group). Examples include cultural and language rights and peoples’ right to self-determination (e.g., Margalit & Raz 1990).

Thirdly, even if a norm is justified by the common good, the practice and application of that norm arguably must be guided by the content of the norm alone, not by its justification (see, e.g., Berkeley 1712: sec. 31; Rawls 1955). When someone “stands on” his or her legal rights, it is invariably under conditions of conflict with the claims or interests of others or with the common good. Accordingly, at least at the level of legal practice and in particular cases, rights and the common good are indeed sometimes antagonistic (Lyons 1982). Yet, from this it does not follow that at the level of their moral justification legal rights are necessarily or even typically inhospitable to or incompatible with the common good. Clearly if a legal right is in conflict with the common good, and if that right prevails as a matter of law, the common good suffers. Nevertheless, such an outcome in a specific case is not necessarily averse to the common good when viewed from the broader perspective of the rule’s justification (Sumner 2006: 192–195). It is often in the common good for law to grant certain rights to individuals; rights that, on occasion and in specific cases, setback the common good in favor of individual right-holders (e.g., Greenawalt 1982). Mill, for instance, arguably advocated such a view of legal rights (Sumner 2006: 189–192, 195–197):

[to] have a right, then, is, I conceive, to have something which society ought to defend me in the possession of. If the objector goes on to ask, why it ought? I can give him no other reason than general utility. (Mill 1863: Ch. 5. Par. 25)

Many rights of criminal procedure, to give just one example, exhibit this justificatory structure. Such as the rights to legal representation and against unlawful search and seizure, which can shackle the criminal justice system, sometimes resulting in less effective law enforcement. And still, on balance, right-based limitations on the coercive and punitive branches of government are widely recognized as in the common good.

9.3 Moral Rights and the Justification of Legal Rights

The justificatory relation between moral and legal rights is complex. Some legal rights arguably find at least some of their moral justification in certain moral rights. In fact, arguably there is something about moral rights that counts in favor of their practical implementation and enforcement, such as through law (Hart 1955: 177–178). For instance, at times legal rights approximate their putative moral counterparts, functioning as moral rights roughly recognized in law. For example, the content of legal rights to life or liberty arguably partially mirrors moral rights for the same values. In fact, human rights law is often considered to give legal recognition and even to roughly mirror moral human rights. When this is the case, arguably part of what justifies such legal rights are their moral counterparts. That said, given the complexity and contingency of systems of positive law, there is perhaps something simplistic in the mirroring view of how legal rights are justified by moral rights (for a critical evaluation see Buchanan 2013; Buchanan & Sreenivasan 2018; Tomalty 2016).

Moral rights can also lend moral justification to legal rights less straightforwardly. For instance, a legal right to φ may protect and further adherence to a (or several different) moral right(s) to something else altogether. For example, the legal right to due process of law or the legal right to vote arguably draw some of their justification from their role as a means for the fulfillment of a variety of moral rights, such as, for instance, the rights to dignity and liberty.

Nevertheless, arguably certain moral rights do not at all count in favor of legal rights, be it in the form of a legal counterpart (Feinberg 1992: 156–158, 161–162; Brownlee 2012: 125–126; Buchanan & Sreenivasan 2018: 218–219) or through some other type of legal right. For example, even assuming certain cases of terminal illness involve holding a moral right against one’s doctor to active euthanasia, it is not at all clear that such a right would justify a legal right to that effect, even if just for the unconscionability of enforcing such a right. Moreover, moral rights can count in favor and even justify legal arrangements that do not take the form of any legal right (Waldron 1999: 217–219). For example, children may have a moral right to an education, yet plausibly the ideal way of assuring children obtain an education is by imposing a system of compulsory schooling.

10. Features Salient to Legal Rights

10.1 Institutional Rights

Many of the features salient specifically to legal rights arise from law being an institutional system of norms (Raz 1979: 103–121), largely oriented towards action-guiding and towards aspects of human behavior that can be adjudicated (Raz 1994: 255–259). Ingrained in law, legal rights, therefore, tend to exhibit a practical orientation and institutional features less dominant in non-institutional rights, such as being subject to (in)validation, recognition, adjudication, legislation, enforcement, and inclusive of and nested in a rich network of procedures.

Legal rights also exhibit features absent or more muted in rights found in normative systems of non-legal institutions, such as social clubs, trade unions, or universities. Features derived from law’s relative greater social importance; law’s claim to supremacy over other institutional normative systems under law’s jurisdiction; the far greater range of activities that can and typically do fall under law’s domain; law’s compulsoriness; and, law’s commonly greater use of remedies, sanctions, and violence (Raz 1979: 115–121; Sumner 1987: 70–79).

10.2 Procedural Rights

The division between law’s substantive and procedural norms is foundational. Broadly, procedural norms are norms bearing on the administration of the engagement with other (mostly substantive) norms. Given its institutional nature, law typically involves a slew of procedural norms. In legal systems respective of rights, procedural rights often control how (i.e., the procedure of) certain other norms can or ought to be created, deliberated on, and applied in the case of the right-holder. Examples include rights to a hearing, trial by jury, confront witnesses, notice of accusation, receive reasons for official decisions, finality, appeal, evidentiary rights, and many more. Not to deny the existence of noninstitutional procedural moral rights (Enoch 2018), although some have (C. H. Wellman 2015); yet, there is no normative domain in which procedural rights are more central or developed than law.

10.3 Imperfect Rights

Echoing Grotius’s classic distinction regarding moral rights (see Darwall 2012: 306–307), law distinguishes between “perfect” legal rights, which are enforceable, and imperfect legal rights, which are not (Fitzgerald [Salmond] 1966: 233). Although there are imperfect legal rights (e.g., unenforceable contracts, certain immunities, and claims barred by lapse of time), these are not the norm (Fitzgerald [Salmond] 1966: 233; Raz 1994: 256). Law is primarily oriented towards practical application, and probably for good reason. As such, typically legal rights are rights that the law is willing and able to adjudicate and, if violated, to impose remedies or sanctions for their violation. Thus, imperfect legal rights seem to cut against the practical grain of law, explaining why they are atypical. Imperfect moral rights are not similarly scarce.

10.4 Remedial Rights and Rights of Action

Characteristic to legal rights and certainly of rights in private law, is a two-tiered system of interrelated norms—primary and secondary (Fitzgerald [Salmond] 1966: 100–104; Paton 1972: 487). Primary norms grant rights and impose correlative duties. Following law’s ancient maxim that “where there is a right, there is a remedy” (ubi jus, ibi remedium) (Blackstone 1765–9: 23; Goldberg 2005: 531–59; Goldberg & Zipursky 2020: 25–51, 82–110), when a primary right is violated law typically provides right-holders with a right to recourse (Stevens 2011: 133–134; Gardner 2019: 18–19) or, at the very least, with a right of action to pursue recourse against the wrongdoer (Zipursky 1998; Smith 2012: 1727–1728; Goldberg & Zipursky 2020: 98–103).

Remedies can take the form of enforcement of the violated (primary) right, either through self-help, policing, or a court order. Yet, enforcement is sometimes less favored, impossible, impractical, inequitable, or too costly. If so, law typically provides victims of rights violations with secondary rights, which are remedial rights grounded in the violation of the primary right. Secondary rights are typically for restitution of unjust gains or for compensation for the violation of a primary right and for resulting deprivations and proximate losses. Secondary rights are normally accompanied or preceded by rights of action to pursue their enforcement through the mechanism of the state (Paton 1972: 487–493). Importantly, remedial rights and rights of action against the party who violated a primary right, and are typically held exclusively by the party who held that right (Zipursky 1998: 4).

The intricacy of secondary and, more broadly, of remedial rights in the law, far exceeds anything found in moral theory. Moreover, lacking institutions of adjudication and enforcement, morality does not obviously involve formalized straightforward rights of action to pursue recourse for rights violation.



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Legal Sources

  • The Constitution of the United States.
  • Universal Declaration of Human Rights (1948).
  • Canadian Charter of Rights and Freedoms (1982).
  • Gannett Co. v. DePasquale, 443 U.S. 368 (1979).
  • Griswold v. Connecticut, 381 U.S. 479 (1965).
  • Iraqi Penal Code (Law No. 111), (1969)
  • Marsh v. Alabama, 320 U.S. 501 (1945).
  • Newfoundland (Treasury Board) v. N.A.P.E., [2004] 3 S.C.R. 381, 2004 SCC 66.
  • Roberts v. United States Jaycees, 468 U.S. 609 (1984).
  • Obergefell v. Hodges, 576 U.S. 644 (2015).
  • Smith v. United States, 361 U.S. 147 (1959).
  • Vincent v. Lake Erie Transp. Co., 109 Minn. 456, 124 N.W. 221 (1910).

Other Internet Resources

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