Leibniz on the Problem of Evil

First published Sun Jan 4, 1998; substantive revision Wed Feb 27, 2013

There is no question that the problem of evil vexed Leibniz as much as any of the problems that he engaged in the course of his philosophical career. This is manifest in the fact that the first and the last book-length works that he authored, the Philosopher's Confession (written at age 26 in 1672) and the Theodicy (written in 1709, seven years before his death) were both devoted to this problem, as well as in the fact that in the intervening years Leibniz wrote numerous short pieces on related issues––many of which may be found in Gr and will soon be available in English translations currently being undertaken by R. C. Sleigh, Jr.–– and one full-length work, the Dissertation on Predestination and Grace (DPG), which was only published in 2011. The fact that the Theodicy was the only book-length treatise that Leibniz published during his lifetime provides further evidence of the significance that he attributed to the topic. It is therefore appropriate that it has now become an interpretive commonplace that Leibniz's concern with the problem of evil was central to his overarching philosophical concerns throughout his philosophical career. [See Rutherford (1995) and Antognazza (2009).] Leibniz's approach to the problem of evil became known to many readers through Voltaire's lampoon in Candide: the link that Voltaire seems to forge between Leibniz and the extravagant optimism of Dr. Pangloss continues––for better or worse––to shape the popular understanding of Leibniz's approach to the problem of evil. In this entry we examine the two main species of the problem of evil that Leibniz addresses. The first, “the underachiever problem,” is raised by a critic who would argue that the existence of evil in our world indicates that God cannot be as knowledgeable, powerful, or good as traditional monotheists have claimed. The second, “the holiness problem,” is raised by the critic who would argue that God's intimate causal entanglements with the world make God the cause of evil. God is thereby implicated in evil to the detriment of his holiness.

1. Various Versions of the Problem of Evil in Leibniz

Before examining Leibniz's views on the problem of evil, it is necessary to do some stage-setting in order to locate just what sort of problem Leibniz thought evil presented. Consideration of any present-day introductory textbook of philosophy reveals that the problem of evil in contemporary philosophy is standardly regarded as an argument for atheism. The atheist contends that God and evil are incompatible, and given that evil clearly exists, God cannot exist. Some philosophers, conceding that the claimed incompatibility in the foregoing argument is too strong, contend, nevertheless, that even if the existence of God and the existence of evil should prove to be compatible, the existence (or duration, or amount, or pervasiveness) of evil provides us at the very least with compelling circumstantial evidence that God does not exist.

Framed in this way, the “atheistic problem of evil” invites certain sorts of responses. In particular, it invites the theist to explain how a being that is omniscient, omnibenevolent, and omnipotent can allow evil to exist. Present-day responses to the problem of evil therefore focus largely on presenting “theodicies,” that is, reasons why a perfect being does or might permit evil of the sort (or duration, or amount, or distribution) that we find in our world to exist.

When we consider, however, the works of medieval philosophers who address the problem of evil, the “atheistic problem” is not to be found. Since these figures believed that the arguments of natural theology demonstrated the existence of God, the problem that evil presented for them was different from that engaged by present-day philosophers. In present-day terminology, medieval philosophers did not engage the “evidential” problem of evil: rather, they engaged the “aporetic” problem of evil, in order to try to resolve the apparent logical incompatibility between God's attributes and the existence of evil. [On the distinction between these problems, see Adams and Adams (1990), pp. 1–3.] The problem, therefore, was taken to be that of explaining the compatibility of the existence of evil with divine moral purity or holiness. These philosophers believed that God is the author of everything that exists, and given that evil is one of the things that exists, it might seem that God is therefore the author of evil. And if an agent is an “author of evil,” he is therefore implicated in the evil and cannot be morally pure or holy. Thus, God cannot be morally pure nor holy. Let's call this version of the problem of evil the “holiness problem.” Before moving on, it should be noted that in light of the fact that Leibniz and his predecessors shared a commitment to God's existence, one might think that their approach to the problem of evil begs the question against the atheistic critic who charges that the existence of evil provides evidence that God does not exist. But this issue simply did not arise for Leibniz and his predecessors, given their antecedent belief in God's existence, and therefore it is inappropriate to charge these philosophers with begging the question.

Traditional theists held––and present-day theists still do hold––that God is the “author” or cause of everything in the cosmos in at least three different respects, so discussions of the holiness problem often branch off in three correspondingly different directions. First, God is regarded as the creative cause of everything in the cosmos. Everything that exists contingently is brought into existence by means of the creative activity of God. Second, it is held that God is the conserving cause of everything that exists. So God not only creates every created being, but every created being that continues to exist does so in virtue of God's continuously maintaining it in existence. Third, every action caused by a created being requires direct divine activity as concurrent cause. So every whack of a hammer, every strike of my fingertip on the keyboard, every tug of a magnet on a piece of iron, requires not only that the created being act, but also that the creator act concurrently with the created being in order to bring about the particular effect of the cause in question. [For a classic exposition of these various modes of divine causal involvement see St. Thomas Aquinas, Disputationes de Potentia Dei, Q.3, a.7, resp.]

Given that on this traditional account, God is intimately intertwined with the workings of the cosmos, the holiness problem seemed all the more intractable. In light of the intimate connections between God and the created world, the problem is not just that God created a world that happens to include evil, but that God seems to be causally (and thus morally) implicated in, for example, every particular act of murder, every earthquake, and every death caused by plague. Consequently, responses to the holiness problem sought to explain not only how God could remain holy despite having created a world such as ours, but also how he could remain holy despite conserving the world in existence and causally cooperating with all the events that occur in it.

In light of the fact that Leibniz lived in between these two eras, eras in which evil was taken to present different problems for the monotheistic philosopher, we are immediately led to wonder what sort of problem he sought to address. Leibniz expends a great deal of effort attempting to solve the holiness problem, but he also takes up something akin to the atheistic problem. It would be anachronistic, however, to claim that Leibniz was engaged with the atheistic problem, for in his time the existence of evil was taken to be an argument for an unorthodox form of theism rather than an argument for atheism. Thus, for example, a group of thinkers collectively known as the “Socinians” held, among other things, that the existence of evil was not incompatible with God's existence, but that it was incompatible with the existence of an omniscient God. The Socinians therefore held that God must not be omniscient, and that he must at the very least lack knowledge of future contingent events. [For Leibniz's view on the Socinians see Theodicy 364 (H343; G VI 318) et passim. More details on Socinianism can be found in Jolley, c.2, and Maclachlan.]

We might then characterize the problem raised by atheists in our own century and by the Socinians, to cite just one example from the seventeenth century, more broadly as the “underachiever problem.” According to the underachiever problem, if the sort of being that traditional monotheism identifies as God were to exist, the existence of this world would represent a vast underachievement on his part: therefore there is no such being. Atheists take this conclusion to prove that there is no God; the Socinians take it to show that God is not the sort of being that the traditional theist supposes him to be.

Although Leibniz is concerned about the underachiever problem, it is the Socinian, and not the atheistic, version of the problem that he engages. The winds of atheism had not reached the gale force proportions that they would in succeeding centuries. Consequently, this stronger conclusion was not yet taken as a serious, or at least the main, threat presented by the existence of evil.

It is important to distinguish between these versions of the problem of evil since we cannot understand Leibniz's treatment of evil in a given text until we know what problem it is that he means to be addressing in that text. Having set the stage in this way, we can now consider Leibniz's solutions to the problem of evil: we first consider the underachiever problem, and then turn to the holiness problem.

2. The Underachiever Problem

The core of Leibniz's solution to the underachiever problem is straightforward. Leibniz argues that God does not underachieve in creating this world because this world is the best of all possible worlds. Many thinkers have supposed that commitment to the claim that this world is the best of all possible worlds follows straightforwardly from monotheism. Because God is omnipotent and omniscient, nothing can prevent him from creating the best world, and his omnibenevolence obliges him to create the best world. So the created world is the best world.

Leibniz's reasoning to this conclusion does not, however, follow this straightforward path: among other things, this reasoning is not cogent as it stands. A number of seventeenth-century figures recognized that God would not be obliged to create the best world if there were no such thing as the best world. There would be no best world if the series of possible worlds formed a continuum of increasingly good worlds ad infinitum. And if there is no best world, God cannot be faulted for failing to create the best one since to do so would be as impossible as, say, naming the highest number. There is no such number of course, and likewise no such world. So while God may be obliged to create a world that has at least some measure of goodness, he cannot be obliged, on this view, to create the best. And therefore it might be the case that God simply chose arbitrarily to create one of infinitely many morally acceptable worlds. [This line of argument was common among certain Jesuit scholastics of the period. For discussions of this issue, see, for example, Ruiz de Montoya, Commentaria ac Disputationes in primam partem Sancti Thomae. De voluntate Dei et propiis actibus eius, Lyon 1630, disp. 9 and 10, and Diego Granado, Comentarii in primam partem Summae Theologicae S. Thomae, Pont-a-Mousson, 1624, pp.420–433.]

Leibniz was aware of this argument denying God's obligation to create the best, but he was firmly committed to rejecting it, in virtue of a central principle of his philosophical system, the Principle of Sufficient Reason. According to the Principle of Sufficient Reason, for any state of affairs, there must be a sufficient reason that explains why that state of affairs and not some other state of affairs obtains. When it comes to our world, then, there must be some reason that explains why it, and not some other world, obtains. But there can be no such reason if it is the case that the goodness of worlds increases ad infinitum. Leibniz therefore concluded that there can be no infinite continuum of worlds.

One might be tempted to resist Leibniz's argument by saying that even according to the view on which there is an “infinite continuum of good worlds,” there is something that can serve as the sufficient reason for existence of this world, namely, God's decree that this world be actual. But such a response, Leibniz observes, would merely push the problem back, because the Principle of Sufficient Reason applies to free choices just as it applies to any other event or state of affairs. Thus, we would have to provide a sufficient reason for God's choice of this world instead of some other world on the continuum of morally acceptable worlds. And it seems that such a sufficient reason cannot be given on the infinite continuum of good worlds view. Note that the sufficient reason cannot be derived from some feature or fact about the world that is actually chosen, for this would raise the obvious question: Why did this feature in particular serve as the sufficient reason for God's choice? The only possible answers, it appears, would be: (a) Because God arbitrarily selected that feature as the one he would favor in deciding which world to create; or (b) Because that feature made that world better than all its competitors. But notice that neither of these answers is acceptable. The first is inconsistent with the Principle of Sufficient Reason. The second is incompatible with the hypothesis at issue, that there is no “best world.”

One might think that declaring this world to be the best possible world does not constitute a valid response to the underachiever problem. Indeed, such a response might be taken to provide the basis for a new underachiever argument along the following lines:

  1. If God were all-powerful, all-knowing, and all-good, then this world would be the best possible world.
  2. But surely this world is not the best possible world.
  3. Thus, God is not all-powerful, all-knowing, and all-good.

Leibniz believes, however, that there was overwhelming evidence that the conclusion of this argument was false. He therefore must take one of the two premises in this argument to be false. Given that he himself is committed to the first premise, he must reject the second premise. And this is precisely what he does.

What reason, Leibniz asks, does the critic have for thinking that (2) is true? When Leibniz addresses this issue, he usually has the critic say something along the following lines:

Surely this world is not the best possible world since we can easily conceive of possible worlds that are better. Take some token instance of suffering: the tragic bombing of the Oklahoma City federal building. Surely a world without that event would be better than the actual world. And there is no reason why God couldn't have created the world without that event. Thus, this is not the best possible world. [See Theodicy 118–119 (H 188–191; G VI 168–172).]

Leibniz's response to this sort of criticism comes in two stages. First, Leibniz says that while we can think of certain token features of the world that in and of themselves might be better than they are, we do not know whether it is possible to create a better world lacking those features, because we can never be certain of the nature of the connections between the token events in question and other events in the world. If we could improve or eliminate the token event in question without otherwise changing the world, we might well have a better world. Unfortunately, we have no way of knowing whether such a change to the token event would leave the world otherwise unchanged, or might instead make things, on balance, worse. [See Theodicy 211–214 (H 260–2; G VI 244–7) and Gr, p.64f., for examples of this sort of response.]

Second, examples such as these are deceptive because they presume that God utilizes standards of world goodness that he may not in fact use. For example, it may presume that a world is good only if each part taken in isolation is good (a standard, we have seen, that Leibniz rejects), or it might presume that a world is good only if human beings enjoy happiness in it.

Leibniz argues in numerous texts that it is parochial to think that human happiness is the standard whereby the goodness of worlds is to be judged. A more reasonable standard, according to Leibniz, would be the happiness of all sentient beings. But once we admit this, it may turn out that the amount of unhappiness in the created realm is quite small, given that for all we know, the sentient beings on Earth might constitute a very small percentage of the sentient beings created by God. Here Leibniz includes not only preternatural beings such as angels, but also the possibility of extraterrestrial rational beings [Theodicy 19 (H 134–5; G VI 113–4)].

There is disagreement among Leibniz scholars about the basis for judging the goodness of worlds. Various scholars have defended one or more of the following:

  1. The best world is the one that maximizes the happiness (i.e., virtue) of rational beings.
  2. The best world is the one that maximizes the “quantity of essence.”
  3. The best world is the one that yields the greatest variety of phenomena governed by the simplest set of laws.

There is scholarly dispute about whether Leibniz believed that the maximization of the happiness or virtue of rational beings is one of the standards by which God judges the goodness of the world. [For supporters of this claim see Rutherford, c.3; Blumenfeld, Brown; for detractors see Russell, p. 199, Gale.] It is unlikely that Leibniz believed that (1) alone was the true standard of goodness of the world in light of following comment on an argument advanced by Bayle:

the author is still presupposing that false maxim … stating that the happiness of rational creatures is the sole aim of God. [Theodicy 120 (H 192; G VI 172)]

In part, the dispute over this standard hangs on whether or not (1) is compatible with the more metaphysical standards embodied in (2) and (3), since it is these more metaphysical standards that Leibniz seems to endorse most consistently. In some cases, Leibniz writes as if the standard of happiness is fully compatible with the more metaphysical criteria. For example, within a single work, the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz entitled Section 5 “What the rules of the perfection of divine conduct consist in, and that the simplicity of the ways is in balance with the richness of effects,” and he entitled Section 36: “God is the monarch of the most perfect republic, composed of all minds, and the happiness of this city of God is his principal purpose.” So Leibniz seems to advance both standards (1) and (3) in the same work [For another example, see R p. 105 (K X pp.9–10)]. In other places however, he writes as if they compete with one another [See Theodicy 124 (H 197–8; G VI 178–9).]

Whatever position one comes to hold on this matter, Leibniz often points to the more metaphysical standards as the ones God utilizes in assessing the goodness of worlds. But there is further controversy over exactly which metaphysical standard, (2) or (3), Leibniz endorses. In general, Leibniz holds that God creates the world in order to share his goodness with created things in the most perfect manner possible [Gr 355–6]. In light of the fact that created beings, in virtue of their limitations, can mirror the divine goodness only in limited respects, God creates a variety of things, each of which has an essence that reflects a different facet of divine perfection in its own unique way. Since this is God's purpose in creating the world, it would be reasonable to think that maximizing the mirroring of divine goodness in creation is the goal that God seeks to achieve. And this in fact is one of the standards Leibniz seems to endorse. We might call this the “maximization of essence” standard. Leibniz seems convinced that the actual world meets this standard and that creatures are to be found that mirror the divine perfections in all the sorts of ways that creatures can do this. Thus, there are creatures with bodies and creatures without, creatures with freedom and intelligence and creatures without, creatures with sentience and creatures without, etc. [See, for example, MP pp. 75–6 and 138 (G VII 303–4 and 310).]

In some texts, however, Leibniz frames the standard of goodness in what some have taken to be a third distinct way. In these places he argues that the goodness of a world is measured by the ratio between the variety of phenomena that a world contains and the simplicity of the laws that govern that world. Here Leibniz emphasizes the fact that the perfection of a world that maximizes the variety of phenomena it contains is enhanced by the simplicity of its laws since this displays the intelligence of the creator who created it.

Some scholars have argued that one or the other of these two more metaphysical standards represents Leibniz's settled view on the true standard of goodness [Gale, for example]. Other scholars have argued that, in the end, the two standards are not exclusive of each other. [See Rutherford, cc.2–3 and Rescher, c.1 for two very different ways of harmonizing (2) and (3).]

Regardless of which of these interpretations is correct, if these are the standards by which God judges the world's goodness, it becomes much more difficult to defend the claim that this is not the best possible world. We can use standard (3) to illustrate. In order, for example, for God to eliminate the Oklahoma City bombing from the world, what would be required in order for him to do so? There are presumably a number of ways in which this might be done. The most obvious would involve miraculous intervention somewhere in the chain of events leading up to the explosion. God might miraculously prevent the explosives from detonating, or he might eliminate the truck and its contents from the world. But this sort of miraculous intervention would require that the laws governing the world become more complex. Consequently, Leibniz, and others who share this view of what the goodness of a world consists in, such as Malebranche, think that miraculous intervention is generally repugnant and would require vastly outweighing goods to result from a miraculous intervention in order for such an intervention to be permissible. [See Theodicy 129 (H 192–3; G VI 182).]

In any event, Leibniz holds that we are simply unable to know how changing certain events would change the world's capacity to meet the standards of goodness described in (2) and (3). Thus, according to Leibniz, we are not justified in claiming that this world is not as good, all things considered, as some other possible world. According to Leibniz, then, the underachiever problem cannot get off the ground unless the critic is able to defend the claim that this world is not the best possible world. It should be noted that Leibniz's approach to the underachiever problem thus seems be immune to the line of criticism pressed by Voltaire in Candide, namely, that it is obvious that this world is not the best possible world because there are so many manifest evils in it. Leibniz does not believe that each individual event is the best possible event, and he does not think that it is possible for finite minds to demonstrate that every individual event must be a part of the best possible world: rather, he believes that the world as a whole is the best possible world. (That said, it should be noted that there is considerable scholarly controversy as to whether Voltaire's target in Candide is indeed Leibniz: it has been claimed, for example, that the “optimism” lampooned in Candide is closer to that of Pope (see Rutherford (1995); on the general reception of Leibniz in France, see Barber (1955)].) In any event, on Leibniz's view, our inability to know how changing certain events in the world would affect other events and our inability to know how such changes would affect the overall goodness of the world make it impossible to defend the claim that the manifest evils in the world constitute evidence that this is not the best possible world.

3. The Holiness Problem

Far less scholarly attention has been devoted to Leibniz's treatment of the holiness problem, if only because this conception of the problem has only recently been recognized by Leibniz scholars. As noted above, the main problem here is that God's character seems to be stained by evil because God causally contributes to the existence of everything in the world, and evil is one of those things. [For two recent treatments see Sleigh (1996) and Murray (2005)]

The standard solution adopted by medieval thinkers was to deny an assumption of the preceding argument, namely, that evil is “something.” Evil was claimed not to have any positive reality, but to be a mere “privation” or “lack” of being. On such a view, evil has no more reality than the hole in the center of a donut. Making a donut does not require putting together two components, the cake and the hole: the cake is all that there is to the donut, and the hole is just the “privation of cake.” It therefore would be silly to say that making the donut requires causing both the cake and the hole to exist. Causing the cake to exist causes the hole as a “by-product” of causing a particular kind of cake to exist. Thus, we need not assume any additional cause for the hole beyond that assumed for the causing of the cake.

The upshot of our pastry analogy is this: given that evil, like the hole, is merely a privation, it requires no cause (or as the medievals, and Leibniz, liked to say, it needs no “cause per se”). God does not “causally contribute to the existence of evil” because evil per se is not a thing and therefore requires no cause in order to exist. And since God does not cause the existence of evil, God cannot be causally implicated in evil. Thus, the holiness problem evaporates.

Early in his philosophical career, Leibniz, like other seventeenth-century philosophers, scoffed at this solution to the holiness problem. In a short piece entitled “The Author of Sin,” Leibniz explains why he thinks the privation response to the holiness problem fails. Leibniz argues that God is the author of all that is real and positive in the world, and that God is therefore also the “author” of all of privations in the world. “It is a manifest illusion to hold that God is not the author of sin because there is no such thing as an author of a privation, even though he can be called the author of everything which is real and positive in the sinful act” [A.6.3.150].

Leibniz explains why he takes this response to be a “manifest illusion,” through the consideration of an example. Suppose that a painter creates two paintings that are identical in every respect, except that the one is a scaled down version of the other. It would be absurd, Leibniz remarks,

… to say that the painter is the author of all that is real in the two paintings, without however being the author of what is lacking or the disproportion between the larger and the smaller painting… . In effect, what is lacking is nothing more than a simple result of an infallible consequence of that which is positive, without any need for a distinct author [of that which is lacking]. [A.6.3.151]

So even if it is true that evil is a privation, this does not have as a consequence that God is not the author of sin. Given that what is positively willed by God is a sufficient condition for the existence of the evil state of affairs, in virtue of willing what is positive in some state of affairs, God is also the author of what is privative in that state of affairs. [A similar early critique is found at A.6.3.544].

Leibniz therefore sought to develop a different strategy in order to clear God of the charge of being the author of sin. In the Philosopher's Confession, his most significant treatise on evil aside from the Theodicy, Leibniz claims that although God wills everything in the world, his will with respect to goods is decretory , whereas his will with respect to evils is merely permissive. And Leibniz argues that God's permissive willing of evils is morally permissible if and only if such permission of evil is necessary in order for one to meet one's moral obligations..

It should be noted that Leibniz does not think that the permission of evil is morally justified on the grounds that such permission brings about a greater good that may not otherwise be achieved. Such an explanation, according to Leibniz, would make it the case that God would violate in the Biblical injunction “not to do evil that good may come” [Causa Dei 36 (S 121; G VI 444)]. Leibniz therefore claims that the evil that God permits is a necessary consequence of God's fulfilling his duty (namely, to create the best world). Leibniz characterizes (morally permissible) permission as follows:

P permits E iff:
  1. P fails to will that E
  2. P fails to will that not-E
  3. P brings it about that the state of affairs S obtains by willing that S obtains
  4. If S obtains then E obtains
  5. P knows that (4)
  6. P believes that it is P's duty to will S and that the good of performing one's duty outweighs the evil entailed by E's obtaining

[This account is distilled from A.6.3.129–131]

This, Leibniz believes, resolves any holiness problem that might arise in so far as God is considered as the creator of the universe. However, after writing the Philosopher's Confession, Leibniz became increasingly concerned that a tension might arise in his account when it was applied to the holiness problem in the context of concurrence. Recall that traditional theists held that God was not only creator and conserver of all created things, but that God also was the concurrent cause of all actions of created things.

There were heated debates in the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries concerning the nature of divine concurrence. The dispute centered on the respect in which God concurred with the free acts of creatures. This was an especially pressing problem for the obvious reason that positing too close a connection between God and created beings in cases where moral evils are committed runs the risk of implicating God in the evil, thus raising the holiness problem all over again. This debate often focused on a certain type of proposition and on what made this type of proposition true. The propositions in question are called “conditional future contingents”, propositions of the form:

If agent S were in circumstances C and time t, S would freely chose to f.

Propositions of this form were particularly important in discussions of philosophical theology in the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries because it was believed that it was necessary that God know propositions of this type in order to exercise providential control over the free actions of created beings. In order to exercise providential control over free actions in the created world, God must know precisely how each such being will choose to act in each circumstance in which it will find itself. If God, for example, did not know what Eve would choose to do when confronted by the serpent, or what I would choose to do when confronted with a tuna sandwich, God could not know in advance the order of events in the universe he deigns to create.

But how does God know whether or not a token proposition of this type is true? In general, disputants in this period held that there are only two possible answers to this question. God knows that a token proposition of this type is true either because he wills that that proposition be true, or he knows that proposition to be true because something independent of his will makes it true, and God, in virtue of his omniscience, therefore knows it to be true. Following recent scholarship, we will call the first view the “postvolitional view” (since the truth of the proposition is determined only after God wills it) and the latter view the “prevolitional” view (since the truth of the proposition is independent of what God wills). In his early writings on the topic, Leibniz seemed inclined to postvolitionalism. So take the token proposition:

If Peter were accused of consorting with Christ during Christ's trial, Peter would deny Christ.

The early Leibniz holds that this type of proposition is true because God decrees that it would be true: that is, God decrees that Peter would deny Christ under these circumstances [see C 26–7 and Gr 312–3]. Furthermore, those who held this view generally held that it was in virtue of divine concurrence that God makes the proposition true in the actual world. So, in virtue of causally influencing Peter at the moment of his decision, God brings it about that Peter denies Christ in these circumstances.

This view obviously faces a number of difficulties. For our purposes, the most pressing one is that it seems to undercut Leibniz's solution to the holiness problem based on permission. For if the above proposition is true because God wills that it be true, then it would seem that God wills that Peter sin, and if he wills that Peter sin, he cannot merely permit it, in light of condition (1) of the definition of permission given above. Consequently, it appears that Leibniz must abandon his initial answer to the question of “what makes conditional future contingents true” and adopt the alternative answer.

The alternative answer also raises problems. What does it mean to say that the truth of the proposition is determined independently of God's will? Defenders of this view usually hold that the human will cannot be determined. When an agent chooses freely, nothing can “determine” or “cause” the choice, for otherwise the ehoice would not be free. Thus, for those who defended this view, the answer to the question of “what makes conditional future contingents true” ought to be “nothing.” For if something made future contingents true, then that thing would determine the choice, and the choice would not be free.

Given his commitment to the Principle of Sufficient Reason, however, Leibniz could not endorse such a view. Does Leibniz, then, have an answer to this question that will rescue him from the holiness problem? There is scholarly disagreement about this issue. Some have held that Leibniz is obliged to hold the postvolitional view despite the difficulties that it raises for him. [See Davidson (1996), Sleigh (1994).] Others have held that Leibniz tried to forge a third alternative in order to avoid this seemingly intractable dilemma. [See Murray (2005); for an alternative to Murray (2005), see Cover and Hawthorne (2000)]. I will close by considering the latter suggestion.

According to Leibniz, free choice in humans is brought about through the activity of the human intellect and the human will working in concert with each other. The intellect deliberates about alternatives and selects the one that it perceives to be the best, all things considered. The intellect then represents this alternative to the will as the best course of action. The will, which Leibniz takes to be an “appetite for the good,”, then chooses the alternative represented to it as containing the most goodness [Theodicy, 311 (H 314; G VI 300–1].

On this view, it appears that there are two ways in which I might exercise “control” over my acts of will. First, I might be able to control what appears to me to be the best course of action, all things considered. That is, I might control the process of deliberation. Second, I might be able to control which alternative is presented to the will as containing the greatest good. Leibniz seems to accept both of these possibilities. In certain passages, he argues that by engaging in some sort of moral therapy, I can control which things appear to me to be good, and thus control the outcome of my deliberations. In other passages, he seems to say that while the will does “infallibly” choose that which the intellect deems to be the best, the will nevertheless retains the power to resist the intellect because the intellect does not “cause” the will to choose as it does. [Concerning the first strategy, see, for example, Reflections on Hobbes, 5 (H 396–7; G VI 391–1). For more on this aspect of Leibniz's view of freedom see Seidler (1985). Concerning the second strategy see, for example Theodicy 282 (H 298–300; G VI 284–5).]

Both suggestions face difficulties. Consider the first. How might I go about engaging in “moral therapy”? First, I would have to choose to do something to begin to bring about a change in how I see things. But of course I can make a choice to do this only if I first deliberate about it and see that making this change is the best thing for me to do. But did I have control over this process of “coming to see that a change is the best thing for me to do”? It seems that I may have control here only if I have control over the actions that led me to see things this way in the first place. But do I have control over those actions? If the answer is yes, it is only because I had control over my prior deliberations, and it looks as if this will lead us back in the chain of explanation to certain very early formative stages of my moral and intellectual life, stages over which it is hard to believe I had any control. It therefore seems that this line of reasoning will be difficult to sustain.

Let us consider the second alternative then, according to which I have control because the will is never “causally determined” to choose that which the intellect deems to be best in those circumstances. Leibniz holds that the will is not causally determined in the act of choice but merely “morally necessitated.” There is scholarly disagreement about the interpretation of this phrase. Some think it just means “causally necessitated.” But if this is right, it appears that God, who establishes the laws of nature, determines how creatures act, and this leads us back to the suggestion that Leibniz was a postvolitionalist in these matters. As we noted above, this is a troubling position for Leibniz to adopt since it seems to undermine his response to the holiness problem. [For various positions on the nature of “moral necessity,” see Adams, pp. 21–2, Sleigh (2000), Murray (1995), pp. 95–102, and (1996), esp. Section IV].

Others have held that moral necessity is a philosophical novelty, invented to explain the unique relationship between intellect and will. On this view, the will infallibly follows the determination of the intellect, without thereby being causally determined. Leibniz sometimes hints at this reading, as in the following example derived from Pierre Nicole:

It is considered impossible that a wise and serious magistrate, who has not taken leave of his senses, should publicly commit some outrageous action, as it would be, for instance, to run about the streets naked in order to make people laugh [Theodicy 282 (H299; G VI 284)]

Here, the wise magistrate is not causally determined to refrain from streaking to make people laugh. Instead, he just considers streaking to be so unseemly that “he can't bring himself to do it.” Something about his psychological constitution prevents him from seeing this as something that he might actually do, even though there is surely some sense in which he nevertheless could do it.

If we allow Leibniz to locate control over actions in a will that is only morally necessitated by the intellect, is there a way for him to avoid the postvolitional/prevolitional dilemma discussed earlier? The answer is not obvious. One would have to say that the will's infallibly choosing in accordance with the deliverances of the intellect is a fact whose truth is independent of God's will, while also saying that the deliverances of the intellect provide a sufficient reason for the will's choice. If this can be done, Leibniz may have a way of avoiding the difficulty posed by conditional future contingents.

However we might think these questions should be resolved, Leibniz himself appears to have thought that the prevolitional route was the one to take. He does not think that God makes it the case how human beings would act if they were created; rather, Leibniz believes God "discovers" in the ideas of the possibles how human beings would act if they were created [on this topic see Sleigh (1994).] [Leibniz speaks of these truths about how human beings will act as “limitations” that prevent God from making them, and the world that contains them, more perfect. In the end, it is these limitations, Leibniz argues, that prevent there from being a better world than the actual one. [On the notion of “limitations” see AG 60–2, 11, Theodicy 20 (H 86–7; G VI 114–5), Causa Dei 69–71 (S 128–30; 457–8).] If this interpretation is correct, then we might think that the permission strategy will work as a solution to the holiness problem both when it comes to defending God as creator and as concurrent cause of all effects in the cosmos.

Interestingly, however, Leibniz comes to favor, in later life, the scholastic “privation” view that he rejected in his earliest writings on the problem of evil. [See, for example, Theodicy 20, 30, 153 (respectively, H 86–7, 91–2, 219–20; G VI 114–5, 119–20, 201.] Leibniz's conception of privation in general, and the relation between his earlier and later views on the topic, has recently received a sustained and searching examination in Newlands (forthcoming), to which readers interested in the topic are directed.

The issues that arise in thinking about Leibniz's views on the problem of evil have only in the past couple of decades begun to receive the sustained scholarly attention that they deserve in virtue of their manifest significance for Leibniz. In the last few years in particular––probably not coincidentally, the three-hundredth anniversary of the publication of the Theodicy was celebrated in 2010––considerable interpretive attention has been devoted to the details of Leibniz's treatment of the problem of evil and related topics. [Rateau (2008) is the first book-length treatment of Leibniz's work on the problem of evil; the essays in Rateau (2011) and Newlands and Jorgensen (forthcoming) are devoted to particular topics related to Leibniz's treatment of the problem of evil.] Given the fact that Leibniz's treatment of the problem of evil draws on medieval sources and also was taken as a target by later writers such as Voltaire and Kant, renewed interest in Leibniz's treatment of the problem of evil, combined with the resurgence of interest in contextual history of philosophy, have inspired recent work on the general historical significance of Leibniz's work on the problem of evil that seeks to illuminate later approaches to the problem of evil as well as the nature of the problem of evil itself. [See, inter alia, Larrimore (2004), Neiman (2002), and the essays in Rateau (2009).] In light of the fact that new translations of Leibniz's central texts devoted to the problem of evil have either only relatively recently been published (CP) or are in process––a new edition and English translation of the Theodicy, by Sean Greenberg and R. C. Sleigh, Jr., is well underway and under contract with Oxford University Press–and given that other new texts, like DPW, that bear on this nest of issues may well be discovered, there is reason to expect that this topic will continue to be an active area of Leibniz scholarship, and therefore that any conclusions about Leibniz's views on the problem of evil must, for now, remain tentative and subject to revision.


Primary Sources

[A] Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe . Darmstadt and Berlin: Berlin Academy, 1923-. Cited by series, volume, and page.
[AG] Philosophical Essays. Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber (eds. and trans.), Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989.
[C] Louis Couturat (ed.), Opuscules et Fragments Inédits de Leibniz. Hildesheim: Georg Olms, 1966.
[CP] R. C. Sleigh, Jr. (editor and translator), with contributions from Brandon Look and James Stam, Confessio Philosophi: Papers Concerning the Problem of Evil, 1671–1678. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2005.
[DPW] Michael Murray (editor and translator), Dissertation on Predestination and Grace. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2011.
[G] Die Philosophischen Schriften von Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz. Edited by C.I. Gerhardt. Berlin: Weidman, 1875–1890. Cited by volume and page.
[Gr] Textes Inédits. Edited by Gaston Grua. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1948.
[H] Theodicy. Edited by Austin Farrer and translated by E.M. Huggard. New Haven: Yale UP, 1952.
[MP] Mary Morris and G.H.R. Parkinson (eds. and trans.), Leibniz-Philosophical Writings, London: J.M. Dent and Sons, 1973.
[R] G.W. Leibniz, Political Writings. Patrick Riley (ed. and trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
[S] Paul Schrecker and Anne Martin Schrecker (eds. and trans.), Leibniz: Monadology and Other Philosophical Essays, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1965.

Secondary Sources

  • Antognazza, Maria Rosa, 2009, Leibniz: An Intellectual Autobiography, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Adams, Robert, 1995, Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Adams, Marilyn Mccord and Robert Adams (editors), 1990, The Problem of Evil, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Barber, W. H., 1955, Leibniz in France, from Arnauld to Voltaire: A Study in French Reactions to Leibnizianism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Blumenfeld, David, 1994, “Perfection and Happiness in the Best Possible World,” The Cambridge Companion to Leibniz, Nicholas Jolley (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Brown, Gregory, 1988, “Leibniz's Theodicy and the Confluence of Worldly Goods,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 26: 571–91.
  • Cover, J. and Hawthorne, J., 2000, “Leibnizian Modality Again: A Reply to Murray,” The Leibniz Review, (December): 87–103.
  • Davidson, Jack, 1996, “Untying the Knot: Leibniz's on God's Knowledge of Future Free Contingents,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 13: 89–116.
  • Gale, George, 1976, “On What God Chose: Perfection and God's Freedom,” Studia Leibnitiana, 8: 69–87.
  • Jolley, Nicholas, 1984, Leibniz and Locke: A Study of the New Essays in Human Understanding, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Klopp, Onno (ed.), 1864–84, Die Werke von Leibniz. Reihe I: Historisch-politische und staatswissenschaftliche Schriften, Hannover: Klindworth.
  • Larrimore, Mark, 2004, “Autonomy and the Invention of Theodicy,” New Essays on the History of Autonomy: A Collection Honoring J. B. Schneewind, Natalie Brender and Lawrence Krasnoff (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press: 61–91.
  • MacLachlan, H.J., 1951, Socinianism in Seventeenth-century England, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Murray, Michael J., 1995, “Leibniz on Divine Knowledge of Conditional Future Contingents and Human Freedom,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 55: 75–108.
  • –––, 1996, “Intellect, Will, and Freedom: Leibniz and His Precursors,” The Leibniz Society Review, 6: 25–60.
  • –––, 2005, “Spontaneity and Freedom in Leibniz,” Leibniz: Nature and Freedom, Donald Rutherford and Jan Cover (eds.), New York: Oxford University Press, 2005, pp. 194–216.
  • Neiman, Susan, 2002, Evil in Modern Thought: An Alternative History of Philosophy, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Newlands, Samuel, forthcoming, “Leibniz on Privations, Limitations, and the Metaphysics of Evil,” Journal of the History of Philosophy.
  • –––, and Larry M. Jorgensen (eds.), forthcoming, New Essays on Leibniz's Theodicy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Rateau, Paul, 2008, La Question du mal chez Leibniz: Fondements et élaboration de la Théodicée, Paris: Editions Honoré Champion.
  • ––– (ed.), 2011, Lectures et interprétations des Essais de théodicée de G. W. Leibniz, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag.
  • Rescher, Nicholas, 1981, Leibniz's Metaphysics of Nature, Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
  • Rutherford, Donald, 1995, Leibniz and the Rational Order of Nature, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sleigh, Robert C., 1994, “Leibniz on Divine Foreknowledge,” Faith and Philosophy, 11(4): 547–571.
  • –––, 1996, “Leibniz's First Theodicy,” Noûs, 30: 481–499.
  • –––, 2000, “Determinism and Human Freedom,” The Cambridge History of Seventeenth-Century Philosophy, Daniel Garber and Michael Ayers (eds.), New York: Cambridge University Press, pp. 1195–1273.

Other Internet Resources

Copyright © 2013 by
Michael J. Murray
Sean Greenberg
Thomas Feeney <feen0010@stthomas.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free