Russell’s Logical Atomism

First published Mon Oct 24, 2005; substantive revision Mon Oct 14, 2019

Bertrand Russell (1872–1970) described his philosophy as a kind of “logical atomism”, by which he meant to endorse both a metaphysical view and a certain methodology for doing philosophy. The metaphysical view amounts to the claim that the world consists of a plurality of independently existing things exhibiting qualities and standing in relations. According to logical atomism, all truths are ultimately dependent upon a layer of atomic facts, which consist either of a simple particular exhibiting a quality, or multiple simple particulars standing in a relation. The methodological view recommends a process of analysis, whereby one attempts to define or reconstruct more complex notions or vocabularies in terms of simpler ones. This process often reveals that what we take to be brute necessities are instead purely logical. According to Russell, at least early on during his logical atomist phase, such an analysis could eventually result in a language containing only words representing simple particulars, the simple properties and relations thereof, and logical constants, which, despite this limited vocabulary, could adequately capture all truths.

Russell’s logical atomism had a profound influence on analytic philosophy in the first half of the 20th century; indeed, it is arguable that the very name “analytic philosophy” derives from Russell’s defense of the method of analysis.

1. Introduction

Bertrand Russell (1872–1970) introduced the phrase “logical atomism” to describe his philosophy in 1911 (RA, 94), and used the phrase consistently throughout the 1910s and 1920s (OKEW, 12; SMP, 84; PLA, 178; LA, 323; OOP, 259). Russell’s logical atomism is perhaps best described as partly a methodological viewpoint, and partly a metaphysical theory.

Methodologically, logical atomism can be seen as endorsement of analysis, understood as a two-step process in which one attempts to identify, for a given domain of inquiry, set of beliefs or scientific theory, the minimum and most basic concepts and vocabulary in which the other concepts and vocabulary of that domain can be defined or recast, and the most general and basic principles from which the remainder of the truths of the domain can be derived or reconstructed.

Metaphysically, logical atomism is the view that the world consists in a plurality of independent and discrete entities, which by coming together form facts. According to Russell, a fact is a kind of complex, and depends for its existence on the simpler entities making it up. The simplest sort of complex, an atomic fact, was thought to consist either of a single individual exhibiting a simple quality, or of multiple individuals standing in a simple relation.

The methodological and metaphysical elements of logical atomism come together in postulating the theoretical, if not the practical, realizability of a fully analyzed language, in which all truths could in principle be expressed in a perspicuous manner. Such a “logically ideal language”, as Russell at times called it, would, besides logical constants, consist only of words representing the constituents of atomic facts. In such a language, the simplest sort of complete sentence would be what Russell called an “atomic proposition”, containing a single predicate or verb representing a quality or relation along with the appropriate number of proper names, each representing an individual. The truth or falsity of an atomic proposition would depend entirely on a corresponding atomic fact. The other sentences of such a language would be derived either by combining atomic propositions using truth-functional connectives, yielding molecular propositions, or by replacing constituents of a simpler proposition by variables, and prefixing a universal or existential quantifier, resulting in general and existential propositions. According to the stronger form of logical atomism Russell at times adopted, he held that in such a language, “[g]iven all true atomic propositions, together with the fact that they are all, every other true proposition can theoretically be deduced by logical methods” (PM2, xv; cf. OKEW, 50). This puts the truth or falsity of atomic propositions at the core of Russell’s theory of truth, and hence, puts atomic facts at the center of Russell’s metaphysics.

Russell also at times suggests that analysis demonstrates that what we take to be essential or necessary properties of things and relations between things are the result of the logical forms the these things, properties and relations are logically constructed to have. This suggests that there are no such connections between simple entities, that all atomic propositions are independent of each other, and that all forms of necessity reduce to (formal) logical necessity. Some commentators interpret these theses to be central to Russell’s logical atomism, though explicit commitment to them is scant in his writings.

In what follows, various aspects of Russell’s logical atomism are discussed in greater detail. The next section discusses the origins of logical atomism in the break made by Russell and G.E. Moore from the tradition of British Idealism, and its development during the years in which Russell worked on Principia Mathematica. In section 3, we examine Russell’s notion of analysis as a philosophical method, and give various examples of analysis as Russell understood it. In section 4, we turn to a more detailed look at certain metaphysical aspects of Russell’s atomism, and in particular, the nature and classification of facts, as well certain points of controversy regarding his views. In particular, we’ll examine whether or not Russell’s logical atomism necessarily presupposes a fundamental realm of ultimate simples, and whether or not the atomic propositions of Russell’s atomism were understood as logically independent. The final section is dedicated to a discussion of the influence and reception of Russell’s logical atomism within the subsequent philosophical tradition.

2. Origins and Development of Russell’s Logical Atomism

2.1 The Break with Idealism and the Nature of Relations

In 1959, Russell himself dated his first acceptance of logical atomism to the years 1899–1900, when he and G.E. Moore rejected the main tenets of the dominant school of philosophy in Britain at the time (to which both had previously been adherents), the tradition of neo-Hegelian Idealism exemplified in works of F.H. Bradley and J.M.E. McTaggart, and adopted instead a fairly strong form of realism (MPD, 9). Of their break with idealism, Russell wrote that “Moore led the way, but I followed closely in his footsteps” (MPD, 42).

In 1899, Moore published a paper entitled “The Nature of Judgment”, in which he outlined his main reasons for accepting the new realism. It begins with a discussion of a distinction made by Bradley between different notions of idea. According to Bradley, the notion of idea understood as a mental state or mental occurrence is not the notion of “idea” relevant to logic or to truth understood as a relationship between our ideas and reality. Instead, the relevant notion of idea is that of a sign or symbol representing something other than itself, or an idea understood as possessing meaning. Bradley understood meaning in terms of “a part of the content … [of an idea] cut off, fixed by the mind, and considered apart from the existence of the sign” (Bradley 1883, 8). Moore agreed with Bradley that it is not the mental occurrence that is important to logic. However, with regard to Bradley’s second notion of “idea”, Moore accused Bradley of conflating the symbol with the symbolized, and rejected Bradley’s view that what is symbolized is itself a part of the idea and dependent upon it. Moore introduces the term “concept” for the meaning of a symbol; for Moore, what it is for different ideas to have a common content is for them to represent the same concept. However, the concept itself is independent of the ideas. When we make a judgment, typically, it is not our ideas, or parts of our ideas, which our judgment is about. According to Moore, if I make an assertion, what I assert is nothing about my ideas or my mental states, but a certain “connexion of concepts”.

Moore went on to introduce the term “proposition” for complexes of concepts such as that which would be involved in a belief or judgment. While propositions represent the content of judgments, according to Moore, they and their constituents are entirely independent from the judging mind. Some propositions are true, some are not. For Moore, however, truth is not a correspondence relationship between propositions and reality, as there is no difference between a proposition—understood as a mind-independent complex—and that which would make it true (Moore 1899, 5; Moore 1901). The facts of the world then consist of true propositions, themselves understood as complexes of concepts. According to Moore, something “becomes intelligible first when it is analyzed into its constituent concepts” (Moore 1899, 8). “The Nature of Judgment” had a profound influence on Russell, who later heralded it as the first account of the “new philosophy” to which he and Moore subscribed (MPD, 42).

For his own part, Russell often described his dissatisfaction with the dominant Idealist (and largely Monist) tradition as primarily having to do with the nature and existence of relations. In particular, Russell took issue with the claim found in Bradley and others, that the notion of a fundamental relation between two distinct entities is incoherent. Russell diagnosed this belief as stemming from a widespread logical doctrine to the effect that every proposition is logically of subject-predicate form. Russell was an ardent opponent of a position known as the “doctrine of internal relations”, which Russell stated as the view that “every relation is grounded in the natures of the related terms” (MTT, 139). Perhaps most charitably interpreted (for other interpretations considered by Russell, see BReal, 87), this amounts to the claim that a’s bearing relation R to b is always reducible to properties held by a and b individually, or to a property held by the complex formed of a and b.

In the period leading up to his own abandonment of idealism, Russell was already pursuing a research program involving the foundations of arithmetic (see, e.g., AMR). This work, along with his earlier work on the foundations of geometry (see EFG), had convinced him of the importance of relations for mathematics. However, he found that one category of relations, viz., asymmetrical transitive relations, resisted any such reduction to the properties of the relata or the whole formed of them. These relations are especially important in mathematics, as they are the sort that generates series. Consider the relation of being taller than, and consider the fact that Shaquille O’Neal is taller than Michael Jordan. It might be thought that this relation between O’Neal and Jordan can be reduced to properties of each: O’Neal has the property of being 7′2″ tall, and Jordan has the property of being 6′6″ tall, and the taller than relation in this case is reducible to their possession of these properties. The problem, according to Russell, is that for this reduction to hold, there must be a certain relation between the properties themselves. This relation would account for the ordering of the various height properties, putting the property of being-6′8″-tall in between that of being-7′2″-tall and that of being-6′6″-tall. This relation among the properties would itself be an asymmetrical and transitive relation, and so the analysis has not rid us of the need for taking relations as ultimate. Another hypothesis would be that there is such an entity as the whole composed of O’Neal and Jordan, and that the relation between the two men is reducible to some property of this whole. Russell’s complaint was that since the whole composed of O’Neal and Jordan is the same as the whole composed of Jordan and O’Neal, this approach has no way to explain what the difference would be between O’Neal’s being taller than Jordan and Jordan’s being taller than O’Neal, as both would seem to be reduced to the same composite entity bearing the same quality (see POM, 221–26).

Russell’s rejection of the doctrine of internal relations is very important for understanding the development of his atomistic doctrines in more than one respect. Certain advocates of the claim that a relation must always be grounded in the “nature” of its relata hold that in virtue of a relating to b, a must have a complex nature that includes its relatedness to b. Since every entity presumably bears some relation to any other, the “nature” of any entity could arguably be described as having the same complexity as the universe as a whole (if indeed, it even makes sense on such a picture to divide the world into distinct entities at all, as many denied). Moreover, according to some within this tradition, when we consider a, obviously we do not consider all its relations to every entity, and hence grasp a in a way that falsifies the whole of what a is. This led some to the claim that “analysis is falsification”, and even to hold that when we judge that a is the father of b, and judge that a is the son of c, the a in the first judgment is not strictly speaking the same a as involved in the second judgment; instead, in the first we deal only with a-quâ-father-of-b in the first, and a-quâ-son-of-c in the second (cf. BReal, 89; MTT, 140).

In contradistinction to these views, Russell adopted what he called “the doctrine of external relations”, which he claimed “may be expressed by saying that (1) relatedness does not imply any corresponding complexity in the relata; (2) any given entity is a constituent of many different complexes” (BReal, 87). This position on relations allowed Russell to adopt a pluralist philosophy in which the world is conceived as composed of many distinct, independent entities, each of which can be considered in isolation from its relations to other things, or its relation to the mind. In 1911 Russell claimed that this doctrine was the “fundamental doctrine” of his realistic position (BReal, 87; cf. RA, 92; POM, 226), and it represents perhaps the most important turning point in the development of his logical atomism.

2.2 Propositions in The Principles of Mathematics

Russell’s first published account of his newfound realism came in the 1903 classic The Principles of Mathematics (POM). Part I of POM is dedicated largely to a philosophical inquiry into the nature of propositions. Russell took over from Moore the conception of propositions as mind-independent complexes; a true proposition was then simply identified by Russell with a fact (cf. MTCA, 75–76). However, Moore’s characterization of a proposition as a complex of concepts was largely in keeping with traditional Aristotelian logic in which all judgments were thought to involve a subject concept, copula and predicate concept. Russell, owing in part to his own views on relations, and in part from his adopting certain doctrines stemming from Peano’s symbolic logic, sought to refine and improve upon this characterization.

In the terminology introduced in POM, constituents of a proposition occur either “as term” or “as concept”. An entity occurs “as term” when it can be replaced by any other entity and the result would still be a proposition, and when it is one of the subjects of the proposition, i.e., something the proposition is “about”. An entity occurs as concept when it occurs predicatively, i.e., only as part of the assertion made about the things occurring as term. In the proposition Socrates is human, the person Socrates (the man himself) occurs as term, but humanity occurs as concept. In the proposition Callisto orbits Jupiter, Callisto (the moon itself) and Jupiter (the planet) occur as term, and the relation of orbiting occurs as concept. Russell used the word “concept” for all those entities capable of occurring as concept—chiefly relations and other universals—and the word “thing” for those entities such as Socrates, Callisto and Jupiter, that can only occur as term. While Russell thought that only certain entities were capable of occurring as concept, at the time, he believed that every entity was capable of occurring as term in a proposition. In the proposition Wisdom is a virtue, the concept wisdom occurs as term. His argument that this held generally was that if there were some entity, E, that could not occur as term, there would have to be a fact, i.e., a true proposition, to this effect. However, in the proposition E cannot occur as term in a proposition, E occurs as term (POM, 44–45).

Russell’s 1903 account of propositions as complexes of entities was in many ways in keeping with his views as the nature of complexes and facts during the core logical atomist period of 1911–1925. In particular, at both stages he would regard the simple truth that an individual a stands in the simple relation R to an individual b as a complex consisting of the individuals a and b and the relation R. However, there are a number of positions Russell held in 1903 that were abandoned in this later period; some of the more important were these: (1) in 1903, Russell was committed to a special kind of propositional constituent called a “denoting concept”, involved in descriptive and quantified propositions; (2) in 1903, Russell believed that there was such a complex, i.e., a proposition, consisting of a, b and R even when it is not true that a bears relation R to b, and (3) in 1903, Russell believed in the reality of classes, understood as aggregate objects, which could be constituents of propositions. In each case, it is worth, at least briefly, discussing Russell’s change of heart.

2.3 The Theory of Descriptions

In POM, Russell expressed the view that grammar is a useful guide in understanding the make-up of a proposition, and even that in many cases, the make-up of a proposition corresponding to a sentence can be understood by determining, for each word of the sentence, what entity in the proposition is meant by the word (POM, 46). Perhaps in part because such phrases as “all dogs”, “some numbers” and “the queen” appear as a grammatical unit, Russell came to the conclusion that they made a unified contribution to the corresponding proposition. Because Russell believed it impossible for a finite mind to grasp a proposition of infinite complexity, however, Russell rejected a view according to which the (false) proposition designated by

  1. All numbers are odd.

actually contains all numbers (POM, 145). Similarly, although Russell admitted that such a proposition as (1) is equivalent to a formal implication, i.e., a quantified conditional of the form:

  1. (x)(x is a number ⊃ x is odd)

Russell held that they are nevertheless distinct propositions (POM, 74). This was perhaps in part due to the difference in grammatical structure, and perhaps also because the former appears only to be about numbers, whereas the latter is about all things, whether numbers or not. Instead, Russell thought that the proposition corresponding to (1) contains as a constituent the denoting concept all numbers. As Russell explained them, when denoting concepts occur in a proposition, the proposition is not about them but about other entities to which the denoting concepts bear a special relation. So when the denoting concept all numbers occurs in a proposition, the proposition is not about the denoting concept, but instead about 1 and 2 and 3, etc.

In 1905, Russell abandoned this theory in favor of his celebrated theory of definite and indefinite descriptions outlined in the paper “On Denoting”. What precisely lead Russell to become dissatisfied with his earlier theory, and the precise nature of the argument he gave against denoting concepts (and similar entities such as Frege’s senses), are a matter of great controversy, and have given rise to a large body of secondary literature. For present purposes, it can merely be noted that Russell professed an inability to understand the logical form of propositions about denoting concepts themselves, as in the claim that “The present King of France is a denoting concept” (cf. OD, 48–50). According to the new theory adopted, the proposition expressed by (1) was now identified with that expressed by a quantified conditional such as (2). Similarly, the proposition expressed by

  1. Some number is odd.

was identified with the existentially quantified conjunction represented by

  1. (∃x)(x is a number & x is odd)

Perhaps most notoriously, Russell argued that a proposition involving a definite description, e.g.,

  1. The King of France is bald.

was to be understood as having the structure of a certain kind of existential statement, in this case:

  1. (∃x)(x is King of France & (y)(y is King of France ⊃ x = y) & x is bald)

Russell cited in favor of these theories that they provided an elegant solution to certain philosophical puzzles. One involves how it is that a proposition can be meaningful even if it involves a description or other denoting phrase that does not denote anything. Given the above account of the structure of the proposition expressed by “the King of France is bald”, while France and the relation of being King of are constituents, there is no constituent directly corresponding to the whole phrase “the King of France”. The proposition in question is false, since there is no value of x which would make it true. One is not committed to a nonexistent entity such as the King of France simply in order to understand the make-up of the proposition. Secondly, this theory provides an answer to how it is that certain identity statements can be both true and informative. On the above theory, the proposition corresponding to:

  1. The author of Waverly = Scott

would be understood as having the following structure:

  1. (∃x)(x authored Waverly & (y)(y authored Waverly ⊃ x = y) & x = Scott)

If instead, the proposition corresponding to (7) was simply a complex consisting of the relation of identity, Scott, and the author of Waverly himself, since the author of Waverly simply is Scott, the proposition would be the same as the uninformative proposition Scott = Scott. By showing that the actual structure of the proposition is quite a bit different from what it appears from the grammar of the sentence “The author of Waverly = Scott”, Russell believed he had shown how it might be more informative than a trivial instance of the law of identity (OD, 51–54).

The theory of “On Denoting” did away with Russell’s temptation to regard grammar as a very reliable guide towards understanding the structure or make-up of a proposition. Especially important in this regard is the notion of an “incomplete symbol”, by which Russell understood an expression that can be meaningful in the context of its use within a sentence, but does not by itself correspond to a constituent or unified part of the corresponding proposition. According to the theory of “On Denoting”, phrases such as “the King of France”, or “the author of Waverly” were to be understood as “incomplete symbols” in this sense. The general notion of an “incomplete symbol” was applied by Russell in ways beyond the theory of descriptions, and perhaps most importantly, to his understanding of classes.

2.4 Classes, Propositions and Truth in Principia Mathematica

In POM, Russell had postulated two types of composite entities: unities and aggregates (POM, 140f). By a “unity” he meant a complex entity in which the constituent parts are arranged with a definite structure. A proposition was understood to be a unity in this sense. By an “aggregate”, he meant an entity such as a class whose identity conditions are governed entirely by what members or “parts” it has, and not by any relationships between the parts. By the time of the publication of the first edition of Principia Mathematica in 1910, Russell’s views about both types of composite entities had changed drastically.

Russell fundamentally conceived of a class as the extension of a concept, or as the extension of a propositional function; indeed, in POM he claims that “a class may be defined as all the terms satisfying some propositional function” (POM, 20). However, Russell was aware already at the time of POM that the supposition there is always a class, understood as an individual entity, as the extension of every propositional function, leads to certain logical paradoxes. Perhaps the most famous, now called “Russell’s paradox”, derived from consideration of the class, w, of all classes not members of themselves. The class w would be a member of itself if it satisfied its defining condition, i.e., if it were not a member of itself. Similarly, w would not be a member of itself if it did not satisfy its defining condition, i.e., if it were a member of itself. Hence, both the assumption that it is a member of itself, and the assumption that it is not, are impossible. Another related paradox Russell often discussed in this regard has since come to be called “Cantor’s paradox”. Cantor had proven that if a class had n members, that the number of sub-classes that can be taken from that class is 2n, and also that 2n > n, even when n is infinite. It follows from this that the number of subclasses of the class of all individuals, (i.e., the number of different classes of individuals) is greater than the number of individuals. Russell took this as strong evidence that a class of individuals could not itself be considered an individual. Likewise, the number of subclasses of the class of all classes is greater than the number of members in the class of all classes. This Russell took to be evidence that there is some ambiguity in the notion of a “class” so that the subclasses of the class of “all classes” would not themselves be among its members, as it would seem.

Russell spent the years between 1902 and 1910 searching for a philosophically motivated solution to such paradoxes. He tried solutions of various sorts. However, in late 1905, after the discovery of the theory of descriptions, he became convinced that an expression for a class is an “incomplete symbol”, i.e., that while such an expression can occur as part of a meaningful sentence, it should not be regarded as representing a single entity in the corresponding proposition. Russell dubbed this approach the “no classes” theory of classes (see e.g., TNOT, 145), because, while it allows discourse about classes to be meaningful, it does not posit classes as among the fundamental ontological furniture of the world. The precise nature of Russell’s “no classes” theory underwent significant changes between 1905 and 1910. However, in the version adopted in the first edition of Principia Mathematica, Russell believed that a statement apparently about a class could always be reconstructed, using higher-order quantification, in terms of a statement involving its defining propositional function. Russell believed that whenever a class term of the form “{zz}” appeared in some sentence, the sentence as a whole could be regarded as defined as follows (cf. PM, 188):

f({zz})   =df   (∃φ)((x)(φ!x ≡ ψx) & f(φ))

The above view can be paraphrased, somewhat crudely, as the claim that any truth seemingly about a class can be reduced to a claim about some or all of its members. For example, it follows from this contextual definition of class terms that the statement to the effect that one class A is a subset of another class B is equivalent to the claim that whatever satisfies the defining propositional function of A also satisfies the defining propositional function of B. Russell also sometimes described this as the view that classes are “logical constructions”, not part of the “real world”, but only the world of logic. Another way Russell expressed himself is by saying that a class is a “logical fiction”. While it may seem that a class term is representative of an entity, according to Russell, class terms are meaningful in a different way. Classes are not among the basic stuff of the world; yet it is possible to make use of class terms in significant speech, as if there were such things as classes. A class is thus portrayed by Russell as a mere façon de parler, or convenient way of speaking about all or some of the entities satisfying some propositional function.

During the period in which Russell was working on Principia Mathematica, most likely in 1907, Russell also radically revised his former realism about propositions understood as mind independent complexes. The motivations for the change are a matter of some controversy, but there are at least two possible sources. The first is that in addition to the logical paradoxes concerning the existence of classes, Russell was aware of certain paradoxes stemming from the assumption that propositions could be understood as individual entities. One such paradox was discussed already in Appendix B of POM (527–28). By Cantor’s theorem, there must be more classes of propositions than propositions. However, for every class of propositions, m, it is possible to generate a distinct proposition, such as the proposition that every proposition in m is true, in violation of Cantor’s theorem. Unlike the other paradoxes mentioned above, a version of this paradox can be reformulated even if talk of classes is replaced by talk of their defining propositional functions. Russell was also aware of certain contingent paradoxes involving propositions, such as the Liar paradox formulated involving a person S, whose only assertion at time t is the proposition All propositions asserted by S at time t are false. Given the success of the rejection of classes as ultimate entities in resolving the paradoxes of classes, Russell was motivated to see if a similar solution to these paradoxes could be had by rejecting propositions as singular entities.

Another set of considerations pushing Russell towards the rejection of his former view of propositions is more straightforwardly metaphysical. According to his earlier view, and that of Moore, a proposition was understood as a mind independent complex. The constituents of the complex are the actual entities involved, and hence, as we have seen, when a proposition is true, it is the same entity as a fact or state of affairs. However, because some propositions are false, this view of propositions posits objective falsehoods. The false proposition that Venus orbits Neptune is thought to be a complex containing Venus and Neptune the planets, as well as the relation of orbiting, with the relation occurring as a relation, i.e., as relating Venus to Neptune. However, it seems natural to suppose that the relation of orbiting could only unite Venus and Neptune into a complex, if in fact, Venus orbits Neptune. Hence, the presence of such objective falsehoods is itself out of sorts with common sense. Worse, as Russell explained, positing the existence of objective falsehoods in addition to objective truths makes the difference between “truth” and “falsehood” inexplicable, as both become irreducible properties of propositions, and we are left without an explanation for the privileged metaphysical status of truth over falsehood (see, e.g., NTF, 152).

Whatever his primary motivation, Russell abandoned any commitment to objective falsehoods, and restructured his ontology of facts, and adopted a new correspondence theory of truth. In the terminology of the new theory, the word “proposition” was used not for an objective metaphysical complex, but simply for an interpreted declarative sentence, an item of language. Propositions are thought to be true or false depending on their correspondence, or lack thereof, with facts.

In the Introduction to Principia Mathematica, as part of his explanation of ramified type-theory, Russell described various notions of truth applicable to different types of propositions of different complexity. The simplest propositions in the language of Principia Mathematica are what Russell there called “elementary propositions”, which take forms such as “a has quality q”, “a has relation [in intension] R to b”, or “a and b and c stand in relation S” (PM, 43–44). Such propositions consist of a simple predicate, representing either a quality or a relation, and a number of proper names. According to Russell, such a proposition is true when there is a corresponding fact or complex, composed of the entities named by the predicate and proper names related to each other in the appropriate way. E.g., the proposition “a has relation R to b” is true if there exists a corresponding complex in which the entity a is related by the relation R to the entity b. If there is no corresponding complex, then the proposition is false.

Russell dubbed the notion of truth applicable to elementary propositions “first truth”. This notion of truth serves as the ground for a hierarchy of different notions of truth applicable to different types of propositions depending on their complexity. A proposition such as “(x)(x has quality q)” which involves a first-order quantifier, has (or lacks) “second truth” depending on whether its instances have “first truth”. In this case, “(x)(x has quality q)” would be true if every proposition got by replacing the “x” in “x has quality q” with the proper name of an individual has “first truth” (PM, 42). A proposition involving the simplest kind of second-order quantifier, i.e., a quantifier using a variable for “predicative” propositional functions of the lowest type, would have or lack “third truth” depending on whether its allowable substitution instances have second (or lower) truth. Because any statement apparently about a class of individuals involves this sort of higher-order quantification, the truth or falsity of such a proposition will ultimately depend on the truth or falsity of various elementary propositions about its members.

Although Russell did not use the phrase “logical atomism” in the Introduction to Principia Mathematica, in many ways it represents the first work of Russell’s atomist period. Russell there explicitly endorsed the view that the “universe consists of objects having various qualities and standing in various relations” (PM, 43). Propositions that assert that an object has a quality, or that multiple objects stand in a certain relation, were given a privileged place in the theory, and explanation was given as to how more complicated truths, including truths about classes, depend on the truth of such simple propositions. Russell’s work over the next two decades consisted largely in refining and expanding upon this picture of the world.

3. Russell’s Philosophical Method and the Notion of Analysis

Although Russell changed his mind on a great number of philosophical issues throughout his career, one of the most stable elements in his views is the endorsement of a certain methodology for approaching philosophy. Indeed, it could be argued to be the most continuous and unifying feature of Russell’s philosophical work (e.g., see Hager 1994). Russell employed the methodology self-consciously, and gave only slightly differing descriptions of this methodology in works throughout his career (see, esp., EFG, 14–15; POM, 1–2, 129–30; RMDP, 272–74; PM, 59; IPL, 284–85; TK, 33, 158–59; OKEW, 144–45; PLA, 178–82, 270–71; IMP, 1–2; LA, 324–36, 341; RTC, 687; HWP, 788–89; HK, 257–59; MPD, 98–99, 162–163). Understanding this methodology is particularly important for understanding his logical atomism, as well as what he meant by “analysis”.

The methodology consists of a two phase process. The first phase is dubbed the “analytic” phase (although it should be noted that sometimes Russell used the word “analysis” for the whole procedure). One begins with a certain theory, doctrine or collection of beliefs which is taken to be more or less correct, but is taken to be in certain regards vague, imprecise, disunified, overly complex or in some other way confused or puzzling. The aim in the first phase is to work backwards from these beliefs, taken as a kind of “data”, to a certain minimal stock of undefined concepts and general principles which might be thought to underlie the original body of knowledge. The second phase, which Russell described as the “constructive” or “synthetic” phase, consists in rebuilding or reconstructing the original body of knowledge in terms of the results of the first phase. More specifically, in the synthetic phase, one defines those elements of the original conceptual framework and vocabulary of the discipline in terms of the “minimum vocabulary” identified in the first phrase, and derives or deduces the main tenets of the original theory from the basic principles or general truths one arrives at after analysis.

As a result of such a process, the system of beliefs with which one began takes on a new form in which connections between various concepts it uses are made clear, the logical interrelations between various theses of the theory are clarified, and vague or unclear aspects of the original terminology are eliminated. Moreover, the procedure also provides opportunities for the application of Occam’s razor, as it calls for the elimination of unnecessary or redundant aspects of a theory. Concepts or assumptions giving rise to paradoxes or conundrums or other problems within a theory are often found to be wholly unnecessary or capable of being supplanted by something less problematic. Another advantage is that the procedure arranges its results as a deductive system, and hence invites and facilitates the discovery of new results.

Examples of this general procedure can be found throughout Russell’s writings, and Russell also credits others with having achieved similar successes. Russell’s work in mathematical logic provides perhaps the most obvious example of his utilization of such a procedure. It is also an excellent example of Russell’s contention that analysis proceeds in stages. Russell saw his own work as the next step in a series of successes beginning with the work of Cantor, Dedekind and Weierstrass. Prior to the work of these figures, mathematics employed a number of concepts, number, magnitude, series, limit, infinity, function, continuity, etc., without a full understanding of the precise definition of each concept, nor how they related to one another. By introducing precise definitions of such notions, these thinkers exposed ambiguities (e.g., such as with the word “infinite”), revealed interrelations between certain of them, and eliminated dubious notions that had previously caused confusion and paradoxes (such as those involved with the notion of an “infinitesimal”). Russell saw the next step forward in the analysis of mathematics in the work of Peano and his associates, who not only attempted to explain how many mathematical notions could be “arithmetized”, i.e., defined and proven in terms of arithmetic, but had also identified, in the case of arithmetic, three basic concepts (zero, successor, and natural number) and five basic principles (the so-called “Peano axioms”), from which the rest of arithmetic was thought to be derivable.

Russell described the next advance as taking place in the work of Frege. According to the conception of number found in Frege’s Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, a number can be regarded as an equivalence class consisting of those classes whose members can be put in 1-1 correspondence with any other member of the class. According to Russell, this conception allowed the primitives of Peano’s analysis to be defined fully in terms of the notion of a class, along with other logical notions such as identity, quantification, negation and the conditional. Similarly, Frege’s work showed how the basic principles of Peano’s analysis could be derived from logical axioms alone. However, Frege’s analysis was not in all ways successful, as the notion of a class or the extension of a concept which Frege included as a logically primitive notion lead to certain contradictions. In this regard, Russell saw his own analysis of mathematics (largely developed independently from Frege) as an improvement, with its more austere analysis that eliminates even the notion of a class as a primitive idea (see the discussion of classes in Section 2.4 above), and thereby eliminates the contradictions (see, e.g., RMDP, 276–81; LA, 325–27).

It was clearly a part of Russell’s view that in conducting an analysis of a domain such as mathematics, and reducing its primitive conceptual apparatus and unproven premises to a minimum, one is not merely reducing the vocabulary of a certain theory, but also showing a way of reducing the metaphysical commitments of the theory. In first showing that numbers such as 1, 2, etc., could be defined in terms of classes of like cardinality, and then showing how apparent discourse about “classes” could be replaced by higher-order quantification, Russell made it possible to see how it is that there could be truths of arithmetic without presupposing that the numbers constitute a special category of abstract entity. Numbers are placed in the category of “logical fictions” or “logical constructions” along with all other classes.

Russell’s work from the period after the publication of Principia Mathematica of 1910 shows applications of this general philosophical approach to non-mathematical domains. In particular, his work over the next two decades shows concern with the attempt to provide analyses of the notions of knowledge, space, time, experience, matter and causation. When Russell applied his analytic methodology to sciences such as physics, again the goal was to arrive at a “minimum vocabulary” required for the science in question, as well as a set of basic premises and general truths from which the rest of the science can be derived. We cannot delve into all the details of Russell’s evolving analyses here. However, according to the views developed by Russell in the mid-1910s, many of the fundamental notions in physics were thought to be analyzable in terms of particular sensations: i.e., bits of color, auditory notes, or other simple parts of sensation, and their qualities and relations. Russell called such sensations, when actually experienced, “sense”. In particular, Russell believed that the notion of a “physical thing” could be replaced, or analyzed in terms of, the notion of a series of classes of sensible particulars each bearing to one another certain relations of continuity, resemblance, and perhaps certain other relations relevant to the formulation of the laws of physics (OKEW, 86ff; RSDP, 114–15; UCM, 105). Other physical notions such as that of a point of space, or an instance of time, could be conceived in terms of classes of sensible particulars and their spatial and temporal relations (see TK, 77; OKEW, 91–99). Later, after abandoning the view that perception is fundamentally relational, and accepting a form of William James’s neutral monism, Russell similarly came to believe that the notion of a conscious mind could be analyzed in terms of various percepts, experiences and sensations related to each other by psychological laws (AMi chaps. 1, 5; OOP chap. 26; cf. PLA, 277ff). Hence, Russell came to the view that words as “point”, “matter”,“instant”, “mind”, and the like could be discarded from the minimum vocabulary needed for physics or psychology. Instead, such words could be systematically translated into a language only containing words representing certain qualities and relations between sensible particulars.

Throughout these analyses, Russell put into practice a slogan he stated as follows: “Wherever possible, logical constructions are to be substituted for inferred entities” (RSDP, 115; cf. LA, 326). Rival philosophies that postulate an ego or mind as an entity distinct from its mental states involve inferring the existence of an entity that cannot directly be found in experience. Something similar can be said about philosophies that take matter to be an entity distinct from sensible appearances, lying behind them and inferred from them. Combining Russell’s suggestions that talk of “minds” or “physical objects” is to be analyzed in terms of classes of sensible particulars with his general view that classes are “logical fictions”, results in the view that minds and physical objects too are “logical fictions”, or not parts of the basic building blocks of reality. Instead, all truths about such purported entities turn out instead to be analyzable as truths about sensible particulars and their relations to one another. This is in keeping with the general metaphysical outlook of logical atomism. We also have here a fairly severe application of Occam’s razor. The slogan was applied within his analyses in mathematics as well. Noting that sometimes a series of rational numbers converges towards a limit which is not itself specifiable as a rational, some philosophers of mathematics thought that one should postulate an irrational number as a limit. Russell claimed that rather than postulating entities in such a case, an irrational number should simply be defined as a class of rational numbers without a rational upper bound. Russell preferred to reconstruct talk of irrationals this way rather than infer or postulate the existence of a new species of mathematical entity not already known to exist, complaining that the method of “postulating” what we want has “the advantages of theft over honest toil” (IMP, 71).

In conducting an analysis of mathematics, or indeed, of any other domain of thought, Russell was clear that although the results of analysis can be regarded as logical premises from which the original body of knowledge can in principle be derived, epistemologically speaking, the pre-analyzed beliefs are more fundamental. For example, in mathematics, a belief such as “2 + 2 = 4” is epistemologically more certain, and psychologically easier to understand and accept, than many of the logical premises from which it is derived. Indeed, Russell believed that the results obtained through the process of analysis obtain their epistemic warrant inductively from the evident truth of their logical consequences (see, e.g., TK, 158–59). As Russell put it, “[t]he reason for accepting an axiom, as for accepting any other proposition, is always largely inductive, namely that many propositions which are nearly indubitable can be deduced from it, and that no equally plausible way is known by which these propositions could be true if the axiom were false, and nothing which is plausibly false can be deduced from it” (PM, 59; cf. RMDP, 282). It is perhaps for these reasons that Russell believed that the process of philosophical analysis should always begin with beliefs the truth of which are not in question, i.e., which are “nearly indubitable”.

When Russell spoke about the general philosophical methodology described here, he usually had in mind applying the process of analysis to an entire body of knowledge or set of data. In fact, Russell advocated usually to begin with the uncontroversial doctrine of a certain science, such as mathematics or physics, largely because he held that these theories are the most likely to be true, or at least nearly true, and hence make the most appropriate place to begin the process of analysis.

Russell did on occasion also speak of analyzing a particular proposition of ordinary life. One example he gave is “There are a number of people in this room at this moment” (PLA, 179). In this case, the truth or falsity of this statement may seem obvious, but exactly what its truth would involve is rather obscure. The process of analysis in this case would consist in attempting to make the proposition clear by defining what it is for something to be a room, for something to be a person, for a person to be in a room, what a moment is, etc. In this case, it might seem that the ordinary language statement is sufficiently vague that there is likely no one precise or unambiguous proposition that represents the “correct analysis” of the proposition. In a sense this is right; however, this does not mean that analysis would be worthless. Russell was explicit that the goal of analysis is not to unpack what is psychologically intended by an ordinary statement such as the previous example, nor what a person would be thinking when he or she utters it. The point rather is simply to begin with a certain obvious, but rough and vague statement, and find a replacement for it in a more precise, unified, and minimal idiom (see, e.g., PLA, 180, 189).

On Russell’s view, vagueness is a feature of language, not of the world. In vague language, there is no one-one relation between propositions and facts, so that a vague statement could be considered verified by any one of a range of different facts (Vag, 217). However, in a properly analyzed proposition, there is a clear isomorphism between the structure of the proposition and the structure of the fact that would make it true (PLA, 197); hence a precise and analyzed proposition is capable of being true in one and only one way (Vag, 219). In analyzing a proposition such as “there are a number of people in this room at this moment”, one might obtain a precise statement which would require for its truth that there is a certain class of sensible particulars related to each other in a very definite way constituting the presence of a room, and certain other classes of sensible particulars related to each other in ways constituting people, and that the sensible particulars in the latter classes bear certain definite relations to those in the first class of particulars. Obviously, nothing like this is clearly in the mind of a person who would ordinarily use the original English expression. It is clear to see in this case that a very specific state of things is required for the truth of the analyzed proposition, and hence the truth of it will be far more doubtful than the truth of the vague assertion with which one began the process (PLA, 179–80). As Russell put the point, “the point of philosophy is to start with something so simple as not to seem worth stating, and to end with something so paradoxical that no one will believe it” (PLA, 193).

4. Ontological Aspects of Russell’s Logical Atomism

4.1 Russellian Facts: Atomic, Negative and General

As we have seen, the primary metaphysical thesis of Russell’s atomism is the view that the world consists of many independent entities that exhibit qualities and stand in relations to one another. On this picture, the simplest sort of fact or complex consists either of a single individual or particular bearing a quality, or a number of individuals bearing a relation to one another. Relations can be divided into various categories depending on how many relata they involve: a binary or dyadic relation involves two relata (e.g., a is to the left of b); a triadic relation (e.g., a is between b and c) involves three relata and so on. Russell at times used the word “relation” in a broad sense so as to include qualities, which could be considered as “monadic” relations, i.e., relations that only involve one relatum. The quality of being white, involved, e.g., in the fact that a is white, could then, in this broader sense, also be considered a relation.

At the time of Principia Mathematica, complexes in Russell’s ontology were all described as taking the form of n individuals entering into an n-adic relation. There he writes:

We will give the name of “a complex” to any such object as “a in the relation R to b” or “a having the quality q,” or “a and b and c standing in relation S.” Broadly speaking, a complex is anything which occurs in the universe and is not simple. (PM, 44)

As we have seen, at the time of writing Principia Mathematica, Russell believed that an elementary proposition consisting of a single predicate representing an n-place relation along with n names of individuals is true if it corresponds to a complex. An elementary proposition is false if there is no corresponding complex. Russell there gave no indication that he believed in any other sorts of complexes or truth-makers for any other sorts of propositions. Indeed, he held that a quantified proposition is made true not by a single complex, but by many, writing, “[i]f φx is an elementary judgment it is true when it points to a corresponding complex. But (x).φx does not point to a single corresponding complex: the corresponding complexes are as numerous as the possible values of x” (PM, 46).

Soon after Principia Mathematica, Russell became convinced that this picture was too simplistic. In the “Philosophy of Logical Atomism” lectures he described a more complicated framework. In the new terminology, the phrase “atomic fact” was introduced for the simplest kind of fact, i.e., one in which n particulars enter into an n-adic relation. He used the phrase “atomic proposition” for a proposition consisting only of a predicate for an n-place relation, along with n proper names for particulars. Hence, such propositions could take such forms as “F(a)”, “R(a, b)”, “S(a, b, c)” (cf. PM2, xv). An atomic proposition is true when it corresponds to a positive atomic fact. However, Russell no longer conceived of falsity as simply lacking a corresponding fact. Russell now believed that some facts are negative, i.e., that if “R(a, b)” is false, there is such a fact as a’s not bearing relation R to b. Since the proposition “R(a, b)” is affirmative, and the corresponding fact is negative, “R(a, b)” is false, and, equivalently, its negation “not-R(a, b)” is true. Russell’s rationale for endorsing negative facts was somewhat complicated (see, e.g., PLA, 211–15); however, one might object that his earlier view, according to which “R(a, b)” is false because it lacks a corresponding complex, is only plausible if you suppose that it must be a fact that there is not such a complex, and such a fact would itself seem to be a negative fact.

By 1918, Russell had also abandoned the view, held at least as late as 1911 (see RA, 94) that qualities and relations can occur in a complex as themselves the relata to another relation, as in “priority implies diversity”. Partly influenced by Wittgenstein, Russell now held the view that whenever a proposition apparently involves a relation or quality occurring as logical subject, it is capable of being analyzed into a form in which the relation or quality occurs predicatively. For example, “priority implies diversity” might be analyzed as “(x)(y)(x is prior to yx is not y)” (PLA, 205–06; for further discussion see Klement 2004).

Russell used the phrase “molecular proposition” for those propositions that are compounded using truth-function operators. Examples would include, “F(a) & R(a, b)” and “R(a, b) ∨ R(b, a)”. According to Russell, it is unnecessary to suppose that there exists any special sort of fact corresponding to molecular propositions; the truth-value of a molecular proposition could be entirely derivative on the truth-values of its constituents (PLA, 209). Hence, if “F(a) & R(a,b)” is true, ultimately it is made true by two atomic facts, the fact that a has property F and the fact that a bears R to b, and not by a single conjunctive fact.

However, by 1918, Russell’s attitude with regard to quantified propositions had changed. He no longer believed that the truth of a general proposition could be reduced simply to the facts or complexes making its instances true. Russell argued that the truth of the general proposition “(x).R(x, b)” could not consist entirely of the various atomic facts that a bears R to b, b bears R to b, c bears R to b, …. It also requires the truth that there are no other individuals besides a, b, c, etc., i.e., no other atomic facts of the relevant form. Hence, Russell concluded that there is a special category of facts he calls general facts that account for the truth of quantified propositions, although he admitted a certain amount of uncertainty as to their precise nature (PLA, 234–37). Likewise, Russell also posited existence facts, those facts corresponding to the truth of existentially quantified propositions, such as “(∃x)R(x, b)”. In the case of general and existence facts, Russell did not think it coherent to make distinctions between positive and negative facts. Indeed, a negative general fact could simply be described as an existence fact, and a negative existence fact could be described as a general fact. For example, the falsity of the general proposition “all birds fly” amounts to the fact that there exist birds that do not fly, and the falsity of the existential proposition “there are unicorns” amounts to the general fact that everything is not a unicorn. Obviously, however, the truth or falsity of a general or existence proposition is not wholly independent of its instances.

In addition to the sorts of facts discussed above, Russell raised the question as to whether a special sort of fact is required corresponding to propositions that report a belief, desire or other “propositional attitude”. Russell’s views on this matter changed over different periods, as his own views regarding the nature of judgment, belief and representation matured. Moreover, in some works he left it as an open question as to whether one need presuppose a distinct kind of logical form in these cases (e.g., PLA, 224–28; IMT, 256–57). At times, however, Russell believed that the fact that S believes that a bears R to b amounts to the holding of a multiple relation in which S, a, R and b are all relata (e.g. NTF, 155–56; TK, 144ff). At other points, he considered more complicated analyses in which beliefs amount to the possession of certain psychological states bearing causal or other relationships to the objects they are about, or the tendencies of believers to behave in certain ways (see, e.g., IMT, 182–83; HK, 144–48). Depending on how such phenomena are analyzed, it is certainly not clear that they require any new species of fact.

4.2 Logical Atoms and Simplicity

Russell’s use of the phrase “atomic fact”, and indeed the very title of “logical atomism” suggest that the constituents of atomic facts, the “logical atoms”, Russell spoke of, must be regarded as utterly simple and devoid of complexity. In that case, the particulars, qualities and relations making up atomic facts constitute the fundamental level of reality to which all other aspects of reality are ultimately reducible. This attitude is confirmed especially in Russell’s early logical atomist writings. For example, in “Analytic Realism”, Russell wrote:

… the philosophy I espouse is analytic, because it claims that one must discover the simple elements of which complexes are composed, and that complexes presuppose simples, whereas simples do not presuppose complexes …

I believe there are simple beings in the universe, and that these beings have relations in virtue of which complex beings are composed. Any time a bears the relation R to b there is a complex “a in relation R to b” …

You will note that this philosophy is the philosophy of logical atomism. Every simple entity is an atom. (RA, 94)

Elsewhere he spoke of “logical atomism” as involving the view that “you can get down in theory, if not in practice, to ultimate simples, out of which the world is built, and that those simples have a kind of reality not belonging to anything else” (PLA, 270). However, it has been questioned whether Russell had sufficient argumentation for thinking that there are such simple beings.

In the abstract, there are two sorts of arguments Russell could have given for the existence of simples, a priori arguments, or empirical arguments (cf. Pears 1985, 4ff). An a priori argument might proceed from the very understanding of complexity: what is complex presupposes parts. In 1924, Russell wrote, “I confess it seems obvious to me (as it did Leibniz) that what is complex must be composed of simples, though the number of constituents may be infinite” (LA, 337). However, if construed as an argument, this does not seem very convincing. It seems at least logically possible that while a complex may have parts, its parts might themselves be complex, and their parts might also be complex, and so on, ad infinitum. Indeed, Russell himself later came to admit that one could not know simply on the basis of something being complex that it must be composed of simples (MPD, 123).

Another sort of a priori argument might stem from conceptions regarding the nature of analysis. As analysis proceeds, one reaches more primitive notions, and it might be thought that the process must terminate at a stage in which the remaining vocabulary is indefinable because the entities involved are absolutely simple, and hence, cannot be construed as logical constructions built out of anything more primitive. Russell did at some points describe his logical atoms as reached at “the limit of analysis” (LA, 337) or “the final residue in analysis” (MPD, 164). However, even during the height of his logical atomist period, Russell admitted that it is possible that “analysis could go on forever”, and that complex things might be capable of analysis “ad infinitum” (PLA, 202).

Lastly, one might argue for simples as the basis of an empirical argument; i.e., one might claim to have completed the process of analysis and to have reduced all sorts of truths down to certain entities that can be known in some way or another to be simple. Russell is sometimes interpreted as having reasoned in this way. According to Russell’s well known “principle of acquaintance” in epistemology, in order to understand a proposition, one must be acquainted with the meaning of every simple symbol making it up (see, e.g., KAKD, 159). Russell at times suggested that we are only directly acquainted with sense data, and their properties and relations, and perhaps with our own selves (KAKD, 154ff). It might be thought that these entities are simple, and must constitute the terminus of analysis. However, Russell was explicit that sense data can themselves be complex, and that he knew of no reason to suppose that we cannot be acquainted with a complex without being aware that it is complex and without being acquainted with its constituents (KAKD, 153; cf. TK, 120). Moreover, Russell continued to use the label “logical atomism” to describe his philosophy long after his epistemology had ceased to center around the acquaintance relation. (For further argumentation on these points, see Elkind 2018.) Indeed, Russell eventually came to the conclusion that nothing can ever be known to be simple (MPD, 123).

While there is significant evidence that Russell did believe in the existence of simple entities in the early phases of his logical atomist period, it is possible that, uncharacteristically, he held this belief without argumentation. In admitting that it is possible that analysis could go on ad infinitum, Russell claimed that “I do not think it is true, but it is a thing that one might argue, certainly” (PLA, 202). In his 1924 piece “Logical Atomism”, Russell admitted that “by greater logical skill, the need for assuming them [i.e. simples] could be avoided”. This attitude may explain in part why it is that at the outset of his 1918 lectures on logical atomism, he claimed that “[t]he things I am going to say in these lectures are mainly my own personal opinions and I do not claim that they are more than that” (PLA, 178). It may have been that Russell was interested not so much in establishing definitively that there are any absolutely simple entities, but rather in combating the widespread arguments of others that the notion of a simple, independent entity is incoherent, and only the whole of the universe is fundamentally real. According to Russell, such attitudes are customarily traced to a wrong view about relations; in arguing for the doctrine of “external relations”, Russell was attempting simply to render a world of simple entities coherent again. Others had argued that possessing an inner complexity in the form of “nature” was needed to explain the essential properties of things or the necessary connections between them; as we shall see in Section 4.3 below, Russell believed that such apparent essential properties or necessary relations could typically be explained away.

As his career progressed, Russell became more and more prone to emphasize that what is important for his philosophical outlook is not absolute simplicity, but only relative simplicity. As early as 1922, in response to criticism about his notion of simplicity, Russell wrote:

As for “abstract analysis in search of the ‘simple’ and elemental”, that is a more important matter. To begin with, “simple” must not be taken in an absolute sense; “simpler” would be a better word. Of course, I should be glad to reach the absolutely simple, but I do not believe that that is within human capacity. What I do maintain is that, whenever anything is complex, out knowledge is advanced by discovering constituents of it, even if these constituents themselves are still complex. (SA, 40)

According to Russell, analysis proceeds in stages. When analysis shows the terminology and presuppositions of one stage of analysis to be definable, or logically constructible, in terms of simpler and more basic notions, this is a philosophical advance, even if these notions are themselves further analyzable. As Russell says, the only drawback to a language which is not yet fully analyzed is that in it, one cannot speak of anything more fundamental than those objects, properties or relations that are named at that level (e.g., LA, 337).

In a later work, Russell summarized his position as follows:

If the world is composed of simples—i.e., of things, qualities and relations that are devoid of structure—then not only all our knowledge but all that of Omniscience could be expressed by means of words denoting these simples. We could distinguish in the world a stuff (to use William James’s word) and a structure. The stuff would consist of all the simples denoted by names, while the structure would depend on relations and qualities for which our minimum vocabulary would have words.

This conception can be applied without assuming that there is anything absolutely simple. We can define as “relatively simple” whatever we do not know to be complex. Results obtained using the concept of “relative simplicity” will still be true if complexity is afterward found, provided we have abstained from asserting absolute simplicity (HK, 259)

Russell concluded that even if there are no ultimate simples, no fundamental layer of reality that analysis can in principle reach, this does not invalidate analysis as a philosophical procedure. Moreover, at a given stage of analysis, a certain class of sentences may still be labeled as “atomic”, even if the facts corresponding to them cannot be regarded as built of fundamental ontological atoms (MPD, 165). Russell concluded that “the whole question whether there are simples to be reached by analysis is unnecessary” (MPD, 123). From this vantage point, it might be argued that Russell’s “logical atomism” can be understood as first and foremost a commitment to analysis as a method coupled with a rejection of idealistic monism, rather than a pretense to have discovered the genuine metaphysical “atoms” making up the world of facts, or even the belief that such a discovery is possible (cf. Linsky 2003; Maclean 2018). Indeed, Russell continued to use the phrase “logical atomism” to describe his philosophy in later years of his career, during the period in which he stressed relative, not absolute simplicity (RTC, 717; MPD, 9).

4.3 Atomic Propositions, Logical Independence and Necessity

Another important issue often discussed in connection with logical atomism worth discussing in greater detail is the supposition that atomic propositions are logically independent of each other, or that the truth or falsity of any one atomic proposition does not logically imply or necessitate the truth or falsity of any other atomic proposition. This supposition is often taken to be a central aspect of the very notion of “logical atomism”, perhaps largely because it is found explicitly in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, almost certainly the most important account of a logical atomist philosophy found outside of Russell’s work. Wittgenstein claimed:

4.211   It is a sign of a proposition’s being elementary that there can be no elementary proposition contradicting it. (Wittgenstein 1922, 89)

5.134   From an elementary proposition no other can be inferred. (Wittgenstein 1922, 109)

The lack of any logical relations between atomic propositions goes hand in hand with a similar view about atomic facts; each atomic fact is metaphysically independent of every other, and any one could obtain or fail to obtain regardless of the obtaining (or not) of any other.

This position also pairs well with a broader view on the nature of necessity: that all necessity reduces to features of logical form. There is nothing in the form of one atomic statement that would allow us to infer (or reject) another. Hence, if all necessary connections are a result of logical form, atomic facts must be independent. If what appears to be a simple subject-predicate statement is necessary, it must in fact have a more complicated form when analyzed, so that the necessity of the statement is explained by its form. Similar remarks might be suggested what appear to be simple necessary relational statements. Wittgenstein, at least, explicitly endorsed the position that all necessity is logical necessity (6.37). Some commentators also take the thesis that all necessity is logical necessity (Landini 2010, chap. 4; 2018), or the thesis that de re modality is to be rejected in favor of de dicto necessity (Cocchiarella 2007, chap. 3), to be key to Russell’s logical atomism as well.

Russell’s precise positions on these matters is not as clear as one might hope and nowhere does he treat them at any length. The few pertinent remarks he does make are either somewhat ambivalent or seem to work against interpreting him as holding strong versions of these theses. For example, in 1914, in arguing that atomic facts are typically known by direct empirical means rather than by inference, he wrote that “[p]erhaps one atomic fact may sometimes be capable of being inferred from another, though I do not believe this to be the case; but in any case it cannot be inferred from premises no one of which is an atomic fact” (OKEW, 48). Here, Russell expressed doubt about the existence of any relations of logical dependence between atomic propositions, but the fact that he left it as an open possibility makes it seem that he would not consider it a defining feature of an atomic proposition that it must be independent from all others, or a central tenet of logical atomism generally that atomic facts are independent from one another. In 1936 he even went so far as to mock Wittgenstein’s claims that atomic facts are independent of one another, and that all deductions must be formal, by claiming that “no one in fact holds these views, and a philosophy which professes them cannot be wholly sincere” (LE, 319).

Nevertheless, there a number of aspects of Russell’s philosophical positions that lead to the conclusion that they cohere best with some doctrine about the independence of atomic facts or propositions. Russell did often speak about the constituents of atomic facts as independently existing entities. He writes for example that “each particular has its being independently of any other and does not depend upon anything else for the logical possibility of its existence” (PLA, 203). It is not altogether clear what Russell meant by speaking of particulars or entities as being logically independent. In contemporary parlance, typically, “logical independence” is used solely to speak of a relation between sentences, propositions, or perhaps facts or states of affairs. One possible interpretation would be to take Russell as holding that any atomic fact involving a certain group of particulars is logically independent of an atomic fact involving a distinct group of particulars, even if the two facts involve the same quality or relation (see, e.g., Bell and Demopoulos 1996, 118–19). This weakened version of the independence thesis even has certain attractions over the stronger principle endorsed by Wittgenstein. Most of the usual counterexamples given against the thesis that atomic facts or propositions are always independent involve simple properties that are thought to be exclusive. Consider, for example, what has come to be called the “color exclusion problem”. The propositions “a is red” and “a is blue” do not seem to be independent from one another: from the truth of one the falsity of the other can seemingly be inferred. However, the weakened version of the independence principle, on which only atomic facts involving different particulars are independent, does not entail that it is possible that “a is red” and “a is blue” may both be true.

It is likely that Russell’s contention that particulars are independent from one another was connected in his mind with his views on relations. In holding the view that relations among simple particulars are external, Russell saw himself as denying the view that when a bears R to b, there is some part of a’s “nature” as an entity that involves its relatedness to b. It might be thought that Russell’s doctrine of external relations committed him at least to certain principles regarding the modal status of atomic facts (if not the independence principle). According to certain ways of defining the phrase, what it means for a relation to be internal is that it is a relation that its relata could not fail to have; an external relation is one its relata could possibly not have. Russell then might be seen as committed to the view that atomic facts (all of which involve particulars standing in relations, in the broad sense above) are always contingent. While this does not directly bear on the question of their independence, it would nevertheless commit Russell to certain tenets regarding the modal features of atomic facts.

However, Russell himself warned against interpreting his position on relations this way, writing, “the doctrine that relations are ‘external’ … is not correctly expressed by saying that two terms which have a certain relation might not have had that relation. Such a statement introduces the notion of possibility and thus raises irrelevant difficulties” (BReal, 87). Complicating matters here are Russell’s own rather idiosyncratic and skeptical views about modal notions. Russell was dissatisfied with the prevailing conceptions of necessity and possibility among philosophers of his day, and argued instead against necessity (or possibility) as a fundamental or irreducible concept (see NP passim).

Despite Russell’s misgivings about modal notions, it is clear enough from Russell’s conception of logic that logical relations between propositions would always obtain in virtue of their form (IMP, 197–98; PLA, 237–39). Again, atomic propositions are of the simplest possible forms, and there is certainly nothing in their forms that would suggest any logical connection to, or incompatibility with, other atomic propositions.

Perhaps the most illuminating remarks to be found in Russell’s work that would lead one to expect complete logical independence among atomic propositions involve the claims he made about how it is that one recognizes a certain class of purported entities as “logical constructions”, and the recommendations he gives about analyzing propositions involving them. Russell writes:

When some set of supposed entities has neat logical properties, it turns out, in a great many instances, that the supposed entities can be replaced by purely logical constructions composed of entities which have not such neat properties. In that case, in interpreting a body of propositions hitherto believed to be about the supposed entities, we can substitute the logical structures without altering any detail of the body of propositions in question (LA, 326).

Russell did not define here what he means by “neat logical properties”, but it is possible to understand what he had in mind by way of the examples he gave. He cited as “neat properties” of material objects that it is impossible for two material objects to occupy the same place at the same time, and that it is impossible for one material object to occupy distinct places in space at the same time (LA, 329; cf. AMi, 264–65; AMa, 385). Consider then the propositions “O1 is located at p1 at t1”, and “O1 is located at p2 at t1” where “O1” is the name of a physical object, “p1” and “p2” represent distinct locations in space, and “t1” the name of a certain instant in time. Prior to analysis, such propositions appear to be logically incompatible atomic propositions. However, Russell explains that the logical necessities involved in cases such as these are due to the nature of material objects, points and instants as logical constructions. At a certain point in time, a physical object might be regarded as a class of sensible particulars bearing certain resemblance relations to one another occupying a continuous region of space. It is therefore impossible by definition for the same physical object to occupy wholly distinct locations at the same time. When analyzed, such propositions as “O1 is located at p1 at t1” are revealed as having a much more complicated logical form, and hence may have logical consequences not evident before analysis. We do not have here any reason to think that truly atomic propositions, those containing names of genuine particulars and their relations, are not always independent.

Russell strongly intimated that it is a part of the very nature of logical analysis that if our pre-analyzed understanding of a certain phenomenon involves the postulation of entities with certain structural or modal properties, one should seek to replace talk of such entities with logical constructions specifically constituted so as to have these features by definition (PLA, 272–79; LA, 326–29). A logical construction would typically be understood as a sort of class; since discourse about classes was regarded by Russell as a convenience, which would be eliminated in a fully analyzed language in favor of speaking of their defining properties and relations, by such a process Russell believed it is possible to replace commitment to entities having “neat logical properties” with commitment to those that do not possess such features. Russell’s work on mathematics provides us with what he would have taken as many examples of this phenomenon. If we take "3 > 2” and "3 < 2” at face-value as expressing simple dyadic relations between simple entities named “2” and “3”, then these appear to be two atomic propositions, one necessary, one impossible, which are not independent of each other. But after analysis, “2” and “3” are revealed not to be names at all, and the necessity, impossibility, and mutual incompatibility of these statements is rendered purely logical. Assuming that there is a final terminus of analysis in absolutely simple entities and fully atomic facts, one might suppose that here the logical necessities and relationships between them would have completely disappeared.

Russell later summarized the attitude of his logical atomist period by writing that “it seemed to result that none of the raw material of the world has smooth logical properties, but that whatever appears to have such properties is constructed artificially in order to have them” (IPOM, xi). While this is not exactly an endorsement of the claim that atomic facts are logically independent of one another, it is perhaps the closest sentiment one can find in his philosophy. It is again perhaps better understood as an endorsement of a methodological maxim. If a certain stage of analysis seems to portray entities as having “neat” logical properties, i.e., necessary features or relations not explained by logical form, this is a sign that more analysis is needed. Perhaps by analyzing the statements further, “busting open” the apparent terms for these things to reveal more complicated logical forms, what appear to be necessary connections between atomic facts will be shown actually to be logically necessary relationships between non-atomic facts owed to their logical forms (cf. Elkind forthcoming).

5. Influence and Reception

Russell’s logical atomism had significant influence on the development of philosophy, especially in the first half of the 20th century. Nowhere is Russell’s influence more clearly seen than in the work of his pupil Ludwig Wittgenstein. Wittgenstein’s Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus appeared in 1921; in it, Wittgenstein presented in some detail a logical atomist metaphysics. (It should be noted, however, that there is significant controversy over whether, in the end, Wittgenstein himself meant to endorse this metaphysics.) In the Tractatus, the world is described as consisting of facts. The simplest facts, which Wittgenstein called “Sachverhalte”, translated either as “states of affairs” or “atomic facts”, are thought of as conglomerations of objects combined with a definite structure. The objects making up these atomic basics were described as absolutely simple. Elementary propositions are propositions whose truth depends entirely on the presence of an atomic fact, and other propositions have a determinate and unique analysis in which they can be construed as built up from elementary propositions in truth-functional ways.

Partly owing to Wittgenstein’s influence, partly directly, Russell’s logical atomism had significant influence on the works of the logical positivist tradition, as exemplified in the works of Carnap, Waismann, Hempel and Ayer. This tradition usually disavowed metaphysical principles, but methodologically their philosophies owed much to Russell’s approach. Carnap, for example, described philosophy as taking the form of providing “the logical analysis of the language of science” (Carnap 1934, 61). This originally took the form of attempting to show that all meaningful scientific discourse could be analyzed in terms of logical combinations beginning with “protocol sentences”, or sentences directly confirmable or disconfirmable by experience. This notion of a “protocol sentence” in this tradition was originally modeled after Russellian and Wittgensteinian atomic propositions. The notion of a “logical construction” was also important for how such thinkers conceived of the nature of ordinary objects (see, e.g., Ayer 1952, chap. 3). The view that scientific language could readily and easily be analyzed directly in terms of observables gradually gave way to more holistic views, such as Quine’s (see, e.g. Quine 1951), in which it is claimed that it is only a body of scientific theories that can be compared to experience, and not isolated sentences. However, even in later works growing out of this tradition, the influence of Russell can be felt.

Besides positive influence, many trends in 20th century philosophy can be best understood largely as a reaction to Russell’s atomistic philosophy. Ironically, nowhere is this more true than in the later writings of Wittgenstein, especially his Philosophical Investigations (1953). Among other things, Wittgenstein there called into question whether a single, unequivocal notion of simplicity or a final state of analysis can be found (e.g., secs. 46–49, 91), and questioned the utility of an ideal language (sec. 81). Wittgenstein also called into question whether, in those cases in which analysis is possible, the results really give us what was meant at the start: “does someone who says that the broom is in the corner really mean: the broomstick is there, and so is the brush, and the broomstick is fixed in the brush?” (sec. 60). Much of the work of the so-called “ordinary language” school of philosophy centered in Oxford in the 1940s and 1950s can also been seen largely as a critical response to views of Russell (see, e.g., Austin 1962, Warnock 1951, Urmson 1956).

Nevertheless, despite the criticisms, many so-called “analytic” philosophers still believe that the notion of analysis has some role to play in philosophical methodology, though there seems to be no consensus regarding precisely what analysis consists in, and to what extent it leads reliably to metaphysically significant results. Debates regarding the nature of simple entities, their interrelations or dependencies between one another, and whether there are any such entities, are still alive and well. Russell’s rejection of idealistic monism, and his arguments in favor of a pluralistic universe, have gained almost universal acceptance, with a few exceptions. Abstracting away from Russell’s particular examples of proposed analyses in terms of sensible particulars, the general framework of Russell’s atomistic picture of the world, which consists of a plurality of entities that have qualities and enter into relations, remains one to which many contemporary philosophers are attracted.


Works By Russell

AMa The Analysis of Matter. London: Kegan Paul, 1927.
AMi The Analysis of Mind. London: Allen & Unwin, 1921.
AMR “An Analysis of Mathematical Reasoning” (1898), in CPBR2, pp. 162–242.
BReal “The Basis of Realism” (1911), in ROM pp. 87–90 and CPBR6 pp. 128–81.
CPBR2 Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, vol. 2, Philosophical Papers 1896–99, ed. N. Griffin and A. C. Lewis. London: Unwin Hyman, 1990.
CPBR3 Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, vol. 3, Toward the “Principles of Mathematics”, 1900–02, ed. G. H. Moore. London: Routledge, 1993.
CPBR4 Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, vol. 4, Foundations of Logic 1903–05, ed. A. Urquhart. London: Routledge, 1994.
CPBR6 Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, vol. 6, Logical and Philosophical Papers, 1909–1913, ed. J. G. Slater. London: Allen & Unwin, 1992.
CPBR8 Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, vol. 8, The Philosophy of Logical Atomism and Other Essays: 1914–1919, ed. J. G. Slater. London: Allen & Unwin, 1986.
CPBR9 Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, vol. 9, Essays on Language, Mind and Matter, 1919–26, ed. J. G. Slater. London: Unwin Hyman, 1988.
CPBR10 Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, vol. 10, A Fresh Look at Empiricism, 1927–42, ed. J. G. Slater. London: Routledge, 1996.
CPBR11 Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, vol. 11, Last Philosophical Testament, 1943–68, ed. J. G. Slater. London: Routledge, 1997.
EA Essays in Analysis, ed. D. Lackey. London: Allen & Unwin, 1973.
EFG An Essay in the Foundations of Geometry. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1897.
HK Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits. London: Allen & Unwin, 1948.
HWP A History of Western Philosophy. New York: Simon and Schuster, 1945
IMP Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy. London: Allen & Unwin, 1919.
IMT An Inquiry into Meaning and Truth. London: Allen & Unwin, 1940.
IPL “L’Importance philosophique de la logistique” (1911), translated as “The Philosophical Implications of Mathematical Logic,” in EA pp. 284–94 and CPBR6 pp. 33–40.
IPOM Introduction to The Principles of Mathematics, 2nd ed. London: W. W. Norton, 1937.
ITLP Introduction to L. Wittgenstein, Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus. London: Kegan Paul, 1922.
KAKD “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description” (1911), in ML pp. 152–167 and CPBR6 pp. 147–61.
LA “Logical Atomism” (1924), in LK pp. 323–43 and CPBR9 pp. 160–79.
LE “The Limits of Empiricism” (1936), in CPBR10 pp. 313–328.
LK Logic and Knowledge, ed. R.C. Marsh. London: Allen & Unwin, 1956.
ML Mysticism and Logic and Other Essays.  London: Longmans, 1918.
MPD My Philosophical Development. London: Allen & Unwin, 1959.
MTCA “Meinong’s Theory of Complexes and Assumptions” (1904), in EA pp. 21–76 and CPBR4 pp. 432–74.
MTT “The Monistic Theory of Truth” (1907), in PE pp. 131–46
NA “On the Nature of Acquaintance” (1914), in LK pp. 125–74.
NC “On the Notion of Cause” (1913), in ML pp. 132–151 and ROM pp. 163–182 and CPBR6 pp. 193–210.
NP “Necessity and Possibility” (1905), in CPBR3 pp. 508–20.
NTF “On the Nature of Truth and Falsehood” (1910), in PE pp. 147–59 and CPBR6 pp.116–24 .
OD “On Denoting” (1905), in LK pp. 41–56, EA pp. 103–119 and CPBR4 pp. 415–27.
OKEW Our Knowledge of the External World. London: Allen & Unwin, 1914.
OOP An Outline of Philosophy. London: Allen & Unwin, 1927.
OP “On Propositions: What They Are, and How They Mean” (1919), in LK pp. 285–320 and CPBR8 pp. 276–306.
PE Philosophical Essays. London: Longmans, 1910.
PLA “The Philosophy of Logical Atomism” (1918), in LK pp. 177–281 and CPBR8 pp. 157–244.
PM Principia Mathematica (with A. N. Whitehead). 3 vols. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1925–27 (First edition 1910–13).
PM2 Introduction to the Second Edition of Principia Mathematica. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1925.
POL A Critical Exposition of the Philosophy of Leibniz. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1900.
POM The Principles of Mathematics. London: W.W. Norton, 1937. (First edition 1903.)
POP The Problems of Philosophy. London: Williams and Norgate, 1912.
RA “Le Réalisme analytique” (1911), translated as “Analytic Realism,” in ROM pp. 91–96 and CPBR6 pp. 133–46
RMDP “The Regressive Method for Discovering the Premises of Mathematics” (1907), in EA pp. 272–83.
RMSL “On the Relation of Mathematics to Symbolic Logic” (1905), in EA pp. 260–71 and CPBR3 pp. 524–32.
ROM Russell on Metaphysics, ed. S. Mumford. London: Routledge, 2003.
RSDP “The Relation of Sense Data to Physics” (1914), in ML pp. 108–131 and CPBR8 pp. 3–26.
RTC “Reply to Criticisms” (1944), in P. A. Schlipp, ed. The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell. 3rd ed. 2 vols. New York: Harper in Row, 1963.
RUP “On the Relations of Universals and Particulars” (1911), in LK pp. 103–24, ROM pp. 123–43 and CPBR6 pp. 167–82.
SA “Dr. Schiller’s Analysis of The Analysis of Mind” (1922), in CPBR9 pp. 37–44.
SMP “On Scientific Method in Philosophy” (1914), in ML pp. 75–93.
TK Theory of Knowledge: The 1913 Manuscript, ed. E. R. Eames and K. Blackwell. London: Allen & Unwin, 1984.
TNOT “The Theory of Transfinite Numbers and Order Types” (1905), in EA pp. 135–64.
UCM “The Ultimate Constituents of Matter” (1915), in ML pp. 94–107 and CPBR8 pp. 75–86.
Vag “Vagueness” (1923), in ROM pp. 211–20 and CPBR9 pp. 147–54.

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