Meaning Holism

First published Mon Sep 15, 2014; substantive revision Tue Sep 29, 2020

The term “meaning holism” is generally applied to views that treat the meanings of all of the words in a language as interdependent. Holism draws much of its appeal from the way in which the usage of all our words seems interconnected, and runs into many problems because the resultant view can seem to conflict with (among other things) the intuition that the meanings of individual words are by and large shared and stable.

This entry will examine the strengths of the arguments for and against meaning holism.

1. General characterization of the view

The label “meaning holism” is generally applied to views that treat the meanings of all of the words in a language as interdependent. Meaning holism is typically contrasted with atomism about meaning (where each word’s meaning is independent of every other word’s meaning),[1] and molecularism about meaning (where a word’s meaning is tied to the meanings of some comparatively small subset of other words in the language—such as “kill” being tied to “cause” and “die” or “if … then…” being tied to “not” and “or”).

The view is often traced to Quine’s claims that “It is misleading to speak of the empirical content of an individual statement” (Quine 1951: 43), and that “the unit of empirical significance is the whole of science” (Quine 1951: 42), and one finds an even earlier statement of it in Hempel’s assertion that

the cognitive meaning of a statement in an empirical language is reflected in the totality of its logical relationships to all other statements in the language. (Hempel 1950: 59)

The interdependence associated with meaning holism is usually taken to follow from the meaning of each word (or sentence) being tied to its use, with this “use” typically being understood in terms of (1) all of the beliefs that could be expressed with (the words in) it (Bilgrami 1992; Davidson 1984), or (2) all of the inferences it is involved in (Block 1986, 1998; Harman 1973; Sellars 1974). The “belief-focused” and “inference-focused” ways of characterizing use-based holism are often treated as interchangeable,[2] and will be so treated here unless the distinction is particularly relevant in a context,[3] and so for our purposes here, meaning holism will be understood as the following general view:

The determinants of the meanings of our terms are interconnected in a way that leads a change in the meaning of any single term to produce a change in the meanings of each of the rest.

2. Arguments for Meaning Holism

2.1 Direct Arguments

Some arguments for meaning holism are “direct” in that they provide a substantive account of what meaning is, and then argue that if that is what meaning is, then meaning holism must follow.

For instance, meaning holism seems to result from radical use-theories[4] that attempt to identify meaning with some aspects of our use. Examples of this could be:

  • Theories that identify a sentence’s meaning with its method of verification. Verificationism, combined with some plausible assumptions about the holism of confirmation (Hempel 1950; Quine 1951), would seem to lead to meaning holism.
  • Theories that identify a word’s meaning with its inferential role. Which inferences one endorses with a word depends on what one means by one’s other words, and so (when combined with a rejection of the analytic/synthetic distinction—see below) the web quickly spreads to the entire language. (Block 1986, 1995; Brandom 1994; Field 1977; Harman 1973, 1993; Sellars 1954, 1974)
  • Theories that take what a person means by a word to be a functional property of that person, and assume that functional properties are individuated holistically. (Block 1998; Churchland 1979, 1986)
  • Theories that identify what a person means by a word with all of the beliefs that they would express using that word. (Bilgrami 1992, 1998)

Identifying meaning with the beliefs associated with a word or its inferential/functional role leads quickly to a type of meaning holism because of the way that the connections between such beliefs and inferences spread through a language. For instance, a word like “squirrel” might be inferentially connected to, say, “animal” which is in turn connected to “Koala” which is connected to “Australia”, and through similar chains, every word will be related inferentially to (and thus semantically entangled with) every other term in the language (especially when one considers connections like that between, say, “is a squirrel” and “is not a building” or any other thing we take squirrels not to be). Changing the meaning of one word thus changes the content of at least some of the inferences and beliefs that constitute the meaning of other terms in the language, and so a change in the meaning of one term quickly leads to a change in the meaning of the rest.

Such fine-grained conceptions of meaning are often motivated by the thought that only holistically structured meanings that were so tied to our beliefs or to the inferences that we were disposed to make could adequately serve the purposes of psychological explanation (either to deal with Frege-cases (Bilgrami 1992, 1998), to match the fact that understanding itself is holistic (Brandom 2011: 24; Heal 1994), or to just specify an internalistically determined “narrow” content (Block 1995)).[5] Most such arguments crucially rely on a sub-argument with something like the following general form:

  1. Some of an expression’s inferential properties must be part of its meaning.
  2. If some of an expression’s inferential properties are part of its meaning, then they all are.
  3. So, all of the inferential properties of an expression are part of its meaning.[6]

Semantic atomists usually deny the first premise of this argument, and semantic molecularists deny the second, and so “indirect” arguments for meaning holism usually take the form of arguing against atomism and molecularism.

2.2 Indirect Arguments

As stated above, indirect arguments try to bolster the case for meaning holism by undermining the case for its most obvious rivals. Molecularism about meaning may initially be the most appealing alternative to holism, and indeed, finding a principled way of trying to stop the “spreading effect” that seems to follow from taking inferences as relevant to meaning has long been one of the main objectives for molecularists about meaning (Devitt 1993, 1996; Dummett 1973). Molecularist theories typically try to keep the idea that meaning is tied to inferential role, but insist that only some of the inferences involved with a term constitute its meaning. However, drawing a clear line between the meaning-constitutive and non-meaning-constitutive inferences/beliefs seems to commit one to a version of the analytic/synthetic distinction that has been out of favor since Quine’s attack on it (Quine 1951),[7] and it is a familiar criticism of molecularism that it is an unstable resting point between atomism and holism, so that once you give up the former, it is difficult, if not impossible, to find compelling reasons not to move all the way to the latter (Fodor and Lepore 1992, but see Devitt 1996).

While there have been some attempts to make the distinction without buying into the analytic/synthetic distinction, or to argue that some version of the analytic/synthetic distinction isn’t that bad after all (Boghossian 1996, 2001, 2003; Devitt 1996; Horwich 2005; Pacherie 1994; Peacocke 1995, 1997; Russell 2008), such views remain controversial, and an obvious way to avoid the slippery slope into meaning holism is to not even make the first step towards molecularism and just keep one’s semantics atomistic (Fodor and Lepore 1992).

Atomistic semantic theories tend to be causal theories, and these tend to fall into two types: backward and forward looking. Holists (and other critics of atomism) typically argue that both types of causal account face serious difficulties if they are to remain atomistic.

Backward looking causal theories inspired by Kripke (1972) and Putnam (1975) might have initially seemed like candidates for an atomistic semantics. If what I meant by “cat” were determined by a causal chain leading back to the kind that prompted the first “that’s a cat” utterance, then one might think that the determinants of the meaning of each term could be distinct in the way that atomism requires. However, this initial attempt to restrict the determinants to a set of initial baptisms quickly ran aground on various counterexamples (such as the discussion of “Madagascar” (Evans 1973)), and the realization that some beliefs about sortals were needed (since the objects we would encounter at any “baptism” could be counted as instances of any number of kinds),[8] resulted in a the view sliding increasingly towards something that was at least molecularist in structure.[9]

Forward looking causal theories (which look ahead to the items that our concepts cause us to apply terms to rather than back to the ones that first caused us to form the concept), such as those presented by writers working in what can roughly be called “Information Semantics” (Dretske 1981; Fodor 1987, 1990; Stampe 1979), also attempt to develop semantic theories that are typically atomistic. The type of use that such atomistic theories must take meaning to be determined by are typically single applications like “cat” or at best “That’s a cat”, since any more complex examples of use (such as sentences like “cats are mammals” or “cats like milk”) run the risk of tying the meaning of “cat” to our use of other words in the language (and thus to the factors that determine their meaning). However, underwriting a distinction between correct and incorrect use while appealing only to such simple assertions has proved to be extremely difficult, and there is no consensus even among the proponents of such atomistic approaches about what is the most promising way to tackle the problem (see the discussion of “the disjunction problem” in Adams & Aizawa 2010). It has been tried in terms of optimal conditions (Papineau 1987), contexts where the term was learned (Dretske 1981) asymmetric causal dependence (Fodor 1990), but no such account has done a convincing job of preventing classifications that intuitively seem to be errors from being built into the purported extensions of our terms. Indeed, it has been argued that the checks on our dispositions that these atomistic theories need to get truth-conditions right must include the collateral commitments that speakers have in particular contexts, and that appealing to these will lead away from atomism (Boghossian 1989, 1990 (drawing on Kripke 1982); Jackman 2003b; Podlaskowski 2010).

Furthermore, both the backward and forward looking causal theories run into trouble when dealing with parts of the language other than the sorts of kind terms upon which their defenders typically focus. For instance, both sorts of causal theories seem ill-suited for dealing with parts of the language like “big”, “of”, “quickly”, or “unless”, none of which invite the same sort of isolated use that “red” or “cat” might.[10] The atomist might seem to require a different semantic theory for these others parts of speech, while the holist and molecularist can allow that the story about how every word acquires its value is uniform throughout the language.

The meaning holist thus can argue that both atomism and molecularism about meaning face serious problems.[11] However, unlike the direct arguments, which can establish meaning holism in virtue of giving a substantive account of meaning, indirect arguments typically just make holism seem more plausible by ruling out some of the major alternatives. In particular, meaning holism in the sense focused on here isn’t simply entailed by the denial of atomism and molecularism. The denial of atomism and molecularism leads to, at best, the following view:

The determinants of the meanings of our terms are interconnected in a way that leads a change in the determinants the meaning of any single term to produce a change in the determinants of the meanings of each of the rest.[12]

To get from this view to full-fledged meaning holism, namely,

The determinants of the meanings of our terms are interconnected in a way that leads a change in the meaning of any single term to produce a change in the meanings of each of the rest.

One needs to add the assumption that the function from the determinants of meaning to the meanings themselves is one-to-one (that is, not only does any change to a word’s meaning require some change in the determinants of its meaning, but also that any change to the determinants of a word’s meaning must produce a change to its meaning), and doing that will probably require something more like a “direct” argument, since it is unlikely that one could argue that the function from use to meaning had to be one-to-one without some sort of substantial account of how use determined meaning.

3. Problems for Meaning Holism

The most common objections to meaning holism relate to three topics: compositionality, instability and objectivity.

3.1 Compositionality

An initial problem with meaning holism is that it seems to conflict with the presumed compositionality of language (Fodor & Lepore 2002). Semantics is supposed to explain, among other things, how the meanings of sentences and complex terms are a function of the meanings of their parts, and meaning holism appears to stand in the way of such an approach. If meaning were, say, inferential role, then the inferential role of, for instance, “pet fish” would follow from the inferential roles of “pet” and “fish”, but while one can typically infer “weighs less than three ounces” from “is a pet fish”, this inference follows neither from “is a pet” or “is a fish” nor from a combination of those two sets of inferences. In short, they argue:

  1. Meanings are compositional
  2. but inferential roles (or any other holistic meaning) are not compositional.
  3. so meanings can’t be inferential roles. (Fodor and Lepore 1991)

Holists have a number of responses to this argument.

One of these is to insist (following Block 1993: 42) that as long as we can count “weighs less than three ounces if it’s a fish” as part of the inferential role of “it’s a pet” then inferential roles would compose in just the way that Fodor and Lepore deny. Block argues that any attempt to keep “weighs less than three ounces if it’s a fish” out of the inferential role of “pet” would already presuppose the denial of holism, so the compositionality argument isn’t an independent argument against holism since it already presupposes its denial.

Another is to follow Brandom in arguing that although, properly understood, a holistic semantics is “not compositional”, it can still be “fully recursive” (Brandom 2008: 135). That is to say, while Brandom denies that the meanings of complex expressions can be determined solely from the meanings of their components, he still insists that the meanings of expressions at one level of complexity are determined by the meanings of the expressions at the level below, and that this recursivity can be used to explain the facts about systematicity and language learning that compositionality is often invoked to explain.[13] Of course, one could still insist that a language whose semantics was actually compositional might be still more systematic, and easier to learn. However, the compositionality argument against meaning holism needs to show more than just that it would be easier for us if our semantics were compositional, it needs to show that our semantics must be compositional, and this assumption is what Brandom’s argument hopes to undercut.

Both of these responses suggest that while meaning holism may make giving a compositional/recursive semantics hard, it does not make it impossible. However, this leads to a related argument against meaning holism that stresses (with Stanley 2008) that the project of providing a semantics for our language within an atomistic framework (in which, say, the semantic value of “dog” is tied to the set of dogs), has been noticeably more productive than any attempt to do so within a molecular or holistic framework (where, say, the semantic value of “dog” is a set of inferences or some other property of the word’s use).[14] While it may be possible that a holistic inferential semantics may eventually catch up with the results achieved by more traditional atomistic truth-conditional semantics (see the discussion in and following Stanley 2006, Other Internet Resources), the results of the semantic programs thus far may suggest that we should favor meaning atomism over meaning holism unless given good reasons to do otherwise.

3.2 Instability

Worries about compositionality aside, most of the problems associated with meaning holism are tied to the way in which it seems to make meaning idiosyncratic and unstable.[15] If what one meant by a term were individuated in terms of, say, all of the beliefs or inferences that one was disposed to make with it, then two people (or one person at two times) would only mean the same thing by any of their terms if all of their beliefs or inferential dispositions were identical. In effect, meaning holism threatens to erase the distinction between change/differences of meaning and change/differences of belief, so that every time I change any one my beliefs, I change the meanings of all of my terms, and any time two people fail to share a single belief, the meaning of all their terms and the content of all of their beliefs must differ.[16]

3.2.1 Problems from Instability

Instability presents problems for the meaning holist in the following areas:

Change of Mind. I can’t, strictly speaking, change my mind about any particular proposition, since if I went from believing, say, “Dogs are good pets” to believing “Dogs are not good pets”, what I mean by “Dog” and “Pet” would have changed. As a result, there is no proposition that I previously thought to be true that I now treat as false. However, since the most natural way to make sense of changing one’s mind about something is in terms of changing the truth-value one assigns to a single proposition, the intuitive notion of change of mind seems lost. (Fodor and Lepore 2002)

Disagreement. In much the same way, it’s natural to think of disagreement in terms of two people assigning different truth values to the same proposition, but if meaning holism is true, no two people could disagree over a single proposition, since if they didn’t both accept a particular sentence, then they must differ in what they mean by it, in which case their differing attitudes don’t constitute a disagreement. (Fodor and Lepore 2002)[17]

Creative Inference. Creative inference also seems problematic for the meaning holist. One could rehearse the inferential relations between things one already believed, but one couldn’t validly draw new conclusions, since if the conclusion of the inference is something that one didn’t believe already, then the terms in that conclusion will mean something different than what the seemingly identical terms meant in the premises, making the inference invalid.[18] (The inference could, of course, later be recapitulated as a valid one, since at that point the meaning of the terms in the premises would have changed as well, but this is just to say that the recapitulation doesn’t capture the transitions that were actually going on when the inference was first taking place.)

Language Learning. Learning a language would be problematic, since it seems as if one couldn’t learn any part of a given language until one had mastered all of it. (Dummett 1973: 597–600, 1976: 44, 1991: 221, see also Bilgrami 1986, Dresner 2002, Jönsson 2014) Of course, one could argue that on this holistic view, there are no “languages” to learn, just a series of changing idiolects, and at any point in one’s acquisition period, one would have mastered some idiolect. However, this in turn leads to the following problem.

Communication. Strictly speaking, informative communication would be impossible. No one would mean the same thing by any of their terms unless they shared all the same beliefs, in which case, communication would be possible, but uninformative, and truly understanding the utterances of others would be impossible unless you already knew everything that they believed. (Fodor 1987; Fodor and Lepore 1992).

Psychological Explanation. No intentional laws or psychological generalizations would be possible, since no two subjects would, as a matter of fact, have beliefs with the same content. We assume that generalizations like “If someone is thirsty, and they believe that there is a glass of water in front of them, then (all else being equal), they will try to drink from it” are well supported, but this would require “believing that there is a glass of water in front of them” is an attitude that lots of people have, and for the meaning holist, there are, strictly speaking, no such shared attitudes. (Fodor, 1987; Fodor and Lepore 1992)[19]

The Incredulous Stare. Finally, there is the plain fact that most people take it to be “obvious” that there can be changes of belief without changes of meaning, and that when I come to believe that there are four elephants in the Seattle Zoo, I haven’t changed what I mean by “Elephant”. The incredulous stare is hardly a knockdown argument (especially in philosophy), but it suggests that meaning holism comes with a substantial conceptual cost, and so requires equally substantial benefits to compensate for it.

3.2.2 Coping with Instability

There are a number of ways that the meaning holist can attempt to answer the objection that the view erases the distinction between differences/change of meaning and differences/changes of belief. These include:

Biting the bullet. One could simply say that, in fact, there isn’t any real difference between change of meaning and change of belief and that we never really communicate, disagree, or change our mind, but it’s hard to imagine someone simply biting that bullet and leaving it at that. Nevertheless, some have endorsed a modified version of the above, arguing that, at least strictly speaking, we never communicate, disagree or change our mind, and then providing an explanation of why things might appear otherwise, and how loosely speaking we do manage to communicate, disagree, change our minds, etc. Which leads us to…

Similarity. Many holists have argued that while none of us ever mean precisely what our compatriots and former selves do by our terms, we can still explain communication, change of mind etc. in terms of the fact that the different things that we mean are still extremely similar, so while I don’t mean precisely what my wife means by “cat”, I still mean something extremely similar to what she does because we share most of our beliefs and inferences where that term is concerned. (For versions of something like this approach, see Harman 1973; Block 1986; Churchland 1998; Fultner 1998; Brandom 2007; Schroeder 2007; Jorgensen 2009; Rovane 2013, Dresner 2019; Pollock 2020).

However, even if such an appeal to similarity worked for the case above, there is the problem that for many terms, our total belief sets simply aren’t all that similar. After all, the similarity response presupposes that most of the beliefs and inferences associated with a particular word are shared, but even in a generous sense of sharing, one might think that the total belief set that I associate with my name for Omaha, a city which I’ve never visited, will not be even remotely similar to the belief set of someone who grew up there.

Furthermore, while the appeal to similarity is very natural, it can be hard to spell out in detail since the intuitive sense in which, say, my wife and I “share most of our beliefs and inferences” seems to presuppose just the sort of content identity that meaning holism makes problematic. One would like to say that I mean something similar to my wife by “cat” because, in spite of our differences, we both believe things like “cats make good pets”, “cats are mammals”, “cats are typically smaller than dogs”, etc. However, to say that we “share” these beliefs would be to assume that we mean the same thing by “pet”, “mammal” and “dog”, which is something that the meaning holist is committed to denying. Strictly speaking, for the meaning holist, I don’t share any beliefs and inferences with my compatriots and past selves, and so similarity can’t be explained in terms of shared beliefs and inferences (Fodor 1998; Fodor and Lepore 1992, 1999).

Of course there may be other ways to pin down similarity, and one of these can be seen to flow out from the approach found immediately below.

Narrow Content and Wide Content. Another way of making biting the bullet more palatable is by arguing that what we mean by any word involves two parts, a “wide” meaning that is understood in terms of something atomistic like reference, and a “narrow” meaning that is closer to something holistic like inferential role (Block 1986, 1993, 1995; Field 1977).

If meaning holism is true only of the “narrow” meaning used for psychological explanation (Block 1993), then communication, disagreement, change of mind etc. can be explained in terms of the “wide” truth-conditional meaning. In spite of our different narrow meanings, I can communicate with a compatriot because our sentences like, say, “Pork chops are generally better in Memphis than in Portland” will have the same wide truth conditions in spite of their having different narrow meanings. In much the same way, disagreement could be explained by the fact that a single sentence will have the same truth conditions for both me and my interlocutor (even though we each tie it to different narrow meanings), and so if I affirm it, and they deny it, then only one of us can be correct.

The “two factor” theory would also help support something like the similarity response mentioned above in that narrow meanings could be treated as similar if they embodied most of the “same” inferences where those inferences were themselves typed in terms of having the same wide content. This would allow one to say that the narrow meanings of “cat” between my wife and I are very similar, since most of our “cat”-beliefs have the same truth-conditions.[20]

Of course, appeals to narrow content are not uncontroversial. The notion seems more natural with belief content than linguistic meaning, and even for the former, there have been doubts raised about whether it really is a coherent notion of content at all (Bilgrami 1992; McDowell 1986). Further, even if one accepts that there are these two sorts of content, we are left with the question of what holds the two types of meaning together. As Fodor and Lepore put it, why couldn’t something have the same “narrow” meaning as “water” and at the same time refer to the number four? (Fodor and Lepore 1992: 170). This worry is most pronounced for theories that, unlike the more traditional Fregean account where the mode of presentation is expected to determine reference, follow those who “tend to suppose that a concept’s identification procedure has nothing to do with its reference” (Margolis & Laurence 1999: 72). Such psychological factors making up the narrow content would thus be “merely associated” with a wide content rather than helping determine it.[21]

Contextualism. Yet another way of dealing with the sort of instability associated with meaning holism is to appeal to context, rather than similarity, to ensure that communication, change of mind and the rest are possible. For instance, Bilgrami (1992) argues that critics of meaning holism fail to distinguish aggregate contents (which are tied to all of the agent’s beliefs) and local contents (which are only tied to those belief relevant in a particular communicative context). While meaning holism would have all the instability-related problems mentioned above at an aggregate level, at a local level (which is where communication and psychological explanation actually takes place), content identity can be preserved.[22] On such an account, only some of the beliefs/inferences associated with a particular word will be active in any particular context, and so two people who might (indeed, will inevitably) mean something different at an aggregate level (at which we consider all their beliefs) may still mean the same thing in any particular context, since the beliefs that they take to be relevant in that context could be identical. In effect, one has something that looks like a type of molecularist view in each context, but unlike the standard molecularist, who treats the meaning-constitutive beliefs/inference as invariant across contexts, the contextualist allows the relevant subset to change from situation to situation.

For instance, while the total set of beliefs associated with “sugar” varies greatly from person to person, if someone asks me whether I would like some sugar with my coffee, most of our idiosyncratic sugar-beliefs would be irrelevant, and in that context, only the beliefs that sugar is sweet, has a certain color, texture and taste will be active. Since those beliefs are probably shared, I am able to communicate with that person about sugar in that context even if we mean something different by the term at the “aggregate” level.

However, this presupposes a lot about the contexts involved, and the assumption that even within a particular context, two people would take the same beliefs/inferences to be relevant is not uncontroversial. Indeed, if I’m communicating novel information that my interlocutor doesn’t know, this might always entail that I start off meaning something different than they do (though they may come to share a meaning by accepting the claim). This worry would be even more pronounced when we try to move from communication to disagreement, where, by hypothesis, there is a contextually relevant sentence involving the words in question that my interlocutor and I don’t both accept. This problem could be avoided by insisting that the focus of a conversation not be included in the context, and that the local content simply be stipulated to only include what the two parties agree on (Bilgrami 1992: 146). However, such a restriction would seem to make the resulting contents less suitable for psychological explanation, since the behavior of the speakers involved in a disagreement would likely be sensitive to their opinions on the issue about which they disagree.[23]

Still, the appeal to context might be viewed as a supplement to, rather than alternative to, the similarity response. If the beliefs were restricted to those relevant in a particular context, then even if they aren’t identical, it’s quite likely that the belief sets will be similar even when, as in the case of “Omaha” above, the two speakers have very different total beliefs sets associated with the word. Context would thus make appeals to ubiquitous similarity more plausible, and similarity could be used as a back up for those contexts which fail to produce context-relative identity.

Anti-Individualism. As stated above, instability arises not from meaning holism per se, but from versions of meaning holism motivated by an identification of meaning with some aspect of use, and some of the problems relating to instability can be mitigated if the meaning holist loosens the connection between meaning and individual use. One natural way to do this is to take it to be the beliefs and inferences endorsed by a group rather than an individual that determine a word’s meaning (Brandom 1994, 2000). On such an account, two different individuals (or one individual at two times) could mean the same thing by a word even if they endorse different inferences provided that both were members of a single social group that collectively endorses a single set of inferences or beliefs. Disagreement, communication, inference, and change of mind would all thus seem initially less puzzling for the meaning holist if they happens to be an anti-individualist as well.

This sort of anti-individualism might seem independently motivated by the considerations raised in Tyler Burge’s “Individualism and the Mental”,[24] and it shares with Burge’s account the challenges of (1) determining just what beliefs or inferences are endorsed by a group or society (those of the majority, the experts, etc.) and (2) individuating the relevant groups themselves.

Furthermore, given that what is believed about anything even at a social level undoubtedly changes over time, and given the spreading effect endemic to meaning holism that leads a change in one element to ultimately produce changes in the rest, one might expect that most of our terms will end up changing their meaning each day even for the anti-individualist meaning holist. For instance, if we allow that, say, the experts determine what inferences or beliefs are tied to the meaning of any particular term, then any changes to their term-specific belief set will not only change the meaning of that term, but also cascade down through the language to ultimately affect every word just as it did in the individual case. Since some change in expert belief about something happens every day, one might think that we are still left in a state of comparative flux. Consequently, while the appeal to the social-determination of meaning allows for synchronic communication, disagreement, etc., the diachronic sense of all of these are still undermined (unless, of course, this appeal to anti-individualism is combined with some of the appeals to similarity, wide contents, or context discussed above).[25]

Finally, this sort of answer to instability worries would not be available to many meaning holists, who, like Block (1986, 1995), seem driven to meaning holism by an interest in supplying a semantics for an explicitly individualistic psychology.

Normativity. The anti-individualistic response presented above, like most holistic accounts of meaning, focuses on the inferences that speakers (or social groups) do make, rather than the ones that they should make. However, just as extensional accounts of meaning tie the meaning of a term to what we should apply it to, not what we simply do apply it to, one might think that the holist could take a similar normative approach from the inferential side. If one takes this more normative approach to the inferences involved, many of the instability-based worries disappear. The inferences I do make with the term, say, “gold” change over time and differ from those that my compatriots make, but the inferences I should make with the term are considerably more stable and shared. I may change what inferences I do make about gold’s atomic number, but the ones that I should make with respect to it are stable (Brandom 1994, 2000: 29).

There will, nevertheless, still be some instability even with this normative account if we merely identify the inferences we should make with all of the ones that are truth preserving.[26] For instance on such an account, while I should infer “is worth less per ounce than platinum” from “is gold”, if the price of gold were to go up enough, the validity of that inference would change. However, intuitively the meaning of “gold” should not be changing in a case like this. A significant change in gold’s price shouldn’t cause me to be unable to understand gold-utterances of people before the price went up, or view the meaning of “Susan loves gold” as opaque if I don’t know whether it was uttered before or after the price spike.[27] That said, if the holist is making an appeal to similarity and wide-contents as well, then an isolated sentence like that would not be much of a problem, since the vast majority of the inferences we should make with the term would still be both constant and shared.

Of course, like the anti-individualist response discussed above, the normative response won’t be available to those meaning holists who, like Block, motivate their holism in terms of a type of individualistic functionalist psychology.

3.3 “Analyticity” and Objectivity

A final group of objections to meaning holism stem from the assumption that theories that tie what we mean by a term to some of the beliefs or inferences associated with it can seem to make the all of the meaning-constitutive beliefs or inferences “true in virtue of meaning”, and thus in a sense “analytically true”.[28] The meaning molecularist’s claim that their proposed meaning-constitutive inferences need to be valid (say, if the meaning of “&” were identified with its elimination and introduction rules, then one would need to treat “\((A \ \&\ B) \rightarrow A\)” as true in virtue of meaning) isn’t entirely uncontroversial, but the assumption that meaning-constitutive inferences will be valid isn’t taken to be problematic even by the critics of meaning molecularism (who argue instead that particular candidates for meaning constitutive inferences can’t be accepted, since we can coherently doubt their validity (Burge 1986; Williamson 2003)). However, while the meaning molecularist can at least allow that we can make many mistakes, since most of our beliefs are not meaning constitutive, the meaning holist may seem to be committed to all of our beliefs being true, since all of them determine what we mean.[29] The issue isn’t so much that all such beliefs are true “in virtue of meaning”, but rather that they are all treated by the meaning holist as simply true at all. Whether the truth involved is analytic or not, it doesn’t seem like we should have to treat all of any speaker’s beliefs as true. There are a number of responses to this worry, all of which appeal to strategies already canvassed in describing the meaning holist’s response to worries about instability.

For instance, one way to cut worries about objectivity short is to appeal to the narrow/wide content distinction discussed in 3.2.2, and claim that the meanings for which meaning holism holds are not the sort that relate to truth. Block, in particular, has insisted that, since the contents for which meaning holism holds involve narrow meanings, the question of their truth doesn’t come up. The “narrow analog” of analyticity doesn’t produce analyticity in the traditional sense, and thus Block can reject what he calls “The Plausible Sounding Principle”, namely:

Inferences that are part of inferential roles must be regarded by the inferential role theorist as analytic. For these inferences are what are taken to constitute meaning, and inferences that constitute meaning are analytic. (Block 1993: 51)

Since “determinate meaning facts about narrow meaning do not engender analyticities” (Block 1993: 54), the analyticity worry won’t plague this sort of holist. Since narrow contents have no truth values, “and hence have no truth conditions”, they simply aren’t the type of thing that could be true in virtue of meaning, and thus “aren’t even the sort of things that can be analytic” (Block 1993: 61).

Another way for the meaning holist to mitigate worries about objectivity is to adopt a version of the “contextualist” approach also mentioned in 3.2.2. On that view, since only some of one’s beliefs are relevant to a term’s meaning in any context, one’s other beliefs can turn out to be false when evaluated from that context. However, while this would allow for some false beliefs, one might worry whether it goes far enough. Beliefs that speakers in a context didn’t agree on could turn out to be false, but other inferences, inferences that intuitively seem fallible, turn out to be effectively analytic within the relevant contexts. For instance if both my interlocutor and I believe “All sugar comes from sugarcane” in a context where that belief is relevant (we are, for instance, asked “Name a product that comes exclusively from a single type of plant”) it would seem as if my answer “sugar” would have to be correct on the contextualist version of meaning holism, which it doesn’t seem to be.[30]

The “anti-individualistic” and “normative” responses to instability discussed in 3.2.2 can also both do service in defending the meaning holist from worries about objectivity. The anti-individualist strategy would do a good job accounting for individual error, since individual inferences can be understood as mistaken in virtue of being out of line with the preferred social usage. Nevertheless, understanding how the preferred social usage (be it expert usage, majority usage, or something else) could be mistaken would still be a problem on such an account. The normative strategy, on the other hand, build’s a notion of objectivity directly into the use appealed to, and so seems best placed to respect the purported objectivity of our claims (the fact that the inferences that we should make couldn’t turn out to be mistaken on such an account doesn’t seem particularly troubling). However, as discussed in 3.2.2, both of the anti-individualistic and normative responses detach meaning from individual use in a way that many meaning holists would find unacceptable.

4. Conclusion

Meaning holism thus comes with a number of costs (particularly relating to instability and objectivity), and while there are a variety of strategies available to make these costs more bearable, no single approach to doing so seems problem-free. That said, these strategies can be complementary, and it may be the case that a combination of them can do the work in a way that no single one of them would be able to. In any case, being completely problem free is a very high bar to set for a philosophical theory, and meaning holists are free to argue not only that the benefits that come with their view outweigh the costs, but also that the atomistic and molecularist theories face equally severe problems of their own.


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Thanks to Jacob Beck, David Chalmers, Paul Horwich, Muhammad Ali Khalidi, Ernie Lepore, Robert Myers, Peter Pagin, Judy Pelham, Gurpreet Rattan, Claudine Verheggen, and a number of anonymous referees for comments on earlier drafts.

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