Notes to Theories of Meaning

1. For an illuminating discussion of the analogies between semantic rules and systems of etiquette, see McKeown-Green 2002.

2. This way of putting the point assumes that contents can have different references with respect to different times; this is a controversial assumption discussion of which would take us too far afield. (For an argument against this assumption, see Richard 1981.) Even if this assumption is false, an argument for double-indexing semantics parallel to the above could be constructed using changes in reference across worlds rather than across times.

3. According to the first sort of Russellian, we can’t adequately decide disputes about the semantics of names without also investigating the relationship between semantics and pragmatics; one of the important trends in recent semantics has been an increasing attempt to explain linguistic phenomena with an eye on both possible semantic and pragmatic explanations.

4. This is not to say that there is not controversy over the existence of these sorts of entities; there is. (See for discussion nominalism in metaphysics.) The point is just that many believe in the existence of entities of these kinds for reasons unconnected to the philosophy of language; these entities were not introduced to play the role of the contents of expressions.

5. See Grice 1957 and 1969.

6. This is most natural for views, like Millian-Russellian views, which make meaning closely related to the entity in the world for which the word stands.

7. Horwich (1998: 85–6) suggests that cases of this sort can be handled by adding to his account a clause which makes it sufficient to mean (for example) dog by “dog” that one be disposed to defer to experts whose use of the term is explained by the canonical basic acceptance regularity, so long as one’s use is “close enough” to theirs. But it is hard to see why the absence of such a disposition, perhaps out of simple obstinacy or distaste for experts, should disqualify a biologically unsophisticated person from meaning by “dog” what we do.

Copyright © 2019 by
Jeff Speaks <>

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