Singular Propositions

First published Sat Jul 19, 1997; substantive revision Fri Sep 27, 2013

Singular propositions (also called ‘‘Russellian propositions’’) are propositions that are about a particular individual in virtue of having that individual as a direct constituent. This characterization assumes a structured view of propositions — see propositions: structured. Alleged examples of singular propositions are the propositions [Mont Blanc is more than 4,000 meters high], [Socrates was wise], and [She (pointing at Susan) lives in New York]. A singular proposition is to be contrasted with a general proposition, which is not about any particular individual, and a particularized proposition, which is about a particular individual but does not contain that individual as a constituent. Examples of the first are the propositions [Most Americans favor tax cuts] and [Some music is great]; examples of the second are the propositions [The inventor of bifocals was bald] and [The tallest spy is a man]. A singular proposition is directly about an individual whereas a particularized proposition is indirectly about an individual in virtue of that object satisfying a condition that is a constituent of the proposition — in our cases, the conditions ‘x uniquely invented bifocals’ and ‘x is a tallest spy’.

The acceptance or rejection of singular propositions lies at the center of many issues in semantics, the philosophy of language and mind, and metaphysics. In this essay, we shall look at some of the arguments for singular propositions, discuss problems their existence give rise to, and show how singular propositions are related to certain questions in metaphysics.

1. Fregeanism and Russellianism

We will assume without argument a propositionalist semantics, according to which sentences (in context) are assigned propositions as contents which are the primary bearers of truth values, bearers of modal properties like contingency and necessity, and objects of the propositional attitudes like believing, hoping, and saying. We can distinguish two broad classes of theories about propositions. Proponents of the first, Fregean view accept Frege's distinction between sense and reference and proponents of the second, Russellian view do not. If Fregeanism is true, all thought about concrete individuals is indirect, mediated by senses that are independent of those individuals. (Some maintain that Frege recognized de re senses — senses whose existence and identity is dependent upon their reference — as the contents of proper names, in which case he would not have subscribed to a Fregean theory, as characterized above. The supplementary document

Evans on Frege

contains further discussion.) The easiest way to get a grip on this is to think of senses as purely qualitative satisfaction conditions. Such a condition determines an object in virtue of the qualities it instantiates. According to Russellianism, on the other hand, we can think about an individual directly; we can have a thought about an individual by having that individual as an immediate constituent of the thought. On the standard interpretation of Frege, individuals are not constituents of propositions. Propositions are composed of senses, not individuals, and senses are individuated independently of any individual. If Fregeanism is true, there are no singular propositions. If Russellianism is true, then singular propositions play a crucial role in semantics and any complete theory of thought.

Before discussing the reasons for and against singular propositions, we begin with a brief discussion of the views of the historical Frege and Russell. The hope is that the discussion will provide a clearer understanding of the views outlined above.

Gottlob Frege famously distinguished between an expression's reference and its sense. (The classic source is Frege 1892/1948. The distinction was first introduced a year earlier in (1891). It is commonly thought, and Frege asserts as much, that the sense-reference distinction was not present in (1879/1967). But this early work does contain a seeming anticipation of the distinction, as well as the same argument from the opening paragraphs of (1892/1948) against the metalinguistic solution promoted in (1879/1967), which is extremely puzzling. We don't try to resolve the interpretative issues here.) We focus on proper names, although Frege maintained that the sense-reference distinction applied to all expressions, including sentences, where the reference of a sentence is a truth value and its sense a thought. The reference of the name ‘Mark Twain’ is the man Mark Twain himself, while its sense is a mode of presentation or way of thinking of that object.

Frege argued for the distinctness of sense from reference as follows. Suppose, for reductio, that the sole semantic value of the name ‘Mark Twain’ were its reference. Then, as the name ‘Samuel Clemens’ is coreferential, the two names would be identical in their semantic values. Given a plausible assumption of compositionality, the sentences ‘Mark Twain was a famous American author’ and ‘Samuel Clemens was a famous American author’ would then express the same proposition. But that is counterintuitive. It seems that fully competent speakers can believe what the one expresses without believing what the other expresses. (Imagine our agent had an American literature class, having read Huck Finn and Tom Sawyer, in which biographical facts were withheld. She will accept the first sentence and reject the second.) If this is so, then the two sentences express different propositions. And if they express different propositions, there must be some semantically relevant difference between the names ‘Mark Twain’ and ‘Samuel Clemens’. As their references do not differ, sense is distinct from reference.

An expression's sense is intended to capture its cognitive value. The above argument is intended to show that coreferential proper names can present the same object in different ways and it can be a cognitive achievement to come to learn that the object presented in those different ways is one and the same. Reference alone, Frege persuasively argued, cannot capture cognitive value. Capturing the cognitive significance of an expression is a primary role senses played in Frege's system. But they also played several other roles as well: They are the primary bearers of truth values, the indirect references of sentences and hence the objects denoted by that clauses like ‘that Frege denied the existence of singular propositions’, and the objects of propositional attitudes, most importantly. These roles give rise to the following theses concerning the individuation of senses.

If two sentences have different truth values, then they have different senses.

For any pair of sentences, s1 and s2, if a competent speaker can rationally, reflectively, and sincerely accept s1 while rejecting s2, then s1 and s2 have different senses.

For any pair of sentences, s1 and s2, and propositional attitude verb Vs, if the truth of a Vs that s1 is consistent with the falsity of a Vs that s2, then s1 and s2 have different senses.

Frege's case for the sense-reference distinction is also a case that singular propositions are not the semantic contents of natural language sentences and are not the objects of the propositional attitudes. Singular propositions are too coarse-grained to account for what a competent speaker understands in virtue of grasping the meaning of a sentence. But the content of a sentence is, intuitively, what an agent grasps when she understands a sentence and what she believes when she accepts it. Frege concluded that singular propositions are ill-suited for the purposes of semantics and psychology, as they lead to violations of Accept and Attitude. (For further discussion, see the entry Frege.)

Bertrand Russell's views of language and thought are importantly different from Frege's. (Russell held many distinct views. We focus here on the Russell roughly from 1905 through 1912.) First, Russell held an acquaintance-based theory, according to which some thought about individuals is direct, in the sense of involving singular propositions involving those very individuals. Second, whereas Frege introduced senses to help solve the puzzles discussed above, Russell employed logical analysis and his theory of definite descriptions. We take each point in turn.

Russell maintained that an agent must be acquainted with every constituent of a thought that she is in a position to entertain. Call this the Acquaintance Principle. (The principle makes an appearance in (1905), but the view behind the principle is worked out in (1910) and (1912).) Russell thought that we are acquainted only with our occurrent sense data and universals (and he sometimes included the self, when he wasn't feeling skeptical of awareness of the self as an entity). So, Russell maintained that the only singular propositions we can grasp are ones with those items as constituents.

We can trace the fundamental source of Russell's restrictivism about acquaintance to the claim that one is acquainted only with that for which misidentification is rationally impossible. If it is possible for one to be presented with o twice over and rationally not realize it as the same object, then one is not acquainted with o; one's thoughts about o are, in that case, indirect. This line of reasoning relies on the Fregean claim that identity confusions are to be explained in terms of differences in thought constituents. Our English student's confusion regarding Mark Twain is thus to be explained in terms of different thoughts and hence different thought constituents corresponding to the different ways of thinking about the man Mark Twain associated with the expressions ‘Mark Twain’ and ‘Samuel Clemens’. This — that cases of misidentification always involve differences in thought contents — marks an important point of agreement between Frege and Russell.

Neo-Russellians are more permissive about the objects of acquaintance, including extra-mental particulars in this class. David Kaplan's pioneering work (1977/1989) is typically the starting point, although Russell himself started out with such a position, maintaining, for example, that Mont Blanc itself is a constituent of the thought that Mont Blanc has snowfields. Neo-Russellians must deny the Fregean claim that whenever misidentification is rationally possible, there is a difference in thought constituents. They might still agree with Fregean intuitions about the truth and falsity of propositional attitude ascribing sentences — agreeing, for example, that ‘Peter believes that Mark Twain was a famous American author’ is true while ‘Peter believes that Samuel Clemens was a famous American author’ is false — claiming that this does not require a difference at the level of thought constituents, following, for example, Mark Crimmins and John Perry (1989) or Mark Richard (1990). Such neo-Russellians claim that the truth or falsity of a belief attitude ascribing sentence involves more than just the agent of the report having among her beliefs the proposition expressed by the sentence embedded in the reporting sentence. Alternatively, the neo-Russellian might deny the Fregean intuitions about the truth and falsity of propositional attitude ascribing sentences, following, for example, Nathan Salmon (1986) in accounting for those intuitions in nonsemantic terms. (For further discussion, see propositional attitude reports.) Either way, however, given that misidentification of extra-mental particulars is obviously possible, the permissive theory of acquaintance requires denying the claim that all cases of misidentification involve differences in thought constituents.

We have seen how Russell's adherence to the Acquaintance Principle together with his adoption of a Fregean attitude towards misidentification led him to deny that we can think directly about extra-mental particulars. Russell admitted that there is an extra-mental reality filled with extra-mental particulars that we can and do think about. Like Frege, all such thought, Russell insisted, is indirect. But Russell did not follow Frege in introducing senses as the mediators between individuals and our thought about them. Rather, Russell appealed to logical analysis through his theory of descriptions. For Russell, all thought about extra-mental particulars is descriptive. In (1910), the canonical form such thought took is the following: The thing that caused THIS [demonstratively referring to one's occurrent sense datum] is such-and-such, which is singular with respect to the sense datum demonstrated. We can work up to this by seeing how Russell contrasted three thoughts about Bismarck to the effect that he unified Germany (1910, 114–17). First, assuming acquaintance with the self, there is Bismarck's own thought about himself. This thought is singular with respect to Bismarck, having as its content the singular proposition [Bismarck unified Germany]. “But if a person who knew Bismarck made a judgment about him, the case is different. What this person was acquainted with were certain sense data which he connected (rightly, we will suppose) with Bismarck's body” (114). No human but Bismarck, then, can grasp this singular proposition. Someone that has perceived Bismarck, say, Wilhelm II, has a thought with the following form, where BOB is the sense datum the agent has in virtue of his perception of Bismarck.

<[the x: x has a body that is the cause of BOB] x unified Germany>

This proposition is particularized with respect to Bismarck, but direct and thus singular only with respect to the occurrent sense datum being demonstratively referred to. Finally, contrast this judgment with someone who has never perceived Bismarck but has only heard about him indirectly. Such agents cannot relate Bismarck directly to their sense data because, unlike Wilhelm, none of their sense data are caused by Bismarck's body. Hence, they must either think of him purely qualitatively — as, say, the first Chancellor of the German Empire, treating the German Empire as if it were a purely qualitative condition — or more indirectly, as the person written about in the books causing these sense data, thought standing in front of the books that are the source of the agents' thoughts about Bismarck.

For Russell, sense data are the direct objects of thought in terms of which we think about extra-mental reality under descriptions relating, typically causally, those bits of reality to the directly referred to sense data. (It is worth noting that the basic idea does not require Russell's theory of perception. For example, John Searle, in (1983), has a similar view according to which we think immediately about experiences, which are not analyzed in terms of the mind's being presented with sense data. We then think of extra-mental objects as the causes of such and such occurrent experiences.) For Russell, while there are thoughts about particulars that are wholly qualitative and wholly general, the paradigm form our thought about external reality takes is ultimately grounded in acquaintance, albeit acquaintance with sense data as opposed to extra-mental reality itself. This is in stark contrast to the canonical form such thought takes in Frege's system, in which there is no direct reference to any individuals, including sense data, and all thought is entirely indirect. (For further discussion, see the entries Bertrand Russell, knowledge by acquaintance vs. description, and descriptions.)

Russell rejected Frege's distinction between sense and reference and attempted to solve the problems motivating that distinction through logical analysis and scope distinctions. The resulting view is one on which the proposition expressed by a sentence like ‘The inventor of bifocals was bald’ has neither a Fregean sense nor the referent of the subject-position term as a constituent. Instead, Russell had propositional functions — functions from objects to propositions — in place of senses. Yet at the bottom level such a view seems to require singular propositions, which are the basic or atomic propositions upon which the complex propositions are built. Frege's atomic propositions are composed of senses while Russell's require individuals.

2. Reasons for Singular Propositions: The modal argument

The first argument in favor of singular propositions we shall examine is based on Saul Kripke's modal argument in (1970/1980). Kripke presented the argument as an argument that proper names like ‘Nixon’ are not synonymous with ordinary definite descriptions like ‘the first US president from California’, rather than an argument for singular propositions, the existence of which he never endorsed in print. David Kaplan, in (1977/1989, 512–13), however, used the argument to conclude that demonstratives are directly referential expressions and hence express singular propositions. The argument can be presented as follows.

Suppose that David is standing at a table with Charles to his immediate left and Paul to his immediate right. Paul lives in New Jersey and Charles lives in Illinois. David points to the person on his right and utters sentence (1) below at time t.

(1) He lives in New Jersey.

David has said something about Paul. Call the proposition David has expressed p. p is distinct from the propositions expressed by the following sentences.

(2) The person on David's immediate right (at t) lives in New Jersey.
(3) The person David demonstrated (at t) lives in New Jersey.

Both of the latter propositions are about Paul indirectly, in virtue of the properties he contingently has (namely, being to David's right at t and being demonstrated at t by David, respectively). Now consider a counterfactual circumstance in which Paul and Charles have switched places but in which everything else about them remained the same, consistent with this switch, and, in particular, in which Paul still lived in New Jersey and Charles in Illinois. p is true at this circumstance, as Paul lives in New Jersey, while the propositions expressed by (2) and (3) are false at this circumstance, as Charles is both to David's right and demonstrated by David and he doesn't live in New Jersey. So, p is distinct from the propositions expressed by (2) and (3).

It is important to be clear that we are concerned with the truth values of the propositions expressed by (1)-(3) at a described counterfactual situation, not what propositions those sentences would have expressed in those circumstances. (1) would have expressed a different proposition, a proposition about Charles and so false, were David to have uttered it in the described situation. But our claim is that the proposition expressed by David's actual utterance of (1) is true at the described counterfactual circumstance, while the propositions (actually) expressed by (2) and (3) are false at that circumstance.

Since p differs in truth value in the described counterfactual circumstance from the propositions expressed by (2) and (3), it follows that p is distinct from the propositions expressed by (2) and (3). This is because, as propositions are the objects that are true or false in counterfactual circumstances, if p = p*, then p and p* have the same truth value in all counterfactual circumstances. These considerations suggest that the proposition expressed by David's utterance of (1) is about Paul directly and hence that p is a singular proposition. Any proposition that is about Paul indirectly, in virtue of qualities that he contingently instantiates, will be subject to a similar argument.

There are two main responses to the modal argument in the literature. The first involves a denial of the principle that, if p = p*, then p and p* have the same truth value in all counterfactual circumstances. Michael Dummett (1991) and Jason Stanley (1997a/b; 2002) have developed this response by denying that propositions are the bearers of modal properties. Dummett distinguishes senses from what he calls ingredient senses. Senses give the contents of expressions, are the bearers of truth and falsity, and are the objects of the attitudes. Ingredient senses, on the other hand, are the bearers of modal properties like being necessarily or contingently true or false and being true or false at a world. Because propositions are not the bearers of modal properties, Dummett and Stanley can accept that (1) is true with respect to our counterfactual situation while (2) and (3) are false even though the proposition expressed by (1) is the same as the proposition expressed by either (2) or (3). (It may be possible to get the same results without denying that propositions are the bearers of modal properties by offering a nonstandard semantics of modal adverbs like ‘necessarily’ and ‘contingently’ according to which they ascribe properties — the property of being true in every/some world, say — to propositions but are sensitive to more than just the proposition they operate on. One model for this is the way ‘so-called’ functions in a sentence like ‘Superman is so-called for his super powers’. To our knowledge such a theory has yet to be worked out in detail, but we have no doubt that it could be.)

The second response involves moving from contingent properties like those involved in (2) and (3) to necessary properties, and in particular to what, following Plantinga in (1974), we will call an individual essence, which is a property that, necessarily, if x exists, then it has that property and, necessarily, only x has. The property being on David's right is not an individual essence of Paul, as Paul might have existed without having had it and Charles might have had it instead. But it is easy to turn such contingent properties into necessary ones by rigidifiying them. Paul necessarily has the property of actually being on David's right. For any world w, Paul has that rigidified property in w just in case in the actual world Paul has the (contingent) property of being on David's right. And, if Paul is the only person to have that property in the actual world, then the rigidified property is not only a necessary property of Paul but also an individual essence of Paul. Such a property “tracks” Paul across every possible world. Consider then the propositions expressed by (4) and (5).

(4) The person actually on David's immediate right (at t) lives in New Jersey.
(5) The person actually David demonstrated (at t) lives in New Jersey.

As far as the modal argument goes, these propositions can be identified with p, as, for every world w, they have exactly the same truth value at w as p intuitively has at w.

We do not claim that either response is ultimately satisfying. Indeed, we are satisfied by neither. But their presence does show that the modal argument fails to bring out the real difficulties with descriptivism and the fundamental need for singular propositions.

3. Reasons for Singular Propositions: The argument from indexicals and demonstratives

David Kaplan, in (1977/1989), and John Perry, in (1977), (1979), (1980a/b), and (2001), argued that an adequate theory of indexicality requires singular propositions. An indexical is an expression whose content is not fixed by its linguistic meaning alone but requires extra-linguistic contextual supplementation. Take, for example, the sentence ‘I am happy’, considered in isolation from any particular utterance or specifications of who is uttering it at what time. The question of whether or not it is true is hardly sensible. That question makes sense only when we either consider an utterance of the sentence or provide the specification of at least an agent as speaker. (We remain neutral on the issue whether utterances of sentences are the primary bearers of semantic values or sentences in context.) Both Kaplan and Perry argue that a Fregean account of indexical expressions like ‘I’, ‘today’, and ‘here’ and demonstrative expressions like ‘he’, ‘this’, and ‘there’ is inadequate. We focus here on Perry's view.

Perry argued against the Fregean claim that there is a single entity — sense — that answers to the three principles of sense individuation presented in section 1. He argued that this identification leads to several problems when applied to indexicals. Perry's position is that one entity answers to Accept and a distinct entity answers to Truth and Attitude. More generally, Perry argued that an adequate account of indexicals and demonstratives in thought and language requires that we have one entity serving as cognitive values and a distinct entity serving as the contents of thoughts and sentences and bearers of truth value. The mistake of the Fregean is to think that there is a single item that can do all of the work.

Consider the following sentence.

(6) George quit his job today.

(6) doesn't express a complete proposition on its own because ‘today’ does not have a complete sense on its own. Suppose that George held exactly one job, which he quit on 1 Aug 2000. (6) is then true as uttered on 1 Aug 2000 and false as uttered on any other day. Perry considers three Fregean accounts of the sense expressed by a use of ‘today’ in (6) and argues that they all fail. The first identifies the sense of ‘today’ with its role or character; the second identifies it with an equivalence class of ordinary Fregean senses; and the third involves looking to the beliefs of the speaker for its sense.

We begin with the first, according to which the sense of a use of ‘today’ is its role. This account, in effect, denies that ‘today’ is an indexical. This is because the role of an expression is the rule that takes one from a particular utterance of the expression to its content on that use, which is the same across all uses. An expression's role is related to its linguistic meaning. The role of ‘today’ is a rule that takes one from a given use to the day of that use and the role of ‘I’ is a rule that takes one from a given use to the speaker of that use. So, if the sense of ‘today’ were its role, the same thought would be expressed by every utterances of (6), regardless of the day of occurrence. But, as we have seen, different utterances of (6) have different truth values. But then, by Truth, those utterances express different thoughts. Furthermore, the account violates Accept, as it is possible to rationally take differential attitudes towards different utterances of (6). The sense of a use of ‘today’,then, is not its role.

According to the second Fregean account, the sense of a use of an indexical like ‘today’ is the class of referentially equivalent ordinary Fregean senses. The equivalence class of thoughts for an utterance of (6) on 1 Aug 2000 is the class of thoughts composed of the (incomplete) sense of ‘George quit his job’ and any completing sense that determines 1 Aug 2000. Referential equivalence classes function much like singular propositions, in that they do not place any restrictions on the way in which the agent conceives of the referent of the thought. This makes them poor candidates for accounting for the cognitive value of a sentence, as they lead to violations of Accept. Consider the following case, derived from a case of Perry's. Suppose that you are sitting in a large harbor city and see the bow of a ship, with the name ‘Enterprise’ clearly in view, sticking out behind a building. You also see the stern of a ship, with no name, sticking out behind another building two blocks away. The water view is obstructed by buildings for the intervening blocks. You might then accept your companion's utterance of the sentence ‘This is the Enterprise’, pointing at the bow of the ship, but reject her utterance of the sentence ‘This is the Enterprise’, pointing at the stern of the ship. Associated with both utterances is the same equivalence class of Fregean senses, as both uses of ‘this’ refer to the same ship. But, because you competently accept the one and not the other, by Accept, different senses are expressed. We get the same results for (6) by considering someone who is confused about what day it is. She might then accept an utterance of (6) on 1 August 2000 while rejecting an utterance of ‘George quit his job on 1 August 2000’, without a change of mind and despite the fact that the same equivalence class is associated with both. If the sense of a use of ‘today’ is intended to capture that use's cognitive significance, as it clearly should on a Fregean account, we should reject this second account.

The failings of the first two accounts as plausible Fregean accounts of (6) are fairly evident. The third Fregean account turns to the attitudes of the speaker to determine the sense of a given use of an indexical. Perry presented the key idea as follows.

To understand a demonstrative, is to be able to supply a sense for it on each occasion, which determines as reference the value the demonstrative has on that occasion…. [W]e can say that for each person the sense of the demonstrative ‘today’ for that person on a given day is just the sense of one of the descriptions D (or some combination of all the descriptions) such that on that day he believes [‘Today is D’]. (1977, 11–12)

Perry required that the descriptions D should be nonindexical. Perry then presented three arguments against this suggestion. (Kaplan developed similar arguments against what he calls the Fregean theory of demonstratives in (1977/1989).)

The first objection is the irrelevancy of belief objection. Believing that you live in that time and possessing accurate descriptive information of the medieval age does not make your uses of ‘today’ about 1 August 1204, even though that is the date that best fits your conception of the date of your utterance. Uses of ‘today’ are about whatever day they occur on, whatever descriptions one associate with one's uses of the expression and however one conceives of the day of one's utterance. But if the sense of a use of a ‘today’ were determined by the beliefs of the speaker, and if sense determines reference, then it would seem that your utterance is about 1204. So, the beliefs of the speaker are irrelevant to the day an utterance of ‘today’ is about.

This objection works best with “automatic” or “pure” indexicals like ‘today’ and ‘I’ rather than “non-automatic” indexicals or “true” demonstratives like ‘she’ and ‘this’, which require an associated demonstration to refer in context. This is because the reference of a use of a true demonstrative is at least arguably determined in part by the speaker's beliefs and audience-directed intentions, whereas the reference of a pure indexical is settled by objective, attitude-independent factors of the occasion of utterance, like who is speaking when and where. (There is a debate about whether or not speaker beliefs and intentions are relevant even to true demonstratives. See Bach 1992, Bertolet 1993, and Reimer 1991a/b and 1992.)

We noted above that Perry assumed that the descriptive beliefs that determine the sense of a use of ‘today’ themselves are not indexical. Lifting this ban removes some of the sting from the irrelevancy of belief objection. For consider the agent's belief that she would express by saying, ‘‘Today is the day of this very utterance.’’ While the purely qualitative descriptive conditions a speaker believes the day of her speech satisfies may be satisfied by a different day, it is much less clear that the above descriptive condition is satisfied by the wrong day. (It is also harder to imagine a nonproblematic case where the agent is confused about whether or not the day referred to by her use of ‘today’ satisfies this description.) But there are at least two problems with the Fregean appealing to such descriptions. The first is that it is unclear that ordinary agents actually have such beliefs when they competently utter a sentence like (6). It is also questionable whether all speakers who competently use ‘today’ have the concepts of an utterance. If they do not, then they are in a position to believe what is expressed by an utterance of ‘Today is fine’ without believing what is expressed by an utterance of ‘The day of this utterance is fine’, in which case, by Accept, the two sentence express different propositions. Second, even if they did, the same question of the sense of the use of ‘this’ would arise once again, with all of the problems Perry raises for the sense of (6). There is no room, in Frege's system, for irreducibly indexical thoughts, as Frege is clear that thoughts are true or false absolutely, which an irreducibly indexical thought could not be (just as the sentence ‘I am happy’ is not itself true or false absolutely). Insofar as the Fregean claims that truth is an absolute property of thoughts, she must explicate the indexicality of language and judgments using only nonindexical propositions or thoughts. (A proponent of a broadly Fregean view might claim that the truth or falsity of a thought (and not just a sentence) is relative to a sequence of parameters like a person, place, time, etc.. She could then claim that the thought expressed by an utterance of (6) is itself irreducibly indexical and is only true or false relative to an assignment of parameters and in particular to a day.)

Perry's second objection is the nonnecessity of belief objection. This objection turns on the fact that a speaker can refer to the time at which she is speaking with her use of ‘today’ even though she lacks any adequate purely qualitative conception of what day it is. Consider the case of Rip Van Winkle. “When he awakes on October 20, 1823, and says with conviction ‘Today is October 20, 1803,’ the fact that he is sure he is right does not make him right, as it would if the thought expressed were determined by the sense he associated with ‘today’” (1977, 12). (The case of Rip Van Winkle is very rich. For further discussion, see Evans 1981/1985, Kaplan 1977/1989 (538), and Perry 1997.) Van Winkle need not have a correct conception of the day of his utterance to be talking and thinking about that day with his use of ‘today’. It suffices to simply be located on that day and say, ‘‘Today is fine,’’ knowing the general rule of how uses of ‘today’ function. A similar point can be made about ‘I’, using a case of a person suffering complete amnesia, who intuitively still speaks of herself when she says, ‘‘I am alive’’, despite lacking true beliefs of identifying biographical information, and ‘here’, using a case of a person who is completely confused about where she is. As was the case with Perry's first objection, however, the nonnecessity of belief objection is less persuasive with true demonstratives, where some kind of correct conception of the intended reference is arguably needed to demonstrate it.

In his response to Perry, Gareth Evans (1981/1985) claimed that retaining indexical beliefs across changes in circumstance requires keeping track of the objects those beliefs are about. So, for example, to believe the same thing today that I believed yesterday when I uttered (yesterday) the sentence ‘Today is fine’ requires more than simply competently uttering today the sentence ‘Yesterday was fine’. I must in addition, Evans claimed, have kept track of the day and so properly registered the change in day. This makes belief necessary for retention of indexical beliefs, even beliefs expressed by sentences with pure indexicals. As Van Winkle does not successfully track the twenty some years between his falling asleep and waking up, he does not retain the temporally indexical beliefs he had the night he fell asleep. Evans is less clear, however, that a proper conception of the day is necessary for formation (as opposed to retention) of a temporally indexical belief, which is what Perry's second objection denies. Does Van Winkle not think a thought about 1823 when he awakes and thinks to himself, ‘Today is fine’?) Furthermore, the tracking condition has consequences that seem contrary to key tenets of Fregeanism. Losing track of time isn't something that is always internally accessible. Rip Van Winkle and his less well-known brother Kip, both of whom went to sleep after a fine day in October 1803. Kip woke up 10 hours later and, recalling the previous day, thought to himself, ‘Yesterday was fine’; Rip slept an additional 20 years and woke with memories of what he took to be the previous day and thought to himself, ‘Yesterday was fine’, being unaware of the additional passage of time. Because “everything is all the same” as far as Kip and Rip are concerned upon waking, there is some pressure to say that their beliefs have the same content, assuming belief contents are intended to capture how the agent conceives the world, which is the motivation behind a principle like Accept. (There is equally strong pressure to say that they believe different things, as Kip's belief is true and Rip's false. But that is not generated from Accept but Truth and Perry's point is that, for important cases, those principles pull in opposite directions.)

Perry's third objection is the nonsufficiency of belief. Consider the case of Hume and Heimson. Heimson believes that he is Hume. But Heimson isn't just crazy, but also well informed about every aspect of Hume's life. Still, Hume says something true when he utters the sentence ‘I wrote the Treatise’ and Heimson says something false. If so, then, by Truth, they say different things, despite the similarity in their qualitative descriptive beliefs. Even though Heimson's descriptive beliefs about who he is best fit Hume, still his self-thoughts are about Heimson and not Hume. The Fregean cannot, Perry claims, account for this.

Perry assumed that Fregean thoughts are generally accessible, as they are entirely composed of logical operations and purely qualitative conditions. But then the thought Hume grasps when he thinks to himself ‘‘I wrote the Treatise’’ is a thought available for Heimson to grasp as well. (This assumption of general accessibility is at odds with what Frege says in his late work (1918/1956), where he claims that “everyone is presented to himself in a particular and primitive way, in which he is presented to no-one else” (298). In his discussion of Dr. Lauben, Frege denies that all thoughts are generally accessible and that the thought Dr. Lauben grasps when he thinks to himself, ‘‘I am cold,’’ for example, is a thought that can be expressed by any sentence with a proper name. It is important to realize that this limited accessibility thesis Frege held in later work is distinct from the view alluded to above according to which a thought is irreducibly indexical. The former view is consistent with Dr. Lauben's thought being absolutely true or false, whereas the latter view is not. Frege did not always hold this limited accessibility view, however. In an earlier, unpublished work intended as a logic textbook he writes:

In this case [the sentence ‘I am cold’] the mere words do not contain the entire sense; we have in addition to take into account who utters it. There are many cases like this in which the spoken words have to be supplemented by the speaker's gesture and expression, and the accompanying circumstances. The word ‘I’ simply designates a different person in the mouths of different people. It is not necessary that the person who feels cold should give utterance to the thought that he feels cold. Another person can do this by using a name to designate the one who feels cold. (1914, 134–5)

Frege here seems to be claiming that the thought you have when you say to yourself, ‘‘I am cold,’’ is a thought someone else can express by pointing at you and saying, ‘‘S/he is cold,’’ which is exactly what he denied in (1918/1956). Furthermore, although Frege only posits private senses only for ‘I’, the worries that drove him to this view can be raised with other indexicals like ‘here’, ‘today’, and ‘now’. It becomes less and less plausible to posit context-bound senses for each place, day, and moment. In any event, the move to such perspective-bound thoughts has not been generally accepted, even by followers of Frege.)

Any generally accessible, absolutely true or false thought, Perry argued, will violate Accept. For suppose that there were a purely qualitative descriptive condition F Hume associated with his use of ‘I’ that gives its sense; say, the condition expressed by the expression ‘the philosopher who argued against the rationality of induction’. It would seem that, insofar as Hume forgot (or never knew) that he himself is uniquely F but retained his ability to think of himself with the expression ‘I’, it is possible for him to competently, reflectively, and sincerely accept the sentence ‘I wrote the Treatise’ while not accepting ‘The F wrote the Treatise’. No such purely qualitative, generally accessible proposition, Perry concluded, is equivalent in cognitive significance to Hume's thought that he himself wrote the Treatise. But Fregeanism entails that there is such a thought. So Fregeanism is false.

So far we have focused on Perry's case against Fregean accounts of indexicals in thought and language. Let's move briefly to Perry's positive, anti-Fregean view of indexicality. Perry's views have gone through important and often drastic changes from his early views in (1977) and (1979) to his later views in his (2001), which we shall not try to sort out here, focusing primarily on the earlier view. A view broadly similar to Perry's early view is developed in Kaplan 1977/1989, where Kaplan distinguishes content and character, claiming that the latter captures the cognitive significance of an expression and the former is the bearer of truth value and the object of the propositional attitudes, often being a singular proposition. Perry initially (1977) distinguished “thoughts” and “senses,” but later (1979) and (1980a/b) made the same distinction in terms of belief contents and belief states. (Perry also initially identified the “thought” associated with an expression with its role, which is proven false by cases like the Enterprise case discussed above. If an expression's role is identified with its linguistic meaning, then the two occurrences of ‘this’ surely have the same role. The two utterances of ‘this’ have distinct associated demonstrations, but demonstrations are not part of linguistic meaning.) The core idea is that an adequate account of indexicality in thought and language involves two distinct items, one that is roughly characterized by Truth and Attitude — propositions — and the other that is roughly characterized by Accept and is intended to capture the “cognitive significance” of an expression and through which propositions are grasped. The former is, in the case of indexical beliefs, a singular proposition. This distinction, Perry claimed, is the key to solving the problems with self-locating beliefs that we have discussed above; it is the Fregean's identification of the items that answer to Accept, Truth, and Attitude that leads to the problems surveyed above.

Let's apply the view to the case of Heimson. What, on Perry's view, distinguishes Hume from Heimson? Both Hume and Heimson are in the same first-person belief state when they say to themselves, ‘‘I wrote the Treatise.’’ Furthermore, the belief content Hume has when he is in that belief state — namely, the singular proposition [Hume wrote the Treatise] — is a belief content readily available for Heimson to entertain as well. However, only Hume can grasp that belief content by being in a first-person belief state. When Heimson is in a first-person belief state, he grasps the distinct singular proposition [Heimson wrote the Treatise] and when Heimson grasps the singular proposition [Hume wrote the Treatise], it is only in virtue of being in a third-person belief state. Perry is thus able to account for the similarities between Heimson and Hume (they are in the same belief state) and what is distinctive of Hume (only he grasps the singular proposition [Hume wrote the Treatise] when in a first-person belief state).

Belief states are important because they are involved in explaining, predicting, and rationalizing behavior. Perry provided a host of memorable cases that make this point. Here's one. Consider two people who both utter to themselves the sentence ‘I am being attacked by a bear’. All other things being equal, both people will act in similar ways. There is a common explanation of their behaviors only in terms of their shared belief states, as they apprehend distinct propositions, each believing a proposition about himself. Furthermore, it is crucial to how our agents act that they grasp the relevant singular proposition in a first-person way and not, say, as one would if one saw one's own reflection in a mirror with the reflection of a bear sneaking up without realizing that the person being seen is oneself. So, explanation, prediction, and rationalization are all sensitive to belief states. To quote Perry on this point:

[I]n virtue of being in a belief state in a certain environment, we believe a certain object. Because the same object can be believed in different ways, from different environments or “points of view,” classifying people by objects believed is not always particularly useful…. Consider the sentence ‘There is a hungry lion coming towards me’. Now consider the contexts relative to which this sentence is true. They all consist of persons and times such that the person is being approached by a hungry lion at that time. It is a good idea for all of these people to run like crazy [presumably, at that time or at least shortly thereafter]. In a sense they do not need to know what they believe. Even if they have forgotten who they are and lost track of time, they know enough to run. (In another sense, they do know what they believe even then.) Most of these people will not believe the same thing. But each of them will believe in something that provides them with good reason to run. (1980a, 323)

But belief states are not contents; they are not true or false and they are not what we express when we utter a sentence. We must thus also recognize belief contents as distinct elements. (For further discussion of the issues raised in this section, see the entries indexicals and propositional attitude reports.)

4. Reasons for Singular Propositions: The reduplication argument

Peter Strawson's reduplication argument, developed in (1959, 20–22), can be construed as an argument for singular propositions. Strawson used the argument to support the related thesis that demonstrative identification is fundamental to our ability to identify and hence refer to, in speech and thought, individuals. Demonstrative identification of o is enabled by one sensibly discriminating o from other individuals. So one can demonstratively identify only individuals that one has perceived. But one can think about other individuals as well. These further individuals, then, must be descriptively identified. Individuals that one identifies demonstratively are directly identified and not identified in virtue of their satisfies qualities by which the agent conceives the object, as individuals descriptively identified are. (This distinction is reminiscent of Russell's distinction between thought by acquaintance and thought by description. We compare Russell and Strawson in more detail below.) Strawson's notion of demonstrative identification is thus closely related to the notions of direct reference and singular propositions.

A reduplication universe is one in which the same set of qualities are distributed in the same pattern across two regions. There are both temporal and spatial versions of reduplication. We shall focus on the spatial version, as Strawson does. Suppose that Sally lives in a reduplication universe. Sally is standing in front of Bill, thinking that he has a stain on his shirt. In another region of the universe there is a qualitatively identical set of circumstances. So, there is Sally*, who is just like Sally, standing in front of Bill*, who is just like Bill, thinking that he has a stain on his shirt. For any purely qualitative condition Bill satisfies, Bill* satisfies it too. Nonetheless it seems highly intuitive that Sally is thinking about Bill and not Bill* (and Sally* is thinking about Bill* and not Bill); after all, it is Bill and not Bill* that she is standing in front of and who is the obvious source of her judgment.

Suppose that all forms of identification were descriptive, so that identifying an object required qualitatively discerning it from all others. Then, as Sally cannot discern Bill from Bill* in wholly qualitative terms, her thought is not determinately about Bill rather than Bill*. But intuitively her thoughts are about Bill, in virtue of the fact that she is in perceptual contact with Bill rather than Bill*. This is even more clear when we consider Sally's thought about herself. When Sally says to herself, ‘‘I am hungry’’, she is thinking of herself and not Sally*. But if her thought about herself were in terms of purely qualitative conditions, then she would be unable to think determinately of herself instead of Sally*. So, she must be capable of an alternative form of thought and identification that is distinct from and does not presuppose descriptive identification. Call this form of identification demonstrative identification. We have argued that it is distinct from and does not depend upon descriptive identification.

The argument we have presented above presupposes that Sally and Sally* and Bill and Bill* are numerically distinct but qualitatively indiscernible pairs of objects. Although many find this to be a genuine possibility, thanks in large part to Max Black (1952) and Robert Adams (1979), there is a long tradition that subscribes to the Identity of Indiscernibles (PII), according to which, for any objects x and y, if, for every quality F, x is F if and only if y is F (i.e., if x and y are qualitatively indiscernible), then x=y. But the argument can be developed in such a way that it does not presuppose the falsity of PII. Let there be a quality that Bill and Bill* lacks. Then the distinctness of Bill from Bill* is consistent with PII. But now let Sally (and thus Sally*) be unaware of Bill's (and Bill*'s) instantiating that quality. As long as Bill and Bill* are qualitatively indiscernible as far as Sally is concerned and yet intuitively Sally is thinking of Bill and not Bill*, the above argument for the irreducibility of demonstrative identification to descriptive identification goes through, even if it is not possible for there to be distinct objects with all the same qualities.

So far we have argued that demonstrative identification is not reducible to descriptive identification. But Strawson makes the stronger claim that, in the reduplication universe, descriptive identification depends on demonstrative identification. To get this stronger claim consider an object that Sally has never perceived but can intuitively think about — say, Bill's mother. Strawson claims that considering this case proves false the claim “that where the particular to be identified cannot be directly located [i.e., cannot be demonstratively identified because it cannot be perceptually discriminated], its identification must rest ultimately on description in purely general [i.e., qualitative] terms” (1959, 21). Bill's mother (call her Morgan) is qualitatively indiscernible from Bill*'s mother. So Sally is unable to distinguish in purely qualitative terms Morgan from every other object in the universe. But intuitively she can nonetheless think of her. This is because Sally can demonstratively identify Bill and thus have thoughts determinately about Bill as opposed to his qualitative twin Bill* and then think of Morgan under the descriptive condition Bill's mother. As Bill is directly given, this is a condition that Morgan and not her qualitative twin Morgan* satisfies. Thus Sally's ability to descriptively identify objects in the universe is ultimately grounded in her ability to demonstrative identify some stock of objects, identifying other objects in virtue of the unique relations they bear to members of that stock. Strawson argues that the general way of relating objects one has not perceived to those demonstratively identified is by way of spatio-temporal relations. (See (1959, 22) in particular, but much of the discussion that follows in chapter 1 is aimed at establishing the Kantian claim that spatio-temporal relations are the privileged set of relations for enabling identification of particulars.)

Let's grant that to have a thought determinately about an individual in a reduplication universe requires possessing an irreducible, fundamental form of demonstrative identification. What bearing does that have on thought about individuals in nonreduplication universes and in particular thought about individuals in our universe, which we take, rightly we can suppose, to be a nonreduplication universe. Although Strawson does not argue in this way, the following seems compelling. Grant that our universe is in fact not a reduplication universe. But it could have been. Had there been, in some distant part of the universe, a qualitative duplicate of me and my surroundings, my thought would not have taken a different form than it actually has. But the considerations above show that, had we been living in a reduplication universe, then demonstrative identification would have been irreducible and fundamental. But then it is actually irreducible and fundamental.

We end this section by briefly comparing Strawson's view with Russell's and the contemporary neo-Russellian's views. We have seen that, for Russell, like Strawson, demonstrative identification plays a crucial role, in the form of acquaintance. But unlike Strawson, Russell denies that we demonstratively identify extra-mental individuals. Russell can deliver the intuitively correct results that Sally's thoughts are determinately about Bill and not Bill*, even though she is not, on Russell's view, able to demonstratively identify Bill. This is because Sally can demonstratively identify her sense data that are caused by Bill and not Bill*. On Russell's view, Sally descriptively identifies even Bill, but the descriptive condition she employs contains direct reference to her occurrent sense data. She is thus able to form a descriptive (although not purely qualitative) condition that Bill satisfies and Bill* does not. For this reason, Russell is better able to handle the reduplication argument than the Fregean.

Both Strawson and Russell claimed that thought about particulars is ultimately grounded on direct reference. But they disagree about what we can directly refer to, with Strawson claiming that it includes perceived objects in the external world and Russell that it only includes mental particulars. It is important to note, however, that as far as the reduplication argument is concerned, this difference is of little consequence. As long as there is a stock of individuals that are thought of directly and not in terms of purely qualitative conditions that can serve as the anchors in terms of which the qualitatively indiscernible objects can then be discerned, the intuition that Sally is thinking determinately of Bill and not Bill* is respected.

Strawson maintained that an agent can demonstratively identify only objects that she has perceived. Neo-Russellians typically go a step further, claiming that an agent can think directly about objects she has not perceived in virtue of standing in the appropriate communicative chains ending in the object. So, even though you have never perceived Plato, we will safely suppose, you can nevertheless think directly about Plato in virtue of your standing in a communicative chain that ultimately traces back to perceptions (on the part of other agents in the communicative chain) of Plato. (For a representative of this view, see Bach's (1994, chapter 2).) Some neo-Russellians go even further and maintain that there needn't be any perceptual contact at all with an object to think about it directly. (See, for example, Kaplan 1975b, where he defends the thesis that the dthat-operator can transform any designating expression into a directly referential term, competence with which enables an agent to think about the designation of the original term directly. Hence, Le Verrier was able to think about Neptune directly despite the lack of perceptual contact with the planet (we will suppose) in virtue of his competence with the expression ‘dthat[the cause of the perturbations in Uranus's orbit]’. See also Robin Jeshion's (2002) for a similar view, in that she too thinks perceptual contact with an object is not necessary for thinking of that object directly, although she does not appeal to Kaplan's dthat-operator. (For more on these topics, see the papers collected in Jeshion 2010.)

We thus have a spectrum of views that agree that there is direct reference to individual in thought and language but disagree about its scope, from Russell's restrictive view of direct reference, according to which an agent can only think directly about her occurrent sense data, to the liberal view of direct reference held by Kaplan and Jeshion, according to which objects that have never been perceived can be thought about directly. All of these views respect the intuition that Sally's thoughts are determinately about Bill and not Bill*. Thus, while the reduplication argument makes a powerful case that there is some direct reference and hence that singular proposition are necessary for an adequate account of reference to individuals in thought and language, it does not settle the further issue of how much of our thought is direct and involves the grasping of singular propositions and what is thought by description. That is, while the reduplication argument might settle that there are singular propositions, we must appeal to different considerations, like those involved in the argument from indexicals and demonstratives, to resolve the further issue of what individuals can be constituents of singular propositions and under what conditions.

5. Modal Problems for Singular Propositions

In sections 2–4, we discussed three sets of argument for the thesis that there are singular propositions. The first, the modal argument, was broadly linguistic in nature and the other two, the arguments from indexicals and reduplication, were pyschological. But singular propositions also give rise to a number of important metaphysical problems, in addition to those involving propositional attitudes and apparent substitution failures already discussed. We end this essay by discussing two related problems: Modal problems and temporal problems.

Consider the following proposition.

(7) George Bush does not exist.

(The number designates the proposition actually expressed by ‘George Bush does not exist’, not the sentence itself.) While (7) is false, it might have been true. But suppose (7) is a singular proposition, involving George Bush as a constituent. Then there are problems, given the following two principles.

(P1) Necessarily, for all propositions p, had p been true, then p would have existed.
(P2) Necessarily, if (7) were true, then George would not have existed.

Both principles are highly plausible. (P1) is plausible because being true is a property and there must be something that has a property in order for that property to be instantiated. So, had it been that a given proposition were true, then there must have been something — namely, that proposition — that would have had the property of being true. (P2) states the intuitive truth conditions of (7), being an instance of the modalized propositional equivalent of the Tarski truth-schema s is true iff s. But these principles seem to entail that, if (7) is a singular proposition, then it is not possibly true. For suppose it were. Then there is a world w in which (7) is true. By (P1), (7) exists in w. But then all of its constituents exists in w as well, as a complex does not exist in a world unless all of its constituents exist in that world. But then George Bush exists in w. So, by (P2), (7) is not true in w, which contradicts our original assumption that it is true in w. So, either (7) is not a singular proposition or it is not possibly true.

The basic structure of this argument derives from Alvin Plantinga's argument from his (1983) against what he called existentialism, the thesis that all individual essences are dependent upon the individuals that instantiate them. Plantinga concluded that a singular proposition about o can exist even though o does not exist. (See in particular (1983, 8–9), where he argued that the notion of constituency is too confused to allow us to conclude that the constituent of a singular proposition must exist in a world for that proposition to exist in that world.) Plantinga also argued that the property being identical to o can exist without o, even though that property is constructed by λ-abstraction from the proposition [o is identical to o]. Plantinga would have been much better served, we believe, by denying that propositions like (7) are singular propositions, on the grounds that, if they were, they would not be possibly true. Instead, propositions like (7) contain individual essences as constituents. (Plantinga should not conceive of an individual essence as constructs form an individual identity property, as that property is dependent on the individual that instantiates it. Instead, an individual essence is either a primitive property stipulated to be necessarily related to the individual whose essence it is or would have been that can nonetheless exist unexemplified or the rigidification of some condition that the individual uniquely satisfies, following Plantinga's response to the modal argument above in section 2.) Let H be such an individual essence of Bush. Then (7) is true just in case H is uninstantiated, the proposition [Bush is president] is true just in case H and the property being president are coinstantiated, etc.. The pay-off is that (7)'s being true in a possible world does not violate (P1) and (P2), as there are possible worlds in which Bush's individual essence exists but is unexemplified.

There are several responses to Plantinga's argument, differing in their metaphysical underpinnings. The first involves the possibilist's thesis that there are individuals that are not actual. (See Lewis's (1986).) In that case, what exists in a world does not exhaust what exists simpliciter. Bush is around to serve as a constituent of a proposition, even with respect to worlds in which he does not exist, because he exists simpliciter by existing in other worlds. The possibilist can thus claim that the truth of (P1) does not entail that, if p is true in w, then p exists in w; rather, it only entails that p and all its constituents exists.

Matters are more difficult if one is an actualist, subscribing to the thesis that absolutely everything is actual. Then, if one accepts the existence of singular propositions, one has two options. First, one might deny that propositions like (7) are possibly true, accepting that necessarily everything necessarily exists, as Bernard Linsky and Edward Zalta, in their (1994) and Timothy Williamson, in his (2001), do. This position is only as plausible as the explanation on offer of the intuitive contingency of ordinary objects like Bush. If being and existence are necessary properties, then some contingent property must be offered in place that can be used to explain the intuition that (7) might have been true. Linsky and Zalta claim that being concrete is a contingent property. They claim that Bush might have been nonconcrete and that, when we consider a world in which he is nonconcrete, we are inclined to say that he does not exist there. Although the virtues of this view are many, not the least of which is the simple and straightforward modal logic it validates, we are very reluctant to accept that concreteness is a contingent property.

Finally, if one insists that propositions like (7) are singular propositions that are possibly true, then one must claim that (7) is true at worlds in which it does not exist, thus denying (P1). (Examples include Adams 1981, Deutsch 1994, Fine 1977 and 1985, Fitch 1996, and Menzel 1991 and 1993.) A proposition p is true in a world w just in case, were w actual, then p would have been true. Call this inner truth. (P1) is true for inner truth and there are no singular negative existential propositions like (7) that are true in any possible worlds. But there is another notion of truth with respect to a possible world that is associated with genuine necessity and contingency. Adams describes this notions as follows.

A world-story [a maximal, consistent set of actually existing propositions] that includes no singular proposition about me constitutes and describes a possible world in which I would not exist. It represents my possible non-existence, not by including the proposition that I do not exist but simply by omitting me. That I would not exist if all the propositions it includes, and no other actual propositions, were true is not a fact internal to the world that it describes, but an observation that we make from our vantage point in the actual world, about the relation of that world story to an individual of the actual world. (1981, 22)

The world-story corresponding to a possibility where George Bush does not exist does not, then, contain (7) as a member. Instead, (7) is true with respect to the possibility that world-story describes in virtue of the world-story omitting mention of Bush altogether. From the perspective of the actual world, and with its resources, we can say that (7) is true at that possibility, even though, from the perspective of the possibility itself, there is complete silence about George Bush. Call this outer truth.

The intuitive possible truth of (7) is an example of one side of our intuitions of the contingency of existence, being an example of the possible nonexistence of a thing that actually exists. An example of the other side of those intuitions concerns the possible existence of something that does not actually exist. As a matter of fact, Natalie Portman and George Bush did not have any children together and so, given plausible essentialists intuitions, nothing that actually exists could have been their child. But they could have had a child. Had certain contingent happenings occurred, then there would have been a person parented by Portman and Bush. So, (8) below is intuitively true.

(8) Nothing that actually exists could have been parented by Portman and Bush, but it is possible that there is someone parented by Portman and Bush.

The possibilist maintains that what actually exists is a proper subset of what exists. So, while nothing in the domain of the actual world could have been Portman and Bush's child, there are things in the most inclusive domain of quantification, which includes merely possible individuals, that are parented by Portman and Bush in some possible worlds. On Plantinga's view, there is an uninstantiated individual essence that could have been instantiated and, had it been instantiated, it would have been instantiated by something that was parented by Portman and Bush. On Linsky and Zalta's view, there is a nonconcrete individual that could have been concrete and, had it been concrete, it would have been parented by Portman and Bush. All three views, then, seem to easily account for the truth of something close to (8). (The last view must offer a slight revision of (8): While a nonconcrete individual actually exists and could have been parented by Portman and Bush, nothing that is actually concrete could have been parented by Portman and Bush.) Proponents of the last view considered above, however, do not countenance merely possible individuals, uninstantiated individual essences, nor contingently nonconcrete individuals. Instead they must give a different account of the second side of our intuitions that what exists is contingent.

Following Adams 1981, proponents of our final view can claim that the actually existing quantified proposition [There is someone parented by Portman and Bush] is a member of a world-story corresponding to the possibility in which Portman and Bush have a child together, but no atomic proposition of the form [o is parented by Portman and Bush] is a member of that set, as there is no such proposition that could have been true. (If there were such an atomic proposition, then there would be something that could have been parented by Portman and Bush, which there is not.) So, there are quantified propositions that are true at a possible world w even though there are no witnesses of those propositions — i.e., no corresponding singular propositions — true at w. This requires abandoning a general analysis of the truth of quantified propositions to the truth of atomic propositions. The best that a proponent of this account can say is that, had one of the possibilities in question been actual, then there would have been such a singular proposition and so there would have been a witness to the possibly true quantified proposition. But, as things actually are, the quantified proposition could have been true even though there is no singular proposition that could have been true.

None of the solutions considered in this section are without their problems. The possibilist recognizes a distinction between existing and actually existing that requires a bloated ontology. Plantinga's solution requires mysterious entities — individual essences that could exist unexemplified and thus that are individuated independently of the individuals that instantiate them. Linsky and Zalta's solution runs contrary to the robust intuition that what individuals there happen to be is a contingent matter and requires that ordinary existents could exist as nonconcrete objects. And the final solution requires a distinction between how matters stand in a possible world or from the perspective of that possible world and how matters stand at that world, which many find mysterious and claim to require an unpalatable form of realism about possible worlds. The account also requires complicating one's quantified modal logic, as it entails that there are theorems of classical quantificational logic (for example, ∃x(a=x)) that are contingent, requiring either a revision of classical quantificational logic, and a movement to a free logic, in which case those problematic classical theorems are no longer theorems, or a restriction on the standard Rule of Necessitation of standard modal logic, in which case there are contingent logical truths. (For a more detailed discussion of the issues raised in this section, see the entry on the possibilism-actualism debate.)

6. Temporal Problems for Singular Propositions

Singular propositions are a combination of the abstract and concrete, which leads to problems. The modal problem arises because, on the one hand, there are reasons to think that all propositions, as abstract objects, exist necessarily, but, on the other hand, it is highly intuitive that ordinary individuals might not have existed and others could have existed, in which case the singular propositions containing them as constituents exist contingently. The solutions to this problem discussed above involve denying that there are singular propositions, denying that ordinary objects are contingent existents, or denying that propositions are necessary existents. The temporal problems we shall consider in this section arise because ordinary individuals change over time, including coming into and going out of existence. Propositions, on the other hand, are usually taken to be eternal objects — things that do not change over time and exist at all times.

Consider the following proposition.

(9) Socrates existed but does not exist.

(9) seems like a true singular proposition, as Socrates died long ago. How then is (9) true, as its constituent Socrates does not exist and so it does not exist? This is clearly the temporal analog of the modal problem discussed in the previous section. Moreover, if (9) is a singular proposition, then what is the constituent of (9) like? How old is it? Is it sitting or standing? It seems absurd to say that the age of a constituent of a proposition is thus and so and that it is sitting and not standing, yet if Socrates himself is a constituent of (9), then he must be a determinate age and must be in a determinate position; no person exists without being a determinate age and being in a position. Our second set of questions also have modal analogs and it may help clarify the issues to present them before exploring answers to the temporal problems.

Bush in fact has two arms, but he might have had only one. But then if Bush himself is a constituent of the proposition that Bush has two arms, he must either have exactly two arms or exactly one arm, it would seem, as no person exists without having a determinate number of arms. But neither answer seems satisfying. This issue is related to problems of temporary and accidental intrinsics. (See his (1986, chapter 4).)

In the next two sub-sections we consider each set of issues in turn.

6.1. Temporal Problems for Singular Propositions: Quantitative Change

In section 5 we considered the modal version of the first set of issues and saw how one's account is connected to larger issues in the metaphysics of modality. Similarly, one's account of the temporal problems is connected to larger issues in the metaphysics of time. Recall the possibilist solution from section 5. The temporal analog of possibilism is eternalism, according to which what exists at a time is but a proper subset of what exists simpliciter. (Works that defend eternalism include Heller 1990, Lewis 1986, Mellor 1981 and 1998, Quine 1963, Sider 1997 and 2001, Smart 1955, and Williams 1951.) The eternalist maintains that, although Socrates does not presently exist, he does exist simpliciter and so is available to be the constituent of (9), even at times at which he does not exist. (9) is true, then, because Socrates is in the domain of a past time but not in the domain of the present time.

Presentism is the temporal analog of actualism. Presentists maintain that absolutely everything is present; entities, like Socrates, that do not presently exist, simply do not exist. (Works that defend presentism include Crisp 2002, 2005, and 2007a/b, Hinchliff 1988 and 1996, Markosian 2003, Prior 1959, 1962, 1965, 1970, and 1977, and Zimmerman 1996 and 1998a/b.) Presentists have a hard row to hoe in accounting for the apparent truth of (9). In the previous section we outlined three actualist accounts of (7) and (8). Each has a temporal analog that can be applied to (9).

First, the presentist might appeal to Plantingian individual essences, claiming that (9) is not a singular proposition containing Socrates himself as a constituent, as there is no such entity, but rather a proposition with Socrates's individual essence as a constituent. (9) is then true because that individual essence was instantiated in the past but is no longer instantiated.

Second, the presentist might claim that Socrates does exist, albeit as a nonconcrete object, adopting the temporal analog of the view held by Linsky and Zalta. Then, although (9) is false, if the predicate ‘x exists’ is regimented as ∃y(y=x), a related proposition concerning Socrates's concreteness is true. Socrates was concrete and now, while he still exists, is nonconcrete. (This view carries a commitment to the claim that a concrete object becomes nonconcrete and that a nonconcrete object becomes concrete, which is even more problematic than the claim that concreteness is a contingent property.)

Third, the presentist might follow Adams and distinguish a proposition's being true in a time from its being true at a time. Consider first a negative existential about a currently existing object. It is true that George Bush did not exist in 1820 because the singular proposition [George Bush exists] is false at 1820. The proposition is not true in 1820, because it did not exist when 1820 was present, as its constituent Bush did not exist then. (9), however, is a negative existential about a past object that no longer exists. It is, then, more analogous to (8) from above, illustrating the second half of our intuitions that existence is contingent, than to (7). (8) has a quantificational form on its surface, while (9) appears to be singular. This difference makes is questionable whether appeal to the truth in/truth at distinction can be used by the presentist to develop an account of (9)'s truth and thus whether there is a viable presentist analog to Adams's actualist view.

To see why, focus on the first conjunct of (9): ‘Socrates existed’. This appears to have the form Px(s=x), where P is the past-tense operator ‘it was the case that’. But that carries a commitment to the wholly past object Socrates, contrary to presentism. The presentist must, then, reinterpret (9) so that it does not involve a proposition singular with respect to Socrates, even one embedded in the scope of tense operators. This is problematic, as it entails that the sentences ‘George Bush was sitting’ and ‘Socrates was sitting’ express propositions with radically different forms, despite their evident surface grammatical similarity.

Finally, there is a fourth presentist solution worth discussing, which also has a modal analog not discussed in the previous section. One might insist that, although Socrates does not exist, Socrates is nonetheless a constituent of reality, in the range of the most unrestricted of quantifiers and available as a constituent of singular propositions. This is because there are entities that do not exist. This form of Meinongian presentism, according to which everything that exists at all presently exists, although there are things that do not presently exist and so do not exist at all, has been defended by Mark Hinchliff (Hinchliff 1988; 1996). Many find the distinction between being and existing obscure and the Meinongian metaphysics incredible, but the view promises a solution to the problems similar to possibilist and contingent concreteness solutions but with an alternative metaphysics. (For further discussion of eternalism and presentism, see the entries spacetime: being and becoming in modern physics and time. For discussion of Meinongianism, see existence and nonexistent objects.)

6.2. Temporal Problems for Singular Propositions: Qualitative Change

We raised two questions concerning (9). We discussed the first in section 6.1 and we now turn to the second. In order to better focus attention on the second issues, we switch to an apparent singular proposition about a presently existing object, setting aside the issues connected with the problems of section 6.1.

(10) Bush is sitting.

Bush changes his position, sitting at t and standing at t'. Then (10) is true at t and false at t'. (Not all would agree that the proposition, as opposed to tensed sentence, varies its truth value across time. We discuss this below.) Suppose that (10) is a singular proposition with Bush as a constituent. What is that constituent like? No answer seems to satisfy. By the law of excluded middle, either it satisfies the condition ‘x is sitting’ or it doesn't. If it does, then why is (10) false, as it is at t'; if it doesn't, then it why is (10) true, as it is at t? It also seems strange to think of that (10) itself as changing in its constituents across time, as one and the same proposition is being evaluated at the different times.

One's answers to these questions depends on one's views on the nature of persistence through time and change. Broadly speaking, there are two realist views of change: Perdurantism (or four-dimensionalism or the doctrine of temporal parts), which reduces persisting objects to more fundamental, momentary objects, and endurantism (or three-dimensionalism), which takes persisting objects as primitive, maintaining that a persisting object is “wholly present” at each time it exists (see Crisp and Smith 2005 for an interesting attempt to articulate this notion). Proponents of the perdurantism include Armstrong 1980, Heller 1990, Jubien 1993, Lewis 1971, 1976, 1986, and 1988, Quine 1960 and 1963, Robinson 1982, Russell 1927, Smart 1955 and 1972, Taylor 1955, and Williams 1951, among others. Versions of endurantism are defended in Chisholm 1976, Forbes 1987, Geach 1966 and 1967, Haslanger 1985, 1989a/b, and 2003, Hinchliff 1988 and 1996, Johnston 1983 and 1987, Lowe 1987, 1988, and 1998, Mellor 1981 and 1998, Thomson 1983, van Inwagen 1990 and 2000, Wiggins 1968, 1980, and 2001, and Zimmerman 1996 and 1998a/b, among others. (There are important differences between the versions of endurantism defended in these works, related to whether or not “tense is taken seriously”, presentism is accepted or rejected, whether or not seemingly monadic properties like being age 64 are treated as relations between individuals and times, and whether or not the instantiation relation between individuals and properties is claimed to obtain only relative to a time. See the entries identity over time and temporal parts for further discussion.)

Perdurantists maintain that a persisting object is a sum of momentary temporal parts. An object persists through an interval of time by having numerically distinct temporal parts existing at each moment in that interval. An object undergoes a change in its qualities across time by having numerically distinct temporal parts with contrary qualities. A close cousin of perdurantism is the stage view, defended in Hawley 2001 and Sider 1996, 1997, 2000, and 2001, according to which the subject of temporal predication is a momentary temporal part. Whereas perdurantists claim that a name like ‘Bush’ designates a sum of temporal parts, stage theorists maintain that it designates a momentary object. A past tense predication like ‘x was sitting’ is true of that momentary stage s, assuming this a case of the simple past tense, just in case there is an earlier temporal part that bears the counterpart relation to s that satisfies the condition ‘x is sitting’ (and similarly for future tense predications). If singular propositions are the contents of those sentences, then it is natural to claim that different propositions, with different temporal parts as constituents, are expressed by utterances of the sentence ‘Bush is sitting’ at different times. There are, then, two distinct propositions corresponding to (10).

(S-101) Bush-at-t is sitting.

(S-102) Bush-at-t' is sitting.

(S-101) is false simpliciter, being false both at t and t', while (S-102) is true simpliciter. In general, then, the constituent of a singular proposition is a temporary object.

Proponents of perdurantism and the stage view have natural answers to our questions about the subject constituent of singular propositions like (10). Perdurantists can claim that the subject constituent of (10) is a sum of temporal parts. (10) is true at t because the part of that sum that directly exists at t has the property of sitting; (10) is false at t' because the part of that sum that directly exists at t' has the property of not sitting. Stage theorists can claim that there are a host of distinct propositions corresponding to (10), each with a distinct momentary stage as subject constituent in whatever state the object is in at the time of its existence. Momentary objects have their properties absolutely. So, Bush-at-t is simply sitting, although it will be not sitting in virtue of there being a numerically distinct momentary object that is not sitting that is the first's later counterpart. Bush-at-t' is simply not sitting, although it was sitting in virtue of its earlier counterpart's properties.

These accounts of the constituents of singular propositions concerning an object's changing properties presuppose theories of qualitative change incompatible with the intuition that a persisting object directly bears each of its changing qualities at each time it exists, not inheriting those qualities from the properties of numerically distinct objects. Endurantists take this intuition as a centerpiece. One and the numerically same object, endurantists maintain, exists at different times and directly bearers the qualities the persisting object possesses at any time. The endurantist must, then, develop alternative answers to our questions about (10).

On one version of endurantism, relationalism, seemingly monadic properties like sitting and not sitting are really time indexed properties like sitting-at-t and not sitting-at-t', which are properties that an object simply has, instantiating them (or not, as the case may be) absolutely. Unlike the original unindexed properties of sitting and not sitting, these two indexed properties are not contraries and so there is no problem saying that one and the same object simply has both of them. Like the stage theorist, the relationalist claims that there are in fact a multitude of distinct propositions related to (10), like the following.

(R-101) Bush is sitting-at-t.

(R-102) Bush is sitting-at-t'.

(R-101) and (R-102) have absolute truth values, the first being true simpliciter and the second false simpliciter. An utterance of the sentence ‘Bush is sitting’ on t expresses (R-101) while an utterance of that sentence on t' expresses the distinct proposition (R-102). This much is analogous to the stage theorist's account. But unlike the stage theorist, the relationalist claims that there is a single object that directly bears the properties in question, the time index qualifying the property and not the subject of predication. So, there is a single common subject constituent to all of the distinct (R-10) propositions.

The stage theorist and relationalist both reject the claim that a persisting object directly bears each of contrary properties it has when it undergoes a change in qualities, the stage theorist rejecting that the same object directly bears the qualities at the different times and the relationalist denying that the properties are genuinely contrary. Some claim that rejecting either of the claims is tantamount to rejecting the very notion of a thing's changing its qualities through time. A proponent of the final version of endurantism, a dynamic relativist, insists that one and the same object, Bush himself, in the case of (10), directly bears the genuinely contrary properties of sitting and not sitting. The relativist avoids contradiction by claiming that an object doesn't simply have (or lack) a property simpliciter but has (or lacks) a property relative to a time. Bush has, relative to t, the property of sitting and lacks, relative to t', the property of not sitting. A proponent of this view rejects the idea that there is a single, fundamental, coherent way things are that transcends how things are at a time. While there are several distinct dynamic accounts worth distinguishing, what unites them all is the idea that, at the most fundamental level, a temporally neutral proposition like (10) is true at one time and false at another. A proponent of this view should be particularly troubled by our question about the constituent of (10). While (10) is true at t and false at t', the time relativization does not affect anything intrinsic to the proposition itself; both Bush and the property remain the same when the proposition is evaluated at these different times. But then what is the subject constituent of (10) and what is its connection to the property of sitting?

There are two competing theories to consider. According to the bundle theory, an individual is a bundle of properties. According to the substance theory, an individual is an entity distinct from its properties in which those properties inhere.

One attractions of the bundle theory is its promise of explaining predication in terms of membership, where the object identified with a bundle B of properties instantiates a property F just in case F is among B. This, however, works against a relativist invoking the bundle theory to answer our second problem. Suppose that the subject constituent of a singular proposition is a bundle of properties. What properties are in the bundle? If the object undergoes a change, then is (i) exactly one member of the pair of contrary properties among that bundle, (ii) both properties, or is the bundle (iii) incomplete, containing neither of the pair? (Recall, the relativist claims that it is the same proposition that is true at one time and false at another and so nothing intrinsic to the proposition alters; it must, then, be the same bundle of properties that is the object constituent in both cases.) None of the options seem appealing.

Suppose that, corresponding to (i), the constituent of (10) includes exactly one of the contrary properties of sitting and not sitting: say, not sitting. Then it is hard to see how (10) is true, as it is at t, given that the object constituent is a bundle of properties including the property of not sitting. Suppose that, corresponding to (ii), both properties are among the bundle. Then it is hard to see how Bush exists, given that he is an inconsistent bundle of properties. Finally, suppose that, corresponding to (iii), the bundle of properties identified with the object constituent of (10) contains neither of its changing contrary properties sitting nor not sitting. Then, given the bundle theorist's offered theory of predication, (10) is not true, even at t.

Consider now the substance theory. The relativist proponent of the substance theory might claim that the object constituent of (10) is a bare particular, independent of all its properties in which all those properties inhere. (10) can then be said to vary its truth value across time, being true at t and false at t', without more ado, as the constituent of (10) neither includes nor excludes sitting. (See the entry substance for further discussion.)

Many reject the substance theory because they think it entails that something could exist without any properties whatsoever. While substance theorists do claim that the basic bearers of properties are independent of those properties, being the entities in which properties are, in the first instance, instantiated, it does not follow from this that there is something that can exist without any properties at all. To see why, distinguish, first, an object's temporary properties (i.e., the properties it has at some times of its existence and not at others) from its permanent properties. As far as the problem of temporal qualitative variation goes, the constituent of a singular proposition with o as a constituent need not exclude its permanent properties and so need not be a completely bare particular, as the object instantiates those permanent properties whenever it exists.

Not all permanent properties are necessary. The property of having been conceived in Provo is a permanent property of Susan but contingent, as her mother could have been elsewhere when Susan was conceived. In response to the modal version of our second problem, a substance theorist should claim that the constituents of singular propositions are independent of their contingent properties but involve their necessary properties. Where F is a necessary property of o and G a contingent, temporary property of o, the singular proposition [o is F] is true at evey index while the proposition [o is G] is true at some times and worlds and false at others. o is thus independent of its contingent but not necessary properties. The substance theorist can insist, then that the object constituent of (10) is not a property-less bare particular, but instead an entity clad in its necessary properties.

Finally, many substance theorists, following Aristotle, have found it natural to distinguish necessary from essential properties, claiming that there are some necessary properties that are accidental. For example, everything necessarily has the property of being self-identical, but that property is a poor candidate as an essential property. A thing's essence provides its definition, answering the What is it? question. Being told that the thing is self-identical does not provide much by way of an answer to that question, as it does not offer grounds for distinguishing the thing in question from other things. Contrast this with the general essence of being human. Being told of some particular that it is a human does provide insight into what the thing is. And the property being identical to o is a good candidate for a singular essence. While the latter property does not so much ground the identity and diversity of o as simply presuppose it, it is a property cognitive grasp of which constitutes an understanding of what o is.

A temporary, contingent singular proposition like (10) is true at some indices and false at others, while a necessary singular proposition, like the proposition [Bush is such that 2+2=4], has the same truth value at every index. Essentialist singular propositions, like the proposition [Bush is human], also have the same truth value at every index, but, unlike mere necessary propositions, are intrinsically true, in the sense that an adequate account of the subject position constituent, and so a full understanding of what that entity is involves conceiving of it as having that property, provides one with the grounds to recognize it as true without further logical operation or inference. An individual and its essential properties may still be conceptually distinct entities for the substance theorist, the substance theorist can still claim that an individual is nonetheless tightly connected to some of its properties. The substance theorist can thus does not need to conceive of the object constituents of singular propositions as bare particulars.

7. Conclusion

There are compelling reasons to countenance singular propositions as the contents of some sentences of natural language and our attitudes. But singular propositions give rise to metaphysical difficulties, as propositions have traditionally been taken to be necessary, permanent existents, but ordinary objects are not. Solutions to these difficulties require stances on general issues in the metaphysics of modality and time. In this essay we have surveyed some of the reasons for accepting singular propositions, examined the metaphysical difficulties they create, and distinguished several strategies for solving those difficulties.


Philosophy of Language and Mind: Sections 1–4

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Modality and Time: Sections 5–6

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Sadly, Gregory Fitch passed away January 27, 2007. Prior to his death, he made arrangements for Michael Nelson to take over the entry as co-author. Although the two authors discussed much of this material and shared a common perspective on the content of this article, Sections 3 and especially 4 are new and were written independently by the new co-author. Fitch's original, solely authored entry is available in the SEP Archives, at <>. (See the version history.) Thanks to Penelope Mackie for extremely helpful editorial advice.

Copyright © 2013 by
Greg Fitch
Michael Nelson <>

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