John Stuart Mill

First published Thu Aug 25, 2016

John Stuart Mill (1806–73) was the most influential English language philosopher of the nineteenth century. He was a naturalist, a utilitarian, and a liberal, whose work explores the consequences of a thoroughgoing empiricist outlook. In doing so, he sought to combine the best of eighteenth-century Enlightenment thinking with newly emerging currents of nineteenth-century Romantic and historical philosophy. His most important works include System of Logic (1843), On Liberty (1859), Utilitarianism (1861) and An Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy (1865).

1. Life

John Stuart Mill was born on 20 May 1806 in Pentonville, then a northern suburb of London, to Harriet Barrow and James Mill. James Mill, a Scotsman, had been educated at Edinburgh University—taught by, amongst others, Dugald Stewart—and had moved to London in 1802, where he was to become a friend and prominent ally of Jeremy Bentham and the Philosophical Radicals. John’s remarkable education, famously recounted in his Autobiography, was conducted with the intention of equipping him for leadership of the next generation of radicalism. For this, at least, it prepared him well. Starting with Greek at age three and Latin at age eight, Mill had absorbed most of the classical canon by age twelve—along with algebra, Euclid, and the major Scottish and English historians. In his early teenage years, he studied political economy, logic, and calculus, utilising his spare time to digest treatises on experimental science as an amusement. At age fifteen—upon returning from a year-long trip to France, a nation he would eventually call home—he started work on the major treatises of philosophy, psychology and government. All this was conducted under the strict daily supervision of his father—with young John holding primary responsibility for the education of his siblings (Reeves 2007: 11–27).

The intensity of study and weight of expectation took its toll. Mill had internalised the radical and utilitarian creed during his education—a process capped off with a close reading of Bentham in Dumont’s French translation and editorial responsibility for Bentham’s Rationale of Judicial Evidence—and had begun to put it into practise as a youthful propagandist. But he quickly found that his education had not prepared him for life. Mill suffered, aged twenty, a “mental crisis”.

[I]t occurred to me to put the question directly to myself: “Suppose that all your objects in life were realized; that all the changes in institutions and opinions which you are looking forward to, could be completely effected at this very instant: would this be a great joy and happiness to you?” And an irrepressible self-consciousness distinctly answered, “No!” […] I seemed to have nothing left to live for. (Autobiography, I: 139).

Mill’s malaise continued through 1826–7 (Capaldi 2004: 55ff.). Though such episodes were to recur throughout his life, his initial recovery was found in the poetry of the Romantics. A new side developed to Mill’s character, and he now emphasised the importance of the culture of the feelings as well as the need for social reform. Mill particularly valued Wordsworth during this period—though his new interests quickly led him to the work of Coleridge, Carlyle, and Goethe. Mill’s acquaintance with these thinkers gave him a lasting openness to Romantic thought—and an acute awareness that the Enlightenment philosophy with which he had been brought up only contained “one side of the truth” (Autobiography, I: 169). His primary philosophic goal became, and would throughout his life remain, to integrate and reconcile these opposing schools of philosophy. “[W]hoever could master the premises and combine the methods of both, would possess the entire English philosophy of their age” (Coleridge, X: 121).

This new-found eclecticism also led to productive engagement with, amongst others, Francois Guizot, Auguste Comte, and Tocqueville. All would leave a lasting influence on Mill’s work, but in this period, another figure also loomed large: Harriet Taylor (Kinzer 2007: 77–111). Mill met Harriet at a dinner party in 1830, and the two quickly fell in love. Harriet had, four years’ prior, married John Taylor—an amiable, though intellectually unadventurous, pharmacist. The three eventually came to an arrangement by which Mill would be allowed to visit Harriet at the Taylors’ country retreat when her husband was not present, and at their London residence while he visited his Club. This arrangement persisted for years, and, by all accounts, Mill and Harriet’s relationship was entirely platonic. John Taylor died in 1849, with Harriet and Mill marrying in 1851—though not before the perceived scandal had caused a rift between Mill and many of his friends. Mill felt first-hand the stifling effect of Victorian judgmentalism and oppressive norms of propriety—a subject he would later take up in On Liberty.

Mill idolized Harriet, and credited her with virtual co-authorship of many of his works. Untangling the influence she exerted upon Mill’s thought is complicated, precisely because the two worked so closely together on what would become many of Mill’s central ideas. She died, however, in 1858, while Mill and she were travelling through France. Harriet was buried in Avignon, where Mill subsequently purchased a house close by the cemetery, and lived for the rest of his life. Mill inscribed on her grave that

[s]he was the sole earthly delight of those who had the happiness to belong to her. […] Were there but a few hearts and intellects like hers this earth would already become the hoped-for heaven.

Harriet’s death, in fact, came only a little over a month after Mill’s retirement from the East India Company, for which he had worked for almost thirty-five years. Mill had taken a position as a junior clerk at aged seventeen, working directly under his father, who had received the post on the basis of his authorship of A History of British India. John rose through the ranks, eventually holding the position of Chief Examiner of Correspondence—a position roughly equivalent to Undersecretary of State, involving managing dispatches for colonial administration (Zastoupil 1994). The job, Mill noted, provided the stability of income needed for an author without independent means, and was not so taxing as to prevent him exerting the majority of his time and mental energy on his philosophical pursuits. In 1865, he was elected as the Member of Parliament for Westminster for the Liberal Party. In keeping with his views on distinction between representation and delegation, Mill declined to actively canvass for the seat—indeed, he remained, for most of the campaign, at his home in Avignon. While in the Commons, he championed what he perceived as unpopular but important causes: the extension of suffrage to women, Irish reform, and the prosecution of Governor Eyre for atrocities committed during his administration of Jamaica. He did not win a second term, being defeated by in 1868 (Kinzer, Robson, and Robson 1992).

Mill, it might be noted, never held a university post—nor did he even attend university himself—except for the “honorary” position of Rector of the University of St Andrews. He was, throughout his life, a religious sceptic, having been “brought up from the first without any religious belief” (Autobiography, I: 41; see also Matz 2017). He died in Avignon on 7 May 1873, and was buried next to his wife.

2. Mill’s Naturalism

2.1 Anti a priorism

Mill’s entire philosophical outlook is informed by a spirit of naturalism (Skorupski 1989: 5ff.). It is not easy, however, to get a foothold on this naturalism. Mill’s general picture of mind and world is established by appealing to what we are warranted in believing about the nature of those objects—and hence relies on a substantive account of knowledge. His account of knowledge, however, draws upon his general picture of mind, world, and their relation—and therefore depends on a theory of what there is. This circularity will be discussed in §3.7. As an entry point into Mill’s overall system for the purposes of exposition, however, we might simply note Mill’s commitment to the claim that human beings are wholly part of nature, keeping in mind that Mill does not think of this as his unsupported starting point, but itself a substantive claim.

Mill’s belief that the mind is part of nature might usefully be contrasted with those philosophers who hold that the mind has some exalted place in the order of things. Relevant contrasts are, for instance, theists who hold that our minds have been given to us by an omnipotent and benevolent God for the purpose of comprehension, and idealists who hold that the mind has a formative role in constructing the world. For such thinkers, a basic harmony between the architecture of mind and world might seem to be a given—as such, if our experience could be found to take a certain form, then we could infer facts about how the world must be composed. Mill rejects this move.

Such an inference would only be warrantable, if we could know a priori that we must have been created capable of conceiving whatever is capable of existing: that the universe of thought and that of reality, the Microcosm and the Macrocosm (as they were once called) must have been framed in complete correspondence with one another […] but an assumption more destitute of evidence could scarcely be made. (Examination, IX: 68)

As logically independent matters of fact, Mill thought there could be no seamless inference from the composition of our mind to how the rest of the world is, or must be. Mill holds, therefore, that there can be no genuine a priori knowledge of objective facts. Mill’s view that there are “no truths cognizable by the mind’s inward light, and grounded on intuitive evidence” (Coleridge, X: 125) holds across the board.

The doctrine of a priori principles is one and the same doctrine, whether applied to the ὂν or the δέον—to the knowledge of truth or that of duty. (Whewell on Moral Philosophy, X: 171)

All genuine knowledge, then, whether theoretical or ethical, must be obtained by observation and experience.

2.2 Associationism

We might call this Mill’s anti apriorism about knowledge—the view runs deep, giving an anthropological and empirical character to all of his philosophy. Mill adds to it a psychological account of the underlying mechanism by which we form ideas. Here, he follows very much in the tradition of the British Empiricists—the theory being traced by Mill back to Hobbes, through Locke and Hartley, and to James Mill’s publication of The Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind—in endorsing what has become known as associationist psychology: “the theory which resolves all the phenomena of the mind into ideas of sensation connected together by the law of association” (Blakey’s History of Moral Science, X: 23).

All of our ideas and beliefs, Mill holds, have their origins in sense impressions. Ideas or sensations which are either (i) “similar” or (ii) “frequently experienced (or thought of) either simultaneously or in immediate succession”, come to be thought of together, and are eventually inseparably bound together in our mind, forming more complex ideas (System, VIII: 852; see Wilson 1990). The theory aims to derive even our most abstract ideas from experience—“Place, Extension, Substance, Cause, and the rest, are conceptions put together out of ideas of sensation by the known laws of association” (Examination, IX: 9)—and thereby undermine the intuitionist’s claim that such ideas are a priori.

Apparently a priori beliefs are subject to a similar undermining analysis.

There are innumerable cases of Belief for which no cause can be assigned, except that something has created so strong an association between two ideas that the person cannot separate them in thought. […] [T]his is one of the component and most fertile sources of erroneous thought. (Notes on the Analysis, XXXI: 161).

To give one of Mill’s own examples, the apparently intuitive belief that space is infinite is explained as in fact being wholly the result of a process of association.

We have never perceived any object, or any portion of space, which had not other space beyond it. And we have been perceiving objects and portions of space from the moment of birth. How then could the idea of an object, or of a portion of space, escape becoming inseparably associated with the idea of additional space beyond? Every instant of our lives helps to rivet this association, and we never have had a single experience tending to disjoin it. (Examination, IX: 82)

From this process, we come to form the belief that space is infinite. But,

an association, however close, between two ideas, is not a sufficient ground of belief; it is not evidence that the corresponding facts are united in external nature. (Notes on the Analysis, XXXI: 163)

Such beliefs must be tested by reasoning about what we ought to believe—a process we shall investigate below, in §3.2.

3. Mill’s Theoretical Philosophy

3.1 Philosophy of Language and Logic

Though Mill holds that basic human thought is possible without language, “in complicated cases [it] can take place in no other way” (System, VII: 19). As such, a study of human beings’ theoretical engagement with the world demands clarity on this “fundamental instrument of thought” (System, VIII: 663; see also Losonsky 2006: 119–28). Mill’s account of language turns upon a distinction between the denotation and connotation of a word. Words denote the objects which they are true of; they connote specific attributes of those objects. The word “man”, for instance, denotes, or is true of, all men—“Peter, Paul, John, and an indefinite number of other individuals” (System, VII: 31). But it connotes the attributes in virtue of which the word “man” applies to these individuals—“corporeity, animal life, rationality, and a certain external form, which for distinction we call the human” (System, VII: 31). Connotation determines denotation in the following sense: to know the connotation of a word is to know the necessary and sufficient conditions to determine whether a given object is denoted by that word.

Not all words have connotation. Mill notes that words can be singular or general. “Cicero” is a singular name—applying to only one object, namely Cicero. “Roman” is, by contrast, a general name—applying to many objects, including Cicero but also Augustus, Nero, and many others. While “all concrete general names are connotative” (System, VII: 32)—signaling the attributes which justify our application of the name to individual objects—the same cannot be said of singular names. To be sure, some singular names are connotative—“the author of De Re Publica” is, as we would say, a definite description, and picks out one individual by way of signaling its attributes—but not all are. The name “Cicero” does not connote any attributes at all—but is a proper name, and serves simply as a marker for that individual (Schwartz 2014).[1]

The analysis affords a simple means of determining the meaning of a vast range of simple propositions—those portions of discourse “in which one predicate is affirmed or denied of one subject” by way of a copula such as is, or is not (System, VII: 81)—and their composition into more complex linguistic entities (Skorupski 1989: 178–92). The proposition S is P can be understood, in the case that P is a connoting term, as the claim that the object denoted by S has the attribute connoted by P. “The summit of Chimborazo is white” asserts a fact about the world—that the object denoted by the name “the summit of Chimborazo” has the attribute connoted by the name “white” (System, VII: 97). The proposition S is P, where P is a non-connoting term, can be understood as the claim that the object denoted by S is the same object as that denoted by P. “Tully is Cicero” asserts merely a fact about those names—that the name “Tully” is used to refer to the same object as the name “Cicero”.

The difference is key. We learn nothing about the world when we learn that “Tully is Cicero” is true—this proposition does not convey a fact about how things are, but rather about our own linguistic conventions of naming (System, VII: 110). The proposition is, in Mill’s terminology, merely verbal. Such propositions are key to understanding the uninformative nature of a priori propositions and a priori reasoning. Mill, quite rightly, does not make the claim that a priori propositions such as “every man is a living creature” are, like “Tully is Cicero”, assertions merely about our own conventions of naming. But he does argue that such propositions share the feature of conveying no genuine information about the world. For the connotation of “man”—the attributes it signals—includes the connotation of “living creature”. Someone who already knows the meaning of the term “man” is not told anything about how the world is when told that “every man is a living creature” (Kroon 2017: 214–6).

Deductive or a priori reasoning, Mill thinks, is similarly empty. Predating the revolution in logic that the late nineteenth-century ushered in, Mill thinks of deductive reasoning primarily in terms of the syllogism. Syllogistic reasoning, he argues can elicit no new truths about how the world is: “nothing ever was, or can be proved by syllogism which was not known, or assumed to be known, before” (System, VII: 183).

Premise 1: All men are mortal,

Premise 2: Socrates is a man,

Conclusion: Socrates is mortal.

In standard syllogistic inferences, he argues, for arguments to be valid, the conclusion must already have been asserted in the premises. By way of example, in the above argument, the conclusion must already have been asserted in the Premise 1—the proposition that all men are mortal must be said to include the proposition that Socrates is mortal if the argument is to be valid. No new knowledge is therefore acquired in reasoning from premises to conclusion. The claim is perhaps more difficult to support than Mill appreciates, depending, as it does, upon equating of the meaning of a universal statement with the meaning of a conjunction of singular statement (Fumerton 2017: 200). Nevertheless, Mill’s argument that we can learn nothing about the world by reflecting on our language dovetails neatly with his naturalistic claim that all genuine cognitive advancement must take place by observation.

The suggestion that deductive reasoning cannot lead us to any new knowledge prompts two questions. Firstly, if not the advancement of knowledge, what is the function of syllogistic reasoning? And, secondly, what are we to say about apparently deductive reasoning which manifestly does lead us to new knowledge? To the first question, Mill answers that syllogistic reasoning allows us “test” our commitment to general propositions (System, VII: 196). In making arguments such as the one above, we cannot acquire new knowledge: for no facts beyond those which are in the premises are present in the conclusion. But the implications of holding a general premise are more clearly displayed by the syllogistic reasoning, and this, in certain instances, may cause us to re-evaluate our commitment to that premise. To the second question, Mill holds that where we do gain genuinely new knowledge—in cases of mathematics and geometry, for instance—we must, at some level, be reasoning inductively. Mill, that is to say, attempts to account for the genuine informativeness of mathematical and geometric reasoning by denying that they are in any real sense a priori. We shall return to this claim in §3.4.

3.2 Foundations of Theoretical Reason

We cannot acquire any genuine knowledge a priori, then. Mill holds that knowledge can be obtained only by empirical observation, and by reasoning which takes place on the ground of such observations. This principle stands at the heart of his radical empiricism. Sense perceptions are the “original data, or ultimate premises of our knowledge” (System, VII: 7)—knowledge of greater levels of complexity is arrived at solely by inferences from that original data. And, as we shall see, Mill grants the validity of only one kind of inference. “Inference, consequently all Proof, and all discovery of truths not self-evident, consists of inductions, and the interpretation of inductions” (System, VII: 283).

Induction properly so called […] may […] be summarily defined as Generalization from Experience. It consists in inferring from some individual instances in which a phenomenon is observed to occur, that it occurs in all instances of a certain class; namely, in all which resemble the former, in what are regarded as the material circumstances. (System, VII: 306)

Mill rightly notes that upon observing that x1, x2, x3, … xn are P, human beings are disposed to form the belief that some relevantly similar xn+1 is P. Upon seeing ten swans, all white, for instance, we tend to believe that an eleventh unseen swan is also white. But, Mill holds, such inferences are not something we are merely disposed to believe, but something we have reason to believe—inferences of this general form are warranted. The question arises, of course, how it is that we can be warranted in believing the results of induction prior to their confirmation or disconfirmation—how it comes to be that we can be justified in believing an inductively suggested conclusion.

Mill offers two answers to this question. The first, we might term his iterative validation of induction. We are warranted in believing enumerative inductions, Mill thinks, because “[t]he universe, so far as known to us, is so constituted, that whatever is true in any one case, is true in all cases of a certain description” (System, VII: 306). This uniformity of nature, however, is something we do not, and could not, know a priori, but only itself as “as an instance of induction” (System, VII: 307). We know, in other words, by an act of induction, that inductive generalizations tend to be true, and that induction is therefore a good way of reasoning. Induction is, in this sense, self-supporting.

Of course, this justification is circular, as Mill realizes. If we are warranted in believing that induction is in general a good way of reasoning only to the extent that our past inductions are themselves taken to have been good inferences, then the question remains how those inductions can be warranted forms of inference (cf. Fumerton 2009: 167–8). Mill’s second answer, which we might term his initiating validation of induction, addresses this issue.

Many of the uniformities existing among phenomena are so constant, and so open to observation, as to force themselves upon involuntary recognition. (System, VII: 318)

We are, Mill claims, naturally inclined to reason inductively, and upon critical inspection, acts of induction strike us as “deserving of reliance” (System, VII: 319). We adopt induction “spontaneously” as a method of reasoning—and under free consideration, it seems to us reasonable to do so (System, VII: 317).

This initiating validation of the principle of induction is directly parallel to Mill’s argument for the principle of utility (Macleod 2014). We are naturally inclined to desire pleasure, and such desires, when we attend to them, strike us as reasonable—as being desire-worthy. Similarly, we are naturally disposed to believe in inductive generalisations, and such beliefs, when we attend to them, strike us as reasonable—being belief-worthy. In each case, there is no further initial justification of our natural reasoning propensities beyond the fact that, upon critical inspection, they strike us as sound. Indeed, that valid principles of reason—practical and theoretical—are established by casting a critical eye upon how we in fact do reason should be of no surprise: such an anthropological approach to the normative is forced by Mill’s naturalism. We cannot know what constitutes good reasoning a priori, and as such “[t]he laws of our rational faculty, like those of every other natural agency, are only learnt by seeing the agent at work” (System, VII: 833).

The evidence provided by critically examining our natural modes of reasoning is of course defeasible—as in the case of the ‘proof’ of the principle of utility, the initiating validation is not a proof in the traditional deductive sense. But the justification provided is real nevertheless. And from here, iterative validation can increase our confidence that we are warranted in reasoning inductively: further inductions ranging over inductions can improve our reasoning abilities by establishing in more and more precise ways the circumstances in which inductive moves are good ones to make. Indeed, this process of sharpening inductive reasoning by “ulterior revision of […] spontaneous generalizations” (System, VII: 319) is, as we shall see, the very heart of the process of scientific thinking.

As noted above, Mill claims not only that enumerative induction is a valid principle, but that it is the sole principle by which we are justified in inferring unobserved facts about the world. [2] In particular, he rejects the independent validity of the “Hypothetical Method”—what has come to be known as inference to the best explanation (System, VII: 492). We are not entitled, that is to say, to believe in something unobserved solely on the basis that it explains the observed facts (Skorupski 1989: 197–202; see also Macleod 2016; Jacobs 1991). A hypothesis

is not to be received probably true because it accounts for all the known phenomena; since this is a condition sometimes fulfilled tolerably well by two conflicting hypotheses. (System, VII: 500)

This is not to deny the role of hypothesis in investigation altogether, however. Mill claims that hypotheses about unobserved entities made in an effort to explain empirical observations can provide useful suggestions, but that entitlement to believe can only be provided by reasoning based on the principle of enumerative induction.

[H]ypothesis, by suggesting observations and experiments, puts us on the road to that independent evidence if it be really attainable. (System, VII: 496, my emphasis)

3.3 Sharpening Reason: Philosophy of Science

All genuine inferential knowledge we have of the world, then, is justified by the use of simple enumerative induction—this is “free-standing and the sole load-bearing structure in Mill’s logic” (Godden 2017: 175). The reasoning that takes place in our scientific engagement with the world, Mill holds, is simply the application of a particularly refined version of such enumerative induction.

[T]he most scientific proceeding can be no more than an improved form of that which was primitively pursued by the human understanding while undirected by science. (System, VII: 318)

Improvement to inductive methodology comes by theoretical reason’s reflective self-examination—inductive consideration of induction itself.

Experience testifies, that among the uniformities which it exhibits or seems to exhibit, some are more to be relied on than others […] This mode of correcting one generalization by means of another, a narrower generalization by a wider, which common sense suggests and adopts in practice, is the real type of scientific Induction. (System, VII: 319)

The history of science, as Mill sees it, is the history of the growth of our knowledge by inductive reason, but also the growth of our knowledge of inductive reason. As we learn more about the world, induction becomes more and more established, and with this it becomes self-critical and systematic.

“[W]e may discover, by mere observation without experiment, a real uniformity in nature” (System, VII: 386). Where possible, however, engaging in experimental activity is the most direct way to uncover the causal relations between events, because it allows us to “meet with some of the antecedents apart from the rest, and observe what follows from them; or some of the consequents, and observe by what they are preceded” (System, VII: 381). Mill claims that, as science has progressed, four methods have emerged as successful in isolating causes of observed phenomena (System, VII: 388–406; see Cobb 2017: 240–1). Firstly, the Method of Agreement: where instances of phenomenon A are always accompanied with phenomenon a, even when other circumstances accompanying A are varied, we have reason to believe that A and a are causally related. Secondly, the Method of Difference: where the only distinguishing feature marking situations in which phenomenon a occurs or does not occur is the presence or absence of phenomenon A, there is reason to think that A is an indispensable part of the cause of a. (If we have noted, via the Method of Agreement, that in all instances of A, a is present, we can, where possible, systematically withdraw A, to determine whether A is a cause of a by the Method of Difference. Mill terms this the Joint Method of Agreement and Difference.) Thirdly, the Method of Residues: against the knowledge that A is the cause of a, and B the cause of b, where ABC causes abc, and AB causes merely ab, we can (by ruling out that c is the joint effect of AB) regard C as the cause of c. Fourthly, the Method of Concomitant Variations: whenever a varies when A varies in some particular manner, a may be thought to be causally connected to A.

Such methods must, of course, be applied cautiously—the existence of background conditions makes it difficult to say with certainty that any individual phenomenon is in fact the causally active agent—and results will always be provisional, and open to further correction (Ducheyne 2008). But by carefully varying conditions, Mill holds, we can isolate causes and reveal the laws which govern natural phenomena. We learn first to explain individual events by showing that they are instances of known causal laws, and then “in a similar manner, a law or uniformity in nature is said to be explained, when another law or laws are pointed out, of which that law itself is but a case” (System, VII: 464). By continued application of the Canons of Induction, the most general Laws of Nature can be ascertained—this is the ultimate goal of science. Mill adopts a Humean account of such laws as regularities: “The expression, Laws of Nature, means nothing but the uniformities which exist among natural phenomena” (System, VII: 318). Nevertheless, he thinks that science reveals the deep structure of the world—how things genuinely are.

Kepler did not put what he had conceived into the facts, but saw it in them. A conception implies, and corresponds to, something conceived: and though the conception itself is not in the facts, but in our mind, yet if it is to convey any knowledge relating to them, it must be a conception of something which really is in the facts, some property which they actually possess, and which they would manifest to our senses, if our senses were able to take cognizance of it. (System, VII: 295; cf. System, VII: 651)

Mill’s insistence that the process of science involves finding the structure already present in nature gives his philosophy a realist orientation. Perhaps the clearest instance of such realism in his work, however, is the claim that “Kinds have a real existence in nature” (System, VII: 122). Scientific analysis of nature, Mill holds, uncovers a “radical distinction in the things themselves” (System, VII: 123).

In so far as a natural classification is grounded on real Kinds, its groups are certainly not conventional; it is perfectly true that they do not depend upon an arbitrary choice of the naturalist. (System, VIII: 720)

Such Kinds are marked not by the possession of some metaphysical essence—but by their marking “an indeterminate multitude of properties not derivable from one another” (System, VII: 126). Some groups of objects share characteristics because those characteristics are the very grounds of their being grouped together—Real kinds share an unknown number of similarities because they have a shared nature. The notion is closely, though not unproblematically, related to the modern notion of a Natural Kind (Magnus 2015).

Because Mill’s naturalism commits him to the principle that “[t]he laws of our rational faculty […] are only learnt by seeing the agent at work”, the investigation of scientific methodology pursued in the System of Logic takes the form of a theoretical investigation of lessons learnt from the history of successful scientific practice. It is perhaps odd, then, that Mill himself was not a historian of science of any real depth. As a matter of biographical fact, Mill’s knowledge of this topic was derived principally from secondary sources—William Whewell’s History of Inductive Science, John Herschel’s Discourse on the Study of Natural Philosophy and August Comte’s Cours de Positive Philosophie—and the sections of the System which make significant appeal to the history of science were significantly indebted to the research conducted on his behalf by Alexander Bain (Autobiography, I: 215–7, 255; Bain 1904: 137, 141). Had Mill been better acquainted with the history of actual scientific practice, it is questionable whether he would have insisted that the story of scientific progress is simply the story of the steady use of observation and induction—whether the Canons of Induction really are exhaustive of the way in which scientific investigation has enabled humans to obtain knowledge of the world. A detailed anthropological study of the history of successful scientific practice is likely to reveal the irreducible use of imaginative hypothesis-making—not to mention changing questions and ideals of the sort later highlighted by Thomas Kuhn (1962). Such was the basis for a telling historico-normative debate between Whewell and Mill—the former arguing that scientific reasoning had and should involve the creative a priori development of concepts prior to the discovery of laws, the latter claiming, as can be seen in the quote above, that observation and induction alone could track facts about the world and elicit the concepts used in science (Snyder 2006).

3.4 Arithmetic, Geometry and Necessity

Amongst the Laws of Nature learnt by way of inductive reasoning are the laws of geometry and arithmetic. It is worth emphasizing that in no case does Mill think that the ultimately inductive nature of the sciences—whether physical, mathematical, or social—precludes the deductive organization and practice of the science (Ryan 1987: 3–20). Manifestly, we do work through many inferences in deductive terms—and this is nowhere clearer than in the case of mathematics. Mill’s claim is simply that any premise or non-verbal inference can only be as strong as the inductive justification that supports it.

Arithmetic, Mill holds, is at base non-verbal. That two plus one is equal to three is not

a definition of the word three; a statement that mankind have agreed to use the name three as a sign exactly equivalent to two and one; to call by the former name whatever is called by the other more clumsy name. (System, VII: 253)

In contrast to many in the empiricist tradition—including his father—Mill holds that mathematical propositions assert genuine facts. “[T]here is in every step of arithmetical or algebraically calculation a real induction, a real inference of facts from facts” (System, VII: 254). That we perform operations in a deductive manner in the following case:

\[ \begin{align} 2 \times (2+1) & = 2 \times 3\\ & = 6\\ \end{align} \]

should not obscure that the validity of each move is established by induction. We establish that two plus one is equal to three by generalization from specific instances: that two pebbles and one pebble together make three pebbles, that two horses and one horse together make three horses, and so on. So too other such arithmetic laws. Of course, as is the case with our discovery of physical laws, the laws which we learn first are, as the “Science of Number” grows more sophisticated, subsumed as instances of more fundamental laws—and can eventually be shown to follow from the axioms of mathematics (System, VII: 253, 608ff.).

Geometrical propositions, too, are inferred from premises which themselves have real content. Such premises—that, for instance, we can draw a straight line connecting any two single points—are not mere verbal propositions. Indeed, Mill claims, such premises are not strictly even true of the real space we encounter in experience: neither perfectly single points, nor perfectly straight lines exist in nature. These are rather idealizations of that space—but idealizations which are based on principles that could only be known by inductive generalization of our observations. The same holds for the results of geometric reasoning (System, VII: 224ff.).[3]

Mill’s account of mathematics is brief, and raises many issues. Amongst the most pressing questions pertain to the status of the objects which mathematicians talk about. The Platonist can characterize the claims of mathematics as claims about abstract objects—but, as a naturalist, no such option is open to Mill. “All numbers must be numbers of something: there are no such things as numbers in the abstract” (System, VII: 254). Similarly, there are no real objects corresponding to the definitions of geometry (System, VII: 225). Mill, rather, claims that numbers are properties of aggregates and as such denote aggregates with those properties, and takes geometrical objects to be limit cases of real world objects (System, VII: 610–1, 226–9). More, however, needs to be said about the referents of the entities appealed to in the higher regions of mathematics—higher order sets, imaginary numbers, the transfinites—as well as how to construe ‘limit cases’ naturalistically (Shapiro 2000: 91–102, 226–56; Kitcher 1998). One can, perhaps, take mathematical objects to be fictions (Balaguer 2014)—but specifying how such fictions can be subject to constrained standards of truth and falsity remains difficult.

That Mill holds that even mathematics is founded upon inductive reasoning is perhaps most interesting because it demonstrates the radical and thoroughgoing nature of his empiricism. Indeed, Mill saw this aspect of his work in just this way—combatting the a priori and intuitionist school by “driv[ing] it from its stronghold” (Autobiography, I: 233). Mill’s denial of the a priori status of mathematical propositions, of course, challenges the commonplace idea that, when true, such propositions are true necessarily. Indeed, the rejection of the possibility of a priori knowledge as such challenges the notion that there are any necessary truths. Mill does not shy away from this implication. Truths can be better or worse established—central or peripheral to our understanding of the world—and we can therefore be more or less willing to abandon them. But Mill shows little interest in principled or absolute modal distinctions between necessary and contingent truths. Rather, Mill argues, some propositions seem to us necessary because of processes of psychological association make them so ingrained that their denial seems to us inconceivable.

3.5 The Mind in the World: Psychology, Ethology, and Freedom

As was noted above (§2.1), Mill’s naturalism involves the claim that human beings and their minds are wholly a part of nature. As such, they are subject to causal laws in just the same manner as the rest of natural world—empirical study of the mind, Mill holds, reveals that it is governed by the laws of associationistic psychology. Mill’s associationism differs in key respects from that of his predecessors—he shows more concern to do justice to the spontaneity of mind (Bain’s Psychology, XI: 335), the world-directed nature of representational thought (Notes on the Analysis, XXXI: 413), and the fact that some complex ideas cannot be accounted for in terms of the mechanical combination of simple ideas present in sense experience (System, VIII: 852–6). Such modifications of his associationistic inheritance were, in part, a reaction to points made by the Germano-Coleridgean school. His account, nevertheless, remains firmly within the tradition of British empiricism—and he never wavers from a commitment to the claim that our mental life is governed by causal laws operating in a deterministic fashion. Indeed, Mill holds out hope that our understanding of such laws will improve—and even shows interest in the promise of understanding the “material conditions” of thought in the brain and nervous system (Bain’s Psychology, XI: 348).

The character of the mind of an individual, Mill holds, is a function entirely of the experiences that individual has undergone. In this sense, Mill holds firm to the eighteenth-century empiricists’ doctrine of the tabula rasa. In Mill’s hands, however, it becomes transformed into a characteristically nineteenth-century claim that human nature itself is malleable (Mandelbaum 1971: 141ff.). Specific experiences, to be sure, write their lessons on our minds—but background conditions, which differ from culture to culture, play an equally important role. Such acculturation affects the characters, desires, and dispositions of human beings, which vary radically depending on the setting of human beings—a point noted by many of Mill’s romantic contemporaries, and one which influenced the direction of his utilitarianism. Human nature exhibits “astonishingly pliability” (Civilization, XVIII: 145).

[I]f there are some tendencies of human nature […] which are the same in all ages and countries, these never form the whole of the tendencies. (Spirit of the Age, XXII: 256–7)

But it also affects our beliefs and our modes of perceiving the world. As Mill notes,

A great part of what seems observation is really inference […] For in almost every act of our perceiving faculties, observation and inferences are intimately blended. What we are said to observe is usually a compound result, of which one-tenth may be observation, and the remaining nine-tenths inference. (System, VIII: 641–2)

What are properly inferences from our observations come by processes of association to seem as observations themselves. I observe, properly, only a certain sensory manifold, and infer that this is my brother—but, with repetition, the inference becomes merged by association with the observation, and I take the inferred content to be part of the observation itself. Processes of association, that is to say, renders our observations deeply theory laden. And the theories with which they are laden, of course, will vary with social setting.

The systematic science treating the topic of how upbringing and environment affect the formation of individuals, Mill terms “ethology” (System, VIII: 861). Such a science, which would utilize the principles of psychology to allow us to determine the conditions most conducive or damaging to the production of characters we think desirable, “is still to be created” (System, VIII: 872–3). Nevertheless, much of Mill’s work can be seen as an attempt to start such a research programme, charting the effects of social conditions on the creation of character—his own character in the Autobiography, that of women in the Subjection, and those of democratic societies in On Liberty (Ball 2010).

Individuals’ characters are the result of causal processes—and such characters determine their actions.

No one who believed that he knew thoroughly the circumstances of any case, and the characters of the different persons concerned, would hesitate to foretell how all of them would act. (System, VIII: 837)

Given that individuals are subject to such laws, there is little reason to think that the societies composed of individuals will not be subject to natural laws (System, VIII: 879). And, indeed, Mill thinks it possible to specify laws by which societies evolve from the state of barbarism to civilization—“laws which regulate the succession between one state of society and another” (System, VIII: 912)—and chart, scientifically, the process of history (Levin 2004; see also Macleod 2017). “The order of human progress” is guided with “a sort of necessity established […] by the general laws of human nature” (System, VIII: 938).

Understanding the human world scientifically—understanding it as part of the natural world—of course puts pressure on the notion that human beings are in any real sense free. Mill is clear that human actions could be “unerringly inferred” if their antecedents were known, but nevertheless maintains that this deterministic stance does not “conflict in the smallest degree with what is called our feeling of freedom” (System, VIII: 837). Our actions are causally determined, but nevertheless, Mill maintains, we are free (Ryan 1987: 103–131). Mill adopts a compatibilist account of human freedom. Although it is true that our character and desires, in combination with a set of circumstances, causally necessitates some particular action, it is not true that if that person had some alternative character and set of desires that that same cause would necessitate that same action. Had that person had different desires, or a different character, he might well have acted differently. This, Mill concedes, would be of little consolation if our character and desires are beyond the control of an individual to influence. But, he points out, we can influence our character and desires. We can place ourselves in circumstances that modify our character, and we can practice better habits.

[I]f we examine closely, we shall find that this feeling, of our being able to modify our own character if we wish, is itself the feeling of moral freedom which we are conscious of. (System, VIII: 841)

3.6 The World in the Mind: the Relativity of Knowledge and Mill’s Idealism

As we have seen, Mill holds that “a great part of what seems observation is really inference” (System, VIII: 641). The raw content of experience is itself extremely narrow—indeed, Mill holds, we directly perceive only our own internal impressions. “From my senses, I have only the sensations” (System, VIII: 643). The claim is a strong one—that what is directly present to the mind are not external objects, but only “a set of appearances” (System, VIII: 783). We have unmediated access only to the impression that are generated in us—we are directly aware only of our own mental content.

We know of objects in the world only to the extent that they affect us and give rise to conscious impressions—and such impressions will only ever be presented by way of the mediating sense faculties. Mill claims that we cannot know anything of objects in themselves, but only as they appear to us, and terms this position the “Relativity of Human Knowledge” (Examination, IX: 4).

[A]ll the attributes which we ascribe to objects, consist in their having the power of exciting one or another variety of sensation in our mind […] our knowledge of objects […] consist[s] of nothing but the sensations which they excite. (Examination, IX: 6)

Our theoretical engagement with the world is always mediated by our conditioning faculties—and as such our representations of the world are always representations of what the world is like for beings such as ourselves.

Mill calls this insight “one of great weight and significance, which impresses a character on the whole mode of philosophical thinking of whoever receives it” (Examination, IX: 11). The doctrine ultimately pushes Mill towards Idealism. One might hold that, though we are only familiar in experience with mental impressions, we can nevertheless infer the existence of non-mental objects lying behind such mental objects. But such an inference could not be supported within experience by enumerative induction—no non-mental objects are ever observed behind mental objects—but only by a hypothesis to some unobserved entity. As was noted above, however, Mill rejects the method of hypothesis as an autonomous form of reasoning—no such inference to unobserved non-mental objects could for him be valid. Mill is forced towards the conclusion that we can have no warrant for believing in non-mental entities.

All that can be established inductively is that a certain class of objects of sensation are stable—that they can be returned to, after durations in which they go unperceived. Such, Mill thinks, is the true content of our notion of the external world.

Matter, then, may be defined, a Permanent Possibility of Sensation. If I am asked, whether I believe in matter, I ask whether the questioner accepts this definition of it. If he does, I believe in matter: and so do all Berkeleians. In any other sense than this, I do not. (Examination, IX: 183)

The idea of an external world is not present in the content of experience. Rather, our idea of externality is derived from the recognition that certain sensations can be revisited: that

though I have ceased to see it […] I believe that when I again place myself in the circumstances in which I had those sensations […] I shall again have them; and further, that there is no intervening moment at which this would not have been the case. (Examination, IX: 179)

Our idea of matter is exhausted by the idea of

something which exists when we are not thinking of it; which existed before we had ever thought and would exist if we were annihilated. (Examination, IX: 178–9)

But matter, so conceived, is not “intrinsically distinct” from sensation itself (Examination, IX: 182). Whether this stance is entirely coherent, we shall consider below, in section 3.7.

Mill’s claim about the relativity of knowledge extends to our knowledge of mind itself.

[O]ur knowledge of mind, like that of matter, is entirely relative […] We have no conception of Mind itself, as distinguished from its conscious manifestations. (Examination, IX: 188–9)

We know our own self, Mill claims, only as it phenomenally appears to us—and we know of other selves only by inference from our own case. Mill rejects the “common theory of Mind, as a so-called substance” (Examination, IX: 206). But he also resists the total reduction of mind to the existence of sensations—or even to the existence of possible sensations—on the grounds that there remains a unity to apperception. As he points out, a reduction of self to sensations cannot be wholly satisfactory, because a sense of the self enters into many sensations as a constituent part. When I recall a memory, for instance, the sensation is of a memory which has as part of its content that it is my memory.

If, therefore, we speak of the Mind as a series of feelings, we are obliged to complete the statement by calling it a series of feelings which is aware of itself as past and future; and we are reduced to the alternative of believing that the Mind, or Ego, is something different from any series of feelings, or possibilities of them, or of accepting the paradox, that something which ex hypothesi is but a series of feelings, can be aware of itself as a series. (Examination, 194)

On the surface, Mill’s motivations towards idealism is epistemic—that we can never experience unmediated non-mental objects, and so cannot be warranted in believing in their existence. But the argument goes deeper, suggesting that we cannot even imagine what it would be to believe in the existence of non-mental objects. “[E]ven an imaginary object is but a conception, such as we are able to form, of something which would affect our senses” (Examination, IX: 6). Indeed, Mill at times suggests a semantic version of the argument, which would establish that the very meaning of our words—determined, as they are, by experience—obstructs us from referring to anything beyond experience.

It would, no doubt, be absurd to assume that our words exhaust the possibilities of Being. There may be innumerable modes of it which are inaccessible to our faculties, and which consequently we are unable to name. But we ought not to speak of these modes of Being by any of the names we possess. These are all inapplicable, because they all stand for known modes of Being. (Examination, IX: 11)

Its bears emphasis that Mill’s argument about the limits of human cognition does not depend on our current state of scientific knowledge—or indeed upon the particular sense faculties we possess. Even if we had extra sense faculties or could come to perceive in new ways, he notes, all knowledge that would still be “merely phaenomenal” (Examination, IX: 8). Cognition, in any sentient creature must be mediated by some method of cognising—and if even if we came to possess new ways of cognizing the world, “[w]e should not, any more than at present, know things as they are in themselves” (Examination, IX: 8, my emphasis). Indeed, to say even that “the Creator” knows things as they are in themselves is to commit a confusion.

3.7 Mill’s Theoretical Philosophy: Self-Supporting or Self-Undermining?

Mill’s theoretical philosophy is, in an important sense, circular and self-supporting (Skorupski 1989: 125, 149). As noted, Mill views enumerative induction—the sole method of warranted theoretical reasoning—as self-validating and self-improving. We spontaneously take certain initial inductive moves to be justified. Induction’s self-examination then leads to an increasing confidence that induction is a warranted way of reasoning about the world, and to a general sharpening of that method of reasoning. Induction could have been self-undermining—its success as a form of reasoning about the world, established on its own terms, is not trivial.

More broadly, however, Mill’s theoretical view of mind and world is as a whole circular and self-supporting. Mill’s naturalistic picture of the relation between mind and world—of the mind as itself part of the natural order and incapable of knowledge a priori—must itself be treated as a substantive discovery. As such, it could only be arrived at by inductive reasoning. Inductive investigation allows us to better understand that the mind is itself governed by natural laws—and to better understand the processes of sense perception that allow us to be causally receptive to the world. Elements of Mill’s associationist psychology are apt to strike us as outdated—but that does not alter the basic point that the naturalistic study of mind has been enormously successful in affording a better understanding of how we process the world we occupy. Such discoveries clarify and strengthen our sense of why a priori knowledge is impossible in the first place, and why empirical investigation is necessary for any genuine knowledge.

The view that Mill sketches is rich in potential—and it has sufficient breadth to promise a successful means of theoretically orienting ourselves in the world. The issue, of course, is, whether naturalism is the only possible view. Granting that Mill’s theoretical philosophy is impressive on the grounds of offering a systematic and coherent way of thinking about the world and the history of our theoretical engagement with it, the question remains whether that coherence and systematicity is any guarantee of truth. The question must remain whether there are equally good non-naturalistic ways of thinking about the world and our place within it. Because naturalism is a substantive doctrine, that is a possibility to which Mill must remain open.

A more pressing question still is whether Mill’s picture truly is coherent. As discussed above, Mill’s naturalistic approach drives him, via his inductivism and endorsement of the Relativity of Knowledge, towards idealism. Ultimately, he holds, the only things that we can be warranted in believing are permanent possibilities of sensation. But such objects are not—at least not obviously—natural entities. Mill is never entirely clear about the status of the permanent possibilities of sensation. To the extent that they are ideal objects, we might doubt their status as natural entities; the further reified such entities are in relation to actual sensations, the less plausible it is to characterise the inference from sensation to the possibility of sensation as an inductive one. Whether Mill’s naturalism is compatible with his idealism is very much an open question.

The worry enters from multiple directions. Perhaps most obviously, it calls into question the down-to-earth realism that Mill endorses within the philosophy of science. Mill’s claim that that the process of science involves finding the structure already present in nature seems at least in tension with the claim that all knowledge is phenomenal and relativized. More subtly, Mill’s basic conception of the relation of mind and world also seems challenged. Mill claims that a priori knowledge is impossible because we cannot know

that the universe of thought and that of reality, the Microcosm and the Macrocosm (as they were once called) must have been framed in in complete correspondence with one another. (Examination, IX: 68)

But if the world is fundamentally ideal—if, as Mill seems to claim, our world is the world as conditioned by our mediating senses, because we can know and represent it in no other way—we might wonder why a basic harmony between the architecture of mind and world should not be taken as given, and a priori knowledge not be possible. Indeed, Mill’s claim that cognition must be mediated by some method of cognising—that any creature must perceive in this way—itself seems suspiciously unrevisable and a priori.

These problems emerge because the priority between mind and world in Mill’s work is unclear: the mind is seen as both the condition for the representation of the only world we ever encounter, and as a natural object within the world. The former is brought to the foreground only in Mill’s most philosophical moments—the latter is present throughout Mill’s characterisation of scientific and ordinary thinking. One option to resolve this tension, of course, is to follow Kant in distinguishing transcendental and empirical levels of reflection—another is to follow the post-Kantian idealists in attempting to unite and overcome such oppositions wherever they occur. Mill, however, never worked through the internal pressures of his own position with sufficient rigour to feel the push within naturalism towards these positions.[4]

4. Mill’s Practical Philosophy

4.1 The Foundations of Practical Reason: The ‘Proof’

Whereas theoretical reasoning concerns what there is reason to believe, practical reasoning concerns how there is reason to act. Just as Mill thinks that there is one fundamental principle of theoretical reason—the principle of enumerative induction—so too he thinks that there is one fundamental principle of practical reason.

There are not only first principles of Knowledge, but first principles of Conduct. There must be some standard by which to determine the goodness or badness, absolute and comparative, of ends or objects of desire. And whatever that standard is, there can be but one. (Mill, System, VIII: 951)

That principle, of course, is the principle of utility.

[T]he general principle to which all rules of practice ought to conform, and the test by which they should be tried, is that of conduciveness to the happiness of mankind […] the promotion of happiness is the ultimate principle of Teleology. (System, VIII: 951)

The claim that “happiness is the sole end of human action, and the promotion of it the test by which to judge of all human conduct” stands at the center of Mill’s practical philosophy, determining how individuals should act, individually and collectively (Utilitarianism, X: 237).

The principle of utility is examined in detail in Utilitarianism, during which it is both clarified and defended. At the center of the work stands Mill’s ‘proof’ of the principle of utility. The argument takes place by way of three subclaims. Mill argues for:

desirability: that happiness is desirable as an end,

exhaustiveness: that nothing but happiness is desirable as an end, and

impartiality: that each person’s happiness is equally desirable.

Mill takes the first subclaim—desirability—to be reasonably uncontentious. Happiness, most will admit, is at least one of the things which is desirable (Donner 1991: 31). His argument for the claim, however, has become infamous.

The only proof capable of being given that an object is visible, is that people actually see it. The only proof that a sound is audible, is that people hear it: and so of the other sources of our experience. In like manner, I apprehend, the sole evidence it is possible to produce that anything is desirable, is that people do actually desire it. (Utilitarianism, X: 234)

Mill adds to this the observation that “each person, so far as he believes it to be attainable, desires his own happiness” (Utilitarianism, X: 234). As such, happiness is shown to be desirable as an end.

G.E. Moore famously attacks this argument, suggesting that “the fallacy in this step is so obvious, that is quite wonderful how Mill failed to see it” (Moore 1993: 118). ‘Desired’ does not bear the same relation to ‘desirable’ as ‘heard’ does to ‘audible’—for desirability is the property of being deserving or worthy of being desired, whereas audibility is property of being capable of being heard. Mill’s choice of framing the argument in this way is, admittedly, unfortunate, but the basic thrust of the argument is nevertheless strong, if understood in terms of its own aims.

The argument for the desirability of happiness is, like the rest of Mill’s philosophy, naturalistic in orientation. As was observed above (section 2.1), Mill’s naturalism leads him to the claim that we cannot have any knowledge by intuition. His claim that the “sole evidence” it is possible to produce for normative claims about desirability are empirical observations about what people “do actually desire” must be seen in the context of this basic commitment—our knowledge of the desirable cannot be anchored by direct a priori insight into the nature of the good, and as such can only come by way of critical examination of what human beings do actually take as good.

“[P]ractised self-consciousness and self-observation, assisted by observation of others” reveals that human beings do, as a matter of fact, desire happiness (Utilitarianism, X: 237). We do so, Mill claims, by virtue of our nature—and that propensity strikes us as reasonable upon inspection. That human beings universally do desire happiness, and take it to be reasonable to do so under free consideration, is evidence that happiness is desirable. Such evidence, of course, is defeasible—but real nonetheless. And in the absence of reasons to doubt our universal tendency to desire happiness, we are warranted in taking happiness to be desirable. The argument for the desirability of happiness is, in this sense, parallel to Mill’s initiating validation of the principle of enumerative induction (see §3.2).

Human beings, of course, desire many things besides happiness—Mill acknowledges this fact as “palpable” (Utilitarianism, X: 234). Insofar as what we desire is taken as evidence of what is desirable, this might seem incompatible with Mill’s second subclaim—that happiness is exhaustive of the desirable. Mill’s strategy for establishing that happiness is the only desirable thing is to show that although there are other things which are desired by human beings, such things are desired only because of the relation they bear to happiness. Many things, of course, are desired merely as means to happiness. Upon inspection, such things do not strike us as ultimately desirable, but merely as useful mechanisms for bringing about that which is ultimately desirable. Mill recognises, however, that not all desiderata besides happiness are desired merely as means. Some people, for instance, “desire virtue for its own sake”—as a matter of “psychological fact”, they desire it “disinterestedly, for itself” (Utilitarianism, X: 237, 235). This does not threaten the claim that happiness is the only thing ultimately desirable, Mill argues, because for such individuals, virtue is desirable because it forms a part of their happiness.

Virtue, according to the utilitarian doctrine, is not naturally and originally part of the end, but it is capable of becoming so […] There was no original desire of it, or motive to it, save its conduciveness to pleasure, and especially to protection from pain. But through the association thus formed, it may be felt a good in itself, and desired as such with as great intensity as any other good. (Utilitarianism X: 235–6)

Objects which are desired initially merely as a means to happiness, can become so central to a person’s conception of what it means to be happy as to be seen as a part of their happiness. At this point, they may be desired in themselves—and quite apart from their results. We shall discuss this claim further below (section 4.2). But as part of Mill’s general strategy for showing that nothing beyond happiness is desirable, the import of the claim is clear. It allows Mill to argue that nothing apart from happiness is ultimately desired. “Whatever is desired otherwise than as a means […] to happiness, is desired as itself a part of happiness”, and as such “there is in reality nothing desired except happiness” (Utilitarianism, X: 237).

Mill’s argument for impartiality—that that each person’s happiness is equally desirable—passes quickly, and many have found it problematic. Mill claims that “each person’s happiness is a good to that person, and the general happiness, therefore, a good to the aggregate of all persons” (Utilitarianism, X: 234). The argument is, in one sense, merely a reflection of Mill’s individualism (cf. System, VIII: 879). The underlying thought is that the good of a group of people can be no other than the sum of the good of its members. But the argument goes deeper than this plausible claim, relying on stronger premises. The supposition that “equal amounts of happiness are equally desirable, whether felt by the same or by different persons” (Utilitarianism, X: 258n) is in fact contentious. One might well argue, for instance, that to add to the happiness of the already content or the undeserving is not to add to the general good at the same level as adding to the happiness of the discontent or deserving: that the value of happiness is in part determined by where it occurs. Mill does not, however, consider these objections.

By showing that happiness is desirable, that nothing other than happiness is desirable, and that every person’s happiness is equally desirable, Mill holds that “the principle of utility is proved” (Utilitarianism, X: 239). It is not, of course, a proof in the traditional sense of being a logical deduction of the principle of utility. Indeed, Mill acknowledges that in a strict sense, “ultimate ends are not amenable to direct proof” (Utilitarianism, X: 207; cf. X: 234). Being based on critical examination of how we do reason, claims about how we ought to reason—whether practically or theoretically—must remain provisional, and open to ongoing correction by further observations of our reasoning practices. Nevertheless, Mill holds, the ‘proof’ presents “[c]onsiderations […] capable of determining the intellect” (Utilitarianism, X: 208). As such, the principle of utility—“the doctrine that all things are good or evil, by virtue solely of the pleasure or the pain which they produce”—is shown to have “rational grounds” (The Protagoras, XI: 61; Utilitarianism, X: 208).

4.2 Mill’s Conception of Happiness

We have seen, then, that Mill holds that “happiness is the sole end of human action, and the promotion of it the test by which to judge of all human conduct” (Utilitarianism, X: 237). The content of this claim, however, clearly depends to a great extent upon what is meant by happiness. Mill gives what seems to be a clear and unambiguous statement of his meaning. “By happiness is intended pleasure, and the absence of pain; by unhappiness, pain, and the privation of pleasure” (Utilitarianism, X: 210). That statement has seemed to many to commit Mill, at a basic level, to hedonism as an account of happiness and a theory of value—that it is pleasurable sensations that are the ultimately valuable thing.

Mill departs from the Benthamite account, however, which holds that if two experiences contain equal quantities of pleasure, then they are thereby equally valuable. In contrast, Mill argues that

[i]t would be absurd that while, in estimating all other things, quality is considered as well as quantity, the estimation of pleasures should be supposed to depend on quantity alone. (Utilitarianism, X: 211)

Some pleasures are, by their nature, of a higher quality than others—and as such are to be valued more.

If I am asked, what I mean by difference of quality in pleasures, or what makes one pleasure more valuable than another, merely as a pleasure, except its being greater in amount, there is but one possible answer. Of two pleasures, if there be one to which all or almost all who have experience of both give a decided preference […] that is the more desirable pleasure. (Utilitarianism, X: 211)

The claim is one purely relating to value ordering—that there can exist experiences h and l, such that h is more valuable than l, despite l containing an equal or greater quantity of pleasure than h. Some commentators (Riley 2002) have claimed that Mill holds that any quantity of a higher pleasure is more valuable than any quantity of a lower pleasure on the basis of the following passage:

If one of the two [pleasures] is, by those who are competently acquainted with both, placed so far above the other that they prefer it […] and would not resign it for any quantity of the other pleasure which their nature is capable of, we are justified in ascribing to the preferred enjoyment a superiority in quality. (Utilitarianism, X: 211)

The claim that it would be rational to sacrifice any amount of a lower pleasure for a minuscule amount of a higher pleasure, though, seems too implausible to attribute to Mill—and in the passage cited, he only registers a sufficient condition for considering one pleasure of a higher quality to another, and not a necessary condition (Saunders 2011; Miller 2010: 58). In fact, Mill gives very little indication as to how to weigh quality against quantity of pleasure—he simply does not speak to the specifics of how varying quantities of pleasures at varying qualities are to be reconciled against one another.

The question remains as to which sorts of pleasures are of higher quality than others. Mill holds that pleasures “of the intellect, of the feelings and imagination, and of the moral sentiments” are amongst the higher pleasures (Utilitarianism, X: 211). But Mill’s doctrine need not be read as restrictively intellectualist. As well as pleasures of the mind, he holds that pleasures gained in activity are of a higher quality than those gained passively (Liberty, XVIII: 262; cf. Utilitarianism, X: 215). Ultimately, however, the quality of any given pleasure must itself be a substantive question, to be addressed by ongoing experimentation and comparison of the preferences of competent judges—those who have experienced, and appreciated, the sorts of pleasure being compared.

The lurking suspicion for many has been that in distinguishing qualities of pleasure, Mill departs from hedonism. If Mill claims that a small amount of pleasure can be more valuable than a high amount, anti-hedonist interpreters suggests, it must be on the grounds of valuing something apart from the pleasurable experience itself—for if Mill valued solely the pleasurable experience, then he would always value more pleasurable experience over less. Mill must, that is to say, consider high quality pleasures more valuable not on account of their pleasantness, but on some other grounds—i.e., their source. But this would be to abandon hedonism. The anti-hedonist interpretation might be further supported by appealing to Mill’s talk of ‘parts of happiness’. As was noted above, when defending the claim that happiness is the sole end of action, Mill acknowledges that “[t]he ingredients of happiness are very various, and each of them is desirable in itself” (Utilitarianism, X: 235). While talk of (for instance) virtue as a part of happiness is certainly intelligible, it is perhaps less obvious that it is compatible with his hedonism.

Those who doubt whether Mill remains a hedonist have in general claimed that Mill moves towards a eudaimonistic or perfectionist account of happiness (Brink 2013: 46ff.; Nussbaum 2004; Clark 2010). By ‘happiness’, they claim, Mill does not mean certain experiences or sensations, but rather the flourishing that is achieved in the realization of a character ideal. There are occasions when Mill makes claims which lend themselves to such an interpretation. When, in On Liberty, Mill emphasizes the value of autonomy and originality—when he claims that “[i]t really is of importance, not only what men do, but also what manner of men they are that do it” (Liberty, XVIII: 263)—his focus does seem to be on the value of being a certain way, rather than the value of experiences.

It is certainly true that, in attempting to combine the best of eighteenth-century empiricism and nineteenth-century romanticism, Mill gravitated towards character as the locus of practical theorizing (Devigne 2006). This, by necessity, involved a change of emphasis in his philosophy. The question, however, is whether Mill’s focus on character is simply an instance of his attempt to elicit “dynamical conclusions” from “mechanical premises” (Letter to Thomas Carlyle, XII: 181)—whether, in other words, his attempt is to rest a character-focused ethic upon hedonistic foundations. The claim that some qualities of pleasure are more valuable than others need not violate the core claim of hedonism: that pleasurable experiences are the ultimately valuable things. It is perfectly open to the hedonist to claim that different pleasurable experiences are, on the grounds of their phenomenology, of different value. Mill’s associationism provides the resources to claim that pleasures are themselves complex and evolving emotions, reflective of, and often entangled with, the characters that give rise to them. This too may offer some explanation of what Mill means by claiming that, for instance, virtue can become part of our happiness. Given Mill’s profession that

all desirable things […] are desirable either for the pleasure inherent in themselves, or as means to the promotion of pleasure and the prevention of pain,

then, there seems little reason to doubt his commitment to hedonism (Utilitarianism, X: 210).

4.3 Morality

It is important to note that the claims made so far concern Mill’s axiology (Fletcher 2008). They concern, that is to say, what states of affairs are valuable—which outcomes are good. Such axiological claims are, in themselves, silent on the question of our moral obligations. Mill is not a maximizing utilitarian about the moral. Although, admittedly, he often makes statements which seem to imply that he is committed to this position—most famously, towards the beginning of Utilitarianism, that “actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness, wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness” (Utilitarianism, X: 210)—such statements should be understood as simplifying devices for the purposes of initial exposition. Other, more careful, statements clearly show that this is not his considered position.

The maximizing utilitarian believes that we are morally obliged to bring about the most happiness we can—that insofar as we fall short of this mark, we violate our moral obligations. Yet Mill clearly believes that we are not obliged to do all that we can upon pain of moral censure.

It is not good that persons should be bound, by other people’s opinion, to do everything that they would deserve praise for doing. There is a standard of altruism to which all should be required to come up, and a degree beyond it which is not obligatory, but meritorious. (Auguste Comte and Positivism, X: 337)

Mill, that is to say, believes in the existence of a class of supererogatory acts (Donner 2009: 140–3). While it might be extremely praiseworthy to do the most good that we can—and while there might be reason to do the most good that we can—failure to do so is not the standard that marks the distinction between acting morally and immorally. Rather, Mill claims, the notion of moral wrong is connected to that of punishment.

I think there is no doubt that this distinction lies at the bottom of the notions of right and wrong; that we call any conduct wrong, or employ, instead, some other term of dislike or disparagement, according as we think that the person ought, or ought not, to be punished for it. (Utilitarianism, X: 246)

Mill’s notion of ‘punishment’, however, is a broad one.

We do not call anything wrong, unless we mean to imply that a person ought to be punished in some way or other for doing it; if not by law, by the opinion of his fellow creatures; if not by opinion, by the reproaches of his own conscience. […] [If] it is not a case of moral obligation; we do not blame them, that is, we do not think that they are proper objects of punishment. (Utilitarianism, X: 246)

An act is morally wrong, then, if it is blameworthy, i.e., if it would be proper to blame an agent for performing that act. The question, of course, is what grounds such norms of blame. Interpreters have in general taken Mill to believe that whether we ought to blame an individual for any given act—and whether, therefore that act is morally wrong—is determined by considerations of utilitarian efficiency. An act is wrong, therefore, if it would be productive to overall utility to blame an individual for performing that act—or, under a rule-focused interpretation, if it would be productive to overall utility for there to exist a rule to the effect that individuals performing actions of that sort were subject to blame.[5]

The efficiency of such norms of blame will be dependent, in part, on the culture in which they are to operate—on the dispositions of individuals to react to blame and the promise of blame, and on the possibility of inculcating these dispositions in a given group—and, for this reason, the domain of moral duty will vary with time and place (Auguste Comte, X: 338; Miller 2010: 99). A significant remaining question is whether there is a constraint placed on morality by the logic of that emotion: whether, in other words, there are certain actions which, because of the nature of the emotion of blame, cannot be regarded as morally wrong (Jacobson 2008).

Mill’s stance on the place of morality in practical reasoning overall—how our moral obligations are related to what we ought to do, all things considered—is complex. Mill writes that

the moral view of actions and characters […] is unquestionably the first and most important mode of looking at them. (Bentham, X: 112)

But, at the same time, he is critical of those “morality-intoxicated” philosophers who take morality to crowd out the sphere of practical reason entirely—who treat the moral dimension of questions about how we should act “as if it were the sole one” (Auguste Comte, X: 336; Bentham, X: 112). “Practical Reason”—or, as Mill also terms it, “the Art of Life”—has as its proper object, bringing into existence the greatest possible happiness.[6] It is divided into three domains: “Morality, Prudence or Policy, and Aesthetics; the Right, the Expedient, and the Beautiful or Noble” (System, VIII: 949; cf. Bentham, X: 112). An action is prudent simply to the extent that it maximizes a person’s individual utility, which can of course be in part a function of others’ utility; an action is beautiful to the extent that it is admirable, and excites aesthetic pleasure in its contemplation (cf. Loizides 2013: 133–40).

Moral rules play a role in guiding and evaluating action, to be sure, but so do rules of aesthetics and prudence: these too promote the general happiness, and as such provide reasons for action. There can, of course, be clashes between such rules of morality, prudence, and aesthetics—and, indeed, clashes of rules within those domains. In such cases, Mill writes, it is “requisite that first principles should be appealed to” (Utilitarianism, X: 226; cf. System, VIII: 951). Mill also allows that appeal be made directly to the principle of utility on occasions when an agent knows that following rules—moral, prudential, or aesthetic—would generate significantly less overall happiness than violating those rules (Utilitarianism, X: 223; Taylor’s Statesman XIX: 638–40). But Mill is unclear as to how often such clashes and exceptions license direct appeal to the principle of utility. To the extent that one ought often to ignore the rules of morality, prudence, and aesthetics, and act simply on the basis of which action is most choice-worthy according to the theory of practical reason overall, Mill is, in the end, pulled towards something which comes to resemble an act-utilitarianism position (Turner 2015).

4.4 Equality, the Sexes, and the Nineteenth Century

The nineteenth century was a period coming to terms with the rise of democracy, and this is reflected in the concerns of its social philosophy. Mill’s writings in this area are no exception. His engagement with the question of how society and its institutions ought to be organized is of course guided by an abstract commitment to general happiness as the measure of the success of all human practice—but it is also deeply attentive to the concrete possibilities and dangers of the newly emerging democratic era, and how they relate to this overarching goal (Skorupski 2006).

Influenced by Tocqueville, Mill held that the great trend of his own period was a falling away of aristocratic mores and a growth of equality.[7] Mill’s distinctively English take on modern Europe’s “irresistible tendency to equality of conditions” characterised the spread of equality as a manifestation of “the growth of the middle class” (De Tocqueville on Democracy in America [II], XVIII: 150, 196). Although modern Europe had not annihilated the class distinctions of earlier periods, in Mill’s view, such differences were becoming less and less influential on social norms. Wealth, education, status, and therefore power, he held, were amassing with a socially and politically dominant middle class, whose shared commercial traits and interests dictated equality as the emerging rule.

Mill believes that this trend presents a chance for the improvement of society—in this sense, he stands as the heir to Bentham and James Mill in trying to drive forward the agenda of modernisation. But, like many of his nineteenth-century contemporaries—in particular, conservative social critics such as Coleridge and Carlyle—he also sees that the newly emerging order carries with it newly emerging dangers. His aim was therefore to ameliorate the negative effects of the rise of equality, while capitalising on the opportunity it presented for reform.

The most pressing need for reform in this situation, Mill thought, was the removal of structures of discrimination and oppression against women. Mill held, on the grounds of associationist psychology, that human character is wholly a product of upbringing. As such, he was suspicious of the then common claim that women had a different nature from men—and that the sexes were therefore naturally suited for different roles within the family and society more broadly.

[N]o one can safely pronounce that if women’s nature were left to choose its direction as freely as men’s, and if no artificial bent were attempted to be given to it except that required by the conditions of human society, and given to both sexes alike, there would be any material difference, or perhaps any difference at all, in the character and capacities that would unfold themselves. (Subjection, XXI: 305)

To the extent that the sexes in general exhibit different character traits, these traits are the product of upbringing into stereotypes, rather the justification for such stereotypes. So too for differences that are claimed to exist naturally between the races, and to justify the authority of one set of individuals over another (The Negro Question, XII: 93). With the growth of equality that came with a dominant middle class, Mill held, these forms of oppression stood out all the more clearly, and the time was therefore ripe to dismantle such practices of discrimination.

Such practices were, Mill held, objectionable on the grounds of “social expediency”—that they were detrimental to overall utility (Subjection, XXI: 64; cf. Admission of Women to Franchise, XXVIII: 152). The denial of the vote harmed the disenfranchised on two grounds. Firstly, their interests—interests which might diverge in significant ways from other groups (Autobiography, I: 107)—went unrepresented in Parliament, and were therefore liable to frustration. Secondly, to deny individuals access to political participation was to deny them access to an important aspect of the good and happy life.

[A]n equal right to be heard—to have a share in influencing the affairs of the country—to be consulted, to be spoken to, and to have agreements and considerations turning upon politics addressed to one—tended to elevate and educate the self-respect of the man […] To give people an interest in politics and in the management of their own affairs was the grand cultivator of mankind […] That was one of the reasons why he wanted women to have votes; they needed cultivation as well as men. (Westminster Election 1865 [4], XXVIII: 39; see also Considerations, XIX: 469)

For these reasons, Mill fought against political discrimination throughout his life, both as a philosopher and a Member of Parliament (Kinzer, Robson and Robson 1992; Varouxakis 2013). We shall return to the complexities of Mill’s views on political democracy below (section 4.7), but in the context of discussion of equality, we should note that Mill was just as critical of social forms of discrimination as of the denial of the vote to women. Barriers to education and the professions, he held, were as much in need of reform as barriers to representation (Subjection, XXI: 300). But his most vehement criticisms were made of the institution of marriage, as practiced in his own time.

Marriage—which in this period deprived the wife of property and legal personhood, and forced total obedience to a husband—was, Mill held, akin to slavery (Subjection, XXI: 271). Often, he observed, it involved physical violence. But even where this was not the case, the preparation for and participation in such unequal partnerships caused women to develop constrained, artificial, and submissive personalities. And not only was it degrading for women to be held in such a position of slavery—exercising such domination was debasing to men, corrupting their personalities, too (Subjection, XXI: 321). The prevalence of such a vicious power-relationship in a central area of human life cried out for renovation. The only circumstances in which marriage could be a positive institution, adding to human happiness, was one in which men and women were treated with total equality (Miller 2017).

4.5 On Liberty and Freedom of Speech

The transformation of society from aristocratic to increasingly democratic forms of organization brought with it opportunities, then. But it also presented dangers. It meant rule by a social mass which was more powerful, uniform, and omnipresent than the sovereigns of previous eras. The dominance of the majority, Mill held, presented new threats of tyranny over the individual—freedom was no less at risk from a newly empowered many, than from an absolute monarch. The restrictions over freedom that concerned Mill included, to be sure, legislatively enacted restrictions of liberty—but they also took in broader “compulsion and control, whether the means used be physical force in the form of legal penalties, or the moral coercion of public opinion” (Liberty, XVIII: 223). Informal mechanisms of social pressure and expectation could, in mass democratic societies, be all-controlling. Mill worried that the exercise of such powers would lead to stifling conformism in thought, character and action.

It was in this context that On Liberty was written (Scarre 2007: 1–9). The aim of the argument is announced in the first chapter:

The object of this Essay is to assert one very simple principle […] That principle is, that the sole end for which mankind are warranted, individually or collectively, in interfering with the liberty of action of any of their number, is self-protection. (Liberty, XVIII: 223)

As with all of Mill’s practical philosophy, the argument for this claim is utilitarian.

It is proper to state that I forego any advantage which could be derived to my argument from the idea of abstract right, as a thing independent of utility. (Liberty, XVIII: 224)

It could not be known a priori that we should organize society along liberal principles. Indeed, Mill held conditions of freedom are only desirable in civilized societies—“[u]ntil then, there is nothing for them but implicit obedience to an Akbar or a Charlemagne, if they are so fortunate as to find one” (Liberty, XVIII: 224). Mill’s case for liberty, in this sense, is based on observation about the conditions under which human beings flourish and are happy.

Mill’s claim that On Liberty presents “one very simple principle”—is “a kind of philosophic text-book of a single truth”—perhaps belies the fact that there are many distinct arguments and conclusions drawn throughout the text (Liberty, XVIII: 223; Autobiography, I: 259). Mill employs different strategies to argue for freedom of thought and discussion, freedom of character, and freedom of action—and although of course such arguments overlap, they must be carefully unpicked if we are to appreciate their strengths and weaknesses. In this section, we will consider the argument for freedom of speech, turning, in the next section, to his case for freedom of character and action more broadly.

Mill’s argument for the freedom of thought and discussion is given in chapter 2 of On Liberty, and in it he aims to show that there should be no attempt “to control the expression of opinion” (Liberty, XVIII: 229; see Riley 2015: 74ff.). The chapter takes the form of a proof from the exhaustion of cases. Mill claims that, for any opinion P which is a candidate for suppression, P must be either: (i) true, (ii) false, or (iii) partially true. Whichever is the case, he argues, P’s assertion will be useful for discovering and maintaining the truth—and as such should be welcome.

True beliefs are in general suppressed because, though they are true, they are thought to be false. To assume that because one thinks a view is false, it should be suppressed, Mill argues, is to assume infallibility for one’s beliefs. Human beings, though, are not creatures capable of infallible knowledge. Mill’s empiricism leads him to believe that we do not have direct a priori insight into the truth, and that all of our beliefs must remain open to revision in light of further observation. As such, discussion must remain open—even on issues which we think securely established. It might be argued, he observes, that certain true beliefs should be suppressed because, although true, they are thought to be harmful. But to argue that we should suppress a view because it is harmful would either be to assume infallibility on its status as harmful, or to allow debate on that question—which in turn must involve debate on the substantive issue itself. Opinions belonging to case (i) therefore ought to not to be suppressed.

Even when a belief is false, Mill holds, its assertion may still be conducive to securing the truth—and as such, opinions belonging to case (ii) should not be suppressed. The assertion of false opinions leads to debate—which in turn leads to greater understanding. Without active defence of a truth, we risk losing sense of its real meaning, with genuine knowledge becoming reduced to “phrases retained by rote” (Liberty, XVIII: 249). It is therefore just as important to hear counterarguments to the truth as its re-articulation.

However unwillingly a person who has a strong opinion may admit the possibility that his opinion may be false, he ought to be moved by the consideration that however true it may be, if it is not fully, frequently, and fearlessly discussed, it will be held as a dead dogma, not a living truth. (Liberty, XVIII: 243)

Mill holds that

there is a commoner case than either of these; when the conflicting doctrines, instead of being one true and the other false, share the truth between them. (Liberty, XVIII: 252)

Such situations make up case (iii). In complicated matters—especially in matter of politics of morality—the truth is “many-sided” (Letter to Thomas Carlyle XII: 181). Most well-thought-out views—whether conservative or liberal—on such matters contain part of the truth. Individuals are rarely in the position to see the “whole truth” for themselves, and the only way for it to emerge is by therefore by “the reconciling and combining of opposites” (Liberty, XVIII: 258, 254).

Mill takes the three cases to be exhaustive: whatever an opinion’s status in terms of truth, then, its suppression would be epistemically damaging (Skorupski 1989: 377–83). The argument’s focus on truth, of course, limits the scope of the argument. Though there may be arguments establishing that forms of communication which do not have truth as their goal—poetry, art, music—should be free from interference, these are not to be found in chapter 2, but later in On Liberty.

4.6 On Liberty and Freedom of Character and Action

Mill’s argument for freedom of character—“Individuality” (Liberty, XVIII: 260)—is given in chapter 3 of On Liberty, and is two-pronged. On the one hand, he argues that it is best for individuals that they are given freedom and space to develop their own character. On the other, he argues that it best for society, too. Mill’s argument for the former is Romantic in tone, maintaining that, because different individuals have different natures, they must be given space to discover and develop their own personalities and ways of living.

Human nature is not a machine to be built after a model, and set to do exactly the work prescribed for it, but a tree, which requires to grow and develope itself on all sides, according to the tendency of the inward forces which make it a living thing. (Liberty, XVIII: 263)

The basic diversity of human beings means it is not productive for there to exist an expectation that all individuals will live in a similar manner. In this sense, the argument is a pragmatic one: that one mode of life is unlikely to fit all individual tastes. But Mill also suggests that it is a central feature of the good life that it be a life chosen for oneself.

It is possible that he might be guided in some good path […] But what will be his comparative worth as a human being? It really is of importance, not only what men do, but also what manner of men they are that do it. (Liberty, XVIII: 263)

Along with other thinkers of the period—Arnold, Nietzsche, and Schiller are all useful points of comparison—Mill believes that the great danger of mass-society is self-repression and conformism, leading to the sapping of human energy and creativity. Victorian society was, he claimed, governed by an ethos of propriety based on “Christian self-denial”; Mill, in contrast, encourages the “Greek ideal of self-development” (Liberty, XVIII: 266). It is individuals that are well-rounded, authentic and spontaneous, he believes, that are most truly happy.

It is also important for society more broadly that individuals be free to develop their own ways of living. It is beneficial to have a rich variety of “experiments of living” (Liberty, XVIII: 260) on display in any given society, to allow individuals to be inspired by a wide range of possible forms of life. And the variety that exists within such a context, Mill thinks, key to maintaining social progress. A “diversity of character and culture” provides the engine of productive tension that drives a nation forward. Without it, Mill fears “Chinese stationariness” (Liberty, XVIII: 188; De Tocqueville on Democracy in America [II], XVIII: 189).

The despotism of custom is everywhere the standing hindrance to human advancement, being in unceasing antagonism to that disposition to aim at something better than customary, which is called, according to circumstances, the spirit of liberty, or that of progress or improvement. (Liberty, XVIII: 272)

In chapters 4 and 5 of On Liberty, Mill’s attention turns from a general defence of the salutary effects of freedom to an an exploration of which actions in particular should or should not be subject to interference. The scope of legitimate coercion is guided by the ‘harm principle’:

the only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over any member of a civilised community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others. (Liberty, XVIII: 223; cf. Liberty, XVIII: 292)

An individual’s action can be legitimately encroached upon if and only if that action might harm another individual. Of course, it may not be prudent to intervene in all cases in which it be legitimate to do so. In this sense, the principle merely states the conditions under which interference is permissible—not the conditions under which it is desirable.

Mill rules out intervention in that “part of a person’s life which concerns only himself” primarily because individuals—once they have reached “the maturity of their faculties”—are far more competent with respect to their own good than others (Liberty, XVIII: 280, 224; see Turner 2013).

[W]ith respect to his own feelings and circumstances, the most ordinary man or woman has means of knowledge immeasurably surpassing those that can be possessed by any one else. The interference of society to overrule his judgment and purposes in what only regards himself, must be grounded on general presumptions; which may be altogether wrong, and even if right, are as likely as not to be misapplied to individual cases. (Liberty, XVIII: 277)

As such, there should exist a general presumption against paternalistic attempts to interfere with an individual’s self-regarding conduct for their own good.

Mill readily admits that no conduct is self-regarding in the sense that it affects only the agent themselves. “No person is an entirely isolated being” (Liberty, XVIII: 280). But it is only when an individual “violate[s] a distinct and assignable obligation to any other person or persons, the case is taken out of the self-regarding class” (Liberty, XVIII: 281). In the sense Mill intends, then, we harm an individual only when we violate an obligation to that individual. The damage done by the bad example set to others by a drunkard provides no legitimate reason for interference with his conduct; if his drunkenness causes him to violate the obligation to support his family, then that action constitutes a harm and is subject to interference.

Mill’s concern, throughout On Liberty, is to preserve the individual’s freedom not only in the face of the threat of legislative or state coercion, but from the threat of more insidious forms of social coercion. In mass society, curtain-twitching judgmentalism and whispered smear-campaigns can be more dangerously controlling than formal acts of tyranny, “penetrating much more deeply into the details of life, and enslaving the soul itself” (Liberty, XVIII: 220). And yet, of course, Mill holds that individuals are themselves free to form unfavorable opinions about the character of others. We are free to remonstrate with an individual, to avoid him, and to encourage others to avoid him—that is our right. But not to “parade the avoidance” (Liberty, XVIII: 278). The dividing line between the legitimate and illegitimate use of our freedom, however, is surely difficult to draw.

4.7 Authority and Democracy

As we have seen, Mill believes that we can have no genuine knowledge a priori. One important result of this general claim, Mill holds, is that knowledge—on political and ethical matters, as well as within the physical sciences—is more difficult to acquire than those who appeal directly to intuition or common sense might wish. An individual’s need for knowledge far outstrips the possibility of individual observation—as such, the vast majority of our knowledge must be acquired on the basis of testimony.

I yield to no one in the degree of intelligence of which I believe [the people] to be capable. But I do not believe that, along with this intelligence, they will ever have sufficient opportunities of study and experience, to become themselves familiarly conversant with all the inquiries which lead to the truths by which it is good that they should regulate their conduct, and to receive into their own minds the whole of the evidence from which those truths have been collected, and which is necessary for their establishment. […] As long as the day consists but of twenty-four hours, and the age of man extends but to threescore and ten […] the great majority of mankind will need the far greater part of their time and exertions for procuring their daily bread. (Spirit of the Age, XXII: 241)

In previous ages, the existence of a leisured and spiritual class meant that it was relatively easy to establish who possessed the intellectual authority to function as leaders in thought and action (Spirit of the Age, XXII: 304–5). But the eighteenth-century Enlightenment philosophers had discredited these trusted forms of authority, making it increasingly difficult to distinguish “well-grounded opinion” from “charlatanerie” (Civilization, XVIII: 132, 135).[8] The rise of the numerical majority in the modern-era meant that the individual was liable to become “so lost in the crowd, that though he depends more and more upon opinion, he is apt to depend less and less upon well-grounded opinion” (Civilization, XVIII: 132; cf. Liberty, VIII: 268).

Ultimately, Mill remains optimistic about the prospects of the modern individual to successfully autonomously navigate that crowd and identify voices worthy of respect.

No government by a democracy or a numerous aristocracy […] ever did or could rise above mediocrity, except in so far as the sovereign Many have let themselves be guided (which in their best times they always have done) by the counsels and influence of a more highly gifted and instructed One or Few. […] The honour and glory of the average man is that he is capable of following that initiative; that he can respond internally to wise and noble things, and be led to them with his eyes open. (Liberty, XVIII: 269)

He is conscious, however, that effort is required to preserve and cultivate the individual’s ability to recognize and respond to such voices. Formal education, of course, must play a significant role in maintaining an “an enlightened public” who know enough “to be able to discern who are those that know them better” (Inaugural Address, XXI: 223; see Findlay 2017). But Mill also looks to the institution of democracy itself to help solidify the influence of elites.

Mill held, as was noted above (section 4.4), that the democratic expansion of the franchise was inevitable, and to be welcomed. Possessing the vote ensured that an individual’s interests would be represented—and, equally importantly, it had an elevating and educative effect on the public. Active participation in collective decision making was, Mill held, part of the good and happy life (Urbinati 2002). He was in favor, therefore, of extending the vote to all those who were not reliant on public support and possessed a basic competency in reading, writing, and arithmetic. “But though every one ought to have a voice—that every one should have an equal voice is a totally different proposition” (Considerations, XIX: 473). In an ideal system of democracy, Mill held, those whose opinions are “entitled to a greater amount of consideration” would be given more consideration, with level of education determining the number of votes a person could cast (Considerations, XIX: 474; see Miller 2015).

A system of plural voting would not only counteract the tendency of democracy to descend into rule by the mob, but would embody and signal the general principle that some opinions are more worthy of attention than others.

It is not useful, but hurtful, that the constitution of the country should declare ignorance to be entitled to as much political power as knowledge. The national institutions should place all things that they are concerned with, before the mind of the citizen in the light in which it is for his good that he should regard them: and as it is for his good that he should think that every one is entitled to some influence, but the better and wiser to more than others. (Considerations, XIX: 478)

Mill’s concern to ensure that the recognition of genuine expertise is not lost in the age of democracy also underlies his support for Thomas Hare’s system of Proportional Representation. Instead of limiting the choice to local candidates, Mill hoped to allow voters to join together and elect the most distinguished candidates from throughout the nation, resulting in the “very élite of the country” being elected to, and exercising an influence within and beyond, Parliament (Considerations, XIX: 456). The desire for expertise also guides Mill’s belief that a Second Chamber would, at best, be a Senate composed of those who had previously held high political offices or employments, and had thereby established their quality as “natural leaders” (Considerations, XIX: 516).

Mill’s attempt to secure conditions in which genuine authorities can be identified and heard amongst the clamor of democratic society is not, of course, an attempt to stifle other voices. Neither is it an attempt to impose the will of experts on an unwilling majority. At all points, Mill remains committed to the freedom of individuals to hold and express their own opinions, and to the sovereignty of the majority will on public matters. His sensitivity towards the very real dangers of populism in modern societies is, that is to say, never allowed to overshadow his basic commitment to liberal democracy as the political system most suited to the cultivation of a free, active, and happy citizenry.


Primary Sources

All citations of Mill are taken from The Collected Works of John Stuart Mill, edited by John M. Robson (Toronto: University of Toronto Press, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1963–91), in 33 volumes, and are given by volume and page.

Secondary Sources

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  • Balaguer, M., 2014, “Mill and the Philosophy of Mathematics: Physicalism and Fictionalism”, in Loizides 2014: 83–100.
  • Ball, T., 2010, “Competing Theories of Character Formation: James vs. John Stuart Mill”, in John Stuart Mill—Thought and Influence: The Saint of Rationalism, Georgios Varouxakis and Paul Kelly (eds.), London: Routledge, pp. 35–56.
  • Brink, D., 2013, Mill’s Progressive Principles, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2017, “Mill on Justice and Rights”, in Macleod and Miller 2017.
  • Brook, R.J., 1973, Berkeley’s Philosophy of Science, The Hague: M. Nijhoff.
  • Capaldi, N., 2004, John Stuart Mill: a Biography, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Clark, S., 2010, “Love, Poetry, and the Good Life: Mill’s Autobiography and Perfectionist Ethics”, Inquiry, 53(6): 565–78.
  • Cobb, A., 2017, “Mill’s Philosophy of Science”, in Macleod and Miller 2017: 234–49.
  • Devigne, R., 2006, Reforming Liberalism: J.S. Mill’s Use of Ancient, Religious, Liberal, and Romantic Moralities, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
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Other Internet Resources


I owe thanks to Reuven Brandt, Aaron Cobb, Sam Clark, Fred Kroon, John Skorupski and Nick Unwin for reading drafts, offering comments, and correcting errors. As can be seen from the Bibliography above, I have learnt much about Mill during the process of co-editing A Companion to Mill—I therefore owe thanks to the contributors to that volume, as well as my co-editor, Dale Miller.

Copyright © 2016 by
Christopher Macleod <>

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