Mill’s Moral and Political Philosophy

First published Tue Oct 9, 2007; substantive revision Mon Aug 22, 2022

John Stuart Mill (1806–1873) was the most famous and influential British philosopher of the nineteenth century. He was one of the last systematic philosophers, making significant contributions in logic, metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, political philosophy, and social theory. He was also an important public figure, articulating the liberal platform, pressing for various liberal reforms, and serving in Parliament. During Mill’s lifetime, he was most widely admired for his work in theoretical philosophy and political economy. However, nowadays Mill’s greatest philosophical influence is in moral and political philosophy, especially his articulation and defense of utilitarianism and liberalism (Nicholson 1998). This entry will examine Mill’s contributions to the utilitarian and liberal traditions. We will concentrate on his two most popular and best known works, Utilitarianism (1861, cited as U) and On Liberty (1859, cited as OL), drawing on other texts when this sheds light on his utilitarian and liberal principles. We will conclude by looking at how Mill applies these principles to issues of political and sexual equality in Considerations on Representative Government (1859, cited as CRG), Principles of Political Economy (1848, cited as PPE), and The Subjection of Women (1869, cited as SW).

1. Mill’s Intellectual Background

One cannot properly appreciate the development of Mill’s moral and political philosophy without some understanding of his intellectual background. Mill was raised in the tradition of Philosophical Radicalism, made famous by Jeremy Bentham (1748–1832), John Austin (1790–1859), and his father James Mill (1773–1836), which applied utilitarian principles in a self-conscious and systematic way to issues of institutional design and social reform. Utilitarianism assesses actions and institutions in terms of their effects on human happiness and enjoins us to perform actions and design institutions so that they promote—in one formulation, maximize—human happiness. Utilitarianism was a progressive doctrine historically, principally because of its universal scope—its insistence that everyone’s happiness matters—and its egalitarian conception of impartiality—its insistence that everyone’s happiness matters equally. Because of these general characteristics of utilitarianism, the Radicals’ application of utilitarian principles to social institutions tended to challenge traditional institutions of class and privilege and support egalitarian reforms.

As documented in his Autobiography (1873), Mill was groomed from birth by his father to become the ultimate Victorian intellectual and utilitarian reformer. As part of this apprenticeship, Mill was exposed to an extremely demanding education, shaped by utilitarian principles. While Mill followed the strict intellectual regimen laid down by his father for many years, he suffered a profound intellectual and emotional crisis in the period 1826–1830. Mill’s recovery was assisted by friendships he formed with Thomas Carlyle and Samuel Coleridge, who introduced him to ideas and texts from the Romantic and Conservative traditions. As Mill emerged from his depression, he became more concerned with the development of well-rounded individuals and with the role of feeling, culture, and creativity in the happiness of individuals (see Capaldi 2004).

Though Mill never renounced the liberal and utilitarian tradition and mission that he inherited from his father, his mental crisis and recovery greatly influenced his interpretation of this tradition. He became critical of the moral psychology of Bentham and his father and of some of the social theory underlying their plans for reform. It is arguable that Mill tends to downplay the significance of his innovations and to underestimate the intellectual discontinuities between himself and his father. One measure of the extent of Mill’s departure from the views of Bentham and James Mill is that Mill’s father came to view him as a defector from the utilitarian cause (Autobiography 189). We need to try to understand the extent of the transformation Mill brings to the utilitarian and liberal principles of the Radicals.

1.1 The Philosophical Radicals

Some of Mill’s most significant innovations to the utilitarian tradition concern his claims about the nature of happiness and the role of happiness in human motivation. Bentham and James Mill understand happiness hedonistically, as consisting in pleasure, and they believe that the ultimate aim of each person is predominantly, if not exclusively, the promotion of the agent’s own happiness (pleasure).

Bentham begins his Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation (1789) with this hedonistic assumption about human motivation.

Nature has placed mankind under the governance of two sovereign masters, pain and pleasure (Principles I 1).

Bentham allows that we may be moved by the pleasures and pains of others. But he appears to think that these other-regarding pleasures can move us only insofar as we take pleasure in the pleasure of others (V 32). This suggests that Bentham endorses a version of psychological egoism, which claims that the agent’s own happiness is and can be the only ultimate object of his desires. In his unfinished Constitutional Code (1832), Bentham makes this commitment to psychological egoism clear.

On the occasion of every act he exercises, every human being is led to pursue that line of conduct which, according to his view of the case, taken by him at the moment, will be in the highest degree contributory to his own greatest happiness. (Introduction, §2)

Bentham is a hedonist about utility or happiness, treating happiness as consisting in pleasure (Principles I 3). So the version of psychological egoism to which he is attracted is psychological hedonism. Bentham does not say why he believes that one’s own pleasure is the only ultimate object of desire. He may see it as a generalization from his observations about the motives underlying human behavior.

James Mill also treats psychological hedonism as axiomatic in his Essay on Government (1824).

The desire, therefore, of that power which is necessary to render the persons and properties of human beings subservient to our pleasures, is the grand governing law of human nature. (§IV; also see §V)

Sometimes, Bentham appears to allow for a more diverse set of ultimate motives or interests, including other-regarding motives (Principles X 25, X 36–38, XI 31; Table of the Springs of Action II 2). But these concessions to psychological pluralism are exceptional. Even in contexts where Bentham recognizes motivation that is not ultimately self-interested, he appears to treat it as weaker and less dependable than self-interested motivation (Book of Fallacies 392–93).

Bentham claims that utility not only describes human motivation but also sets the standard of right and wrong (Principles I 1).

By the principle of utility is meant that principle which approves or disapproves of every action whatsoever, according to the tendency which it appears to have to augment or diminish the happiness of the party whose interest is in question …. (Principles I 2)

It remains to be determined whose happiness matters. One might imagine that it is the utility of the agent. This would be the ethical counterpart to psychological egoism. However, Bentham’s answer, and the answer characteristic of utilitarianism, is the happiness of all (Principles I 4–10). Bentham says that our account of right action, obligation, and duty ought to be governed by the principle of utility (I 9–10). This seems to imply that an action is right or obligatory just insofar as it promotes utility. But then the right or obligatory act would seem to be the one that promotes utility the most or maximizes utility. For these reasons, it is common to understand Bentham as combining psychological hedonism and hedonistic utilitarianism.

But, if this is Bentham’s view, he faces a problem, for he combines the ethical claim that each of us ought to aim at the general happiness (pleasure) with the psychological claim that each of us can only aim (ultimately) at his own happiness (pleasure). Here we seem to have a special case of the conflict between psychological egoism and morality’s other-regarding or altruistic demands.

Bentham is not unaware of this tension. He addresses part of the problem in the political context in other writings, notably his Plan for Parliamentary Reform (1817). In the political context, the problem is how we can get self-interested rulers to rule in the interest of the governed, as utilitarianism implies that they should. Bentham’s answer invokes his commitment to representative democracy. We can reconcile self-interested motivation and promotion of the common good if we make rulers democratically accountable to (all) those whom they govern, for this tends to make the interest of the governed and the interest of the governors coincide. Bentham’s argument, elaborated by James Mill in his Essay on Government, is something like this.

  1. Each person acts only (or predominantly) to promote his own interests.
  2. The proper object of government is the interest of the governed.
  3. Hence, rulers will pursue the proper object of government if and only if their interests coincide with those of the governed.
  4. A ruler’s interest will coincide with those of the governed if and only if he is politically accountable to the governed.
  5. Hence, rulers must be democratically accountable.

It was this reasoning that led Bentham and James Mill to advocate democratic reforms that included extending the franchise to workers and peasant farmers.

In Principles Chapter IV Bentham sets out his conception of pleasure and utility in more detail, distinguishing between intrinsic and relational dimensions of pleasures. For our purposes, some dimensions matter more than others. Hedonism says that pleasure is the one and only intrinsic good and that pain is the one and only intrinsic evil. All other things have only extrinsic or instrumental value depending on whether and, if so, how much pleasure or pain they produce. Because the utilitarian asks us to maximize value, he has to be able to make sense of quantities or magnitudes of value associated with different options, where he assigns value to pleasure and disvalue to pain. Intensity, duration, and extent would appear to be the most relevant variables here. Each option is associated with various pleasures and pains both within a single life and across lives. For any given option we must find out how many pleasures and pains it produces, whether those occur in a single life or in different lives. For every distinct pleasure and pain, we must calculate its intensity and its duration. That would give us the total amount of (net) pleasure (or pain) associated with each option. Then we must do that option with greatest total. If there are two (or more) options with the greatest total, we are free to select any of these.

Bentham does not assume that our estimates of what will maximize utility will always be reliable. Nor does he assume that we should always try to maximize utility (Principles I 13, IV 6). Doing so is costly, and we may sometimes promote utility best by not trying to promote it directly. Nonetheless, utility, he thinks, is the standard of right conduct.

2. Mill’s Utilitarianism

Though Mill accepts the utilitarian legacy of the Radicals, he transforms that legacy in important ways. Part of understanding Mill’s contributions to the utilitarian tradition involves understanding his disagreement with the Radicals on issues about human motivation and the nature of happiness.

2.1 Psychological Egoism

Henry Sidgwick (1838–1900), for one, read Mill as a psychological egoist (The Methods of Ethics 42–44). This is not just guilt by association. For it may appear that Mill endorses psychological egoism in his so-called “proof” of the principle of utility in Chapter IV of Utilitarianism. There, Mill aims to show that happiness is the one and only thing desirable in itself (U IV 2). To do this, he argues that happiness is desirable in itself (IV 3), and a central premise in this argument is that everyone desires his own happiness (IV 3). Mill later argues that only happiness is desirable (IV 4).

But the proof does not reveal Mill to be a psychological egoist. While Mill does say that each person has an ultimate desire for her own happiness, he does not say that this is each person’s only ultimate desire. Indeed, in the second half of the proof he allows that some agents have a disinterested concern for virtue and that they care about virtue for its own sake (IV 4–5). And what is true of virtue is no less true of less grand objects of desire, such as money or power (IV 6). These too it is possible to desire for their own sakes. If psychological egoism claims that one’s own happiness is the only thing that is desired for its own sake, then this shows that Mill is not a psychological egoist.

If we look outside of Utilitarianism we can find even clearer evidence of Mill’s doubts about psychological egoism and hedonism. In a note to his edition of James Mill’s Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind (1869) John Stuart Mill diagnoses a possible equivocation in his father’s doctrine.

That the pleasures or pains of another person can only be pleasurable or painful to us through the association of our own pleasures and pains with them, is true in one sense, which is probably that intended by the author, but not true in another, against which he has not sufficiently guarded his mode of expression. It is evident, that the only pleasures or pains of which we have direct experience … [are] those felt by ourselves … [and] that the pleasure or pain with which we contemplate the pleasure or pain felt by someone else, is itself a pleasure or pain of our own. But if it be meant that in such cases the pleasure or pain is consciously referred to self, I take this to be a mistake. (Notes II 217–18)

In his “Remarks on Bentham’s Philosophy” (1833) Mill urges a similar caution in understanding Bentham.

In laying down as a philosophical axiom that men’s actions are always obedient to their interests, Mr. Bentham did no more than dress up the very trivial proposition that all people do what they feel themselves most disposed to do …. He by no means intended by this assertion to impute universal selfishness to mankind, for he reckoned the motive of sympathy as an interest. (CW X: 13–14)

In both passages Mill makes what is now a familiar diagnosis of the troubles with psychological egoism. He thinks that psychological egoism is ambiguous between a true but trivial thesis about the ownership of desire—an agent necessarily acts on his own desires—and a substantive but wildly implausible thesis about the content of desires—an agent’s ultimate desire is always and necessarily to promote his own interests or pleasure. If so, there is no thesis that is both substantive and plausible. The substantive thesis may seem speciously attractive if we tacitly confuse it with the trivially true thesis. But it seems clear from Bentham’s and James Mill’s worries about the conflict between ruler’s interests and the interest of the ruled that they intend something like the substantive psychological thesis. But if they do so because they conflate it with the trivial but true thesis, then they commit the fallacy of equivocation.

So Mill rejects the substantive doctrines of psychological egoism and hedonism that Bentham and his father sometimes defended or suggested. This is really part of a larger criticism of the conception of psychology and human nature underlying Benthamite utilitarianism, which Mill elaborates in his essays on Bentham. Mill’s desire to distance himself from Benthamite assumptions about human nature and psychology are also reflected in his conception of happiness and his doctrine of higher pleasures.

2.2 Happiness and Higher Pleasures

Mill also disagrees with the Radicals about the nature of happiness. Though he never abandons the utilitarian tradition of the Radicals, Mill modifies their assumptions about happiness. He explains his commitment to utilitarianism early in Chapter II of Utilitarianism.

The creed which accepts as the foundations of morals “utility” or the “greatest happiness principle” holds that actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness; wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness. By happiness is intended pleasure and the absence of pain; by unhappiness, pain and the privation of pleasure. (II 2; also see II 1)

This famous passage is sometimes called the Proportionality Doctrine. It sounds like Bentham. The first sentence appears to endorse utilitarianism, while the second sentence appears to endorse a hedonistic conception of utilitarianism.

Hedonism implies that the mental state of pleasure is the only thing having intrinsic value (and the mental state of pain is the only intrinsic evil). All other things have only extrinsic value; they have value just insofar as they bring about, mediately or directly, intrinsic value (or disvalue). It follows that actions, activities, etc. can have only extrinsic value, and it would seem that their value should depend entirely upon the quantity of pleasure that they produce, where quantity is a function of the number of pleasures, their intensity, and their duration. This would mean that one kind of activity or pursuit is intrinsically no better than another. If we correctly value one more than another, it must be because the first produces more numerous, intense, or durable pleasures than the other.

Mill worries that some will reject hedonism as a theory of value or happiness fit only for swine (II 3). In particular, he worries that opponents will assume that utilitarianism favors sensual or voluptuary pursuits (e.g., push-pin) over higher or nobler pursuits (e.g., poetry). Mill attempts to reassure readers that the utilitarian can and will defend the superiority of higher pleasures.

He begins by noting, with fairly obvious reference to Bentham, that the hedonist can defend higher pursuits as extrinsically superior on the ground that they produce more pleasure (II 4). While Mill thinks that the Benthamite can defend the extrinsic superiority of higher pleasure, he is not content with this defense of their superiority. Mill insists that the greater value of intellectual pleasures can and should be put on a more secure footing (II 4). He explains these higher pleasures and links them with the preferences of a competent judge, in the following manner.

If I am asked what I mean by difference of quality in pleasures, or what makes one pleasure more valuable than another, merely as a pleasure, except its being greater in amount, there is but one possible answer. If one of the two is, by those who are competently acquainted with both, placed so far above the other that they prefer it, even though knowing it to be attended with a greater amount of discontent, and would not resign it for any quantity of the other pleasure which their nature is capable of, we are justified in ascribing to the preferred enjoyment a superiority in quality so far outweighing quantity as to render it, in comparison, of small account. (II 5)

Indeed, Mill seems to claim here not just that higher pleasures are intrinsically more valuable than lower ones but that they are discontinuously better (II 6).

This certainly goes beyond Bentham’s quantitative hedonism. In fact, it is not even clear that Mill’s higher pleasures doctrine is consistent with hedonism. Mill’s position here is hard to pin down, in part because he uses the term ‘pleasure’ sometimes to refer to (a) a certain kind of mental state or sensation and at other times to refer to (b) non-mental items, such as actions, activities, and pursuits that do or can cause pleasurable mental states (consider the way in which someone might say that surfing was her greatest pleasure). We might call (a)-type pleasures subjective pleasures and (b)-type pleasures objective pleasures. What’s unclear is whether Mill’s higher pleasures are subjective pleasures or objective pleasures. His discussion concerns activities that employ our higher faculties. What’s unclear is whether higher pleasures refer to mental states or sensations caused by higher activities or the activities themselves.

It might seem clear that we should interpret higher pleasures as subjective pleasures. After all, Mill has just told us that he is a hedonist about happiness. The Radicals may not have always been clear about the kind of mental state or sensation they take pleasure to be, but it seems clear that they conceive of it as some kind of mental state or sensation. Some, like Bentham, appear to conceive of pleasure as a sensation with a distinctive kind of qualitative feel. Others, perhaps despairing of finding qualia common to all disparate kinds of pleasures, tend to understand pleasures functionally, as mental states or sensations the subject, whose states these are, prefers and is disposed to prolong. James Mill held something like this functional conception of pleasure (An Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind II, p. 184). Pleasures, understood functionally, could have very different qualitative feels and yet still be pleasures. Insofar as Mill does discuss subjective pleasures, he is not clear which, if either, of these conceptions of pleasure he favors. Nonetheless, it may seem natural to assume that as a hedonist he conceives of pleasures as subjective pleasures. According to this interpretation, Mill is focusing on pleasurable sensations and then distinguishing higher and lower pleasures by references to their causes. Higher pleasures are pleasures caused by the exercise of our higher faculties, whereas lower pleasures are pleasures caused by the exercise of our lower capacities. But this interpretation of the higher pleasures doctrine is problematic.

One concern is raised by Henry Sidgwick (Outlines 247). Hedonism is committed to the idea that one pleasure is better than another because it is more pleasurable. But this sounds like a quantitative relation. If higher pleasures are better than lower pleasures, but not because they involve a greater quantity of pleasure, how can this be squared with hedonism? One answer is that Mill thinks that there are two factors affecting the magnitude of a pleasure: its quantity, as determined by its intensity and duration, and its quality or kind. On this proposal, one pleasure can be greater than another independently of its quantity by virtue of its quality (Sturgeon 2010).

We can distinguish among pleasures between those that are caused by the exercise of our higher faculties and those that are caused by the exercise of our lower faculties. But why should this difference itself affect the pleasurableness of the state in question? If Mill holds a preference or functional conception of pleasure, according to which pleasures are mental states that the subject prefers and other things being equal would prolong, then perhaps he could claim that pleasures categorically preferred by competent judges are more pleasurable pleasures. However, he says that competent judges have this preference for the higher pleasure, “even though knowing it to be attended with a greater amount of discontent” (U II 5). This suggests that higher pleasures may not be more pleasurable even for competent judges, and in any case it’s not clear that we could infer what was more pleasurable for someone who was not a competent judge from what was more pleasurable for someone who was. So, even if we can distinguish higher and lower pleasures, according to their causes, it remains unclear how the hedonist is to explain how higher pleasures are inherently more pleasurable.

A related concern is how this interpretation of the higher pleasures doctrine makes sense of Mill’s contrast between happiness and contentment or satisfaction. After explaining higher pleasures in terms of the categorical preferences of competent judges and insisting that competent judges would not trade any amount of lower pleasures for higher pleasures, he claims that this preference sacrifices contentment or satisfaction, but not happiness (II 6). Mill does not say that the preference of competent judges is for one kind of contentment over another or that Socrates has more contentment than the pig or fool by virtue of enjoying a different kind of contentment. Instead, he contrasts happiness and contentment and implies that Socrates is happier than the fool, even if less contented.

Another problem for this reading of the higher pleasures doctrine is that Mill frequently understands higher pleasures as objective pleasures. First, we have independent evidence that Mill sometimes uses the word “pleasure” to refer to objective pleasures. For instance, in the second part of the “proof” of the principle of utility in Chapter IV Mill counts music, virtue, and health as pleasures (IV 5). These seem to be objective pleasures. Elsewhere in his discussion of higher pleasures in Chapter II, Mill equates a person’s pleasures with his “indulgences” (II 7) and with his “mode of existence” (II 8). Here too he seems to be discussing objective pleasures. When Mill introduces higher pleasures (II 4) he is clearly discussing, among other things, intellectual pursuits and activities. He claims to be arguing that what the quantitative hedonist finds extrinsically more valuable is also intrinsically more valuable (II 4, 7). But what the quantitative hedonist defends as extrinsically more valuable are complex activities and pursuits, such as writing or reading poetry, not mental states. Because Mill claims that these very same things are intrinsically, and not just extrinsically, more valuable, his higher pleasures would appear to be intellectual activities and pursuits, rather than mental states. Finally, in paragraphs 4–8 Mill links the preferences of competent judges and the greater value of the objects of their preferences. But among the things Mill thinks competent judges would prefer are activities and pursuits.

Now it is an unquestionable fact that those who are equally acquainted with and equally capable of appreciating and enjoying both do give a most marked preference to the manner of existence which employs their higher faculties. (II 6; emphasis added)

Here Mill is identifying the higher pleasures with activities and pursuits that exercise our higher capacities.

Insofar as Mill’s higher pleasures doctrine concerns objective pleasures, it appears anti-hedonistic for two reasons. First, he claims that the intellectual pursuits have value out of proportion to the amount of contentment or pleasure (the mental state) that they produce. This would contradict the traditional hedonist claim that the extrinsic value of an activity is proportional to its pleasurableness. Second, Mill claims that these activities are intrinsically more valuable than the lower pursuits (II 7). But the traditional hedonist claims that the mental state of pleasure is the one and only intrinsic good; activities can have only extrinsic value, and no activity can be intrinsically more valuable than another.

Whichever way we read Mill’s higher pleasures doctrine, it is hard to square that doctrine with hedonism, as traditionally formulated. This apparent inconsistency was noted by many of Mill’s subsequent critics, including Sidgwick (Methods 93n, 94, 121), F.H. Bradley (Ethical Studies 116–20), T.H. Green (Prolegomena to Ethics §§162–63), and G.E. Moore (Principia Ethica 71–72, 77–81). Green’s discussion is especially instructive. He focuses on Mill’s explanation of the preferences of competent judges for modes of existence that employ their higher faculties. Mill explains the fact that competent judges prefer activities that exercise their rational capacities by appeal to their sense of dignity.

We may give what explanation we please of this unwillingness [on the part of a competent judge ever to sink into what he feels to be a lower grade of existence] …but its most appropriate appellation is a sense of dignity, which all human beings possess in one form or other, and in some, though by no means in exact, proportion to their higher faculties …. (U II 6)

Green thinks that the dignity passage undermines hedonism (Prolegomena §§164–66, 171). In claiming that it is the dignity of a life in which the higher capacities are exercised and the competent judge’s sense of her own dignity that explains her preference for those activities, Mill implies that her preferences reflect judgments about the value that these activities have independently of their being the object of desire or the source of pleasure. We take pleasure in these activities because they are valuable; they are not valuable, because they are pleasurable.

To see Green’s point, think of competent judges as demi-gods. In the dignity passage, Mill is making the same sort of point that Socrates does in discussing Euthyphro’s definition of piety as what all the gods love (Euthyphro 9c–11b). Socrates thought the gods’ attitudes would be principled, not arbitrary. But this meant that their love presupposed, rather than explained, piety and justice. Similarly, Mill thinks that the preferences of competent judges are not arbitrary, but principled, reflecting a sense of the value of the higher capacities. But this would make his doctrine of higher pleasures fundamentally anti-hedonistic, insofar it explains the superiority of higher activities, not in terms of the pleasure they produce, but rather in terms of the dignity or value of the kind of life characterized by the exercise of higher capacities. And it is sensitivity to the dignity of such a life that explains the categorical preference that competent judges supposedly have for higher activities.

2.3 Perfectionist Elements

We can begin to see the possibility and the appeal of reading Mill as a kind of perfectionist about happiness, who claims that human happiness consists in the proper exercise of those capacities essential to our nature. For instance, Mill suggests this sort of perfectionist perspective on happiness when early in On Liberty he describes the utilitarian foundation of his defense of individual liberties.

It is proper to state that I forego any advantage which could be derived to my argument from the idea of abstract right as a thing independent of utility. I regard utility as the ultimate appeal on all ethical questions; but it must be utility in the largest sense, grounded on the permanent interests of man as a progressive being. (OL I 11)

Mill apparently believes that the sense of dignity of a (properly self-conscious) progressive being would give rise to a categorical preference for activities that exercise his or her higher capacities. In claiming that “it is better to be a human being dissatisfied than a pig satisfied; better to be Socrates dissatisfied than a fool satisfied” (U II 6), Mill recognizes capacities for self-examination and practical deliberation as among our higher capacities.

This concern with self-examination and practical deliberation is, of course, a central theme in On Liberty. There he articulates the interest that progressive beings have in reflective decision-making.

He who lets the world, or his own portion of it, choose his plan of life for him has no need of any other faculty than the ape-like one of imitation. He who chooses his plan for himself employs all his faculties. He must use observation to see, reasoning and judgment to foresee, activity to gather materials for decision, discrimination to decide, and when he has decided, firmness and self-control to hold his deliberate decision. And these qualities he requires and exercises exactly in proportion as the part of his conduct which he determines according to his own judgment and feelings is a large one. It is possible that he might be guided in some good path, and kept out of harm’s way, without any of these things. But what will be his comparative worth as a human being? (OL III 4)

Even if we agree that these deliberative capacities are unique to humans or that humans possess them to a higher degree than other creatures, we might wonder in what way their possession marks us as progressive beings or their exercise is important to human happiness.

In his discussion of responsibility in A System of Logic (SL VI.ii.1–4) Mill suggests that he thinks that humans are responsible agents and that this is what marks us as progressive beings. There he claims that capacities for practical deliberation are necessary for responsibility. In particular, he claims that moral responsibility involves a kind of self-mastery or self-governance in which one can can deliberate about the appropriateness of one’s desires and regulate one’s actions according to these deliberations (SL VI.ii.3). If this is right, then Mill can claim that possession and use of our deliberative capacities mark us as progressive beings, because they are what mark as moral agents who are responsible. If our happiness should reflect the sort of beings we are, Mill can argue that higher activities that exercise these deliberative capacities form the principal or most important ingredient in human happiness.

2.4 Reconciling the Elements

Where exactly does this recognition of perfectionist elements in Mill’s conception of happiness leave us? Any interpretation faces significant worries about his consistency. Part of the problem is that Mill appears to endorse three distinct conceptions of the good and happiness.

  1. Hedonism: Pleasure is the one and only intrinsic good, things are good insofar as they are pleasant, and happiness consists in pleasure.
  2. Desire-satisfaction: The one and only intrinsic good is the satisfaction of desire (actual or idealized), things are good insofar as they satisfy desire, and happiness consists in the satisfaction of desire.
  3. Perfectionism: The exercise of one’s higher capacities is the one and only intrinsic good, things are good insofar as they exercise higher capacities, and happiness consists in the exercise of higher capacities.

Hedonism is apparently introduced in the Proportionality Doctrine, when Mill identifies happiness and pleasure (U II 2). In introducing the doctrine of higher pleasures, Mill appears to want to make some refinement within hedonism (II 3–5). But the higher pleasures doctrine appeals to the informed or idealized preferences of a competent judge and identifies higher pleasures with the object of their preferences (II 5). Moreover, he treats this appeal to the preferences of competent judges as final (II 8). But competent judges prefer higher activities, and not just subjective pleasures caused by those activities, and their preference for higher pursuits is based on their sense of the dignity inherent in a life lived that way (II 6). Moreover, in On Liberty and elsewhere he embraces a “progressive” conception of happiness in terms of reflective self-examination and directive self-control. Since these are three distinct and rival claims about Mill’s conception of the final good, any reading must explain away inconsistency as best it can and say something about how these three elements are to be reconciled with one another.

We could reconcile either hedonism or perfectionism with the desire-satisfaction claim if we treat the latter as a metaethical claim about what makes good things good and the former as a substantive claim about what things are good. On this reading, what makes something good is that it would be preferred by competent judges, and what competent judges in fact prefer is pleasures, especially higher pleasures (according to the hedonist claim) or higher activities and pursuits (according to the perfectionist claim). But, as we have seen, neither of these claims can accommodate all of Mill’s claims about happiness, and both assume that the preferences of competent judges are constitutive of the superiority of the object of the their preferences. But the dignity passage implies that the preferences of competent judges are evidential, rather than constitutive, of the value of the object of the their preferences.

The perfectionist reading offers one reconciliation of Mill’s disparate claims. It says that happiness consists in the exercise of higher capacities, that the preferences of competent judges are evidential of superior value, and that higher pleasures are objective pleasures. There is no doubt that his initial formulation of his conception of happiness in terms of pleasure misleadingly leads us to expect greater continuity between his own brand of utilitarianism and the hedonistic utilitarianism of the Radicals than we actually find. However, this perfectionist interpretation seems to afford the most consistent reading of Mill’s disparate claims about happiness (also see Saunders 2017).

2.5 Conceptions of Duty

As Mill’s Proportionality Doctrine makes clear, he endorses the utilitarian idea that duty or right action is to be defined in terms of the promotion of happiness. But exactly how Mill thinks duty is related to happiness is not entirely clear. To understand the different strands in his conception of utilitarianism, we need to distinguish between direct and indirect utilitarianism.

  • Direct Utilitarianism: Any object of moral assessment (e.g., action, motive, policy, or institution) should be assessed by and in proportion to the value of its consequences for the general happiness.
  • Indirect Utilitarianism: Any object of moral assessment should be assessed, not by the value of its consequences for the general happiness, but by its conformity to something else (e.g., norms or motives) that has (have) good or optimal acceptance value.

So formulated, direct and indirect utilitarianism are general theories that apply to any object of moral assessment. But our focus here is on right action or duty. Act utilitarianism is the most familiar form of direct utilitarianism applied to action, whereas the most common indirect utilitarian theory of duty is rule utilitarianism.

  • Act Utilitarianism: An act is right insofar as its consequences for the general happiness are at least as good as any alternative available to the agent.
  • Rule Utilitarianism: An act is right insofar as it conforms to a rule whose acceptance value for the general happiness is at least as great as any alternative rule available to the agent.

This conception of act utilitarianism is both maximizing, because it identifies the right action with the best available action, and scalar, because it recognizes that rightness can come in degrees, depending on the action’s proximity to the best (contrast Norcross 2008). The right act is the optimal act, but some suboptimal acts can be more right and less wrong than others. Similarly, this conception of rule utilitarianism assesses rules in both maximizing and scalar fashion.

2.6 Utilitarianism as a Standard of Conduct

We might expect a utilitarian to apply the utilitarian principle in her deliberations. Consider act utilitarianism. We might expect such a utilitarian to be motivated by pure disinterested benevolence and to deliberate by calculating expected utility. But it is a practical question how to reason or be motivated, and act utilitarianism implies that this practical question, like all practical questions, is correctly answered by what would maximize utility. Utilitarian calculation is time-consuming and often unreliable or subject to bias and distortion. For such reasons, we may better approximate the utilitarian standard if we don’t always try to approximate it. Mill says that to suppose that one must always consciously employ the utilitarian principle in making decisions

… is to mistake the very meaning of a standard of morals and confound the rule of action with the motive of it. It is the business of ethics to tell us what are our duties, or by what test we may know them; but no system of ethics requires that the sole motive of all we do shall be a feeling of duty; on the contrary, ninety-nine hundredths of all our actions are done from other motives, and rightly so done if the rule of duty does not condemn them. (U II 18)

Later utilitarians, such as Sidgwick, have made essentially the same point, insisting that utilitarianism provides a standard of right action, not necessarily a decision procedure (Methods 413).

If utilitarianism is itself the standard of right conduct, not a decision procedure, then what sort of decision procedure should the utilitarian endorse, and what role should the principle of utility play in moral reasoning? As we will see, Mill thinks that much moral reasoning should be governed by secondary precepts or principles about such things as fidelity, fair play, and honesty that make no direct reference to utility but whose general observance does promote utility. These secondary principles should be set aside in favor of direct appeals to the utilitarian first principle in cases in which adherence to the secondary precept would have obviously inferior consequences or in which such secondary principles conflict (U II 19, 24–25).

The question that concerns us here is what kind of utilitarian standard Mill endorses. Is he an act utilitarian, a rule utilitarian, or some other kind of indirect utilitarian?

2.7 Act Utilitarianism

Several of Mill’s characterizations of utilitarianism endorse the direct utilitarian claim that an action’s moral status is a function of its utility. Chapter II, we saw, is where Mill purports to say what the doctrine of utilitarianism does and does not say. In the opening paragraph, he tells us that utilitarians are “those who stand up for utility as the test of right and wrong” (II 1). According to the Proportionality Doctrine, introduced in the next paragraph, utilitarianism holds “that actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness; wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness” (II 2). Later in that chapter, he says that it requires that “utility or happiness [be] considered as the directive rule of human conduct” (II 8). Still later in Chapter II, he describes utilitarianism as a “standard of what is right in conduct” (II 17). Even Chapter V, which will eventually introduce some indirect elements, begins with Mill asserting that utilitarianism is “the doctrine that utility or happiness is the criterion of right and wrong” (V 1).

2.8 Rule Utilitarianism

But not everyone agrees. J.O. Urmson famously defended a rule utilitarian reading of Mill (1953). One of Urmson’s reasons for this rule utilitarian reading appeals to Mill’s reliance on various rules and secondary principles in moral reasoning. We will examine that rationale shortly. But Urmson also appeals to the Proportionality Doctrine as requiring a rule utilitarian interpretation of Mill.

2.8.1 Felicific Tendencies

Recall that the Proportionality Doctrine says, in part, that utilitarianism holds that actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness; wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness (U II 2). Urmson claims that we can make sense of an action’s tendency to produce good or bad consequences only as a claim about what is true of a class or type of actions. Token actions produce specifiable consequences; only types of actions have tendencies. On Urmson’s interpretation, Mill is really saying that an action is right if it is a token of a type of act that tends to have good or optimal consequences. So interpreted, the Proportionality Doctrine would espouse a form of rule utilitarianism.

But it was common among the Philosophical Radicals to formulate utilitarianism, as the Proportionality Doctrine does, in terms of the felicific tendencies of individual actions. For instance, Bentham does this early in his Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation.

By the principle of utility is meant that principle which approves or disapproves of every action whatsoever, according to the tendency which it appears to have to augment or diminish the happiness of the party whose interest is in question: or, what is the same thing in other words, to promote or oppose that happiness. I say of every action whatsoever; and therefore not only every action of a private individual, but of every measure of government. (I 2; also see I 3, 6)

Here and elsewhere, Bentham clearly ascribes the felicific tendency to action tokens, and he equates an action’s felicific tendency with the extent to which it promotes utility.

The general tendency of an act is more or less pernicious, according to the sum total of its consequences: that is, according to the differences between the sum of such as are good, and the sum of such as are evil. (VII 2; also see IV 5)

If we interpret Mill’s Proportionality Doctrine against the background of similar claims made by Bentham, this is evidence against Urmson’s reading and in favor of an act utilitarian reading of the Proportionality Doctrine (see Berger 1984: 73–78).

2.8.2 Secondary Principles

Urmson also defends a rule utilitarian interpretation as a reading of Mill’s claims about the importance of secondary principles in our moral reasoning. Mill defends the utilitarian’s appeal to familiar moral precepts about such things as fidelity, veracity, and fair play as secondary principles that should regulate much moral reasoning (U II 24–25). He seems to believe that secondary principles often satisfy two conditions.

  1. Following the principle generally but imperfectly leads to optimal results.
  2. The suboptimal results that adherence to the principle produces cannot be identified reliably and efficiently in advance.

When these two conditions are met, Mill believes, agents should for the most part follow these principles automatically and without recourse to the utilitarian first principle. However, they should periodically step back and review, as best they can, whether the principle continues to satisfy conditions (1) and (2). Also, they should set aside these secondary principles and make direct appeal to the principle of utility in unusual cases in which it is especially clear that the effects of adhering to the principle would be substantially suboptimal and in cases in which secondary principles, each of which has a utilitarian justification, conflict (II 19, 24–25).

Regulating one’s behavior in this way by secondary principles, Mill believes, is what will best promote happiness, as he explains in A System of Logic.

I do not mean to assert that the promotion of happiness should be itself the end of all actions, or even all rules of action. It is the justification, and ought to be the controller, of all ends, but it is not itself the sole end. There are many virtuous actions, and even virtuous modes of action (though the cases are, I think, less frequent than is often supposed) by which happiness in the particular instance is sacrificed, more pain being produced than pleasure. But conduct of which this can be truly asserted, admits of justification only because it can be shown that on the whole more happiness will exist in the world, if feelings are cultivated which will make people, in certain cases, regardless of happiness. (SL VI.xii.7)

He makes similar claims in his essay “On Bentham” (CW X: 110–11).

Mill’s utilitarian justification of secondary principles is intended as a contrast with the intuitionism of William Whewell and others. As he makes clear in his essay “Whewell on Moral Philosophy”(CW X), Mill thinks that the intuitionist wrongly treats familiar moral precepts as ultimate moral factors whose justification is supposed to be self-evident. By contrast, Mill’s account of secondary principles recognizes their importance in moral reasoning but insists that they are neither innate nor infallible; they are precepts that have been adopted and internalized because of their acceptance value, and their continued use should be suitably regulated by their ongoing comparative acceptance value. Far from undermining utilitarian first principles, Mill thinks, appeal to the importance of such moral principles actually provides support for utilitarianism.

Whether Mill’s claims about the importance of secondary principles imply rule utilitarianism depends, in part, on whether he wants to define right action in terms of the best set of secondary principles or whether they are just a reliable way of doing what is in fact best. If he defines right action in terms of conformity with principles with optimal acceptance value, then he is a rule utilitarian. But if the right action is the best action, and secondary principles are just a reliable (though imperfect) way of identifying what is best, then Mill is an act utilitarian. Mill appears to address this issue in two places. In Chapter II of Utilitarianism Mill appears to suggest that in the case of abstinences or taboos the ground of the obligation in particular cases is the beneficial character of the taboo considered as a class (II 19). But in a letter to John Venn Mill claims that the moral status of an individual action depends on the utility of its consequences; considerations about the utility of a general class of actions are just defeasible evidence about what is true in particular cases (CW XVII: 1881). Unfortunately, natural readings of the two passages point in opposite directions on this issue, and each passage admits of alternative readings.

Without clear support for the rule utilitarian reading of secondary principles, it seems that Mill’s main claims about secondary principles are not inconsistent with act utilitarianism. Moreover, it is clear that Mill thinks we need to depart from otherwise justified secondary principles in an important range of cases. Though Mill does not treat secondary principles as mere rules of thumb in utilitarian calculation, he does not think that they should be followed uncritically or independently of their consequences. He thinks that they should be set aside in favor of direct appeal to the principle of utility when following them would be clearly suboptimal or when there is a conflict among secondary principles.

2.9 Sanction Utilitarianism

So far, Mill’s various claims about duty are largely consistent with direct utilitarianism, and, hence, act utilitarianism. However, Chapter V of Utilitarianism introduces claims about duty, justice, and rights that are hard to square with either.

For the truth is, that the idea of penal sanction, which is the essence of law, enters not only into the conception of injustice, but into that of any kind of wrong. We do not call anything wrong unless we mean to imply that a person ought to be punished in some way or other for doing it—if not by law, by the opinion of his fellow creatures; if not by opinion, by the reproaches of his own conscience. This seems the real turning point of the distinction between morality and simple expediency. (V 14)

Here Mill defines wrongness and, by implication, duty, not directly in terms of the nature of the action or its consequences but indirectly in terms of appropriate responses to it. He appears to believe that one is under an obligation or duty to do something just in case failure to do it is wrong and that an action is wrong just in case some kind of external or internal sanction—punishment, social censure, or self-reproach—ought to be applied to its performance. This test distinguishes duty from expediency (V 14, 15). Not all suboptimal or inexpedient acts are wrong, only those to which one ought to apply some sort of sanction (at least, self-reproach).

Justice is a proper part of duty. Justice involves duties that are perfect duties—that is, duties that are correlated with rights (V 15). An act is just if and only if it is not unjust, and it is unjust just in case it is wrong and violates someone’s rights (V 23). Someone has a right just in case she has a claim that society ought to protect by force of law or public opinion (V 24).

Notice that these relationships among duty, justice, and rights do not yet introduce any utilitarian elements. But Mill does think that whether sanctions ought to be applied to an action—and hence whether it is wrong—and whether society ought to enforce an individual’s claim—and hence whether she has a right—both depend upon the utility or expediency of doing so (V 25). He does not say precisely what standard of expediency he has in mind. In particular, he does not say whether the relevant test for whether something is wrong requires that sanctions be optimal or merely beneficial. To fix ideas, let us assume that an action is wrong if and only if it is optimal to sanction it.

Because this account of duty defines the rightness and wrongness of an act, not in terms of its utility, as act utilitarianism does, but in terms of the utility of applying sanctions to the conduct, it is an indirect form of utilitarianism. Because justice is a species of duty, it inherits this indirect character (also see Lyons 1994). Because it makes the deontic status of conduct depend upon the utility of sanctioning that conduct in some way, we might call this conception of duty, justice, and rights sanction utilitarianism. Because sanction utilitarianism is a species of indirect utilitarianism, it is inconsistent with act utilitarianism. The introduction of indirect utilitarian ideas in Chapter V of Utilitarianism into an account of utilitarianism that otherwise looks act utilitarian reveals a fundamental tension in Mill’s thought about duty.

2.10 Act vs. Sanction Utilitarianism

Given Mill’s ambivalence between direct and indirect utilitarianism, it is natural to inquire whether one view is more plausible than the other. Some of Mill’s claims in Chapter V suggest a possible advantage that sanction utilitarianism might have. In articulating sanction utilitarianism, Mill claims that it allows him to distinguish duty and expediency and claim that not all inexpedient acts are wrong; inexpedient acts are only wrong when it is good or optimal to sanction them. This suggests that sanction utilitarianism may be preferable to act utilitarianism, because it has a more plausible account of the relation among different deontic categories.

Commonsense moral thinking recognizes a familiar fourfold deontic distinction.

  1. wrong or forbidden
  2. permissible
  3. obligatory
  4. supererogatory

The act utilitarian seems unable to account for this fourfold distinction. It implies that I do wrong every time I fail to perform the optimal act, even when these suboptimal acts are very good. Because it makes the optimal obligatory and the suboptimal wrong, it appears to expand the domain of the forbidden, collapse the distinction between the permissible and the obligatory, and make no room for the supererogatory. If the optimal is already one’s duty, there appears to be no room for the supererogatory. By contrast, sanction utilitarianism does not appear to have these problems. It offers a distinct account of each category.

  1. Wrong or forbidden acts are those whose performance it is optimal to blame.
  2. Permissible acts are those whose performance it is not optimal to blame.
  3. Obligatory acts are those whose omission it is optimal to blame.
  4. Supererogatory acts are permissible acts that are especially expedient.

In this way, sanction utilitarianism appears to respect this common deontic categorization and, in particular, to make room for the supererogatory.

However, the direct utilitarian can and should distinguish between the moral assessment of an act and the moral assessment of the act of praising or blaming that act. Each should be assessed, the direct utilitarian claims, by the utility of doing so. But then it is possible for there to be wrongdoing (a suboptimal act) that is blameless or even praiseworthy. But then the direct utilitarian can appeal to the same distinctions among praiseworthiness and blameworthiness that the sanction utilitarian appeals to, while denying that her own deontic distinctions track blame and praise. So, for instance, there can be acts that are wrong, because suboptimal, that it would nonetheless be wrong to blame, because this would be suboptimal. If so, it is unclear that sanction utilitarianism enjoys any real advantage here over act utilitarianism.

Moreover, sanction utilitarianism appears to have disadvantages that act utilitarianism does not. One such problem derives from its hybrid structure. Sanction utilitarianism is impurely indirect. For while it provides an indirect utilitarian theory of duty, the account it provides of when sanctions should be applied to conduct is direct—it depends upon the consequences of applying sanctions. Sanction utilitarianism provides an indirect utilitarian account of the conditions under which an action—any action—is right or wrong. This general criterion is that any action is wrong to which one ought to attach sanctions. But imposing sanctions is a kind of action, and we can ask whether the imposition of a particular sanction would be right or wrong. The general criterion implies that we should answer this question about the rightness of applying sanctions in sanction-utilitarians terms, namely, by asking whether it would be right to sanction the failure to apply sanctions. This introduces a second-order sanction, whose rightness we can now ask about. We seem to be off on an infinite regress of sanctions. Sanction-utilitarianism avoids the regress because it provides a direct utilitarian answer to the question when to apply the first-order sanction. It says that a sanction should be applied iff doing so is optimal. Though this avoids a regress, it appears to render sanction utilitarianism internally inconsistent.

  1. Any act is right iff and because it is optimal to apply sanctions to its omission (the indirect claim).
  2. Applying sanctions is right iff and because doing so is optimal (the direct claim).

(2) is inconsistent with (1).

The different strands in Mill’s utilitarian conception of duty require disentangling. In his central exposition of the utilitarian standard in Chapter II, Mill commits himself to act utilitarianism in multiple passages. In that same chapter, he focuses on the felicific tendencies of actions and assigns a significant role to rules within moral reasoning, both of which have been taken to commit him to a rule utilitarian doctrine. However, these claims are reconcilable with direct utilitarianism and so provide no good reason to depart from a traditional act utilitarian reading of that chapter. But in Chapter V Mill does introduce indirect utilitarian ideas in the doctrine of sanction utilitarianism. It is hard to reconcile these direct and indirect elements in Mill’s conception of duty.

2.11 The Proof of Utility

We have focused so far on understanding Mill’s version of utilitarianism, especially his conceptions of happiness and duty. Now we should consider his justification of utilitarianism, which he offers in his discussion of the “proof” of the principle of utility in Chapter IV. Mill claims that the utilitarian must claim that happiness is the one and only thing desirable in itself (IV 2). He claims that the only proof of desirability is desire and proceeds to argue that happiness is the one and only thing desired. He argues that a person does desire his own happiness for its own sake and that, therefore, happiness as such is desired by and desirable for its own sake for humanity as a whole (“The aggregate of all persons”) (IV 3). He then turns to defend the claim that happiness is the only thing desirable in itself, by arguing that apparent counterexamples (e.g., desires for virtue for its own sake) are not inconsistent with his claim (IV 5–8).

One traditional reconstruction of Mill’s proof might look something like this.

  1. Utilitarianism is true iff happiness is the one and only thing desirable for its own sake (and not for the sake of something else).
  2. The only proof of desirability is desire.
  3. Each person desires his own happiness for its own sake (and not for the sake of something else).
  4. Hence, happiness, as such, is desired for its own sake (and not for the sake of something else) from the point of view of humanity (= the aggregate of persons).
  5. Hence, happiness, as such, is desirable for its own sake (and not for the sake of something else).
  6. Happiness is the only thing desired for its own sake (and not for the sake of something else). Other things—such as virtue, health, music, money, and power—can come to be desired for their own sakes, but then they are desired as parts of happiness.
  7. Hence, happiness is the only thing desirable for its own sake (and not for the sake of something else).
  8. Hence, utilitarianism is true.

The proof has, at least in some quarters, threatened Mill’s reputation as a careful philosopher. Here is a partial list of concerns about Mill’s argument, as traditionally conceived.

  1. (1) is plausible only if “desirable” means worthy of being desired, not if it means capable of being desired. But (2) is most plausible if “desirable” means capable of being desired (see (iii) below). But then there is a real worry that the argument trades on a tacit equivocation between these two different senses of “desirable” and that the argument is, as a result, invalid.
  2. Even so, (1) is false. Even if happiness were the one and only thing desirable for its own sake, this would establish only a claim about the good or “ends.” It is not a claim about duty or right action. Utilitarianism not only claims that the good is human happiness but goes on to define the right in terms of promoting the good. The second claim does not follow from the first.
  3. For the argument to be valid, “desirability” in premise (2) must mean worthy of being desired (as it does in premise (1)). But then (2) is false. Desire is not proof of desirability. People can and do have mistaken desires about what is good. Indeed, if Mill is either a hedonist or a perfectionist he must think that people can and do have desires that fail to track the good.
  4. It is not clear that (3) is true. It seems as if masochists or selfless altruists might fail to desire their own happiness for its own sake.
  5. (4) may be incoherent and certainly does not follow from (3). It is not clear that aggregates of persons have desires. Perhaps under special circumstances groups of people might form a corporate agent or person. But aggregates of persons, as such, are not persons and do not have desires. Even if they did, it is doubtful that one could infer what the aggregate desires from facts about what its members desire. That would involve a compositional fallacy.
  6. (5) is presumably equivalent to the claim that happiness is good. But is it good simpliciter or good for the aggregate? The analogy between individuals and groups would suggest that happiness should be a good for the aggregate. But presumably the intended conclusion requires that happiness be good simpliciter.
  7. It is not clear how to understand (6). One would think that the aim is to make claims that parallel (4) and (5). But then (6) needs to be understood as making another claim about aggregate psychology. And this raises some of the earlier questions about aggregate psychology. However, much of the discussion in IV 5–8 seems to be about individual psychology. Mill seems to be saying that insofar as individuals do have intrinsic desires for things other than their own happiness the objects of intrinsic desire are desired as parts of their own happiness. Perhaps this is Mill’s initial claim from which he then hopes to infer, as he did from (3)–(4), that the general happiness is the only thing desired by the aggregate for its own sake (and not for the sake of something else). This inference would, of course, give rise to the same sort of worries we raised about the inference from (3)–(4). In particular, we might doubt that aggregates of persons have any aims, much less ultimate aims. And even if we conceded that they did, it is not clear that we could infer facts about the desires of aggregates from facts about the desires of its members. That, we said, would seem to involve a compositional fallacy.
  8. Even if we accepted this defense of (5) and (7), this would only establish that happiness as such was the only thing desirable or good for the aggregate. It looks like we could have parallel claims about the agent’s own happiness being the only thing desirable or good for the individual. But this might seem to imply that while the aggregate should pursue or promote the general happiness individuals should pursue or promote their own happiness. That would not be a defense of utilitarianism.

These are all serious worries about Mill’s proof, as traditionally conceived. These objections seem so serious and so obvious that they should make us wonder if there is a more plausible interpretation of his proof.

For one thing, Mill need not confuse desire and desirability. He recognizes that they are distinct, but says that desire is our only proof of desirability (IV 3). In saying this, he need not presuppose that desiring something confers value on (obtaining) it. Our desires often reflect value judgments we make, explicitly or implicitly. If so, our desires will be evidence of what we regard as valuable, and our reflectively acceptable desires may provide our best defeasible test of what things are objectively valuable.

Mill first applies this test to what each of us desires for her own sake. His answer is that what each of us desires for her own sake is happiness (IV 3). We needn’t interpret Mill as endorsing psychological egoism at this point. Rather, he is saying when each of us does focus on her own ends or sake, we find that each cares about her own happiness. Another way to put Mill’s point is that prudential concern focuses on the agent’s happiness.

Mill goes on to say that just as each person’s own happiness is a good to that person, so too happiness, as such, is a good to the aggregate of persons. But we need not suppose that Mill is attributing a psychology, much less an egoist psychology, to humanity as a group. Instead, we can read Mill as claiming that just as the agent’s own happiness is the object of prudential concern, so too happiness as such is the proper object of disinterested or impartial concern.

On this reading, Mill is not trying to derive utilitarianism from egoism (see Hall 1949). Rather, he is assuming that the moral point of view is impartial in a way that prudence is not. Just as prudence aims at the agent’s own happiness, so too, Mill thinks, morality, which is impartial, aims at happiness as such. On this reading, the structure of Mill’s proof looks something like this.

  1. Prudence is partial.
  2. Because prudence is partial, it aims at the agent’s own happiness.
  3. Morality, by contrast, is impartial.
  4. Because morality is impartial, it aims at happiness as such.
  5. If the moral point of view aims at happiness as such, then it is the moral duty of each to promote happiness.
  6. Hence, utilitarianism is true.

If this is the right way to understand Mill’s proof, then his justification of utilitarianism consists in assuming that the moral point of view is impartial and claiming that utilitarianism is the right way to understand impartiality. Morality is impartial, and impartiality requires taking everyone’s interests into account—and not just those of some select few—and weighing them equally—and not with a thumb in the scales for some select few. Indeed, later, in Chapter V, Mill identifies impartiality and its progressive demands with both justice and morality.

It [impartiality] is involved in the very meaning of Utility, or the Greatest-Happiness Principle. That principle is a mere form of words without rational signification, unless one person’s happiness, supposed equal in degree (with the proper allowance made for kind), is counted for exactly as much as another’s. Those conditions being supplied, Bentham’s dictum ‘everybody to count for one, nobody for more than one,’ might be written under the principle of utility as an explanatory commentary. The equal claim of everybody to happiness in the estimation of the moralist and the legislator involves an equal claim to all the means of happiness …. And hence all social inequalities which have ceased to be considered expedient, assume the character not of simple inexpediency, but of injustice. The entire history of social improvement has been a series of transitions, by which one custom or institution after another, from being supposed a primary necessity of social existence, has passed into the rank of universally stigmatized injustice and tyranny. So it has been with the distinctions of slaves and freemen, nobles and serfs, patricians and plebeians; and so it will be, and in part already is, with the aristocracies of colour, race, and sex. (V 36)

Here we see Mill identifying utilitarian impartiality with the demands of justice and morality itself (also see Crisp 1997: 79–80).

One might wonder if utilitarianism is the only or the best way to understand impartiality. Indeed, this is one way of understanding now familiar worries about the implications of utilitarianism for issues of distributive justice and individual rights. But this reading of the proof has the virtue of identifying Mill’s defense of utilitarianism with the feature of it that made it a progressive influence historically.

2.12 The Sanctions of Utility

In Chapter III of Utilitarianism Mill addresses the question of the ultimate sanction of the principle of utility. He understands this alternately as a question about “the motives to obey it” and the “source of its obligation … [or] binding force” (III 1). Mill recognizes a potential worry about the sanctions of utilitarianism that apparently has its source in prudence or self-interest.

He [an agent] says to himself, I feel that I am bound not to rob or murder, betray or deceive; but why am I bound to promote the general happiness? If my own happiness lies in something else, why may I not give that the preference? (III 1)

But this worry about potential conflicts between the agent’s own interests and utilitarian moral demands seems to arise for any conception of morality that recognizes other-regarding moral demands. For this reason, Mill seems to think that it poses no special problem for utilitarianism (III 1, 2, 3, 6).

Is Mill right that there is no special threat to utilitarianism here? One might wonder whether utilitarianism makes greater demands on agents than other moral theories. Contemporary writers have argued that utilitarianism seems to be potentially very demanding, much more so than commonsense morality. For instance, reformist utilitarians, such as Peter Singer (1972), have argued that utilitarianism entails extensive duties of mutual aid that would call for significant changes in the lifestyles of all those who are even moderately well off. And critics of utilitarianism have treated the demandingness of utilitarianism as one of its principal flaws. Rawls (1971) has argued that the sort of interpersonal sacrifice that utilitarianism requires violates the strains of commitment in a well-ordered society. And Bernard Williams (1973) has argued that the demandingness of utilitarianism threatens the sort of personal projects and partial relationships that help give our lives meaning. The common complaint here is that utilitarianism’s demands threaten to offend against a requirement of psychological realism, according to which the demands of an acceptable moral theory must be ones that can be incorporated into a reasonable and satisfying life plan.

This worry about the demands of utilitarianism is not easy to assess. One might wonder how to interpret and whether to accept the psychological realist constraint. If the constraint is relative to people’s actual psychologies, then it represents a potentially conservative constraint on moral theorizing that one might well reject. If the constraint is relative to possible or ideal psychology, then it is not clear that even a highly revisionary moral theory need flout the constraint. Then there is a question about how demanding or revisionary utilitarianism actually is. Mill and Sidgwick thought that our knowledge of others and our causal powers to do good were limited to those near and dear and other associates with whom we have regular contact, with the result that as individuals we do better overall by focusing our energies and actions on associates of one kind or another, rather than the world at large (U II 19; Sidgwick, Methods 361–69). On this view, utilitarianism can accommodate the sort of special obligations and personal concerns to which the critics of utilitarianism appeal. But it is arguable that even if this sort of utilitarian accommodation was tenable in nineteenth century Britain, technological development and globalization have rendered utilitarian demands more revisionary. Our information about others and our causal reach are not limited as they once were. Given the high benefit-to-cost ratio of many modern relief agencies, it is hard to resist something like Singer’s conclusions about the reformist demands of utilitarianism. So even if Mill was right to think that the motivational demands of utilitarianism were not so different from those of other moral theories at the time he wrote, that claim might need to be reassessed today.

3. Mill’s Liberalism

Mill’s On Liberty is the most influential statement of his liberal principles. He begins by distinguishing old and new threats to liberty. The old threat to liberty is found in traditional societies in which there is rule by one (a monarchy) or a few (an aristocracy).[1] Though one could be worried about restrictions on liberty by benevolent monarchs or aristocrats, the traditional worry is that when rulers are politically unaccountable to the governed they will rule in their own interests, rather than the interests of the governed. In particular, they will restrict the liberties of their subjects in ways that benefit themselves, rather than the ruled. It was these traditional threats to liberty that the democratic reforms of the Philosophical Radicals were meant to address. But Mill thinks that these traditional threats to liberty are not the only ones to worry about. He makes clear that democracies contain their own threats to liberty—this is the tyranny, not of the one or the few, but of the majority (OL I 1–5). Mill sets out to articulate the principles that should regulate how governments and societies, whether democratic or not, can restrict individual liberties (I 6).

3.1 Liberal Principles and the Categorical Approach

In an early and famous passage Mill conceives of liberalism in terms of “one very simple principle.”

The object of this essay is to assert one very simple principle, as entitled to govern absolutely the dealings of society with the individual in the way of compulsion and control, whether the means used be physical force in the form of legal penalties or the moral coercion of public opinion. That principle is that the sole end for which mankind are warranted, individually or collectively, in interfering with the liberty of action of any of their number is self-protection. That the only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over any member of a civilized community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others. His own good, either physical or moral, is not a sufficient warrant. He cannot rightfully be compelled to do or forbear because it will be better for him to do so, because it will make him happier, because, in the opinions of others, to do so would be wise or even right. These are good reasons for remonstrating with him, or reasoning with him, or persuading him, or entreating him, but not for compelling him or visiting him with any evil in case he do otherwise. To justify that, the conduct from which it is desired to deter him must be calculated to produce evil to someone else. The only part of the conduct of anyone for which he is amenable to society is that which concerns others. In the part which merely concerns himself, his independence, is, of right, absolute. Over himself, over his own body and mind, the individual is sovereign. (I 9)

In this passage, Mill distinguishes paternalistic and moralistic restrictions of liberty from restrictions of liberty based upon the harm principle and claims that the harm prevention is the sole legitimate basis for restricting individual liberties.

  • A’s restriction of B’s liberty is paternalistic if it is done for B’s own benefit.
  • A’s restriction of B’s liberty is moralistic if it is done to ensure that B acts morally or not immorally.
  • A’s restriction of B’s liberty is an application of the harm principle if it is done to prevent harm to someone other than B.

Later, Mill distinguishes between genuine harm and mere offense. In order to satisfy the harm principle, an action must violate or risk violation of those important interests of others in which they have a right (I 12; III 1; IV 3, 10; IV 12; V 5).

These distinctions allow Mill to defend a categorical approach to liberal rights. To decide whether an individual’s liberty ought to be protected, we must ascertain to which category the potential restriction of liberty belongs: offense, moralism, paternalism, and harm prevention. Mill seems to permit or forbid restrictions on liberty by category, claiming that the only restrictions that are permissible involve harm prevention. Of course, a given regulation might fall under more than one category. Many provisions of the criminal law, such as prohibitions on murder and assault, might be designed both to enforce fundamental moral provisions and to prevent harm to others. Mill does not object to moralistic or paternalistic legislation that can also be defended by appeal to the harm principle. Rather, the objection is to restrictions that can only be justified in these ways and cannot be justified by appeal to harm prevention.

Harm prevention is a necessary but not sufficient ground for restricting individual liberties. Harm prevention is sufficient to establish a pro tanto case for regulation (I 11), but whether regulation is all things considered appropriate depends on a utilitarian calculation of whether the benefits of regulation exceed its costs.

As soon as any part of a person’s conduct affects prejudicially the interests of others, society has jurisdiction over it, and the question whether the general welfare will or will not be promoted by interfering with it, becomes open to discussion. (IV 3)

This means that the harm principle is not in fact Mill’s only principle, because we cannot decide whether regulations that would prevent harm should be adopted without appealing to the principle of utility. But even if harm prevention is not sufficient to justify restricting liberty, Mill does appear to claim that it is necessary.

Sometimes Mill suggests that the harm principle is equivalent to letting society restrict other-regarding conduct (I 11; IV 2). On this view, conduct can be divided into self-regarding and other-regarding conduct. Regulation of the former is paternalistic, and regulation of the latter is an application of the harm principle. So on this view it is never permissible to regulate purely self-regarding conduct and always permissible to regulate other-regarding conflict. But, as Mill himself concedes, very little conduct is purely self-regarding (IV 8). Some other-regarding conduct causes mere offense, not genuine harm (IV 3; IV 12). So Mill cannot equate harmful behavior and other-regarding behavior and cannot think that all other-regarding behavior may be regulated.

It is generally thought that by applying this categorical approach to liberty and its permissible restrictions Mill is led to offer a fairly extensive defense of individual liberties against interference by the state and society. In particular, it is sometimes thought that Mill recognizes a large sphere of conduct which it is impermissible for the state to regulate. We might characterize this sphere of protected liberties as Mill’s conception of liberal rights. On this reading, Mill is deriving his conception of liberal rights from a prior commitment to the categorical approach and, in particular, to the harm principle (see Jacobson 2000 for an alternative reading).

3.2 Categories, Rights, and Utility

There is an apparent tension between Mill’s commitment to a categorical approach to basic liberties and his defense of utilitarianism. Utilitarianism treats the good as prior to and independent of the right or duty—defining duty as the promotion of good consequences. Perhaps certain kinds of actions tend to be good or bad, but, according to direct utilitarianism, the moral quality of a particular action depends on its own consequences. By contrast, the deontological and natural rights traditions treat duty or the right as prior to and independent of the good. In particular, deontologists believe that it is not always one’s duty to promote good consequences. Sometimes one has a duty to do an act that is suboptimal, and sometimes it is wrong to do the optimal act. Deontologists recognize moral constraints on pursuing the good. These constraints usually take the form of categorical rules to perform or refrain from certain sorts of actions (e.g., to keep promises or to refrain from lying), regardless of the consequences. A special case of this perceived conflict between categorical rules and utility is the perceived tension between utility and rights. For, on a common view, individual rights just are a special case of categorical rules. Individual rights, such as rights to liberties or to freedom from harm, are interpreted as “trumps” or “side constraints” on the pursuit of good consequences (Dworkin 1977: xi, 184–205; Nozick 1974: 28–35).

The apparent conflict between utility and rights poses an interesting test for Mill, because he wants to defend liberal rights that have utilitarian foundations.

It is proper to state that I forego any advantage which could be derived to my argument from the idea of abstract right as a thing independent of utility. I regard utility as the ultimate appeal on all ethical questions; but it must be utility in the largest sense, grounded on the permanent interests of man as a progressive being. (OL I 11)

We need to ask if Mill is able to reconcile his defense of utility and liberty without compromising either his utilitarianism or his defense of a right to liberties.

3.3 Freedom of Expression

Mill begins his defense of basic liberties with a discussion of freedom of expression. He thinks that there is general agreement on the importance of free speech and that, once the grounds for free speech are understood, this agreement can be exploited to support a more general defense of individual liberties (I 16; III 1). So his defense of expressive liberties is important not only in its own right but also insofar as it lays the foundation of his liberal principles.

Mill’s discussion of censorship in Chapter II focuses on censorship whose aim is to suppress false or immoral opinion (II 1–2). He mentions four reasons for maintaining free speech and opposing censorship.

  1. A censored opinion might be true (II 1–20, 41).
  2. Even if literally false, a censored opinion might contain part of the truth (II 34–39, 42).
  3. Even if wholly false, a censored opinion would prevent true opinions from becoming dogma (II 1–2, 6, 7, 22–23, 43).
  4. As a dogma, an unchallenged opinion will lose its meaning (II 26, 43).

It is natural to group these four considerations into two main kinds: the first two invoke a truth-tracking defense of expressive liberties, while the second two appeal to a distinctive kind of value that free discussion is supposed to have.

3.3.1 The Truth-Tracking Rationale

The first two claims represent freedom of expression as instrumentally valuable; it is valuable, not in itself, but as the most reliable means of producing something else that Mill assumes is valuable (either extrinsically or intrinsically), namely, true belief. It is not hard to see how true beliefs would possess at least instrumental value, if only because our actions, plans, and reasoning are likely to be more successful when based on true beliefs. Of course, the most reliable means of promoting true belief would be to believe everything. But that would bring a great deal of false belief along too. A more plausible goal to promote would be something like the ratio of true belief to false belief. Freedom of expression might then be defended as a more reliable policy for promoting the ratio of true belief to false belief than a policy of censorship. This rationale for freedom of expression is echoed by Justice Oliver Wendell Holmes in his famous dissent in Abrams v. United States (1919) when he claims that the best test of truth is free trade in the marketplace of ideas.

Notice that this instrumental defense of freedom of expression does not require the mistaken assumption that the censor must assume his own infallibility (OL II 3). The censor can recognize that he might be mistaken, but insist that he must act on the best available evidence about what is true. Mill can reply that proper recognition of one's own fallibility should typically lead one to keep discussion open and not foreclose discussion of possibilities that seem improbable.

This instrumental rationale may justify freedom of expression in preference to a policy of censorship whenever the censor finds the beliefs in question implausible or offensive. But it does not justify freedom of expression in preference to more conservative forms of censorship. If the question is what policies are likely to increase the ratio of true to false belief, we would seem to be justified in censoring opinions for whose falsity there is especially clear, compelling, and consistent or stable evidence. We would be on good ground in censoring flat-earthers (both literal and figurative).

Another way to see the weakness of the truth-tracking justification of freedom of expression is to notice that this instrumental defense of freedom of expression cannot explain what is wrong with censorship that is successful in truth-tracking terms. Suppose we lived in a society of the sort Plato imagines in the Republic in which cognitive capacities are distributed unequally between rulers and citizens and in which maximally knowledgeable and reliable censors—call them “philosopher kings”—censor all and only false beliefs. The truth-tracking argument would provide no argument against censorship in such circumstances. This shows that the truth-tracking argument condemns only unsuccessful or incompetent censorship. For some, this may be the biggest worry about censorship. But many would have residual worries about successful or competent censorship. They would object to censorship, even by philosopher-kings. Answering this worry requires a more robust defense of expressive liberties.

3.3.2 The Deliberative Rationale

The resources for a more robust defense of freedom of expression can be found in Mill’s claim that it is needed to keep true beliefs from becoming dogmatic, because this reason for valuing freedom is intended to rebut the case for censorship even on the assumption that all and only false beliefs would be censored (II 2, 21).

Mill’s claim that the value of freedom of expression lies in keeping true beliefs from becoming dogmatic reflects his view that freedoms of thought and discussion are necessary for fulfilling our natures as progressive beings (OL II 20). For instance, Mill appeals to a familiar distinction between true belief, on the one hand, and knowledge, understood as something like justified true belief, on the other hand (II 22; cf. Scanlon 1972; Ten 1980: 126–28). Progressive beings seek knowledge or justified true belief, and not simply true belief. Whereas the mere possession of true beliefs need not exercise one’s deliberative capacities, because they might be the product of indoctrination, their justification would. One exercises deliberative capacities in the justification of one’s beliefs and actions that is required for theoretical and practical knowledge. This is because justification involves comparison of, and deliberation among, alternatives (II 6, 7, 8, 22–23, 43). Freedoms of thought and discussion are essential to the justification of one’s beliefs and actions, because individuals are not cognitively self-sufficient (II 38, 39; III 1). Sharing thought and discussion with others, especially about important matters, improves one’s deliberations. It enlarges the menu of options, by identifying new options worth consideration, and helps one better assess the merits of these options, by forcing on one’s attention new considerations and arguments about the comparative merits of the options. In these ways, open and vigorous discussion with diverse interlocutors improves the quality of one’s deliberations. If so, censorship, even of false belief, can rob both those whose speech is suppressed and their audience of resources that they need to justify their beliefs and actions (II 1).

This deliberative rationale can explain why it is often wrong to censor even false beliefs. In this way, Mill’s defense of expressive liberties that relies on his perfectionist appeal to deliberative values is a more robust defense than the one provided by his truth-tracking arguments alone.

3.4 A Perfectionist Defense of Basic Liberties

Though important in its own right, Mill’s defense of freedom of thought and discussion provides the resources for a more general defense of basic liberties of thought and action that Mill offers in the balance of On Liberty. A good human life is one that exercises one’s higher capacities (I 11, 20; III 1–10); a person’s higher capacities include her deliberative capacities, in particular, capacities to form, revise, assess, select, and implement her own plan of life. This kind of self-government requires both positive and negative conditions. Among the positive conditions it requires is an education that develops deliberative competence by providing understanding of different historical periods and social possibilities, developing cultural and aesthetic sensibilities, developing skills essential for critical reasoning and assessment, and cultivating habits of intellectual curiosity, modesty, and open-mindedness (V 12–15). Among the negative conditions that self-government requires are various liberties of thought and action. If the choice and pursuit of projects and plans is to be deliberate, it must be informed as to the alternatives and their grounds, and this requires intellectual freedoms of speech, association, and press that expand the menu of deliberative options and allow for the vivid representation of the comparative merits of options on that menu. If there is to be choice and implementation of choices, there must be liberties of action such as freedom of association, freedom of worship, and freedom to choose one’s occupation.

Indeed, liberties of thought and action are importantly related. This is apparent in the pre-eminent value Mill assigns to diversity and experimentation in life-style. Indeed, in his Autobiography Mill describes this as the central truth of On Liberty:

The importance, to man and society, of a large variety in types of character, and of giving full freedom to human nature to expand itself in innumerable and conflicting directions. (Autobiography 259)

Diversity and experimentation in life-style are important not only insofar as they are expressions of self-government but also insofar as they enhance self-government. For experimentation and diversity of life-style expand the deliberative menu and bring out more clearly the nature and merits of options on the menu (OL II 23, 38; III 1).

3.5 Limits on Liberty

Despite this robust rationale for liberties of thought and action, it is also important to see that Mill is not treating liberty as an intrinsic good or endorsing an unqualified right to liberty.

First, we should note that Mill does not defend liberty per se, but only certain basic liberties. His defense focuses on three basic categories of liberty (I 12).

  1. Liberties of conscience and expression
  2. Liberties of tastes, pursuits, and life-plans
  3. Liberties of association

Though these liberties evidently include quite a bit, there is no suggestion here that any and all liberty deserves protection. Why not? Insofar as Mill defends individual liberties by appeal to deliberative values, he can distinguish the importance of different liberties in terms of their role in practical deliberation. A central part of practical deliberation is forming ideals and regulating one’s actions and plans in accordance with these ideals. But some liberties seem more central than others to the selection of personal ideals. For instance, it seems plausible that liberties of speech, association, worship, and choice of profession are more important than liberties to drive in either direction on streets designated as one-way, liberties not to wear seat belts, or liberties to dispose of one’s gross income as one pleases, because restrictions on the former seem to interfere more than restrictions on the latter with deliberations and choices about what sort of person to be.

Second, even the exercise of basic liberties is limited by the harm principle, which justifies restricting liberty to prevent harm to others. Even expressive liberties can be restricted when their exercise poses a “clear and present danger” to others.

[E]ven opinions lose their immunity when the circumstances in which they are expressed are such as to constitute their expression a positive instigation to some mischievous act. An opinion that corn dealers are starvers of the poor, or that private property is robbery, ought to be unmolested when simply circulated through the press, but may justifiably incur punishment when delivered orally to an excited mob assembled before the house of a corn dealer, or when handed about among the same mob in the form of a placard. (III 1)

There are interesting questions about the correct interpretation of the harm principle, which we will examine later. But Mill’s commitment to some version of the harm principle as a ground for restricting liberty is hard to dispute.

Third, it is important to be clear about how Mill values basic liberties. To account for the robust character of his perfectionist argument, it is tempting to suppose that Mill thinks these basic liberties are themselves important intrinsic goods (see Berger 1984: 41, 50, 199, 231–32; Bogen and Farrell 1978: 325–28). But in Mill’s introductory remarks he insists that his liberal principles do not apply to individuals who do not have a suitably developed normative competence (I 10). So, for instance, the prohibition on paternalism does not extend to children with immature deliberative faculties or to adults with very limited normative competence, whether due to congenital defects or social circumstance. Such restrictions on the scope of Mill’s principles make little sense if basic liberties are dominant intrinsic goods, for then it should always be valuable to accord people liberties—a claim that Mill denies. Instead, Mill claims that these liberties have value only when various necessary conditions for the exercise of deliberative capacities—in particular, sufficient rational development or normative competence—are in place.

3.6 The Harm Principle

With a better understanding of the rationale and limits of Mill’s liberal principles, we can take a closer look at the details of his categorical approach, including its centerpiece—the harm principle.

First, recall that Mill distinguishes between harm and mere offense. Not every unwelcome consequence for others counts as a harm. Offenses tend to be comparatively minor and ephemeral. To constitute a harm, an action must be injurious or set back important interests of particular people, interests in which they have rights (I 12; III 1; IV 3, 10, 12; V 5). Whereas Mill appears to reject the regulation of mere offense, the harm principle appears to be the one justification he recognizes for restricting liberty.

Second, Mill envisions that the harm principle is something that we can apply prospectively to prevent someone from acting in certain ways and causing harm. In many cases all we could reasonably know is that a given action risks harm. Fortunately, this seems to be all that Mill requires (IV 10). There are interesting and important questions about what threshold of risk must be met for purposes of the harm principle, which Mill does not address. Presumably, the threshold should vary inversely with the magnitude of the harm risked, so that the probability of harm required to justify regulation is lower the greater the harm risked.

Third, Mill wants the harm principle to have wide scope. He insists that the harm principle regulates more than relations between government and individuals. Its application should include the family, in particular, relationships between husbands and wives and parents and children (V 12). Here, he prefigures some claims he will develop in The Subjection of Women (discussed below).

Fourth, though Mill often focuses simply on harm, it appears that his real focus is on non-consensual harm (I 2; see Saunders 2016). He endorses the maxim volenti non fit injuria, which he glosses in Utilitarianism as the doctrine that “that is not unjust which is done with the consent of the person who is supposed to be hurt by it” (U V 28). It is not that one cannot be hurt by something one has consented to or freely risked. Rather, when one has knowingly and willing risked something harmful, one cannot legitimately complain when that harm comes home to roost. Having my nose broken surely counts as a harm, but if you broke my nose in a boxing match, I cannot fairly complain about the harm, because I consented to the risk.

Does Mill really treat the harm principle as the sole legitimate basis for restricting the liberties of individuals? As we have seen, Mill cannot think that harm prevention is sufficient to justify restricting liberty.

As soon as any part of a person’s conduct affects prejudicially the interests of others, society has jurisdiction over it, and the question whether the general welfare will or will not be promoted by interfering with it, becomes open to discussion. (OL IV 3)

Later, Mill makes clear that harm prevention is necessary but not sufficient to justify restrictions on liberty.

[I]t must by no means be supposed, because damage, or probability of damage, to the interests of others, can alone justify the interference of society, that therefore it always does justify such interference. (V 3)

These claims demonstrate that Mill is not committed to a simple version of the sufficiency of harm for restrictions on liberty. However, these claims are compatible with Mill endorsing a weaker version of sufficiency.

If anyone does an act hurtful to others, there is a prima facie case for punishing him by law or, where legal penalties are not safely applicable, by general disapprobation. (I 11)

This suggests that Mill’s position is that causing harm is always pro tanto reason—a non-negligible reason—to regulate the action, but nonetheless a reason that might be outweighed by countervailing reasons not to regulate. If the regulation is more harmful than the behavior in question, it may be best not to regulate, despite the pro tanto case for regulation. This suggests that we should distinguish stronger and weaker versions of the idea that harm is sufficient to justify regulation.

  • Weak Sufficiency: Harm to others is a pro tanto justification of regulation.
  • Strong Sufficiency: Harm to others is a conclusive justification of regulation.

Once we distinguish these options, there is a pretty compelling case for thinking that Mill rejects strong sufficiency but embraces weak sufficiency.

But notice that if Mill rejects strong sufficiency then this compromises his one very simple principle. For only strong sufficiency shows that the harm principle is a complete guide to the regulation of liberty, telling us both when regulation is impermissible and when it is required. Even weak sufficiency implies that the harm principle must be supplemented with some other principle, such as the utilitarian principle, in order to determine if regulation is permissible, much less required. Mill’s doubts about strong sufficiency imply that his own conception of liberal rights requires more than the harm principle.

In rejecting strong sufficiency, Mill claims that actions that cause losses in a fair competition should not be regulated (V 3–4). This case would fall within his “free-trade” exception, which limits the scope of the liberty principle (V 4). Unfortunately, Mill is not entirely clear about the basis for the free-trade exception. After all, losses, even in a fair competition, can be harmful. If I have a successful business selling widgets and then you move into the area selling widgets at a big discount and drive me out of business, forcing me into bankruptcy, I suffer a significant loss, making me worse off than I would otherwise have been.

If Mill accepts weak, rather than strong, sufficiency, then he might claim that though there is a reason to regulate harmful economic competition the costs of interfering with free markets are too great. However, this seems not be Mill’s preferred response. His official position seems to be that the harm principle should not be applied to such economic harms (IV 4). It is hard to see why Mill embraces this sort of free-trade exception. A different and better reply would not suspend the operation of the harm principle in such cases but rather claim that such losses should not be understood as harms, in the relevant sense. Mill might make either of two related arguments for not treating such losses as harms. First, he might invoke the volenti principle and insist that the harm principle targets only non-consensual harms. He could then argue that in a market economy that ensures fair terms of cooperation economic losses of the sort described are freely risked and so consensual, in the relevant sense. Second, Mill can and does claim that competitive losses are not harms, because they do not deprive economic actors of something to which they have a right (OL V 3). Recall that Mill says that a harm involves damage to an interest to which a person has a right (I 12; III 1; IV 3, 10, 12; V 5). You may beat me out in a fair competition for a job. But I don’t seem to have a right to the job. Instead, what I have is a right of fair opportunity to compete for the job.

Is harm necessary to justify regulation? Though some of Mill’s pronouncements suggest that causing harm is a necessary condition of restricting liberty, closer inspection suggests that Mill countenances various restrictions on individual liberty that appear designed to benefit others, rather than prevent harm. Let’s focus on two main kinds of apparent exceptions to the necessity thesis: (1) enforceable duties to others that benefit them, such as the duty to give evidence in court and Good Samaritan duties (I 11) and (2) enforceable duties to contribute one’s fair share to the provision of various kinds of public goods (IV 3), including the common defense (OL I 11; PPE V.viii.1), community infrastructure (PPE V.viii.1; CRG 538, 541), mandatory education (OL V 12–14; PPE II.xiii.3, V.xi.8; CRG 467–70), and state support for the arts (PPE V.xi.15). These two sorts of exception present somewhat different issues.

In discussing enforceable duties to give evidence or Samaritan aid, Mill claims that the failure to confer benefits constitutes harm. But it is not in general true that the failure to provide benefits always counts as a harm. In many cases it seems not to. You would benefit me by transferring all your savings to my bank account (let us assume); it doesn’t follow that your failure to do so harms me. Why not? Presumably, because we assess harms counterfactually: if x harms me, it makes me significantly worse off than I would have been otherwise. This makes clear that harms are assessed relative to some baseline. It is an interesting question how to set the baseline. But the baseline cannot be set by the restriction on liberty itself; that would convert all failures to benefit into harms. The baseline must have some independent rationale. Consider Mill’s example of Good Samaritan laws. A classic example of the sort of Samaritan duty that Mill favors would be the requirement to save a drowning child when I could do so at little cost or risk to myself. It is not clear that my failure to rescue harms the child. Have I made the child worse-off than he would otherwise have been? Well, relative to what baseline? Of course, I have made him worse-off relative to the baseline situation in which Good Samaritanism is compulsory. But why select that baseline? I haven’t made him worse-off relative to the situation he would have been in had I not been there. By hypothesis, he would have drowned in my absence. If so, it is not clear that I harm the person whom I fail to rescue. This is not to deny that my failure to rescue is wrong and perhaps that the law ought to compel aid in such cases. But it does raise questions about whether we can justify Good Samaritan laws by appeal to the harm principle.

Notice that even if my failure to rescue the child does not harm him, he is nonetheless harmed by drowning. After all, he would have been better off had he not fallen into the pond and drowned. This suggests a possible way for Mill to square Good Samaritan laws with the harm principle. Even if restrictions on A’s freedom, requiring him to benefit B, cannot be justified on grounds of preventing A from harming B, they may nonetheless be justified on the grounds of preventing harm to B. This draws our attention to a significant ambiguity in the harm principle (see Lyons 1979). Mill talks both about preventing one from harming others and about harm prevention. Indeed, his statement of the one very simple principle mentions both (OL I 9). But as the Samaritan example brings out, these two claims are not equivalent. Every time I prevent one person from harming another, I also engage in harm prevention. But some cases of preventing harm may not be cases of preventing one person from harming another. So we really should distinguish two different versions of the harm principle.

  • HP1 is an anti-harming principle: A can restrict B’s liberty only in order to prevent B from harming others.
  • HP2 is a harm-prevention principle: A can restrict B’s liberty only in order to prevent harm to others.

Because every case of preventing one person from harming another is a case of harm prevention, but not vice versa, HP1 is narrower than HP2. Indeed, HP1 is a proper part of HP2. Whereas HP1 justifies intervention only when the target herself would be the cause of harm to others, HP2 would justify intervention to prevent harm to others, whether that harm would be caused by the target or in some other way. Clearly, HP2 will justify more intervention than HP1. As we have seen, it is hard to justify Good Samaritan laws if HP is the sole basis for restricting liberty as long as we understand HP as HP1. The fact that Mill thinks Samaritan laws can be squared with the harm principle (I 11) is evidence that he understands the harm principle in terms of harm prevention.

A different worry about the necessity of harm concerns those cases involving restrictions on liberty in the compulsory provision of public goods. For it is part of the structure of public goods that the effect of individual contributions on provision of the public good is negligible. The negative impact of an individual’s failure to contribute is both small and is spread widely over the population. But that means that even if failure to provide public goods would otherwise count as a serious loss for all and a harm, the cost of individual failures to provide for such goods does not seem to meet Mill’s criteria for harmful conduct—the impact of individual failures to contribute to public goods is too small and spread too widely to constitute the breach of “a distinct and assignable obligation to any other person or persons” (IV 10). Insofar as this is a worry for the harm principle, it seems to be equally a worry for HP1 and for HP2.

One Millian response is to deny that the harm principle is intended to serve as a necessary condition on any and all restrictions on liberty. As we saw, Mill is interested in defending fundamental or basic liberties, rather than liberty per se. In particular, he is interested in liberties of conscience and expressive liberties, liberties of tastes and pursuits, and liberties of association (I 12). He can defend these liberties as playing a more central role in our practical deliberations and our formation and pursuit of personal ideals than other liberties. But then Mill might try to justify the modest restrictions on liberty necessary to provide the benefits of significant public goods by claiming that, even if these restrictions on liberty don’t prevent harms, they do not restrict fundamental liberties and they do help secure other goods, such as education, security, and sanitation, that serve as necessary conditions of our happiness.

This issue requires us to distinguish two more readings of the harm principle: one in terms of liberty per se and one in terms of basic liberties. This distinction cuts across the distinction between anti-harming and harm prevention, giving us four possible interpretations of the necessity claim.

  • HP1A: A can restrict B’s liberty only in order to prevent B from harming others.
  • HP1B: A can restrict B’s basic liberties only in order to prevent B from harming others.
  • HP2A: A can restrict B’s liberty only in order to prevent harm to others.
  • HP2B: A can restrict B’s basic liberties only in order to prevent harm to others.

Earlier, we suggested that the harm principle would be more robust and better fit with Mill’s views about justified restrictions of liberty if we understood it is a harm prevention principle, essentially, as HP2A, rather than HP1A. Now we have seen how the harm principle would be more robust and better fit Mill’s views about justified restrictions of liberty if we understood it to regulate restrictions on basic liberties, rather than liberty per se. This requires us to interpret the harm principle as HP2B. We might call this the basic liberties harm prevention principle. But if we interpret the harm principle this way, then Mill is even further from a libertarian view, at least if libertarianism is understood as the idea that the only legitimate limit on individual liberty is to prevent that individual from acting in ways that harm others.

The necessity claim that the harm principle makes is more robust if we interpret it as the basic liberties harm prevention principle. But, even so interpreted, the necessity claim is still false. For all versions of the harm principle insist that paternalism is an impermissible rationale for restriction. But Mill does not in fact accept a blanket prohibition on paternalism. He allows paternalistic restrictions on selling oneself into slavery (V 11). In a moment, we will discuss the justification and scope of this exception to the normal prohibition on paternalism. But the exception itself shows that Mill does not think that the only acceptable restrictions on liberty are those that prevent harm to others. For this is a case in which it is permissible to restrict liberty, not to prevent harm to others, but to prevent a special kind of harm to self.

If harm prevention is neither necessary nor sufficient for justifying restrictions on liberty, then Mill’s “one very simple principle” is over-simple.

3.7 Paternalism

Insofar as Mill insists that preventing harm to others is the only legitimate basis for restricting individual liberty, he is committed to a blanket prohibition on paternalism. Why? Mill offers two explicit reasons.

First, state power is liable to abuse. Politicians are self-interested and corruptible and will use a paternalistic license to limit the freedom of citizens in ways that promote their own interests and not those of the citizens whose liberty they restrict (V 20–3).

Second, even well intentioned rulers will misidentify the good of citizens. Because an agent is a more reliable judge of his own good, even well intentioned rulers will promote the good of the citizens less well than would the citizens themselves (IV 4, 12).

These are reasonably strong consequentialist arguments against giving the state a broad discretionary power to engage in paternalistic legislation whenever it sees fit. However, they do not support a categorical ban on paternalism. In particular, these arguments provide no principled objection to paternalism—no objection to successful paternalistic restrictions on B’s liberty that do in fact benefit B. This weakness in Mill’s explicit argument against paternalism is like the weakness in his truth-tracking defense of freedom of expression. Just as that argument provided no objection to successful censorship (censorship of all and only false belief), so too this argument provides no objection to successful paternalism (A’s restrictions on B’s liberty that do benefit B). Perhaps some who object to paternalism are only concerned with unsuccessful paternalism. But many would have doubts about successful paternalism. For it is common to think that individuals have a right to make choices in their own personal affairs and that this includes a right to make choices that are imprudent.

However, Mill’s perfectionist conception of happiness provides a more robust rationale against paternalism. For if a person’s happiness depends on her exercise of the capacities that make her a responsible agent, then a principal ingredient of her own good must include opportunities for responsible choice and self-determination. But then it becomes clear how autonomy is an important part of a person’s good and how paternalism undercuts her good in important and predictable ways. Mill may still not have an argument against successful paternalism, but his perfectionism gives him an argument that successful paternalism is much harder to achieve than one might have thought, because it is very hard to benefit an autonomous agent in ways that bypass her agency.

Despite Mill’s blanket prohibitions on paternalism, he does not (consistently) reject paternalism per se. For instance, he is forced to qualify his blanket prohibition on paternalism in order to maintain his claim that no one should be free to sell himself into slavery.

The ground for thus limiting his power of voluntarily disposing of his own lot is apparent, and is very clearly seen in this extreme case. … [B]y selling himself for a slave, he abdicates his liberty; he foregoes any future use of it beyond that single act. He, therefore, defeats in his own case, the very purpose which is the justification of allowing him to dispose of himself. (V 11)

Because it is the importance of exercising one’s deliberative capacities that explains the importance of certain liberties, the usual reason for recognizing liberties provides an argument against extending liberties to do things that will permanently undermine one’s future exercise of those same capacities. In this case, an exception to the usual prohibition on paternalism is motivated by appeal to the very same deliberative values that explain the usual prohibition. So this seems to be a principled exception to the usual prohibition on paternalism. We might call these autonomy-enhancing forms of paternalism.

Mill claims that the reasons for allowing paternalism in “this extreme case” are “evidently of far wider application” (V 11). That raises the question of what other forms of paternalism might be justified as principled exceptions to the usual prohibition on paternalism. Unfortunately, Mill does not directly address this question. However, in a nearby passage Mill does refer to the “almost despotic power of husbands over wives” (V 12). We might see Mill likening a wife’s consent to marriage, in which she must surrender various rights of control over herself and her children, to someone contracting herself into slavery. This, of course, is a theme that he develops in The Subjection of Women (discussed below).

3.8 Offense

As we have seen, Mill distinguishes between merely offensive and genuinely harmful behavior. Whereas genuinely harmful behavior can be regulated, merely offensive behavior cannot (I 12; III 1; IV 3, 10, 12; V 5). However, in his discussion of drunkenness, Mill does at one point allow that offenses against others may be prohibited, at least when they involve acts of public indecency.

Again, there are many acts which, being directly injurious only to the agents themselves, ought not to be legally interdicted, but which, if done publicly, are a violation of good manners and, coming thus within the category of offenses against others, may be rightly prohibited. Of this kind are offenses against decency; on which it is unnecessary to dwell, the rather as they are only connected indirectly with our subject, the objection to publicity being equally strong in the case of many actions not in themselves condemnable, nor supposed to be so. (V 7)

The immediate context is otherwise paternalistic restrictions with drink. But when drinking that is otherwise purely self-regarding is done in public, it becomes offensive and, Mill here claims, regulable. It seems impossible to square this with Mill’s blanket prohibition on offense regulation. Why this exception for public offenses? Mill’s answer is that when done in public, the conduct comes “thus within the category of offense against others.” But if publicity is relevant because it makes the conduct offensive, then Mill’s real appeal is to offense. But then this exception threatens to swallow the rule.

Mill may not have a consistent view about offense. It is instructive in this context to consider briefly the views of Joel Feinberg, who sees himself articulating a Millian position in his important four-volume work Moral Limits of the Criminal Law (1984–88). Feinberg understands his own defense of Millian principles as involving a modified Millian categorical approach. His main modification of Millian principles is to permit some forms of offense regulation. In Offense to Others (1985), Feinberg begins by focusing on nuisance. Many offensive things are nuisances; they cause passing disagreeable mental states or sensations. But even if many nuisances are just the price one has to pay to live in a free society, it is common for the law to regulate nuisance. Feinberg thinks that some nuisances—especially public nuisances—can justify regulation. To determine when offense (nuisance) regulation is permissible and when it is not, Feinberg employs a balancing test in which we must weigh the seriousness of the offense (e.g., its magnitude and avoidability) against the importance of the agent’s interests being regulated (e.g., their importance and the existence of alternative avenues of expression).

The details of Feinberg’s balancing test are complex and potentially controversial. But most liberal societies do in fact allow for some nuisance regulation. If one is going to consider modifying Mill’s categorical approach so as to allow the prevention of profound nuisance, then one must employ some such balancing test and allow restriction only when the offense is hard to avoid, the expressive interests of the offenders are modest, and offenders have alternative avenues of expression. Since Mill’s own position on offense regulation is not fully consistent, it is hard to say how big a modification this would make in his liberal principles.

3.9 Moralism

Mill, we saw, appears to reject legal moralism categorically (I 9). Other Millian liberals, such as Feinberg, treat the rejection of legal moralism as a constitutive commitment of liberalism. Of course, a great deal of morality is concerned with harm prevention, and central provisions of the criminal law prohibiting killing, rape, assault, and theft are clearly concerned to prevent especially serious moral wrongs that harm others. This means that much of the criminal law both prevents harm and enforces morality. These are not simply coincidental outcomes, inasmuch as the immorality of much criminal conduct consists in its harmfulness. This could make us wonder if there are cases of legal moralism that can’t be justified by appeal to the harm principle.

Even if there is considerable overlap between harmful conduct and wrongdoing, the two are distinguishable. The traditional debate over legal moralism between Devlin (1965) and Hart (1963) concerned the legislative enforcement of sexual morality, in particular, the regulation of homosexuality, prostitution, and pornography. For the most part, both sides conceded that these activities were immoral but harmless and debated whether it could be permissible to regulate them as a matter of enforcing sexual morality. But we might reject Devlin’s moralistic proposals, not because we reject legal moralism per se, but rather because we do not regard homosexuality, prostitution, or pornography as per se immoral. If these were the only candidates for harmless wrongdoing, we might wonder if there was such a thing. For this reason, we might consider a less controversial case of harmless immorality, say, a case of promise-breaking or deception that actually fails to result in harm. Suppose Junior takes his parents’ car out without their permission but nothing untoward happens. Here is a case of harmless wrongdoing. Consider this argument for moral legislation.

  1. Society has reason to prohibit behavior that is immoral, whether or not it causes harm.
  2. Junior’s taking the car without parental permission is a case of harmless wrongdoing.
  3. Hence, society has a right to prohibit Junior’s behavior.

Presumably, liberals would reject (3), claiming that this is a case in which the law should not intervene. Here, it might seem that we need to reject the moralistic premise in (1) in order to avoid the illiberal conclusion in (3). Indeed, many people tend to think that to avoid illiberal conclusions about moral legislation one must reject legal moralism as such.

But the argument is not valid, from which it follows that we cannot appeal to the falsity of the illiberal conclusion to reject the moralistic premise. The legal moralist principle (1) asserts only a pro tanto or prima facie reason to regulate. But a pro tanto reason to regulate does not entail an all-thing-considered reason to regulate. In particular, even if there is some reason to regulate conduct, there may be countervailing reasons not to regulate it. Perhaps the costs of regulation—administrative and otherwise—exceed the benefit of regulation. But this shows that the legal moralist need not regulate all harmless wrongdoing, and this shows that it is not necessary to reject legal moralism as such in order to defend some liberal conclusions. This does not entail that Mill’s rejection of legal moralism is wrong, only that it is not necessary to deliver most of his liberal conclusions.

This shows us that we should distinguish stronger and weaker legal moralist claims.

  1. Weak Moralism: an action’s wrongness is pro tanto reason to regulate it.
  2. Strong Moralism: an action’s wrongness is conclusive reason to regulate it.

As we’ve just seen, liberal claims that harmless immorality should not be regulated are inconsistent with strong moralism, but not with weak moralism. It’s clear that Mill rejects strong moralism. What is less clear is whether he also rejects weak moralism. We must endorse weak moralism if we think that there are cases of harmless wrongdoing where legal regulation is not only pro tanto justified but also on-balance justified. Any list is potentially controversial, but many people would think that it is not only permissible but also desirable to regulate unsuccessful criminal attempts, fraud and blackmail that do not harm, desecration of the dead, and bestiality. If any of these should be regulated, that may require weak legal moralism.

3.10 The Categorical Approach Revisited

Mill’s “one very simple principle”—that liberty may be restricted always and only to prevent harm to another—is over-simple. So too is the related categorical approach to liberty that approves all applications of the harm principle and rejects all cases of paternalism, censorship, offense regulation, and legal moralism.

The harm principle itself is complex in several ways. Harm to others is not a sufficient ground for restricting liberty. Rather, it creates a pro tanto reason for restricting liberty. Determination of whether restrictions on harmful conduct are fully justified depends on balancing the evils of regulation against the harm to be prevented. Moreover, it is not clear if the harm principle justifies restricting liberty to prevent others from being harmed or only justifies restricting liberty to prevent those whose liberty is being restricted from causing harm to another. The anti-harming rationale for restricting liberty is narrower than the harm-prevention rationale. Only the broader harm-prevention rationale would explain how Mill could hope to square Good Samaritan laws and laws compelling testimony in court with the harm principle. Because the harm-prevention principle is broader, it will justify greater restrictions on liberty than the anti-harming principle. It is also unclear whether the harm principle protects all liberty or just basic liberties. The harm principle is more robust if it targets restrictions on basic liberties, rather than liberty per se. But if we qualify the harm principle in these ways, we are very far from the common libertarian reading of the harm principle as limiting any and all liberty only to prevent force or fraud.

However these questions are resolved, it is doubtful that the harm principle is necessary to justify restrictions on liberty. Mill makes principled exceptions to his general anti-paternalism to defend the permissibility of restrictions on selling oneself into slavery and other autonomy-enhancing forms of paternalism. Mill does allow some forms of offense regulation designed to prevent public indecency. Moreover, though Mill does seem more consistent in his opposition to legal moralism, it is not necessary to reject legal moralism as such in order to recognize the liberal conclusion that many forms of legal moralism do not do enough good in order to justify the harms they cause.

Harm prevention is neither necessary nor sufficient to restrict individual liberties. Nonetheless, one might argue that Mill recognizes basic liberties as especially important interests that can only be interfered with to prevent harm to others and or to prevent significant harm to the individual’s own agency.

3.11 Utilitarianism, Rights, and Liberalism

Having examined Mill’s liberalism we can return to the apparent tension between liberal rights and utilitarianism. For even if Mill employs complex, rather than simple, categories, there appears to be a tension between categorical protections of basic liberties and the sort of case-by-case consequentialist analysis that utilitarianism would seem to require. We might consider three different reconciliation strategies.

3.11.1 The Sanction Theory of Rights

Mill’s explicit theory of rights is introduced in Chapter V of Utilitarianism in the context of his sanction theory of duty, which is an indirect form of utilitarianism that identifies wrong actions as actions that it is useful to sanction (U V 14). Mill then introduces justice as a proper part of duty. Justice involves duties that are perfect duties—that is, duties that are correlated with rights (V 15).

Justice implies something which it is not only right to do, and wrong not to do, but which some individual person can claim from us as a matter of right. (V 15)

Mill explains his theory of rights in terms of the two elements in a rights violation—an injury to the right holder and warranted punishment.

These [two] elements are, a hurt to some assignable person or persons on the one hand, and a demand for punishment on the other. … [T]hese two things include all that we mean when we speak of violation of a right. When we call anything a person’s right, we mean that he has a valid claim on society to protect him in the possession of it, either by the force of law, or by that of education and opinion. If he has what we consider a sufficient claim, on whatever account, to have something guaranteed to him by society, we say that he has a right to it. If we desire to prove that anything does not belong to him by right, we think this is done as soon as it is admitted that society ought not to take measures for securing it to him, but should leave it to chance, or to his own exertions. (V 24)

This is a sanction theory of rights, akin to Mill’s sanction theory of duty. It says that one has a right to some interest or liberty insofar as society ought to protect that interest or liberty.

So far, this conception of a right does not yet introduce any utilitarian considerations. Mill adds utilitarianism to the mix in his account of the conditions under which society ought to enforce an individual’s claim.

To have a right, then, is, I conceive, to have something which society ought to defend me in the possession of. If the objector goes on to ask why it ought, I can give him no other reason than general utility. (V 25)

This sanction theory of rights is an indirect utilitarian one insofar as it implies that whether someone has a right to something depends not on the utility of that claim but on the utility of our responses to violations of that claim.

Does the sanction theory of rights provide a good reconciliation of rights and utility? Not surprisingly, the sanction theory of rights inherits the problems of the sanction theory of duty. Recall that we found sanction utilitarianism to be internally inconsistent insofar as it combines indirect and direct utilitarian claims (§2.10). Because the sanction theory of rights is committed to sanction utilitarianism, it inherits this inconsistency.

  1. X has a right to Y iff society ought to protect X’s claim to Y from interference (the first part of the sanction theory of rights).
  2. Society ought to protect X’s claim to Y from interference iff doing so is optimal (the second, direct part of the sanction theory of rights).
  3. Society ought to protect X’s claim to Y from interference iff it would be optimal to blame society for failing to do so (the indirect sanction theory of duty).

(2) and (3) are inconsistent. One could respond by decoupling the sanction theory of rights from the sanction theory of duty. But if we reject the sanction theory of duty, why accept a sanction theory of rights?

Moreover, the sanction theory of rights has problems of its own. The sanction theory of rights treats the desirability of social enforcement as constitutive of the idea of a right. But this seems to get things backward. It is because we have rights that society ought to enforce them; it is not that we have rights to whatever society ought to enforce. The desirability of social enforcement seems consequential on the existence of the right. This is even clearer, because there are some claims that society ought to enforce that are not rights. Among the things that society ought to recognize and protect are both rights and privileges. The exact line between rights and privileges is not always clear. But we recognize the distinction in claiming that some interests and opportunities that the state ought to protect are not ones that can be claimed as a matter of right. This shows that the usefulness of social enforcement cannot be constitutive of a right, because otherwise privileges would be rights.

Though the sanction theory is Mill’s explicit conception of rights, he has the resources for two other conceptions.

3.11.2 Rights as Secondary Principles

We saw that Mill recognizes the need for various secondary principles in moral reasoning (§2.9). These are principles that do not themselves refer to utility but whose adoption and general deployment are justified on utilitarian grounds. So one way for Mill to reconcile rights and utility is for him to treat rights as secondary principles, perhaps especially important ones, whose observance is justified on utilitarian grounds (also see Berger 1984: chs. 3–4). On this interpretation, rights are protected by rules that insulate an individual’s interest or liberty from certain kinds of interference and that make no direct reference to the good consequences of insulation. We should observe such rules more or less uncritically, and set them aside only when adherence to them is clearly suboptimal or in cases of conflicts among such rules (rights). In such exceptional cases, we should make direct appeal to the principle of utility. But, otherwise, not.

Why should we regulate our conduct by such rules? Because doing so is generally but imperfectly optimal, and we are unable to discriminate for cases in which deviation form the rules is suboptimal without deviating from them in other cases in which it is not.

3.11.3 Rights as Pre-eminent Goods

Why should we believe that there are interests or liberties that it is generally but imperfectly optimal to protect? Mill’s answer is that some interests and liberties play a more fundamental role in human happiness than others. On this reading, rights protect pre-eminent or especially important goods.

While I dispute the pretensions of any theory which sets up an imaginary standard of justice not grounded on utility, I account the justice which is grounded on utility to be the chief part, and incomparably the most sacred and binding part, of all morality. Justice is a name for certain classes of moral rules which concern the essentials of human well-being more nearly, and are therefore of more absolute obligation, than any other rules for the guidance of life; and the notion which we have found to be of the essence of the idea of justice—that of a right residing in an individual—implies and testifies to this more binding obligation. (U V 32; also see V 33, 37–38)

Indeed, if the goods protected by rights are so important, we can understand why Mill might think that society ought to enforce them by law or opinion (V 24). But notice that here enforceability is a consequence of the importance of rights, rather than the defining feature of rights.

This conception of rights presupposes a hierarchy of values in which some kinds of goods are superior to others. We know that Mill accepts a hierarchy of values from his doctrine of higher pleasures. That doctrine treats the possession and use of capacities for practical deliberation as higher-order goods. Various liberties of thought and action are important as necessary conditions for realizing these higher-order goods.

But if the rights we have are to especially important goods, then we can see how honoring rights promotes the good. By hypothesis, it will be best to honor rights when this conflicts with the promotion of lesser goods. We might say that rights “trump” these lesser goods. Rights don’t trump the pursuit of other comparably important goods. These should be treated as conflicts of rights, and the utilitarian should resolve such conflicts by recourse to the utilitarian first principle and a determination of which right, in the context, is most important.

These three conceptions of rights offer somewhat different ways of reconciling utility and rights. The biggest difference is between the sanction theory, on the one hand, and the secondary principle and pre-eminent goods conceptions, on the other hand, because the first is an indirect utilitarian conception of rights, whereas the second two are compatible with direct utilitarianism. Whereas the sanction theory of rights appears problematic, the secondary principles and pre-eminent goods conceptions appear more plausible. It would be premature to say that they are fully adequate conceptions of rights, but they do offer some promise of reconciling utility and rights.

4. Liberal Democracy

We get a somewhat different perspective on Mill’s utilitarian and liberal principles by seeing how he applies them to social and political issues. We might begin by focusing on Mill’s defense of a democratic form of liberalism in Considerations on Representative Government and Principles of Political Economy.

In Considerations on Representative Government Mill argues that a form of representative democracy is the best ideal form of government. It is not an invariant ideal that holds regardless of historical or social circumstances. But he does think that it is the best form of government for societies with sufficient resources, security, and culture of self-reliance. In particular, Mill thinks that representative democracy is best, when it is best, because it best satisfies two criteria of all good government: (1) that government is good insofar as it promotes the common good, where this is conceived of as promoting the moral, intellectual, and active traits of its citizens, and (2) that government is good insofar as it makes effective use of institutions and the resources of its citizens to promote the common good (CRG 390, 392). Insofar as (2) is really a component of (1), Mill’s ultimate criterion is that good government should promote the common good of its citizens. Mill does not explicitly invoke his version of utilitarianism. Perhaps he wants his defense of representative democracy to rest on more ecumenical premises. But he clearly understands this political criterion of the common good in broadly consequentialist or result-oriented terms. Moreover, though he may not mention the higher pleasures doctrine explicitly, it is also clear that Mill understands the good of each in broadly perfectionist terms that emphasize the importance of an active and autonomous form of life that exercises intellectual, deliberative, and creative capacities.

4.1 Representative Democracy

Mill thinks that there are two ways in which democracy is, under the right circumstances, best suited to promote the common good.

First, he thinks that democracy plays an important epistemic role in identifying the common good. Proper deliberation about issues affecting the common good requires identifying the consequences of different policies for the interests of affected parties and so requires the proper representation and articulation of the interests of citizens. But failure of imagination and the operation of personal bias present obstacles to the effective representation of the interests of others. Universal suffrage and political participation provide the best assurance that the interests of the governed will be properly appreciated by political decision-makers (404).

Second, Mill thinks that democracy is also the best form of government because of the constitutive effects of political participation on the improvement of the moral capacities of citizens (404). To the extent that the governed can and do participate in public debate and elections they exercise those very deliberative capacities that it is the aim of government to develop. They learn to gather information about their options, deliberate about their merits, and choose a representative who will give expression to their ideals and preferences. They deliberate and choose with others about a public agenda, and in so doing they cultivate abilities to form a conception of a common good, to take principled stands, to exchange reasons with others, and to learn from others.

So far, these would seem to be arguments for widespread—indeed, universal—direct democracy. In fact, unlike many of his contemporaries interested in expanding the franchise, Mill defends the extension of the franchise to women too, rejecting any restriction on their franchise as baseless (479). But Mill qualifies this defense of direct democracy in various significant ways.

Democracy presumably involves rule by the will of the people. We might say that a political system is democratic insofar as the content of its political decisions reflect the will of the people. A direct democracy, in which every citizen votes on legislation, is one way for political decisions to reflect the will of the people. But direct democracy is impractical in anything but a small community (412). Mill defends representative, rather than direct, democracy.

Mill believes that representatives are charged with the task of voting, after free and open discussion, their own considered views about what would promote the common good (490). Here Mill expresses doubts about an interest group model of democracy, according to which representatives are advocates of the sectarian interests of their constituents and democracy is seen as an impartial aggregation and set of compromises among sectarian interests. Instead, Mill regards representatives as fiduciaries in a public trust, in which each representative aims at a genuinely common good, and in which individual and collective deliberations are shaped by a diversity of experiences and perspectives.

Many needs are local in nature, and, even when the needs are general, their satisfaction may depend heavily on local conditions. For this reason, Mill advocates a federal system in which a central representative body has more limited functions and local or municipal representative bodies govern in matters involving local affairs or local detail, such as the creation and maintenance of local infrastructure, including roads, courts, jails, and schools (422–34).

However, one important function of a central government, Mill believes, is the need to protect local political minorities from being systematically disadvantaged by local political majorities (544). Here he shows his concern with individual rights against the tyranny of the majority, which was a focus of On Liberty and suggests that constitutional guarantees may be better preserved by central, rather than local, authorities. Unfortunately, he does not devote much attention to exactly which individual rights should be recognized constitutionally.

Mill also insists that a representative democracy, either local or federal, should employ proportional, rather than winner-take-all, representation (CRG 449–62; “Thoughts on Parliamentary Reform” 328–29). We can see how proportional representation fits with the epistemic argument for democracy. Winner-take-all representation may eliminate or reduce effective expression of minority points of view so essential for free and informed inquiry about the common good and respecting the interests of political minorities (CRG 458).

4.2 The Scope of the Franchise and Weighted Voting

In his philosophical writings and in his service as a Liberal member of Parliament for Westminster from 1865 to 1868, Mill was a vigorous advocate for extending the franchise. Though he recognized some limits in the scope of the franchise, he was a consistent, though not always successful, advocate for its extension beyond its then current scope. He supported extending the franchise to previously disenfranchised members of the working class, and he was a staunch advocate for female suffrage (479–81). To many, such views about the appropriate scope of the franchise seemed quite radical. Though Mill did support weighted voting, he may have seen this, at least in part, as a necessary concession to succeed in securing his primary objective of (near) universal suffrage (476). It is worth bearing this context in mind when evaluating Mill’s proposals for the scope and weight of the franchise.

As we noted earlier, Mill does not defend representative democracy as ideal under all historical and social circumstances. There are some social circumstances, he thinks, in which democracy will not promote the common good. These are backward states of society in which most citizens are unfit to rule, because they lack necessary ingredients of the culture of autonomy to exercise decision-making authority responsibly. They lack discipline, or education, or an active and independent character. Different forms of government are appropriate for such backward states of advancement. In particular, Mill thinks that benevolent rule by an enlightened one or few, which aimed at the common good, would be better suited for such societies (415–18). Here, Mill is introducing a scope limitation on the defense of political rights that he recognized explicitly in his defense of basic liberties in On Liberty (I 10). There are important practical questions, which Mill does not address very clearly, about which societies cross this threshold of capacity for improvement by free inquiry and political rights. We might reasonably disagree with Mill about what the competence threshold is and which societies satisfy it.[2] But he does make clear that political participation, like free inquiry, is important as a necessary condition for the exercise of our higher capacities and has value only when a threshold level of normative competence is met.

What is true of some societies in relation to others is also true of some individuals in relation to others within societies that cross this threshold of normative competence. This explains limitations on the scope of the franchise that Mill recognizes within such advanced civilizations. He confines the scope of the franchise to mature adults, excluding minors who would not have crossed the threshold of normative competence. He is also prepared to exclude those adults who are not literate (CRG 470–71). This is a failure of normative competence for which society is to blame and which it is society’s duty to correct (470). Mill also excludes from the franchise those adults who do not pay taxes and are on public assistance (472). Here he expresses the concern that voting gives one a say not only over one’s own life but also over the lives of others and that without contributing to the production of an economic surplus one has no right to help determine how this surplus is distributed. Mill is also committed to doubts about the normative competence of those on public assistance. Elsewhere, Mill insists that charities make beneficiaries dependent on benefactors in ways that compromise their autonomy and independence (PPE V.xi.13; SW 330). Insofar as this is true, it provides an additional rationale for excluding dependents from the franchise.

The main limitations on the scope of the franchise that Mill recognizes track this threshold of normative competence. Mill thinks that the reasons for favoring democracy apply to all those above this normative threshold. Literate manual laborers have the same claim to the franchise, Mill thinks, as anyone else. They need to stand up for their own interests and make sure they are properly reckoned in political decision-making. Moreover, they stand to benefit from political participation, because of the way it develops their deliberative capacities.

Of course, there are differences in normative competence among those above this threshold. But Mill’s account of representative democracy tracks these further differences in terms of the weight, rather than the scope, of the franchise (CRG 473). Differences in normative competence above this threshold should affect the comparative weight of one’s vote. This scheme of weighted voting takes the form of a system of plural votes (CRG 467–81; also see “Parliamentary Reform” 322–28). Mill emphatically rejects property qualifications as suitable proxies for normative competence (CRG 474; “Parliamentary Reform” 325) and insists on educational qualifications.

The most direct mode of effecting this, would be to establish the plurality of votes, in favour of those who could afford a reasonable presumption of superior knowledge and cultivation. … The perfection, then, of an electoral system would be, that every person should have one vote, but that every well-educated person in the community should have more than one, on a scale corresponding as far as practicable to their amount of education. (“Parliamentary Reform” 324–25)

There is an upper limit on the system of plural votes such that the weighted votes of the educational elite will not give them a majority coalition that could advance its class interests at the expense of the uneducated (CRG 476).

Mill’s commitment to weighted voting reflects his views about the backward state of the working classes.

The opinions and wishes of the poorest and rudest class of labourers may be very useful as one influence among others on the minds of the voters, as well as on those of the Legislature; and yet it may be highly mischievous to give them the preponderant influence, but admitting them, in their present state of morals and intelligence, to the full exercise of the suffrage. (“Parliamentary Reform” 334)

Despite these doubts about the working classes, Mill regarded himself as their friend (Autobiography 274; see Ten 1998). Mill did not blame the working classes for what he saw as their lesser competence, and he did not regard their backwardness as a natural or permanent condition. He thought that improved access to quality primary and secondary education and greater scope for civic participation would gradually improve normative competence in the working classes (PPE IV.vii.2). Insofar as this is true, the qualification to Mill’s commitment to political equality, represented by his scheme of weighted voting, is temporary and transitional. In this sense, weighted voting is not part of ideal political theory in the way that (near) universal suffrage and proportional representation are.

Even if weighted voting tracks the epistemic reasons for democracy and differences in underlying normative competence, it violates norms of political equality. Mill seems not to recognize the potentially corrosive effects of weighted voting in terms of the message it sends of second-class citizenship to the working classes. He thinks that self-respect requires only that one have the vote, not that one have an equal vote, regardless of normative competence.

There is not, in this arrangement [weighted voting], anything necessarily invidious to those to whom it assigns the lower degrees of influence. Entire exclusion from a voice in the common concerns is one thing; the concession to others of a more potential voice, on the ground of greater capacity for the management of the joint interests, is another. The two things are not merely different, they are incommensurable. Everyone has a right to feel insulted by being made a nobody, and stamped as of no account at all. No one but a fool … feels offended by the acknowledgment that there are others whose opinion … is entitled to a greater amount of consideration than his. (CRG 474)

But why should I care so much about being branded a nobody and not at all about being branded a lesser somebody? One might well want to harness the resources and expertise of an educated elite, perhaps, as Mill already imagines, by giving them special roles in the drafting of legislation or in setting the agenda for public deliberations. But this does not require giving the educated elite plural votes. Doing that seems to have significant symbolic value, saying that working classes should have less political standing and say. From this perspective, Mill displays something of a tin ear for egalitarian concerns about weighted voting. Interestingly, while he does not seem especially sensitive to concerns about the bad effects of second-class citizenship in Considerations on Representative Government, he seems much more sensitive to such concerns in The Subjection of Women. As we will see, Mill is acutely aware of the variety of ways in which women’s contributions can be discouraged and undervalued and of the individual and social costs of women’s second-class status. Had Mill been as mindful of the costs of according workers second-class citizenship as he would later be of the costs of according women second-class status, he might have been more skeptical of weighted voting than he in fact was.

4.3 Liberal Democracy and the Common Good

What of the substance of democratic government? Though Mill is an advocate of limited government in ways that one might expect given his defense of basic liberties in On Liberty, he is no libertarian. He emphatically rejects the idea that legitimate government is limited to the functions of affording protection against force and fraud (PPE V.i.2). Instead, he thinks that there are a variety of ways in which government can and should intervene in the lives of citizens—sometimes as coercer and other times as enabler or facilitator—in order to promote the common good. Mill’s claims about happiness imply that the good of each consists in the exercise of her higher capacities. This requires an active life in which one’s activities are regulated by one’s deliberations and choices. As we have seen in Mill’s critical discussions of paternalism, this places limits on how others can promote one’s own good. I can’t promote your good, understood in this way, in ways that bypass your agency anymore than I can win a race for you. But just as I can do things to help you win the race yourself (training with you, sharing nutritional tips, and helping you plan strategy), so too I can do things that help you lead an autonomous life. I can provide various sorts of necessary conditions for your leading such a life. If an individual’s good consists in this sort of self-realization, then a government which aims at the common good should concern itself in significant part with the fair provision of opportunities for welfare.

Early in The Subjection of Women Mill contrasts systems of hereditary caste, such as feudalism and social systems based on slavery, with the distinctively modern and progressive commitment to equal opportunity for welfare.

For, what is the peculiar character of the modern world—the difference which chiefly distinguishes modern institutions, modern social ideas, modern life itself, from those of times long past? It is that human beings are no longer born into their place in life, and chained down by an inexorable bond to the place they are born to, but are free to employ their faculties, and such favorable chances as offer, to achieve the lot which may appear to them most desirable. (SW 272–73)

As with basic liberties, opportunities for welfare have value, not in themselves, but as necessary conditions for the sort of self-realization to which Mill assigns pre-eminent intrinsic value. But they are no less important for that reason. Indeed, many of the functions of government that he recognizes can be traced to providing conditions and opportunities for self-realization.

Though Mill generally opposes paternalism, censorship, offense regulation, and moralism, he does recognize various functions that government should perform in pursuing the common good. In part because the opportunities for each depend in part upon the position and resources of others, Mill thinks that provision of fair equality of opportunity constrains permissible socio-economic inequalities (PPE II.ii.1).

A just and wise legislation would abstain from holding out motives for dissipating rather than saving the earnings of honest exertion. Its impartiality between competitors would consist in endeavoring that they should all start fair …. Many, indeed, fail with greater efforts than those with which others succeed, not from difference of merits, but difference of opportunities; but if all were done which it would be in the power of a good government to do, by instruction and by legislation, to diminish this inequality of opportunities, the differences of fortune arising from people’s own earnings could not justly give umbrage. (PPE V.ii.3)

As Mill makes clear in this passage, his concern is not with inequality as such. Though he envisions a society in which inequalities are reduced and in which a decent minimum standard of living is available to all (PPE, he does defend the profits of capitalists as a just recompense for their savings, risk, and economic supervision (PPE II.xv.1; “Chapters on Socialism” 734–35). Rather, Mill’s concern in this passage is with inequalities derived from inequality of opportunity and those inequalities that perpetuate inequality of opportunity. To achieve equality of opportunity, Mill endorses various redistributive tax measures (also see Berger 1984: 159–86). He defends a flat tax rate on earned income above a threshold necessary to secure a decent minimum standard of living, leaving earned income below this threshold untaxed (PPE II.i.3, II.xii.2, II.xii.3, V.ii.1–3, V.iii.3–5). In addition, he endorses the use of higher tax rates on unearned income and on inheritance (PPE II.ii.1, II.ii.3–4, II.xii.3, V.ii.3, V.ii.5,, V.ix.1). Such taxes limit intergenerational inequalities that would otherwise constrain equality of opportunity.

Within this framework established for equal opportunity, Mill defends additional governmental functions designed to promote the common good. A prime condition of normative competence is a decent education, and Mill thinks that it is one of the central roles of the state to require and, if necessary, provide a quality education (OL V 12–13; PPE V.xi.8). Mill thinks that the state can and should require parents to provide schooling for their children, ensuring that this kind of education is available to all, regardless of financial circumstances, by subsidizing the costs of education for the poor so that it is available free or at a nominal cost.

We have also seen that Mill thinks that charity breeds dependence, rather than autonomy. This is one reason that he defends the adoption of Poor Laws that provide, among other things, work for the able-bodied indigent (PPE II.xii.2). Mill also thinks that government should step in where market forces are unlikely to provide what people need or want (PPE V.xi.8). In this way, he thinks that it is an important function for the state, whether central or local, to create and maintain various aspects of community infrastructure, including such things as a common defense, roads, sanitation, police, and correctional facilities (PPE V.vii.1; CRG 541). He also thinks regulation of working conditions (hours, wages, and benefits) is permissible, because the provision of improved working conditions typically has the structure of a public or collective good for workers, each of whom stands to gain a competitive advantage by conceding a little more to capital than his peers (PPE V.xi.12). If left unregulated, each has incentive to concede more to capital than his rivals, with the result that all workers are made worse-off. State intervention and regulation, Mill thinks, is the best solution to this collective action problem. He also thinks that there are other goods for which market provision will lead to underproduction, presumably because of positive externalities, which is why he thinks that the state should subsidize scientific research and the arts (PPE V.xi.15).

Mill’s liberalism is committed to democratic political institutions in which the franchise is widespread, private property rights, market economies, equal social and economic opportunity, and a variety of personal and civic liberties. To appreciate the significance of his brand of liberalism, it is helpful to focus on the substance of his conception of liberal essentials—the package of individual liberties and state responsibilities that he endorses—and the way he justifies his conception of liberal essentials. Millian liberalism is not laissez-faire liberalism, and it justifies liberal essentials as a way of promoting the common good. The distinctiveness of this brand of liberalism is perhaps best seen in contrast with two other conceptions of liberalism—a more libertarian conception of liberal essentials and their justification that dominated the British Liberal Party at mid-century and the sort of contemporary political liberalism that justifies liberal essentials as required if the state is to be neutral among rival conceptions of the good life that its citizens might hold.

A good part of the agenda of the Liberal Party during much of the nineteenth century consisted in reforms that sought to undo limitations that the state placed on the liberties and opportunities of citizens, especially when these forms of state intervention tended to reinforce class privileges. This political culture was exemplified in the repeal of the Corn Laws, opposition to religious persecution, and several electoral reforms. But in the later part of the nineteenth century there emerged a new view about the role of such reforms within the Liberal agenda. Earlier Liberals, such as Herbert Spencer, thought that reform should be limited to the removal of state interference with individual liberty. By contrast, the New Liberals thought that these reforms that extended economic, social, and political liberties had to be supplemented by social and economic reforms in areas of labor, education, and health designed to redress the effects of inequality. These new reforms gave the state positive, and not just negative, responsibilities that sometimes required interference with individual liberties. Because Mill thinks that the state has an important role to play in securing equal opportunity, ensuring a good education that will nurture normative competence, and redressing various market failures and providing various public goods, it makes sense to view Mill as laying much of the intellectual groundwork for the New Liberalism—both in its conception of liberal essentials and in its conception of the proper justification of liberal essentials by appeal to a broadly consequentialist interest in promoting self-realization.

Mill’s perfectionist justification of liberal essentials also provides a contrast with an influential strand in recent Anglo-American philosophical defenses of liberalism that insist on neutrality among rival conceptions of the good life (see Turner 2017). According to many contemporary liberals, neutrality about the good is a constitutive commitment of liberalism, and liberal neutrality places limits on the justification of state action. Liberal governments, on this view, can and must enforce individual rights and any further demands of social justice, including those necessary to maintain peace and order. But they are not to undertake any action as a way of promoting a particular conception of the good life or a comprehensive philosophical doctrine. On matters of the good, a liberal state must be strictly neutral. It can promote the good of its citizenry only in ways that are consistent with every reasonable conception of the good (see Rawls 1993 and Kymlicka 1989).

By contrast, Mill is a perfectionist liberal who eschews neutrality about the good. According to Millian perfectionism, the good life is not defined in sectarian terms as consisting in a particular set of activities. Rather, the good life is understood in terms of the exercise of capacities for practical deliberation that can be realized in diverse, though limited, ways. Basic liberties are important because they are necessary conditions for this sort of reflective self-direction and self-realization. On this version of liberalism, the state recognizes various civil liberties and resists regular paternalism and moralism, not because it won’t take a stand on questions of the good, but precisely because it recognizes autonomy and self-determination as higher-order goods.

5. Sexual Equality

Mill applies his liberal principles to issues of sexual equality primarily in The Subjection of Women. He denounces existing forms of sexual inequality in clear and unequivocal terms.

[T]he principle which regulates the existing social relations between the two sexes—the legal subordination of one sex to the other—is wrong in itself, and now one of the chief hindrances to human improvement; and … it ought to be replaced by a principle of perfect equality, admitting no power or privilege on the one side, nor disability on the other. (SW 261)

To modern ears, Mill’s defense of sexual equality may seem obvious, and, to some contemporary feminists, Mill’s criticism of sexual inequality may not be deep or consistent enough. But, when viewed in historical context, Mill’s defense of sexual equality is radical, courageous, and sometimes eloquent (Shanley 1998). While Mill clearly expected some aspects of his liberal principles in On Liberty to be controversial (OL I 6–8), their revolutionary import became especially clear when he applied them to issues of sexual equality in The Subjection of Women (Nicholson 1998: 471).

5.1 The Case for Sexual Equality

Mill rejects sexual inequality in both domestic and social contexts. He discusses domestic equality primarily in Chapter II. There, he focuses on the rights of wives and mothers, recognizing women’s equal rights over their bodies or persons (SW 283–86), to own and control property (284–85, 297) to control various aspects of domestic decision-making and household management (290–92), to custody and care of children (285), and to separation and divorce (285–86). But Mill is not only concerned with wives and mothers in domestic contexts. He also defends equal rights to education (315–16), to professional opportunities (299; cf. PPE IV.vii.3), to vote in political elections (301), and to run for political office (301). In addition to these rights, Mill presumably also endorses equal rights to freedom of expression, worship, and association. One assumes that he sees the main threats to these rights as occurring in the domestic realm and coming from husbands, fathers, and brothers.

At times, Mill defends sexual equality on explicitly consequentialist grounds as a way of making fuller use of people’s talents and promoting a culture of equal opportunity, accountability, and genuine meritocracy (326–28). But Mill also defends sexual equality as a matter of individual rights and justice.

Thus far, the benefits which it has appeared that the world would gain by ceasing to make sex a disqualification for privileges and a badge of subjection, are social rather than individual; consisting in an increase of the general fund of thinking and acting power, and an improvement in the general conditions of the association of men and women. But it would be a grievous understatement of the case to omit the most direct benefit of all, the unspeakable gain in private happiness to the liberated half of the species; the difference to them between a life of subjection to the will of others, and a life of rational freedom. After the primary necessities of food and raiment, freedom is the first and strongest want to human nature. (336)

In elaborating this claim about women’s higher-order interests in liberty, he says that personal independence is an “element of happiness” (336–37). This echoes the arguments in On Liberty for claiming that basic liberties are necessary for persons to exercise the deliberative capacities that make them progressive beings.

In defending women’s rights, Mill also appeals to the distinctively modern and progressive commitment to equal opportunity for welfare (272–73). At several points, he likens the status of women inside and outside of marriage to slavery (284–86, 323). Mill is not much impressed by those who would dispute the analogy on the ground that women are treated much better than slaves. Gilded cages are still cages that restrict freedom and opportunity. And often the cages are not gilded; Mill insists that husbands can be and often are just as violent and abusive as masters (285–86, 288–89). Indeed, with the demise of slavery in America, he views sexual inequality as the last vestige of slavery in the West.

The law of servitude in marriage is a monstrous contradiction to all the principles of the modern world, and to all the experience through which those principles have been slowly and painfully worked out. It is the sole case, now that negro slavery has been abolished, in which a human being in the plenitude of every faculty is delivered up to the tender mercies of another human being, in the hope forsooth that this other will use the power solely for the good of the person subjected to it. Marriage is the only actual bondage known to our law. There remain no legal slaves, except the mistress of every house. (323)

The restrictions contained in Victorian marriage law that give husbands complete control over the person and property of their wives and that do not allow for unilateral divorce or separation make marriage a form of sexual or gendered slavery. Slavery is an impermissible restriction of the liberty of another. Slavery would be impermissible even if the wife consented to marriage (270). Mill might question whether the consent is meaningful given the social pressures to marry and to defer to their husbands, the limited options for those who do not marry, and the adverse consequences to women of expressing dissent within marriage (270). But the quality of consent should be in any case irrelevant, because we know that Mill thinks that it is impermissible to contract into slavery and that paternalistic laws that prevent such contracts are not only permissible but obligatory (OL V 11). Presumably, this is just the sort of case that Mill has in mind when he suggests that the prohibition of selling oneself into slavery is a principled exception to the usual prohibition on paternalism that has “wider application.” This norm of equal opportunity for welfare, which is violated by Victorian marriage law, is a demand of justice (SW 325) and grounds a claim of right.

5.2 Rebutting the Case for Inequality

Mill considers and replies to various actual and possible defenses of sexual inequality. In most cases, the apologist for inequality alleges that women are naturally inferior in relation to men along some dimension that is alleged to be relevant to the proper management of personal and public affairs. For the most part, the apologist claims that men possess some trait essential for normative competence that women lack—these might be represented as alleged female deficits—or that women possess some trait that men lack that threatens normative competence—these might be represented as alleged female disqualifiers. In either case, the apologist argues, it turns out that women are naturally inferior and so do not deserve equal treatment.

Mill considers a large list of potential natural differences, not restricted to deficits and disqualifiers, including claims that women are (1) more intuitive and practical, less principled and theoretical, than men (305), (2) more focused on particulars, less capable of abstraction or generalization, than men (306), (3) more nervous and excitable than men (308), (4) less single-minded than men (310), (5) less accomplished in philosophy, science, and art than men (313–14), (6) less original than men (314–15), (7) morally superior to men (320–21), (8) more susceptible to personal bias than men (321), (9) more pacific and less aggressive than men (329–30), (10) more philanthropic than men (330), and (11) more self-sacrificing and self-abnegating than men (293).

Mill’s response to these alleged differences is mixed. Sometimes, he questions whether the traits in question are unevenly distributed. But, for the most part, he seems to concede that the traits are unevenly distributed. He doesn’t always agree that the female trait is a deficit or disqualifier. For instance, he thinks that being more intuitive, more practical, more focused on particulars, and less rigid allows women to compensate for deficits in the way that men typically approach decision-making. Women are less likely to follow principle for its own sake and are more likely to test principles by their real world consequences. They are better able to multi-task and intellectually more open-minded. Being morally superior and less aggressive are unqualified goods. However, he seems to concede that women are more excitable, less accomplished, and less original than men. He tries to explain these deficits and disqualifiers in ways that do not presuppose women’s natural inferiority.

Mill’s primary response to the apologists is to claim that even if the trait is unevenly distributed and functions as a deficit or disqualifier there is nonetheless no evidence of natural inferiority. There is no evidence of natural inferiority, because we cannot be sure that the incapacity is the product of nature, rather than nurture. In particular, because the history of sexual relations has been discriminatory, we cannot rule out the possibility that female incapacity is the product of past discriminatory treatment (275–77, 304–05, 313).

I consider it a presumption in any one to pretend to decide what women are or are not, can or cannot be, by natural constitution. They have always hitherto been kept, as far as regards spontaneous development, in so unnatural a state, that their nature cannot but have been greatly distorted and disguised; and no one can safely pronounce that if women’s nature were left to choose its direction as freely as men’s, and if no artificial bent were attempted to be given to it except that required by the conditions of human society, and given to both sexes alike there would be any material difference, or perhaps any difference at all, in the character and capacities that would unfold themselves. (304–05)

Mill rightly insists that incapacity that is the product of discriminatory treatment cannot be appealed to justify that discrimination. That would be circular reasoning.

Mill can explain differential accomplishments in philosophy, science, and the arts by appeal to social barriers to women’s participation in these fields (313–18) and to competing domestic demands that are placed on them (318–19). In this connection, it is worth noting that Mill can concede not only differential accomplishments of the sexes but differential capacity, in at least one sense. For Mill can and should distinguish between actual capacity and potential capacity. Actual capacities determine what an agent is now able to do, whereas potential capacities determine what actual capacities she can develop. For instance, I have no actual capacity to speak Russian, but presumably I do have a potential capacity to speak Russian. By contrast, I don’t have even a potential capacity to fly or run a three-minute mile. Actual capacities are a function of potential capacities and suitable training, opportunities, and responsibilities. If I have not been given a proper education and training with suitable deliberative opportunities and responsibilities at various points in my development, my potential competence may not be actualized. Even if everyone had equal potential capacities, we should expect unequal actual capacities in systems where education and deliberative opportunities and responsibilities have been distributed unequally. If so, then greater actual capacity would not be evidence of greater potential capacity.

The moral that Mill draws is that equal rights should prevail in the absence of any good evidence about the way in which natural assets and potential capacities are distributed by gender. Equality is the presumption, even if it is a rebuttable presumption, and the presumption can only be rebutted on the basis of adequate empirical evidence (262).

5.3 Is the Sexual Division of Labor Natural?

In rebutting potential defenses of sexual inequality by appeal to various alleged dimensions of natural inferiority, Mill insists that we cannot determine whether traits commonly found in women are the product of nature or nurture without suitable social experimentation, including, the social experiment of sexual equality. In particular, there is the very real possibility that the traits alleged to justify sexual discrimination are the product of past discriminatory practice. But Mill does not adhere to this point consistently (see Annas 1977; Okin 1979: 226–30). At several points, he expresses the conviction that most women with a full menu of opportunities will accept a traditional sexual division of labor in which they perform domestic functions while their husbands pursue professions in civil society, and he approves of this traditional division of labor.

When the support of the family depends, not on property, but on earning, the common arrangement, by which the man earns the income and the wife superintends the domestic expenditure, seems to me in general the most suitable division of labor between the two persons. … In an otherwise just state of things, it is not, therefore, I think, a desirable custom, that the wife should contribute by her labour to the income of the family. (SW 297)

Of course, Mill is right that a wife should not also have to earn a living outside the home if she is working full time within the home. But he gives no reason for thinking that women should have families or that, if they do, they, rather than their husbands, should be responsible for matters domestic. Indeed, Mill’s view seems to be that for women extra-domestic vocations should be reserved primarily for those without children or whose children are already grown (338). He seems here to assume that the traditional sexual division of labor is natural. Of course, it is possible that the traditional sexual division of labor would emerge in a system of equal opportunity. But this is conjecture. Indeed, one might have thought that his own claims about how the system of unequal opportunity has repressed women’s creative and managerial capacities would have suggested that the traditional sexual division of labor was probably not robust. In defending or at least speculating about the robustness of the traditional sexual division of labor, Mill appears to be ignoring his own methodological strictures.

5.4 Millian Feminism

This is a significant blemish on Mill’s feminist credentials. He sometimes assumed that a traditional sexual division of labor was natural in the sense that it was likely to emerge in a culture of equal opportunity for all. Given Mill’s recognition that the existing division of labor was produced and sustained in conditions of sexual discrimination and unequal opportunity, there is no basis for supposing that this division of labor would survive a culture of equality. However, it is Mill himself that supplies the resources for criticizing his assumption. That ought to provide partial mitigation of his mistake.

Otherwise, Mill’s feminist credentials are strong. He is a keen critic of domestic and social forms of inequality, recognizing the harm such practices cause women and the ways in which they deform the lives of boys and men too. Victorian marriage law, the denial of the franchise, and lack of social and economic opportunities violate higher-order interests of women. These rights violations are a matter of serious social injustice. The corollary of these criticisms is that Mill is a staunch defender of equal opportunity for women and an eloquent spokesman for the way in which a culture of equality would transform the lives of girls and women, liberating their creative potential and emotional sensibilities, and make possible more productive social cooperation and friendships among equals.

Mill’s discussion of sexual equality is one place where the perfectionist underpinnings of his liberal principles play an important role and add to the depth of his criticisms of sexual discrimination and his case for sexual equality. His defense of sexual equality highlights the genuinely progressive aspects of his utilitarian and liberal commitments.

6. Concluding Remarks

As perhaps the leading historical proponent of two important normative traditions—utilitarianism and liberalism—Mill occupies an unusually important position in the history of western moral and political philosophy. Viewed in historical context, both utilitarianism and liberalism have exerted considerable progressive influence on the scope of moral concern, the design of public institutions, the responsibilities of government, and the interests and rights of the governed. Mill did much to articulate the justification, content, and implications of utilitarian and liberal principles. Inevitably, there are questions about the proper interpretation, adequacy, and consistency of his various claims on these topics. But he has left an enduring legacy in both utilitarian and liberal traditions. Both traditions figure centrally in contemporary discussions of analytical ethical and political theory. Further progress in these traditions must take account of his contributions.

A Note on Texts and References

References to Mill’s texts and other historical texts will be by title or short title; references to contemporary articles and books will be by year of publication. Publication details and conventions for referring to Bentham’s and Mill’s texts are provided in this Note (below). Otherwise, publication details can be found in the Bibliography. If a parenthetical reference does not identify the text in question, the reader should assume that it is the last identified text being referenced again (context should make it clear).

Bentham’s Works

Bentham’s writing were originally published as The Works of Jeremy Bentham, 11 vols., ed. J. Bowring (Edinburgh: William Tait, 1838–43) and are available electronically. I refer to the following works, employing the associated abbreviations.

  • Introduction to the Principles of Moral and Legislation [Principles] (1789) Works vol. I. References by chapter and paragraph number.
  • Table of the Springs of Action (1817) Works I. References by table number and section.
  • Plan for Parliamentary Reform (1817) Works III.
  • Book of Fallacies (1824) Works I. Works pagination.
  • Constitutional Code (1832) Works IX. References by chapter and section number.

So, for instance, Principles I 2 refers to paragraph 2 of chapter I of the Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation.

Mill’s Works

There are many editions of Mill’s more popular and influential works, including many of his writings in moral and political philosophy. The definitive edition of Mill’s writings is Collected Works of John Stuart Mill [CW], 33 volumes, ed. J. Robson (Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1965–91) and available online through the Liberty Fund. In order to facilitate common reference among readers using different editions of his most commonly read texts—Utilitarianism, On Liberty, A System of Logic, and Principles of Political Economy—I will refer to those works using natural divisions in his texts, such as chapter, section, and/or paragraph. Otherwise, I will refer to Mill’s works using pagination in his Collected Works. I refer to the following works, employing the associated abbreviations.

  • “Remarks on Bentham’s Philosophy” [“Remarks on Bentham”] (1833) [CW X]. CW pagination.
  • “Bentham” (1838) [CW X]. CW pagination.
  • A System of Logic [SL] (1843) [CW VII–VIII]. References by book, chapter, and section number.
  • Principles of Political Economy [PPE] (1848) [CW II–III]. References by book, chapter, and section number.
  • “Chapters on Socialism” (1850) [CW V]. CW pagination.
  • “Whewell on Moral Philosophy” (1852) [CW X]. CW pagination.
  • “Thoughts on Parliamentary Reform” (1859) [CW XIX]. CW pagination.
  • On Liberty [OL] (1859) [CW XVIII]. References by chapter and paragraph number.
  • Utilitarianism [U] (1861) [CW X]. References by chapter and paragraph number.
  • Considerations on Representative Government [CRG] (1861) [CW XIX]. CW pagination.
  • “August Comte and Positivism” (1865) [CW X]. CW pagination.
  • The Subjection of Women [SW] (1869) [CW XXI]. CW pagination.
  • Notes to James Mill, Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind [Notes], 2 vols., 2d ed., J.S. Mill, London: Longmans, 1869.
  • Autobiography (1873) [CW I]. CW pagination.

So, for instance, OL I 11 refers to paragraph 11 of chapter I in On Liberty and SL VI.xii.6 refers to book VI, chapter xii, section 6 of A System of Logic.


This is a very select bibliography of other primary and secondary work relevant to the study of Mill’s moral and political philosophy. It is selective, because Mill scholarship is voluminous and my knowledge of it is limited. While it does include those works I have found especially interesting or useful, it is not intended to be comprehensive.

  • Anderson, E., 1991, “John Stuart Mill and Experiments in Living,” reprinted in Lyons 1997: 123–48.
  • Annas, J., 1977, “Mill and the Subjection of Women,”Philosophy, 52: 179–94.
  • Archard, D., 1990, “Freedom Not to Be Free: The Case of the Slavery Contract in J.S. Mill’s On Liberty,” The Philosophical Quarterly, 40: 453–65.
  • Arneson, R., 1979, “Mill’s Doubts about Freedom under Socialism,” in Copp 1979: 231–49.
  • –––, 1980, “Mill versus Paternalism,”Ethics, 90: 470–89.
  • –––, 1982, “Democracy and Liberty in Mill’s Theory of Government,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 20: 43–64.
  • –––, 1989, “Paternalism, Utility, and Fairness,” reprinted in Dworkin 1997: 83–114.
  • Bain, A., 1882a, James Mill: A Biography, London: Thoemmes, 1995.
  • –––, 1882b, John Stuart Mill: A Criticism with Personal Recollections, London: Longmans.
  • Berger, F., 1984, Happiness, Justice and Freedom: The Moral and Political Philosophy of John Stuart Mill, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Bogen, J. and D. Farrell, 1978, “Freedom and Happiness in Mill’s Defence of Liberty,” Philosophical Quarterly, 28: 325–28.
  • Bradley, F.H., 1876, Ethical Studies, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Brink, D., 1992, “Mill’s Deliberative Utilitarianism,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 21: 67–103.
  • –––, 2001, “Millian Principles, Freedom of Expression, and Hate Speech,” Legal Theory, 7: 119–57.
  • –––, 2003, Perfectionism and the Common Good: Themes in the Philosophy of T.H. Green, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 2008, “Mill’s Liberal Principles and Freedom of Expression,” in Ten 2008, 40–61.
  • –––, 2010, “Mill’s Ambivalence about Rights,” Boston University Law Review, 90: 1669–1704.
  • –––, 2012, “Mill’s Ambivalence about Duty,” in Mill on Justice, L. Kahn (ed.), London: Palgrave.
  • –––, 2013, Mill’s Progressive Principles, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 2017, “Mill on Justice and Rights,” in A Companion to Mill, C. MacLeod and D. Miller (ed.), West Sussex: John Wiley & Sons.
  • Brown, D.G., 1972, “Mill on Liberty and Morality,” Philosophical Review, 81: 133–58.
  • –––, 1973, “What is Mill’s Principle of Utility?” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 3: 1–12 and reprinted in Lyons 1997: 9–24.
  • –––, 1974, “Mill’s Act-Utilitarianism,” Philosophical Quarterly, 24: 67–68 and reprinted in Lyons 1997: 25–28.
  • Capaldi, N., 2004, John Stuart Mill: A Biography, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Clarke, P., 1978, Liberals and Social Democrats, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Collini, S., 1979, Liberalism and Sociology: L.T. Hobhouse and Political Argument in England 1880–1914, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Copp, D. (ed.), 1979, New Essays on John Stuart Mill and Utilitarianism, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, Supp. Vol. V.
  • Crisp, R., 1997, Mill on Utilitarianism, London: Routledge.
  • Devlin, P., 1965, The Enforcement of Morals, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Donner, W., 1993, The Liberal Self: John Stuart Mill’s Moral and Political Philosophy, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Dworkin, G., 1972, “Paternalism,” reprinted in Dworkin 1997: 61–82.
  • ––– (ed.), 1997, Mill’s On Liberty: Critical Essays, Totowa, NJ: Roman and Littlefield.
  • Dworkin, R., 1977, Taking Rights Seriously, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Eggleston, B., D. Miller, and D. Weinstein (eds.), 2011, John Stuart Mill and the Art of Life, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Estlund, D, 2008, Democratic Authority, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Feinberg, J., 1984–88, The Moral Limits of the Criminal Law, 4 vols., New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 1985, Offense to Others, [vol. 2 of The Moral Limits of the Criminal Law], New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Feldman, F., 2004, Pleasure and the Good Life, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Gray, J., 1983, Mill on Liberty: A Defence, London: Routledge.
  • Green, T.H., 1883, Prolegomena to Ethics, D. Brink (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2003.
  • Habibi, D., 2017, “Mill on Colonialism,” in A Companion to Mill, C. MacLeod and D. Miller (ed.), West Sussex: John Wiley & Sons.
  • Hall, E., 1949, “The ‘Proof’ of Utility in Bentham and Mill,” Ethics, 60: 1–18.
  • Hare, R.M., 1981, Moral Thinking: Its Levels, Methods, and Point, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Hart, H.L.A., 1963, Law, Liberty, and Morality, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • –––, 1982, Essays on Bentham, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Himmelfarb, G., 1974, On Liberty and Liberalism: The Case of John Stuart Mill, New York: Knopf.
  • Hurka, T., 1993, Perfectionism, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Irwin, T., 2009, The Development of Ethics, vol. 3, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Jacobson, D., 2000, “Mill on Liberty, Speech, and the Free Society,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 29: 276–309.
  • –––, 2003, “J.S. Mill and the Diversity of Utilitarianism,” Philosophers’ Imprint, 3(2): 1–18. [Jacobson 2003 available online]
  • Kymlicka, W., 1989, Liberalism, Community, and Culture, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lewis, D., 1989, “Mill and Milquetoast,” reprinted in Dworkin 1997: 1–30.
  • Lively, J. and J. Rees (eds.), 1978, Utilitarian Logic and Politics, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Lovett, F., 2008, “Mill on Consensual Domination,” in Ten 2008, 123–37.
  • Lyons, D., 1965, The Forms and Limits of Utilitarianism, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1970, In the Interest of the Governed, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1977, “Human Rights and the General Welfare,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 6: 113–29 and reprinted in Lyons 1997: 29–44.
  • –––, 1980, “Utility as a Possible Ground of Rights,” Nous, 14: 17–28.
  • –––, 1979, “Liberty and Harm to Others,” reprinted in Dworkin 1997: 115–36.
  • –––, 1994, Rights, Welfare, and Mill’s Moral Theory, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • ––– (ed.), 1997, Mill’s Utilitarianism: Critical Essays, Totowa, NJ: Roman and Littlefield.
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Other Internet Resources


I would like to thank the Academic Senate of the University of California, San Diego for two summer grants which supported valuable research assistance from Kory Schaff and Charlie Kurth. In writing this essay, I am conscious of especially significant debts to Richard Arneson, Stephen Darwall, David Lyons, and the editors of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

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