Baron de Montesquieu, Charles-Louis de Secondat

First published Fri Jul 18, 2003; substantive revision Wed Apr 2, 2014

Montesquieu was one of the great political philosophers of the Enlightenment. Insatiably curious and mordantly funny, he constructed a naturalistic account of the various forms of government, and of the causes that made them what they were and that advanced or constrained their development. He used this account to explain how governments might be preserved from corruption. He saw despotism, in particular, as a standing danger for any government not already despotic, and argued that it could best be prevented by a system in which different bodies exercised legislative, executive, and judicial power, and in which all those bodies were bound by the rule of law. This theory of the separation of powers had an enormous impact on liberal political theory, and on the framers of the constitution of the United States of America.

1. Life

Charles-Louis de Secondat, Baron de La Brède et de Montesquieu, was born on January 19th, 1689 at La Brède, near Bordeaux, to a noble and prosperous family. He was educated at the Oratorian Collège de Juilly, received a law degree from the University of Bordeaux in 1708, and went to Paris to continue his legal studies. On the death of his father in 1713 he returned to La Brède to manage the estates he inherited, and in 1715 he married Jeanne de Lartigue, a practicing Protestant, with whom he had a son and two daughters. In 1716 he inherited from his uncle the title Baron de La Brède et de Montesquieu and the office of Président à Mortier in the Parlement of Bordeaux, which was at the time chiefly a judicial and administrative body. For the next eleven years he presided over the Tournelle, the Parlement's criminal division, in which capacity he heard legal proceedings, supervised prisons, and administered various punishments including torture. During this time he was also active in the Academy of Bordeaux, where he kept abreast of scientific developments, and gave papers on topics ranging from the causes of echoes to the motives that should lead us to pursue the sciences.

In 1721 Montesquieu published the Persian Letters, which was an instant success and made Montesquieu a literary celebrity. (He published the Persian Letters anonymously, but his authorship was an open secret.) He began to spend more time in Paris, where he frequented salons and acted on behalf of the Parlement and the Academy of Bordeaux. During this period he wrote several minor works: Dialogue de Sylla et d'Eucrate (1724), Réflexions sur la Monarchie Universelle (1724), and Le Temple de Gnide (1725). In 1725 he sold his life interest in his office and resigned from the Parlement. In 1728 he was elected to the Académie Française, despite some religious opposition, and shortly thereafter left France to travel abroad. After visiting Italy, Germany, Austria, and other countries, he went to England, where he lived for two years. He was greatly impressed with the English political system, and drew on his observations of it in his later work.

On his return to France in 1731, troubled by failing eyesight, Montesquieu returned to La Brède and began work on his masterpiece, The Spirit of the Laws. During this time he also wrote Considerations on the Causes of the Greatness of the Romans and of their Decline, which he published anonymously in 1734. In this book he tried to work out the application of his views to the particular case of Rome, and in so doing to discourage the use of Rome as a model for contemporary governments. Parts of Considerations were incorporated into The Spirit of the Laws, which he published in 1748. Like the Persian Letters, The Spirit of the Laws was both controversial and immensely successful. Two years later he published a Defense of the Spirit of the Laws to answer his various critics. Despite this effort, the Roman Catholic Church placed The Spirit of the Laws on the Index of Forbidden Books in 1751. In 1755, Montesquieu died of a fever in Paris, leaving behind an unfinished essay on taste for the Encyclopédie of Diderot and D'Alembert.

2. Major Works

Montesquieu's two most important works are the Persian Letters and The Spirit of the Laws. While these works share certain themes -- most notably a fascination with non-European societies and a horror of despotism -- they are quite different from one another, and will be treated separately.

3. The Persian Letters

The Persian Letters is an epistolary novel consisting of letters sent to and from two fictional Persians, Usbek and Rica, who set out for Europe in 1711 and remain there at least until 1720, when the novel ends. When Montesquieu wrote the Persian Letters, travellers' accounts of their journeys to hitherto unknown parts of the world, and of the peculiar customs they found there, were very popular in Europe. While Montesquieu was not the first writer to try to imagine how European culture might look to travellers from non-European countries, he used that device with particular brilliance.

Many of the letters are brief descriptions of scenes or characters. At first their humor derives mostly from the fact that Usbek and Rica misinterpret what they see. Thus, for instance, Rica writes that the Pope is a magician who can "make the king believe that three are only one, or else that the bread one eats is not bread, or that the wine one drinks is not wine, and a thousand other things of the same kind" (Letter 24); when Rica goes to the theater, he concludes that the spectators he sees in private boxes are actors enacting dramatic tableaux for the entertainment of the audience. In later letters, Usbek and Rica no longer misinterpret what they see; however, they find the actions of Europeans no less incomprehensible. They describe people who are so consumed by vanity that they become ridiculous, scholars whose concern for the minutiae of texts blinds them to the world around them, and a scientist who nearly freezes to death because lighting a fire in his room would interfere with his attempt to obtain exact measurements of its temperature.

Interspersed among these descriptive letters are the Persians' reflections on what they see. Usbek is particularly given to such musings, and he shares many of Montesquieu's own preoccupations: with the contrast between European and non-European societies, the advantages and disadvantages of different systems of government, the nature of political authority, and the proper role of law. He also seems to share many of Montesquieu's views. The best government, he says, is that "which attains its purpose with the least trouble", and "controls men in the manner best adapted to their inclinations and desires" (Letter 80). He notes that the French are moved by a love of honor to obey their king, and quotes approvingly the claim that this "makes a Frenchman, willingly and with pleasure, do things that your Sultan can only get out of his subjects by ceaseless exhortation with rewards and punishments" (Letter 89). While he is vividly aware of the importance of just laws, he regards legal reform as a dangerous task to be attempted "only in fear and trembling" (Letter 129). He favors religious toleration, and regards attempts to compel religious belief as both unwise and inhumane. In these reflections Usbek seems to be a thoughtful and enlightened observer with a deep commitment to justice.

However, one of the great themes of the Persian Letters is the virtual impossibility of self-knowledge, and Usbek is its most fully realized illustration. Usbek has left behind a harem in Persia, in which his wives are kept prisoner by eunuchs who are among his slaves. Both his wives and his slaves can be beaten, mutilated, or killed at his command, as can any outsider unfortunate enough to lay eyes on them. Usbek is, in other words, a despot in his home. From the outset he is tortured by the thought of his wives' infidelity. It is not, he writes, that he loves his wives, but that "from my very lack of feeling has come a secret jealousy which is devouring me" (Letter 6). As time goes on problems develop in the seraglio: Usbek's wives feud with each other, and the eunuchs find it increasingly difficult to keep order. Eventually discipline breaks down altogether; the Chief Eunuch reports this to Usbek and then abruptly dies. His replacement is clearly obedient not to Usbek but to his wives: he contrives not to receive any of Usbek's letters, and when a young man is found in the seraglio he writes: "I got up, examined the matter, and found that it was a vision" (Letter 149). Usbek orders another eunuch to restore order: "leave pity and tenderness behind. ... Make my seraglio what it was when I left it; but begin by expiation: exterminate the criminals, and strike dread into those who contemplated becoming so. There is nothing that you cannot hope to receive from your master for such an outstanding service" (Letter 153). His orders are obeyed, and "horror, darkness, and dread rule the seraglio" (Letter 156). Finally, Roxana, Usbek's favorite wife and the only one whose virtue he trusted, is found with another man; her lover is killed, and she commits suicide after writing Usbek a scathing letter in which she asks: "How could you have thought me credulous enough to imagine that I was in the world only in order to worship your caprices? that while you allowed yourself everything, you had the right to thwart all my desires? No: I may have lived in servitude, but I have always been free. I have amended your laws according to the laws of nature, and my mind has always remained independent" (Letter 161). With this letter the novel ends.

The Persian Letters is both one of the funniest books written by a major philosopher, and one of the bleakest. It presents both virtue and self-knowledge as almost unattainable. Almost all the Europeans in the Persian Letters are ridiculous; most of those who are not appear only to serve as a mouthpiece for Montesquieu's own views. Rica is amiable and good-natured, but this is largely due to the fact that, since he has no responsibilities, his virtue has never been seriously tested. For all Usbek's apparent enlightenment and humanity, he turns out to be a monster whose cruelty does not bring him happiness, as he himself recognizes even as he decides to inflict it. His eunuchs, unable to hope for either freedom or happiness, learn to enjoy tormenting their charges, and his wives, for the most part, profess love while plotting intrigues. The only admirable character in the novel is Roxana, but the social institutions of Persia make her life intolerable: she is separated from the man she loves and forced to live in slavery. Her suicide is presented as a noble act, but also as an indictment of the despotic institutions that make it necessary.

4. The Spirit of the Laws

Montesquieu's aim in The Spirit of the Laws is to explain human laws and social institutions. This might seem like an impossible project: unlike physical laws, which are, according to Montesquieu, instituted and sustained by God, positive laws and social institutions are created by fallible human beings who are "subject ... to ignorance and error, [and] hurried away by a thousand impetuous passions" (SL 1.1). One might therefore expect our laws and institutions to be no more comprehensible than any other catalog of human follies, an expectation which the extraordinary diversity of laws adopted by different societies would seem to confirm.

Nonetheless, Montesquieu believes that this apparent chaos is much more comprehensible than one might think. On his view, the key to understanding different laws and social systems is to recognize that they should be adapted to a variety of different factors, and cannot be properly understood unless one considers them in this light. Specifically, laws should be adapted "to the people for whom they are framed..., to the nature and principle of each government, ... to the climate of each country, to the quality of its soil, to its situation and extent, to the principal occupation of the natives, whether husbandmen, huntsmen or shepherds: they should have relation to the degree of liberty which the constitution will bear; to the religion of the inhabitants, to their inclinations, riches, numbers, commerce, manners, and customs. In fine, they have relations to each other, as also to their origin, to the intent of the legislator, and to the order of things on which they are established; in all of which different lights they ought to be considered" (SL 1.3). When we consider legal and social systems in relation to these various factors, Montesquieu believes, we will find that many laws and institutions that had seemed puzzling or even perverse are in fact quite comprehensible.

Understanding why we have the laws we do is important in itself. However, it also serves practical purposes. Most importantly, it will discourage misguided attempts at reform. Montesquieu is not a utopian, either by temperament or conviction. He believes that to live under a stable, non-despotic government that leaves its law-abiding citizens more or less free to live their lives is a great good, and that no such government should be lightly tampered with. If we understand our system of government, and the ways in which it is adapted to the conditions of our country and its people, we will see that many of its apparently irrational features actually make sense, and that to 'reform' these features would actually weaken it. Thus, for instance, one might think that a monarchical government would be strengthened by weakening the nobility, thereby giving more power to the monarch. On Montesquieu's view, this is false: to weaken those groups or institutions which check a monarch's power is to risk transforming monarchy into despotism, a form of government that is both abhorrent and unstable.

Understanding our laws will also help us to see which aspects of them are genuinely in need of reform, and how these reforms might be accomplished. For instance, Montesquieu believes that the laws of many countries can be made be more liberal and more humane, and that they can often be applied less arbitrarily, with less scope for the unpredictable and oppressive use of state power. Likewise, religious persecution and slavery can be abolished, and commerce can be encouraged. These reforms would generally strengthen monarchical governments, since they enhance the freedom and dignity of citizens. If lawmakers understand the relations between laws on the one hand and conditions of their countries and the principles of their governments on the other, they will be in a better position to carry out such reforms without undermining the governments they seek to improve.

4.1 Forms of Government

Montesquieu holds that there are three types of governments: republican governments, which can take either democratic or aristocratic forms; monarchies; and despotisms. Unlike, for instance, Aristotle, Montesquieu does not distinguish forms of government on the basis of the virtue of the sovereign. The distinction between monarchy and despotism, for instance, depends not on the virtue of the monarch, but on whether or not he governs "by fixed and established laws" (SL 2.1). Each form of government has a principle, a set of "human passions which set it in motion" (SL 3.1); and each can be corrupted if its principle is undermined or destroyed.

In a democracy, the people are sovereign. They may govern through ministers, or be advised by a senate, but they must have the power of choosing their ministers and senators for themselves. The principle of democracy is political virtue, by which Montesquieu means "the love of the laws and of our country" (SL 4.5), including its democratic constitution. The form of a democratic government makes the laws governing suffrage and voting fundamental. The need to protect its principle, however, imposes far more extensive requirements. On Montesquieu's view, the virtue required by a functioning democracy is not natural. It requires "a constant preference of public to private interest" (SL 4.5); it "limits ambition to the sole desire, to the sole happiness, of doing greater services to our country than the rest of our fellow citizens" (SL 5.3); and it "is a self-renunciation, which is ever arduous and painful" (SL 4.5). Montesquieu compares it to monks' love for their order: "their rule debars them from all those things by which the ordinary passions are fed; there remains therefore only this passion for the very rule that torments them. ... the more it curbs their inclinations, the more force it gives to the only passion left them" (SL 5.2). To produce this unnatural self-renunciation, "the whole power of education is required" (SL 4.5). A democracy must educate its citizens to identify their interests with the interests of their country, and should have censors to preserve its mores. It should seek to establish frugality by law, so as to prevent its citizens from being tempted to advance their own private interests at the expense of the public good; for the same reason, the laws by which property is transferred should aim to preserve an equal distribution of property among citizens. Its territory should be small, so that it is easy for citizens to identify with it, and more difficult for extensive private interests to emerge.

Democracies can be corrupted in two ways: by what Montesquieu calls "the spirit of inequality" and "the spirit of extreme equality" (SL 8.2). The spirit of inequality arises when citizens no longer identify their interests with the interests of their country, and therefore seek both to advance their own private interests at the expense of their fellow citizens, and to acquire political power over them. The spirit of extreme equality arises when the people are no longer content to be equal as citizens, but want to be equal in every respect. In a functioning democracy, the people choose magistrates to exercise executive power, and they respect and obey the magistrates they have chosen. If those magistrates forfeit their respect, they replace them. When the spirit of extreme equality takes root, however, the citizens neither respect nor obey any magistrate. They "want to manage everything themselves, to debate for the senate, to execute for the magistrate, and to decide for the judges" (SL 8.2). Eventually the government will cease to function, the last remnants of virtue will disappear, and democracy will be replaced by despotism.

In an aristocracy, one part of the people governs the rest. The principle of an aristocratic government is moderation, the virtue which leads those who govern in an aristocracy to restrain themselves both from oppressing the people and from trying to acquire excessive power over one another. In an aristocracy, the laws should be designed to instill and protect this spirit of moderation. To do so, they must do three things. First, the laws must prevent the nobility from abusing the people. The power of the nobility makes such abuse a standing temptation in an aristocracy; to avoid it, the laws should deny the nobility some powers, like the power to tax, which would make this temptation all but irresistible, and should try to foster responsible and moderate administration. Second, the laws should disguise as much as possible the difference between the nobility and the people, so that the people feel their lack of power as little as possible. Thus the nobility should have modest and simple manners, since if they do not attempt to distinguish themselves from the people "the people are apt to forget their subjection and weakness" (SL 5.8). Finally, the laws should try to ensure equality among the nobles themselves, and among noble families. When they fail to do so, the nobility will lose its spirit of moderation, and the government will be corrupted.

In a monarchy, one person governs "by fixed and established laws" (SL 2.1). According to Montesquieu, these laws "necessarily suppose the intermediate channels through which (the monarch's) power flows: for if there be only the momentary and capricious will of a single person to govern the state, nothing can be fixed, and, of course, there is no fundamental law" (SL 2.4). These 'intermediate channels' are such subordinate institutions as the nobility and an independent judiciary; and the laws of a monarchy should therefore be designed to preserve their power. The principle of monarchical government is honor. Unlike the virtue required by republican governments, the desire to win honor and distinction comes naturally to us. For this reason education has a less difficult task in a monarchy than in a republic: it need only heighten our ambitions and our sense of our own worth, provide us with an ideal of honor worth aspiring to, and cultivate in us the politeness needed to live with others whose sense of their worth matches our own. The chief task of the laws in a monarchy is to protect the subordinate institutions that distinguish monarchy from despotism. To this end, they should make it easy to preserve large estates undivided, protect the rights and privileges of the nobility, and promote the rule of law. They should also encourage the proliferation of distinctions and of rewards for honorable conduct, including luxuries.

A monarchy is corrupted when the monarch either destroys the subordinate institutions that constrain his will, or decides to rule arbitrarily, without regard to the basic laws of his country, or debases the honors at which his citizens might aim, so that "men are capable of being loaded at the very same time with infamy and with dignities" (SL 8.7). The first two forms of corruption destroy the checks on the sovereign's will that separate monarchy from despotism; the third severs the connection between honorable conduct and its proper rewards. In a functioning monarchy, personal ambition and a sense of honor work together. This is monarchy's great strength and the source of its extraordinary stability: whether its citizens act from genuine virtue, a sense of their own worth, a desire to serve their king, or personal ambition, they will be led to act in ways that serve their country. A monarch who rules arbitrarily, or who rewards servility and ignoble conduct instead of genuine honor, severs this connection and corrupts his government.

In despotic states "a single person directs everything by his own will and caprice" (SL 2.1). Without laws to check him, and with no need to attend to anyone who does not agree with him, a despot can do whatever he likes, however ill-advised or reprehensible. His subjects are no better than slaves, and he can dispose of them as he sees fit. The principle of despotism is fear. This fear is easily maintained, since the situation of a despot's subjects is genuinely terrifying. Education is unnecessary in a despotism; if it exists at all, it should be designed to debase the mind and break the spirit. Such ideas as honor and virtue should not occur to a despot's subjects, since "persons capable of setting a value on themselves would be likely to create disturbances. Fear must therefore depress their spirits, and extinguish even the least sense of ambition" (SL 3.9). Their "portion here, like that of beasts, is instinct, compliance, and punishment" (SL 3.10), and any higher aspirations should be brutally discouraged.

Montesquieu writes that "the principle of despotic government is subject to a continual corruption, because it is even in its nature corrupt" (SL 8.10). This is true in several senses. First, despotic governments undermine themselves. Because property is not secure in a despotic state, commerce will not flourish, and the state will be poor. The people must be kept in a state of fear by the threat of punishment; however, over time the punishments needed to keep them in line will tend to become more and more severe, until further threats lose their force. Most importantly, however, the despot's character is likely to prevent him from ruling effectively. Since a despot's every whim is granted, he "has no occasion to deliberate, to doubt, to reason; he has only to will" (SL 4.3). For this reason he is never forced to develop anything like intelligence, character, or resolution. Instead, he is "naturally lazy, voluptuous, and ignorant" (SL 2.5), and has no interest in actually governing his people. He will therefore choose a vizier to govern for him, and retire to his seraglio to pursue pleasure. In his absence, however, intrigues against him will multiply, especially since his rule is necessarily odious to his subjects, and since they have so little to lose if their plots against him fail. He cannot rely on his army to protect him, since the more power they have, the greater the likelihood that his generals will themselves try to seize power. For this reason the ruler in a despotic state has no more security than his people.

Second, monarchical and republican governments involve specific governmental structures, and require that their citizens have specific sorts of motivation. When these structures crumble, or these motivations fail, monarchical and republican governments are corrupted, and the result of their corruption is that they fall into despotism. But when a particular despotic government falls, it is not generally replaced by a monarchy or a republic. The creation of a stable monarchy or republic is extremely difficult: "a masterpiece of legislation, rarely produced by hazard, and seldom attained by prudence" (SL 5.14). It is particularly difficult when those who would have both to frame the laws of such a government and to live by them have previously been brutalized and degraded by despotism. Producing a despotic government, by contrast, is relatively straightforward. A despotism requires no powers to be carefully balanced against one another, no institutions to be created and maintained in existence, no complicated motivations to be fostered, and no restraints on power to be kept in place. One need only terrify one's fellow citizens enough to allow one to impose one's will on them; and this, Montesquieu claims, "is what every capacity may reach" (SL 5.14). For these reasons despotism necessarily stands in a different relation to corruption than other forms of government: while they are liable to corruption, despotism is its embodiment.

4.2 Liberty

Montesquieu is among the greatest philosophers of liberalism, but his is what Shklar has called "a liberalism of fear" (Shklar, Montesquieu, p. 89). According to Montesquieu, political liberty is "a tranquillity of mind arising from the opinion each person has of his safety" (SL 11.6). Liberty is not the freedom to do whatever we want: if we have the freedom to harm others, for instance, others will also have the freedom to harm us, and we will have no confidence in our own safety. Liberty involves living under laws that protect us from harm while leaving us free to do as much as possible, and that enable us to feel the greatest possible confidence that if we obey those laws, the power of the state will not be directed against us.

If it is to provide its citizens with the greatest possible liberty, a government must have certain features. First, since "constant experience shows us that every man invested with power is apt to abuse it ... it is necessary from the very nature of things that power should be a check to power" (SL 11.4). This is achieved through the separation of the executive, legislative, and judicial powers of government. If different persons or bodies exercise these powers, then each can check the others if they try to abuse their powers. But if one person or body holds several or all of these powers, then nothing prevents that person or body from acting tyrannically; and the people will have no confidence in their own security.

Certain arrangements make it easier for the three powers to check one another. Montesquieu argues that the legislative power alone should have the power to tax, since it can then deprive the executive of funding if the latter attempts to impose its will arbitrarily. Likewise, the executive power should have the right to veto acts of the legislature, and the legislature should be composed of two houses, each of which can prevent acts of the other from becoming law. The judiciary should be independent of both the legislature and the executive, and should restrict itself to applying the laws to particular cases in a fixed and consistent manner, so that "the judicial power, so terrible to mankind, … becomes, as it were, invisible", and people "fear the office, but not the magistrate" (SL 11.6).

Liberty also requires that the laws concern only threats to public order and security, since such laws will protect us from harm while leaving us free to do as many other things as possible. Thus, for instance, the laws should not concern offenses against God, since He does not require their protection. They should not prohibit what they do not need to prohibit: "all punishment which is not derived from necessity is tyrannical. The law is not a mere act of power; things in their own nature indifferent are not within its province" (SL 19.14). The laws should be constructed to make it as easy as possible for citizens to protect themselves from punishment by not committing crimes. They should not be vague, since if they were, we might never be sure whether or not some particular action was a crime. Nor should they prohibit things we might do inadvertently, like bumping into a statue of the emperor, or involuntarily, like doubting the wisdom of one of his decrees; if such actions were crimes, no amount of effort to abide by the laws of our country would justify confidence that we would succeed, and therefore we could never feel safe from criminal prosecution. Finally, the laws should make it as easy as possible for an innocent person to prove his or her innocence. They should concern outward conduct, not (for instance) our thoughts and dreams, since while we can try to prove that we did not perform some action, we cannot prove that we never had some thought. The laws should not criminalize conduct that is inherently hard to prove, like witchcraft; and lawmakers should be cautious when dealing with crimes like sodomy, which are typically not carried out in the presence of several witnesses, lest they "open a very wide door to calumny" (SL 12.6).

Montesquieu's emphasis on the connection between liberty and the details of the criminal law were unusual among his contemporaries, and inspired such later legal reformers as Cesare Beccaria.

4.3 Climate and Geography

Montequieu believes that climate and geography affect the temperaments and customs of a country's inhabitants. He is not a determinist, and does not believe that these influences are irresistible. Nonetheless, he believes that the laws should take these effects into account, accommodating them when necessary, and counteracting their worst effects.

According to Montesquieu, a cold climate constricts our bodies' fibers, and causes coarser juices to flow through them. Heat, by contrast, expands our fibers, and produces more rarefied juices. These physiological changes affect our characters. Those who live in cold climates are vigorous and bold, phlegmatic, frank, and not given to suspicion or cunning. They are relatively insensitive to pleasure and pain; Montesquieu writes that "you must flay a Muscovite alive to make him feel" (SL 14.2). Those who live in warm climates have stronger but less durable sensations. They are more fearful, more amorous, and more susceptible both to the temptations of pleasure and to real or imagined pain; but they are less resolute, and less capable of sustained or decisive action. The manners of those who live in temperate climates are "inconstant", since "the climate has not a quality determinate enough to fix them" (SL 14.2). These differences are not hereditary: if one moves from one sort of climate to another, one's temperament will alter accordingly.

A hot climate can make slavery comprehensible. Montesquieu writes that "the state of slavery is in its own nature bad" (SL 15.1); he is particularly contemptuous of religious and racist justifications for slavery. However, on his view, there are two types of country in which slavery, while not acceptable, is less bad than it might otherwise be. In despotic countries, the situation of slaves is not that different from the situation of the despot's other subjects; for this reason, slavery in a despotic country is "more tolerable" (SL 15.1) than in other countries. In unusually hot countries, it might be that "the excess of heat enervates the body, and renders men so slothful and dispirited that nothing but the fear of chastisement can oblige them to perform any laborious duty: slavery is there more reconcilable to reason" (SL 15.7). However, Montesquieu writes that when work can be done by freemen motivated by the hope of gain rather than by slaves motivated by fear, the former will always work better; and that in such climates slavery is not only wrong but imprudent. He hopes that "there is not that climate upon earth where the most laborious services might not with proper encouragement be performed by freemen" (SL 15.8); if there is no such climate, then slavery could never be justified on these grounds.

The quality of a country's soil also affects the form of its government. Monarchies are more common where the soil is fertile, and republics where it is barren. This is so for three reasons. First, those who live in fruitful countries are more apt to be content with their situation, and to value in a government not the liberty it bestows but its ability to provide them with enough security that they can get on with their farming. They are therefore more willing to accept a monarchy if it can provide such security. Often it can, since monarchies can respond to threats more quickly than republics. Second, fertile countries are both more desirable than barren countries and easier to conquer: they "are always of a level surface, where the inhabitants are unable to dispute against a stronger power; they are then obliged to submit; and when they have once submitted, the spirit of liberty cannot return; the wealth of the country is a pledge of their fidelity" (SL 18.2). Montesquieu believes that monarchies are much more likely than republics to wage wars of conquest, and therefore that a conquering power is likely to be a monarchy. Third, those who live where the soil is barren have to work hard in order to survive; this tends to make them "industrious, sober, inured to hardship, courageous, and fit for war" (SL 18.4). Those who inhabit fertile country, by contrast, favor "ease, effeminacy, and a certain fondness for the preservation of life" (SL 18.4). For this reason, the inhabitants of barren countries are better able to defend themselves from such attacks as might occur, and to defend their liberty against those who would destroy it.

These facts give barren countries advantages that compensate for the infertility of their soil. Since they are less likely to be invaded, they are less likely to be sacked and devastated; and they are more likely to be worked well, since "countries are not cultivated in proportion to their fertility, but to their liberty" (SL 18.3). This is why "the best provinces are most frequently depopulated, while the frightful countries of the North continue always inhabited, from their being almost uninhabitable" (SL 18.3).

Montesquieu believes that the climate and geography of Asia explain why despotism flourishes there. Asia, he thinks, has two features that distinguish it from Europe. First, Asia has virtually no temperate zone. While the mountains of Scandinavia shelter Europe from arctic winds, Asia has no such buffer; for this reason its frigid northern zone extends much further south than in Europe, and there is a relatively quick transition from it to the tropical south. For this reason "the warlike, brave, and active people touch immediately upon those who are indolent, effeminate and timorous; the one must, therefore, conquer, and the other be conquered" (SL 17.3). In Europe, by contrast, the climate changes gradually from cold to hot; therefore "strong nations are opposed to the strong; and those who join each other have nearly the same courage" (SL 17.3). Second, Asia has larger plains than Europe. Its mountain ranges lie further apart, and its rivers are not such formidable barriers to invasion. Since Europe is naturally divided into smaller regions, it is more difficult for any one power to conquer them all; this means that Europe will tend to have more and smaller states. Asia, by contrast, tends to have much larger empires, which predisposes it to despotism.

4.4 Commerce

Of all the ways in which a country might seek to enrich itself, Montesquieu believes, commerce is the only one without overwhelming drawbacks. Conquering and plundering one's neighbors can provide temporary infusions of money, but over time the costs of maintaining an occupying army and administering subjugated peoples impose strains that few countries can endure. Extracting precious metals from colonial mines leads to general inflation; thus the costs of extraction increase while the value of the extracted metals decreases. The increased availability of money furthers the development of commerce in other countries; however, in the country which extracts gold and silver, domestic industry is destroyed.

Commerce, by contrast, has no such disadvantages. It does not require vast armies, or the continued subjugation of other peoples. It does not undermine itself, as the extraction of gold from colonial mines does, and it rewards domestic industry. It therefore sustains itself, and nations which engage in it, over time. While it does not produce all the virtues -- hospitality, Montesquieu thinks, is more often found among the poor than among commercial peoples -- it does produce some: "the spirit of commerce is naturally attended with that of frugality, economy, moderation, labor, prudence, tranquility, order, and rule" (SL 5.6). In addition, it "is a cure for the most destructive prejudices" (SL 20.1), improves manners, and leads to peace among nations.

In monarchies, Montesquieu believes, the aim of commerce is, for the most part, to supply luxuries. In republics, it is to bring from one country what is wanted in another, "gaining little" but "gaining incessantly" (SL 20.4). In despotisms, there is very little commerce of any kind, since there is no security of property. In a monarchy, neither kings nor nobles should engage in commerce, since this would risk concentrating too much power in their hands. By the same token, there should be no banks in a monarchy, since a treasure "no sooner becomes great than it becomes the treasure of the prince" (SL 20.10). In republics, by contrast, banks are extremely useful, and anyone should be allowed to engage in trade. Restrictions on which profession a person can follow destroy people's hopes of bettering their situation; they are therefore appropriate only to despotic states.

While some mercantilists had argued that commerce is a zero-sum game in which when some gain, others necessarily lose, Montesquieu believes that commerce benefits all countries except those who have nothing but their land and what it produces. In those deeply impoverished countries, commerce with other countries will encourage those who own the land to oppress those who work it, rather than encouraging the development of domestic industries and manufacture. However, all other countries benefit by commerce, and should seek to trade with as many other nations as possible, "for it is competition which sets a just value on merchandise, and establishes the relation between them" (SL 20.9).

Montesquieu describes commerce as an activity that cannot be confined or controlled by any individual government or monarch. This, in his view, has always been true: "Commerce is sometimes destroyed by conquerors, sometimes cramped by monarchs; it traverses the earth, flies from the places where it is oppressed, and stays where it has liberty to breathe" (SL 21.5). However, the independence of commerce was greatly enhanced when, during the medieval period, Jews responded to persecution and the seizure of their property by inventing letters of exchange. "Commerce, by this method, became capable of eluding violence, and of maintaining everywhere its ground; the richest merchant having none but invisible effects, which he could convey imperceptibly wherever he pleased" (SL 21.20). This set in motion developments which made commerce still more independent of monarchs and their whims.

First, it facilitated the development of international markets, which place prices outside the control of governments. Money, according to Montesquieu, is "a sign which represents the value of all merchandise" (SL 22.2). The price of merchandise depends on the quantity of money and the quantity of merchandise, and on the amounts of money and merchandise that are in trade. Monarchs can affect this price by imposing tariffs or duties on certain goods. But since they cannot control the amounts of money and merchandise that are in trade within their own countries, let alone internationally, a monarch "can no more fix the price of merchandise than he can establish by a decree that the relation 1 has to 10 is equal to that of 1 to 20" (SL 22.7). If a monarch attempts to do so, he courts disaster: "Julian's lowering the price of provisions at Antioch was the cause of a most terrible famine" (SL 22.7).

Second, it permitted the development of international currency exchanges, which place the exchange rate of a country's currency largely outside the control of that country's government. A monarch can establish a currency, and stipulate how much of some metal each unit of that currency shall contain. However, monarchs cannot control the rates of exchange between their currencies and those of other countries. These rates depend on the relative scarcity of money in the countries in question, and they are "fixed by the general opinion of the merchants, never by the decrees of the prince" (SL 22.10). For this reason "the exchange of all places constantly tends to a certain proportion, and that in the very nature of things" (SL 22.10).

Finally, the development of international commerce gives governments a great incentive to adopt policies that favor, or at least do not impede, its development. Governments need to maintain confidence in their creditworthiness if they wish to borrow money; this deters them from at least the more extreme forms of fiscal irresponsibility, and from oppressing too greatly those citizens from whom they might later need to borrow money. Since the development of commerce requires the availability of loans, governments must establish interest rates high enough to encourage lending, but not so high as to make borrowing unprofitable. Taxes must not be so high that they deprive citizens of the hope of bettering their situations (SL 13.2), and the laws should allow those citizens enough freedom to carry out commercial affairs.

In general, Montesquieu believes that commerce has had an extremely beneficial influence on government. Since commerce began to recover after the development of letters of exchange and the reintroduction of lending at interest, he writes:

it became necessary that princes should govern with more prudence than they themselves could ever have imagined; for great exertions of authority were, in the event, found to be impolitic ... We begin to be cured of Machiavelism, and recover from it every day. More moderation has become necessary in the councils of princes. What would formerly have been called a master-stroke in politics would be now, independent of the horror it might occasion, the greatest imprudence. Happy is it for men that they are in a situation in which, though their passions prompt them to be wicked, it is, nevertheless, to their interest to be humane and virtuous. (SL 21.20)

4.5 Religion

Religion plays only a minor part in the Spirit of the Laws. God is described in Book 1 as creating nature and its laws; having done so, He vanishes, and plays no further explanatory role. In particular, Montesquieu does not explain the laws of any country by appeal to divine enlightenment, providence, or guidance. In the Spirit of the Laws, Montesquieu considers religions "in relation only to the good they produce in civil society" (SL 24.1), and not to their truth or falsity. He regards different religions as appropriate to different environments and forms of government. Protestantism is most suitable to republics, Catholicism to monarchies, and Islam to despotisms; the Islamic prohibition on eating pork is appropriate to Arabia, where hogs are scarce and contribute to disease, while in India, where cattle are badly needed but do not thrive, a prohibition on eating beef is suitable. Thus, "when Montezuma with so much obstinacy insisted that the religion of the Spaniards was good for their country, and his for Mexico, he did not assert an absurdity" (SL 24.24).

Religion can help to ameliorate the effects of bad laws and institutions; it is the only thing capable of serving as a check on despotic power. However, on Montesquieu's view it is generally a mistake to base civil laws on religious principles. Religion aims at the perfection of the individual; civil laws aim at the welfare of society. Given these different aims, what these two sets of laws should require will often differ; for this reason religion "ought not always to serve as a first principle to the civil laws" (SL 26.9). The civil laws are not an appropriate tool for enforcing religious norms of conduct: God has His own laws, and He is quite capable of enforcing them without our assistance. When we attempt to enforce God's laws for Him, or to cast ourselves as His protectors, we make our religion an instrument of fanaticism and oppression; this is a service neither to God nor to our country.

If several religions have gained adherents in a country, those religions should all be tolerated, not only by the state but by its citizens. The laws should "require from the several religions, not only that they shall not embroil the state, but that they shall not raise disturbances among themselves" (SL 25.9). While one can try to persuade people to change religions by offering them positive inducements to do so, attempts to force others to convert are ineffective and inhumane. In an unusually scathing passage, Montesquieu also argues that they are unworthy of Christianity, and writes: "if anyone in times to come shall dare to assert, that in the age in which we live, the people of Europe were civilized, you (the Inquisition) will be cited to prove that they were barbarians; and the idea they will have of you will be such as will dishonor your age, and spread hatred over all your contemporaries" (SL 25.13).


Works by Montesquieu

  • Œuvres Complètes, 2 volumes, Roger Callois (ed.), Paris: Editions Gallimard, 1949.
  • Persian Letters, C. J. Betts (trans.), Harmondsworth, UK: Penguin Books, 1973.
  • Considerations on the Causes of the Greatness of the Romans and Their Decline, David Lowenthal (trans.), Indianapolis: Hackett, 1999.
  • The Spirit of the Laws, Thomas Nugent (trans.), New York: MacMillan, 1949.


  • Shackleton, Robert, 1961, Montesquieu: A Critical Biography, London: Oxford University Press.
  • Kingston, Rebecca, 1996, Montesquieu and the Parlement of Bordeaux, Geneva: Librairie Droz.

Selected Secondary Literature

  • Althusser, Louis, 2007, Politics and History: Montesquieu, Rousseau, Marx, Ben Brewster (trans.), London: Verso.
  • Berlin, Isaiah, 2001, “Montesquieu”, in Against the Current, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Carrithers, D., Mosher, M., and Rahe, P. (eds.), 2001, Montesquieu's Science of Politics: Essays on The Spirit of the Laws, Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Cohler, Anne, 1988, Montesquieu's Comparative Politics and the Spirit of American Constitutionalism, Lawrence KS: University of Kansas Press.
  • Conroy, Peter, 1992, Montesquieu Revisited, New York: Twayne Publishers.
  • Cox, Iris, 1983, Montesquieu and the History of French Laws, Oxford: Voltaire Foundation at the Taylor Institution.
  • Durkheim, Emile, 1960, Montesquieu and Rouseau: Forerunners of Sociology, Ann Arbor: University of Michign Press.
  • Hulliung, Mark, 1976, Montesquieu and the Old Régime, Berkeley: University of California Press
  • Keohane, Nannerl, 1980, Philosophy and the State in France: The Renaissance to the Enlightenment, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Krause, Sharon, 1999, “The Politics of Distinction and Disobedience: Honor and the Defense of Liberty in Montesquieu”, Polity, 31 (3): 469-499.
  • Oakeshott, Michael, 1993, “The Investigation of the ‘Character’ of Modern Politics”, in Morality and Politics in Modern Europe: The Harvard Lectures, Shirley Letwin (ed.), New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Pangle, Thomas, 1973, Montesquieu's Philosophy of Liberalism: A Commentary on The Spirit of the Laws, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Rahe, Paul, 2009, Montesquieu and the Logic of Liberty, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Schaub, Diana, 1995, Erotic Liberalism: Women and Revolution in Montesquieu's Persian Letters, Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Shackleton, Robert, 1988, Essays on Montesquieu and the Enlightenment, David Gilman and Martin Smith (eds.), Oxford: Voltaire Foundation at the Taylor Institution.
  • Shklar, Judith, 1987, Montesquieu, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Shklar, Judith, 1998, “Montesquieu and the New Republicanism”, in Political Thought and Political Thinkers, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Other Internet Resources

  • Helvetius' Response to The Spirit of the Laws, maintained by The Library of Economics and Liberty and Liberty Fund, Inc., a private, educational foundation established to encourage the study of the ideal of a society of free and responsible individuals.
  • Condorcet's Response to The Spirit of the Laws, maintained by The Library of Economics and Liberty and Liberty Fund, Inc., a private, educational foundation established to encourage the study of the ideal of a society of free and responsible individuals.

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