First published Mon Jun 19, 2006; substantive revision Wed Jun 29, 2022

In political theory and philosophy, the term ‘republicanism’ is generally used in two different, but closely related, senses. In the first sense, republicanism refers to a loose tradition or family of writers in the history of western political thought, including especially: Machiavelli and his fifteenth-century Italian predecessors; the English republicans Milton, Harrington, Sidney, and others; Montesquieu and Blackstone; the eighteenth-century English commonwealthmen; and many Americans of the founding era such as Jefferson, Madison, and Adams. The writers in this tradition emphasize many common ideas and concerns, such as the importance of civic virtue and political participation, the dangers of corruption, the benefits of a mixed constitution and the rule of law, etc.; and it is characteristic of their rhetorical style to draw heavily on classical examples—from Cicero and the Latin historians especially—in presenting their arguments. In light of the last point, this is sometimes referred to as the ‘classical republican’ or ‘neo-roman’ tradition in political thought.

Beyond this brief sketch, there exists considerable historiographical controversy—with respect to who the tradition’s members are, and their relative significance; with respect to how we should interpret its underlying philosophical commitments; and with respect to its role (especially vis-à-vis liberalism) in the historical development of modern political thought. This brings us to the second sense of the term ‘republicanism’. In contemporary political theory and philosophy, it most often refers to a specific (and still contested) interpretation of the classical republican tradition, associated especially with the work of Quentin Skinner; together with a research program dedicated to developing insights from this tradition into an attractive contemporary political doctrine, associated especially with the work of Philip Pettit. According to republicans in this second sense (sometimes called ‘civic republicans’ or ‘neo-republicans’), the paramount republican value is political liberty, understood as non-domination or independence from arbitrary power. This entry will primarily discuss republicanism in this second sense.

In their interpretation of the classical republicanism tradition, civic republicans are often in debate with civic humanists, with whom they are often confused (see the entry on civic humanism). Developed as a contemporary political doctrine, civic republicanism is broadly speaking progressive and liberal, but not without important distinctive features. Some of its policy implications diverge from mainstream liberalism in particular ways, and for this reason civic republicans are sometimes also confused with communitarians (see the entry on communitarianism). For the strengths or weakness of civic republicanism to be fairly assessed, both confusions should be assiduously avoided.

1. Political Liberty as Non-Domination

Absolutely central to the contemporary civic republican program is the conception of political liberty as non-domination or independence from arbitrary power, and so it makes good sense to begin with an explication of this idea.

1.1 Political Liberty, Positive and Negative

It is notorious that there are several competing conceptions of political liberty. The now standard account was laid down most influentially by Isaiah Berlin in his famous lecture on “Two Concepts of Liberty” (Berlin 1969). According to the first, ‘negative’ conception of liberty, people are free simply to the extent that their choices are not interfered with. There are many variations on this conception, depending on how exactly one wants to define ‘interference’, but they all have in common the basic intuition that to be free is, more or less, to be left alone to do whatever one chooses. This idea of negative liberty Berlin associates especially with the classic English political philosophers Hobbes, Bentham, and J. S. Mill, and it is today probably the dominant conception of liberty, particularly among contemporary Anglo-American philosophers. In Mill’s well-known words, “the only freedom which deserves the name, is that of pursuing our own good in our own way, so long as we do not attempt to deprive others of theirs” (1859, 17).

The second, ‘positive’ conception of liberty is not quite so easy to define. Roughly speaking, a person or group is free in the positive sense to the extent that they exercise self-control or self-mastery. It is not agreed, however, what exactly constitutes this self-mastery in the relevant sense. According to one influential account, to be free in the positive sense is to be able to act on one’s second-order desires (Frankfurt 1982). For example, the addicted gambler may be free in the negative sense not to gamble—since no one actually forces him to do so—, but he is not free in the positive sense unless he actually succeeds in acting on his presumed second-order desire not to desire gambling. Berlin associates this second conception especially with such continental philosophers as Spinoza, Rousseau, and Hegel. Although it found some support among English Hegelians like T. H. Green, those who advocate the positive conception of liberty have generally been in the minority, particularly among contemporary Anglo-American philosophers.

The troubling implications of the positive conception of liberty are well-known, and need not be rehearsed at length here. For the most part, these stem from the problem that freedom in the positive sense would seem to license fairly extensive coercion on behalf of individuals’ allegedly ‘real’ interests—for example, coercively forcing the gambler to quit on the presumption that this is, in fact, what he really wants to do even if he doesn’t say so. Regarding this danger, Berlin writes:

It is one thing to say that I may be coerced for my own good which I am too blind to see: this may, on occasion, be for my benefit …. [But] it is another to say that if it is my good, then I am not being coerced, for I have willed it, whether I know this or not, and am free (or ‘truly’ free) even when my poor earthly body and foolish mind bitterly reject it, and struggle against those who seek however benevolently to impose it …. (1969, 134)

Liberals like Berlin have thus understandably rejected the positive and embraced the negative conception of liberty. The question remains, however, whether the received view of negative liberty as non-interference in particular adequately captures the political ideal we should be most interested in. Contemporary civic republicans argue that it does not.

1.2 Liberty as Non-Domination

By way of illustration, consider the following scenarios (both are standard examples in the republican tradition). In the first, imagine a group of slaves with a generally well-meaning master. While the latter has an institutionally-protected right to treat his slaves more or less as he pleases (he might start whipping them just for the heck of it, say), let us suppose that this master in particular leaves his slaves for the most part alone. Now to the extent that he does not in fact interfere with his slaves on a day-to-day basis, we are committed to saying—on the non-interference view of liberty—that they enjoy some measure of freedom. Some find this conclusion deeply counterintuitive: if there is anything to the idea of political liberty, one might think, surely it cannot be found in the condition of slavery!

Even if we are willing to accept this conclusion, the non-interference view of liberty commits us to others that are perhaps even more paradoxical. For one thing, notice that we are committed to saying that the slaves of our well-meaning master enjoy greater freedom than the slaves of an abusive master down the road. Of course, the former slaves are better off in some respect than the latter, but do we really want to say that they are more free? For another, consider the slave who, over time, comes to understand his master’s psychological dispositions better and better. Taking advantage of this improved insight, he manages to keep on his master’s good side, and is consequently interfered with less and less. Thus, on the non-interference view of liberty, we are committed to saying that his freedom is increasing over time. Again, while it is clear that the slave’s greater psychological insight improves his well-being in some respect, do we really want to say that it increases his freedom specifically?

Now consider a second scenario. Imagine the colony of a great imperial power. Suppose that the colonial subjects have no political rights, and thus that the imperial power governs them unilaterally. But further suppose that the imperial power, for one reason or another, chooses not to exercise the full measure of its authority—that its policy towards the colony is one of more or less benign neglect. From the point of view of liberty as non-interference, we must conclude that the colonial subjects enjoy considerable freedom with respect to their government for, on a day-to-day basis, their government hardly ever interferes with them. Next suppose that the colonial subjects revolt with success, and achieve political independence. The former colony is now self-governing. We may imagine, however, that the new government is somewhat more active than its imperial predecessor, passing laws and instituting policies that interfere with people’s lives to a greater extent than formerly was the case. On the view of liberty as non-interference, we must therefore say that there has been a decline in freedom with independence. As in the first scenario, many find this counterintuitive. Surely, a nation that has secured its independence from colonial rule must have increased its political liberty.

What these examples are driving at is that political liberty might best be understood as a sort of structural relationship that exists between persons or groups, rather than as a contingent pattern on outcomes. Whether a master chooses to whip his slave on any given day, we might say, is a contingent outcome: it all depends on the master’s mood, the slave’s behavior, and so forth. What is not contingent (or at least not in the same way) is the broader configuration of laws, institutions, and norms that effectively permit masters to treat their slaves however they please. As the ex-slave Frederick Douglass said of his former condition, “it was slavery—not its mere incidents—that I hated” (1855, 161).

The republican conception of political liberty aims to capture this insight as directly as possible. It defines freedom as a sort of structural independence—as the condition of not being subject to the arbitrary or uncontrolled power of a master. Pettit, who has done more than anyone else to develop this republican conception of freedom philosophically, puts it thus: a person or group enjoys freedom to the extent that no other person or group has “the capacity to interfere in their affairs on an arbitrary basis” (1999, 165; cf. Pettit 1997, 2001, 2012, 2014). On a plausible rendering of the term ‘domination’ as, roughly speaking, arbitrary or uncontrolled power (see Wartenberg 1990; Pettit 1997, 2012; Lovett 2010, 2018), we might equivalently say that freedom in the republican sense consists in the secure enjoyment of non-domination. This view has since been widely embraced by republican-minded authors such as Skinner (1998, 2002, 2008), Viroli (2002), Maynor (2003, 2015), Laborde (2008, 2010), Costa (2009, 2013, 2016), Honohan (2013, 2014), Taylor (2017), and O’Shea (2019).

1.3 Republican versus Negative Liberty

Notice that the republican view of freedom is, at least in the broad sense, a negative conception of political liberty. One need not do or become anything in particular to enjoy political liberty in the republican sense; one need not exercise self-mastery, on any view of what that entails, nor succeed in acting on one’s second-order desires (Skinner 1984, 1991, 2002; Spitz 1993). Republican freedom merely requires the absence of something, namely, the absence of any structural dependence on arbitrary power or domination. (Also like non-interference, non-domination comes in degrees: on the civic republican view, one is not either free or unfree, but rather more or less free depending on the extent of non-domination one securely enjoys.)

Despite these similarities, however, republican freedom is not equivalent to the received view of negative liberty as non-interference. In contrast to the non-interference view, it easily accounts for our intuitions in the two scenarios described above. The slave lacks freedom because he is vulnerable to the arbitrary power of his master; whether his master happens to exercise that power is neither here nor there. Likewise, what matters with respect to political freedom on the republican view is not how much the imperial power chooses to govern its colony, but the fact that the former may choose to govern the latter as much and however it likes. Thus Joseph Priestley described the lightly-governed American colonies as nevertheless in a condition of servitude because “by the same power, by which the people of England can compel them to pay one penny, they may compel them to pay the last penny they have” (1769, 140).

Moreover, the republican conception captures in a more intuitively satisfying way what would improve either situation with respect to political liberty. Most people are not inclined to say that slaves enjoy increasing freedom just because, with experience, they improve their insight into their master’s psychological dispositions. But many would be inclined to say that their freedom is enhanced, other things being equal, if some effective reform in the laws, institutions, or norms sharply reduced their master’s authority over them. (This is not necessarily to say that the slaves will enjoy greater well-being, all things considered—only that because their domination is lessened, they enjoy greater freedom to that extent.) And of course, no matter how benevolent their particular master happens to be, no slave can be completely free until the institution of slavery itself is abolished.

Political freedom, in other words, is constituted by rightly-ordered laws, institutions, and norms: “to enjoy such non-domination, after all, is just to be in a position where no one can interfere arbitrarily in your affairs,” writes Pettit, “and you are in that position from the moment that the institutions are in place” inhibiting possible arbitrary interference (1997, 107). Political freedom is most fully realized, on this view, in a well-ordered self-governing republic of equal citizens under the rule of law, where no one citizen is the master of any other (Pettit 1989, 1997, 2012, 2014; Skinner 1991, 1998; Spitz 1993, 1995; Viroli 2002; Maynor 2003; Lovett 2022). In the classic expression of James Harrington, such a community would be an “empire of laws and not of men” (1656, 8).

2. Republican Liberty: Problems and Debates

The appeal of the republican conception of political liberty as independence from the arbitrary power of a master is perhaps understandable. This is not to say, however, that this conception is uncontroversial. Before discussing its role in developing contemporary civic republican arguments, we should consider various problems and debates surrounding the republican idea of freedom.

2.1 What about non-interference?

A common objection to the republican idea of freedom is that it fails to pick out an distinct conception at all. The suggestion here, first noted perhaps by Paley (1785), is that talking about non-domination is really just another (more obscure) way of talking about security of non-interference (Goodin 2003; Carter 2008; Kramer 2008). Contemporary civic republicans must reject this view. Pettit (1997, 73–4) observes that one might secure a low expected level of non-interference in more than one way, and the republican idea of freedom is by no means indifferent as to the method adopted. For example, to have a master with an exceptionally benevolent disposition is to be reasonably secure in one’s expectation that one will not often be adversely interfered with—but it is to have a master nonetheless. The republican idea of freedom specifically instructs us not to make our master a better person (the goal of the old ‘mirror for princes’ literature), but to render him less of a master (Lovett 2012b). This can only be done by curbing either his arbitrary power or his subjects’ dependency on him.

Supposing then that non-domination and non-interference are indeed distinct ideas, one might wonder where this leaves the latter, on the civic republican view of things. Is obtaining freedom from arbitrary power the only thing we should care about? Roughly speaking, there are three possible answers civic republicans might give to this question.

The first is simply to answer yes. It was a mistake, one might argue, to ever think non-interference important or desirable in itself. Of course, as a contingent empirical fact, extensive arbitrary power often brings extensive interferences in train (slave masters and absolute monarchs just can’t help meddling in their subjects’ affairs, we might suppose), so it is understandable that our distaste for the former should influence our assessment of the latter. There are good reasons for rejecting this first answer, however. Imagine living in a community where our lives are regulated down to the tiniest detail, but always in strict accordance with commonly-known, non-arbitrary rules and procedures. Although we enjoy extensive freedom from arbitrary power, we have hardly any freedom of individual choice. Most would not want to live in such a community, and this suggests that we do indeed place some independent value on non-interference (Larmore 2001; Wall 2001).

This leaves two other possible answers. On the one hand, we might try to incorporate some measure of non-interference into our idea of freedom as non-domination. Something like this approach was initially taken by Pettit (1997, 74–7): there he distinguished between factors that “compromise” liberty, and factors that “condition” it. Perhaps my republican freedom is compromised when someone gains arbitrary power over me, but it is merely conditioned when I lack the means or opportunities to make full use of it, and interferences might be one such conditioning factor. On the other hand, we might allow that republican freedom and non-interference are distinct goods, but hold that both are valuable in some degree. We might either regard them as having roughly equal value (Skinner 1998), or we might regard republican liberty as having greater importance than non-interference, other things equal (Viroli 2002, Pettit 2012). Each of these options has its advantages and disadvantages, and there is no settled view in the contemporary civic republican literature on this point (see Lovett 2018). 

2.2 What Counts as ‘Arbitrary’ Power?

A second major difficulty in developing the republican idea of freedom lies in giving precise meaning to the notion of arbitrariness. According to what criteria are we to consider power ‘arbitrary’? Not simply when its exercise is random or unpredictable. This view would undermine the whole point of the republican conception of political liberty. As discussed above, with long experience a slave is better able to predict his master’s behavior, and so it appears less random to him, but (the civic republican wants to argue) the slave does not enjoy greater freedom by that fact alone. Just because one is better able to cope with arbitrary power, it does not follow that one’s domination is any less.

‘Discretionary’ is much closer to the relevant meaning of arbitrary, but it is not quite right either. Discretionary power might be delegated to a public agency with a view to advancing certain policy goals or ends—as for example Congress has delegated discretionary authority to the Federal Reserve—but we would not want to say that this reduces our freedom (or, at any rate, not so long as that discretionary authority is appropriately answerable to a common knowledge understanding of the goals or ends it is meant to serve and the means it is permitted to employ). For reasons explained in the fourth section of this entry, contemporary civic republicans must be able to offer an account of non-arbitrary, yet discretionary authority.

How then should we characterize arbitrary power? Broadly speaking, two answers have been proposed. The first defines non-arbitrariness procedurally. Power is not arbitrary, on this view, to the extent that it is reliably controlled by effective rules, procedures, or goals that are common knowledge to all persons or groups concerned (Lovett 2010, 2022). To be reliable and effective, on this view, constraints must be resilient over a wide range of possible changes or modifications in the relevant circumstances. Roughly speaking, the procedural view equates republican freedom with the traditional idea of the rule of law, provided we are willing to extend the latter idea considerably (List 2006; Lovett 2016a).

Alternatively, we might define non-arbitrariness democratically. Power is not arbitrary, on this second view, to the extent that it is directly or indirectly controlled by the concerned persons or groups themselves. In an example offered by Pettit (2012, 57–58), suppose Andrea has given Bob the keys to her alcohol cupboard, with strict instructions that no matter how much she pleads, he is not to return them except on twenty-four hours notice. Since Bob must answer to Andrea for his conduct in this regard, his power over her is not arbitrary. In roughly the same way, the power of the state over its citizens will not be arbitrary provided the people have an equal share in controlling how their state exercises its power. Many authors subscribe to some version of this democratic view (see for example Bohman 2008; Laborde 2008; Forst 2013; McCammon 2015).

Either way, two caveats are worth noting. The first is that, on either view, arbitrariness simply means uncontrolled and vice versa. Pettit’s recent preference for the latter term over the former (e.g., Pettit 2012, 2014) is simply due to its superior clarity, and represents neither a real change in view nor the addition of a new condition alongside the old. The second caveat is that, again on either view, arbitrary or uncontrolled power should not be defined along substantive lines as power that is unjust or illegitimate. This was never Pettit’s view, though in earlier work (e.g., Pettit 1997) some passages may have inadvertently suggested otherwise. The well-known problem with a moralized definition of arbitrariness is that it would collapse our conception of republican freedom into a general account of the human good (Larmore 2001; Costa 2007; Carter 2008).

2.3 Republican Freedom and the Human Good

So far we have assumed that, however ultimately defined, republican freedom is always a good thing. Some have wondered whether this is the case, however. This objection is most often expressed via the example of benevolent care-giving relationships. On the republican view that one enjoys freedom only to the extent that one is independent from arbitrary power, it would seem that children do not enjoy republican freedom with respect to their parents. But surely, one might suppose, the parent-child relationship is (in most cases) an extremely valuable one, and so we would not want greater republican freedom in such a context. Republican freedom is, perhaps, not always a good thing (Ferejohn 2001).

As stated, this objection rests on a conceptual error, though (as we shall see) it points to an important set of issues as yet under-developed in the contemporary civic republican literature. The error in the above example stems from our confusing the overall evaluation of a whole with an evaluation of its parts considered separately. It is undeniable that, at least in the ordinary course of things, parent-child relationships are extremely valuable, considered as a whole; it does not follow from this, however, that the relationship is necessarily valuable in each and every part. For the objection to hold, it must be the case—not only that the parent-child relationship is valuable overall—but further, that that it would actually be worse if, holding all its other features constant, it involved less arbitrary power. But this is highly doubtful. Clearly, the introduction of children’s rights into western law was a boon, precisely because it reduced the degree of arbitrary power to which children are inevitably subject (which is to say, because it increased their republican freedom). That their republican freedom cannot be increased still further, perhaps, without destroying family life altogether, and thus losing its many other benefits, is neither here nor there.

What consideration of this faulty objection does reveal, however, is that republican freedom is simply one good among others, with which it might come into conflict (Markell 2008). The challenge for contemporary civic republicans, therefore, is less to show why non-domination is an important human good (for which there are plenty of good arguments in the literature: see Pettit 1997; Maynor 2003; Laborde 2008; Gädeke 2020), but rather to show how it fits into a broader moral framework, and specifically, the comparative weight we should assign to republican freedom vis-à-vis other important goods in the achievement of human flourishing (or, if non-domination is regarded as a deontological side-constraint, as suggested by Forst 2013, its relative priority vis-à-vis other side-constraints). Pettit (2005, 2014) sketches a case for the relative priority of republican liberty on more or less pragmatic grounds: roughly speaking, he argues that political doctrines will be most effective when they concentrate on as few core values as possible, and accordingly that the best values to concentrate on are those whose promotion will service as wide a range of needs as possible. Republican freedom is just such a good, he claims, insofar as our efforts to promote it will necessarily have far-reaching beneficial consequences. It will be more clear why this might be so in light of the discussion in part four below, but regardless there remains considerable work to be done developing the foundations of republican theory.

3. The Classical Republican Tradition

After long-standing neglect among historians of political thought, there has been a dramatic revival of interest in the classical republican tradition in the past fifty years or so. For the first few decades of this revival, a particular interpretation of that tradition prevailed. According to this view, the classical republicans held what would now be described as a perfectionist political philosophy—that is, a political philosophy centered on the idea of promoting a specific conception of the good life as consisting in active citizenship and healthy civic virtue on the one hand, while combating any sort of corruption that would undermine these values on the other. This distinctive vision of the good life is supposed to be rooted in the experience of the ancient Greek polis, especially as expressed in the writings of Aristotle. The goods of active political participation, civic virtue, and so on, are to be understood as intrinsically valuable components of human flourishing.

It is now standard to refer to this as the ‘civic humanist’ interpretation of the classical republican tradition, and it is most commonly associated with the writings of Arendt (1958, 1963), Pocock (1975, 1981), and Rahe (1992). These and other civic humanist writings have left such an impression on the field that even today many fail to distinguish their views from those of the civic republicans. As we shall see, however, the two are importantly distinct.

3.1 The Instrumental Turn

Beginning with Skinner (1984), Sunstein (1988), and Pettit (1989), an alternative interpretation of the tradition began to emerge. Undoubtedly, the classical republicans were committed to the importance of active political participation, civic virtue, combating corruption, and so forth. But rather than viewing these as intrinsically valuable components of a particular vision of the good life, these authors argued, they should instead be viewed as instrumentally useful tools for securing and preserving political liberty, understood as independence from arbitrary rule. Republicanism, on this view, has its roots not in an Aristotelian vision of the ancient Greek polis, but rather in Roman jurisprudence with its fundamental and categorical distinction between free men and citizens on the one hand, and dependent slaves on the other. This instrumental or ‘neo-Roman’ interpretation of the tradition was cemented in major contributions by Spitz (1995), Pettit (1997), Dagger (1997), and Skinner (1998).

There now exists a considerable historiographical literature advancing this new interpretation, including studies of Machiavelli (Skinner 1983, 1984; Viroli 1998), the seventeenth-century English republicans (Dzelzainis 1995; Skinner 1998, 2000; Lovett 2005, 2012a, 2020); Rousseau (Viroli 1998); many Americans of the founding era (Sellers 1994); Wollstonecraft (Coffee 2012; Halldenius 2015); some of the French revolutionaries (Hammersley (2010); and the nineteenth-century American labor republicans (Gourevitch 2015). These and other contemporary civic republicans argue that a careful reading of the classical republican texts firmly rejects the perfectionist interpretation favored by civic humanists.

Moreover, the instrumental turn was vital to establishing interest in republicanism as a viable contemporary political doctrine. The difficulty with civic humanism, as many critics have pointed out, is that a perfectionist vision of human flourishing through active political virtue is out of step with modern political and social conditions. There is simply no hope for recreating the experience of the Greek polis in economically complex mass democracies characterized by reasonable pluralism (Herzog 1986; Goodin 2003; Brennan and Lomasky 2006). This objection is removed, however, if we regard civic virtue instrumentally, as merely one tool among others for securing political liberty. Insofar as republicans are willing to use that tool, and thus willing to support public policies designed to deliberately cultivate civic virtue, they must perhaps reject stronger doctrines of liberal neutrality; but they will nevertheless be happy to endorse broad principles of toleration (Honohan 2013; Lovett and Whitfield 2016). Thus properly understood, republicanism is fully “compatible with modern pluralistic forms of society” (Pettit 1997, 8).

3.2 Republicanism and Liberalism

The contemporary civic republican interpretation carries with it what could be seen as a significant drawback, namely, that it reduces the distance between classical republicanism and the mainstream liberal tradition. At one level, this should surprise no one. After all, classical republicans and classical liberals shared many political commitments (constitutionalism and the rule of law, for example), and many figures are regarded as central to both traditions (Montesquieu, for example). The difficulty arises, however, from the suggestion that on the new instrumental interpretation, republicanism for all intents and purposes collapses into liberalism (Patten 1996; Larmore 2001). Indeed, at one point in his Political Liberalism, Rawls explicitly states that his theory has “no fundamental opposition” with a non-perfectionist, instrumental interpretation of republicanism (1993, 205). What then is the advantage of civic republicanism over mainstream liberalism (Herzog 1986; Goodin 2003; Brennan and Lomasky 2006)?

The standard reply among contemporary civic republicans is to argue that there is indeed a connection between republicanism and liberalism, but that liberalism is “an impoverished or incoherent republicanism” (Viroli 2002, 61)—a bastard offshoot, so to speak, of what was originally a considerably more appealing political philosophy. The republican critique of liberalism is thus best understood as a critique of various problematic tendencies that developed within the liberal tradition as it increasingly diverged from its republican roots.

The most important of these is the tendency in the liberal tradition, especially beginning with Bentham, Paley, and Constant, to displace the robust conception of liberty as independence from arbitrary or uncontrolled power with a weaker conception of liberty as non-interference. The significance of this substitution will be easier to assess after the discussion below, but in the main it comes down to this: because republican liberty is inherently incompatible with any form of dependency or mastery, its social implications are considerably more radical than those of mere negative liberty. This is precisely why many liberal authors took pains to distance themselves from republicanism in the first place, as they openly admitted: “those definitions of liberty ought to be rejected, which, by making that essential to civil freedom which is unattainable in experience, inflame expectations that can never be gratified,” observed Paley (1785, 315; cf. Pettit 1997).

What is more, on the view of liberty as non-interference, any sort of public law or policy intervention will count as an interference and, ergo, as a reduction in freedom. Liberals committed to the received view of negative liberty will thus tend to be overly hostile to government action (Pettit 1997, 2009). On the republican view, by contrast, public laws or policy interventions need not always count as reductions in freedom. Provided the law or policy is adopted and implemented in an appropriately non-arbitrary manner, the citizens’ freedom remains untouched. Indeed, if the law or policy ameliorates dependency, or curtails the arbitrary powers some in the community exercise over others, freedom may be enhanced. In the classical tradition, this idea was often expressed as the claim that, in the words of Blackstone, “laws, when prudently framed, are by no means subversive but rather introductive of liberty” and thus “where there is no law, there is no freedom” (1765, 122). The grounds for this claim will be explained further below.

4. The Contemporary Republican Program

However interesting the debates discussed in the previous section, one may still wonder whether republicanism has anything valuable to contribute to contemporary normative political theory and philosophy. One reason many people remain skeptical has to do with the fact that the classical republican writings often express views that are decidedly elitist, patriarchal, and militaristic. How could the basis for an appealing contemporary political program be found in such writings (Goldsmith 2000; Maddox 2002; Goodin 2003; McCormick 2003)?

That the classical republicans often expressed these very unappealing views is not disputed. But what are we to make of this fact? There are two possibilities. On the one hand, the parochialism of the classical republicans might reflect logical consequences of their core value commitments, in which case we cannot adopt the latter without taking on board the former. On the other hand, it might merely reflect the accidental prejudices of their day, in which case it can easily be dispensed with as we modernize the republican program. Now according to the civic humanist reading of the tradition, the classical republicans were committed to a perfectionist conception of the human good as active citizenship and civic virtue. On this view, it is clear that some individuals will be more successful than others in attaining the good so understood—some are more adept at politics than others, some are more capable of heroic displays of virtue than others, and so on. Indeed, political power and public honor are, to some extent, positional goods, meaning that their distribution among the members of a community will necessarily be unequal. It follows that, on the civic humanist reading of the tradition, the elitist bent of the classical republican writings is a consequence of their core values. As Arendt writes, it is “the sign of a well-ordered republic” that only the politically virtuous elite “would have the right to be heard in the conduct of the business of the republic” (1963, 279).

The civic republicans, naturally, reject this view. There is nothing inherently elitist about the ideal of freedom when this is understood negatively as independence from arbitrary or uncontrolled power. The classical republicans, to be sure, typically confined the extension of this ideal to a narrow range of propertied, native-born male citizens. But on the civic republican reading of the tradition, this merely reflects an unnecessary prejudice we can easily dispense with. The elitism of the tradition long concealed the potentially radical implications of freedom as non-domination; suitably universalized now at last, republicanism is revealed to be a strikingly progressive political doctrine (Pettit 1997, 2014; Maynor 2003; Gourevitch 2015).

The remainder of this section will sketch some of the wide-ranging applications of a universalized republicanism, dedicated to the promotion of freedom as non-domination. Much of the contemporary republican program, as one would expect, bears some familial relationship with the political commitments of the classical republicans. There are also divergences, however. Contemporary civic republicans draw inspiration from the classical tradition, but they do not aim to anachronistically implement the republicanism of yore for its own sake.

4.1 Republican Public Policy

Contemporary civic republicans aim to promote freedom, understood as independence from arbitrary power. Roughly speaking, there are two directions from which republican freedom might be threatened. First, there is the obvious danger of an autocratic or despotic government assuming arbitrary powers over its subjects; this concern, and republican remedies for it, will be discussed below. But there is a second danger to republican freedom as well—one that concerns contemporary civic republicans just as much as the first. This is the danger that some individuals or groups within civil society will succeed in assuming arbitrary or uncontrolled powers over others. Absent this second concern, republican policy would indeed often seem “indeterminate,” as observed by McMahon (2005) and Costa (2007). A few examples will help clarify this second danger.

Imagine for a moment there were no system of domestic criminal and civil law. In this case, citizens would not know where they stood with one another; their interrelations would be governed simply by force—which is to say, by the arbitrary whim of the momentarily stronger party. In order to enjoy some degree of republican freedom, therefore, it is absolutely essential to introduce a domestic legal system so as to govern the citizens’ mutual relations (Lovett 2016a). Notice that, on the republican view of freedom, the laws do not merely protect some freedoms at the expense of others (as on the non-interference view), but rather themselves actually introduce or enable that freedom. On this view, only when their interrelations are mutually governed by a system of public and stable rules is it possible for fellow citizens to enjoy some measure of independence from arbitrary rule (Pettit 1989, 1997, 2012; Spitz 1995; Viroli 2002; Dagger 2009).

This connection between the rule of law and freedom is a common theme in the classical republican literature. Contemporary civic republicans observe, however, that even when the rule of law is firmly established, there remain many other potential dangers of which the classical republicans were less well aware. For example, while markets as such need not involve domination (Pettit 2006), and indeed when well-ordered might reduce it (Taylor 2017), republicans’ enthusiasm for markets will have definite limits. Specifically, there is the danger of basic needs deprivation, which can place the least advantaged members of society in a position of economic vulnerability (Spitz 1993; Pettit 1997; Viroli 2002). In order to satisfy their basic needs, individuals may well submit themselves to the arbitrary power of exploitative employers or become dependent on the whims of voluntary charity (Dagger 2006; Gourevitch 2015; O’Shea 2019). Ensuring the enjoyment of republican freedom will therefore require some public provision for otherwise unmet basic needs.

Yet another danger to republican freedom arises in the context of family life and gender relations. Traditional family law subjected both wives and children to considerable arbitrary power: circumstances in the case of the latter, circumscribed opportunities in the case of the former, ensured the nearly complete dependency of both on the family they happened to be in. The contemporary civic republican program is thus congenial to both an expansion of children’s rights, and the elimination of sex domination (Pettit 1997; Phillips 2000; Costa 2013; Halldenius 2015).

It is always important from a civic republican point of view to be on guard against the introduction of new forms of dependency and arbitrary power through those very laws and policies designed to enhance individual freedom, however. In the area of criminal and civil law, for example, freedom might be threatened by legal uncertainty or prosecutorial discretion; and, of course, there are grave republican concerns with respect to the existing system of punishment in many western nations (Braithwaite and Pettit 1990). These dangers might suggest the need for a more democratized system of criminal justice (Martí 2009). Similarly, in the public provision of basic needs, there are republican concerns with respect to dependence on government aid and arbitrariness in the distribution of benefits that might point to the introduction of an unconditional basic income (Raventos 2007; Lovett 2010; for a contrary view, see Taylor 2017). In many of these areas, however, there remains considerable work for contemporary civic republicans in determining the appropriate public policy implications of a universalized concern for republican freedom.

4.2 Republican Political Institutions

Turning from questions of public policy to the form of government, we return to issues more familiar to the writers in the classical tradition. Protecting citizens from the arbitrary or uncontrolled power of their government through good institutional design represents perhaps the signature classical republican concern. Many of the standard devices for achieving this aim—the rule of law, the separation of powers, federalism, constitutionally entrenched basic rights, and so on—have been adopted by liberals and others. Contemporary civic republicans, naturally, remain committed to these institutional devices in some measure (Pettit 1997, 2012, 2014; Maynor 2003).

However, contemporary civic republicans also recognize that these sorts of devices can only go so far. The basic reason for this is that, no matter how carefully designed, the operation and functioning of government necessarily entails considerable discretion on the part of public authorities (Pettit 1997; Richardson 2002). There are two especially prominent instances of this. First, it is clear that no matter how detailed and carefully-crafted it is, no system of explicit rules and regulations can possibly cover all contingencies and circumstances. It follows that discretionary authority must inevitably be left in the hands of courts, public agencies, and administrative bureaucracies. Second, even apart from this, there remains extensive discretion in the hands of legislatures to set public law and policy in the first place. A daily-changing system of rules is no better than having no rules at all.  

The standard republican remedy for this problem is enhanced democracy. It must, however, be democracy of the right sort. Most contemporary civic republicans reject the populist model of democracy according to which all public laws and policies must express the collective will of the people in order to be considered legitimate. Instead, they generally endorse some form of “qualified populism” (Richardson 2002) or “contestatory democracy” (Pettit 1997, 1999, 2001; Maynor 2003). Roughly speaking, the idea is that properly-designed democratic institutions should give citizens the effective opportunity to contest the decisions of their representatives. This possibility of contestation will make government agents wielding discretionary authority answerable to a public understanding of the goals or ends they are meant to serve and the means they are permitted to employ. In this way, discretionary power can be subject to popular control in the sense required for a secure enjoyment of republican liberty (Pettit 2012, 2014; Ingham 2019).

Next, of course, we will want to know how popular control might actually be put into practice. The main challenges are commonly addressed under three headings, outlined by Pettit (1997, 186–7). The first and most thoroughly discussed is the requirement that discretionary authority be guided by the norm of deliberative public reasoning. This means that the relevant decision-makers (legislatures, courts, bureaucrats, etc.) must be required to present reasons for their decisions, and those reasons must be subject to open public debate (see Sunstein 1988, 1993; Pettit 1997; Richardson 2002). So, for example, legislative processes should be designed so as to discourage back-room bargaining on the basis of sectional interests, and instead to encourage open public deliberation. Similarly, bureaucratic agencies should not be allowed to merely issue determinations on the basis of technocratic expertise without offering reasons for their decisions that are open to public examination.

The other two requirements have not received as much attention as the first, perhaps because both are relatively obvious. The second is that of inclusiveness. Opportunities for democratic contestation must be equally open to all persons and groups in the society. This requirement follows naturally from a universalized concern for republican liberty, and it has implications for the design of representative institutions, campaign financing, and so on (Pettit 1997, 2012; Bellamy 2007). And the third requirement is that there exist institutionalized forums for contestation—impartial ‘courts of appeal,’ so to speak, where citizens can raise objections to public laws and policies (Pettit 1997, 1999, 2012). Whether these forums should include constitutional courts with strong powers of judicial review remains a subject of debate in the republican literature, however (Bellamy 2007; Honohan 2009; Hickey 2019).

4.3 Civic virtue and corruption

Among the more salient themes in the classical republican tradition are the importance of civic virtue and the dangers of corruption. We may understand the term ‘corruption’ simply to mean the advancement of personal or sectional interest at the expense of the public good, and ‘civic virtue’ as its opposite—that is, a willingness to do one’s part in supporting the public good. Critics of republicanism often fear that this implies extensive self-sacrifice and frugality, a renunciation of individuality and self-identification with the community (Herzog 1986; Goodin 2003; Brennan and Lomasky 2006). These fears are no doubt encouraged by the civic humanist reading of the classical tradition along perfectionist lines. Civic republicans accordingly have been at pains to show the contrary—that civic virtue should be understood as a strictly instrumental good, useful in establishing and maintaining republican liberty. Far from calling for the subjection of individual to collective aims, they argue, republican liberty is desirable in part because it enables citizens to pursue their private aims with assurances of security (Skinner 1984, 1991; Spitz 1993; Dagger 1997; Viroli 2002; Maynor 2003).

Broadly speaking, there are two topics to consider under the heading of civic virtue. On the one hand, there is the civic virtue and danger of its corruption on the part of public officials; on the other, there is the civic virtue and danger of its corruption on the part of citizens in general. With respect to the former, republicans typically reject the view (common in the liberal tradition) that public officials are by nature corrupt, and instead regard individuals as potentially corruptible, but not necessarily corrupt (Pettit 1997). Working from this assumption, it is strictly a pragmatic and empirical question which configurations of public laws, institutions, and norms are most likely to minimize the danger of corruption, and enhance the civic virtue of public officials. Options here include screening procedures on the selection of officials, rules and norms keeping some policy options out of bounds, and both positive and negative sanctions. In designing such institutions, it is important not to assume the worst of people, for otherwise we might inadvertently encourage (through an evident lack of trust) the very corrupt behavior one aims to guard against.

Promoting civic virtue on the part of the citizens in general, however, is just as important from a republican point of view. There are a variety of possible reasons for this. For the most part, they stem from the observation that the widespread enjoyment of republican liberty is most likely to be maximized in a community where the citizens are committed to that ideal, and each is willing to do his or her part in realizing it. For example, through collective political action, citizens can bring instances of domination to public attention; they can support laws and policies that would expand republican freedom; and they can do their part in defending republican institutions when called upon to do so. Promoting this sort of commitment to republican ideals will require a fairly robust program of civics education, together with a culture that rewards virtue with public esteem (Dagger 1997; Pettit 1997; Brennan and Pettit 2003; Maynor 2003; Costa 2009; Lovett 2020). Again, it should be emphasized here that citizens do not enjoy republican freedom, on the civic republican view, in being virtuous. Indeed, this could not be the case since, as argued earlier, the degree of republican freedom enjoyed is rather a question of how the laws, institutions, and norms of the community are ordered. Civic virtue is, however, instrumentally useful both in bringing about the right sorts of laws, institutions, and norms, and in ensuring their durability and reliability.

Finally, it is worth mentioning the connection between civic virtue (both on the part of public officials and citizens in general) and the rule of law. The significance of the rule of law for republican liberty was discussed above; in the classical republican tradition, this was expressed as the “empire of law” ideal—the notion that in a free republic laws, not men, rule. Of course this cannot ever be literally true, but it can be approximated in a sort of artificial way, so that life can be experienced as if it were true within a given community. This requires, however, that the law be widely regarded as clear, predictable, and legitimate, and this in turn is possible only when there is a generally high level of compliance and when legal rules are embedded in a shared network of informal social norms (Pettit 1997; Lovett 2016a).

4.4 Republicanism Across Borders

The classical republicans were fond of extolling the martial valor of Rome and other ancient republics, and they often followed Machiavelli in advocating policies and institutions that would enhance the expansionist capacities of republics. For this they have often been accused of militaristic and imperialistic tendencies (see for example Goodin 2003), but this is not entirely fair. One has to be mindful of the dangerous security environments republics have often faced. The classical republicans rarely advocated conquest for its own sake: “swords were given to men,” writes Sidney, “that none might be slaves,” not that they might enslave others (1698, 343). In a hostile world populated by autocratic rivals, Machiavelli may have been right to believe that a republic’s best defence is a good offense.

Even so, the classical republicans were sensitive to the particular dangers of territorial expansion. They especially worried that by upsetting the domestic balance of wealth and power, imperial conquest would undermine freedom at home, and accordingly they sought remedies through various cooperative and federal arrangements (Deudney 2007; Bohman 2008). Whether optimally securing republican freedom under modern conditions will ultimately require some sort of global republic, however, remains a topic of debate (see Pettit 2010; Martí 2010; Maynor 2015).

Beyond narrow security concerns, however, contemporary civic republicans have recently begun to explore the implications of republican freedom for global economic justice. Supposing the ideal is suitably universalized, and thus every human being’s non-domination counts the same, are republicans committed to cosmopolitan policies of global redistribution? Here a wide range of views can be found in the literature. Pettit (2010, 2014) argues no, on the grounds that economic justice is mainly important indirectly for preserving domestic republican institutions, whereas Lovett (2016b) argues yes, on the grounds that poverty and severe inequality directly expose individuals to domination. In between these positions, Laborde (2010), and Laborde and Ronzoni (2016) maintain that our global obligations to promote non-domination are similar but ultimately weaker than our domestic ones. Finally, Bachvarova (2013) suggests that republicanism is best suited to address relational rather than distributive global justice.

Perhaps the greatest challenge to contemporary civic republican theory, however, is the problem of state borders and global migration. Republicans are in a strong position to advocate for stateless persons, refugees, and resident non-citizens who, in various ways, are clearly vulnerable to avoidable domination (Bohman 2009; Benton 2010). Much less obvious, however, is how to address the issue of international freedom of movement. Traditionally committed to a strong conception of citizenship, the republican ideal of political liberty has often seemed inseparable from the existence of bounded communities of fellow free citizens. Pettit (2012, 161–2) claims that since states have no choice but to maintain borders, the existence of migration controls as such cannot count as dominating, while Costa (2016) disagrees. Honohan (2014) insists that any migration controls a given state does implement should be non-arbitrary, but as Fine (2014) observes, this does not settle the ultimate question of whether freedom of movement can be reconciled with the need to maintain civic community.

5. Conclusion

In many respects, civic republicanism remains a still underdeveloped political doctrine. Further work is required in all the areas discussed above, and there are many issues central to the concerns of contemporary political theorists and philosophers that contemporary civic republicans have only recently begun to examine. Among the latter, there are now at least initial treatments of multiculturalism (Laborde 2008; Lovett 2010; Honohan 2013; Bachvarova 2014), education policy (Peterson 2011; Hinchliffe 2014; Macleod 2015), and intergenerational justice (Beckman 2016; Katz 2017; Pinto 2019), although substantial work certainly remains to be done. Nevertheless, civic republicanism is a dynamic and growing field, which stands to make continuing positive contributions to debate in contemporary social and political theory.


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