Moral Responsibility

First published Wed Oct 16, 2019; substantive revision Mon Jun 3, 2024

Making judgments about whether a person is morally responsible for their behavior, and holding others and ourselves responsible for actions and the consequences of actions, is a fundamental and familiar part of our moral practices and our interpersonal relationships.

The judgment that a person is morally responsible for their behavior involves—at least to a first approximation—attributing certain powers and capacities to that person, and viewing their behavior as arising, in the right way, from the fact that the person has, and has exercised, these powers and capacities. Whatever the correct account of the powers and capacities at issue (and canvassing different accounts is one task of this entry), their possession qualifies an agent as morally responsible in a general sense: that is, as one who may be morally responsible for particular exercises of agency. Normal adult human beings may possess the powers and capacities in question, and other agents (such as non-human animals and very young children) are generally taken to lack them.

To hold someone responsible involves—again, to a first approximation—responding to that person in ways that are made appropriate by the judgment that they are morally responsible. These responses often constitute instances of moral praise or moral blame (though there may be reason to allow for morally responsible behavior that is neither praiseworthy nor blameworthy: see McKenna 2012, 16–17 and M. Zimmerman 1988, 61–62). Blame is a response that may follow on the judgment that a person is morally responsible for behavior that is wrong or bad, and praise is a response that may follow on the judgment that a person is morally responsible for behavior that is right or good. (See Menges 2017 for an account that emphasizes the independence of blame from judgments about blameworthiness.)

The attention in the philosophical literature given to blame far exceeds that given to praise. One reason for this is that blameworthiness, unlike praiseworthiness, is often taken to involve liability to sanction. Thus, articulating the conditions on blameworthiness may seem the more pressing matter. Perhaps for related reasons, there is a richer language for expressing blame than praise (Watson [1996]2004, 283), and “blame” finds its way into idioms for which there is no ready parallel employing “praise”: compare “S is to blame for x” and “S is to praise for x.” Note, as well, that “holding responsible” is not a neutral expression: it typically arises in blaming contexts (Watson [1996]2004, 284).

Additionally, there may be asymmetries in the contexts in which praise and blame are appropriate: private blame is more familiar than private praise (Coates and Tognazzini 2013b), and while minor wrongs may reasonably earn blame, minimally decent behavior seems insufficient for praise (Eshleman 2014). Finally, the widespread assumption that praiseworthiness and blameworthiness are at least symmetrical in terms of the capacities they require has also been questioned (Nelkin 2008, 2011; Wolf 1980, 1990). Like most work on moral responsibility, this entry will focus largely on the negative side of the phenomenon; for more, see the entry on blame.

In everyday speech, one hears references to “moral responsibility” where the point is to indicate the presence of an obligation. Someone may say that “the United States has a moral responsibility to assist Ukraine,” where this means that the United States ought to adopt certain policies or take certain actions. This entry, however, is concerned not with accounts that specify people’s responsibilities in the sense of obligations, but rather with accounts of whether a person bears the right relation to their actions to be properly held accountable for them.

Moral responsibility should also be distinguished from causal responsibility. We may assign causal responsibility to someone for an outcome that they have caused, and we may also judge the person morally responsible for having caused the outcome. But the powers and capacities that are required for moral responsibility are not identical with an agent’s causal powers, so we cannot always infer moral responsibility from an assignment of causal responsibility. A young child can cause an outcome while failing to fulfill the general requirements on moral responsibility, and even agents who fulfill the general requirements on moral responsibility may explain or defend their behavior in ways that call into question their moral responsibility for outcomes for which they are causally responsible. Suppose that S causes an explosion by flipping a switch: the fact that S had no reason to expect such an outcome may call into question their moral responsibility (or at least their blameworthiness) for the explosion without calling into question their causal contribution to it. (For discussion of moral responsibility for causal outcomes, see §3.5.)

Having distinguished different senses of “responsibility,” the word will be used in what follows to refer to “moral responsibility” in the sense specified above.

For a long time, the bulk of philosophical work on moral responsibility was conducted in the context of debates about free will and the threat that determinism might pose to free will. A largely unquestioned assumption was that free will is required for moral responsibility, and the central questions had to do with the ingredients of free will and with whether their possession is compatible with determinism. Recently, however, the literature on moral responsibility has addressed issues that are of interest independently of worries about determinism. Much of this entry will deal with these latter aspects of the moral responsibility debate. However, it will be useful to begin with issues at the intersection of concerns about free will and moral responsibility.

1. Freedom, Responsibility, and Determinism

What power do responsible agents exercise over their actions? One (partial) answer is that the relevant power is a form of control, and, in particular, a form of control such that the agent could have done otherwise than to perform the action in question. This captures one standard notion of free will, and one of the central issues in debates about free will has been about whether possession of it (free will, in the ability-to-do-otherwise sense) is compatible with causal determinism (or with, for example, divine foreknowledge—see the entry on foreknowledge and free will).

If causal determinism obtains, then the occurrence of every event (including events involving human deliberation, choice, and action) was made inevitable by—because it was causally necessitated by—the facts about the past (and about the laws of nature) prior to the event. Under these conditions, the facts about the present, and about the future, are uniquely fixed by the facts about the past (and about the laws of nature): given these earlier facts, the present and the future can unfold in only one way. For more, see the entry on causal determinism.

If free will requires the ability to do otherwise, then it is easy to see why free will may be incompatible with causal determinism. One way of getting at this incompatibilist worry is to focus on the way in which performance of a given action by an agent should be up to the agent if they have the sort of free will required for moral responsibility. As the influential Consequence Argument has it (Ginet 1966; van Inwagen 1983, 55–105), the truth of determinism entails that an agent’s actions are not really up to the agent since they are the unavoidable consequences of things over which the agent lacks control. Here is an informal summary of this argument from Peter van Inwagen’s An Essay on Free Will (1983):

If determinism is true, then our acts are the consequences of the laws of nature and events in the remote past. But it is not up to us what went on before we were born, and neither is it up to us what the laws of nature are. Therefore, the consequences of these things (including our present acts) are not up to us. (1983: 16)

For an important argument that the Consequence Argument conflates different senses in which the laws of nature are not up to us, see Lewis (1981). For more on incompatibilism, see the entries on free will, arguments for incompatibilism, and incompatibilist (nondeterministic) theories of free will, as well as Clarke (2003).

Compatibilists maintain that free will and moral responsibility are compatible with determinism. Versions of compatibilism have been defended since ancient times. The Stoics—Chryssipus, in particular—argued that the truth of determinism does not entail that human actions are entirely explained by factors external to agents; thus, human actions are not necessarily explained in a way that is incompatible with praise and blame (see Bobzien 1998 and Salles 2005 for Stoic views on freedom and determinism). Similarly, philosophers in the Modern period (such as Hobbes and Hume) distinguished the general way in which our actions are necessitated if determinism is true from the specific instances of necessity sometimes imposed on us by everyday constraints on behavior (e.g., coercive pressures or physical impediments that make it impossible to act as we would like). The difference is that the necessity involved in determinism is compatible with agents acting as they choose: even if S’s behavior is causally determined, it may be behavior that S chose to perform. And perhaps the ability that matters for free will (and responsibility) is just the ability to act as one chooses, which seems to require only the absence of external constraints and not the absence of determinism.

This compatibilist tradition was carried into the 20th century by logical positivists such as Ayer (1954) and Schlick ([1930]1966). Here is how Schlick expressed a central compatibilist insight in 1930 (drawing, in particular, on Hume):

Freedom means the opposite of compulsion; a man is free if he does not act under compulsion, and he is compelled or unfree when he is hindered from without…when he is locked up, or chained, or when someone forces him at the point of a gun to do what otherwise he would not do. (1930 [1966: 59])

Since deterministic causal pressures do not always force one to “do what otherwise he would not do,” freedom—at least of the sort specified by Schlick—is compatible with determinism.

A related compatibilist strategy, influential in the early and mid-20th century, was to offer a conditional analysis of the ability to do otherwise (Ayer 1954, Moore 1912; for earlier expressions, see Hobbes [1654]1999 and Hume [1748]1978). As noted above, even if determinism is true, agents may often act as they choose; it is also compatible with determinism that an agent who performed act A (on the basis of their choice to do so) might have performed a different action on the condition that the agent had chosen to perform the other action. Even if a person’s actual behavior is causally determined by the actual past, it may be that if the past had been suitably different (if the person’s desires, intentions, and choices had been different), then they would have acted differently. Perhaps this is all that the ability to do otherwise comes to.

However, this compatibilist picture is open to serious objections. It might be granted that an ability to act as one sees fit is valuable, and perhaps related to the type of freedom at issue in the free will debate, but it does not follow that this is all that possession of free will comes to. People who have certain desires as a result of indoctrination, brainwashing, or psychopathology may act as they choose, but their possession of free will and moral responsibility may be questioned. (For more on the relevance of such factors, see §3.2 and §3.9.) The conditional analysis also seems open to the following counterexample. It might be true that an agent who performs act A would have omitted A if they had so chosen, but it might also be true that the agent in question suffers from an overwhelming compulsion to perform act A. The conditional analysis suggests that the agent in question retains the ability to do otherwise than A, but given their compulsion, it seems clear that they lack this ability (Chisholm 1964, Lehrer 1968, van Inwagen 1983).

Despite the above objections, the compatibilist project described so far has had lasting influence. The fact that determined agents can act as they see fit is still an important inspiration for compatibilists, as is the fact that determined agents may have acted differently in counterfactual circumstances. For more, see the entry on compatibilism. For recent accounts related to and improving upon early compatibilist approaches, see Fara (2008), M. Smith (2003), and Vihvelin (2004); for criticism of these accounts, see Clarke (2009).

Compatibilists have also argued that moral responsibility does not require the ability to do otherwise. If this is right, then determinism would not threaten responsibility by ruling out access to alternatives (though it might threaten responsibility in other ways: see van Inwagen 1983, 182–88 and Fischer and Ravizza 1998, 151–168). In an influential 1969 paper, Harry Frankfurt offers examples meant to show that an agent can be morally responsible for an action even if he could not have done otherwise. Versions of these examples are often called Frankfurt cases or Frankfurt examples. In the basic form of the example, an agent, Jones, considers a certain action. Another agent, Black, would like to see Jones perform this action and, if necessary, Black can make Jones perform it by intervening in Jones’s deliberative processes. However, as things transpire, Black does not intervene in Jones’s decision making since he can see that Jones will perform the action on his own. Black does not intervene to ensure Jones’s action, but he could have and would have had Jones showed some sign that he would not perform the action on his own. Therefore, Jones could not have done otherwise, yet he seems responsible for his behavior since he does it on his own.

There are questions about whether Frankfurt’s example really shows that Jones couldn’t have done otherwise and that he is morally responsible. How can Black be certain whether Jones would perform the action on his own? There seems to be a dilemma here. Perhaps determinism obtains in the universe of the example, and Black sees some sign that indicates the presence of factors that causally ensure that Jones will behave in a particular way. But in this case, incompatibilists are unlikely to grant that Jones is morally responsible since they believe that moral responsibility is incompatible with determinism. On the other hand, perhaps determinism is not true in the universe of the example, but then it is not clear that the example excludes alternatives for Jones: if Jones’s behavior isn’t causally determined, then perhaps he can do otherwise. For objections to Frankfurt’s original example along these lines, see Ginet (1996) and Widerker (1995); for defenses of Frankfurt, see Fischer (2002; 2010); and for refined versions of Frankfurt’s example, meant to clearly deny Jones access to alternatives, see Mele and Robb (1998), Hunt (2000), and Pereboom (2000; 2001, 18–28). For a valuable collection on this topic, see Widerker and McKenna (2006).

In response to such criticisms, Frankfurt has said that his example was intended mainly to draw attention to the fact “that making an action unavoidable is not the same thing as bringing it about that the action is performed” (2006, 340; emphasis in original). In particular, while determinism may make an agent’s action unavoidable, it does not follow that the agent acts only because determinism is true: it may also be true that the agent acts a certain way because they want to. The point of his original example, Frankfurt suggests, was to draw attention to the significance that the actual causes of an agent’s behavior can have independently of whether the agent might have done something else. Frankfurt concludes that “[w]hen a person acts for reasons of his own … the question of whether he could have done something else instead is quite irrelevant” for the purposes of assessing responsibility (2006, 340). A focus on the actual causes that lead to behavior, as well as investigation into when an agent can be said to act on their own reasons, has characterized a great deal of work on responsibility since Frankfurt’s essay.

2. Some Approaches to Moral Responsibility

2.1 Forward-Looking Accounts

Forward-looking approaches to moral responsibility justify responsibility practices by focusing on the beneficial consequences that can be obtained by engaging in these practices. This approach was influential in the earlier parts of the 20th century (as well as before), had fallen out of favor by the closing decades of that century, and has recently been the subject of renewed interest.

Forward-looking perspectives emphasize one of the points discussed in the previous section: an agent’s being subject to determinism does not entail that they are subject to constraints that force them to act independently of their choices. If this is true, then, regardless of the truth of determinism, it may be useful to offer certain incentives to agents—to praise and blame them—in order to encourage them to make certain future choices and thus to secure positive behavioral outcomes.

According to some articulations of the forward-looking approach, to be a responsible agent is simply to be an agent whose motives, choices, and behavior can be shaped in this way. Thus, Schlick argued that

The question of who is responsible is the question concerning the correct point of application of the motive…. in this its meaning is completely exhausted; behind it lurks no mysterious connection between transgression and requital…. It is a matter only of knowing who is to be punished or rewarded, in order that punishment and reward function as such—be able to achieve their goal. (1930 [1966: 61]; emphasis in original)

According to Schlick, the goals of punishment and reward have nothing to do with the past: the idea that punishment “is a natural retaliation for past wrong, ought no longer to be defended in cultivated society” ([1930]1966, 60; emphasis in original). Instead, punishment ought to be “concerned only with the institution of causes, of motives of conduct …. Analogously, in the case of reward we are concerned with an incentive” ([1930]1966, 60; emphasis in original).

J. J. C. Smart (1961) also defended a well-known forward-looking approach to responsibility. Smart claimed that to blame someone for their behavior is simply to assess the behavior negatively (to “dispraise” it) while simultaneously ascribing responsibility for the behavior to the agent. And, for Smart, an ascription of responsibility merely involves taking an agent to be such that they would have omitted the behavior if they had been provided with a motive to do so. Whatever sanctions may follow an ascription of responsibility are administered with eye to giving an agent a motive to refrain from such behavior in the future.

Smart’s approach has its contemporary defenders (Arneson 2003), but many have found it lacking. R. Jay Wallace argues that an approach like Smart’s “leaves out the underlying attitudinal aspect of moral blame” (Wallace 1996, 56, emphasis in original; see the next subsection for more on blaming attitudes). According to Wallace, the attitudes involved in blame are “backward-looking and focused on the individual agent who has done something morally wrong” (Wallace 1996, 56). But a forward-looking approach, with its focus on bringing about desirable outcomes “is not directed exclusively toward the individual agent who has done something morally wrong, but takes account of anyone else who is susceptible to being influenced by our responses” (Wallace 1996, 56; emphasis added). In exceptional cases, a focus on beneficial outcomes may provide grounds for treating as blameworthy those who are known to be innocent (Smart 1973). This feature of some forward-looking approaches has led to particularly strong criticism.

Recent efforts have been made to develop partially forward-looking accounts of responsibility that evade some of the criticisms mentioned above. These accounts justify our general system of responsibility practices by appeal to its suitability for fostering moral agency and the acquisition of capacities required for such agency. Most notable in this regard is Manuel Vargas’s “agency cultivation model” of responsibility (2013; also see Jefferson 2019 and McGeer 2015). Recent conversational accounts of responsibility (§3.3) also have a forward-looking component insofar as they regard those with whom one might have fruitful moral interactions as candidates for responsibility. Some responsibility skeptics have also emphasized the forward-looking benefits of certain responsibility practices. Derk Pereboom—who rejects desert-based blame—has argued that some conventional blaming practices can be maintained (even after ordinary notions of blameworthiness have been left behind) insofar as these practices are grounded in “non-desert invoking moral desiderata” such as “protection of potential victims, reconciliation to relationships both personal and with the moral community more generally, and moral formation” (2014, 134; also see Caruso 2016, Caruso and Pereboom 2022, Levy 2012, Milam 2016). (For more on skepticism about responsibility, see §3.6 and the entry on skepticism about moral responsibility.)

2.2 The Reactive Attitudes Approach

2.2.1 “Freedom and Resentment”

P. F. Strawson’s 1962 paper, “Freedom and Resentment,” is the inspiration for a great deal of contemporary work on responsibility, especially the work of compatibilists. Strawson focuses on the emotions—the reactive attitudes—that play a fundamental role in our practices of holding one another responsible. He suggests that attending to the logic of these emotional responses yields an account of what it is to be open to praise and blame that need not invoke the incompatibilist’s conception of free will.

Part of the novelty of Strawson’s approach is its emphasis on the “importance that we attach to the attitudes and intentions towards us of other human beings” ([1962]1993, 48) and on “how much it matters to us, whether the actions of other people … reflect attitudes towards us of goodwill, affection, or esteem on the one hand or contempt, indifference, or malevolence on the other” ([1962]1993, 49). For Strawson, our practices of holding others responsible are largely responses to these things: that is, “to the quality of others’ wills towards us” ([1962]1993, 56).

To get a sense of the importance of quality of will for our interpersonal relations, note the difference in your response to one who injures you accidentally as compared to how you respond to one who does you the same injury out of “contemptuous disregard” or “a malevolent wish to injure [you]” (P. Strawson [1962]1993, 49). The second case is likely to arouse a type and intensity of resentment that would not reasonably be felt in the first case. Corresponding points may be made about gratitude: you would likely not have the same feelings of gratitude toward a person who benefits you accidentally as you would toward one who does so out of concern for your welfare.

According to Strawson, the tendency to respond with reactive attitudes to another’s display of good or ill will involves imposing on the other a demand for moral respect and due regard ([1962]1993, 63). Thus, among the circumstances that mollify a person’s negative reactive attitudes are those which show that—perhaps despite initial appearances—the demand for due regard has not been ignored or flouted. When someone explains that the injury they caused you was entirely unforeseen and accidental, they indicate that their regard for your welfare was not insufficient and that they are, therefore, not an appropriate target of the attitudes involved in blame.

An agent who excuses themselves from blame in the above way is not calling into question their status as a generally responsible agent: they are still open to the demand for due regard and liable, in principle, to reactive responses. Other agents, however, may be inapt targets for blame and the reactive emotions precisely because they are not legitimate targets of a demand for regard. In these cases, an agent is not excused from blame, they are exempted from it: it is not that their behavior is discovered to have been non-malicious, but rather that they are recognized as one of whom better behavior cannot reasonably be demanded. (The widely-used terminology in which the above contrast is drawn—“excuses” versus “exemptions”—is due to Watson [1987]2004).

For Strawson, the most important group of exempt agents includes those who are, at least for a time, significantly impaired for normal interpersonal relationships. These agents may be children, or psychologically impaired like the “schizophrenic” (P. Strawson [1962]1993, 51). Alternatively, exempt agents may simply be “wholly lacking … in moral sense” (P. Strawson [1962]1993, 58), perhaps because they suffered from “peculiarly unfortunate … formative circumstances” (P. Strawson [1962]1993, 52). These agents are not candidates for the range of responses involved in our personal relationships because they do not participate in these relationships in the right way for such responses to be sensibly applied to them. Rather than taking up interpersonally-engaged attitudes (that presuppose a demand for respect) toward exempt agents, we take an objective attitude toward them. Such an agent may be regarded merely as “an object of social policy,” something “to be managed or handled or cured or trained” (P. Strawson [1962]1993, 52).

Strawson’s perspective has an important compatibilist upshot. For one thing, Strawson claims that our “commitment to participation in ordinary interpersonal relationships is … too thoroughgoing and deeply rooted for us to take seriously the thought that” the truth of determinism entails that such relationships do not, or should not, exist ([1962]1993, 54); but being involved in these relationships “precisely is being exposed to the range of reactive attitudes” that constitute our responsibility practices ([1962]1993, 54). So, regardless of the truth of determinism, we cannot give up—not entirely at least—these ways of engaging with one another. Strawson also insists that the truth of determinism would not show that human beings generally occupy excusing or exempting conditions. It would not follow from the truth of determinism “that anyone who caused an injury either was quite simply ignorant of causing it or had acceptably overriding reasons for” doing so (P. Strawson [1962]1993, 53; emphasis in original); nor would it follow “that nobody knows what he’s doing or that everybody’s behaviour is unintelligible in terms of conscious purposes or that everybody lives in a world of delusion or that nobody has a moral sense” (P. Strawson [1962]1993, 59).

2.2.2 Criticisms of Strawson’s Approach

Strawson argues that learning that determinism is true would not raise general concerns about our responsibility practices. This is because the truth of determinism would not show that human beings are generally abnormal in a way that would call into question their openness to the reactive attitudes: “it cannot be a consequence of any thesis which is not itself self-contradictory that abnormality is the universal condition” (P. Strawson [1962]1993, 54). But it has been noted that while the truth of determinism might not suggest universal abnormality, it may well show that normal human beings are morally incapacitated in a way that is relevant to our responsibility practices (Russell 1992, 298–301). Strawson’s claims that we are too deeply and naturally committed to our reactive-attitude-involving practices to give them up, and that doing so would irreparably distort our moral lives, have also been questioned (Nelkin 2011, 42–45; G. Strawson 1986, 84–120; Watson [1987]2004, 255–58).

A different objection emphasizes the response-dependence of Strawson’s account: that is, the way it explains an agent’s responsibility in terms of the responses that characterize a given community’s responsibility practices, rather than in terms of independent facts about whether the agent is responsible. This feature of Strawson’s approach invites the following reading:

In Strawson’s view, there is no such independent notion of responsibility that explains the propriety of the reactive attitudes. The explanatory priority is the other way around: It is not that we hold people responsible because they are responsible; rather, the idea (our idea) that we are responsible is to be understood by the practice, which itself is not a matter of holding some propositions to be true, but of expressing our concerns and demands about our treatment of one another. (Watson [1987]2004, 222; emphasis in original; see Bennett 1980 for a related, non-cognitivist interpretation of Strawson’s approach)

Strawson’s approach would be particularly problematic if, as the above reading might suggest, it entails that a group’s responsibility practices are—as they stand and however they stand—beyond criticism simply because they are that group’s practices (Fischer and Ravizza 1993, 18).

But there is something to be said from the other side of the debate. It may seem obvious that people are appropriately held responsible only if there are independent facts about their responsibility status. But as Wallace argues, it can be difficult “to make sense of the idea of a prior and thoroughly independent realm of moral responsibility facts” that is separate from our practices and yet to which our practices must answer (1996, 88). For Wallace, giving up on practice-independent responsibility facts doesn’t mean giving up on facts about responsibility; rather, “we must interpret the relevant facts [about responsibility] as somehow dependent on our practices of holding people responsible” (1996, 89). Such an interpretation requires an investigation into our practices, and what emerges most conspicuously, for Wallace, is the degree to which our responsibility practices are organized around a fundamental commitment to fairness (1996, 101). Wallace develops this commitment to norms of fairness into an account of the conditions under which people are appropriately held morally responsible (1996, 103–109). (For a more recent defense of the response-dependent approach to responsibility, see Shoemaker 2017b; for criticism of such approaches, see Todd 2016.)

2.2.3 Resentment and Blame

Due to Strawson’s influence, philosophers often now think of blameworthiness as centrally involving an agent’s being an appropriate object of certain emotions, particularly resentment. (For accounts that focus instead on the appropriateness of guilt, see Carlsson 2017, Clarke 2016, and Duggan 2018, as well as some of the essays in Carlsson 2022).

Emotions seem to have, in some way or other, a representational component, and whether an emotion is fitting in a given context can be assessed, at least in part, in terms of its representational accuracy. So, for example, the emotion of fear may represent its object as dangerous and an episode of fear may be fitting if the object of that emotion is in fact dangerous. (For more, see the entry on emotion.) It is possible, then, to give an account of blameworthiness in terms of the fittingness of resentment, which will involve giving an account of how resentment represents its object. Recent efforts along these lines include Graham (2014), Rosen (2015), and Strabbing (2019), all of whom take resentment to involve certain thoughts, and the fittingness of resentment to depend on the accuracy of these thoughts. As Rosen puts it, “[f]or X to be morally blameworthy for A just is for it to be appropriate to resent X for A, or in other words, for the thoughts implicit in resentment … to be true” (2015, 72). See D’Arms (2022) for criticism of Rosen’s approach. D’Arms and his co-author Jacobson (2023) hold that emotional fittingness is generally not a matter of some thought being true, it is rather a matter of correct appraisal, though they do conceive of resentment as involving certain thoughts since it is a cognitive “sharpening” of a more basic emotion kind such as anger (2023, 109 note 6).

For Graham, the thought involved in resentment is that the object of blame “has violated a moral requirement of respect” (2014, 408); for Rosen, it is that “[i]n doing A, X showed an objectionable pattern of concern” (2015, 77); for Strabbing, “the following thought partly constitutes resentment: in doing A, S expressed insufficient good will” (2019, 3127). But Rosen and Strabbing find additional thoughts to also be part of resentment. For Rosen, resentment involves not just the thought that another has acted with an objectionable pattern of concern, it also includes “the retributive thought” that the other deserves to suffer for acting as they did (2015, 83; emphasis in original). This will rule out resentment and blame in the case of an agent who violates a moral requirement but who “lacked the capacity to recognize and respond to the reasons for complying with it” since it would be, Rosen claims, unfair to sanction such an agent (2015, 84). (See Wallace 1996 and Watson [1987]2004 for other accounts that impose a fairness condition on resentment in view of its supposed sanctioning nature.) Strabbing argues that resentment is constituted not just by the thought that another showed insufficient good will but also by the thought that the other “could have acted with a better quality of will” (2019, 3129). Again, this will make resentment unfitting in the case of some agents who fail to show proper concern for others.

There is disagreement about whether wrongdoers who faultlessly acquire a commitment to flawed moral values—perhaps as a result of cultural context—are open to blame (for more, see §3.2, §3.10). These wrongdoers may behave permissibly according to their own culturally-supported values, yet they may also act with an objectionable quality of will. Rosen’s and Strabbing’s accounts would explain why resentment might be inappropriate in the case of such wrongdoers: it may be unfair to sanction them or to expect them to act with a better quality of will. On the other hand, if the cognitive content of resentment is narrower than Rosen and Strabbing suggest—if, for example, it involves merely an attribution of ill will—then resentment may be fitting in some of these cases. Alternatively, it may be possible to distinguish between varieties of resentment: there may be a resentment-like emotion partly constituted by relatively narrow cognitive content (i.e., the thought that another acted with ill will), and a distinct resentment-like emotion partly constituted by the broader cognitive content suggested by Rosen and Strabbing. In this case, the wrongdoers in question may be open to a type of resentment that represents them simply as wrongdoers, but not to a more complex type of resentment; see Hieronymi (2014) and Talbert (2014) for suggestions like this.

2.3 Reasons-Responsiveness Views

As noted in §1, a lasting influence of Frankfurt’s work was to draw attention to the actual causes of agents’ behavior, and particularly to whether an agent acted for their own reasons. Reasons-responsiveness approaches have been particularly attentive to these issues. These approaches ground responsibility by reference to agents’ capacities for being appropriately sensitive to the rational considerations that bear on their actions. Interpreted broadly, reasons-responsiveness approaches include a diverse collection of views: Brink and Nelkin (2013), Fischer and Ravizza (1998), McKenna (2013), Nelkin (2011), Sartorio (2016), Wallace (1996), and Wolf (1990). Fischer and Ravizza’s Responsibility and Control (1998) is the most influential articulation of this approach.

Fischer and Ravizza take Frankfurt cases (§1) to show that access to alternatives is not necessary for moral responsibility. Rather, what is required is “guidance control,” which is manifested when an agent guides their behavior in a particular direction, and regardless of whether it was open to them to guide their behavior differently (Fischer and Ravizza 1998, 29–34).

If a person’s behavior is brought about by hypnosis or genuinely irresistible urges, then they may not be morally responsible for their behavior because they do not reflectively guide it in the way required for responsibility (Fischer and Ravizza 1998, 35). More specifically, an agent in the above circumstances is not likely to be responsible because he “is not responsive to reasons—his behavior would be the same, no matter what reasons there were” (Fischer and Ravizza 1998, 37). Thus, Fischer and Ravizza characterize possession of guidance control as dependent on responsiveness to reasons. In particular, guidance control depends on whether the psychological mechanism that issues in an agent’s behavior is responsive to reasons. (Guidance control also requires that an agent owns the mechanism on which they act. According to Fischer and Ravizza, this requires placing historical conditions on responsibility; see §3.9.)

Fischer and Ravizza’s focus on mechanisms is motivated by the following reasoning. In a Frankfurt case, an agent is responsible for an action even though their action is ensured by external factors. But the presence of these external factors means that the agent in a Frankfurt case would have acted the same no matter what reasons they were confronted with. So, the responsible agent in a Frankfurt scenario is not responsive to reasons. Fischer and Ravizza’s solution to this problem is to argue that while the agent in a Frankfurt case may not be responsive to reasons, the agent’s mechanism—“the process that leads to the relevant upshot [i.e., the agent’s action]”—may well be responsive to reasons (1998, 38). In other words, the agent’s generally-specified psychological mechanism might have responded (under counterfactual conditions) to considerations in favor of omitting the action that the agent performed. Fischer and Ravizza thus conclude that “relatively clear cases of moral responsibility”—those in which an agent is not hypnotized, etc.—are distinguished by the fact that “an agent exhibits guidance control of an action insofar as the mechanism that actually issues in the action is his own, reasons-responsive mechanism” (1998, 39).

But how responsive to reasons does an agent’s mechanism need to be? Fischer and Ravizza argue that moderate (as opposed to strong or weak) reasons responsiveness is required for guidance control (1998, 69–85). A mechanism that is moderately responsive to reasons may not be receptive to every sufficient reason to act in a certain way, but it will exhibit “an understandable pattern of (actual and hypothetical) reasons-receptivity” (Fischer and Ravizza 1998, 71; emphasis in original). Such a pattern will indicate that an agent understands “how reasons fit together” and that, for example, “acceptance of one reason as sufficient implies that a stronger reason must also be sufficient” (Fischer and Ravizza 1998, 71). In addition, the desired pattern of regular receptivity to reasons will include receptivity to a range of moral considerations (Fischer and Ravizza 1998, 77; see Todd and Tognazzini 2008 for criticism of Fischer and Ravizza’s articulation of this condition.) This will rule out attributing moral responsibility to non-moral agents.

Fischer and Ravizza’s account has generated a great deal of attention and criticism. Some critics focus on the contrast Fischer and Ravizza draw between the capacity for receptivity to reasons and the capacity for reactivity to reasons (McKenna 2005, Mele 2006a, Watson 2001). Others are dissatisfied with their focus on the powers of mechanisms as opposed to agents. This has led some authors to develop agent-based reasons-responsiveness accounts that address the concerns that led Fischer and Ravizza to their mechanism-based approach (Brink and Nelkin 2013, McKenna 2013, Sartorio 2016).

3. Contemporary Debates

3.1 The “Faces” of Responsibility

3.1.1 Attributability versus Accountability

Do our responsibility practices accommodate distinct forms of moral responsibility? Interest in this question stems from a debate between Susan Wolf and Gary Watson. Among other things, Wolf’s important 1990 book, Freedom Within Reason, offers a critical discussion of “Real Self” theories of responsibility. On these views, a person is responsible for behavior that is attributable to their real self, and “an agent’s behavior is attributable to the agent’s real self … if she is at liberty (or able) both to govern her behavior on the basis of her will and to govern her will on the basis of her valuational system” (Wolf 1990, 33). A responsible agent is, therefore, not simply moved by their strongest desires; rather, they are moved by desires that the agent endorses insofar as the desires are in conformity either with the agent’s values or with their higher-order desires. Wolf’s central example of a Real Self View is Watson (1975). (In an earlier paper, Wolf 1987 characterizes Watson 1975, Frankfurt 1971, and Taylor 1976 as offering “deep self views.” For more on real-self/deep-self views, see §3.9; for a recent presentation of a real-self view, see Sripada 2016.)

According to Wolf, Real Self views can explain why people acting under the influence of hypnosis or compulsive desires are not responsible (1990, 33). Since these agents are unable to govern their behavior on the basis of their valuational systems, they are alienated from their behavior in a way that undermines responsibility. But for Wolf it is a mark against Real Self views that they are silent on the topic of how agents came to be the way they are. An agent’s real self might be the product of a traumatic upbringing, and Wolf argues that this would give us reason to question the “agent’s responsibility for her real self” and thus her responsibility for the present behavior that issues from that self (1990, 37; emphasis in original). For an account of an agent with such an upbringing, see Wolf’s (1987) fictional example of JoJo; see Watson ([1987]2004) for a related discussion of the convicted murderer Robert Alton Harris. (For discussion of JoJo, see §3.2; for discussion of the relevance of personal history for present responsibility see §3.9.)

Wolf suggests that when a person’s real self is the product of childhood trauma (or similar factors), then that person is potentially responsible for their behavior only in a superficial sense that merely attributes bad actions to the agent’s real self (1990, 37–40). However, Wolf argues that ascriptions of moral responsibility go deeper than such attributions can reach:

When … we consider an individual worthy of blame or of praise, we are not merely judging the moral quality of the event with which the individual is so intimately associated; we are judging the moral quality of the individual herself in some more focused, noninstrumental, and seemingly more serious way. (1990, 41)

This deeper form of assessment requires more than that an agent is “able to form her actions on the basis of her values,” it also requires that “she is able to form her values on the basis of what is True and Good” (Wolf 1990, 75). This latter ability may be limited in an agent whose real self is the product of pressures (such as a traumatic upbringing) that have impaired their moral competence. (For more on moral competence, see §3.2.)

In his response to Wolf, Watson ([1996]2004) agrees that some approaches to responsibility—i.e., self-disclosure views (a phrase Watson borrows from Benson 1987)—focus narrowly on whether behavior is attributable to an agent. But Watson denies that these attributions constitute a merely superficial form of assessment. Behavior that is attributable to an agent because it issues from their valuational system often discloses something interpersonally and morally significant about the agent’s “fundamental evaluative orientation” (Watson [1996]2004, 271). Thus, ascriptions of responsibility in this responsibility-as-attributability sense are “central to ethical life and ethical appraisal” (Watson [1996]2004, 263).

However, Watson agrees with Wolf that there is more to responsibility than attributing actions to agents. In addition, we hold agents responsible for their behavior, which “is not just a matter of the relation of an individual to her behavior” (Watson [1996]2004, 262). When we hold responsible, we also “demand … certain conduct from one another and respond adversely to one another’s failures to comply with these demands” (Watson [1996]2004, 262). The moral demands, and potential for adverse treatment, associated with holding others responsible are part of our accountability (as opposed to attributability) practices, and these features of accountability raise issues of fairness that do not arise in the context of determining whether behavior is attributable to an agent (Watson [1996]2004, 273; also see material in §2.2.3). Therefore, conditions may apply to accountability that do not apply to attributability: perhaps “accountability blame” should be—as Wolf suggested—moderated in the case of an agent whose “squalid circumstances made it overwhelmingly difficult to develop a respect for the standards to which we would hold him accountable” (Watson [1996]2004, 281).

So, on Watson’s account, there is responsibility-as-attributability, and when an agent satisfies the conditions on this form of responsibility, behavior is properly attributed to the agent as reflecting morally important features of the agent’s self. But there is also responsibility-as-accountability, and when an agent satisfies the conditions on this form of responsibility, which requires more than the correct attribution of behavior, they can be held accountable for that behavior in the ways that characterize moral blame.

3.1.2 Attributionism

It has become common for the views of several authors to be described (with varying degrees of accuracy) as instances of “attributionism”; see Levy (2005) for the first use of this term. These authors include Adams (1985), Arpaly (2003), Hieronymi (2004), Scanlon (1998, 2008), Sher (2006, 2009), A. Smith (2005, 2008), Schlossberger (2021), and Talbert (2012a). Attributionists take moral responsibility assessments to be concerned with whether an action (omission, character trait, or belief) is attributable to an agent for the purposes of moral assessment, where this usually means that the action (or omission, etc.) reflects the agent’s “judgment sensitive attitudes” (Scanlon 1998), “evaluative judgments” (A. Smith 2005), or, more generally, the agent’s “moral personality” (Hieronymi 2008).

Attributionism resembles the self-disclosure views mentioned by Watson (see the previous subsection) insofar as both focus on the way that a responsible agent’s behavior discloses morally significant features of the agent’s self. However, attributionists are interested in more than specifying the conditions for what Watson calls responsibility-as-attributability. Attributionists take themselves to give conditions for holding agents responsible in Watson’s accountability sense. (See the previous subsection for the distinction between accountability and attributability.)

According to attributionism, fulfillment of attributability conditions is sufficient for holding agents accountable for their behavior. This means that attributionism rejects conditions on moral responsibility that would excuse agents if their characters were shaped under adverse conditions (Scanlon 1998, 278–85), or if the thing for which the agent is blamed was not under their control (Sher 2006b and 2009, A. Smith 2005), or if the agent can’t be expected to recognize the moral status of their behavior (Scanlon 1998, 287–290; Talbert 2012a). Attributionists reject these conditions on responsibility because morally significant behavior is attributable to agents that do not fulfill them. Attributionists have also argued that blame may profitably be understood as a form of moral protest (Hieronymi 2001, A. Smith 2013, Talbert 2012a); part of the appeal of this move is that moral protests may be legitimate in cases in which the above conditions are not met.

Some argue that attributionists are wrong to reject the conditions on responsibility mentioned in the last paragraph (Levy 2005, 2011; Shoemaker 2011, 2015; Watson 2011). It has also been argued that the attributionist account of blame is too close to mere negative appraisal (Levy 2005; Wallace 1996, 80–1; Watson 2002). In addition, Scanlon (2008) has been criticized for failing to take negative emotions such as resentment to be central to the phenomenon of blame (Wallace 2011, Wolf 2011; the criticism could also be applied to Sher 2006). For overviews of attributionism, see Schlossberger (2021) and Talbert (2022).

3.1.3 Answerability

Building on the distinction between attributability and accountability (§3.1.1), David Shoemaker (2011 and 2015) introduces a third form of responsibility: answerability. On Shoemaker’s view, attributability-responsibility assessments respond to facts about an agent’s character, accountability-responsibility responds to an agent’s degree of regard for others, and answerability-responsibility responds to an agent’s evaluative judgments. A. Smith (2015) and Hieronymi (2008 and 2014) use “answerability” to refer to a view more like the attributionist perspective described in the previous subsection, and Pereboom (2014) has used the term to indicate a form of responsibility more congenial to responsibility skeptics.

3.2 The Moral Competence Condition on Responsibility

Possession of moral competence—the ability to recognize and respond to moral considerations—is often taken to be a condition on moral responsibility. Wolf’s (1987) story of JoJo illustrates this proposal. JoJo was raised by an evil dictator and becomes the same sort of sadistic tyrant that his father was. JoJo is happy to be the sort of person that he is, and he is moved by precisely the desires (e.g., to imprison and torture his subjects) that he wants to be moved by. Thus, JoJo fulfills important conditions on responsibility (see, in particular, the discussion of structural accounts of responsibility in §3.9), however, Wolf argues that it may be unfair to hold JoJo responsible for his objectionable behavior.

JoJo’s upbringing plays an important role in Wolf’s argument, but only because it left JoJo unable to appreciate the wrongfulness of his behavior. It is JoJo’s impaired moral competence that does the real excusing work, and similar conclusions of non-responsibility should be drawn about others whom we think “could not help but be mistaken about their [bad] values” (Wolf 1987, 57).

Many join Wolf in arguing that impaired moral competence (perhaps on account of one’s upbringing or other environmental factors) undermines moral responsibility (Benson 2001, Fischer and Ravizza 1998, Fricker 2010, Levy 2003, Russell 1995 and 2004, Wallace 1996, Watson [1987]2004). Part of what motivates this conclusion is the thought that it can be unreasonable to expect morally-impaired agents to avoid wrongful behavior, and that it is therefore unfair to expose these agents to the harm of moral blame (also see §2.2.3 and §3.1.1). For detailed development of the moral competence requirement on responsibility in terms of considerations of fairness, see Wallace (1996); also see Kelly (2013), Levy (2009), and Watson ([1987]2004). For rejection of the claim that blame is unfair in the case of morally-impaired agents, see several of the defenders of attributionism mentioned in §3.1.2.

The moral competence condition on responsibility can also be motivated by the suggestion that impaired agents are not able to commit wrongs that have the sort of moral significance to which blame would be an appropriate response. While morally-impaired agents can fail to show appropriate respect for others, these failures do not necessarily constitute the kind of flouting of moral norms that grounds blame (Watson [1987]2004, 234). In other words, a failure to respect others, is not always an instance of blame-grounding disrespect for others, since the latter (but not the former) requires the ability to comprehend the norms that one violates (Levy 2007, Shoemaker 2011; for a reply, see Talbert 2012b).

3.3 Conversational Approaches to Responsibility

Conversational theories of responsibility construe elements of our responsibility practices as moves in a moral conversation.

Several prominent versions of the conversational approach develop P. F. Strawson’s suggestion (§2.2.1) that the negative reactive attitudes involved in blame are expressions of a demand for moral regard. Considerations about moral competence (§3.2) are relevant here. Watson argues that a demand “presumes,” as a condition on the intelligibility of expressing it, “understanding on the part of the object of the demand” ([1987]2004, 230). Therefore, since, “[t]he reactive attitudes are incipiently forms of communication,” they are intelligibly expressed “only on the assumption that the other can comprehend the message,” and since the message is a moral one, “blaming and praising those with diminished moral understanding loses its ‘point’” (Watson [1987]2004, 230; see Watson 2011 for a modification of his original proposal). Wallace argues, similarly, that since responsibility practices are internal to moral relationships that are “defined by the successful exchange of moral criticism and justification…. It will be reasonable to hold accountable only someone who is at least a candidate for this kind of exchange of criticism and justification” (1996, 164).

Michael McKenna’s Conversation and Responsibility (2012) offers the most developed conversational analysis of responsibility. For McKenna, the “moral responsibility exchange” occurs in stages: an initial “moral contribution” of morally salient behavior; the “moral address” of, e.g., blame that responds to the moral contribution; the “moral account” in which the first contributor responds to moral address with, e.g., apology; and so on (2012, 89). Like Wallace and Watson, McKenna notes the way in which a morally-impaired agent will find it difficult “to appreciate the challenges put to her by those who hold [her] morally responsible,” but he also argues that a sufficiently impaired agent cannot even make the first move in a moral conversation (2012, 78). Thus, a morally-impaired agent’s responsibility is called into question not only because they are unable to respond appropriately to moral demands, but also because “she is incapable of acting from a will with a moral quality that could be a candidate for assessment from the standpoint of holding responsible” (McKenna 2012, 78). This is related to Levy’s and Shoemaker’s contention (§3.2) that impairments of moral competence can leave an agent unable to express the type of ill will to which blame responds. By contrast, Watson (2011), allows that significant moral impairment is compatible with the ability to perform blame-relevant wrongdoing, even if such impairment undermines the wrongdoer’s moral accountability for their actions.

For another important account of responsibility in broadly conversational terms, see Shoemaker’s discussion of the sort of moral anger involved in holding others accountable for their behavior (2015, 87–117). For additional defenses and articulations of the conversational approach to responsibility, see Darwall (2006), Fricker (2016), and Macnamara (2015).

It was suggested above that blame may amount to the expression of a moral demand. Macnamara (2013) argues, to the contrary, that blame is not helpfully construed in such terms, and that the prospects for construing praise as a demand are even worse. Macnamara suggests that we should interpret both blame and praise as ways of recognizing the moral significance of behavior, and as calling on the blamed and the praised to express similar recognitions of the quality of their actions. In successful cases, this will involve the target of blame being subject to feelings of guilt or remorse, and the target of praise being subject to feelings of self-approbation. Similarly, Telech (2021), interprets praise not as issuing a demand but rather as issuing an invitation to the praiseworthy person to accept moral credit by jointly (i.e., with the praiser) valuing what was creditworthy in their action.

3.4 Standing to Hold Responsible

A number of philosophers have recently investigated the conditions under which one may lack the standing to hold another person morally responsible. With respect to blame, the thought is that a blamer can, for one reason or another, lack the authority to blame even if the one they blame is blameworthy. There is disagreement about whether the authority just mentioned amounts to a right that permits one to blame or whether it also involves a normative power to issue a demand for some appropriate response (e.g., an apology). With respect to the first possibility, standingless blame is pro tanto impermissible because one lacks the right to blame; with respect to the second possibility, standingless blame fails to generate imperatives for the blamee. (For the distinction just mentioned, see Fritz and Miller 2022; for accounts of the normative power involved in this context, see Edwards 2019 and Piovarchy 2020). There is also uncertainty in the literature about whether lack of standing should inhibit only overt blaming responses or whether private blame—which may amount only to a blamer’s being subject to otherwise fitting emotional responses (see §2.2.3)— can also be ruled out on grounds of lack of standing.

Several conditions on standing to blame have been proposed, but most attention has been given to two: the no-meddling condition (where one has standing to blame only if blame would not amount to an inappropriate intrusion into the affairs of others—see McKiernan 2016 and Seim 2019) and the non-hypocrisy condition (where one has standing to blame only if they can do so non-hypocritically). Of these two conditions, the second has received more attention.

In a case of hypocritical blame, one blames another for violating a norm that they themselves have unrepentantly violated. Wallace (2010) argues that the hypocritical blamer is open to a distinct moral objection that undermines their standing to blame. The basis for this objection is that the hypocritical blamer denies “the presumption of the equal standing of persons” (Wallace 2010, 330). This presumption—constitutive, Wallace argues, of the moral practice in which the hypocritical blamer is engaged—is denied because the hypocritical blamer takes themselves to remain insulated from blame yet does not take the similarly-morally-positioned target of their blame to enjoy the same protection. (Wallace takes the hypocrite to lack standing not just for expressions of blame but also for the private experience of blaming emotions.)

Fritz and Miller (2018) say that the hypocritical blamer has a “differential blaming disposition”: they are disposed to blame another but not themselves, where there is no morally relevant difference that would justify this. This makes hypocritical blame unfair, which provide “a moral reason that counts against blaming” in contexts of hypocrisy (Fritz and Miller 2018, 122). (It could just as well be concluded that the hypocritical blamer has moral reason to blame more rather than less: that is, they have reason to extend their blame to themselves. A hypocritical blamer may regain standing to blame in this way; see Fritz and Miller 2018 and Todd 2019.) For Fritz and Miller, the unfairness of a differential blaming disposition accounts for what is objectionable in hypocritical blame. To motivate the conclusion that the hypocritical blamer lacks standing to blame, they argue that our right to blame others is grounded in the fact that persons are morally equal. Since “hypocrisy involves at least an implicit rejection of the equality of persons” (Fritz and Miller 2018, 125), the hypocritical blamer rejects the very thing that would ground their right to blame, so they lack standing to blame.

Todd (2019) objects to the preceding accounts, arguing that “we cannot derive the non-hypocrisy condition from facts about the equality of persons” (2019, 371). Against Fritz and Miller, Todd argues that reliance on the equality of persons gives an unwelcome result: it entails that a merely inconsistent blamer lacks standing to blame. If A is disposed, for no good reason, to differentially blame B and C, then A has a differential blaming disposition. So does A, like the hypocritical blamer, lose standing to blame B and C? For his own part, Todd suggests that we may not be able to derive the non-hypocrisy condition from anything more basic (such as considerations about rights or equality), but perhaps we can at least give a partially unifying account of what lack of standing to blame involves. Failure to meet an important subset of standing conditions involves, Todd argues, a blaming agent’s own lack of sufficient commitment to the moral values that the agent blames others for failing to sufficiently respect. For other defenses of this “commitment” view, see Lippert-Rasmussen 2020, Riedener 2019, and Rossi 2018.

In arguing against the non-hypocrisy condition, Bell (2013) notes that “people may … evince a wide variety of moral faults through their blame: they can show meanness, pettiness, stinginess, arrogance, and so on” (2013, 275). But since the arrogant blamer does not clearly lack standing to blame, perhaps we need not conclude that the hypocritical blamer lacks such standing. After all, some of the aims of blame—educating the blamer or providing them with motivation to avoid further wrongdoing—are obtainable even if the one who blames does so hypocritically (Bell 2013, 275). See Fritz and Miller (2018) for a reply to Bell on these points.

King (2019) is also skeptical about a standing condition on blame. He argues (i) that the prospects are dim for giving a plausible account of the right on which standing to blame is supposed to rest, and (ii) that we can appeal to something other than standing to account for what goes wrong in cases of hypocritical and meddling blame. In both cases, the objectionable blamer simply has reason to not blame; rather, they ought to attend to something else (to their own business in the meddling case, to their own faults in the hypocrisy case).

Standing conditions may also apply to praise. Telech (2021) notes that one who lacks an appropriate commitment to the values that a praiseworthy person respects may not be correctly positioned to offer praise: the praiseworthy person may reasonably reject such a praiser’s invitation to accept moral credit (2021, 172). Jeppsson and Brandenburg (2022) argue that hypocritical praise may fail to respect the equality of persons: If A praises B for a type of action that A is not committed to performing, this may indicate that A holds B to a higher standard than the one to which A holds themselves. And what if A is partly responsible for B having to exert themselves in a praiseworthy way? Here, B may rightly ask of A, “Who are you to praise me?” (Jeppsson and Brandenburg 2022, 671; emphasis in original). Finally, Lippert-Rasmussen (2021) has argued that a person may lack standing to praise themselves when they do so hypocritically—that is, when they would not praise another on the same grounds that they praise themselves.

3.5 Responsibility for Outcomes

It’s widely held that moral agents can be responsible not just for actions but also for the causal outcomes of their actions. This can be accounted for by appeal to derivative responsibility: an agent’s responsibility for an outcome may derive from their responsibility for a causally related action. Responsibility for outcomes also involves an epistemic condition: the responsible agent must have been aware of—or at least it must be that they could have and should have been aware of—the likely consequences their actions. (The last point is related to the material in §3.10). Carolina Sartorio collects these elements in her Principle of Derivative Responsibility: “If an agent is responsible for X, X causes Y, and the relevant epistemic conditions for responsibility obtain, then the agent is also responsible for Y” (2016, 76). Blameworthiness for outcomes can perhaps be accounted for in a related way: if an agent fulfills the relevant causal and epistemic conditions on responsibility with respect to some outcome, and they fulfill those conditions in a way that makes them blameworthy, then the agent is blameworthy for the outcome. For proposals along these lines, see Sartorio’s Principle of Derivative Blameworthiness (2016, 77) as well as Björnsson (2017b) and Gunnemyr and Touborg (2023).

If an agent can be responsible for an outcome in virtue of some earlier action, can they also be responsible for an outcome in virtue of an omission? But what are omissions? Are they constituted by other actions that an agent performs, or are omissions simply absences? In the latter case, it may be difficult to see how omissions—being absences—can enter into causal relations with events such as outcomes. But even if omissions are not, strictly speaking, causes, they may still be related to outcomes in a way that is sufficient to support responsibility: when someone fails to act, it may be quite pertinent that an outcome occurs that would not have occurred had the agent not omitted the action in question. For development of this idea, see Clarke (2014, Chapter 2) and Sartorio (2016, Chapter 2) as well as the authors they cite, particularly Dowe (2000). For another important account of responsibility for omissions, see Fischer and Ravizza (1998, Chapter 5). Clarke (2014) offers a valuable treatment of many issues associated with omissions; also see the essays in Nelkin and Rickless (2017a).

If responsibility for outcomes partly depends on the obtaining of causal (or related) relationships, then factors that affect judgments about causation may also affect judgments about moral responsibility. For example, if different theories of causation yield different answers to the question of whether an agent caused an outcome, they may also yield different answers to questions about the agent’s responsibility for the outcome (Bernstein 2017). And in cases of group causation, it may be that the addition or subtraction of causal contributors will affect judgments about the degree to which any individual in the group caused the outcome; again, a corresponding effect on judgments about individual responsibility should be expected. (See Bernstein 2017 and Sartorio 2015 for the last point; both authors note that a form of moral luck may be in play here since whether an agent is part of a larger or a smaller group of causal contributors may be beyond the agent’s control; regarding moral luck, see §3.7) There may also be cases in which it is simply indeterminate what an agent has caused, and judgments about responsibility in these cases may likewise be indeterminate (Bernstein 2016).

In contrast to the tenor of the discussion so far, Kutz (2000) argues that founding responsibility on causal connections can—at least in cases of group agency—lead to counterintuitive results. Kutz’s central example is the Allied bombing campaign that destroyed the German city of Dresden in WWII (2000, 116–24). Far more bombs and bombers were used in the raid than were required to destroy the city, and each bomber pilot might plausibly claim that their casual contribution made no difference to that outcome. Kutz argues that, for the purposes of assessing individual moral accountability, we should refer not to individual causal contributions but rather to the pilots’ overlapping intentions and attitudes that led them to participate in the raid on Dresden.

Lawson (2013) develops an account similar to Kutz’s; Petersson (2013) objects to Kutz and defends the importance of individual causal contributions for assessing responsibility. Sinnott-Armstrong (2005) and Nefsky (2017) are other important investigations of the problem of how to assess non-difference-making causal contributions. Nefsky argues that an individual can make non-superfluous contributions to preventing or bringing about an outcome even if their contributions do not decide whether the outcome occurs. Gunneymr and Touborg’s (2023) emphasis on the way that individual, non-difference-making causal contributions may increase or decrease the “security” of an outcome is also relevant here. Kaiserman (2024) applies a view developed in Kaiserman (2016) to cases like Kutz’s, arguing that an agent can partly contribute to an outcome even if there is no identifiable part of the outcome that they caused.

Positing responsibility for outcomes may involve a commitment to outcome moral luck (§3.7) because while an agent may control their action, whether that action leads to a certain outcome is typically not entirely within the agent’s control. Skepticism about outcome moral luck may thus lead to skepticism about responsibility and blameworthiness for outcomes. Perhaps agents are never responsible for outcomes but only for their action-explaining motives and intentions, or for exercising their will in a certain way. The same may be true of blameworthiness. Andrew Khoury argues that “the only things that one can be blameworthy for are those things that make one blameworthy,” and for Khoury, it is only the moral quality of our “willings,” and never the outcomes to which these willings may lead, that can make us blameworthy (Khoury 2018, 1363). Also see Graham (2014) and (2017) for important contributions in this vein.

3.6 Skepticism about Responsibility

If moral responsibility requires free will and free will requires a type of access to alternatives that is not compatible with determinism (see §1), then it follows that if determinism is true, no one is ever morally responsible for their behavior. The above reasoning, and the skeptical conclusion it reaches about responsibility, is endorsed by the hard determinist perspective on free will and responsibility, which was defended historically by Spinoza and d’Holbach (among others) and more recently by Honderich (2002). But given that determinism may well be false, contemporary skeptics about responsibility more often pursue a hard incompatibilist line of argument according to which the kind of free will required for desert-based (as opposed to forward-looking, see §2.1) moral responsibility is incompatible with the truth or falsity of determinism (Pereboom 2001, 2014).

Discussion of skeptical positions that do not depend on the truth of determinism can be found in each of the four subsections below. For additional skeptical accounts, see Smilansky (2000), Waller (2011); also see the entry on skepticism about moral responsibility.

3.7 Moral Luck and Responsibility

A person is subject to moral luck if factors that are not under that person’s control affect the moral assessments to which they are open (Nagel [1976]1979; also see Williams [1976]1981 and the entry on moral luck.)

Can luck affect moral responsibility? Consider an unsuccessful assassin who shoots at their target but misses because their bullet is deflected by a passing bird. This assassin has good outcome moral luck. Because of factors beyond their control; their moral record is better than it might have been: they are not a murderer and not morally responsible for causing anyone’s death. One might think, in addition, that an unsuccessful assassin is less blameworthy than a successful assassin with whom they are otherwise identical, and that the reason for this is just that the successful assassin intentionally killed someone while the unsuccessful assassin did not. (For important recent defenses of moral luck, see Hanna 2014 and Hartman 2017)

On the other hand, one might think that if the two assassins are identical in terms of their values, goals, intentions, and motivations, then the addition of a bit of luck to the unsuccessful assassin’s story cannot ground a deep contrast between the two in terms of their moral responsibility. One way to sustain this position is to argue that moral responsibility is a function solely of internal features of agents, such as their motives and intentions (Graham 2014 and Khoury 2018; also see §3.5; see Enoch and Marmor 2007 for the main arguments against moral luck). Of course, the successful assassin is responsible for something (killing a person) for which the unsuccessful assassin is not, but perhaps both are responsible—and presumably blameworthy—to the same degree insofar as it was true of both that they aimed to kill, and that they did so for the same reasons and with the same commitment toward bringing about that outcome (M. Zimmerman 2002 and 2015).

But now consider a different would-be assassin who does not even try to kill anyone, but only because their circumstances did not favor this option. This would-be assassin is willing to kill under favorable circumstances (so they may have had good circumstantial moral luck since they were not in those circumstances). Perhaps the degree of responsibility attributed to the successful and unsuccessful assassins described in the previous paragraph depends not so much on the fact that they both tried to kill as on the fact that they were both willing to kill, and the would-be assassin may share the same degree of responsibility since they share the same willingness to kill. But an account that focuses on what agents would be willing to do under counterfactual circumstances is likely to generate unintuitive conclusions about responsibility since many agents who are typically judged blameless might willingly perform terrible actions under the right circumstances. (M. Zimmerman 2002 and 2015 does not shy away from this consequence, but critics—Hanna 2014, Hartman 2017—have made much of it; see Peels 2015 for a position related to Zimmerman’s that may avoid the unintuitive consequence just mentioned.)

Once luck is taken fully into account, there is reason to worry that responsibility may be generally undermined. Consider constitutive moral luck: luck in how one is constituted in terms of the “inclinations, capacities, and temperament” one finds within oneself (Nagel [1976]1979, 28). Facts about a person’s inclinations, capacities, and temperament explain much—if not all—of that person’s behavior, and if the facts that explain why a person acts as they do are a result of good or bad luck, then perhaps it is unfair to hold them responsible for their behavior. And as Nagel notes, once the full sweep of the various kinds of luck comes into view, “[t]he area of genuine agency” may shrink to nothing since our actions and their consequences “result from the combined influence of factors, antecedent and posterior to action, that are not within the agent’s control” ([1976]1979, 35). If this is right, then perhaps, “nothing remains which can be ascribed to the responsible self, and we are left with nothing but a … sequence of events, which can be deplored or celebrated, but not blamed or praised” (Nagel [1976]1979, 37).

Nagel doesn’t fully embrace a skeptical conclusion about responsibility on the above grounds, but others have done so, most notably, Neil Levy (2011). According to Levy’s “hard luck view,” the encompassing nature of moral luck means “that there are no desert-entailing differences between moral agents” (2011, 10). There are differences between agents in terms of their characters and the good or bad actions and outcomes that they produce, but Levy’s point is that, given the influence of luck in generating these differences, they don’t provide a sound basis for differential treatment of people in terms of moral praise and blame. (See Russell 2017 for a compatibilist account that leads to a variety of pessimism, though not skepticism, on the basis of the concerns about moral luck.)

3.8 Ultimate Responsibility

Galen Strawson’s Basic Argument concludes that “we cannot be truly or ultimately morally responsible for our actions” (1994, 5). (Since the argument targets “ultimate” responsibility, it does not necessarily exclude other forms, such as forward-looking responsibility [§2.1] and, on some understandings, responsibility-as-attributability [§3.1.1].) The argument begins by noting that agents make the choices they do because of what seems choiceworthy to them. (This is related to the discussion of constitutive moral luck in §3.7.) So, in order to be responsible for their choices, agents must be responsible for the fact that certain things seem choiceworthy to them. But how can agents be responsible for these prior facts about themselves? Wouldn’t this require a prior choice on the part of the agent, one that resulted in their present disposition to see certain ends as choiceworthy? But this prior choice would itself be something for which the agent would be responsible only if the agent is also responsible for the fact that the prior choice seemed choiceworthy to them. A regress looms here, and Strawson claims that it cannot be stopped except by positing an initial act of self-creation on the responsible agent’s part (G. Strawson 1994, 5, 15). But self-creation is impossible, so no one is ever ultimately responsible for their behavior.

A number of replies to this argument are possible. One might simply deny that how a person came to be the way they are matters for present responsibility: perhaps all we need to know in order to judge a person’s responsibility are facts about their present constitution and about how that constitution is related to the person’s present behavior. (For views like this, see the discussion of attributionism [§3.1.2] and the discussion of non-historical accounts of responsibility in the next subsection). Alternatively, one might think that while personal history matters for moral responsibility, Strawson’s argument sets the bar too high (see Fischer 2006; for a reply, see Levy 2011, 5). Perhaps what is needed is not literal self-creation, but simply an ability to enact changes in oneself so as to acquire responsibility for the self that results from these changes (Clarke 2005). A picture along these lines can be found in Aristotle’s suggestion (in Book III of the Nicomachean Ethics) that one can be responsible for being a careless person if one’s present state of carelessness is the result of earlier choices that one made (also see Moody-Adams 1990).

Roughly in this Aristotelian vein, Robert Kane offers an incompatibilist account of how an agent can be ultimately responsibility for their actions (1996 and 2007). On Kane’s view, for an agent “to be ultimately responsible for [a] choice, the agent must be at least in part responsible by virtue of choices or actions voluntarily performed in the past for having the character and motives he or she now has” (2007, 14; emphasis in original). This position may appear to be open to the regress concerns presented in Strawson’s argument above, but Kane thinks a regress is avoided in cases in which a person’s character-forming choices are undetermined. Since these undetermined choices will have no sufficient causes, there is no relevant prior cause for which the agent must be responsible, so there is no regress problem (Kane 2007, 15–16; see Pereboom 2001, 47–50 for criticism.)

Of particular interest to Kane are potential character-forming choices that occur “when we are torn between competing visions of what we should do or become” (2007, 26). In such cases, if a person sees reasons in favor of either choice that they might make, and the choice that they make is undetermined, then whichever choice they make will have been chosen for their own reasons. According to Kane, when an agent makes this kind of choice, they shape their own character, and since the agent’s choice is not determined by prior causal factors, they are responsible for that choice, for the character shaped by it, and for the character-determined choices that the agent may make in the future.

3.9 Personal History and Manipulation

Accounts such as Levy’s (2011) and G. Strawson’s (1994), described in the two preceding subsections, argue that a person’s present responsibility can depend on facts about the way that person came to be as they are. But non-historical views, such as attributionism (§3.1.2) and the views that Susan Wolf calls “Real Self” theories (§3.1.1), reject this contention. Real Self accounts are sometimes referred to as “structural” or “hierarchical” theories. By whatever name, the basic idea is that an agent is morally responsible insofar as their will has the right structure: in particular, there needs to be an appropriate relationship between the desires that actually move an agent and that agent’s values, or between the desires that move an agent and that agent’s higher-order desires, the latter of which are the agent’s reflective preferences about which desires should move them. (For approaches along these lines, see Dworkin 1987; Frankfurt 1971, 1987; and Watson 1975.)

Harry Frankfurt’s comparison between a willing drug addict and an unwilling addict illustrates important features of his version of the structural approach to responsibility. Both of Frankfurt’s addicts strongly desire to take the drug to which they are addicted and these first-order desires will ultimately move both addicts to take the drug. But the addicts have different higher-order perspectives on their first-order desire to take the drug. The willing addict endorses and identifies with his addictive desire, but the unwilling addict repudiates his addictive desire to such an extent that, when it ends up being effective, Frankfurt says that this addict is “helplessly violated by his own desires” (1971, 12). The willing addict has a kind of freedom that the unwilling addict lacks: they may both act on the desire to take the drug, but insofar as the willing addict is moved by a desire that he endorses, he acts freely in a way that the unwilling addict does not (Frankfurt 1971, 19). A related conclusion about responsibility may be drawn: perhaps the unwilling addict’s addictive desire is alien to him in such a way that his responsibility for acting on it is called into question (for a recent defense of this conclusion, see Sripada 2017).

Frankfurt assumes that an agent’s higher-order desires have the authority to speak for the agent—they reveal (or constitute) the agent’s “real self,” to use Wolf’s language (1990). But if higher-order desires are invoked out of a concern that an agent’s lower-order desires may not speak for the agent, why won’t the same worry recur with respect to higher-order desires? When ascending through the orders of desires, why stop at any particular point? Why not think that appeal to a still higher order is always necessary to reveal where an agent stands? See Watson (1975) for this objection, which partly motivates Watson—in his articulation of a structural approach—to focus on whether an agent’s desires conform with their values, rather than with their higher-order desires.

Even if one agrees with Frankfurt about the structural elements required for responsibility, one might wonder how an agent’s will came to have its particular structure. An objection to Frankfurt’s view notes that the relevant structure might have been put in place by factors that intuitively undermine responsibility, in which case the presence of the relevant structure is not sufficient for responsibility (Fischer and Ravizza 1998, 196–201; Locke 1975). Fischer and Ravizza argue that “[i]f the mesh [between higher- and lower-order desires] were produced by … brainwashing or subliminal advertising … we would not hold the agent morally responsible for his behavior” because the psychological mechanism that produced the behavior would not be, “in an important intuitive sense, the agent’s own” (1998, 197; emphasis in original). In response to this type of worry, Fischer and Ravizza argue that responsibility has a historical component, which they attempt to capture with their account of how agents can “take responsibility” for the psychological mechanism that produces their behavior (1998, 207–239). (For criticism of Fischer and Ravizza’s account of taking responsibility, see Levy 2011, 103–106 and Pereboom 2001, 120–22; for elaboration and defense of Fischer and Ravizza’s account, see Fischer 2004; for quite different accounts of taking responsibility, see Enoch 2012; Mason 2019, 179–207; and Wolf 2001. For work on the general significance of personal histories for responsibility, see Christman 1991, Vargas 2006, and D. Zimmerman 2003.)

Part of Fischer and Ravizza’s motivation for developing their account of “taking responsibility” was to ensure that agents who have been manipulated in certain ways do not count as responsible on their view. Several examples and arguments featuring the sort of manipulation that worry Fischer and Ravizza have played important roles in the recent literature on responsibility. One of these is Alfred Mele’s Beth/Ann example (1995, 2006b), which emphasizes the difficulties faced by accounts of responsibility that eschew historical conditions. Ann has acquired her preferences and values in the normal way, but Beth is manipulated by a team of neuroscientists so that she now has preferences and values that are identical to Ann’s. After the manipulation, Beth reflectively endorses her new values. Such endorsement might be a sign of the self-governance associated with responsibility, but Mele argues that Beth, unlike Ann, exhibits merely “ersatz self-government” since Beth’s new values were imposed on her (1995, 155). And if other kinds of personal histories similarly undermine an agent’s ability to authentically govern their behavior, then agents with these histories will not be morally responsible. For replies to Mele and general insights into manipulation cases, see Arpaly (2003), King (2013), and Todd (2011); for discussion of issues about personal identity that arise in manipulation cases, see Khoury (2013), Matheson (2014), Shoemaker (2012).

One can take a hard line in Beth’s case (Mckenna 2004). That is, one might note that while Beth acquired her new values in a strange way, everyone acquires their values in ways that are not fully under their control. Indeed, following Galen Strawson’s (1994) line of argument (described in §3.8), it might be noted that no one has ultimate control over their values, and even if normal agents have some capacity to address and alter their values, the dispositional factors that govern use of this capacity ultimately result from factors beyond agents’ control. Perhaps, then, Beth is not so easily distinguished from normal agents; perhaps she is just as responsible as they are. But this reasoning can cut both ways: instead of showing that Beth is assimilated into the class of normal, responsible agents, it might show that normal agents are assimilated into the class of non-responsible agents. Derk Pereboom’s four-case argument reasons along these lines (1995, 2001, 2007, 2014). (The “zygote argument” is also relevant here; see Mele 1995, 2006b, and 2008.)

Pereboom’s argument presents four scenarios involving Plum in which Plum kills White while satisfying the conditions on moral responsibility most often proposed by compatibilists (and described in earlier sections of this entry). In Case 1, Plum is “created by neuroscientists, who … manipulate him directly through the use of radio-like technology” (Pereboom 2001, 112). These scientists cause Plum’s reasoning to take a certain path that culminates in Plum deciding to kill White. Pereboom believes that Plum is clearly not responsible for killing White in Case 1 since his behavior was determined by the neuroscientists. In Cases 2 and 3, Plum is causally determined to undertake the same reasoning process as in Case 1, but in Case 2 Plum is merely “programmed” to do so by neuroscientists, and in Case 3 Plum’s reasoning is the result of socio-cultural influences that determine his character. In Case 4, Plum is a normal human being in a causally deterministic universe, and he decides to kill White in the same way as in the previous cases.

Pereboom claims that there is no relevant difference between Cases 1, 2, and 3, so judgments about Plum’s responsibility should be the same in these cases. Plum is not responsible in these cases because his behavior is causally determined by forces beyond his control (Pereboom 2001, 116). But then, Pereboom argues, we should conclude that Plum is not responsible in Case 4 since causal determinism is the defining feature of that case, and the same conclusion should apply to anyone living in a causally deterministic universe.

A possible reply to Pereboom is that the manipulation to which Plum is subjected in Case 1 undermines his responsibility for some other reason besides the fact that it causally determines his behavior. This would stop the generalization of non-responsibility from Case 1 to the subsequent cases. (See Demetriou (Mickelson) 2010, Fischer 2004, Mele 2005; for a response, see Matheson 2016; Pereboom addresses this concern in his 2014 presentation of the argument; also see Shabo 2010). Alternatively, it might be argued, on compatibilist grounds, that Plum is responsible in Case 4 and that this conclusion should be extended to the earlier cases since Plum fulfills the same compatibilist conditions on responsibility in those cases (McKenna 2008).

The four-case argument attempts to show that if determinism is true, then we cannot be the sources of our actions in the way required for moral responsibility. It is, therefore, an argument for incompatibilism rather than for skepticism about moral responsibility. But in combination with Pereboom’s argument that we lack the sort of free will required for responsibility even if determinism is false (2001, 38–88; 2014, 30–70), the four-case argument has emerged as an important motivation for skepticism about responsibility.

3.10 The Epistemic Condition on Responsibility

There has been a recent surge in interest in the epistemic condition on responsibility (as opposed to the freedom or control condition that is at the center of the free will debate).

Sometimes agents act in ignorance of the bad consequences of their actions, and sometimes their ignorance excuses them from blame. But in other cases, an agent’s ignorance does not excuse them. How can we distinguish the cases where ignorance excuses from those in which it does not? One proposal is that ignorance fails to excuse when the ignorance is itself something for which the agent is to blame. And one proposal for when ignorance is blameworthy is that it issues from a blameworthy benighting act in which an agent culpably impairs, or fails to improve, their epistemic position (H. Smith 1983). In such a case, the agent’s ignorance seems to be their own fault, so it cannot excuse them.

But when is a benighting act blameworthy? Several philosophers, such Levy (2011), Rosen (2004), and M. Zimmerman (1997), have suggested that agents are culpable for benighting acts only when they perform them knowingly. The idea is that ignorance for which one is blameworthy, and that leads to blameworthy unwitting wrongdoing, must have its source in knowing wrongful behavior. So, if someone unwittingly does something wrong, then that person will be blameworthy only if we can explain their lack of knowledge (their “unwittingness”) by reference to something else that the agent knowingly and wrongfully did. Thus, Rosen concludes that “the only possible locus of original responsibility [for a later unwitting act] is an akratic act…. a knowing sin” (2004, 307; emphasis in original). Similarly, Michael Zimmerman argues that “all culpability can be traced to culpability that involves lack of ignorance, that is, that involves a belief on the agent’s part that he or she is doing something morally wrong” (1997, 418). (In certain structural respects, the argument here resembles Galen Strawson’s skeptical argument in §3.8)

The above reasoning may apply not just to cases in which a person is unaware of the consequences of their action, but also to cases in which a person is unaware of the moral status of their behavior. A slaveowner, for example, might think that slaveholding is permissible, and so, on the account considered here, they will be blameworthy only if they are culpable for their ignorance about the moral status of slavery, which will require that they ignored evidence about its moral status while knowing that this is something that they should not do (Rosen 2003 and 2004).

These reflections can give rise to a couple forms of skepticism about moral responsibility (and particularly about blameworthiness). One might endorse a form of epistemic skepticism on the grounds that we rarely have insight into whether a wrongdoer knowingly acted wrongly at some suitable point in the history of a given action (Rosen 2004). Alternatively, or in addition, one might endorse a more substantive form of skepticism on the grounds that a great many normal wrongdoers don’t exhibit the sort of knowing wrongdoing supposedly required for responsibility. Perhaps very many wrongdoers don’t know that they are wrongdoers and their ignorance on this score is not their fault since it doesn’t arise from an earlier instance of knowing wrongdoing. In this case, very many ordinary wrongdoers may fail to be responsible for their behavior. (For skeptical conclusions along these lines, see M. Zimmerman 1997 and Levy 2011.)

There is more to the epistemic dimension of responsibility than what is contained in the above skeptical argument, but the argument does bring out a lot of what is of interest in this domain. For one thing, it prominently relies on a tracing strategy. This strategy is used in accounts that feature a person who does not, at the time of action, fulfill control or knowledge conditions on responsibility, but who nonetheless seems responsible for their behavior. In such a case, the agent’s responsibility may be grounded in the fact that their failure to fulfill certain conditions on responsibility is traceable to earlier actions undertaken by the agent when they did fulfill these conditions (also see the discussion of derivative responsibility in §3.5). For example, a person may be so intoxicated that they lack control over, or awareness of, their behavior, and yet it may still be appropriate to hold them responsible for their intoxicated behavior insofar as they freely intoxicated themselves. The tracing strategy plays an important role in many accounts of responsibility (see, e.g., Fischer and Ravizza 1998, 49–51), but it has also been subjected to important criticisms (see Vargas 2005; for a reply see Fischer and Tognazzini 2009; for more on tracing, see Khoury 2012, King 2011, and Shabo 2015).

Various strategies for rejecting the above skeptical argument also illustrate stances one can take on the relationship between knowledge and responsibility. These strategies typically involve rejecting the claim that knowing wrongdoing is fundamental to blameworthiness. It has, for example, been argued that it is often morally blameworthy to perform an action when one is merely uncertain whether the action is wrong (see Guerrero 2007; also see Nelkin and Rickless 2017b and Robichaud 2014). Another strategy would be to argue that blameworthiness can be grounded in cases of morally ignorant wrongdoing if it is reasonable to expect the wrongdoer to have avoided their moral ignorance, and particularly if their ignorance is itself caused by the agent’s own epistemic and moral vices (FitzPatrick 2008 and 2017). Relatedly, it might be argued that one who is unaware that they do wrong is blameworthy if they possessed relevant capacities for avoiding their ignorance; this approach may be particularly promising in cases in which an agent’s lack of moral awareness stems from a failure to remember their moral duties (Clarke 2014, 2017 and Sher 2006, 2009; also see Rudy-Hiller 2017). Finally, it might simply be claimed that morally ignorant wrongdoers can harbor, and express through their behavior, objectionable attitudes or qualities of will that suffice for blameworthiness (Arpaly 2003, Björnsson 2017a, Harman 2011, Mason 2015). This approach may be most promising in cases in which a wrongdoer is aware of the material outcomes of their conduct but unaware of the fact that they do wrong in bringing about those outcomes.

For more, see the entry on the epistemic condition for moral responsibility as well as the essays in Robichaud and Wieland (2017).


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I would like to thank Derk Pereboom and Daniel Miller for their helpful comments on drafts of this entry.

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