Collective Responsibility

First published Mon Aug 8, 2005; substantive revision Mon Dec 19, 2022

The notion of collective responsibility, like that of personal responsibility and shared responsibility, refers in most contexts to both the causal responsibility of moral agents for harm in the world and the blameworthiness that we ascribe to them for having caused such harm. Hence, it is, like its two more purely individualistic counterparts, almost always a notion of moral, rather than purely causal, responsibility. But, unlike its two more purely individualistic counterparts, it does not associate either causal responsibility or blameworthiness with discrete individuals or locate the source of moral responsibility in the free will of individual moral agents. Instead, it associates both causal responsibility and blameworthiness with groups and locates the source of moral responsibility in the collective actions taken by these groups understood as collectives.

Since this notion of collective responsibility makes groups, as distinct from their individual members, out to be moral agents, it has undergone a great deal of scrutiny in recent years by methodological and normative individualists alike. Methodological individualists challenge the very possibility of associating moral agency with groups, as distinct from their individual members, and normative individualists argue that collective responsibility violates principles of both individual responsibility and fairness. In response to these challenges, proponents of collective responsibility set out to show that collective responsibility, as well as group intentions, collective action, and group blameworthiness, are metaphysically possible and can be ascribed to agents fairly in at least some, if not all, cases.

While the vast majority of those now writing on collective responsibility in philosophical circles continue to debate the possibility of collective responsibility, a growing number of scholars have in recent years placed three further—and very important—concerns at the center of our attention. The first has to do with whether groups have to meet the same stringent conditions of moral responsibility that individuals do. (Intentionality becomes a primary site of controversy here.) The second has to do with the advantages and disadvantages of holding particular kinds of groups, e.g., nation states, races, and ethnic groups, morally responsible in practice. The third has to do with what moral implications follow for group members from the moral responsibility of their group for harm. (Do they, too, become morally responsible for the harms and, if so, how is the blame to be distributed?)

The backward looking notion of collective responsibility cited above is what most philosophers have in mind when they talk about collective responsibility. But during the past several years there has been a growing interest in what has come to be known as forward looking collective responsibility or forward looking collective moral responsibility. Forward looking collective responsibility, unlike its backward looking counterpart, does not focus on whether a particular collective agent caused harm in the sense relevant to moral blameworthiness. Nor does it involve itself with blame in general. Instead, it focuses on what, if anything, the agent can be expected to do with respect to remedying the harm and preventing its reoccurrence. Hence, it is sometimes referred to as remedial responsibility and incorporated into larger controversies about the scope of our duties to respond.

1. Collective Responsibility: the Controversies

Both notions of collective responsibility are controversial. The traditional, backward looking, notion does not sit well with those who are skeptical about the ability of collective entities to will and to act as collective entities. The forward looking notion is less controversial than its backward looking counterpart is with respect to its metaphysical foundations. But it does raise questions about how—on the basis of what norms and principles—we can ascribe such responsibility in practice.

Three kinds of controversies surround the traditional notion of collective responsibility.

The first of these controversies concerns whether or not collective responsibility makes sense as a form of moral responsibility. Not surprisingly, the primary focus of attention here has been with both the moral agency of groups in general and the possibility of group intentions in particular. How, participants in this controversy have asked, can we understand the notion of collective responsibility as a matter of moral—and not just causal—responsibility? Is it possible for groups, as distinct from their members, to cause harm in the sense required by moral responsibility? to act as collectives? to have intentions? Is it possible for groups, as distinct from their members, to be morally blameworthy for bringing about harm? to be guilty as moral agents?

The second controversy, interestingly enough, is not really about the moral responsibility of groups at all, even though it is couched in the language of collective moral responsibility. Instead, it is about the moral responsibility of individuals who belong to groups that are themselves thought to be morally responsible for particular cases of harm. How, participants in this controversy have asked, can we distribute collective responsibility across individual members of such a group? Does it makes sense to distribute collective responsibility in general? Is it appropriate to hold individual group members morally responsible for harm that other group members caused? that the group itself caused? that the group as a whole failed to prevent? If so, under what conditions and with respect to what particular kinds of groups? Random collections of individuals? Interest-based groups? Corporate entities?

The third controversy is primarily normative and concerns the value of ascribing collective responsibility in practice. In some cases, the concern is with the general practice of collective responsibility and its consequences for our ability to sustain the values of individualism, freedom, and justice. In other cases, the concern is with the ascriptions of collective responsibility in particular contexts, e.g., in the contexts of war tribunals, reparations for slavery, terrorism, and rape, and with whether such ascriptions are productive and/or fair to those being blamed. What would happen, critics ask, if we were to replace individual responsibility with collective responsibility? Would we be letting individuals off the hook? Would we be eroding the practice of personal responsibility in general?

The controversies surrounding forward looking collective responsibility have to do with both the role of agent causation in ascribing responsibility for remedying harm in the world and the norms and principles that may—or may not—be appropriate to invoke in this context. Does responsibility for remedying harm come down to who caused the harm? If not, what other criteria should we employ? Should we turn to those who are most capable of preventing the harm and hold them—and the community of which they are a part—responsible for remedial action? (Is forward looking collective responsibility primarily an exercise in pragmatism?) Do considerations of fairness have any place in our ascriptions of such responsibility and, if so, what kinds of fairness are relevant? What happens in cases where there is no collective entity capable of taking remedial action? Do we have a moral obligation to bring such a collective entity about and, if so, on what basis?

2. Making Sense of Collective Responsibility: Actions, Intentions, and Group Solidarity

Almost all of those now writing about collective responsibility agree that collective responsibility would make sense if it were merely an aggregative phenomenon. But they disagree markedly about whether collective responsibility makes sense as a non-distributive phenomenon, i.e., as a phenomenon that transcends the contributions of particular group members. In this context, as in many others, skeptics set the agenda. Two claims become crucial. The first is that groups, unlike individuals, cannot form intentions and hence cannot be understood to act or to cause harm qua groups. The second is that groups, as distinct from their individual members, cannot be understood as morally blameworthy in the sense required by moral responsibility.

Both claims come out of classical methodological individualism of the sort articulated by Max Weber (Weber 1914) and H. D. Lewis (Lewis 1948) in their respective rejections of collective responsibility. In Economy and Society Vol. I, Weber (Weber 1914) argues that collective responsibility makes no sense both because we cannot isolate genuinely collective actions, as distinct from identical actions of many persons, and because groups, unlike the individuals who belong to them, cannot think as groups or formulate intentions of the kind normally thought to be necessary to actions. H. D. Lewis follows suit in his own arguments and couples his methodological individualism with a sense of moral outrage at the idea of blaming individuals for the actions of others. Lewis writes:

Value belongs to the individual and it is the individual who is the sole bearer of moral responsibility. No one is morally guilty except in relation to some conduct which he himself considered to be wrong … Collective responsibility is … barbarous. (Lewis 1948, pp. 3–6)

Contemporary critics of collective responsibility do not generally go as far as Lewis does here in equating collective responsibility with barbarism. But they do generally share their predecessors’ skepticism about the possibility of both group intentions and genuinely collective actions. (See below.) Likewise, they, too, worry about the fairness of ascribing collective responsibility to individuals who do not themselves directly cause harm or who do not bring about harm purposefully. Stephen Sverdlik writes:

It would be unfair, whether we are considering a result produced by more than one person’s action or by a single person, to blame a person for a result that he or she did not intend to produce. (Sverdlik 1987, p. 68)

Both of these claims—that genuinely collective actions are not possible and that it would be unfair to consider agents morally blameworthy for harm that they did not bring about purposively—rest on two normative assumptions that are key to the critic’s position. Both concern the importance of intentions. The first is that actions—whether they are individual or collective—necessarily begin with intentions. (Otherwise, they are not actions but instead kinds of behavior.) The second is that moral blameworthiness has its source in and requires the existence of bad intentions—or at least moral faultiness—on the part of those being held responsible.

The first assumption, namely, that all actions begin with intentions, is very useful to critics because it enables them to write group intentions into the definition of collective action itself and hence render group intentions a necessary condition of collective responsibility. J. Angelo Corlett’s definition of a collective action is typical here. According to Corlett,

[a] collective (intentional) action is an action the subject of which is a collective intentional agent. A collective behavior is a doing or behavior that is the result of a collective, though not the result of its intentions. A collective action is caused by the beliefs and desires (wants) of the collective itself, whether or not such beliefs and desires can be accounted for or explained in individualistic terms (Corlett 2001, p. 575).

The second assumption, namely, that moral blameworthiness of all kinds is grounded in the bad intentions of moral agents who cause harm, is also very useful to critics of collective responsibility, since it enables them to stipulate that collective responsibility requires, not just group intentions, but the ability of groups to have bad intentions or at least to be morally faulty. How, critics ask, can groups, as distinct from their individual members, be understood to have bad intentions? to be morally faulty? to have a moral character, faulty or not? How, in other words, can they be understood as appropriate bearers of moral blameworthiness, guilt, or shame?

A majority of critics here concentrate on showing either that actions are associated exclusively with individuals, not groups, or that groups, which do not have minds of their own, cannot make choices or hold beliefs in the sense required by the formulation of intentions. H. D Lewis concentrates on making both points in his 1948 critique of collective responsibility. So, too, does J. W. N. Watkins (1957). Later methodological individualists such as Alvin Goldman (1970), Stephen Sverdlik (1987), J. Angelo Corlett (Corlett 2001), and Jan Narveson (2002), unlike their predecessors, are generally willing to acknowledge the sensibility of collective responsibility in a limited number of cases. But, they, too, draw attention to the host of difficulties that arise for collective responsibility as a moral construct once we acknowledge the simple fact that collectives do not have full blown mental lives.

Critics of collective responsibility pay somewhat less attention to the nature of collective moral blameworthiness than they do to the nature of collective actions. But they do sometimes worry about the appropriateness of associating moral blameworthiness with groups, as distinct from group members. R. S. Downie, among others, places what turns out to be a very traditional notion of moral responsibility at the center of his attention and argues that

[c]ollectives do not have moral faults, since they don’t make moral choices, and hence they cannot properly be ascribed moral responsibility. … For there to be moral responsibility there must be blameworthiness involving a morally faulty decision, and this can only occur at the individual level (Downie 1969, p. 67).

Jan Narveson goes as far in this context as to argue that the bearers of moral blameworthiness have to be individuals because only individuals can have moral agency. “Nothing else,” Narveson writes, “can literally be the bearer of full responsibility” (Narveson 2002, p. 179). The word “literally” here turns out to be significant for those writing on collective responsibility. For, it contrasts with the sense shared by Narveson and others that we might in the end be able to make sense of collective responsibility in metaphorical terms by treating individual moral agency, including both agent causation and moral blameworthiness, as a metaphor for group agency of the sort relevant to moral responsibility traditionally understood.

Defenders of collective responsibility rely on a variety of philosophical strategies to debunk the above claims and to justify both the possibility of collective responsibility in some, if not all, cases, and the coherence of collective responsibility as an intellectual construct. One of these strategies has been simply to point out both that we blame groups all the time in practice and that we do so in a way that is difficult to analyze with the precepts of methodological individualism. David Cooper, among others, uses this strategy to great effect in his own defense of collective responsibility. According to Cooper, “[t]here is an obvious point to be recognized and that obvious point is that responsibility is ascribed to collectives, as well as to individual persons. Blaming attitudes are held towards collective as well as towards individuals,” (Cooper 1968, p. 258.)

Deborah Tollefsen (Tollefsen, 2003) zeros in on the fact that we express various reactive attitudes to groups, e.g., anger, resentment, and moral indignation. How, she asks, can we make sense of these attitudes? She argues that we cannot do so by simply positing that our emotions are misfiring here or that our attitudes are really directed at group members rather than at groups themselves. Instead, we have to recognize that, within our practices of moral responsibility (a là Strawson), groups have the ability of moral address and exhibit moral competence.

But of course our practices of moral responsibility, as well as the reactive attitudes that ground them, may not be justified. Cooper himself acknowledges that both our use of language here and our blaming attitudes may be misguided. Hence, they find it necessary to show, not just that we ascribe blame to collectives in practice, but that the collective blame that we ascribe cannot be analyzed in terms of individual blame. Cooper himself takes on this project by exploring particular cases of blame, e.g., those associated with sports clubs and nations, that, he argues, can only attach to groups. According to Cooper, when we look at how such collectives act, we see that whether we regard statements about collectives as propositional functions or not, we cannot deduce from them statements about particular individuals. “This is so,” he argues, “because the existence of a collective is compatible with varying membership. No determinate set of individuals is necessary for the existence of the collective” (Cooper 1968, p. 260).

In a similar vein, Peter French focuses on that class of predicates that, he contends, can only be true of collectives. According to French,

[t]here is a class of predicates that just cannot be true of individuals, that can only be true of collectives. Examples of such predicates abound … and include ‘disbanded’ (most uses of), ‘lost the football game’, ‘elected a president’, and ‘passed an amendment’. … Methodological individualism would be at a loss in this context. (French 1998, p. 37)

A majority of those who defend the possibility of group actions in this context rely on linguistic analyses. But there are also those who, like Larry May, turn instead to social theory and to the existentialist tradition. May himself uses the relational theory of Jean-Paul Sartre to argue that groups can legitimately be ascribed actions in cases where individuals are related to one another and act in ways together that would not be possible if they acted alone. May sets down two relationally-based conditions under which we can legitimately say of an action that it is collective rather than individual—which for May means, not trans-individual, but relational. The first condition is that the individuals in question be related to each other so as to enable each to act in ways that they could not manage on their own. The second is that some individuals be authorized to represent their own actions as the actions of the group as a whole (May 1987, p. 55).

What about group intentions? Not surprisingly, group intentions present an even greater challenge than group actions do. For, intentions are mental states and hence not the kinds of things that are normally thought to be shareable. Are they shareable?

According to Brook Sadler and others, the question is inherently puzzling. For, “if intentions are mental states, states which play a fundamental role in an agent’s practical deliberation and volition, the prospect of a shared intention introduces the specter of shared mental states and hence shared minds”—which is something that philosophers have traditionally hoped to leave behind. (Sadler 2006, p.115.)

Indeed, the possibility that collective responsibility requires, not only collective actions and intentions, but a collective mind, has proven to be one of the greatest challenges to those who want to sustain a notion of collective responsibility. For while groups can legitimately be said to have beliefs and other states characteristic of a mind in particular cases, e.g., when the group is organized around such beliefs, they do not seem to have minds in any sense other than their ability to build on the minds of individual members. As David Sosa argues, “groups might be said to have a mind or a will but only in a derivative sense: the persons that are members of the group have minds, and the group’s mind (in whatever sense it has one, its beliefs and desires) is some sort of construct from those minds” (Sosa 2007, p. 215).

Not surprisingly, the matter of consciousness becomes key here. Matthew Baddorf (2017) argues straightforwardly that for something to have a mind, it must be phenomenologically conscious and, and according to Baddorf, collectives lack consciousness. Baddorf is willing to go as far as to conclude here that lacking such consciousness, collectives are inappropriate sites of accountability and responsibility. But not everyone is willing to go so far.

Indeed, there are an increasing number of scholars in the field who wonder whether we really need to talk about a collective mind (or consciousness)—or even a unified self—in order to sustain a notion of collective moral responsibility. Michael Bratman appears to have developed a coherent view of collective intentions that does not require us to go that far. According to Bratman, we can talk about collective intentions as intentions that are shared among group members.

[w]e intend to do J if and only if: (1)(a) I intend that we J and (b) you intend that we J and (2) I intend that we J in accordance with and because of (1)(a), (1)(b) and meshing sub-plans of (1)(a), (1)(b), and you intend likewise. (3):(1) and (2) are common knowledge between us. (Bratman 1999:121)

In Shared Agency: A Planning Theory of Acting Together (Bratman 2014), Bratman associates these shared intentions with a pattern of ordinary intentions and beliefs that coordinates multiple individuals’ activity in a fashion analogous to the way in which an individual’s intention coordinates her activity through time. Here, again, Bratman presents shared intentions as a matter of “meshing subplans.” According to Bratman, to say that we have a “shared intention to J,” where J is a joint activity, is to say that “[w]e each have intentions that we J, and we each intend that we J by way of each of our intentions that we J and by way of subplans that mesh.” (Bratman 2014, p. 103)

Two things are important to underscore here. First of all, Bratman is not concerned to account for a collective mind. Instead, he is concerned to account for collective intentions. Second, while he suggests in Shared Agency: A Planning Theory of Acting Together that we can think of shared activity as the activity of a group agent, he makes clear that he is not positing a group subject of the kind necessary to the ascription of moral blameworthiness to the group itself qua moral agent.

Both points together suggest that while Bratman’s theory provides us with a very helpful way of understanding both collective intentions and coordinated activities of various kinds, as well as a basis for grasping the nature of shared deliberation and shared reasoning, it does not attach those collective intentions to the kind of collective moral agent that is required of moral responsibility. Nor does it establish the kind of moral agent in question.

Bratman was not himself interested in establishing this kind of moral agent in his theory of collective intentions. But, if we want to talk about collective moral responsibility, we will have to do so. Moreover, we will have to do so regardless of our stance on the possibility of a collective mind or a collective consciousness. (In other words, we will have to do so regardless of what other conditions of collective moral responsibility we posit and whether we think that these conditions can be met.) For, responsibility of all kinds requires the location of agents and moral responsibility requires that these agents be appropriate sites of blameworthiness.

How, if at all, might we talk about the kind of collective moral agent and/or unified collective moral subject required by collective moral responsibility? Interestingly enough, defenders of collective responsibility frequently turn back here to the works of Durkheim (1895) and Simmel (1971), as well as to that of Sartre (1960), for inspiration, although they themselves proceed analytically. Margaret Gilbert, who grounds several of her arguments in Durkheim’s theory of social facts, develops what she calls a “plural-subject account” of shared intentions to justify the coherence of collective responsibility (Gilbert 1989, 2000, 2006 and 2013) (Gilbert and Priest 2020). She does so in large part by zeroing in on joint commitments. According to Gilbert, group intentions exist when two or more persons constitute the plural subject of an intention to carry out a particular action, or, in other words, when “they are jointly committed to intending as a body to do A” (Gilbert 2000, p. 22).

David Velleman goes on to stress the unified nature of this plural subject. A “truly plural subject”, he writes, involves “two or more subjects who combine in such a way as to make one subject” (Velleman 1997). Both Gilbert and Velleman make clear that a unified moral subject is required of a collective moral responsibility.

While Gilbert and Velleman provide us with a compelling view of a plural subject, two questions remain. Does their plural subject constitute a unified moral subject of the kind that can be morally blameworthy for bringing about harm? If so, is the kind of moral blameworthiness associated with such a unified moral subject the same in the case of a collective as it is in the case of individual moral agents? We address these questions in Section 5.

Suffice it to point out here both that (as Gilbert herself recognizes) such a unified moral subject is necessary to collective moral responsibility and that the location of a plural subject is not the only way of making sense of a collective moral agent. Raimo Tuomela (1989, 2005, 2006 and 2013) chooses a somewhat different strategy in his defense of collective responsibility. He puts forward what he calls “we intentions.” Like Gilbert, he constructs a collective subject on the basis of joint commitments and then applies it to the notion of collective responsibility. But he does not, like Gilbert, stress the pluralistic nature of this subject. Instead, he argues that collective intentional agency supervenes on individual intentional agency in ways that allow us to talk about both collective intentions and collective actions. According to Tuomela, actions by collectives supervene on the actions of the operative members of the collective in such a way that the properties of particular collectives, such as their intentions, beliefs, and desires, are “embodied in” and “determined by” the perspectives of the properties of individual members or representatives of the collective in question (Tuomela 1989, p. 494).

Interestingly enough, Tuomela’s attempt here to save collective responsibility by positing such a representative subject recalls the efforts of Thomas Hobbes to create a collective subject in the guise of his Leviathan (1651). Hobbes, in an effort both to explain sovereignty in general and to justify the legitimacy of the English monarchy in particular, posited a higher authority in the community—the Leviathan—whose own will, as well as actions, came to be those of its/his subjects as a result of their having transferred their own agency to it/him as part of the only kind of social contract that from Hobbes’s perspective made collective life possible. Hobbes’s collective subject not only represented group members but captured their very being as members of his Leviathan.

Contemporary defenders of collective responsibility sometimes recall Hobbes’s Leviathan in their own attempt to develop a collective subject (see for example: Copp 1980). But they do not, in light of Hobbes’s own authoritarianism, go as far as to accept Hobbes’s argument that a Leviathan is necessary to capture the collective will. Nor do they generally toy with the possibility of reintroducing the seemingly more benevolent general will of Rousseau (1762) as a way of substantiating group intentions. Instead, they look for an alternative, less authoritarian, way of substantiating group intentions—representational or not—or else argue that group intentions of the sort associated with traditional Kantian notions of moral agency are not after all necessary to collective moral responsibility.

Larry May offers one of the most interesting arguments of the latter sort in his own defense of collective moral agency (May 1987, 2006 and 2010). May rejects many of the above accounts of group intentions as too closely tied to Kantian notions of moral agency. But he does not do away with group intentions as a necessary condition of collective responsibility. Nor does he accept a fully collectivist methodology. Instead, he reformulates group intentions within a theory of what he calls interdependence and, in doing so, develops a general outlook on collective responsibility that not only combines individualism and collectivism but places both relationships and social structures at the center of our attention. The challenge here becomes to describe what such group intentions actually look like.

May relies in this context once again on the work of Sartre to develop his account of group intentions and posits what he calls a “pre-reflective intention”, i.e., “an intention which is not yet reflected upon by each of the members of the group” (May 1987 p. 64). May makes clear here that group intentions of this sort arise out of the relationships between particular members of a group rather than from any one group member. Hence, while they are not trans-individual or collective in any sense that stands totally above individuals, they can be treated “as if they are collective” (May 1987, p. 64) Moreover, these intentions are, May makes clear, not individual intentions but group-based. “Since each member of the group comes to have the same intention, either reflectively or pre-reflectively”, it is “different from their individual intentions.” Indeed, “the sameness of intention is collective in the sense that it is caused by the group structure, that is, it is group-based” (May 1987, p. 65). The question for May, as for the others, is whether the “sameness of intention” is sufficient for talking about a collective moral agent worthy of blame.

While many of those defending the possibility of collective moral responsibility do not explore the conditions of collective moral blameworthiness, List and Pettit (2011), in an important work on the subject, extend inquiry about collective moral agency into the realm of ethical, political, and legal accountability. List and Pettit argue that groups can meet the requirements of moral agency by virtue of the fact that they “have representational states, motivational states, and a capacity to process them and act on their basis.” (List and Pettit 2011, p. 21) Likewise, they argue that groups can have obligations, entitlements, and power relations that have hitherto gone unnoticed and that require our moral attention.

List and Pettit devote a great deal of their own attention to how we might use our recognition of these obligations, entitlements, and power relations to re-work various institutions in contemporary society. But they do not neglect the question of collective moral blameworthiness. Nor do they simply assume that such blameworthiness follows automatically from group moral agency. Instead they make clear that in order for a group to be morally blameworthy, its actions must be associated with a “grave matter”; the group must have “full knowledge of guilt”; and there must have been “full consent of the will” (List and Pettit 2011, 155). List and Pettit think that these conditions can be met by at least some groups. Are they right?

While they provide convincing evidence that at least some groups can meet the first two conditions, we need, once again, to be worried about the third, i.e., that which pertains to the willfulness or control of a collective agent. In their own words, “the question raised by the third condition is whether a group agent is in control over the actions it takes so that we might expect its normative judgment, for example, to be capable of impacting on its behavior” (List and Pettit, 2011, 159). How can a group, above its individual members, exert this level of control?

List and Pettit do not answer this question. Instead, they point out (correctly) that the question is not more serious for groups than it is for individuals.

This notion of control needs analysis in any full theory of agency, but since the issue arises with individual agency as much as it does with group agency, we need not provide that analysis here. The challenge for us is not to explain what an agent’s control is, but rather to show that there is no special reason why such control, whatever it involves, shouldn’t be instantiated in a group agent as much as in an individual. (List and Pettit, 2011, 159)

But if we are going to justify the possibility of group moral blameworthiness, we cannot be satisfied with simply knowing that the matter of control is no more serious for groups than it is for individuals. Instead, we have to know what group control entails in this context and whether it is possible. In other words, we have to develop the kind of explanation of group control that List and Pettit concede is important, as well as an account of the “whatever such control involves” that they cite.

There have been several interesting efforts in recent years to articulate and justify such a notion of group control. Kendy Hess, in “The Free Will of Corporations and Other Collectives” (Hess, 2014) argues that collectives possess free will to the extent that they act from their own “actional springs” and from their own “reasons-responsive mechanisms”. Hess argues that when collectives do so, they both act freely and are morally responsible for what they do.

Kenneth Silver (2022) follows through on the reasons-responsive approach to group free will and moral responsibility. According to Silver, while it is difficult to establish a group mind or mental state in this context, to do so is not necessary. Instead, we need only establish that groups are sensitive to their reasons and can be motivated to act by them. In Section 5, I address whether such a notion of group control is sufficient to sustain ascriptions of moral blameworthiness.

While List and Pettit do not provide us with their own notion of group control (leaving the question of group moral blameworthiness still up in the air), they do make two related points of importance. The first is that control in this context does not need to reside in the group or in individuals. Instead, it can reside simultaneously in both places, albeit in different forms: “programming causes” vs. “implementing causes” (List and Pettit, 2011, p. 162).

The second is that we need to think, not only about whether groups are morally responsible for harm, but about whether we should hold them morally responsible for harm and, if so, under what conditions. List and Pettit do not take a wholly consequentialist approach to the latter matter themselves. But they do underscore the positive consequences that can follow from our holding groups morally responsible in particular cases, consequences that range from our “recognition... of the true contours of the moral and political world we inhabit” (List and Pettit 2011, p. 185) to the persuasion of group members to give up harmful behaviors to the socialization of group members to act more responsibly in the future. We discuss these and other consequences more fully in Section 6.

3. Collective Responsibility and the Structure of Groups

While Gilbert, May, List, Pettit, and others who concentrate on redeeming collective responsibility as an intellectual construct do so by defending the coherence of collective actions and group intentions, they do not go as far as to assert that all kinds of groups are capable of acting and intending collectively. Nor do they go as far as to assert that all kinds of groups can be understood as collectively responsible for bringing about harm. Instead, they assert that only particular kinds of groups are capable of acting and intending collectively and that only particular kinds of groups are capable of being collectively responsible for harm. What kinds of groups are these?

The most common approach taken to distinguishing between appropriate and inappropriate sites of collective responsibility has been to focus on nations, corporations, and other groups that have well-ordered decision-making procedures in place, since, it is argued, these groups are, by virtue of their well-ordered decision-making procedures, able to demonstrate two things that are often assumed to be necessary to collective responsibility. The first is a set of group actions that have an identifiable moral agent, e.g., a governing board or a representative body, behind them capable of carrying out a group action. The second is a set of decisions that are made self-consciously on a rational basis—or at least purposively—by the group that take the form of group intentions or group choices.

Peter French considers groups that are so organized to be especially appropriate sites of collective responsibility because of three salient features that they all share. The first is a series of organizational mechanisms through which courses of concerted action can be, though not necessarily are, chosen on a rational basis. The second is a set of enforced standards of conduct for individuals that are more stringent than those usually thought to apply in the larger community of individuals, standards that enable us to talk about both group conduct and group discipline. The third is a configuration of “defined roles by which individuals can exercise certain powers ” (French 1984, pp. 13–14) All three of these features, according to French, signal the existence of purposeful and controlled actions that are capable of rendering groups collectively responsible for harm.

A second approach to the location of appropriate sites of collective responsibility has been to use groups such as ethnic communities, clubs, and social movements as paradigmatic cases of appropriate collective responsibility on the grounds that these groups have members who share interests or needs in common. Two assumptions prevail here. The first is that groups whose members share interests or needs in common show signs of group solidarity, which Joel Feinberg defines in this context as a matter of individuals taking a strong interest in each others’ interests (Feinberg 1968). The second is that groups that show signs of group solidarity understood in this way are capable of acting and intending in the sense relevant to collective responsibility, since while they are made up of individuals, they pursue projects together.

Not surprisingly, group solidarity is generally thought to exist primarily in either cases where group members identify themselves as group members and assert their shared interests and needs or in cases where group members exhibit collective consciousness to the extent that they are inclined to take pride or feel shame in group actions without prompting. But, according to at least some of those who make use of the concept of group solidarity here, e.g. Larry May (1987) and Howard McGary (1986), group solidarity does not require group self-consciousness. Indeed, according to both May and McGary, group solidarity can be understood as present in what McGary calls “loosely structured groups”, such as privileged racial groups whose members provide support or benefits to other members qua group members, even though they may not, in McGary’s words, “see themselves as interested in one another’s interests” (McGary 1986, p. 158). In these groups, McGary contends, mutual benefits, as well as practices that may, unbeknownst to those who participate in them, maintain forms of oppression such as racism and sexism, signal group solidarity of the sort relevant to collective responsibility.

A third approach here is to pick up on shared attitudes among group members as something that renders the group itself an appropriate site of collective responsibility. The attitudes taken to be relevant here are generally those that both produce serious harm in society and that require acceptance by many individuals in a community together in order to be effective, e.g., attitudes such as racism, sexism, and anti-Semitism. May (1987), McGary (1986), Marilyn Friedman (Friedman and May 1985) and others cite these attitudes as enough to render groups such as “men” and “white Americans” collectively responsible for the oppression of women and black Americans in some, but not all, cases. Other defenders of collective responsibility, e.g., Peter French, refrain from going this far on the grounds that the groups in question are not organized enough to be capable of sustaining a sense of moral agency that is genuinely collective (French 1984).

All three of the above approaches take us in different directions. Hence, they are sometimes thought to be competing. But they all rest on a general distinction between aggregate and conglomerate collectivities. An aggregate collectivity, Peter French writes, is “merely a collection of people” (French 1984, p. 5). It is not, from the perspective of most of those now writing on collective responsibility, an appropriate site of collective responsibility. A conglomerate collectivity, on the other hand, is an “organization of individuals such that its identity is not exhausted by the conjunction of the identities of the persons in the organization” (French 1984, p. 13). It is, from the perspective of most of those now writing on collective responsibility, an appropriate site of collective responsibility, since, unlike an aggregate collectivity, it supplies us with a moral agent capable of purposeful action.

While most of those who defend collective responsibility as a moral construct adhere to this distinction in general, they do not all agree on what counts as an aggregate collectivity in practice. Indeed, there is considerable disagreement among those now writing about collective responsibility (including some who take the above three approaches) about two particular kinds of groups that appear to some to be aggregative groups. One of these kinds of groups is the mob. The other is what Virginia Held calls a “random collection of individuals.” Neither of these kinds of groups has a decision-making procedure in place. Nor do their members show much solidarity. Hence, they are usually rejected as candidates for collective responsibility by many of those who otherwise find the notion of collective responsibility to be very useful. But there are those who put forward both groups as appropriate sites of collective responsibility.

Virginia Held (Held 1970) argues that members of an unorganized group may be said to be responsible for not taking an action that could have prevented harm in cases where they could have done something to prevent the harm together but chose not to do so. Her particular examples are those of victims of violence who are beaten or killed in full sight of strangers assembled around them, strangers who are themselves neither related to the victim nor there together as part of any group-based project. According to Held, while none of these individuals may have been able to prevent the violence on their own, they could have prevented it if they had organized themselves into a group, i.e., cooperated with at least some of the others. Hence, they can as a group be blamed for the victims’ suffering and/or death.

Held acknowledges here that holding a random collection of individuals responsible for harm is more difficult than holding an organized group responsible for it, since the latter, unlike the former, has a method for deciding how to act, whether it is a voting procedure or a set of hierarchical authority relations. But, she argues, we can still hold the former group, i.e., that which she calls a random collection of individuals, responsible for the violence done to victims, since, if they had tried, they could have come up with such decision-making procedures themselves. “In the foregoing examples,” she writes, “we can say that the random collection of individuals was morally responsible for failing to transform itself into an organized group capable of taking action rather than inaction” with respect to the prevention of harm. (Held 1970, p. 479.)

Mobs are often thought to be the last groups that we should be tying to hold collectively responsible. For, they completely lack decision-making procedures, their members are seemingly not related, and they are often chaotic and irrational. But, Larry May (1987), Raimo Tuomela (1989), and others argue, we can nevertheless hold mobs collectively responsible if at least some of their members contribute directly to harm and others either facilitate these contributions or fail to prevent them. For, in these cases, all mob members are “implicated” in mob action, even if not all of them produced specific harms or organized together to do so. Tuomela (1989, 2005, 2006), much like Le Bon (1896) before him, argues that both crowds and rioters are appropriate sites of collective responsibility by virtue of the fact that they perform their acts as members of a group, even if they do not think of themselves as doing so.

Crowds and rioters … are without much or any structure (and divisions of tasks and activities) … with respect to the goals and interests of the group. … But they can be said to act in virtue of their members’ actions. … Thus in a riot the members of the collective typically perform their destructive actions as members of a collective without acting on its behalf. (Tuomela 1989, p. 476.)

Interestingly enough, in both of these cases—mobs and what Held calls random collections of individuals—the groups in question may not be as unrelated as Held and others suggest they are. Indeed, it may be precisely because these groups are made up of individuals who become related to each other in the process of producing harm together (even though they were initially strangers) that they are now potentially appropriate sites of collective responsibility. Stanley Bates suggests as much in his own arguments that Held has presented us with a group that is neither as random nor as disconnected as the term “random” normally suggests, but that is “related” to the extent that group whose members share a particular challenge and are capable of communicating with one another (Bates 1971).

Two aspects of the debate about random collections have resurfaced in recent years in two related debates about collective moral responsibility. The first is the importance of group inaction when it comes to some cases of collective moral responsibility. The second is the ability of disorganized groups to constitute the kind of moral agents that can be held morally responsible for not acting.

The matter of omissions turns out to be particularly challenging for those who want to hold disorganized groups morally responsible for anything, since, as Joseph Metz (2021) points out, it is hard to see how an individual contributes anything to a collective omission to prevent harm if she could not have made a difference to that harm’s coming about (or at least not on her own). But, Metz argues, we can scale things up to a model of group capability and point to the ability of a group of individuals who did nothing to, say, prevent global warming, and use that ability to say that they could have acted together to prevent the harm.

Metz may well be right here. But the ability of a collective to prevent harm is only one condition of its collective responsibility in cases where the collective did not act. Also necessary is that the collective have been morally expected to act.

Where do these moral expectations come from? The most commonly cited source of them is a collective obligation on the collective’s part to prevent harm. David Copp (2020) underscores the controversial nature of such an obligation and rightfully insists that it be justified in general.

Not surprisingly, a collective obligation to prevent harm is not all that difficult to justify in the case of organized collectives (whether we are talking about actions or omissions), since in these cases we can reference group identity, inter- and intra- group relationships, moral commitments, and promises, as well as expediency. In Group Duties, Stephanie Collins (2019) explores the various ways in which we might justify collective obligations in these cases; she also draws out the implications of them for individual group members.

In “How Much Can We Ask of Collective Agents?”, Collins (2020) goes on to explore the scope of collective obligations and defends them against claims of over-demandedness.

In cases of yet-to-be-formed collectives, collective obligations are more difficult to justify, since the contours of the collective are by nature fuzzy and there is no clear collective moral agent to be pinpointed. But there have been efforts to justify collective obligations in these cases nevertheless. Interestingly enough, they have generally focussed on group capacity. In Violetta Igneski’s words (Igneski, 2020), “[W]hen there is evidence that a group of individuals has the capacity to prevent harm or a wrong and the individual members are aware (or should be aware) of this, they have a duty, as a group, to prevent the harm or wrong” (p. 447).

As we shall see in Section 7, things may not be quite so simple. For, even if a group has the capacity to act if organized, there are other factors that need to be taken into consideration before we can posit a collective obligation and make a subsequent claim of collective responsibility. One of these considerations is whether the prevention of the particular case of harm in question ranks high on the list of the many cases of harm prevention that require the group’s attention in a situation where choices have to be made. Another is whether, given other demands on the group, including the well being of the group itself, it would be fair to expect the group to pursue this particular project (and hence take it on as a collective obligation).

Moreover, even in cases where we agree that the group should take on the project as a collective obligation, we still face a further challenge, namely, that the groups we are talking about here are not (at this point) organized to the point where they can act. Hence, even if we can expect them to act and they would be able to do so if they were organized, they are not at this point able to d oso. How, we have to ask, can we transform a disorganized collective into one that is organized enough to be associated with a collective obligation (and hence collective responsibility)? What might motivate such a transformation? Igneski (2020) gestures to the place of individual moral agents with duties of their own as a starting point for getting the requisite collective organized. We discuss this possibility more fully in Section 7, where the transformation in question becomes key to the coherence and workability of forward looking collective responsibility.

Suffice it to underscore two things here. First of all, when it comes to traditional, backward looking, collective responsibility, we need, at the very least, to be able to locate a group that is capable of being construed as a collective moral agent, that could have been expected to prevent the harm in question (by virtue of, say, having a collective obligation to do so), and that was capable of acting in the ways required. Second, it is much easier for a collective that is organized to meet these conditions than a collective that is not. Third, in order for a collective that is not organized to meet these conditions, it may have to rely on individual members to organize it, individual members who are motivated in some way to do so qua individual moral agents.

In almost all of the above discussions of collective moral responsibility, the groups being held morally responsible for harm are made up of those individuals who either caused the harm themselves or refrained from preventing it at the time it occurred. But in recent years, a number of efforts have been made to hold groups morally responsible for actions performed by earlier generations. The case of slavery tends to take center stage here and is often accompanied by arguments for reparations. While such efforts have generally taken place in the legal arena, they have not been excluded entirely from contemporary philosophical discussions of collective responsibility. Indeed, in recent years, a variety of philosophers have set out to ascribe moral responsibility to groups whose present members were not even alive when the bad actions in question were carried out, even though, as Janna Thompson points out, “not being born when an injustice took place seems to be a very good reason for denying any responsibility” (Thompson 2006, p. 155).

How can we possibly hope to hold groups morally responsible for the bad actions of previous generations? Farid Abdel-Nour (Abdel-Nour, 2003) argues that community solidarity is sufficient to render at least some kinds of groups morally responsible for the harms brought about by earlier generations, especially if there is a high level of cross-generational identification and pride in one’s ancestors’ deeds.

Not surprisingly, these kinds of arguments run into trouble when questions of agency arise. For, while the existence of solidarity and identification may allow us to talk about a group over time and even label its actions morally wrong,they do not allow us to posit the kind of agency that is required of moral responsibility as traditionally understood. For, as Michael Bratman shows in his own work on collective responsibility, the latter requires, not only that individuals share intentions but that they interact. (See especially Bratman 2000).

While most of those writing on collective responsibility seem to agree with Bratman here on the necessity of interaction, not all do. Linda Radzik (Radzik 2001) claims that we need only show that existing group members benefit from a past injustice to hold them responsible for it. Larry May makes similar claims throughout his work, including in his arguments that men are collectively responsible for rape and whites in the U.S. are collectively responsible for racism (May and Strikwerda 1994).

What place does benefiting from harm have in the ascription of collective responsibility? As Janna Thompson (2002, 2006) points out, to benefit from a harm is not the same thing as to cause it. Hence benefit—as when men benefit from sexism and whites from racism—does not appear to be an appropriate source of collective responsibility for the past actions of others. But it might be an appropriate source of collective responsibility for the prolongation of the harm and/or its consequences into the future. In other words, it might be an appropriate source of collective responsibility for present and future, if not for past, injustices—including injustices that began with earlier wrongs.

Moreover, while groups of persons might not be good candidates for moral responsibility for past injustices, particular kinds of collective entities—e.g., states, corporations, and organized religions—might be. For, the latter have decision-making bodies, executive processes, and belief systems that extend over time. Surely, positing such a collective entity would be very helpful in the case of reparations for slavery in the U.S. and elsewhere. As Maeve McKeown (2021) argues in her study of collective responsibility and reparations, backward looking reparations for racial abuses can—and should—be justified on the basis of state liability over time. Janna Thompson (2006) argues therefore that they can be understood as legitimate sites of moral responsibility—although it is not clear that they have the kinds of agency that we normally associate with moral responsibility.

How, if they are not moral agents, can Thompson or anyone else speak of groups such as states, corporations and organized religions, as morally responsible? Thompson feels comfortable speaking of these groups as morally responsible for harm on the grounds that they are like moral agents. According to Thompson, “whether they count as real moral persons or only act as if they were, it seems that we are, at least sometimes, justified in judging these collectives according to the standards that we apply to moral persons” (Thompson, 2006, p. 158).

But it is not clear that likeness is strong enough to sustain the nature of these groups as moral agents of the kind that we normally associate with moral responsibility. For “acting like a moral agent” is not the same thing as being a moral agent. (And if one really is a moral agent then there is no need to go to the lengths of specifying likeness.)

We suggest below that the unlikelihood that groups are really moral agents does not mean that the latter cannot be held morally responsible for harm. But it does mean that we have to re-think the kinds of moral responsibility that we associate with groups in such a way that moral agents of the Kantian kind are not necessary.

4. Can Collective Responsibility be Distributed?

Collective responsibility refers to the responsibility of a collective entity, e.g., a corporation, a nation state, or a club, for harm in the world. Shared responsibility refers to the responsibility of group members for such harm in cases where they acted together to bring the harm about. Collective responsibility is associated with a single, unified, moral agent. Shared responsibility is associated with individual moral agents who contribute to harm as members of a group either directly through their own actions or indirectly through their membership in the group.

Contemporary moral and political philosophers are generally careful to distinguish between collective responsibility, on the one hand, and shared and individual responsibility, on the other. But they do not leave individual moral agents behind altogether. Indeed, after analyzing collective responsibility as part of group morality, they frequently place individual moral agents back at the center of their attention in an effort to discern what collective responsibility means on the level of individual moral actors. Is it possible, they ask, for individual members of a group to be collectively responsible for group-based harms in cases where they did not directly cause it? In cases where they did not do anything to stop it? If so, under what conditions?

While those who answer these questions tend to focus on the transferability of collective responsibility and its relationship to individual moral agency in general, they do not ignore concrete historical examples in which the moral responsibility of particular groups of individuals for harm is in question. Indeed, almost all of those who write about collective responsibility and the question of distribution place such concrete historical examples of harm at the center of their analyses of collective responsibility in an effort, not just to understand collective responsibility as an abstract construct, but to discern whether or not particular groups of individuals in history can be held morally responsible for harms that their groups caused, whether those groups are ethnic groups (“Germans”), nations (“America”) or racial groups (“Whites”).

Both Karl Jaspers (1961) and Hannah Arendt (1987), as well H. D. Lewis (1948), were clearly concerned in their writings on collective responsibility about whether or not the German people can legitimately be held collectively responsible for World War II Nazi crimes. So, too, were Sanford Levinson (1974), Richard Wasserstrom (1971) and others who produced their own arguments about collective responsibility in light of the Nuremberg trials. The My Lai killings of the Viet Nam War, along with the Kitty Genovese murder and corporate scandals of all kinds, influenced much of the philosophical work done on collective responsibility during the 1970s and 80s, including that of Peter French, Larry May, and Virginia Held, and while it is only recently that group-based oppression such as racism and sexism have come to be of interest to those writing on collective responsibility, they now figure importantly in the writings of Larry May (1987 and 1992), Howard McGary (1986), Marilyn Friedman (Friedman and May 1980), Anthony Appiah (1987), Derrick Darby and Nyla Branscombe (2012 and 2014), and Eva Boodman (2022).

In all of these discussions, the question is whether the whole community—or large parts of it—can be held responsible for the harms produced by particular group members in cases where not all group members caused the harm directly. Is it appropriate to hold all Germans responsible for the deaths of extermination camp victims during WWII? all Americans for the atrocities of the Viet Nam War? Can we legitimately blame all men for the gender-based oppression and sexual violence that women experience in all societies? Can we blame all whites for the racist treatment of blacks in the U.S.? What about members of these groups who go out of their way to stop the harm? Are they excused from blame because they tried to reform their communities or are they, too, responsible for the harm in question by virtue of their group membership?

While the arguments made in this context tend to be tied to particular cases of group-based harm, they are for the most part designed either to establish general criteria for distributing collective responsibility among group members or to demonstrate that collective responsibility cannot in the end be distributed at all. The latter arguments frequently proceed as follows: While collective entities generally act through their individual members, their actions do not coincide with their members’ actions. Nor is their moral agency merely the moral agency of their members or the moral agency of group representatives. Instead, such agency is—if it is to be genuinely collective moral agency—an agency that is attached to the collective itself and hence not the kind of thing that can be distributed across group members or, for that matter, attached to anything other than a collective itself. In other words, such agency is the kind of thing that necessarily has collectives, and not individuals, as its subject matter.

Peter French makes such an argument himself in Individual and Collective Responsibility (1998). But he cautions that the non-distributional character of collective responsibility does not mean that individual members of the group that is collectively responsible for harm are themselves blameless. Indeed, he claims, many of these group members will be morally responsible for all sorts of harms that their group causes.

[I]t should be noted that from ‘Collectivity A is blameworthy for event n, and A is composed of x, y, and z,’ it would be presumptuous to conclude that x, y, and z do not warrant any blame for n, or that x, y, r z is not himself blameworthy in the case of n. My point is that such judgments assessed on members of the collectivity do not follow necessarily from judgments of collective blame (French 1998, p. 25).

The above claim clearly makes sense if we are talking about keeping collective responsibility in tact qua collective responsibility in our efforts to ascribe it in practice. But we might want to loosen things up here a bit and suggest that collective responsibility is the basis upon which we ascribe responsibility to individual group members for harm that the group itself caused. In other words, we might want to suggest that individual group members can take collective responsibility into themselves as persons, in which case collective responsibility changes form and becomes something closer to personal responsibility, albeit personal responsibility that exists only because one’s collective is responsible for harm. In many cases, this is what those in philosophical circles who are concerned with the question of how to distribute collective responsibility seem to have in mind. How do they attempt to distribute collective responsibility?

In The Question of German Guilt, Karl Jaspers (1961) distinguishes between moral guilt that is based on what one does and moral guilt that is based on who one is. He argues that the latter, which he calls “metaphysical guilt”, can be distributed to all members of a community who stand by while their fellows produce harm, e.g., murder Jews. In this context, to be morally blameworthy for harm is largely a matter of belonging to an “evil” community without asserting one’s own moral powers over the community to cleanse it of such evil. According to Jaspers, “[t]here exists a solidarity among men as human beings that makes each as responsible for every wrong and every injustice in the world, especially for crimes committed in his presence or with his knowledge. If I fail to do whatever I can do to prevent them, I too am guilty” (Jaspers 1961, p. 36).

Jaspers has several contemporary followers, including Larry May and Juha Raikka (Raikka 1997), who choose to express Jaspers’ notion of metaphysical guilt as “moral taint”, a notion that emphasizes, among other things, the extent to which, in Anthony Appiah’s terms, we are “dirtied” by association with our community’s harmful actions. Appiah himself is very reluctant to apply the language of moral taint in general and does so only in particular cases where there are strong causal connections between individuals and harm. May, on the other hand, finds moral taint in many places and goes as far as to tout the utilitarian virtues of distributing collective responsibility widely. According to May, “seeing one’s own moral status as interrelated to that of one’s fellow group members will negate the tendency to ignore the most serious moral evils: those which can only be thwarted by the collective efforts of the community” (May 1987, p. 253).

Methodological and normative individualists tend to reject the notion of metaphysical guilt on two related grounds. The first is that it severs the link between responsibility and control, especially in cases where the group membership being invoked is one that individuals cannot possibly choose, e.g., membership in racial, ethnic or national communities (For a very interesting assessment of this claim, see: Radzik 2001). The second is that the metaphysical notion of guilt violates the liberal ethic of what Rawls calls the “separateness of persons”. According to Rawls, in ascribing responsibility we have to consider persons separately and focus on their own actions so as not to violate principles of justice, principles of justice that for Rawls themselves begin with the value of discrete individuals (Rawls 1971).

While not all liberal individualists agree with Rawls’ particular claims here, they do agree with Rawls that, at the very least, individual group members have to be faulty in some way in order to be held collectively responsible for harm. Joel Feinberg’s theory of group liability is often taken as a starting point of discussion in this context. According to Feinberg, in distributing collective responsibility, we need to focus on two kinds of cases: cases in which all members of a collective share the same fault or cases in which all members of a collective contribute to harm but at different levels. In both kinds of cases, Feinberg stresses, there does not need be a direct link between the individual being held responsible and the harm, but there does need to be the sharing of faultiness.

Various faults can exist in the absence of any causal linkage to harm, where that absence is only a lucky accident reflecting no credit on the person who is at fault. Where every member of a group shares the same fault, but only one member’s fault leads to any harm, and that not because it was more of a fault than that of others, but only because of independent fortuities, many will be inclined to ascribe collective liability to the whole group (Feinberg 1968, p. 687).

Feinberg himself is willing to ascribe collective responsibility to group members for such harm in some cases, although, he makes clear, in doing so we need to shift our attention away from strict liability to a softer kind of social blame on grounds of fairness. He concerns himself with three kinds of cases in particular, namely, those in which large numbers of individuals are independently at fault; those in which the harm is caused by a joint undertaking of numerous persons acting cooperatively, and those in which the harm is ascribed to a particular feature of the common culture which is self-consciously accepted by or participated in by members of the group. Feinberg is willing to accept the possibility of ascribing collective responsibility in all three kinds of cases. But he cautions that we need to proceed on a situation-by-situation basis, since to ascribe collective responsibility in cases such as these requires not only that we locate genuinely shared faults but assess various incommensurable dimensions of individual contributions, including degrees of initiative, importance of assigned task, levels of authority, etc.

Gregory Mellema (2006) provides a very useful way of assessing different levels of individual contribution by distinguishing between six different ways in which individuals can be complicit in wrong-doing. According to Mellema, individuals can induce or command others to produce harm. They can counsel others to produce harm. They can give consent to the production of harm by others. They can praise these others when they produce the harm. They can fail to stop them from producing it.

A second way of tackling the distribution question in this context that does not seem to violate the principle of individual freedom is to look, not just at the particular role that individuals played in their community’s production of harm, but at how much freedom the individuals had to distance themselves from the community that has done wrong. Here we might want to use voluntariness of membership as a criterion of responsibility. Jan Narveson (2002) does so himself in his generally skeptical work on collective responsibility. Narveson argues that in thinking about the responsibility of individuals for group harms we need to be careful to distinguish between four different kinds of groups, namely: those that are fully voluntary; those that are involuntary in entrance but voluntary in exit; those that are voluntary in entrance but involuntary in exit; and those that are voluntary in neither respect. As Narveson makes clear, responsibility is diminished, if not eradicated, as we go down this list.

Narveson clearly takes an individualistic perspective here. Hence, he is able to address the questions of individual freedom and personal responsibility with relative ease. Not surprisingly, things get somewhat more complicated when we start to think about individuals, not only as participating in groups, but as taking their identity from groups. Karen Kovach (2006) contends that in some cases, individuals align themselves with their groups—Kovach is concerned with ethnic groups in particular—to the extent that they see the group’s agency as an extension of their own. In these cases, Kovach contends, we can distribute collective moral responsibility to all members of the group because of what she calls “moral alignment”.

“Moral alignment” cannot of course be a simple matter of identification if it is to sustain collective moral responsibility. For, identification does not implicate an individual in either the intentions or the actions of the group with which she identifies. Hence, Kovach finds it necessary to insist that if individuals are to be held collectively responsible for group harms that they be understood as having “acted out the view of themselves as group members” or as having “performed” the group identity.

While such an insistence goes far in showing how collective responsibility might be distributed to all members of a group for harm that the group produced in particular cases, e.g., in cases such as genocide or ethnic cleansing where ethnic identity is everything, it is not clear that the responsibility in question is the kind that we normally associate with moral responsibility. For, while “acting out” or “performing” a group identity may contribute to harm in cases such as these, it is not the same thing as doing something that contributes to that harm. In other words, it does not signal moral agency—unless one asserts one’s identity knowing that it will lead to harming others, in which case it is the act of assertion, not identification, that is doing the work here.

Interestingly enough, one of the major points of agreement among those now writing about collective responsibility is that responsibility cannot be distributed to those group members who openly resist or fight against their communities’ bad actions or policies. See here, for example, the arguments of Joel Feinberg (1968), Peter French (1998), Howard McGary (1986), J. R. Lucas (1993), and Michele Moody-Adams (1994). While the above writers, who find collective responsibility to be a compelling moral construct in general, differ in particular respects, they all agree that it would be wrong to ascribe responsibility to dissenters or, in other words, that if one tries to fight harm one should not be held responsible for it. McGary makes his own claim here in terms of what he calls the “dissociation condition”, according to which a person is exempt from collective responsibility in cases where one’s community caused harm if he or she dissociates him or herself from the action of the community by opposing its bad actions or policies (McGary 1986).

But there are some who do call for the distribution of collective responsibility to individuals even in cases where these individuals actively opposed their community’s wrong doings. Juha Raikka, for example, claims that the only way that opposition can exonerate those who, say, live in a society that systematically pollutes the environment or depletes resources, is if they are able, by dissenting, to avoid supporting the system that does these things (a condition that, Raikka acknowledges, is very hard to meet). According to Raikka,

[o]pposing an evil practice cleans one’s hands only on the condition that it does not require supporting another evil practice. … In the end, even those who oppose evil practices may be blameworthy for those practices. A single member of a group may have acted as he or she, all things considered, ought to have acted, but still share responsibility for the group’s evil practices. (Raikka 1997, p.104.)

Raikka claims in this context that dissenters can be morally blameworthy even if they cannot control the system that implicates them in evil. Hence, he finds it necessary to do two things that not only place him squarely in the camp of Karl Jaspers and other advocates of metaphysical guilt but that are very telling with respect to contemporary philosophical debates about collective responsibility in general. The first is to subtract from the set of conventionally invoked criteria of collective responsibility a criterion that the majority of those now writing about collective responsibility take very seriously, namely, the ability of individuals to control those things (whether actions or harms) for which they are being blamed. The second is to detach moral blameworthiness from the will of discrete individuals (where traditional, Kantian notions of agency place it) and to locate its source in the greater community of which the individuals deemed guilty are ostensibly a part.

Both of these moves force us to acknowledge that, in the end, the various differences that exist among contemporary philosophers with respect to the coherence and applicability of collective responsibility as a construct have their source, not just in competing theories of intentions and actions, but also in competing notions of moral blameworthiness. While neither defenders nor critics of collective responsibility generally take on the nature of the moral blameworthiness that they put at the center of our attention, they do make clear that for some of them the traditional, Kantian standards of moral blameworthiness still prevail and that for others the appropriate standards of moral blameworthiness take us beyond the wills of discrete individuals to the structure of guilty communities.

5. Alternative Approaches to Collective Responsibility

Moral Responsibility has traditionally been understood to entail moral—and not just social or legal—blameworthiness and moral blameworthiness has, during the modern period, been understood to be an aspect of an individual’s own moral agency rather than a judgment that we ourselves make on the basis of our own social and legal standards. Hence, those who search for the conditions of moral responsibility generally insist that an agent has herself caused—freely willed—that for which she is being held morally responsible. Marion Smiley (1992) argues that this has not always been the case but is rather a modern development.

Not surprisingly, the kind of free will that is required of the modern notion of moral responsibility—contra-causal freedom—is difficult if not impossible to locate in practice. So, too, is the “softer” notion of free will preferred by compatibilitists. Hence, when contemporary philosophers turn their attention to the conditions of moral responsibility in practice, they frequently zero in on what they take to be one of free will’s key components—intentionality—and ask: Under what conditions can we say that an agent intended X?

Smiley (1992) argues that having an intention is neither equivalent to free will nor sufficient to ground the modern notion of moral responsibility (as distinct from its Aristotelian counterpart). Suffice it to point out here that contemporary philosophers who write about collective responsibility place intentionality at the center of their attention and because they have accepted (consciously or unconsciously) the modern notion of moral responsibility, they associate it with a unified moral self that is capable of controlling outcomes.

But, as we have seen in Section 2, such a unified moral self might not be possible in the case of collective entities. Where, then, does that leave us? Critics of collective responsibility assume that if such a unified moral self is not possible in the case of collective entities, collective moral responsibility does not make sense. But such an assumption may be premature and in the end not warranted. For, if we were to develop an alternative notion of collective moral responsibility, i.e., one that does not attempt to mimic its (modern) individualist counterpart, we might not have to insist on such a unified moral self. What might such an alternative notion of collective moral responsibility look like?

Three things suggest that we have a lot more creative freedom in this context than we now realize. First of all, contrary to the assumptions of many contemporary philosophers, the modern notion of moral responsibility is not moral responsibility per se. Instead, it is a distinctly Kantian notion of moral responsibility that has at least a trio of respectable counterparts, namely, the Aristotelian, Christian, and pragmatist notions of moral responsibility (Smiley 1992).

Second, while many contemporary moral philosophers may in the end prefer the Kantian notion, we cannot dismiss these others simply because they do not live up to Kantian standards. Nor, for that matter, can we designate these other notions of moral responsibility as non-moral or as “merely sociological” simply because they do not conform to what Kantians see as “the moral realm”. Instead, we have to make room for the above notions of moral responsibility—and perhaps others still—in our discussions of collective responsibility.

Third, given its association with discrete individuals, the Kantian understanding of moral responsibility would seem to be especially out of place when it comes to collective responsibility. For, moral responsibility as Kantians understood it is not something that we just happen to associate with individual moral agents. Nor is its notion of moral blameworthiness just incidentally applied to individuals. Instead, moral responsibility as put forward by Kantians is by nature associated with individual moral agents. So, too, is the notion of moral blameworthiness that grounds it. Indeed, the latter is best defined as individual moral blameworthiness.

All three points should be liberating for those who want to re-think collective responsibility in ways that render it both possible and appropriate to groups. The first suggests that there are other notions of moral responsibility available to us. The second makes clear that these other notions of moral responsibility cannot be dismissed simply because they do not conform to the Kantian notion of morality. The third points to the need to move beyond what is by definition a notion of individual moral blameworthiness and to figure out how groups might be understood as morally blameworthy qua groups.

What might it mean for groups to be morally blameworthy? What kind of causation would be required to sustain a notion of group moral blameworthiness? How might we put these two things—group moral blameworthiness and causation—together in this context to constitute an alternative way of thinking about collective responsibility that is both possible and appropriate to groups?

In recent years, a small group of moral philosophers has begun to ask these questions and in doing so has provided us with intriguing alternatives to the traditional understanding of moral responsibility. In his own re-thinking of collective responsibility, Kenneth Shockley (2007 and 2016) sets out to replace the Kantian notion of moral blameworthiness with a looser notion of “being at fault” that allows us to talk about a particular collective as “deserving of some kind of punishment apart from that meted out to its members for their role in harm” (p. 452). Such punishment might mean “eradicating the groups themselves or dismantling part of them. Likewise, it might take the form of reducing the strength of bonds between individual members or … de-institutionalizing group norms” (p. 452).

Neta Crawford (2007, 2013 and 2014), who also distances herself from the Kantian notion of moral blameworthiness, points to the importance of recognizing that collectives, as distinct from their members, can do morally bad things—in some cases through the actions of their members—by virtue of the particular kind of group that they are and how they are organized. Crawford’s particular concern here is with military groups whose soldiers end up killing innocents as a result of either their rules of engagement or the kinds of weapons that they use. What sense does it make to say that such military groups, as distinct from their members, are morally blameworthy for the deaths of these innocents?

Crawford argues that while it makes no sense to consider a military group morally guilty in the sense of having a tainted soul, it does make sense to consider that it is in at least some respects a morally bad organization that deserves punishment. Not surprisingly, such punishment has to be appropriate to organizations, as distinct from individuals, if it is going to ground collective moral responsibility. Hence, Crawford chooses to view punishment here as a matter of forcing a collective to apologize, make amends, and change.

The “change” here frequently amounts to either eradicating parts of the group in question or changing those aspects of the group that lead it to produce harm. In the case of a morally blameworthy military group, it means “reducing the likelihood of systematic atrocities and avoidable accidents by reviewing and revising the choice of weapons and rules of engagement … and apologizing and making amends when systematic atrocity occurs” (Crawford 2007, p. 212).

In other cases, the punishment associated with a morally blameworthy collective may amount to eradicating the group altogether or to forcing it to give up important aspects of itself. The Nazi regime—or any other regime whose purpose is to destroy a race of persons—would presumably fall into the first camp. A government or business club that excludes persons of color and/or women as part of its raison d’etre would presumably fall into the second.

What kind of causation or agency is required by moral blameworthiness of this kind? Since we are not talking about a Kantian notion of moral blameworthiness, we do not have to go as far as to insist on free will or focus all of our attention on the possibility of a unified moral self. Nor as such do we have to make sense of a group’s having freely willed something bad. But, unless we want to ground moral blameworthiness in pure utility, we do have to assume, at the very least, that the collective in question has produced the harm.

Not surprisingly, not just any kind of production will do here. At the very least, the collective has to play what Shockley (2007) calls an “eliminable role” in the production of harm—even if that role is primarily one of providing the conditions under which members of the collective carry out the harmful actions. In other words, the collective has to be necessary to the harm’s production by virtue of what Shockley calls its “coordinating control” over members.

How can we understand such control? In the case of corporations, we can focus on the way in which the norms of the collective determine or shape particular paths of behavior, as well as on how incentive structures and patterns of discipline lead individuals to act in harmful ways. Shockley finds many of these things at work in the case of Enron. According to him, “[t]he norms operative within the membership of Enron controlled for the climate of secrecy and doubt” (Shockley 2007, p. 449).

Shockley assumes here that the collective is morally responsible for harm because it exerts “coordinating control” over what happens in the group. But he does not excuse individual members from moral blameworthiness in the process. Nor, for that matter, does he allow for the possibility that individual members may together bring about harm without having acted in a morally blameworthy fashion themselves. Indeed, he insists on individual members having acted as such if collective moral responsibility is to be coherent. In cases where collectives are morally responsible for harm, “the collective serves as an enabling condition of individual blameworthy agents to perform harmful acts” (Shockley 2007, p. 442).

Shockley is wise to point out that the moral responsibility of a collective does not preclude the moral responsibility of its members. But he may go too far in including the moral blameworthiness of individual members in collective moral responsibility itself. For, there are—even according to Shockley’s own criteria of coordinating control—cases of collective moral responsibility in which individuals either do nothing wrong but together bring about harm within a collective or do harmful things but are excused from moral blameworthiness by virtue of their inability to do otherwise. Mobs are a case of the first kind. Neta Crawford’s soldiers are a case of the second.

Moreover, as argued in Smiley 2010, if we are truly concerned about collective moral responsibility, rather than about the moral responsibility of individuals who belong to collectives, we do not have to insist that individual members have performed actions that render them morally blameworthy. Instead, we have to insist only that the collective, by virtue of its very nature as the particular kind of collective that it is, has led individual members to produce harm that they could not have produced themselves. For, it is the moral blameworthiness of the collective itself, rather than that of its members, that constitutes collective moral responsibility.

While associating collectives with moral blameworthiness is difficult, it is not, as we have seen, impossible. Indeed, by both reimagining moral blameworthiness in the context of groups and developing alternative notions of collective agency that allow us to locate such moral blameworthiness, we can move toward a coherent and empirically feasible practice of collective moral responsibility. Two recent efforts to defend collective moral responsibility appear to be particularly promising in this context. The first involves appropriating P. F. Strawson’s reactive attitudes model of moral blameworthiness for the purpose of showing how a collective might be construed as morally blameworthy qua collective. Gunnar Bjornsson and Kendy Hess (2017) pick up on Strawson’s approach in their own work on collective moral responsibility and ask whether corporations and other collective entities can have the requisite reactive attitudes to be held morally responsible for bringing about harm. They answer in the affirmative and argue that collective entities can have the capacities associated with guilt and indignation, as well as the relevant epistemic and motivational capacities to be blamed.

The second effort zeros in on the motivational capacities of groups associated with reason-giving. Here the argument is that while collectives may not have the kind of free will associated with individual moral agents, they do have the capacity to formulate reasons and act on them. Silver (2022) argues that it is this capacity to respond to one’s reasons and to be motivated by them that renders collectives self-directed in a way that lends credence to our ascriptions of collective moral responsibility to them.

Presumably, not all groups which are appropriate sites of moral responsibility should be blamed. How, if at all, can groups which are appropriate sites of collective moral responsibility, in general, avoid blame in particular cases? While, as Andrés Garcia (2021) argues, collective moral responsibility is not itself inherently unfair in ways that early critics such as H. D. Lewis (1948) claimed, it can be unfair in particular cases. In some of these cases, its unfairness will be a matter of a group’s not having made a sufficient contribution to the harm for which it is being blamed. In other cases, it will be a matter of the group’s not having known what was going on. In these latter cases, we confront the possibility that the group can make a plea of ignorance to avoid blame in the way that individuals do. A plea that as Smiley (2016) points out, needs to be assessed with various standards of fairness in mind.

Not surprisingly, the possibility of group-based ignorance is itself controversial. Anne Schwenkenbecher (2021) articulates several different kinds of group-based ignorance and goes on to argue for collective epistemic obligations. Säde Hormio (2018) explores how group-based ignorance is structured, as well as maintained, within organizations and provides us with a framework for distinguishing between acceptable and unacceptable excuses in the context of group-based blame. While such efforts face the same kinds of challenges faced by all efforts that treat groups as moral agents, they signal the possibility of yet another alternative approach to collective moral responsibility (and a very promising one at that) by treating collective moral responsibility as at least shaped, if not designated by worldly practices such as excuse-giving,

6. Collective Responsibility and the Question of Consequences

When is it appropriate to hold a group responsible for harm? When is it appropriate to refrain from holding a group responsible? As things now stand, we generally assume that to hold a group—or, for that matter, an individual—responsible for harm is simply to establish that he, she, or it is responsible for the harm, and as such we do not generally find the above question especially challenging. Indeed, we often assume that we can answer it by simply reiterating the conditions of collective responsibility itself.

But to hold an agent responsible for harm is not simply to establish that he, she, or it is responsible for the harm. Instead, it is to make the agents’ responsibility known both to them and to the rest of the community or, in other words, to publicize their responsibility as part of a social or legal practice of accountability in particular contexts with particular purposes in mind.

The differences between these two things—the act of holding an agent responsible for harm and the agent’s being responsible for it—are worth underscoring. While X’s being responsible for harm is a matter of what X has done, our holding of X responsible is a matter of what we do with our knowledge of X’s behavior. The former is ostensibly a moral fact about X. The latter is an act that we ourselves perform as part of a social or legal practice of accountability.

When are we justified in performing such an act of accountability? Since holding agents responsible for harm sheds a negative light on them and frequently results in calls for compensation and/or punishment, we generally insist on taking fairness seriously in this context and, in our efforts to take fairness seriously, we generally require accuracy with respect to the facts of responsibility. Indeed, we often combine these two conditions and say that it would not be fair to hold an agent responsible for harm if he, she, or it was not really responsible for it.

But fairness is not always just a matter of factual accuracy when it comes to holding groups responsible. Instead, it can be—and often is—a matter of making sure that we do not in our holding of agents responsible discriminate between equally responsible agents. In other words, it can be—and often is—a matter of treating like cases in the same fashion so as not to be discriminatory. Hence the emphasis that we now see being placed by post-war tribunals on making sure that if collective responsibility is ascribed to particular groups it is ascribed to all groups according to general rules.

As it turns out, we do not always treat like cases in a similar fashion. Nor, for that matter, do we always place fairness above all else. Indeed, we sometimes choose to discriminate between cases that appear to be the same. Moreover, we do so in some cases on self-consciously consequentialist grounds that we find to be justified.

In many of these cases, we are concerned with whether or not we can bring about positive consequences in the world by holding particular groups responsible. (Would these groups behave better if we did? Would others follow suit? Would harm be prevented?) In other cases, we are concerned with consequences of a decidedly more negative sort. (Would holding particular groups responsible for harm lead to greater animosity among groups? create resentment in the community? stand in the way of peace?)

Interestingly enough, those who are concerned about responsibility in philosophical circles are frequently hesitant to enter into a full blown consequentialist debate about when we should hold particular agents responsible in practice. (We suggest why this may be so below.) But they do often make clear that they have particular consequences in mind when, in an off-handed fashion, they assess collective responsibility in practice. In the case of individual responsibility, these consequences tend to be positive and include the reinforcement of norms associated with moral agency. In the case of collective responsibility, they tend to be both positive and negative.

While defenders of collective responsibility do not always distinguish between the consequences of holding particular groups responsible in practice and the value of collective responsibility per se, they do make clear that we can do important things in the world by holding particular groups responsible for harm. Among other things, we can raise consciousness among groups about what they are doing. We can get them to stop harming others. We can reinforce social norms that prevent such harm from occurring in the future. And we can make clear to the world that those being harmed are worth taking seriously.

List and Pettit (2011), as we saw in Section 2, make clear that holding groups responsible for particular kinds of harm not only “lets us discern the true contours of the moral and political world we inhabit” (List and Pettit 2011, p. 185), but provides incentives for change among group members (p. 168), and conditions them to behave better in the future (p. 157). Likewise, it can provide the basis for institutional reform in cases where collective acts were hitherto invisible.

What about the negative consequences that might follow from holding particular groups responsible for harm? Not surprisingly, the most commonly cited of these consequences are those associated with the freeing of individuals from personal responsibility in both private and public life. In some cases, the negative consequences thought to follow from collective responsibility are a matter of moral degeneracy and/or the avoidance of just punishment. In other cases, they are a matter of the erosion of liberal ideals and/or threats to democratic governance.

Not surprisingly, these arguments have been taken in a variety of directions over the years. Garrett Hardin’s early work focused on the squashing of individual initiatives associated with collective responsibility (Hardin 1968). So, too, did the works of many others during the Cold War. Contemporary liberals tend to be less vehement than Hardin with respect to the ways in which collective responsibility undermines individual moral agency. But they, too, worry that individuals will not take responsibility for harm that their group is being held responsible for as well. Moreover, there is some historical evidence for their concerns.

Richard McKeon, in an essay that rarely finds its way into contemporary work on collective responsibility, provides us with important insights into the ways in which the replacement of collective responsibility with personal responsibility in the West was politically, as well as morally, crucial to the development of liberalism. According to McKeon, the replacement of collective responsibility with personal responsibility meant not only that individuals could exercise moral agency as individuals but that the state would no longer be as necessary as it once was, since individuals could now take responsibility for governing themselves (McKeon 1957).

But, of course, we cannot, on an a priori basis, treat personal and collective responsibility as mutually exclusive. For, there is always the possibility of bringing them together and doing so in ways that enhance both. Robert Goodin (Goodin 1998) suggests what such an integrated system of responsibility might look like in the context of a welfare state. List and Pettit underscore how individual and collective responsibility might co-exist on a more general level. (List and Pettit 2011, pp. 121–122)

One of the most interesting critiques of the practice of collective responsibility put forward by a contemporary philosopher is that of Mark Reiff (2008). Reiff concedes that holding particular groups responsible for harm can do good things in the world, e.g., deter these groups from performing harmful actions in the future, aid us in bringing about social order more generally, and provide communities with a basis for justice. But he makes clear that holding groups responsible for harm can also lead to both the escalation of violence and the watering down of moral strictures. Indeed, he claims, “some of the most heinous crimes in human history—including the Nazi’s Final Solution and genocide in Rwanda—have been facilitated if not motivated by a belief in collective responsibility” (Reiff 2008, p. 234).

Reiff’s primary focus when discussing collective responsibility and violence is on what can go wrong when we hold groups responsible for harm over time in contexts where each side in a conflict defines the other as collectively responsible for historical wrongs. According to Reiff, in such cases, we are bound to encounter endless cycles of retaliation, as well as the presentation of murderous acts as acts of punishment. Moreover, we are bound to encounter these kinds of things not because the actors in question lack a sense of morality but because of the particular kind of moral righteousness that claims of collective responsibility allow those who want to retaliate against their enemies in the name of a higher morality.

Since Reiff’s focus here is on moral righteousness, we might expect him to view the practice of holding groups responsible as bolstering morality (albeit morality of a peculiar and skewed kind). But he does not do so. Instead, he argues just the opposite, namely, that claims of collective responsibility can—and often do—undermine both the importance of morality in general and the effectiveness of punishment in particular. Here his focus is primarily on what happens when we internalize claims of collective responsibility.

Reiff argues that when we internalize claims of collective responsibility, we may come to feel more responsibility—or responsibility for more things—than we used to feel. But we are less likely to follow the dictates of morality. For, while the range of our responsibility has been expanded, the ties between responsibility and morality have been weakened. Indeed, these ties may in some cases be totally severed. How might this happen?

Reiff does not claim, as those before him did, that the practice of collective responsibility allows individuals to avoid personal responsibility and hence reduces both their moral agency and their culpability for harm. Nor does he, as his predecessors did, understand the problem in question as a matter of too little personal responsibility in general. Instead, he understands the problem as a matter of individuals feeling responsible for harm even when they have done nothing wrong. (Presumably, the moral dictates that Reiff is concerned with here are those associated with an individual’s own actions.) According to Reiff,

[the] problem is not that people are less likely to feel responsibility for their own misconduct if they feel that others will be held collectively responsible for harm. … The problem is that collective responsibility encourages people to feel responsible and subject to punishment even when they have behaved correctly. Hence, punishment is no longer an incentive. (Reiff 2008, p. 241)

In the end, he concludes, “[e]mbracing collective responsibility undermines the very concept of responsibility itself, for it encourages people to disregard rather than obey the structures of morality” (Reiff 2008, p. 242).

Interestingly enough, most of those who offer consequentialist critiques of collective responsibility—and again they are almost always concerned with the practice of holding groups responsible for harm rather than with the facts of responsibility per se—do so on a surprisingly general level. In other words, they do not provide us with a set of criteria for thinking about the value of holding groups morally responsible in particular situations. But they could do so very productively on the basis of the more general arguments that Reiff and others provide. Moreover, they could do so without violating their own agent-based approaches to moral responsibility. For, as we have suggested above, being morally responsible and holding others morally responsible are not the same thing. Nor do they have the same relationship to consequences. While consequences may be irrelevant to moral responsibility itself, they may be absolutely key to our choice to hold—or not to hold—agents morally responsible in practice.

7. Forward Looking Collective Responsibility

While the majority of those now writing on collective responsibility continue to focus on the kind of responsibility explored above, i.e., backward looking collective responsibility, a small but growing number of philosophers have chosen to focus instead on forward looking collective responsibility. Two things appear to explain such a shift in focus. The first is the recognition that collective entities such as states, corporations, and movements may now be the only agents capable of preventing particular kinds of suffering in the world. The second is the publication of David Miller’s National Responsibility and Global Justice (Miller 2007), Iris Young’s Responsibility for Justice (Young 2011), and Peter French and Howard Weinstein’s edited collection Forward Looking Collective Responsibility (French and Weinstein 2014).

What is forward looking responsibility? Forward looking responsibility, like its backward looking counterpart, refers to a collective agent’s responsibility for a particular state of affairs in the world. But, unlike its backward looking counterpart, it does not make responsibility out to be a matter of having caused an existing (morally problematic) state of affairs. Instead, it makes responsibility out to be a matter of being morally charged with—responsible for—bringing about a state of affairs which we as a community consider to be better. Hence, when we ascribe forward looking responsibility to a collective agent, we do not tell a causal story about the agent. Instead, we specify what the agent should be doing in the world.

Not surprisingly, we often end up pointing to the particular tasks that we think the agent should be carrying out and refer to these tasks as the agent’s responsibilities. But we need to be careful here. For forward looking responsibility is not simply a matter of carrying out tasks. Instead, it is a matter of being morally charged with bringing about a state of affairs that is, by virtue of the ascription of forward looking responsibility itself, now part of the agent’s moral business. Hence, in discussions of forward looking responsibility, we do not simply say of an agent that the agent has responsibilities X, Y, and Z. Instead, we say that the agent is responsible for making sure that a particularly desirable state of affairs X, Y, or Z comes into existence.

Since forward looking responsibility requires that an agent bring about a particular state of affairs, it has a lot in common with being morally obliged to do something. But the emphasis is different. So, too, is the level of flexibility associated with moral agency. In cases where we use the language of moral obligation, we signal that the agent has to perform a particular act. In cases where we use the language of responsibility, we allow the agent to use its own judgment in deciding how to bring about the desired state of affairs. Likewise, we charge it with exercising its judgment wisely.

What is morally salient about forward looking collective responsibility? Backward looking collective responsibility, as we have seen, is morally salient because of its association with blameworthiness. Forward looking responsibility is not completely removed from considerations of blame—we sometimes blame those who fail to take their responsibilities seriously—but it is not morally salient because blame sometimes enters the picture. Instead, it is morally salient because we think that such responsibility may, if taken seriously by those who are being held responsible, help to bring about a desirable (or better) state of affairs in the world.

The requirements associated with forward looking collective responsibility are not as steep as those associated with its backward looking counterpart. Nor are they as metaphysical. For, unlike its backward looking counterpart, forward looking collective responsibility is not designed to capture an agent’s will. Instead, it is designed to distribute moral labor. Hence, while forward looking collective responsibility only works with purposeful agents, it does not require either a “collective mind” or that an agent be able to form “we intentions”. Instead, it requires only that the agent be able to do something in the world and take responsibility for making things happen.

While forward looking collective responsibility is thus not saddled with controversial metaphysical conditions in the way that its backward looking counterpart is, it is not without its own controversies. In some cases, these controversies are about what kinds of groups are capable of forward looking collective responsibility. Bill Wringe (Wringe 2014) and Felix Pinket (Pinket 2014) cover these controversies nicely. In other cases, they are about how—on what normative basis—we can ascribe forward collective looking responsibility in practice. What principles should we invoke to do so? How should we order these principles?

Interestingly enough, not everyone thinks that such principles are necessary. Indeed, a few key figures in the field still assume that forward looking (remedial) responsibility is grounded in causal responsibility for the harm now deemed in need of a remedy. David Lyons (Lyons 2004) feels comfortable assuming that because the U.S. was causally responsibility for poverty and racism in the past, it now has a responsibility for doing everything that it can to create opportunities for the poor and minorities. David Schmidtz (Schmidtz 1998), who, in contrast to Lyons, takes the poor to be causally responsible for many of their own problems, also moves directly from causal to remedial responsibility. So, too, does Iris Young (Young 2011).

But, again, we need to be careful. For, forward looking (remedial) responsibility is not ascribed for the purpose of gauging moral agency per se. Instead, it is ascribed for the purpose of ensuring the success of a particular, morally justifiable, project, e.g., alleviating poverty, hunger, or racism. Hence, when it comes to forward looking responsibility, we need to think about who is in the best position to do something about the harm, and when we do, as Robert Goodin (1998) points out, we may—and probably will—discover in some cases that the agent who caused the harm is not the agent who is now able to remedy it in practice.

None of this suggests that we should abandon judgments of causal responsibility altogether when ascribing forward looking responsibility. Indeed, as we suggest shortly, such judgments may become relevant to matters of fairness in ascribing remedial responsibility. But it does suggest that we cannot move directly from causal to remedial responsibility, i.e., ground the latter exclusively in the former. Likewise, it does suggest that we need intermediary considerations. Carol Rovane (Rovane 2014), Tracy Isaacs (Isaacs 2011; Isaacs 2014), Ludger Jansen (Jansen 2014), Derrick Darby and Nyla Branscombe (Darby and Branscombe, 2014) and Marion Smiley (Smiley 2014) all make this clear from their own theoretical perspectives.

How, then, are we to ascribe forward looking collective responsibility in practice? At the very least, we need to make room for various kinds of practical judgments, including those that draw attention to who is best able to remedy the harm in question and at what cost. But such practical judgments, which are very important, are not the only non-causal matters that we need to take into consideration when ascribing forward looking responsibility. Indeed, as recent debates concerning our responsibility for remedying health care problems at home, starvation abroad, and environmental disasters everywhere attest, judgments about the relative value of our projects in the world are also crucial. So, too, are judgments about fairness and obligation.

Not surprisingly, we incorporate judgments about relative value primarily in cases where we cannot pursue all of our projects—eradicating hunger, bringing up healthy children, creating jobs, reversing global warming—at once or even at all. But we make these judgments in other kinds of cases as well, including those in which a supposed cause of harm, say, capitalism, is also the cause of something that we value. In these cases, we may think that our choice to focus on a particular state of affairs is uncontroversial. But it is in fact steeped in our own priorities.

Take, for example, Young’s ascriptions of responsibility for alleviating poverty, hunger, and violence around the world cited above. Young may be correct that capitalism (or at least unregulated capitalism) is causally responsible for these problems. (There would of course be other agents to consider as well.) But if she is going to go on to ascribe remedial responsibility to those who benefit from capitalism—which is what she is concerned to do—then she has to take into consideration that capitalism (or at least regulated capitalism) may also be causally responsible for things in the world that we value, e.g., significant improvements in health care, education, and food production, as well as the separation of economic from political power.

Moreover, she has to take these things into consideration because of the very nature of remedial responsibility itself as organized and distributed across cases. Remedial responsibility, as we have seen, is attached to a particular project. (Who, we ask, is responsible for carrying out this project?) But it cannot be formulated in isolation. Instead, it has to be formulated with an eye to our other projects. For, we are limited with respect to both moral energy and resources. Hence, we have to prioritize our projects as well as to coordinate our ascriptions of remedial responsibility across them. Likewise, we have to be aware of the priorities that others, e.g., Young, incorporate into their own ascriptions of remedial responsibility.

All of this is to suggest that if we want to ascribe remedial responsibility in a justifiable fashion— in a way that avoids arbitrariness and bias— we will have to argue openly about the relative value of our projects and proceed with an overview in mind. What projects, we will have to ask, are most valuable to us and how do they rank in importance with respect to other projects? Whose needs and interests are being taken into consideration by these projects? How might we ensure that everyone’s needs and interests are taken into consideration? What is the relative cost of the projects in question and how does cost itself rank in importance here?

Robert Goodin defends this kind of pragmatic approach to forward looking collective responsibility in his arguments for why the U.S. should be held responsible for providing the poor with welfare benefits. In distancing himself from the practice of blame, he writes:

It is forward-looking, task oriented, collective responsibility that I am championing.… There are good reasons for pursuing certain sorts of goals through some sort of coordinated, collective apparatus like the state.…Responsibilities get collectivized simply because that is the only realistic way (or anyway, much the most effective way) of discharging them. (Goodin 1998, p. 50)

The pragmatic approach to forward looking collective responsibility gestured to here is very valuable (and sound). But we cannot treat it in isolation from other approaches. In other words, we cannot simply replace causal responsibility with capacity for remedying a problem as a basis for ascribing forward looking responsibility. Instead, we have to incorporate other values and principles into our ascriptions of responsibility. What might they be? As things now stand, the value of fairness is frequently invoked, if not thoroughly explored, in this context. So, too, are the values of citizenship and collective obligation, as well as the principle of a social contract.

Admittedly, those who invoke the value of fairness in ascribing forward looking responsibility do not always have the same thing in mind by the term. Alexander Brown [2009] incorporates judgments about who caused harm into his arguments about who can fairly be held responsible for remedying such harm and, in doing so, treats fairness as a response to causal agency. Brown’s concern is with the behavioral lapses of the poor in a welfare state.

If a person is causally responsible for becoming an addict, then he cannot fairly expect our assistance in getting him off of drugs.…The government can only be expected to do so much. (Brown 2009, p. 151)

Michael Walzer also considers fairness to be very important to ascriptions of forward looking collective responsibility in a welfare state. But he does not consider fairness in this context to rest on considerations of who caused harm. Instead, he considers it to rest on the norms of communal membership. According to Walzer, a fair distribution of responsibilities in a welfare state will always come down to what we owe each other as members of a community—which, from his perspective, translates into all of those things that will make communal membership possible among those in the community, e.g., financial security, health care, education, peace, and security, regardless of whether members caused harm to themselves. (Walzer 2008)

Christian Neuhauser, who underscores the importance of distributive justice in the organization of forward looking collective responsibility, concurs on the importance of fairness to the ascription of remedial responsibility. But he takes things in a somewhat different direction from both Brown and Walzer by treating fairness as a matter of doing one’s fair share. Moreover, Neuhauser places fairness in the context of various collective action scenarios. Hence, he is naturally led to talk about fairness as a motivating force. “The motivation of agents to embrace a forward looking responsibility also depends on whether other actors contribute their fair share”. (Neuhauser 2014, p. 246)

While the value of fairness is commonly invoked by those concerned to locate criteria for ascribing (or organizing or distributing) forward looking collective responsibility in practice, it is not the only value or principle in play. Indeed, many of those in the field continue to look to collective obligations as a basis for remedial responsibility. In some cases, the collective obligations in question are thought to be built into the collective itself. (Miller 2007) In other cases, they are thought to derive from various other norms of moral and political life.

In her discussion of forward looking collective responsibility and the prospects of war, Neta Crawford locates the source of these obligations in the sphere of citizenship. According to Crawford, “ordinary citizens have a collective moral and political responsibility to participate in decisions about wars that are undertaken by their governments and they have a responsibility to protest unjust wars or immoral conduct during wars.” (Crawford, 2014, p. 141) Moreover, they have such responsibility, according to Crawford, by virtue of their identity as citizens in a democratic community. Bill Wringe takes such an analysis to the global level (Wringe 2014), as do many others in the field of global justice, including David Miller (2007).

Derrick Darby and Nyla Branscombe, in their work on responsibility for overcoming social, political, and economic inequality, choose to look, not to the identities of democratic citizens, but to the kinds of social, political, and economic institutions that democratic citizens would choose within a Rawlsian social contract, as a basis for ascribing remedial responsibility. In doing so, they manage not only to bring both shared interests and rational choice together, but, in doing so, to make clear what is unique about forward looking responsibility.

The shift to a forward looking account of political responsibility requires placing greater emphasis on the interest that we all share in sustaining the major social institutions that so profoundly shape our life prospects.…Hence, we should take political responsibility for inequality given our vital interest in sustaining the system of cooperation and institutions that give rise to both permissible and impermissible inequalities. (Darby and Branscombe 2014, p. 133)

Tracy Isaacs, who develops a full-blown account of collective obligations and their relationship to collective responsibility [Isaacs 2011 and 2014], points to many of the norms cited above and emphasizes the centrality of identity. But, interestingly enough, she does not steer clear of causal responsibility in doing so. Instead, she offers a sophisticated view of how causal responsibility helps shape our criteria for ascribing remedial responsibility fairly.

Agents who are causally implicated and who benefit do indeed bear a heavier burden of obligation for alleviating harmful circumstances. Where collective obligation is concerned, these connections to the harm or wrong doing make some collective agents more obligated than others…and play a role in determining the identity of the collective agent who has the collective obligation. (Isaacs 2014, p. 41)

All of these arguments underscore the cluster of values and principles that go into ascribing forward looking collective responsibility in practice. Isaac’s work in particular provides a way of bringing causal responsibility back into play without either blurring the distinction between backward and forward looking responsibility or treating the latter as a natural extension of the former. How, if at all, should we prioritize all of these values, principles, and causal judgments, in ascribing remedial responsibility? It has been suggested (Smiley 2014) that instead of treating one of them as primary and the others as secondary we bring all of them together into a pluralistic normative account of forward looking collective responsibility.

In doing so, we would undoubtedly make the project of forward looking collective responsibility out to be more complicated than it now appears to be in the hands of those who choose one value to place at the center of our attention in this context. But we would also make it more sensitive to the various ethical demands that we rightly place on each other in holding each other responsible for harm in the world.

What about the practical constraints associated with forward looking collective responsibility? Two such constraints (or possible constraints) have come to the fore in recent years. The first has to do with structured injustice. The second has to do with how we can (or cannot) move forward in cases where our collective is not yet organized, i.e., in cases where the kind of collective required for remedial action, namely one that is capable of acting, still has to be created or at least organized.

Iris Young introduces the matter of structural injustice in her arguments for why we should now be focussing on forward looking rather than backward looking, collective responsibility. According to Young, we should be focussing on forward looking collective responsibility because the source of much injustice in the world is located in social, economic, and political structures, and only forward looking collective responsibility can deal with confronting these structures head-on. Robert Goodin and Christian Barry (2021) argue persuasively against the sharp distinction that Young relies on here between individualized responsibility for past structural injustice and collective responsibility for preventing structural injustice in the future. Moreover, Young herself relies on backward looking causal histories of various collectives that bring about harm to sustain her notion of forward looking collective responsibility. Nevertheless, her insistence on viewing both backward and forward looking collective responsibility through the lens of structural injustice sets a very important precedent for future theorizing in the field.

The second practical challenge to the practice of forward looking collective responsibility pertains to the dilemma that we face when trying to hold disorganized collectives responsible for preventing harm in the future that they could, if they were organized, prevent. The problem is that they are not now organized and hence cannot act as a collective. A transformation is necessary. But we cannot expect a disorganized group (say, a mob or a group of persons who are not in any way institutionally connected) to instigate such a transformation. For such a group is by definition not organized enough to act as a collective.

What, then, are we to do? How can we transform a disorganized group into one that is organized enough to take on a collective obligation to prevent harm? A promising solution here might be to revisit the place of individual moral agents in ascribing forward looking collective responsibility in cases where a group is not yet organized enough to be ascribed such responsibility. In particular, we might want to ask how, if at all, individual moral agents might be motivated and even obligated to create the kind of organized collective that is needed here.

Not surprisingly, the value of self-interest comes to the fore here, especially with the recognition that moral agents may have intergenerational interests moving forward. But we need not rely on self-interest. Nor need we forgo the possibility that existing moral systems of a non-utilitarian kind can provide the necessary moral motivation. Indeed, we may even be able to argue that individual moral agents in a not-yet-organized collective (that, if organized, could prevent harm) have a moral duty to create (together) the kind of collective capable of performing the required actions.

Frank Hindriks takes on this challenge in “The Duty to Join Forces: When Individuals Lack Control” (Hindriks, 2019) and elsewhere (Blomberg and Hindriks, 2020). Hindriks argues very persuasively that we can create the required organized collective if we can substantiate a duty on the part of the individual moral agents to join forces: to approach others, to convince them to contribute to the joint efforts, and to become part of a collective action. This duty is initially associated with individual moral agents. But, Hindriks claims, since it focuses on mobilizing others rather than on preventing harm per se, it is “irreducibly collective” (Hindriks, p. 204).

Whether or not the duty expressed here is “irreducibly collective” (as distinct from being a fusion of individual and collective responsibility) it does appear to be a very promising solution to one of the thorniest problems associated with forward looking collective responsibility, namely, how to bring organized collectives about in cases where their existence is crucial to the prevention of harm.

Suffice it here to underscore three more general points suggested by efforts such as Hindriks’. The first is that reliance on individual moral duties and other kinds of individually based incentives to create new (or newly recognized) collective entities does not undermine the integrity of forward looking collective responsibility, but instead makes the latter possible. The second is that the creation (or recognition) of these new collective entities is absolutely crucial in cases where we are faced, in Stephen Gardiner’s words (Gardiner, 2017), with “paradigmatically global, intergenerational and ecological problems such as climate change” (Gardiner, 2017, p. 22) that require an expanded community of both concern and action. The third is that when we step back and ask how these expanded communities of concern and action can be created, we confront the importance of thinking about individual and collective responsibility, not as mutually exclusive, but, at least in some cases, as mutually supportive in both theory and practice.


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


The editors would like to thank Robert von Hallberg for notifying us about a variety typographical and other errors in an earlier version of this entry.

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