Multiple Realizability

First published Mon Nov 23, 1998; substantive revision Mon May 18, 2020

In the philosophy of mind, the multiple realizability thesis contends that a single mental kind (property, state, event) can be realized by many distinct physical kinds. A common example is pain. Many philosophers have asserted that a wide variety of physical properties, states, or events, sharing no features in common at that level of description, can all realize the same pain. This thesis served as a premise in the most influential argument against early theories that identified mental states with brain states (psychoneural, or mind-brain identity theories). It also served in early arguments for functionalism. Nonreductive physicalists later adopted this premise and these arguments (usually without alteration) to challenge all varieties of psychophysical reductionism. The argument was even used to challenge the functionalism it initially was offered to support. Reductionists (and other critics) quickly offered a number of responses, initially attacking either the anti-reductionist or anti-identity conclusion from the multiple realizability premise, or advocating accounts of the reduction relation that accommodated multiple realizability. More recently it has become fashionable to attack the multiple realizability premise itself. Most recently the first book-length treatment of multiple realizability and its philosophical import has appeared.

This entry proceeds mostly chronologically, to indicate the historical development of the topic. Its principle focus is on philosophy of mind and cognitive science, but it also indicates the more recent shift in emphasis to concerns in the metaphysics of science more generally. It is worth mentioning at the outset that multiple realizability has been claimed in physics (e.g., Batterman 2000), biochemistry (Tahko forthcoming) and synthetic biology (Koskinen 2019a,b). After more than fifty years of detailed philosophical discussion there still seems to be no end in sight for novel ideas about this persistent concern.

1. Multiple Realizability Arguments

1.1 What is Multiple Realizability?

The multiple realizability contention about the mental is that a given psychological kind (like pain) can be realized by many distinct physical kinds: by different brain states in earthly biological pain-bearers, by electronic states in properly programmed digital computers, by green slime states in imagined extraterrestrials, and so on. Correctly characterizing the realization relation remains a contentious matter in analytic metaphysics (Gillett 2003; Polger 2004) and this issue quickly reaches detailed technical depths. But whatever the correct account of realization turns out to be, about whatever kinds turn out to be related by realization, the multiple realizability contention about the mental holds that a given psychological kind (like pain) can stand in that relationship to many distinct physical kinds. Further discussion of this issue with numerous references will arise in section 3 below.

1.2 Initial Multiple Realizability Arguments Against “Reductive” Mind-Brain Identity Theories

Hilary Putnam introduced multiple realizability into the philosophy of mind. Challenging the “brain state theorists”, who held that every mental kind is identical to some yet-to-be-discovered neural kind, Putnam (1967) notes the wide variety of terrestrial creatures seemingly capable of experiencing pain. Humans, other primates, other mammals, birds, reptiles, amphibians, and even mollusks (e.g., octopi) seem reasonable candidates. But then, for the “brain state theory” to be true, there must be some “physical-chemical kind” common to this wide variety of pain-bearing species, and correlated exactly with each occurrence of the mental kind. (This is a necessary condition of the hypothesized type-identity.) Biological considerations speak intuitively against this requirement. Neuroanatomy differs across terrestrial brain-bearing creatures, especially at systems and circuit levels; function, especially sensory functions, are increasingly “corticalized” as cortical mass increases across species. Convergent evolution generates similar phylogenic traits in organisms not closely related due to their having to adapt to similar environments or ecological niches. Such realizers of the same function will highly likely be distinct “physical-chemical” kinds.

In addition, Putnam (1967) points out that early mind-brain identity theorists insisted that these identities, while contingent, hold by virtue of natural (scientific) law. So then any physically possible pain-bearer must also be capable of possessing that physical-chemical kind. This point marks the introduction of the crucial distinction between multiple realization and multiple realizability into the discussion, as well as the well-known philosophers’ imagined metaphysical possibilities. Silicon-based androids, artificially intelligent electronic robots, and Martians with green slime pulsating within their bodies all seem to be possible pain realizers. But they lack “brain states” comparable to ours at any level of physical description. Further still, these mind-brain identity theories were supposed to be completely general. Every mental kind was held to be identical to some neural kind. So the critic needs to find only one mental kind, shared across these structure-types yet realized differently at the physical-chemical level. Putnam (1967) acknowledges that the early identity theories were being offered an empirical hypothesis. But this consequence was “certainly ambitious”, and almost certainly false.

One quick word on this distinction between multiple realizability and realization, for it marks a point where treatment of this topic in metaphysics and cognitive science diverged. Metaphysicians, many of whom came quickly to reject the contingent identity claims of the early mind-brain identity theorists in favor of the necessity of identity claims, focused on multiple realizability, since the possibility of distinct physical realizers of the same psychological kind was sufficient to block any such identity between realized kind and any one of its possible realizers. Philosophers who took their cue from the cognitive and brain sciences focused on proposed instances of multiple realization, of actual instances of the relation among existing cognizers. The emphasis in this entry will be on the latter issue, although some discussion of the metaphysical issues will arise in section 2 and section 3 below.

Stated in canonical form, Putnam’s original multiple realizability argument draws an anti-identity theory conclusion from two premises:

  1. (the multiple realizability contention) (At least) some mental kinds are multiply realizable by distinct physical kinds.
  2. If a given mental kind is multiply realizable by distinct physical kinds, then it cannot be identical to any one (of those) specific physical kind.
  3. (the anti-identity thesis conclusion) (At least) some mental kinds are not identical to any one specific physical kind.

In this simple form, this argument is deductively valid.

Jerry Fodor (1974) extended Putnam’s initial argument by arguing that reductionism imposes too strong a constraint on acceptable theories in special sciences like psychology and economics. According to Fodor, reductionism is the conjunction of “token physicalism” with the claim that there are natural kind predicates in an ideally completed physics corresponding to each natural kind term in any ideally completed special science. He characterizes “token physicalism” as the claim that all events that science talks about are physical events. Token physicalism is a logically weaker thesis than reductionism or type-type physicalism. To illustrate why, consider the following string of numerals:

1 1 2

This string contains two types of numerals (1 and 2), but three tokens of the two types (two tokens of the numeral type 1 and one token of the numeral type 2). Mental states are similarly ambiguous. When you and I both entertain the belief that Fodor advocated a Language of Thought, one type of mental state is entertained, but two tokens of that type occur (your belief state and my belief state). Type-type physicalism insists that each mental state type is identical to some physical state type, i.e., some specific brain state type on the mind-brain identity theory. This view runs afoul of multiple realizability. But token physicalism only insists that each token occurrence of each type of mental state is identical to some token occurrence of some physical state type—not necessarily a token occurrence of the same physical state type on each occasion, e.g., when you and I, with our brains differentiated by our separate life histories, entertain the same belief about Fodor’s favorite philosophy of mind.

Fodor gave reductionists the best-known account of reduction at that time, the one at work in Paul Oppenheim and Hilary Putnam’s (1958; Fodor subtitles his 1974 as “The Disunity of Science as a Working Hypothesis”) and culminating in Ernest Nagel’s (1961) “derivability” account of intertheoretic reduction. According to Fodor, this “classic” account “connects” disparate elements of the reduced and reducing theories’ vocabularies by way of “bridge laws” (not Nagel’s term!) and claims a reduction when the laws of the reduced theory are derived from the laws of the reducing theory plus the bridge laws. According to Fodor (1974), if reductionism is to establish physicalism, these cross-theoretic bridge laws must assert (contingent) identities of reduced and reducing kinds. But given multiple realizability, the only way this can obtain is if the physical science constituent of a psychophysical bridge law is a disjunction of all the terms denoting possible physical realizations of the mental kind. Given the extent and variety of actual (not to say possible) physical realizations, Fodor insists that it is overwhelmingly likely that the disjunctive component will not be a kind-predicate of any specific physical science. It is also overwhelmingly likely that the disjunctive component will not appear in any genuine law of some specific physical science. Multiple realizability thus demonstrates that the additional requirement imposed by reductionism, beyond that of token physicalism, is empirically untenable. (For a recent argument that multiple realization is consistent with Oppenheim and Putnam’s unity of science via reductions, see Shapiro 2018)

1.3 Early Multiple Realizability Arguments for Functionalism

The multiple realizability premise was also part of early arguments for functionalism. Functionalism in the philosophy of mind individuates mental states in terms of their causes and effects. Pain, for example, is caused by tissue damage or trauma to bodily regions, and in turn causes specific beliefs (e.g., that one is in pain), desires (e.g., that one relieves the pain), and behaviors such as crying out, nursing the damaged area, and seeking out pain relieving drugs. Any internal state that mediates a similar pattern of causes and effects is of the mental type pain, regardless of the specific physical mechanisms that realize that pattern of causes and effects in any given case. Ned Block and Jerry Fodor (1972) note that the multiple realizability of mental types on physical types shows that any physicalist type-identity hypothesis will fail to be sufficiently abstract. Functionalism, on the other hand, seems to be at the correct level of abstraction up from explanations of behavior based on physical mechanisms. In particular, it seems sufficiently abstract to handle multiple realizability. Block and Fodor (1972) also note that multiple realizability at the level of physical description is a common characteristic of ordinary functional kinds, like mousetraps and valve lifters. So it appears to be a reasonable empirical hypothesis that characterizing mental kinds as functional kinds is at the correct level of abstraction.

Some contemporary nonreductive physicalists deny that mental kinds are correctly identified with functional kinds. A popular criticism of this sort hinges on issues about individualism in psychology. But Putnam later used multiple realizability itself to argue against functionalism, arguing that mental kinds are both “compositionally” and “computationally” plastic. The first point is his familiar contention of the multiple realizability of the mental on the physical. The second contends that the same mental kind can be a property of systems that are not in the same computational state (see Putnam 1988 for details). In this argument, multiple realizability strikes back against the very theory of mind it initially was used to defend.

1.4 The Multiple Realizability Argument from Psychological Explanations

Psychologist Zenon Pylyshyn (1984) appeals to multiple realizability to ground a methodological criticism of reductionism about psychology. He describes a pedestrian (in the U.S., say), having just witnessed an automobile accident, rushing into a nearby phone booth and dialing a 9 and a 1. (For readers unfamiliar with phone booths, suppose instead that he pulls out his cell phone and punches those numbers.) What will this person do next? With very high probability, he will dial (push) another 1. Why? Because in the U.S., 911 is the universal emergency number and there is a systematic generalization holding between the event he witnessed, his background knowledge, resulting intentions, and that subsequent action (all intentionally described).

We won’t discover that generalization, however, if we focus on the person’s neurophysiology and resulting muscular contractions. That level of explanation logically is too weak, for it cannot tell us that the prior sequence of neural events and muscular contractions will lead to the subsequent action of dialing another 1. A physiological explanation for any given instance will only link one way of learning the emergency phone number to one way of coming to know that an emergency occurred to one sequence of neural events and resulting muscular contractions producing the behavior (nonintentionally described). However, the number of physical events constituting each of these cognitive classes—the learning, the coming to know, and the action of dialing—is potentially unlimited, with the constituents of each class often unrelated to each other at the physiological level of description. (This is Pylyshyn’s appeal to multiple realizability.) So if there is a generalization at the higher level of description available for capturing—and in the example sketched above, surely there is—an exclusively reductionist approach to psychological explanation will miss it. Thus because of multiple realizability, reductionism violates a tenet of scientific methodology: seek to capture all capturable generalizations. Such methodological arguments did not end with Pylyshyn’s. Fodor (1975: Chapter 5) and Terence Horgan (1993) raise related methodological caveats about reductionism based on multiple realizability. Bickle (1998: Chapter 4) responds directly to these.

1.5 Appeals to Multiple Realizability in a Token System Over Time

Anti-reductionists quickly came to stress the more radical form of multiple realizability mentioned in section 1.1 above, in a token system over times. As far back as the late 1970s, Ned Block (1978) insisted that the narrowing of psychological kinds required to render them identifiable with specific physical (i.e., neural) kinds due to the more radical type of multiple realizability would render psychology incapable of capturing most all generalizations across realizers. Ronald Endicott (1993) gives Block’s point empirical backing by noting detailed facts about plasticity in individual human brains. The capacity for distinct neural structures and processes to subserve a given psychological function owing to trauma, damage, changing task demands, development, and other factors is extensive. These facts count further against any proposed reduction of, or identities between psychological and physical kinds. Horgan (1993) clearly appeals to this radical sense of multiple realizability when he writes:

Multiple realizability might well begin at home. For all we now know (and I emphasize that we really do not now know), the intentional mental states we attribute to one another might turn out to be radically multiply realizable at the neurobiological level of description, even in humans; indeed, even in individual humans; indeed, even in an individual human given the structure of his central nervous system at a single moment of his life. (1993: 308; author’s emphases)

This radical sense of multiple realizability was widely adopted among nonreductive physicalists, whose solution to the mind-body problem probably remains the most popular position in Anglo-American philosophy of mind. Putnam’s original multiple realizability argument against the mind-brain identity (see §1.2 above) remains central to this view, with the second premise now replaced with:

If some mental kinds are multiply realizable in this radical single-token-system-over-time sense, then psychology cannot be reduced to any physical science;

and Putnam’s original conclusion replaced with:

Psychology cannot be reduced to any physical science.

2. Replies to Multiple Realizability Arguments: The First Forty Years

2.1 One-Way Bridge Principles in Nagel Reductions

Robert Richardson (1979) argues that Fodor’s multiple realizability challenge to reductionism (see §1.2 above) rests on a misunderstanding of Ernest Nagel’s “classic” account of intertheoretic reduction. Although Nagel’s (1961) detailed examples of historical cases of intertheoretic reduction in science all involve biconditional cross-theory “conditions of connectivity” (what Fodor and others called “bridge laws”), one-way conditional connections expressing sufficient conditions at the reducing level are all that his “principle of derivability” requires. Richardson cites passages from Nagel (1961) indicating that Nagel himself saw the force of this point. Multiple realizability only challenges necessity (and nondisjunctive) reducing conditions, and so is not a challenge to a projected, distinctively Nagelian reduction of psychology to some physical science. However, this response seems not to dispose of the original argument’s force against mind-brain identity theory.

2.2 Domain-Specific Identities and Reductions

David Lewis (1969) argues that the inconsistency between the identity theorist’s thesis and multiple realizability evaporates when we notice a tacit relativity of the former to contexts. A common sense example illustrates his point. The following three claims appear logically inconsistent:

There is only one winning lottery number.
The winning lottery number is 03.
The winning lottery number is 61.

These three similar claims likewise seem inconsistent:

(the identity theorist’s thesis) There is only one physical-chemical realization of pain.
The physical-chemical realization of pain is C-fiber firing.
The physical-chemical realization of pain is … (something else entirely).

(2′) and (3′) reflect the multiple realizability contention. But there is no mystery in how to reconcile (1)–(3). Append “per week” to (1), “this week” to (2), and “last week” to (3). Similarly, append “per nervous system-type” to (1′), “in human nervous systems” to (2′), and “in mollusk nervous systems” to (3′). Inconsistencies evaporate. Lewis’s point is that identity claims are always specific to a domain. One might wonder whether Lewis’s point generalizes to capture the science fiction examples Putnam hinted at in passing (see §1.2 above). Lewis was certainly aware of Putnam’s (1967) argument’s reach (Lewis offers this argument as part of a review of the book in which Putnam’s piece first appeared). So we can assume Lewis thought domain-specific reductions generalize to these metaphysically possible cases as well. (See Lewis’s own elaboration of this argument in his 1983.)

Many reductionist philosophers subsequently elaborated on Lewis’s point with the help of scientific examples. Patricia Churchland (1986: Chapter 7), Clifford Hooker (1981), Berent Enç (1983), and other philosophers of science have described historical intertheoretic reductions where a given reduced concept is multiply realized at the reducing level. A common example is the concept of temperature from classical equilibrium thermodynamics. Temperature in a gas is identical to mean molecular kinetic energy. Temperature in a solid, however, is identical to mean maximal molecular kinetic energy, since the molecules of a solid are bound in lattice structures and hence restricted to a range of vibratory motions. Temperature in a plasma is something else entirely, since the molecular constituents of a plasma have been ripped apart. Even a vacuum can have a (“blackbody”) temperature, though it contains no molecular constituents. “Temperature” of classical thermodynamics is thus multiply realized microphysically in a variety of distinct physical states. Yet this is a “textbook” intertheoretic reduction in the history of science. It is just that the reduction, and the subsequent ontological identifications across theories, are specific to the domain of physical state.

Lewis’s original response also underlies Jaegwon Kim’s (1989, 1992) appeals to structure-specific “local reductions”. Kim agrees that multiple realizability rules out a general reduction of (structure-independent) psychology to some physical science. But it permits, and even sanctions, a local reduction of psychology to a theory of the physical mechanisms of given structure-types. (Kim admits that the relevant structure-types here will probably be narrower than biological species.) Local reductions involve “structure-specific bridge laws” where the mental-physical biconditional occurs as the consequent of a conditional whose antecedent denotes a specific structure-type (e.g., “if X is a member of structure type S, then X is in mental state M if and only if X is in physical state P”). Conditionals whose antecedents denote different structure types will typically have biconditionals as consequents whose mental term-constituents are co-referential but whose physical term-constituents denote different physical events. Multiple realizability forces this much revision to the bridge laws of classical reductionism. But according to Kim, domain-specific local reductions are the rule rather than the exception in science generally, and are sufficient for any reasonable scientific or philosophical purpose.

2.3 Appeals to Neuroscience’s Successes

Jaegwon Kim (1992) suggests, and John Bickle (1998: Chapter 4) emphasizes that guiding methodological principles in contemporary neuroscience assume continuity of underlying neural mechanisms across the nervous systems of different species. This assumption informs many neuroscience experimental techniques and conclusions drawn from experimental results. Continuity is assumed both within and across species. If radical multiple realizability of the sort championed by anti-reductionist philosophers actually obtained among existent species, contemporary neuroscientific experimental techniques and practices built upon this continuity assumption should bear little scientific fruit. Why experiment on the macaque visual system to investigate human visual processing, if we can’t safely assume some fairly strong continuity across these species? Why should positron emission tomography (PET) and functional magnetic resonance imaging (fMRI) reveal common areas of high metabolic activity during psychological task performance, both across and within individual humans—now down to less than a millimeter of spatial resolution in fMRI—if multiple realizability were as prevalent or widespread as many nonreductive philosophers assume? (see §1.5 above). Standard neuroscientific experimental procedures, and even clinical diagnostic tools widely used by practicing neurologists and neuropsychologists, would seem hopelessly naïve in the face of common philosophical assertions about the extent of multiple realizability. But these procedures and tools do work, and are not hopelessly naïve.

So Kim and Bickle draw the modus tollens conclusion, and insist that these neuroscientific successes are evidence that psychological kinds are not as widely or as radically multiply realized in brains as many functionalists and nonreductive physicalists assume. It turns out that even celebrated neural plasticity is systematic within and across nervous systems. It has a regular progression following damage to a principal structure; there are underlying neural mechanisms that subserve it, evolutionarily conserved across species. Furthermore, the newly realized function following brain damage is typically seriously degraded compared to initial performance. Persons can still talk, manipulate spatial representations, or move their extremities, but their performances are typically qualitatively and quantitatively worse than normals. This fact gives rise to tricky questions about individuation of psychological function. Are these alternative neural structures realizing the same psychological function, the same mental kind, as before, as the philosophical uses of multiple realizability require? (This last response has been further developed more recently; see §2.4 and §3.1 below.)

William Bechtel and Jennifer Mundale (1999) provide extensive empirical details about hypothesized or assumed brain type-identities across species in neuroscientific practice. Their explicit target is a methodological consequence sometimes drawn from the multiple realizability premise: if psychological states are multiply realized across biological species, then neuroscience will be of little use toward understanding cognition. But as details of the neuroscience of vision demonstrate, neuroscientists have successfully used understanding of the brain to decompose visual function. The neuroscientific goal has been to

show how functional considerations get built into developing the structural taxonomy and how that taxonomy in turn can be a heuristic guide in developing information-processing models. This project has not been impaired by multiple realization of psychological states; rather, it relies on the assumption that there is a common realization of mechanisms for processing visual information across species. (1999: 201)

It is difficult to argue against contemporary neuroscience’s empirical successes. So even if one accepts multiple realizability in its original type-type form advocated by Putnam (see §1.2 above), Bechtel and Mundale’s argument cautions against drawing strong consequences from it about psychology’s methodological autonomy from neuroscience.

2.4 Challenging the Individuation of Mental Kinds

Over the past two decades philosophers have been more willing than previously to challenge the truth of the multiple realizability premise itself (see §3.2 below.) One approach of this kind challenges the way proponents of multiple realizability individuate mental kinds.

An early version of this argument is from Nick Zangwill (1992), who concludes that multiple realizability across biological species has “never been proven”. The multiple realizability contention assumes a type-identity of mental kinds across species. According to Zangwill this assumption is problematic, given that the obvious sensory and motor differences across species by themselves yield different cause-and-effect patterns at all but the grossest level of description. If successful, Zangwill’s challenge undercuts the multiple realizability argument by denying that the same mental kinds obtain across species, to be realized by different physical mechanisms.

Lawrence Shapiro (2000) also contends that philosophers are too quick to claim that a single given kind is multiply realized. Some properties of the realizers are relevant to the purposes, activities, or capacities that define a given functional kind, but other properties are not. Consider corkscrews. That functional kind can be “multiply realized” in two tokens that differ only in their color. That physical difference does not make them genuinely different realizations of corkscrew, however, because that one makes no relevant difference, that is, no difference to their performances as corkscrews. Similarly for two corkscrews that differ only in that one is made of aluminum and the other of steel. Although that compositional difference might matter for some functional kinds, it doesn’t matter for corkscrews. As Shapiro notes,

steel and aluminum are not different realizations of a waiter’s corkscrew because, relative to the properties that make them suitable for removing corks, they are identical. (2000: 644)

Establishing relevant multiple realizability requires pointing to property differences in the realizers that make for a functional difference for that kind of thing.

Shapiro then points out that this requirement sets up a dilemma for proponents of multiple realizability. Consider what appears to be a genuine case of multiple realizability, that is, two objects that “do the same thing” but in very different ways. Either the realizing kinds genuinely differ in their causally relevant properties or they do not. If they do not, then we don’t really have a case of multiple realizability (like the corkscrews that differ only in color or metal composition). If they do so differ, then they genuinely are different kinds. But then functionally they are not the same kind, and again we don’t have an instance of multiple realizability—of a single functional kind with distinct realizations.

The usual justification for grouping distinct realizers under a single functional kind is that such a classification reveals interesting similarities, of the sort we expect to be captured by laws or generalizations of some higher level science. But according to Shapiro, when the realizing kinds differ significantly in their causally relevant properties for the function at issue, any shared laws or generalizations are “numbingly dull” (2000: 649), e.g., all realizers of mouse traps can be used to catch mice, or both camera eyes and compound eyes have the function of enabling the organism to see. Shapiro remarks:

If [functional kinds] share many causally relevant properties, then they are not distinct realizations … If they have no or only few causally relevant properties in common, then there are no or just a few laws that are true of both of them. (2000: 649)

The first horn acknowledges a single functional kind but denies that it is multiply realized. The second horn undercuts the principal reason for grouping genuinely different physical kinds under a single functional kind. Shapiro concludes that taken together these two horns blunt any claim of multiple realizations of the same functional type. His argument has been central to more recent disputes as concerns about multiple realization shifted to the metaphysics of science (see §3).

Shapiro’s dilemma is in the spirit of an earlier “causal powers” argument from Jaegwon Kim (1992) Kim insists that scientific kinds are individuated by their causal powers, and the causal powers of each instance of some realized kind are identical to those of its realizer. From these principles it follows that instances of a mental kind with different physical realizations are distinct kinds because of the distinct causal powers of their realizers. A structure-independent mental kind is not a causal kind, and hence is disqualified as proper scientific kinds. Multiple realizability yields the failure of structure-independent mental kinds to meet a standard of what makes something a scientific kind.

Mark Couch (2004) presses a related dilemma. Defending a claimed multiple realization involves two steps. Proponents must show

  1. that the physical states (of the realizers) are type distinct, and
  2. that the functional properties are type identical.

Challenges to claimed multiple realizations can attack either step, and most importantly, the step challenged can differ from case to case. Successfully challenging either step blocks any multiple realizability argument appealing to that kind. As we saw in the previous section, Bechtel and Mundale (1999) describe cases in which cognitive neuroscientists treat the physical realizers (brain states) as type-identical across species, thus attacking step (i). In other cases—Couch’s example is primate versus octopus eyes—one can appeal to easily-found differences in functional properties, attacking step (ii). The two types of eyes have different visual pigments in their photoreceptors, different retinas, and different ways of focusing light. These physical differences lead to straightforward input-output (functional) differences: in the optic stimuli the two eyes respond to, in reaction times, and more. Their functions may be similar, but similarity isn’t identity and the multiple realization argument since Putnam’s original version (see §1.2 above) requires identity at the realized functional kinds. Cross-species functional similarities are often quite superficial, especially across species from widely differing taxa (a point stressed by both Couch and Shapiro). In actual scientific practice, discovered physical (neural) differences typically incline psychologists to search for functional differences. Couch’s point is that the individuation of psychological states, like the individuation of brain states, is an empirical issue; Shapiro and Couch both suggest that claims about multiple realizability often rely heavily on “folk” psychological intuitions about individuating mental kinds.

Bechtel and Mundale (1999) note that proponents of multiple realizability often appeal to different amounts of “granularity” in how they individuate mental versus neurobiological kinds. Proponents often analyze psychological states at a coarse-grained level, in which only the loosest input-output similarities across species are deemed sufficient for mental kind identities. Yet they insist on very fine-grained individuation for brain states, in which small differences across species are sufficient for neural type-differences. But psychological ascriptions admit of finer grains and neural ascriptions admit of coarser grains. Bechtel and Mundale insist that when a common grain is chosen for both, mental-neural type-identities holding across species are found.

These responses quickly attracted critical counters. Carl Gillett (2003) argues that Fodor and other proponents of multiple realizability assume a “Dimensioned” view of realization that allows realizer/realized properties to be instantiated in the distinct individuals that bear part-whole relations to one another. Shapiro instead assumes a “Flat” view of realization, which demands that realizer/realized properties be instantiated in the same individual. Gillett argues that Shapiro’s arguments fail under the Dimensioned view of realization, and that he never defends the Flat view over the Dimensioned view. Gillett concludes that failing to directly address the nature of the realization relation more generally vitiates Shapiro’s critique, leaving it as simply begging the question against Fodor’s and others original defenses of the multiple realization premise. These more general accounts later emerged to dominate more recent discussions (see §3 below).

2.5 Reduction and Identity Theory Reconceived

The more radical type of multiple realizability seems to force increasingly narrower domains for reductions to be relativized; at the extreme, to individuals at times. This much “local reduction” seems inconsistent with the assumed generality of science. To avoid this problem, some philosophers of science have suggested significant changes to the “classical” (Nagelian) account of (intertheoretic) reduction to enable the account to handle multiple realizability of reduced kinds, a feature of a number of “textbook” cases of scientific reductions.

Following suggestions by Clifford Hooker (1981) and Berent Enç (1983), John Bickle (1998: Chapter 4) argues that even the radical type of multiple realizability (in the same token system over time sense) is a feature of some widely-accepted historical scientific reductions. For example, it occurs in the reduction of classical equilibrium thermodynamics to statistical mechanics and microphysics. For any token aggregate of gas molecules, there is an indefinite number of realizations of a given temperature: a given mean molecular kinetic energy. Microphysically, the most fine-grained theoretical specification of a gas is its microcanonical ensemble, in which the momentum and location (and thus the kinetic energy) of each molecule is specified. Indefinitely many distinct microcanonical ensembles of a token volume of gas molecules can yield the same mean molecular kinetic energy. Thus at the lowest level of microphysical description, a given temperature is vastly multiply realizable in the same token system over times. Nevertheless, the case of temperature is a textbook case of scientific reduction. So even this radical type of token-token multiple realizability is no barrier in principle to reducibility. An actual case in science exemplifies it.

To accommodate multiple realizability, Hooker (1981: Part III) supplements his general theory of reduction with an account of “token-to-token” reductions. He notes explicitly that this supplement builds the possibility of handling multiple realizability directly into his revised definition of the reduction relation. Let S be the predicate, “satisfies functional theory F”, T be the class of systems to which the token system in question belongs, S′ be an appropriate predicate in some lower level theory of T-system causal mechanisms, and T* be the class of systems to which S′ applies. Then, according to Hooker,

systems of type S of class T are contingently token/token identical with systems of type S′ in class T* =df every instance (token) of a type S system externally classified as in class T is contingently identical with some instance (token) of a type S′ system externally classified as in class T*. (1981: 504)

By “externally classified”, Hooker refers to the sort of cross-classification that holds across different determinable/determinate hierarchies. To address some self-assessed shortcomings of Hooker’s own formulation of his general account of reduction, Bickle (1998) reformulates Hooker’s insights, including his token-token reduction supplement, within a set-theoretically characterized “semantic” account of theory structure and relations. Bickle’s account draws directly on formal work from “structuralist” philosophy of science. More recently Klein (2013) advocated for a semantic “sets of models” account of theory structure as a strategy for accommodating multiple realized reduced kinds.

Other reconceptions of both reduction and the mind-brain identity theory have been proposed explicitly to handle multiple realizability. Elliott Sober (1999) insists that a reductionist thesis actually follows from the multiple realizability premise. He begins by attacking Putnam’s (1967) “objective” account of superior explanation, namely that one explanation is superior to another if the former is more general. According to Putnam, superior explanations “bring out the relevant laws”. But Sober reminds us that explanatory generalizations at lower levels bring out more details. Science “aims for depth as well as breadth” and there is no “objective rule” concerning which endeavor is “better” (1999: 550). Both reductionists and anti-reductionists err in privileging one aim at the expense of the other. Sober then notes that multiple realizability presupposes some form of asymmetric determination: the lower level physical properties that are present at a given time determine the higher level properties that are present. But this assumption commits its proponents to the causal completeness of physics, the thesis that physical effects have only physical causes (a doctrine that Sober sketches toward the end of his 1999). If one is also concerned with causal explanation—that is, if one holds that individual occurrences are explained by citing their causes—then the causal completeness of physics in turn commits multiple realizability proponents to physics’ possessing an important kind of explanatory completeness that all other sciences lack. This is “reductionism of a sort” (Sober 1999: 562).

William Bechtel and Robert McCauley (1999) develop a version of “heuristic” mind-brain identity theory (HIT) and defend it explicitly against multiple realizability. HIT insists that identity claims in science typically are hypotheses adopted in the course of empirical investigations, which serve to guide subsequent research. They are not conclusions reached after empirical research has been conducted. Concerning the multiple realizability of psychological on brain (physical) states, cognitive neuroscience’s heuristic identity claims assert type-commonalities in comparative studies across species, not type-differences. Bechtel and McCauley illustrate their hypothesis with case studies: Brodmann’s early twentieth century work mapping the brain into functionally relevant areas; Ferrier’s late-nineteenth century work employing electrical stimulation to cortex; and more recent detailed maps of visual processing regions in the primate brain. All of these landmark functional anatomical studies used multiple species. As Bechtel and McCauley remind us,

when they consider theories of mind-brain relations, philosophers seem to forget that the overwhelming majority of studies have been on non-human brains. … Although the ultimate objective is to understand the structure and function of the human brain, neuroscientists depend upon indirect, comparative procedures to apply the information from studies with non-human animals to the study of the human brain. (1999: 70–71)

Heuristic psychoneural type-identity claims across species are key components of these standard neuroscientific procedures.

When reduction or identity theory gets reconceived in ways built to accommodate multiple realizability, are reductionists/identity theorists and proponents of multiple realizability then simply talking past one another? Perhaps not. It is worth reminding ourselves that many nonreductive physicalists have employed multiple realizability to argue against all forms of psychophysical reductionism. If better general accounts of scientific reduction or identity theory make room for multiple realizability, these demonstrations count against this broader challenge. And if “nonreductive” physicalists were to reformulate their position to oppose only a specific brand of psychophysical reductionism or identity theory, that would weaken their position significantly, perhaps to the point of showing that it targets a straw person, but also making it compatible with forms of “reductive” physicalism. In fact, this reconception move on the part of reductionists and identity theorists traces back to Fodor’s (1974) essay. While Fodor’s arguments there explicitly targeted a reductionism built on the classical Nagelian account, he suggests in footnote 2 that

what I shall be attacking is what many people have in mind when they refer to the unity of science, and I suspect (though I shan’t try to prove it) that many of the liberalized versions of reductionism suffer from the same basic defect as what I shall take to be the classical form of the doctrine.

The problem was, even back then, new work on (intertheoretic) reduction in the philosophy of science was attempting explicitly to make room for multiple realizability of reduced on reducing kinds. Fodor’s “shan’t trying to prove” the generality of his attack against even the earliest of those reconceptions begged explicitly one of the questions they were addressing.

2.7 Lower Level Reductive Unity?

In searching for reductive unity underlying the variety of cognitive systems, Paul Churchland (1982) once recommended descending “below” neurobiology and even biochemistry, to the level of nonequilibrium thermodynamics. He insisted that finding reductive unity there was more than a bare logical possibility because of some parallels between biological processes, whose multiply realized kinds find reductive unity there, and cognitive activity, especially learning.

Concerning Pylyshyn’s (1984) attack on reductionist methodology (see §1.5 above), Patricia Churchland (1986: Chapter 9) suggests that functional theories are constructed in lower level sciences. New levels of theory thus get inserted between those describing the structure of the lower level kinds and those of purely functional kinds: between, for example, the physiology of individual neurons and cognitive psychology. We might find a common neurofunctional property for a given type of psychological state across a wide variety of distinct brains (or even the same brain over time). And if the scope of the macro-theory doesn’t extend beyond that of its microfunctional counterpart, then reduction will be achieved despite vast multiple realizability at the microstructural level. Neurocomputational approaches that have blossomed since the early 1990s give real empirical credence to Churchland’s suggestion.

Bickle (2003) claims that if we leave our neuroscientific understanding at the systems level, psychoneural multiple realizability seems obvious. Neural systems differ significantly across species. But neuroscience does not stop its inquiries at the systems level. As it moves further down, into cellular physiology and increasingly into the molecular biology of nervous tissue, identities of mechanisms across species have been found. Many molecular mechanisms of neural conductance, transmission, and plasticity are the same, from invertebrates through mammals. This matters for psychology because mechanisms of cognition and consciousness are increasingly being found at these levels. Bickle’s key example is memory consolidation, the conversion of labile, easily disrupted short-term memories into more durable, stable long-term form. Work with fruit flies, sea slugs, and mice has revealed the role of the cyclic adenosine monophosphate (cAMP)-protein kinase A (PKA)-cAMP responsive-element binding protein (CREB) signaling pathway in key forms of experience-driven synaptic plasticity. Across these very distinct taxa, this molecular intracellular signaling pathways has been implicated experimentally in memory consolidation. By altering a single protein in this cascade (using biotechnology and molecular genetics), experimenters have built mutant organisms whose short-term memory remains intact (as does their sensory, motor, and motivational capacities), but which cannot consolidate these short-term memories into long-term form. Bickle quotes with approval statements like the following, from insect biologists Josh Dubnau and Tom Tully:

In all systems studied, the cAMP signaling cascade has been identified as one of the major biochemical pathways involved in modulating both neuronal and behavioral plasticity. … More recently, elucidation of the role of CREB-mediated transcription in long-term memory in flies, LTP and long-term memory in vertebrates, and long-term facilitation in A. californica [a sea slug] suggest that CREB may constitute a universally conserved molecular switch for long term memory. (1998: 438)

Memory consolidation is just one psychological phenomenon, and so its “ruthless” reduction to molecular events doesn’t establish a general claim about unitary mechanisms across widely divergent taxa for other shared cognitive kinds. For that argument, Bickle turns to principles of molecular evolution. The first principle holds that evolution at the molecular level—changes to the amino acid sequence of a given protein—is much slower in functionally important (“constrained”) domains than in functionally less important ones. The second principle is that molecular evolution is much slower in all domains of “housekeeping” proteins, especially in ones that participate in cell-metabolic processes in many tissue types. These two principles imply that these molecules, their domains, and the intracellular processes they participate in will remain constant across existing biological species that share the common ancestor that first possessed them. (This is what Dubnau and Tully refer to above as a “universally conserved” molecular switch.) In the end, any psychological kind that affects an organism’s behavior must engage the cell-metabolic machinery in individual neurons. In the brain, causally speaking, that’s where the rubber meets the road. But that’s the machinery conserved across existing biological species—changes to it, especially its functionally constrained domains, have (almost) inevitably been detrimental to an organism’s survival. So we should expect that the molecular mechanisms for any causally efficacious cognitive kind be “universally conserved”. The discovery of these shared mechanisms of memory consolidation is not some isolated case, but follows from the core principles of molecular evolution. As “molecular and cellular cognition” proceeds, we should expect more examples of unitary realizers—ruthless reductions—across species for shared psychological kinds

3. The Shifting Status of Multiple Realizability Early in the New Millennium

Over the first decade of the twenty-first century, nonreductive physicalism retained its status as the most popular position in Anglo-American philosophy of mind. Its proponents continued to appeal to the standard multiple realizability arguments (see §1 above) to challenge all versions of psychophysical reductionism and identity theory. However, the challenges to multiple realizability and the arguments using it, scouted in section 2 above, began to attract wider notice. New versions of type-identity theory and reductive physicalism began to be formulated more widely (Gozzano and Hill, 2012). The nonidentity of mental content properties with any physical properties no longer seemed to be the “practically received wisdom”, as Ernest LePore and Barry Loewer (1989) called it thirty years ago, although it has clearly remained an entrenched view.

Some of these arguments continued lines introduced in section 2 above. But they warrant separate treatment, not just to keep my presentation historically accurate, but also because more general considerations from the metaphysics of science increasingly came to motivate specifics of the new discussions, although some of these more general features had been scouted previously in works focused on philosophy of mind (see especially William Lycan 1987).

3.1 The Empire Strikes Back

Expectedly, proponents of multiple realizability quickly responded to the myriad challenges outlined in section 2 above. Carl Gillett and Ken Aizawa were perhaps the most vocal defenders of multiple realizability against a number of them. Gillett (2003) develops a precise framework for understanding compositionality relations in science generally, and uses this framework to define property realization and multiple realization, and to distinguish further “flat” from “dimensioned” realization. Recall from section 2.4 above that “flat” realization involves both realized and realizing properties inhering in a single object. “Dimensioned” realization involves realized and realizing properties inhering in distinct individuals that stand in a compositional relationship to one another. For Gillett (2002, 2003), this distinction is important for two reasons. First, scientific explanations employ dimensioned realizations, because inter-level mechanistic explanations relate distinct individuals. Second, Fodor and other proponents of the standard multiple realizability arguments were assuming a dimensioned account, while the arguments of Shapiro and other recent critics (see §2 above) challenge the existence of multiple realizability only by assuming a flat realization. According to Gillett, no recent proponent of multiple realizability has assumed or defended flat realization as the correct account involved in any of the scientific cases at issue.

Explicitly applying Gillett’s precise framework for realization and related notions, Ken Aizawa and Gillett defend the existence of multiple realization in a variety of sciences (2009a). They also argue for the “massive multiple realization” of properties at every level of organization, from the structure and function of proteins in neurons to those of human cognition to those of social interactions (2009b). Their detailed scientific example in the latter essay is visual processing. They contend that neuroscientists, unlike philosophers, are unfazed by massive multiple realization. Multiple realization has been so contentious in philosophy of mind, they insist, because philosophers tacitly assume flawed or scientifically unfounded accounts of realization, like the flat view. According to Aizawa and Gillett (2009b), philosophers uncritically accept a narrative that links multiple realization to the strict methodological autonomy of psychology from neuroscience. They also contend that the empirical details of vision research show that a co-evolutionary research methodology is not just consistent with, but explicitly motivated by massive multiple realization. So this uncritically accepted philosophical narrative not only blinds philosophers to facts that scientists recognize as unproblematic; it is also empirically false.

Soon afterwards, Aizawa and Gillett (2011) distinguish two strategies scientists might adopt to deal with putative cases of multiple realization. One strategy is simply to take multiple realization at face value and live with multiply realized kinds. The other is to split the higher-level multiply realized kind into a variety of sub-kinds, one for each of its distinct lower level realizers, and then eliminate the original higher-level kind, at least for the purposes of further scientific investigation. Do scientists always favor the second strategy, as recent philosophical critics of multiple realizability would seem to recommend? With its well-known distinctions between different types or systems, memory research would seem to be a clear instance of using such an “eliminate-and-split” strategy. Yet, Aizawa and Gillett argue, such an assessment oversimplifies the actual scientific details in even this much-discussed case. Here too they sense an important general methodological lesson: psychology took account of neuroscience discoveries, so even when taking multiple realization at face value scientists do not advocate strict methodological autonomy. But the actual details of how psychology takes neuroscientific discoveries into account depends both on the nature of the psychological kinds in question and the needs of theorizing specific to psychology.

Aizawa has also replied to a number of the challenges to the standard multiple realizability argument scouted in section 2 above. After separating three distinct arguments in Bechtel and Mundale (1999; §2.3 above), Aizawa (2009) sets his critical sights on their Central Argument, which argues against multiple realization from the existence and continued success of brain mapping studies. He argues that Bechtel and Mundale misrepresent the actual nature of these studies, and more generally of the methods employed in functional localization studies. Working with exactly the scientific examples Bechtel and Mundale discuss (mostly from the functional neuroanatomy of vision), Aizawa argues that claims about psychological functions do not play the specific role in these studies that Bechtel and Mundale insist. So the success of these studies does not imply the falsity of multiple realization. Later in that paper Aizawa challenges two of Bechtel and Mundale’s key assertions. He denies that if psychological properties were multiply realized, then functional taxonomy of the brain would have to be carried out independently of psychological function. And he denies that multiple realization rules out comparisons of brains across different species. Hence all the premises of Bechtel and Mundale’s Central Argument are false. Aizawa (2007) criticizes Bickle’s (2003) argument that a unitary realization of memory consolidation across species has been found at the level of molecular mechanisms, despite widespread neural differences in these brains at higher levels of neuroscientific description (§2.3 above). According to Aizawa, the protein components of these evolutionarily conserved molecular mechanisms, and the NNA sequences coding for them, are themselves multiply realized across species. Aizawa (2013) presented numerous scientific examples of multiple realization by “compensatory differences”. In such cases, changes to one or more properties that jointly realize a realized property G are compensated for by changes in others of the jointly realizing properties. Although his overall goal in this paper is to bring this form of multiple realization to wider recognition and study by philosophers of science, he uses the broader “Gillett-Aizawa framework” to argue that highly specific determinate properties, not just generic determinable properties, are multiply realized in this specific fashion. Such multiply realized determinate properties are indeed exactly similar across distinct realizations, and so answer the dilemma posed by Shapiro and others (§2.4 above).

Carrie Figdor (2010) challenges criticisms of multiple realization that appeal to neuroscience, citing explicitly the works discussed in section 2.3 and section 2.7 above. She undertakes to demonstrate not only the empirical plausibility of mind-brain multiple realization, but also to clarify the terms of the empirically-focused debate. Her scientific focus is on “localizationism”, especially the “brain mapping projects” using state-of-the-art functional neuroimaging (2010: 420). Concerning the terms of the empirically-focused debate, Figdor argues that none of the multiple realization hypotheses common to the philosophical literature is appropriate to this scientific endeavor. Instead she appeals to “degeneracy”, a concept from general biology meaning “the ability of elements that are structurally different to perform the same function or yield the same output”, a characteristic of complexity ranging from the genetic code to immune systems to populations (e.g., Edelman and Gally 2001). This is the notion, Figdor claims, that has been co-opted by cognitive neuroscientists to mean

for a given cognitive function F, there is more than one nonisomorphic (nonidentical) structural element that can subserve F, either within an individual at a time, across individuals, or within an individual across times. (2010: 428)

A major reason for cognitive neuroscientist co-opting degeneracy in this fashion is the frequency of anomalous results in functional neuroimaging studies that show activations of brain areas that differ across subjects, or even in a single subject across performances of the same experimental task,. Figdor discusses numerous examples from recent cognitive neuroscience, and carefully separates cases of degeneracy that count as multiple realizations from others that do not. She concludes that her “sketch of degeneracy in cognitive neuroscience suffices to show that [multiple realizability] is a viable empirical hypothesis (2010: 237). And she concludes by addressing specifically Bechtel and Mundale’s (1999) empirical arguments challenging multiple realizability from functional imaging studies (see §2.3 above). Bechtel and Mundale’s claim that neuroscience has been useful for psychology is true, Figdor asserts, but does not challenge a degeneracy-based empirical case for multiple realizability. And Bechtel and Mundale’s stronger claim, that neuroscientists implicitly assume the falsity of multiple realization as reflected in their accepted practices, is itself shown to be false by the use of degeneracy in cognitive neuroscience.

3.2 New Attacks on Multiple Realizability

Critics of multiple realizability and the standard arguments it has figured into also extended their reach early in the twenty-first century. Lawrence Shapiro (2008) raises some methodological difficulties involved in testing whether a given psychological kind actually is multiply realized. (For a related argument see Thomas Polger 2009.) Shapiro reminds us of the crucial role that auxiliary assumptions play in hypothesis testing generally (within a broadly hypothetico-deductive model), and considers a collection of explicit auxiliary assumptions that might be implicitly used to establish a multiple realization hypothesis. He presents a recent ferret brain-rewiring experiment as a scientific example, in which axonal inputs from the primary visual tract were redirected in ferret embryos to project to primary auditory cortex (see Sharma, Angelucci, & Sur 2000 for the scientific details). An auxiliary hypothesis requiring multiply realized higher-level (in this case, psychological) kinds to be “exactly similar”—identical—across distinct realizers won’t help the proponent of the standard multiple realizability argument with this purported case. It is easy to measure better visual performance in the normally-wired control ferrets compared to the re-wired experimental animals. While the experimentally re-wired animals have some visual function, it is diminished significantly compared to controls. “Exact similarity” (identity) of visual function is thus not present across these groups. On the other hand, one might argue for the multiple realizability premise in this ferret re-wiring case using an auxiliary hypothesis that only requires similarity in multiply realized higher level properties, yet still requires that differences across the realizers should not be limited only to the differences that cause differences in the realized (in this case, visual) properties. Shapiro speculates that this auxiliary assumption seems best to capture the sense of multiple realization stressed by proponents of the standard argument. But if we adopt it, again the ferret re-wiring case seems not to provide an empirical instance of multiple realization. Shapiro remarks: “the differences in ferret brains explain nothing more than differences in ferret visual properties” (2008: 523). Shapiro also argues that his detailed discussion of hypothesis testing difficulties for any multiple realization hypothesis reveals a flaw in Bechtel and Mundale’s (1999) influential criticism (discussed in §2.3 above). Bechtel and Mundale’s examples, drawn from the comparative functional neuroanatomy of vision, only compared homologous brain structures. But these only have differences that make a difference in their visual properties, nothing else. Instead of these examples, Shapiro insists, “one should be looking at different brains that reveal similar visual properties despite their differences” (2008: 524)—exactly the kinds of evidence that Bechtel and Mundale’s emphasis on homologies doesn’t consider.

Shapiro and Polger (2012) build upon Shapiro’s account of the complexity of actually testing for scientifically-justified multiple realization. They insist that these actual details render the significance of multiple realization far more dubious than philosophers of mind typically suppose. They introduce explicit criteria to capture the common assumption that multiple realization requires not merely differences between realizing kinds, but “differently the same”: the features of entities A and B that lead them to be classified differently by the realizing science S2 “must be among those that lead them to be commonly classified” by the realized science S1 (2012: 282, criterion iii). This explicit criterion rules out the popular assertion that camera eyes versus compound eyes, with different photoreceptive chemicals in their retinal cones, is a genuine (empirical) instance of multiple realization. Considered coarsely, such eyes are doing the same thing in the same way, so they’re not “differently the same”. Considered finely, the two kinds of eyes are sensitive to different ranges and peaks of spectral stimulation, so they’re “differently different, not differently the same” (2012: 283–284).

Shapiro and Polger’s final explicit criterion captures the “differently the same” intuition in terms of quantitative differences. The relevant variation between entities A and B in realizing science S2 “must be greater than” the individual differences between A and B recognized by the realized science S1 (2012: 282, criterion iv). The variation recognized by the realizing science must not merely map onto individual differences between A and B recognized by the realized science. The demands in actually establishing multiple realization are thus quite strict. Not any old variation will do. According to Shapiro and Polger, these strict demands show both that multiple realization in the sense required to fund the standard argument is “a relatively rare phenomenon”—despite the vast variability everywhere in the world—and that a “relatively modest” mind-brain identity theory has little to worry from it (2012: 284).

Similar in some ways to Couch’s arguments (discussed in §2.4 above), Colin Klein raises a challenge to the scientific contributions made by multiply realized kinds. Noting the variety of things that materials science classifies as “brittle,” Klein (2008) notes that few to none of the many scientific discoveries about realization-restricted brittle things—for example, about brittle steel—generalize to other realization-restricted types—such as brittle glass. Klein insists that generalizations about genuine scientific kinds should be projectable across instances of those kinds, so this requirement seems not to be met by a significant class of multiple realized kinds, namely, the realization-restricted ones. Applying this point to psychological kinds, instead of supporting a scientifically-backed nonreductive physicalism, it appears rather that special sciences should abandon multiply realized kinds. Klein notes that proponents of scientifically-based multiple realizability can find terms in special sciences that figure in legitimate explanations, and so appear to refer to projectable multiply realize kinds. But close investigation of some paradigmatic examples reveals these to be idealizations of actual kinds. Special-science kind-terms are thus typically ambiguous. Sometimes a given term refers to an actual but realization-restricted kind. Other times it refers to features of explanatory but non-actual idealized models. (Klein 2008 illustrates this ambiguity with his detailed example from materials science.) Neither suffices to provide a kind of actual multiple realization that the standard argument requires. However, he insists that his argument isn’t entirely negative for non-reductive physicalism. Idealizations can function in explanations that are autonomous in an important sense from lower level sciences. And furthermore, Klein argues, Jaegwon Kim’s (1992) assumption that all explanatory work in science must appeal to realization-restricted kinds and properties (discussed in §2 above), is simply incorrect. Still, Klein insists, there appear to be no actual and projectable—hence genuinely scientific—multiple realized kinds.

Bickle (2010) questions whether the “second-wave” of criticisms of the standard argument, those that challenge the multiple realization premise itself (discussed in §2.4 and this section above), give aid and comfort to psychoneural reductionists. Since psychoneural reductionism was one of the explicit targets of the standard multiple realization argument, one might plausibly assume that they do. Yet none of those who offer these “second-wave” challenges (Shapiro, Polger, Couch) identify themselves as “reductionists” (with the possible exception of Shapiro, and more recently Bechtel 2009, although his response to the multiple realization argument figures nowhere in his plumb for “mechanistic reduction”). Some of these “second-wave” critics, such as Polger 2004, are explicitly anti-reductionist. (Though Polger 2004 is also explicitly anti-anti-reduction. He argues that multiple realization has little if anything to do with reduction.) This fact alone should give a psychoneural reductionist pause. Second, the direction that the second-wave debates have developed, starting with Gillett’s (2003) criticisms—deeply into the nature of the realization relation, and so deeply into the metaphysics of science rather than into science itself—should prompt the psychoneural reductionist with a metascientific bent to simply tell the second-wavers, thanks for nothing! Does that leave psychoneural reductionism back on its heels, in light of the standard multiple realization argument? Not at all, Bickle (2010) insists. For the “first-wave” actual-scientific-history challenge to the first premise of the standard argument, and the initial critical discussions (see §2.1, §2.2, and §2.5 above) turns out never to have been rejoined by anti-reductionists. Why not? Bickle speculates that metaphysics was the culprit. Non-reductive physicalists seem to have assumed that by rejoining arguments of metaphysicans like Kim (1992), they thereby dismissed the entire first-wave of challenges. Many of the challenges discussed in section 2 above shows that this is not the case. There are numerous examples of multiply realized kinds that are components of scientific theories widely acknowledged to having been reduced to other theories. So multiple realization alone is no barrier to actual scientific reduction. The detailed scientific cases that illuminate many of those “first-wave” challenge to the standard multiple realizability argument remain unanswered to this day.

So well into the second decade of the new millennium, a renewed critical interest in multiple realizability continued to generate new discussions and arguments on both sides, pro and can. The assumption, unfortunately still too common in philosophy of mind, that multiple realizability “seals the deal” against reductive physicalism and mind-brain identity theory, was mistaken back in the 1970s and 1980s (see §2 above), and grew even more discredited by the full scope of published literature on the topic that has followed since. But equally unfortunately, the literature on multiple realizability had taken off in numerous varied directions, and following out any one of these leads one quickly into detailed complicated and technical discussions, in both philosophy and science, and often at quite a distance from those who follow out arguments in other directions. And the fate of one of the most influential arguments in late-twentieth century Anglo-American philosophy hangs in the balance, in all of these debates. By the second decade of the new millennium, concerns about multiple realizability arguments had grown beyond their philosophy of mind origins, into more general questions about relationships obtaining between sciences addressing higher and lower levels of the world’s organization. What the issue needed now was a single work that captured both the full scope of writings on this topic, and with a focus unifying all of these diverging literatures. Fortunately, such a work appeared, and it and its critical reception is the focus on the next section.

4. The Multiple Realization Book and Its Initial Critical Reception

Thomas Polger’s and Lawrence Shapiro’s The Multiple Realization Book (2016) provided what the increasingly fragmenting literature on multiple realizability needed. It is the first book-length treatment of the topic, including many of the broader arguments the topic had become part of. The book pulls together much of the history of work on the topic, plus the more recent work by both proponents and opponents, and usefully organizes all of this around numerous key themes that had come to frame the myriad debates. Polger’s and Shapiro’s goal is not simply to review or clarify the various positions, however. They have a position to push. They end up developing and defending a mind-brain identity theory that explicitly recognizes a sense of the autonomy of psychology from neuroscience. And as one might expect, critics of their view quickly responded. The unifying focus that this book offers, and its initial critical reception, make a detailed discussion of it a useful focus for where the broader issues about multiple realizability stand now, at the end of the second decade of the twentieth century.

Polger and Shapiro begin by focusing on the key contention that functionalists and “realization physicalists” have emphasized to support their views over identity theories. That thesis is “Generality”, namely that

psychological states are general rather than species-bound, such that a range of creatures may possess the same psychological state. (2016: 15)

And the key premise offered in support of this contention, going back to Putnam’s work (presented in §1 above) is multiple realizability. This contention sets the agenda for the book: Polger and Shapiro will argue that there is not the sort of widespread multiple realization of mental states and processes that would be needed to support functionalism or realization physicalism over identity theory. Importantly, Polger and Shapiro do not deny that cases of multiple realization exist. Rather, they insist that the debate between functionalists and mind-brain identity theorists should be guided primarily by the question,

does the best overall model of psychological and neuroscientific processes make substantial and important use of identities? (2016: 34)

Their goal is to defend an affirmative answer.

Polger and Shapiro’s book confirms that multiple realization has of late come to be fought in the metaphysics of science literature. In keeping, they begin by offering an account of the ontological realization relation. And following the lead of their (Shapiro & Polger 2012) paper (discussed in §3.2 above) they use this account to scout the types of evidence and concerns relevant to deciding between realization physicalisms and identity theories. They restrict the scope of their arguments to actual proposed cases of realization, eschewing at least initially concern with philosophers’ imagined cases; they are solely concerned at the outset with multiple realization as an empirical hypothesis. They are also careful to point out that multiple realization is logically narrower than mere variation. Working directly with Putnam’s (1967) discussion, Polger and Shapiro articulate the “Basic Recipe” for finding occurrences of multiple realization: “Multiple realization occurs if and only if two (or more) systems perform the same function in different ways” (2016: 45). While this characterization requires further refinement, even it is enough to rule out some kinds of “sameness” that are not evidence for multiple realization, i.e., sameness of behavioral output. Two systems exhibiting the same behavior in the same circumstances, Polger and Shapiro insist, does not establish sameness of underlying psychological function generating that behavior.

Further refinements introduce “relevance” into Polger and Shapiro’s account. The very function shared by the two kinds that classifies them as the same in the realized science must be what is realized by different mechanisms that classify them as different in the realizing science. Further, the relevant differences in the realizers contribute to the sameness of function; the kinds are “not just differently different, they are differently the same” (2016: 75). Polger and Shapiro show that simple (camera) and compound eyes meet their fully revised “Official Recipe” for genuinely multiply realized kinds. They write:

Multiple realization requires a special pattern of variation: relevantly the same function performed in relevantly different ways, where the differences contribute to the sameness in function and not just to the differences in function. (2016: 77)

Armed with their Official Recipe, Polger and Shapiro next seek to dismiss the evidence commonly put forward by proponents of multiple realization as arguments for functionalism or realization-physicalism over mind-brain identity theory. They first consider “direct evidence”, empirical cases presented as genuine instances of multiple realization of the mental on the physical. One type is “cortical functional plasticity”, in both “common” and “radical” varieties. A “common” kind is cortical reorganization, where neurons in a specific cortical region take on a new function following damage to nerves or axons providing their normal input. A more “radical” variety is exemplified by the well-known work in developing ferrets, in which retinal projections were redirected to the medial, rather than the lateral geniculate nucleus in the thalamus, and hence retinal input was projected to auditory, rather than visual cortex (see the discussion of Shapiro 2008 in §3.2 above). Polger and Shapiro argue that both of these varieties fail to meet at least one condition of their Official Recipe, so neither counts as a genuine instance of mental-to-physical multiple realization. The “common” case involves change in function—in the specific example, neuronal activity in the reorganized region of primate somatosensory cortex now represents stimulation to a different region of the monkey’s hand. In the “radical” ferret rewiring case, the visual capacities of the experimental ferrets’ auditory cortex, compared to those of intact control ferrets, differ significantly, e.g., the experimental ferrets show significantly deficient performances on visual discrimination tasks compared with controls’ performances.

A second kind of direct evidence that Polger and Shapiro consider is kind splitting in scientific practice. Again, their Official Recipe figures into their response. They reformulate Aizawa and Gillett’s (2011) key example, the variations in cone opsins in human color vision (see discussion in §3.1 above) into Official Recipe format, and deny that it is a case of genuine multiple realization. The cited differences among the opsins are not distinct from individual differences among those possessing human trichromatic color vision, violating one condition of the Official Recipe.

Polger and Shapiro then extend their discussion of evidence to consider two “indirect” kinds for mental-to-physical multiple realizability. This evidence seeks to show that, in light of various observations, the multiple realizability hypothesis is more likely to be true than the mind-brain identity hypothesis. They begin by offering a canonical form for indirect evidence arguments, which compares the likelihood of multiple realizability versus the unlikelihood of mind-brain identities in light of the evidence. They then recast Block and Fodor’s (1972) appeal to neural plasticity (see discussion in §1.3 above), an appeal to evolutionary convergence of psychological states and processes, and an appeal to the “conceptual possibility” of artificial minds into this canonical form, and argue that all three arguments fail. Finally they consider an appeal to the prevalence of the “computational theory of mind” within current cognitive science and psychology as an indirect argument for multiple realizability. In agreement with some recent mechanists (e.g., Kaplan and Craver 2011), Polger and Shapiro insist that many “computational explanations” are better understood “as precise descriptions of the task or behavior to be explained” rather than as explanations (2016: 154). And while they admit that the “representationalist” variety of computationalism (of which Fodor’s 1975 Language of Thought is a paradigmatic example) does rule out the possibility of mind-brain identities, they point out that this kind of computationalism is “not the only game in town” anymore (2016: 158). Numerous viable competing alternatives to it exist—Polger and Shapiro mention connectionism, strong and “ruthless” reductionism, and mechanism explicitly in this context—and all those make room for mind-brain identities.

Polger and Shapiro wrap up the book by absolving their identity theory, which rests on their treatment of multiple realizability, of some mistaken charges. They argue that their account is not ontologically eliminativist about psychological kinds, because none of their three types of arguments against multiple realization—“unificationist” arguments which find relevant commonalities in the realizing kinds, “heuristic, abstraction, and idealization” arguments that characterize practices in contemporary cognitive science, and their plump for taxonomic “kind splitting”—leads to any kind of troubling eliminativist conclusion. And by adopting James Woodward’s (2003) “interventionist difference-making” account of causal explanation, Polger and Shapiro deflect the charge that their identity theory undermines the legitimacy of psychological explanations, and thus rules out any autonomy for psychology vis-à-vis neuroscience. Such a charge, they insist, rests on an overly stringent and misguided understanding of scientific explanation. Identity theorists can be and should be pluralists about scientific explanation. Neuroscientists can appeal to neural causes, psychologists and cognitive scientists to mental causes. Since both can cite causal invariances at their respective levels, both offer genuine explanations. Despite the mind-brain identities, psychology remains a methodologically autonomous science. (Their defense of psychology’s autonomy resembles Woodward’s recent more general defense of a general kind of explanatory autonomy, see Woodward forthcoming.)

We have dwelled in some detail on Polger and Shapiro’s (2016) book because of its scope and the unifying focus it offers for philosophical discussions of multiple realization, both historical and recent. Similarly, initial criticisms of the book ranged from ones squarely in philosophy of mind, to others aimed at more broadly metaphysics of science considerations. Not surprisingly, given that the book defends a version of mind-brain identity theory, which has been considered indefensible, or at best fringe, for some time, it met with rapid criticism from philosophers of mind. Ronald Endicott (2017) takes Polger and Shapiro to task for offering few (if any) examples of explicit mind-brain identities. Endicott’s criticism is fair enough, in one sense. Polger and Shapiro nowhere attempt to catalogue or discuss specific identity claims. Neither, of course, did U.T. Place or J.J.C. Smart in their seminal works first defending the view; but those works were published sixty or more years ago, and neuroscience has progressed rapidly over that time. Polger and Shapiro do criticize numerous claims to have found multiple realization of mind on brain, so perhaps those discussions can serve implicitly as mind-brain identity claims. But circa 2016, one reasonably could have hoped for some examples of specific mind-brain identities, and a defense of the evidence that supports them.

Umut Baysan (2018) raises two challenges. His first is squarely within philosophy of mind. He contends that Polger and Shapiro change “the rules of the game” over which functionalists/realization physicalists and identity theorists are disputing. Polger and Shapiro saddle the former with defending a general hypothesis, i.e., all psychological kinds are functional kinds or realized kinds; while identity theorists seek only to defend a far weaker existential claim, i.e., that there are some instances of mind-brain identities. Second, and more generally, Baysan takes Polger and Shapiro to task for limiting their concern to the empirical hypothesis, multiple realization, and refusing to speak to concerns about metaphysically possible realizers of mental kinds, or multiple realizability. Baysan insists that some philosophers are still concerned with the latter, and a work that purports to be a book-length treatment of the general topic will leave these philosophers justifiably disappointed. On the first point, Baysan is right that Polger and Shapiro do seek to reorient this fifty-year-old debate, and they characterize functionalism and realization physicalism as quite general hypotheses. But Baysan’s account of Polger and Shapiro’s weakened identity theory seems to miss the point of their explicit reformulation of the multiple realization problem, into first and foremost the question,

does the best overall model of psychological and neuroscientific processes make substantial and important use of identities? (Polger and Shapiro 2016: 34)

That reformulated focus requires a much stronger defense than does Baysan’s existential hypothesis interpretation of their identity theory. By it Polger and Shapiro are committed to arguing that identity theory provides “the best overall model” of psychology’s relationship to neuroscience. (Whether they succeed in making this argument is a separate issue.) And as far as a need to discuss metaphysical possibilities, and hence multiple realizability in the sense that some philosophers understand it, that depends on who one takes one’s audience to be. If one is concerned strictly about multiple realization as a part of the philosophy of the special sciences—as some discussants of multiple realization are—metaphysical possibilities and realizations of the mental in “metaphysically possible worlds” can strike one as philosophical jibber-jabber, the kind of discussions that give philosophy a bad name within broader twenty-first-century intellectual contexts. Curiously, however, Polger and Shapiro seem not to want to take that extreme a position. They locate their work squarely in the metaphysics of science, not strictly in philosophy of science or metascience. Does that leave them open to the charge of needing to consider at least some metaphysical possibilities, and so some kinds of multiple realizability? We will turn to this problem later in this section, in light of Polger and Shapiro’s replies to other criticisms.

Danny Booth (2018) is sympathetic to Polger and Shapiro’s broader project, and to their conclusion about the importance of mind-brain identities in contemporary cognitive science. But he worries about their deference to scientists concerning how mental kinds are individuated, and thus identified across distinct physical realizations, as their Official Recipe for multiple realization proposes. He points out that many scientists view questions about mental kind individuation as “philosophical”, and so punt this concern back to philosophers. Scientists also sometimes individuate mental kinds on quite narrow grounds; Booth here cites Jacqueline Sullivan’s recent discussions of the difficulty of identifying mental kinds across neuroscience labs that employ different protocols (see discussion of Sullivan’s work in the “Philosophy of Neuroscience” entry, this encyclopedia). Sometimes they do so purely on behavioral grounds which operationalize mental kinds for laboratory experimentation. The latter approach flies directly in the face of Polger and Shapiro’s explicit rejection of mental kind identity in their Official Recipe for multiple realization. Booth also worries about Polger and Shapiro’s more general appeal to an interventionist account of causation to salvage “actual” autonomy for psychology. Nothing stops functionalists or realization physicalists from adopting a similar approach to saving psychology’s autonomy, and in fact many avail themselves of this approach. Booth worries that

this leaves very little that distinguishes Modest Identity Theory from more traditional versions of functionalism. (2018: 440)

That Polger and Shapiro’s view shares more points in common with traditional functionalism than with traditionally “reductionist” versions of identity theory leaves Booth wondering whether Polger and Shapiro’s account itself faces some of the same challenges they direct at functionalism.

Mark Couch (2018) worries about Polger and Shapiro’s general characterization of multiple realization in terms of the taxonomies offered by different sciences, as opposed to more typical accounts in terms of properties or kinds in the world. About this shift, Couch first points out that scientists in any given field aren’t always in agreement about how to taxonomize the phenomena they address. So appealing to “scientists’ taxonomies” might not be sufficient, and philosophers might be forced back to considering “independently existing kinds” (2018: 421). Polger and Shapiro’s refocused account also might not address what has interested philosophers about multiple realization, namely, concerns about metaphysical relations holding between independently existing properties and kinds; independent, that is, of any taxonomic practices. This leads Couch to worry about Polger and Shapiro’s account of “relevant differences” in their “Official Recipe”, especially their account of how we decide when this condition has been met. He senses an internal tension lurking here. On the one hand,

the sciences that deal with the putative realizers tell us which differences in them amount to different ways of producing their effects and which do not. (Polger and Shapiro 2016: 62)

But this “official view” seems at odds with a second “unofficial” way Polger and Shapiro cash “relevant differences”: “a matter of whether a property has an explanatory role with respect to a function” (Couch 2018: 424). This “unofficial” understanding, Couch insists, sees relevance as an explanatory relation between properties or kinds in nature, and thus not merely a matter of what scientists “tell us”. These two readings of “relevant differences” strike Couch as making it unclear how the Official Recipe will apply to Polger’s and Shapiro’s own examples of multiple realized kinds.

In contrast with Booth and Couch, who challenges Polger and Shapiro for deferring too much to scientists and their taxonomies, Mazviita Chirimuuta chides them for not paying enough attention to actual “functional thinking” in the life sciences, and thus relying too heavily on “toy examples” like corkscrews. Chirimuuta agrees with Polger and Shapiro that the old philosophers’ notion of multiple realization, “MR1.0”, needs replacing, but suggests looking directly into three areas of the life sciences for its replacement, “MR2.0”. One area is evolutionary approaches, where Chirimuuta mentions explicitly Ernst Mayr’s proximate/ultimate explanation distinction, the latter referring to the evolutionary function or “purpose” of a behavior, and so serves as a “necessary, non-replaceable completement” of the former (2018: 407). The second area is reverse engineering, which posits a function in the nervous system and then works back to see how the physical components perform it. The third area is the study of robustness in biological systems, whereby the function of a system is maintained despite alterations in lower-level mechanisms. Chirimuuta notes that Criterion IV (the “differently the same” condition mentioned above) of Polger and Shapiro’s “Official Recipe” for genuine multiple realization would probably preclude many cases of biological robustness, in the same fashion Polger and Shapiro used it to rule out the “radical” ferret rewiring example (discussed above). But for Chirimuuta, this consequence suggests that Polger and Shapiro’s “Official Recipe” may be “missing something interesting about the organization of living systems” (2018: 408); and so may not be sensitive enough to real scientific practice. She notes that for all their talk about relying on scientists’ judgments and taxonomies, Polger and Shapiro’s favorite “toy example”, the corkscrew, comes up a lot when the conditions on genuine multiple realization are being articulated and defended. Her point is that a closer look at some real sciences that engage in functional thinking, at the point when Polger and Shapiro are developing and defending their basic analysis of multiple realization, might have generated a different account of what multiple realization is (“MR2.0”). As opposed to what Polger and Shapiro actually do with real scientific examples, namely bring them up to debunk claims about successful multiple realization based on their already existing detailed analysis. Such an approach seemingly would have produced an account tied much more closely to actual scientific practice.

In their (2018) Polger and Shapiro respond to these criticisms. They begin by clarifying what they call a common misconception of their view (and not just among these critics), that they don’t take seriously multiple realizability. They claim they do, but they insist that even these metaphysical concerns “are not immune from evidential demands” (2018: 448). The best evidence for multiple realizability would be widespread instances of multiple realization; but this, as they argued extensively in their (2016), is exactly what is lacking. Other kinds of evidence for multiple realizability include equipotentiality, evolutionary convergence, and computational explanations in the relevant sciences, but Polger and Shapiro insist that they have argued in their book that these kinds of evidence are lacking, too.

They then take up the two criticisms, one from both Booth and Couch, the other from Chirimuuta, which pull in opposite directions concerning their dependence on science. Booth and Couch both insisted that Polger and Shapiro rely too heavily on taxonomies postulated by scientists to characterize genuine instances of multiple realization. Polger and Shapiro take both Booth’s and Couch’s worry to be that their approach thereby shackles their account to “the whim of scientists” (2018: 449). They remind us that by “taxonomy” they refer to “whatever a particular science views as belonging within its domain” (2018: 449). The sciences themselves provide those; the best evidence we can have for any science’s “ontological commitments” are “the taxonomic representations and models that it uses” (2018: 450). Both Polger and Shapiro, and their multiple realization proponents, are assuming that the relevant sciences track real distinctions in the world. Polger and Shapiro agree that sciences can and do mischaracterize these, but “that problem has to do with the fallibility of evidence and not with our account of multiple realization” (2018: 450). Polger and Shapiro also admit that their reference to the notion of taxonomies has not always been clear; but nevertheless appealing to scientific taxonomies as a form of evidence for multiple realization is useful. Their focus on scientific taxonomies is thus not incompatible with more traditional philosophical discussions about multiple realization.

They then turn to Chirimuuta’s contrary criticism, that in developing their account of multiple realization they ignore “functional thinking” in real biology and neuroscience. They begin by focusing on one of Chirimuuta’s claims, that

functional classifications capture regularities not apparent when description is restricted to more fine-grained vocabulary (be it physical, chemical, or neuroanatomical),

with these classifications thus averting us to the “limitations of purely reductive research agendas in biology and neuroscience” (Chirimuuta 2018: 409). If Chirimuuta is here advocating pluralism about scientific explanation, Polger and Shapiro are in full agreement; they are avowed methodological pluralists. But if Chirimuuta is here advocating some kind of “Essential Autonomy Thesis”, that higher-level regularities are “somehow invisible” to would-be reducing explanations, or “can only be captured in the proprietary vocabulary of a special science”, then Chirimuuta’s MR2.0 sounds suspiciously like MR1.0, with the latter being a view she herself insists needs to be rejected. They then insist that Chirimuuta’s own discussion of the role of functional thinking in biology and neuroscience stresses its methodological importance. Again, Polger and Shapiro have no complaint about that. Their critical focus is on an inference from this pluralist methodology and the ability to model a system in this fashion to the conclusion that the system is ipso facto multiply realizable” (2018: 454–455). Being a fellow rejecter of MR1.0 and its accompanying Essential Autonomy Thesis, Polger and Shapiro insist that Chirimuuta should also reject any such inference.

In closing this section, it should be clear that the extension of philosophical discussions about multiple realization, which began with the “second-wave” of criticisms around the year 2000, continues apace. The specific philosophical arena in which these discussions take place continues to expand, from the topic’s origins in mid-twentieth century philosophy of mind through its turn-of-the millennium path into the philosophy of the cognitive sciences and neuroscience, and lately more squarely in the general metaphysics of science. These shifts can make the details of the evolving discussions difficult to track. Polger and Shapiro’s (2016) book, and the critical scrutiny across all of these fields that it spurred, provides a useful framework for organizing these many directions, despite what one judges about its skepticism about the extent of multiple realization and its defense of a mind-brain identity theory. The literature over the last twenty years should put to rest the still-too-prominent view in the philosophy of mind that multiple realization spells doom for reductive materialism and mind-brain identity theory once and for all, as well as the still-too-prominent view in some quarters in philosophy of science that multiple realization, or at least its anti-reductionist consequences, has been vanquished for good. Both views look uninformed and badly outdated in light of the detailed history of multiple realization, a history which now spans more than a half-century of Anglo-American philosophy.


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Other Internet Resources


Mara McGuire assisted greatly with the research for section 4. Thanks also to Mark Couch, Carrie Figdor, Mahi Hardelupas, Thomas Polger, and Lawrence Shapiro for helpful comments on an earlier draft of this latest revision/update. Thanks to an anonymous reviewer for suggestions for improvement and for reminding me about some literature I had overlooked.

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