First published Thu Nov 29, 2001; substantive revision Wed Sep 2, 2020

The term “nationalism” is generally used to describe two phenomena:

  1. the attitude that the members of a nation have when they care about their national identity, and
  2. the actions that the members of a nation take when seeking to achieve (or sustain) self-determination.

(1) raises questions about the concept of a nation (or national identity), which is often defined in terms of common origin, ethnicity, or cultural ties, and specifically about whether an individual’s membership in a nation should be regarded as non-voluntary or voluntary. (2) raises questions about whether self-determination must be understood as involving having full statehood with complete authority over domestic and international affairs, or whether something less is required.

Nationalism came into the focus of philosophical debate three decades ago, in the nineties, partly in consequence of rather spectacular and troubling nationalist clashes. Surges of nationalism tend to present a morally ambiguous, and for this reason often fascinating, picture. “National awakening” and struggles for political independence are often both heroic and cruel; the formation of a recognizably national state often responds to deep popular sentiment but sometimes yields inhuman consequences, from violent expulsion and “cleansing” of non-nationals to organized mass murder. The moral debate on nationalism reflects a deep moral tension between solidarity with oppressed national groups on the one hand and repulsion in the face of crimes perpetrated in the name of nationalism on the other. Moreover, the issue of nationalism points to a wider domain of problems related to the treatment of ethnic and cultural differences within democratic polity, arguably among the most pressing problems of contemporary political theory.

In the last two decades, migration crisis and the populist reactions to migration and domestic economic issues have been the defining traits of a new political constellation. The traditional issue of the contrast between nationalism and cosmopolitanism has changed its profile: the current drastic contrast is between populist aversion to the foreigners-migrants and a more generous, or simply just, attitude of acceptance and Samaritan help. The populist aversion inherits some features traditionally associated with patriotism and nationalism, and the opposite attitude the main features of traditional cosmopolitanism. One could expect that the work on nationalism will be moving further on this new and challenging playground, addressing the new contrast and trying to locate nationalism in relation to it.

In this entry, we shall first present conceptual issues of definition and classification (Sections 1 and 2) and then the arguments put forward in the debate (Section 3), dedicating more space to the arguments in favor of nationalism than to those against it in order to give the philosophical nationalist a proper hearing. In the last part we shall turn to the new constellation and sketch the new issues raised by nationalist and trans-nationalist populisms and the migration crisis.

1. What is a Nation?

1.1 The Basic Concept of Nationalism

Although the term “nationalism” has a variety of meanings, it centrally encompasses two phenomena: (1) the attitude that the members of a nation have when they care about their identity as members of that nation and (2) the actions that the members of a nation take in seeking to achieve (or sustain) some form of political sovereignty (see for example, Nielsen 1998–9: 9). Each of these aspects requires elaboration.

  1. raises questions about the concept of a nation or national identity, about what it is to belong to a nation, and about how much one ought to care about one’s nation. Nations and national identity may be defined in terms of common origin, ethnicity, or cultural ties, and while an individual’s membership in the nation is often regarded as involuntary, it is sometimes regarded as voluntary. The degree of care for one’s nation that nationalists require is often, but not always, taken to be very high: according to such views, the claims of one’s nation take precedence over rival contenders for authority and loyalty.[1]
  2. raises questions about whether sovereignty requires the acquisition of full statehood with complete authority over domestic and international affairs, or whether something less than statehood suffices. Although sovereignty is often taken to mean full statehood (Gellner 1983: ch. 1),[2] possible exceptions have been recognized (Miller 1992: 87; Miller 2000). Some authors even defend an anarchist version of patriotism-moderate nationalism foreshadowed by Bakunin (see Sparrow 2007).

There is a terminological and conceptual question of distinguishing nationalism from patriotism. A popular proposal is the contrast between attachment to one’s country as defining patriotism and attachment to one’s people and its traditions as defining nationalism (Kleinig 2014: 228, and Primoratz 2017: Section 1.2). One problem with this proposal is that love for a country is not really just love of a piece of land but normally involves attachment to the community of its inhabitants, and this introduces “nation” into the conception of patriotism. Another contrast is the one between strong, and somewhat aggressive attachment (nationalism) and a mild one (patriotism), dating back at least to George Orwell (see his 1945 essay).[3]

Despite these definitional worries, there is a fair amount of agreement about the classical, historically paradigmatic form of nationalism. It typically features the supremacy of the nation’s claims over other claims to individual allegiance and full sovereignty as the persistent aim of its political program. Territorial sovereignty has traditionally been seen as a defining element of state power and essential for nationhood. It was extolled in classic modern works by Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau and is returning to center stage in the debate, though philosophers are now more skeptical (see below). Issues surrounding the control of the movement of money and people (in particular immigration) and the resource rights implied in territorial sovereignty make the topic politically central in the age of globalization and philosophically interesting for nationalists and anti-nationalists alike.

In recent times, the philosophical focus has moved more in the direction of “liberal nationalism”, the view that mitigates the classical claims and tries to bring together the pro-national attitude and the respect for traditional liberal values. For instance, the territorial state as political unit is seen by classical nationalists as centrally “belonging” to one ethnic-cultural group and as actively charged with protecting and promulgating its traditions. The liberal variety allows for “sharing” of the territorial state with non-dominant ethnic groups. Consequences are varied and quite interested (for more see below, especially section 2.1).

1.2 The Concept of a Nation

In its general form, the issue of nationalism concerns the mapping between the ethno-cultural domain (featuring ethno-cultural groups or “nations”) and the domain of political organization. In breaking down the issue, we have mentioned the importance of the attitude that the members of a nation have when they care about their national identity. This point raises two sorts of questions. First, the descriptive ones:

What is a nation and what is national identity?
What is it to belong to a nation?
What is the nature of pro-national attitude?
Is membership in a nation voluntary or involuntary?

Second, the normative ones:

Is the attitude of caring about national identity always appropriate?
How much should one care?

This section discusses the descriptive questions, starting with (1a) and (1b);the normative questions are addressed in Section 3 on the moral debate. If one wants to enjoin people to struggle for their national interests, one must have some idea about what a nation is and what it is to belong to a nation. So, in order to formulate and ground their evaluations, claims, and directives for action, pro-nationalist thinkers have expounded theories of ethnicity, culture, nation, and state. Their opponents have in turn challenged these elaborations. Now, some presuppositions about ethnic groups and nations are essential for the nationalist, while others are theoretical elaborations designed to support the essential ones. The definition and status of the social group that benefits from the nationalist program, variously called the “nation”, “ethno-nation”, or “ethnic group”, is essential. Since nationalism is particularly prominent with groups that do not yet have a state, a definition of nation and nationalism purely in terms of belonging to a state is a non-starter.

Indeed, purely “civic” loyalties are often categorized separately under the title “patriotism”, which we already mentioned, or “constitutional patriotism”.[4] This leaves two extreme options and a number of intermediates. The first extreme option has been put forward by a small but distinguished band of theorists.[5] According to their purely voluntaristic definition, a nation is any group of people aspiring to a common political state-like organization. If such a group of people succeeds in forming a state, the loyalties of the group members become “civic” (as opposed to “ethnic”) in nature. At the other extreme, and more typically, nationalist claims are focused upon the non-voluntary community of common origin, language, tradition, and culture: the classic ethno-nation is a community of origin and culture, including prominently a language and customs. The distinction is related (although not identical) to that drawn by older schools of social and political science between “civic” and “ethnic” nationalism, the former being allegedly Western European and the latter more Central and Eastern European, originating in Germany.[6] Philosophical discussions centered on nationalism tend to concern the ethnic-cultural variants only, and this habit will be followed here. A group aspiring to nationhood on this basis will be called an “ethno-nation” to underscore its ethno-cultural rather than purely civic underpinnings. For the ethno-(cultural) nationalist it is one’s ethnic-cultural background that determines one’s membership in the community. One cannot choose to be a member; instead, membership depends on the accident of origin and early socialization. However, commonality of origin has become mythical for most contemporary candidate groups: ethnic groups have been mixing for millennia.

Sophisticated, liberal pro-nationalists therefore tend to stress cultural membership only and speak of “nationality”, omitting the “ethno-” part (Miller 1992, 2000; Tamir 1993,2013; Gans 2003). Michel Seymour’s proposal of a “socio-cultural definition” adds a political dimension to the purely cultural one: a nation is a cultural group, possibly but not necessarily united by a common descent, endowed with civic ties (Seymour 2000). This is the kind of definition that would be accepted by most parties in the debate today. So defined, the nation is a somewhat mixed category, both ethno-cultural and civic, but still closer to the purely ethno-cultural than to the purely civic extreme.

Let us now turn to the issue of the origin and “authenticity” of ethno-cultural groups or ethno-nations. In social and political science one usually distinguishes two kinds of views, but there is a third group, combining element from both. The first are modernist views that see nationalism as born in modern times, together with nation-states.[7] In our times the view was pioneered by Ernst Gellner (see his 1983).[8] Other modernist choose similar starting points with century or two of variation.[9] The opposite view can be called, following Edward Shils (1957) “primordialist”. According to it, actual ethno-cultural nations have either existed “since time immemorial”.

The third, quite plausible kind of view, distinct from both primordialism-ethno-symbolism and modernism, has been initiated by W. Connor (1994).[10] A nation is a politicized and mobilized ethnic group rather than a state. So, the origins of nationalism predate the modern state, and its emotional content remains up to our times (Conversi 2002: 270), but the actual statist organization is, indeed, modern. However, nation-state is a nationalist dream and fiction, never really implemented, due to the inescapable plurality of social groups. So much for the three dominant perspectives on the origin of nationalism.

Indeed, the older authors—from great thinkers like Herder and Otto Bauer to the propagandists who followed their footsteps—took great pains to ground normative claims upon firm ontological realism about nations: nations are real, bona fide entities. However, the contemporary moral debate has tried to diminish the importance of the imagined/real divide. Prominent contemporary philosophers have claimed that normative-evaluative nationalist claims are compatible with the “imagined” nature of a nation.[11] They point out that common imaginings can tie people together, and that actual interaction resulting from togetherness can engender important moral obligations.

Let us now turn to question (1c) about the nature of pro-national attitudes. The explanatory issue that has interested political and social scientists concerns ethno-nationalist sentiment, the paradigm case of a pro-national attitude. Is it as irrational, romantic, and indifferent to self-interest as it might seem on the surface? The issue has divided authors who see nationalism as basically irrational and those who try to explain it as being in some sense rational. Authors who see it as irrational propose various explanations of why people assent to irrational views. Some say, critically, that nationalism is based on “false consciousness”. But where does such false consciousness come from? The most simplistic view is that it is a result of direct manipulation of “masses” by “elites”. On the opposite side, the famous critic of nationalism Elie Kedourie (1960) thinks this irrationality is spontaneous. A decade and a half ago Liah Greenfeld went as far as linking nationalism to mental illness in her provocative 2005 article (see also her 2006 book). On the opposite side, Michael Walzer has offered a sympathetic account of nationalist passion in his 2002. Authors relying upon the Marxist tradition offer various deeper explanations. To mention one, the French structuralist Étienne Balibar sees it as a result of the “production” of ideology effectuated by mechanisms which have nothing to do with spontaneous credulity of individuals, but with impersonal, structural social factors (Balibar & Wallerstein 1988 [1991]).[12]

Some authors claim that it is often rational for individuals to become nationalists (Hardin 1985). Can one rationally explain the extremes of ethno-national conflict? Authors like Russell Hardin propose to do so in terms of a general view of when hostile behavior is rational: most typically, if an individual has no reason to trust someone, it is reasonable for that individual to take precautions against the other. If both sides take precautions, however, each will tend to see the other as increasingly inimical. It then becomes rational to start treating the other as an enemy. Mere suspicion can thus lead by small, individually rational steps to a situation of conflict. (Such negative development is often presented as a variant of the Prisoner’s Dilemma; see the entry on prisoner’s dilemma). It is relatively easy to spot the circumstances in which this general pattern applies to national solidarities and conflicts (see also Wimmer 2013).

Finally, as for question (1d), the nation is typically seen as an essentially non-voluntary community to which one belongs by birth and early nurture and such that the belonging is enhanced and made more complete by one’s additional conscious endorsement. Not everyone agrees: liberal nationalists accept the idea of choice of one’s national belonging and of possibility for immigrants to become nationals by choice and intentional acculturation.

2. Varieties of Nationalism

2.1 Concepts of Nationalism: Classical and Liberal

We pointed out at the very beginning of the entry that nationalism focuses upon (1) the attitude that the members of a nation have when they care about their national identity, and (2) the actions that the members of a nation take when seeking to achieve (or sustain) some form of political sovereignty. The politically central point is (2): the actions enjoined by the nationalist. To these we now turn, beginning with sovereignty and territory, the usual foci of a national struggle for independence. They raise an important issue:

Does political sovereignty within or over a territory require statehood or something weaker?

The classical answer is that a state is required. A more liberal answer is that some form of political autonomy suffices. Once this has been discussed, we can turn to the related normative issues:

What actions are morally permitted to achieve sovereignty and to maintain it?
Under what conditions is it morally permitted to take actions of this kind?

Consider first the classical nationalist answer to (2a). Political sovereignty requires a state “rightfully owned” by the ethno-nation (Oldenquist 1997). Developments of this line of thought often state or imply specific answers to (2b), and (2c), i.e., that in a national independence struggle the use of force against the threatening central power is almost always a legitimate means for bringing about sovereignty. However, classical nationalism is not only concerned with the creation of a state but also with its maintenance and strengthening.

Classical nationalism is the political program that sees the creation and maintenance of a fully sovereign state owned by a given ethno-national group (“people” or “nation”) as a primary duty of each member of the group. Starting from the assumption that the appropriate (or “natural”) unit of culture is an ethno-nation, it claims that a primary duty of each member is to abide by one’s recognizably ethno-national culture in all cultural matters.

Classical nationalists are usually vigilant about the kind of culture they protect and promote and about the kind of attitude people have to their nation-state. This watchful attitude carries some potential dangers: many elements of a given culture that are universal or simply not recognizably national may fall prey to such nationalist enthusiasms. Classical nationalism in everyday life puts various additional demands on individuals, from buying more expensive home-produced goods in preference to cheaper imported ones to procreating as many future members of the nation as one can manage (see Yuval-Davies 1997, and Yack 2012).

Besides classical nationalism (and its more radical extremist cousins), various moderate views are also now classified as nationalist. Indeed, the philosophical discussion has shifted to these moderate or even ultra-moderate forms, and most philosophers who describe themselves as nationalists propose very moderate nationalist programs.

Nationalism in this wider sense is any complex of attitudes, claims, and directives for action ascribing a fundamental political, moral, and cultural value to nation and nationality and deriving obligations (for individual members of the nation, and for any involved third parties, individual or collective) from this ascribed value. The main representative of this group of views is liberal nationalism, proposed by authors like Miller, Tamir, and Gans (see below).

Nationalisms in this wider sense can vary somewhat in their conceptions of the nation (which are often left implicit in their discourse), in the grounds for and degree of its value, and in the scope of their prescribed obligations. Moderate nationalism is less demanding than classical nationalism and sometimes goes under the name of “patriotism.” (A different usage, again, reserves “patriotism” for valuing civic community and loyalty to state, in contrast to nationalism, centered on ethnic-cultural communities).

Let us now turn to liberal nationalism, the most discussed kind of moderate nationalism.

Liberal nationalists see liberal-democratic principles and pro-national attitudes as belonging together. One of the main proponents of the view, Yael Tamir, started the debate in her 1993 book and in her recent book talks about the nation-state as “an ideal meeting point between the two” (2019: 6). Of course, some things have to be sacrificed: we must acknowledge that either the meaningfulness of a community or its openness must be sacrificed to some extent as we cannot have them both. (2019: 57). How much of each is to give way is left open, and of course, various liberal nationalists take different views of what precisely the right answer is.

Tamir’s version of liberal nationalism is a kind of social liberalism, in this respect similar to the views of David Miller who talks about “solidaristic communities” in his 1999 book Principles of Social Justice and also takes stance in his 1995 and 2008 books. They both see the feeling of national identity as a feeling that promotes solidarity, and solidarity as means for increased social justice (Tamir 2019, in particular ch.20; compare Walzer 1983, Kymlicka 1995a, 2001, and Gans 2003, 2008).

Liberal nationalists diverge about the value of multiculturalism. Kymlicka takes it as basic for his picture of liberalism while Tamir dismisses it without much ado: multicultural, multiethnic democracies have a very poor track record, she claims (2019: 62). Tamir’s diagnosis of the present day political crisis, with politicians like Trump and Le Pen coming to the forefront, is that “liberal democrats were paralyzed by their assumed victory” whereas “nationalists felt defeated and obsolete” (2019: 7).

Tamir lists two kinds of reasons that guarantee special political status to nations. First kind, that no other political entity “is more able than the state to promote ideas in the public sphere” (2019: 52), and the second kind that nation needs continuous creative effort to make it functional and attractive.

The historical development of liberalism turned it into a universalistic, anti-communitarian principle; this has been a fatal mistake that can be and should be corrected by the liberal nationalist synthesis. Can we revive the unifying narratives of our nationality without sacrificing the liberal inheritance of freedom and rights? Liberal nationalism answers in the affirmative. From its standpoint, national particularism has primacy: “The love of humanity is a noble ideal, but real love is always particular…” (2019: 68).

Interestingly, Tamir combines this high regard of nation with an extreme constructivist view of its nature: nations are mental structures that exist in the minds of their members (2019: 58).

Is liberal nationalism implemented anywhere in the present world, or is it more of an ideal, probably end-state theory, that proposes a picture of a desirable society? Judging by the writings of liberal nationalists, it is the latter, although presented as a relatively easily reachable ideal, combining two traditions that are already well implemented in political reality.

The variations of nationalism most relevant for philosophy are those that influence the moral standing of claims and of recommended nationalist practices. The elaborate philosophical views put forward in favor of nationalism will be referred to as “theoretical nationalism”, the adjective serving to distinguish such views from less sophisticated and more practical nationalist discourse. The central theoretical nationalist evaluative claims can be charted on the map of possible positions within political theory in the following useful but somewhat simplified and schematic way.

Nationalist claims featuring the nation as central to political action must answer two crucial general questions. First, is there one kind of large social group that is of special moral importance? The nationalist answer is that there certainly is one, namely, the nation. Moreover, when an ultimate choice is to be made, say between ties of family, or friendship, and the nation, the latter has priority. Liberal nationalists prefer a more moderate stance, which ascribes value to national belonging, but don’t make it central in this way. Second, what are the grounds for an individual’s obligations to the morally central group? Are they based on voluntary or involuntary membership in the group? The typical contemporary nationalist thinker opts for the latter, while admitting that voluntary endorsement of one’s national identity is a morally important achievement. On the philosophical map, pro-nationalist normative tastes fit nicely with the communitarian stance in general: most pro-nationalist philosophers are communitarians who choose the nation as the preferred community (in contrast to those of their fellow communitarians who prefer more far-ranging communities, such as those defined by global religious traditions).[13]

Before proceeding to moral claims, let us briefly sketch the issues and viewpoints connected to territory and territorial rights that are essential for nationalist political programs.[14] Why is territory important for ethno-national groups, and what are the extent and grounds of territorial rights? Its primary importance resides in sovereignty and all the associated possibilities for internal control and external exclusion. Add to this the Rousseauian view that political attachments are essentially bounded and that love —or, to put it more mildly, republican civil friendship—for one’s group requires exclusion of some “other”, and the importance becomes quite obvious. What about the grounds for the demand for territorial rights? Nationalist and pro-nationalist views mostly rely on the attachment that members of a nation have to national territory and to the formative value of territory for a nation to justify territorial claims (see Miller 2000 and Meisels 2009). This is similar in some respects to the rationale given by proponents of indigenous peoples’ rights (Tully 2004, but see also Hendrix 2008) and in other respects to Kolers’ 2009 ethno-geographical non-nationalist theory, but differs in preferring ethno-national groups as the sole carriers of the right. These attachment views stand in stark contrast to more pragmatic views about territorial rights as means for conflict resolution (e.g., Levy 2000). Another quite popular alternative is the family of individualistic views grounding territorial rights in rights and interests of individuals.[15] On the extreme end of anti-nationalist views stands the idea of Pogge) that there are no specific territorial problems for political philosophy—the “dissolution approach”, as Kolers calls it.

2.2 Moral Claims, Classical Vs. Liberal: The Centrality of Nation

We now pass to the normative dimension of nationalism. We shall first describe the very heart of the nationalist program, i.e., sketch and classify the typical normative and evaluative nationalist claims. These claims can be seen as answers to the normative subset of our initial questions about (1) pro-national attitudes and (2) actions.

We will see that these claims recommend various courses of action: centrally, those meant to secure and sustain a political organization for the given ethno-cultural national community (thereby making more specific the answers to our normative questions (1e), (1f), (2b), and (2c)). Further, they enjoin the community’s members to promulgate recognizable ethno-cultural contents as central features of the cultural life within such a state. Finally, we shall discuss various lines of pro-nationalist thought that have been put forward in defense of these claims. To begin, let us return to the claims concerning the furthering of the national state and culture. These are proposed by the nationalist as norms of conduct. The philosophically most important variations concern three aspects of such normative claims:

  1. The normative nature and strength of the claim: does it promote merely a right (say, to have and maintain a form of political self-government, preferably and typically a state, or have cultural life centered upon a recognizably ethno-national culture), or a moral obligation (to get and maintain one), or a moral, legal, and political obligation? The strongest claim is typical of classical nationalism; its typical norms are both moral and, once the nation-state is in place, legally enforceable obligations for all parties concerned, including for the individual members of the ethno-nation. A weaker but still quite demanding version speaks only of moral obligation (“sacred duty”).
  2. The strength of the nationalist claim in relation to various external interests and rights: to give a real example, is the use of the domestic language so important that even international conferences should be held in it, at the cost of losing the most interesting participants from abroad? The force of the nationalist claim is here being weighed against the force of other claims, including those of individual or group interests or rights. Variations in comparative strength of nationalist claims take place on a continuum between two extremes. At one rather unpalatable extreme, nation-focused claims take precedence over any other claims, including over human rights. Further towards the center is the classical nationalism that gives nation-centered claims precedence over individual interests and many needs, but not necessarily over general human rights (see, for example, MacIntyre 1994, Oldenquist 1997). On the opposite end, which is mild, humane, and liberal, the central classical nationalist claims are accorded prima facie status only (see Tamir 1993, Gans 2003, and Miller 2013; and for applications to Central Europe Stefan Auer 2004).
  3. For which groups are the nationalist claims, classical or liberal, meant to be valid? What is their scope? One approach claims that they are valid for every ethno-nation and thereby universal. An example would be the claim “every ethno-nation should have its own state”. To put it more officially

    Universalizing nationalism is the political program that claims that every ethno-nation should have a state that it should rightfully own and the interests of which it should promote.

    Alternatively, a claim may be particularistic, such as the claim “Group X ought to have a state”, where this implies nothing about any other group:

    Particularistic nationalism is the political program claiming that some ethno-nation should have its state, without extending the claim to all ethno-nations. It claims thus either

    1. by omission (unreflective particularistic nationalism), or
    2. by explicitly specifying who is excluded: “Group X ought to have a state, but group Y should not” (invidious nationalism).

    The most difficult and indeed chauvinistic sub-case of particularism, i.e., (B), has been called “invidious” since it explicitly denies the privilege of having a state to some peoples. Serious theoretical nationalists usually defend only the universalist variety, whereas the nationalist-in-the-street most often defends the egoistic indeterminate one.

The nationalist picture of morality traditionally has been quite close to the dominant view in the theory of international relations called “realism”. Put starkly, the view is that morality ends at the boundaries of the nation-state; beyond there is nothing but anarchy.[16] It nicely complements the main classical nationalist claim about the nation-state, i.e., that each ethno-nation or people should have a state of its own, and suggests what happens next: nation-states enter into competition in the name of their constitutive peoples.

3. The Moral Debate

3.1 Classical and liberal nationalisms

Recall the initial normative question centered around (1) attitudes and (2) actions. Is national partiality justified, and to what extent? What actions are appropriate to bring about sovereignty? In particular, are ethno-national states and institutionally protected (ethno-) national cultures goods independent from the individual will of their members, and how far may one go in protecting them? The philosophical debate for and against nationalism is a debate about the moral validity of its central claims. In particular, the ultimate moral issue is the following: is any form of nationalism morally permissible or justified, and, if not, how bad are particular forms of it?[17] Why do nationalist claims require a defense? In some situations they seem plausible: for instance, the plight of some stateless national groups—the history of Jews and Armenians, the historical and contemporary misfortunes of Kurds—lends credence to the idea that having their own state would have solved the worst problems. Still, there are good reasons to examine nationalist claims more carefully. The most general reason is that it should first be shown that the political form of the nation-state has some value as such, that a national community has a particular, or even central, moral and political value, and that claims in its favor have normative validity. Once this is established, a further defense is needed. Some classical nationalist claims appear to clash—at least under normal circumstances of contemporary life—with various values that people tend to accept. Some of these values are considered essential to liberal-democratic societies, while others are important specifically for the flourishing of creativity and culture. The main values in the first set are individual autonomy and benevolent impartiality (most prominently towards members of groups culturally different from one’s own). The alleged special duties towards one’s ethno-national culture can and often do interfere with individuals’ right to autonomy.

Liberal nationalists are aware of the difficulties of the classical approach, and soften the classical claims, giving them only a prima facie status. They usually speak of “various accretions that have given nationalism a bad name”, and they are eager to “separate the idea of nationality itself from these excesses” (Miller 1992, 2000). Such thoughtful pro-nationalist writers have participated in an ongoing philosophical dialogue between proponents and opponents of the claim.[18] In order to help the reader find their through this involved debate, we shall briefly summarize the considerations which are open to the ethno-nationalist to defend their case (compare the useful overview in Lichtenberg 1997). Further lines of thought built upon these considerations can be used to defend very different varieties of nationalism, from radical to very moderate ones.

For brevity, each line of thought will be reduced to a brief argument; the actual debate is more involved than one can represent in a sketch. Some prominent lines of criticism that have been put forward in the debate will be indicated in brackets (see Miscevic 2001). The main arguments in favor of nationalism will be divided into two sets. The first set of arguments defends the claim that national communities have a high value, sometime seen as coming from the interests of their individual member (e.g., by Kymlicka, Miller, and Raz) and sometimes as non-instrumental and independent of the wishes and choices of their individual members, and argues that they should therefore be protected by means of state and official statist policies. The second set is less deeply “comprehensive”, and encompasses arguments from the requirements of justice, independent from substantial assumptions about culture and cultural values.

The first set will be presented in more detail since it has formed the core of the debate. It depicts the community as the source of value or as the transmission device connecting its members to some important values. For the classical nationalist, the arguments from this set are communitarian in a particularly “deep” sense since they are grounded in basic features of the human condition.

The general form of deep communitarian arguments is as follows. First, the communitarian premise: there is some uncontroversial good (e.g., a person’s identity), and some kind of community is essential for acquisition and preservation of it. Then comes the claim that the ethno-cultural nation is the kind of community ideally suited for this task. Then follows the statist conclusion: in order for such a community to preserve its own identity and support the identity of its members, it has to assume (always or at least normally) the political form of a state. The conclusion of this type of argument is that the ethno-national community has the right to an ethno-national state and the citizens of the state have the right and obligation to favor their own ethnic culture in relation to any other.

Although the deeper philosophical assumptions in the arguments stem from the communitarian tradition, weakened forms have also been proposed by more liberal philosophers. The original communitarian lines of thought in favor of nationalism suggest that there is some value in preserving ethno-national cultural traditions, in feelings of belonging to a common nation, and in solidarity between a nation’s members. A liberal nationalist might claim that these are not the central values of political life but are values nevertheless. Moreover, the diametrically opposing views, pure individualism and cosmopolitanism, do seem arid, abstract, and unmotivated by comparison. By cosmopolitanism we refer to moral and political doctrines claiming that

  1. one’s primary moral obligations are directed to all human beings (regardless of geographical or cultural distance), and
  2. political arrangements should faithfully reflect this universal moral obligation (in the form of supra-statist arrangements that take precedence over nation-states).

Confronted with opposing forces of nationalism and cosmopolitanism, many philosophers opt for a mixture of liberalism-cosmopolitanism and patriotism-nationalism. In his writings, B. Barber glorifies “a remarkable mixture of cosmopolitanism and parochialism” that in his view characterizes American national identity (Barber 1996: 31). Charles Taylor claims that “we have no choice but to be cosmopolitan and patriots” (Taylor 1996: 121). Hilary Putnam proposes loyalty to what is best in the multiple traditions in which each of us participates, apparently a middle way between a narrow-minded patriotism and an overly abstract cosmopolitanism (Putnam 1996: 114). The compromise has been foreshadowed by Berlin (1979) and Taylor (1989, 1993),[19] and in the last two decades it has occupied center stage in the debate and even provoked re-readings of historical nationalism in its light.[20] Most liberal nationalist authors accept various weakened versions of the arguments we list below, taking them to support moderate or ultra-moderate nationalist claims.

Here are then the main weakenings of classical ethno-nationalism that liberal, limited-liberal, and cosmopolitan nationalists propose. First, ethno-national claims have only prima facie strength and cannot trump individual rights. Second, legitimate ethno-national claims do not in themselves automatically amount to the right to a state, but rather to the right to a certain level of cultural autonomy. The main models of autonomy are either territorial or non-territorial: the first involves territorial devolution; the second, cultural autonomy granted to individuals regardless of their domicile within the state.[21] Third, ethno-nationalism is subordinate to civic patriotism, which has little or nothing to do with ethnic criteria. Fourth, ethno-national mythologies and similar “important falsehoods” are to be tolerated only if benign and inoffensive, in which case they are morally permissible despite their falsity. Finally, any legitimacy that ethno-national claims may have is to be derived from choices the concerned individuals are free to make.

3.2 Arguments in favor of nationalism, classical vs. liberal: the deep need for community

Consider now the particular pro-nationalist arguments from the first set. The first argument depends on assumptions that also appear in the subsequent ones, but it further ascribes to the community an intrinsic value. The later arguments point more towards an instrumental value of nation, derived from the value of individual flourishing, moral understanding, firm identity and the like.

  1. The Argument From Intrinsic Value. Each ethno-national community is valuable in and of itself since it is only within the natural encompassing framework of various cultural traditions that important meanings and values are produced and transmitted. The members of such communities share a special cultural proximity to each other. By speaking the same language and sharing customs and traditions, the members of these communities are typically closer to one another in various ways than they are to the outsiders.
  2. The Argument from Flourishing. The ethno-national community is essential for each of its members to flourish. In particular, it is only within such a community that an individual can acquire concepts and values crucial for understanding the community’s cultural life in general and the individual’s own life in particular. There has been much debate on the pro-nationalist side about whether divergence of values is essential for separateness of national groups.

The Canadian liberal nationalists Seymour (1999), Taylor, and Kymlicka pointed out that “divergences of value between different regions of Canada” that aspire to separate nationhood are “minimal”. Taylor (1993: 155) concluded that it is not separateness of value that matters.

  1. The Argument from Identity. Communitarian philosophers emphasize nurture over nature as the principal force determining our identity as people—we come to be who we are because of the social settings and contexts in which we mature. This claim certainly has some plausibility. The very identity of each person depends upon his/her participation in communal life (see MacIntyre 1994, Nielsen, 1998, and Lagerspetz 2000). Given that an individual’s morality depends upon their having a mature and stable personal identity, the communal conditions that foster the development of personal identity must be preserved and encouraged. Therefore, communal life should be organized around particular national cultures.
  2. The Argument from Moral Understanding. A particularly important variety of value is moral value. Some values are universal, e.g., freedom and equality, but these are too abstract and “thin”. The rich, “thick” moral values are discernible only within particular traditions; as Charles Taylor puts it, “the language we have come to accept articulates the issues of the good for us” (1989: 35). The nation offers a natural framework for moral traditions, and thereby for moral understanding; it is the primary school of morals.
  3. The Argument from Diversity. Each national culture contributes uniquely to the diversity of human cultures. The most famous twentieth century proponent of the idea, Isaiah Berlin (interpreting Herder), writes:

    The ‘physiognomies’ of cultures are unique: each presents a wonderful exfoliation of human potentialities in its own time and place and environment. We are forbidden to make judgments of comparative value, for that is measuring the incommensurable. (1976: 206)

Assuming that the (ethno-)nation is the natural unit of culture, the preservation of cultural diversity amounts to institutionally protecting the purity of (ethno-)national culture. The plurality of cultural styles can be preserved and enhanced by tying them to ethno-national “forms of life”.

David Miller has developed an interesting and sophisticated liberal pro-national stance over the course of decades from his work in 1990 to the most recent work in 2013. He accepts multicultural diversity within a society but stresses an overarching national identity, taking as his prime example British national identity, which encompasses the English, Scottish, and other ethnic identities. He demands an “inclusive identity, accessible to members of all cultural groups” (2013: 91). miller claims such identity is necessary for basic social solidarity, and it goes far beyond simple constitutional patriotism. A skeptic could note the following. The problem with multicultural society is that national identity has historically been a matter of ethno-national ties and has required sameness in the weighted majority of cultural traits (common language, common “history-as-remembered”, customs, religion and so on). However, multi-cultural states typically bring together groups with very different histories, languages, religions, and even quite contrasting appearances. Now, how is the overarching “national identity” to be achieved starting from the very thin identity of common belonging to a state? One seems to have a dilemma. Grounding social solidarity in national identity requires the latter to be rather thin and seems likely to end up as full-on, unitary cultural identity. Thick constitutional patriotism may be one interesting possible attitude that can ground such solidarity while preserving the original cultural diversity.

3.3 Arguments in favor of nationalism: issues of justice

The arguments in the second set concern political justice and do not rely on metaphysical claims about identity, flourishing, and cultural values. They appeal to (actual or alleged) circumstances that would make nationalist policies reasonable (or permissible or even mandatory), such as (a) the fact that a large part of the world is organized into nation-states (so that each new group aspiring to create a nation-state just follows an established pattern), or (b) the circumstances of group self-defense or of redressing past injustice that might justify nationalist policies (to take a special case). Some of the arguments also present nationhood as conducive to important political goods, such as equality.

  1. The Argument from the Right to Collective Self-determination. A group of people of a sufficient size has a prima facie right to govern itself and decide its future membership, if the members of the group so wish. It is fundamentally the democratic will of the members themselves that grounds the right to an ethno-national state and to ethno-centric cultural institutions and practices. This argument presents the justification of (ethno-)national claims as deriving from the will of the members of the nation. It is therefore highly suitable for liberal nationalism but not appealing to a deep communitarian who sees the demands of the nation as independent from, and prior to, the choices of particular individuals.[22]
  2. The Argument from the Right to Self-defense and to Redress Past Injustices. Oppression and injustice give the victimized group a just cause and the right to secede. If a minority group is oppressed by the majority to the extent that almost every minority member is worse off than most members of the majority simply in virtue of belonging to the minority, then nationalist claims on behalf of the minority are morally plausible and potentially compelling. The argument establishes a typical remedial right, acceptable from a liberal standpoint (see the discussion in Kukathas and Poole 2000, also Buchanan 1991; for past injustices see Waldron 1992).
  3. The Argument from Equality. Members of a minority group are often disadvantaged in relation to the dominant culture because they have to rely on those with the same language and culture to conduct the affairs of daily life. Therefore, liberal neutrality itself requires that the majority provide certain basic cultural goods, i.e., granting differential rights (see Kymlicka 1995b, 2001, and 2003b). Institutional protections and the right to the minority group’s own institutional structure are remedies that restore equality and turn the resulting nation-state into a more moderate multicultural one.
  4. The Argument from Success. The nationstate has in the past succeeded in promoting equality and democracy. Ethno-national solidarity is a powerful motive for a more egalitarian distribution of goods (Miller 1995; Canovan 1996, 2000). The nation-state also seems to be essential to safeguard the moral life of communities in the future, since it is the only form of political institution capable of protecting communities from the threats of globalization and assimilationism (for a detailed critical discussion of this argument see Mason 1999).

Andreas Wimmer (2018) presents an interesting discussion of the historical success of nation-state (discussed in Knott, Tolz, Green, & Wimmer 2019).

These political arguments can be combined with deep communitarian ones. However, taken in isolation, their perspectives offer a “liberal culturalism” that is more suitable for ethno-culturally plural societies. More remote from classical nationalism than the liberal one of Tamir and Nielsen, it eschews any communitarian philosophical underpinning.[23] The idea of moderate nation-building points to an open multi-culturalism in which every group receives its share of remedial rights but, instead of walling itself off from others, participates in a common, overlapping civic culture in open communication with other sub-communities. Given the variety of pluralistic societies and intensity of trans-national interactions, such openness seems to many to be the only guarantee of stable social and political life (see the debate in Shapiro and Kymlicka 1997).

In general, the liberal nationalist stance is mild and civil, and there is much to be said in favor of it. It tries to reconcile our intuitions in favor of some sort of political protection of cultural communities with a liberal political morality. Of course, this raises issues of compatibility between liberal universal principles and the particular attachments to one’s ethno-cultural nation. Very liberal nationalists such as Tamir divorce ethno-cultural nationhood from statehood. Also, the kind of love for country they suggest is tempered by all kinds of universalist considerations, which in the last instance trump national interest (Tamir 1993: 115; 2019: passim, see also Moore 2001 and Gans 2003). There is an ongoing debate among philosophical nationalists about how much weakening and compromising is still compatible with a stance’s being nationalist at all.[24] There is also a streak of cosmopolitan interest present in the work of some liberal nationalists (Nielsen 1998–99).[25]

In the last two decades, the issues of nationalism have been increasingly integrated into the debate about the international order (see the entries on globalization and cosmopolitanism). The main conceptual link is the claim that nation-states are natural, stable, and suitable units of the international order. A related debate concerns the role of minorities in the processes of globalization (see Kaldor 2004). Moreover, the two approaches might ultimately converge: a multiculturalist liberal nationalism and a moderate, difference-respecting cosmopolitanism have a lot in common.[26]

3.4 Populism and a new face of nationalism

“Populism” is an umbrella term, covering both right-wing and left-wing varieties. This section will pay attention to right-wing populist movements, very close to their traditional nationalist predecessors. This corresponds to the situation in the biggest part of Europe, and in the US, where nationalist topics are being put forward by the right-wing populist.[27]

However, it has become quite clear that nationalism is only one of the political “isms” attracting the right-wing populists. The migration crisis has brought to the forefront populist self-identification with linguistic-cultural communities (“we, French speaking people” for the former, “we Christians” for the later) that goes beyond nationalism.

Jan-Werner Müller (2016) and Cas Mudde (2007) note that the form common to all sorts of populism is quite simple and describe it as “thin”. Mudde explains: “Populism is understood as a thin-centered ideology that considers society to be ultimately separated into two homogeneous and antagonistic groups, ‘the pure people’ versus ‘the corrupt elite’, and which argues that politics should be an expression of the volonté générale (general will) of the People” (2007: 23). Populism, so defined, has two opposites: elitism and pluralism. First, there is the elite vs. people (“underdog”) contrast. Second, it is possible to distinguish two ways of characterizing “the people”: either in terms of social status (class, income-level, etc.) or in terms of ethnic and/or cultural belonging (see also de Cleen 2017).

Social (class) People ethnic, cultural

The second, horizontal dimension distinguishes the predominantly left-wing from the predominantly right-wing populisms and leaves a place for a centrist populist option. Take classical strong ethnic nationalism. The relation between right-wing populism and such a nationalism is very tight. This has led some theoreticians (Taguieff 2015) to present “nationalist populism” as the only kind of populism. The term captures exactly the synthesis of populism and the strong ethnic nationalism or nativism. From populism, it takes the general schema of anti-elitism: the leader is addressing directly the people and is allegedly following the people’s interest. From nationalism, it takes the characterization of the people: it is the ethnic community, in most cases the state-owing ethnic community, or the ethno-nation. In his work, Mudde documents the claim that purely right-wing populists claim to represent the true people who form the true nation and whose purity is being muddied by new entrants. In the United States, one can talk about populist and reactionary movements, like the Tea Party, that have emerged through the recent experience of immigration, terrorist attacks, and growing economic polarization. We have to set aside here, for reasons of space, the main populist alternative (or quasi-alternative) to national populism. In some countries, like Germany, some populist groups-parties (e.g., German AfD party (Alternative for Germany)), appeal to properties much wider in their reach than ethno-national belonging, typically to religious affiliations. Others combine this appeal with the ethno-national one. This yields what Riva Kastoryano (2006) calls “transnational nationalism”.

Interestingly, liberal nationalism is not very attractive to the populists. On the theoretical side one can note that Tamir (2019) sees her liberal nationalism as a good recipe against the threat of demagogues like Trump and Boris Johnson (she avoids the use of the label “populist”, e.g., 2019: 31).

The rise of populism is changing the political playfield one must work with. The tolerant (liberal nationalist or anti-nationalist) views are confronting new problems in the populist age marked by migration crisis, etc. The dangers traditionally associated with military presence are gone; the national populists have to invent and construct a presumed danger that comes into the country together with foreign families, including those with children. In short, if these conjectures hold, the politicians and theoreticians are faced with a change. The traditional issue of the contrast between patriotism/nationalism and cosmopolitanism has changed its profile: the current drastic contrast is between the populist aversion to the foreigners-migrants and a more generous attitude of acceptance and Samaritan help. Finally, the populist understanding of “our people” (“we-community”) encompasses not only nationalist options but also goes way beyond it. The important element is the promiscuous character of the populist choices. It is probable that the future scholarship on nationalism will mainly focus on this new and challenging playfield, with an aim to address the new contrast and locate kinds of nationalism in relation to it.[28]

3.5 Nation-state in global context

The migration crisis has made the nation-state in global context the central political topic concerning nationality. Before moving on to current events, the state of art before the crisis should be summarized. First, consider the debates on territory and nation and issues of global justice.

Liberal nationalists try to preserve the traditional nationalist link between ethnic “ownership” of the state and sovereignty and territorial control, but in a much more flexible and sophisticated setting. Tamar Meisels thus argues in favor of “taking existing national settlements into account as a central factor in demarcating territorial boundaries” since this line “has both liberal foundations” (i.e., in the work of John Locke) and liberal-national appeal (2009: 159) grounded in its affinity with the liberal doctrine of national self-determination. She combines it with Chaim Gans’ (2003: Ch. 4) interpretation of “historical right” claims as “the right to formative territories”. She thus combines “historical arguments, understood as claims to formative territories”, with her argument from settlement and insists on their interplay and mutual reinforcement, presenting them as being “most closely related to, and based on, liberal nationalist assumptions and underlying ideas” (Meisels 2009: 160). She nevertheless stresses that more than one ethnic group can have formative ties to a given territory, and that there might be competing claims based on settlement.[29] But, given the ethno-national conflicts of the twentieth century, one can safely assume that culturally plural states divided into isolated and closed sub-communities glued together merely by arrangements of modus vivendi are inherently unstable. Stability might therefore require that the pluralist society envisioned by liberal culturalists promote quite intense intra-state interaction between cultural groups in order to forestall mistrust, reduce prejudice, and create a solid basis for cohabitation.

But where should one stop? The question arises since there are many geographically open, interacting territories of various sizes. Consider first the geographical openness of big continental planes, then add the modern ease of interaction (“No island is an island any more”, one could say), and, finally and dramatically, the substantial ecological interconnectedness of land and climate. Here, the tough nationalistic line is no longer proposed seriously in ethical debates, so the furthest pro-national extreme is in fact a relatively moderate stance, exemplified by Miller in the works listed. Here is a typical proposal of his concerning global justice based on nation-states: it might become a matter of national pride to have set aside a certain percentage of GDP for developmental goals—perhaps for projects in one particular country or group of countries (2013: 182).

This brings us to the topic of migrations, and the heated debate on the present scene.[30] In Europe immigration is probably the main topic of the present day populist uproar, and in the United States it is one of the main topics. So, immigration plus the nationalist-populist reactions to it are in the current decade the main testing ground for nationalist and cosmopolitan views.

Let’s look at the pro-national side in the debate. Liberal nationalists, in particular Miller, have put forward some thoughtful pro-nationalist proposal concerning immigration. Miller’s proposal allows refugees to seek asylum temporarily until the situation in their country of origin improves; it also limits economic migration. Miller argues against the defensibility of a global standard for equality, opportunity, welfare, etc., because measures of just equality are context-bound. People do have the right to a minimum standard of living, but the right to migrate only activates as a last resort after all other measures within a candidate-migrant’s country of origin have been tried. However, he also (particularly in his book on “Strangers in our midst”, 2016), claims that national responsibility to accept immigrant refugees is balanced by considerations of the interest of would-be immigrants and the interests that national communities have in maintaining control over their own composition and character.

If we agree with the liberal nationalists on the positive side, we can ask about the dynamics of the help required for the immigrants. Distinguish at least three stages, first, the immediate emergency (starvation, freezing, urgent medical problems) and catering to it, second, settlement and learning (on the host and the immigrant newcomer side), and third, the stage of (some kind of) citizenship, of relatively stable life in the host country.

In the first phase, the immediate help comes first, both normatively and causally: just accept the would-be refugees (indeed, the would-be refugees should be helped in leaving their countries and travelling to the host country). In longer term, staying should involve opportunity for work and training.

But there is more. The Samaritan obligation can and should function as a preparation for wider global activity.[31] So, we have two theoretical steps, first, accepting Samaritanism and second, agreeing with deeper trans-national measure of blocking distant causes, like poverty and wars in the Third world. Let us call this “Samaritan-to-deeper-measures model”. The model is geared to the dramatically changed playground in which the nationalism issues are played out in the context of populism and refugee crisis, raising issues that were not around two decades ago.

4. Conclusion

In presenting the claims that the pro-nationalists defend, we have proceeded from the more radical towards more liberal nationalist alternatives. In examining the arguments for these claims, we have presented metaphysically demanding communitarian arguments resting upon deep communitarian assumptions about culture, such as the premise that the ethno-cultural nation is the most important community for all individuals. This is an interesting and respectable claim, but its plausibility has not been established. The moral debate about nationalism has resulted in various weakenings of culture-based arguments, typically proposed by liberal nationalists, which render the arguments less ambitious but much more plausible. Having abandoned the old nationalist ideal of a state owned by a single dominant ethno-cultural group, liberal nationalists have become receptive to the idea that identification with a plurality of cultures and communities is important for a person’s social identity. They have equally become sensitive to trans-national issues and more willing to embrace a partly cosmopolitan perspective. Liberal nationalism has also brought to the fore more modest, less philosophically or metaphysically charged arguments grounded in concerns about justice. These stress the practical importance of ethno-cultural membership, ethno-cultural groups’ rights to have injustices redressed, democratic rights of political association, and the role that ethno-cultural ties and associations can play in promoting just social arrangements.

The events in the current decade, the refugee crisis and the rise of right-wing populism, have dramatically changed the relevant practical and theoretical playground. The traditional nationalism is still relevant, but populist nationalism attracts much more attention: new theories are being produced and debated, coming to occupy the center stage. On the other hand, migration crisis has replaced the typical cosmopolitan issue of solidarity-with-distant-strangers with burning issues of helping refugees present at our doors. Of course, the causes of the crisis are still the same ones that cosmopolitans have been worrying about much earlier: wars and dramatically unequal global distribution of goods, and of threats, like illnesses and climate disasters. The task of the theory is now to connect these deeper issues with the new problems occupying the center-stage of the new playground; it is a challenge now formulated in somewhat different vocabulary and within different political conceptual frameworks than before.



This is a short list of books on nationalism that are readable and useful introductions to the literature. First, two contemporary classics of social science with opposing views are:

  • Gellner, Ernest, 1983, Nations and Nationalism, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Smith, Anthony D., 1991, National Identity, Harmondsworth: Penguin.

Three presentations of liberal nationalism, two of them by the same author, Yael Tamir, offer the best introduction to the approach:

  • Miller, David, 1995, On Nationality, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0198293569.001.0001
  • Tamir, Yael, 1993, Liberal Nationalism, Press, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 2019, Why Nationalism, Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Two short and readable introductions are:

  • Özkirimli, Umut, 2010, Theories of Nationalism: A Critical Introduction, second edition, London: Palgrave Macmillan. First edition is 2000; third edition is 2017.
  • Spencer, Philip and Howard Wollman, 2002, Nationalism, A Critical Introduction, London: Sage.

The two best anthologies of high-quality philosophical papers on the morality of nationalism are:

  • McKim, Robert and Jeff McMahan (eds), 1997, The Morality of Nationalism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Couture, Jocelyne, Kai Nielsen, and Michel Seymour (eds.), 1998, Rethinking Nationalism, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, Supplement Volume 22, Calgary, AB: University of Calgary Press.

The debate continues in:

  • Miscevic, Nenad (ed), 2000, Nationalism and Ethnic Conflict: Philosophical Perspectives, La Salle and Chicago: Open Court.
  • Dieckoff, Alain (ed.), 2004, The Politics of Belonging: Nationalism, Liberalism, and Pluralism, Lanham: Lexington.
  • Primoratz, Igor and Aleksandar Pavković (eds), 2007, Patriotism, Philosophical and Political Perspectives, London: Ashgate.
  • Breen, Keith and Shane O’Neill (eds.), 2010, After the Nation? Critical Reflections on Nationalism and Postnationalism, London: Palgrave Macmillan. doi:10.1057/9780230293175

A good brief sociological introduction to nationalism in general is:

  • Grosby, Steven, 2005, Nationalism: A Very Short Introduction, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

and to the gender-inspired criticism of nationalism is:

  • Yuval-Davis, Nira, 1997, Gender & Nation, London: Sage Publications.

and also:

  • Heuer, Jennifer, 2008, “Gender and Nationalism”, in Herb and Kaplan 2008: vol. 1, 43–58.
  • Hogan, Jackie, 2009, Gender, Race and National Identity: Nations of Flesh and Blood, London: Routledge.

The best general introduction to the communitarian-individualist debate is still:

  • Avineri, Shlomo and Avner de-Shalit (eds.), 1992, Communitarianism and Individualism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

For a non-nationalist defense of culturalist claims see:

  • Kymlicka, Will (ed.), 1995a, The Rights of Minority Cultures, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

A very readable philosophical defense of very moderate liberal nationalism is:

  • Gans, Chaim, 2003, The Limits of Nationalism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511490231

And for application to Central Europe see:

  • Auer, Stefan, 2004, Liberal Nationalism in Central Europe, London: Routledge.

A polemical, witty and thoughtful critique is offered in:

  • Barry, Brian, 2001, Culture and Equality: An Egalitarian Critique of Multiculturalism, Cambridge, MA: Polity Press.

And a more recent one in

  • Kelly, Paul, 2015, “Liberalism and Nationalism”, in The Cambridge Companion to Liberalism, Steven Wall (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 329–352. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139942478.018

Interesting critical analyses of group solidarity in general and nationalism in particular, written in the traditions of rational choice theory and motivation analysis, are:

  • Hardin, Russell, 1985, One for All, The Logic of Group Conflict, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Yack, Bernard, 2012, Nationalism and the Moral Psychology of Community, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

There is a wide offering of interesting sociological and political science work on nationalism, which is beginning to be summarized in:

  • Motyl, Alexander (ed.), 2001, Encyclopedia of Nationalism, Volumes I and II, New York: Academic Press.

A fine encyclopedic overview is:

  • Herb, Guntram H. and David H. Kaplan, 2008, Nations and Nationalism: a Global Historical Overview, four volumes, Santa Barbara, CA: ABC Clio.

A detailed sociological study of life under nationalist rule is:

  • Billig, Michael, 1995, Banal Nationalism, London: Sage Publications.

The most readable short anthology of brief papers for and against cosmopolitanism (and nationalism) by leading authors in the field is:

  • Cohen, Joshua (ed.), 1996, For Love of Country: Debating the Limits of Patriotism, Martha Nussbaum and respondents, Boston, MA: Beacon Press


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  • Avineri, Shlomo and Avner de-Shalit (eds.), 1992, Communitarianism and Individualism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
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  • –––, 2001, Culture and Equality: An Egalitarian Critique of Multiculturalism, Cambridge, MA: Polity Press.
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  • –––, 2004, Justice, Legitimacy, and Self-Determination: Moral Foundations for International Law, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0198295359.001.0001
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  • –––, 2000, “Patriotism Is Not Enough”, British Journal of Political Science, 30(3): 413–432. doi:10.1017/S000712340000017X
  • –––, 2001, “Sleeping Dogs, Prowling Cats and Soaring Doves: Three Paradoxes in the Political Theory of Nationhood”, Political Studies, 49(2): 203–215. doi:10.1111/1467-9248.00309
  • Carens, Joseph H., 2013, The Ethics of Immigration, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Casertano, Stefano, 2013, Our Land, Our Oil! Natural Resources, Local Nationalism, and Violent Secession, Wiesbaden: Springer Fachmedien Wiesbaden. doi:10.1007/978-3-531-19443-1
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  • Christiano, Thomas, 2008, “Immigration, Community and Cosmopolitanism”, in San Diego Law Review, 933(Nov–Dec): 938–962.
  • –––, 2012, “The Legitimacy of International Institutions”, in The Routledge Companion to Philosophy of Law, Andrei Marmor (ed.), London: Routledge, pp. 380–394.
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  • Cohen, Joshua (ed.), 1996, For Love of Country? (Martha C. Nussbaum with respondents), Boston, MA: Beacon Press.
  • Colm Hogan, Patrick, 2009, Understanding Nationalism: On Narrative, Cognitive Science and Identity, Ohio: Ohio State University Press.
  • Connor, Walker, 1994, Ethnonationalism: The Quest for Understanding, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
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