First published Wed Jan 7, 2015; substantive revision Thu Feb 20, 2020

Negation is in the first place a phenomenon of semantic opposition. As such, negation relates an expression \(e\) to another expression with a meaning that is in some way opposed to the meaning of \(e\). This relation may be realized syntactically and pragmatically in various ways. Moreover, there are different kinds of semantic opposition. Section 1 is concerned mainly with negation and opposition in natural language, both from a historical and a systematic perspective. Section 2 focuses on negation as a unary connective from the point of view of philosophical logic. The history of negation is comprehensively studied and surveyed in Horn 1989 and Speranza and Horn 2012.

1. Negation and opposition in natural language

1.1 Introduction

Negation is a sine qua non of every human language, yet is absent from otherwise complex systems of animal communication.[1] While animal “languages” are essentially analog systems, it is the digital nature of the natural language negative operator, represented in Stoic and Fregean propositional logic as a one-place sentential connective toggling the truth value of statements between T[rue] and F[alse] (or 1 and 0) and applying recursively to its own output, that allows for denial, contradiction, and other key properties of human linguistic systems.

The simple syntactic nature of logical negation belies the profoundly complex and subtle expression of negation in natural language, as expressed in linguistically distinct categories and parts of speech (adverbs, verbs, copulas, quantifiers, affixes). As will be partly explored here (see also Horn 1989, Ladusaw 1996, Pullum 2002), the investigation of the form and meaning of negative expressions in English and other languages and of the interaction of negation with other operators (including multiple iterations of negation itself) is often far from simple, extending to scope ambiguities (Everybody didn’t leave), negative incorporation into quantifiers and adverbs (nobody, never, few), neg-raising (I don’t want to go = “I want not to go”), and the widespread occurrence of negative polarity items (any, ever, lift a finger) whose distribution is subject to principles of syntax, semantics, and pragmatics. At the core of the mental faculty of language, negation interacts in significant ways with principles of morphology, syntax, logical form, and compositional semantics, as well as with processes of language acquisition and sentence processing, whence the prominent role played by work on negation in the development of logic, semantics, linguistic theory, cognition, and psychoanalytic and literary theory.

What sort of operation is negation? In the Categories and De Interpretatione, Aristotle partitions indicative-mood declarative sentences into affirmation and negation/denial (apophasis from apophanein “deny, say no”), which respectively affirm or deny something about something (De Int. 17a25). As a mode of predication, the predicate denial of Aristotelian term logic, while resulting in wide-scope negation opposed in truth value to the corresponding affirmative, is syntactically distinct from the unary “it is not the case that” connective of Stoic and Fregean logic.

By combining subject and predicate to form a proposition, this approach can be seen as offering a more natural representation of ordinary language negation than the standard iterating operator that applies to fully formed propositions (Geach 1972; Englebretsen 1981; Horn 1989, Chap. 7; Sommers and Englebretsen 2000). Indeed, the syncategorematic negation of Montague Grammar (Montague 1973; cf. the entry on Montague semantics) is itself a means of connecting a term phrase subject with a predicate or IV (intransitive verb) phrase and thus fails to apply to its own output (see Horn 1989, §7.2 on “Aristotle as a Montague grammarian”). Cross-linguistically, the structural reflex of sentence-scope negation may be a free-standing adverb (German nicht, English not), a bound inflectional form (Japanese -na-, English -n’t), or a verb (Finnish en, ei).[2]

Where we do not find negation is in the one place propositional logic would lead us to look, sentence- or clause-peripheral position, as an external one-place connective interpreted as “it is not the case that”. (Horn 1989 takes apparent instances of external negation in English and elsewhere to represent the metalinguistic use of negation, discussed in §1.10 below, while Bar-Asher Siegal 2015 presents evidence for the existence of a semantic external negation operator in Jewish Babylonian Aramaic.) Furthermore, unlike speech act types—e.g. interrogatives or exclamatives—negation never seems to be marked in natural language by a global intonation contour. Typically, sentence negation is associated directly on or near the main finite verb or predicate expression.

1.2 Negation in natural language: markedness and asymmetry

It has often been observed that the logical symmetry of negative and affirmative propositions in logic belies a fundamental asymmetry in natural language. It was Plato who first observed, in The Sophist, that negative sentences are less valuable than affirmative ones, less specific and less informative. The ontological, epistemological, psychological, and grammatical priority of affirmatives over negatives is supported by Aristotle:

The affirmative proposition is prior to and better known than the negative (since affirmation explains denial just as being is prior to not-being) (Metaphysics 996b14–16)

and St. Thomas Aquinas:

The affirmative enunciation is prior to the negative for three reasons… With respect to vocal sound, affirmative enunciation is prior to negative because it is simpler, for the negative enunciation adds a negative particle to the affirmative. With respect to thought, the affirmative enunciation, which signifies composition by the intellect, is prior to the negative, which signifies division… With respect to the thing, the affirmative enunciation, which signifies to be, is prior to the negative, which signifies not to be, as the having of something is naturally prior to the privation of it. (St. Thomas, Book I, Lesson XIII, cited in Oesterle 1962, 64)

Not only are negative statements (e.g., “Paris isn’t the capital of Spain”) generally less informative than affirmatives (“Paris is the capital of France”), they are morphosyntactically more marked (all languages have negative markers while few have affirmative markers)[3] and psychologically more complex and harder to process (see Just and Carpenter 1971, 248–9; and other work reviewed in Horn 1989, Chapter 3). Many philosophers, linguists, and psychologists have situated this asymmetry in logic or semantics, as in the claim that every negation presupposes a corresponding affirmative but not vice versa.

The strong asymmetricalist position leads to the “paradox of negative judgment”: if a positive statement refers or corresponds to a positive fact, to what state of affairs does a negative statement refer or correspond? What in fact is a negative fact? For Bergson (1911, 289), negation is necessarily “of a pedagogical and social nature”; for Wood (1933, 421) it is “infected with error and ignorance”. According to Wittgenstein (1953, §447), “the feeling is as if the negation of a proposition had to make it true in a certain sense in order to negate it”. Givón (1978, 70) points to the discourse presuppositionality of utterances like “My wife is not pregnant”. Psycholinguistic studies have shown that negation is easier to process when the denied proposition, if not already in the discourse model, is at least a plausible addition to it (e.g., “The whale is not a fish/?bird”; cf. Wason 1965; Horn 1989, Chapter 3).

Beyond its marked status, negation has also been analyzed variously as a modality, a propositional attitude, and a speech act. The danger here is putting the pragmatic cart before the semantic horse. For example, not every negation is a speaker denial (in making this point, Frege points to the non-denial nature of embedded negation as in “If not-\(p\) then \(q\)”), nor is every speaker denial a linguistic negation. Given the repeated attempts over the centuries to liquidate or tame it—negation as positive difference, as dissimilarity or incompatibility, as falsity, as an admission of epistemic impoverishment, as the speech act of denial—and its resilience in surviving these attacks, negation qualifies as the Rasputin of the propositional calculus.

But the prototypical use of negation is indeed as a denial of a proposition attributable to, or at least considered by, someone relevant to the discourse context. While affirmation standardly introduces a proposition into the discourse model, negation—in its “chief use” (Jespersen 1917, 4), its “most common use” (Ayer 1952, 39), its “standard and primary use” (Strawson 1952, 7)—is directed at a proposition that is already in or that can be accommodated by the discourse model.

1.3 Matters of scope

If we think of negation as essentially a means for opposition—the impossibility of simultaneously endorsing two incompatible options (see the entries on contradiction and the traditional square of opposition)—propositional negation is not necessarily privileged. This view is formally implemented in the Boolean algebraic model of Keenan and Faltz, on which negation is a cross-categorial operation, as are the binary connectives:

We can directly interpret conjunctions, disjunctions, and negations in most categories by taking them to be the appropriate meet, join, and complement functions of the interpretations of the expressions conjoined, disjoined, or negated. The sense in which we have only one and, or, and not is explicated on the grounds that they are always interpreted as the meet, join, and complement functions in whatever set we are looking at. (Keenan and Faltz 1985, 6)

Treatments of English and other languages frequently posit negative operators whose scope is narrower than the sentence or clause. This tradition dates back to Aristotle, for whom the predicate term negation in Socrates is not-wise, affirming that the predicate not-wise holds of Socrates, yields a false statement if Socrates does not exist, while the predicate denial Socrates isn’t wise denies that the predicate wise holds of Socrates and is true if Socrates does not exist. For Jespersen (1917), the subclausal “special” negation as in Nobody came, where “the negative notion…belong[s] logically to one definite idea”, is opposed to “nexal” negation, applying to “the combination of two ideas”, typically the subject-predicate nexus. Later linguists usually follow Klima (1964) and Jackendoff (1969) in allowing for constituent negation (e.g., verb phrase negation in You can [not go]) alongside sentential negation (You cannot go), utilizing various grammatical and semantic diagnostics for distinguishing the two varieties.

A syntactic correlate of the distinction between wide- (sentential) versus narrow-scope (constituent) negation in English is that only when the negative element has clausal scope, as in the (a) examples in (1)-(3) (or in this very sentence), can it trigger negative inversion (Klima 1964). In the corresponding (b) examples, the scope of negation does not extend beyond the fronted phrase, whence the exclusion of ever, a satellite of negation (negative polarity item).[4]

With no job will I be happy. [= I won’t be happy with any job]
With no job I will be happy. [= I will be happy without any job]
In no clothes does Robin look good.
In no clothes Robin looks good.
At no time were we (ever) alone together in the Oval Office.
In no time we were (*ever) alone together in the Oval Office.

Negation also interacts in complicated and often surprising ways with quantification and modality. Perhaps the most analyzed interaction is with universal quantification. Despite the frequent condemnation of the wide-scope reading of negation over universals as in the locus classicus, All that glitters is not gold and similar examples in French, German, and other languages, or in ambiguous sentences like All the boys didn’t leave, the availability of such readings (depending on the speaker, the intonation contour, and the context of utterance) is not as illogical as it may appear (Horn 1989, §3.4; Tottie and Neukom-Hermann 2010).

1.4 Contrariety and contradiction

The concept of negation is often semantically restricted to contradictory opposition between propositions, in which \(\neg A\) can be paraphrased (if not necessarily syntactically represented) as “it is not the case that \(A\)”. As introduced in Aristotle’s Categories (11b17), the genus of opposition (apophasis) is divided into species that include contrariety and contradiction. Contradictory opposites, whether affirmative and negative counterparts of a singular predication (Socrates is wise/Socrates isn’t wise) or quantified expressions (All pleasure is good/Some pleasure is not good), are mutually exhaustive as well as mutually exclusive, while contrary opposites (Socrates is wise/Socrates is unwise; All pleasure is good/No pleasure is good) do not mutually exhaust their domain. Contraries cannot be simultaneously true, though they may be simultaneously false. Members of a contradictory pair cannot be true or false simultaneously; contradictories “divide the true and the false between them” (see the entries on contradiction and the traditional square of opposition).

Contrary terms (enantia) come in two varieties (Cat. 11b38ff.). In immediate or logical contraries (odd/even, sick/well), a true middle—an entity satisfying the range of the two opposed terms but falling under neither of them—is excluded, e.g., an integer neither odd nor even. But mediate contrary pairs (black/white, good/bad) allow for a middle—a shade between black and white, a man or an act neither good nor bad. Neither mediate nor immediate contraries fall under the purview of the Law of Excluded Middle [LEM] (tertium non datur).

For immediate contraries formed by narrow-scope predicate term negation, the rendering \(a\) is not-\(F\) in the traditional quasi-English phrasing corresponds to what Aristotle expresses through word order, utilizing the distinction between e.g., einai mê leukon “to be not-white” and mê einai leukon “not to be white” (Prior Analytics I 51b10). For Aristotle, \(a\) is neither \(F\) nor not-\(F\) can be true if \(a\) doesn’t exist (Santa is neither white nor not-white) or isn’t the kind of thing that can be F (The number 7 is neither white nor not-white), given that not-\(F\) is taken to affirm the negative property non-\(F\)-ness of the subject rather than denying a positive property.

Other cases in which apparent contradictories can be seen as contraries, and thus immune from any application of LEM, are future contingents (There will be/will not be a sea battle tomorrow; cf. De Int. Chapter 9) and, in more recent work (Alxatib and Pelletier 2011, Ripley 2011a), vague predications. Thus a is neither F nor not-F is often judged true when F is a vague predicate (bald, rich, tall), although in the latter case speakers may also be willing to affirm that a is both F and not-F, which complicates matters (see the entries on contradiction, future contingents, and vagueness).

1.5 Negation, presupposition, and singular terms

In his exposition of sense and reference, Frege (1892) argues that both (4a) and its contradictory (4b) presuppose that the name Kepler has a denotation. Every affirmative or negative sentence with a singular subject (name or description) presupposes the existence of a unique referent for that subject; if the presupposition fails, no assertion is made in (4a,b).

Kepler died in misery.
Kepler did not die in misery.

But this presupposition is not part of the content of the expression, and hence (4a) does not entail existence, or the negation of (4a) would not be (4b) but Kepler did not die in misery or the name “Kepler” has no reference, an outcome Frege seems to have taken as an absurdity but one that prefigures the later emergence of a presupposition-cancelling external or exclusion negation.

Unwilling to countenance the truth-value gaps incurred on Frege’s analysis, Russell (1905, 485) reconsiders the status of contradictory negation with vacuous subjects:

By the law of the excluded middle, either “A is B” or “A is not B” must be true. Hence either “the present king of France is bald” or “the present king of France is not bald” must be true. Yet if we enumerated the things that are bald and the things that are not bald, we should not find the king of France on either list. Hegelians, who love a synthesis, will probably conclude that he wears a wig.

To resolve this (apparent) paradox while preserving a classical analysis in which every meaningful sentence is true or false, Russell banishes singular terms like the king of France from logical form, unpacking (5) and (6) as existentially quantified sentences despite their superficial subject-predicate syntax.

The king of France is bald.
The king of France is not bald.

On Russell’s theory of descriptions, (5) can be represented as (5′), the (false) proposition that there is a unique entity with the property of being king of France and that this entity is bald, while (6) is ambiguous, depending on the scope of negation.

\(\exists x(Kx \wedge \forall y(Ky \rightarrow y=x) \wedge Bx))\)
\(\exists x(Kx \wedge \forall y(Ky \rightarrow y=x) \wedge \neg Bx))\)
\(\neg \exists x(Kx \wedge \forall y(Ky \rightarrow y=x) \wedge Bx))\)

(6′), with narrow-scope (“internal”) negation, is the proposition that there is a unique and hirsute king of France, which is “simply false” in the absence (or oversupply) of male French monarchs. In (6″), on the other hand, the description the king of France falls within the scope of external negation and yields a true proposition. Unlike (6′), (6″) fails to entail that there is a king of France; indeed, the non-existence of a king of France guarantees the truth of (6″). This reading is more naturally expressed with the fall-rise contour and continuation characteristic of metalinguistic negation (Horn 1989) as in (7):

The king of France isn’t \(^{{\rm v}}\)BALD—there ISN’T any king of France!

For Strawson (1950, 1952), negation normally or invariably leaves the subject “unimpaired”. Strawson tacitly lines up with Frege and against Russell (and Aristotle) in regarding negative statements like (4b) and (6) as unambiguous and necessarily presuppositional. Someone who utters (6) does not thereby assert (nor does her statement entail) that there is a king of France. Rather, (6)—along with its affirmative counterpart (5)—presupposes it. If this presupposition fails, a statement may be made but the question of its truth value fails to arise.

While many analysts (e.g., Wilson 1975, Atlas 1977, Gazdar 1979, Grice 1989) have since followed Russell by preserving a bivalent semantics and invoking pragmatic explanations of apparent presuppositional effects, other linguists and philosophers (e.g., Fodor 1979, Burton-Roberts 1989, von Fintel 2004) have defended and formalized theories of semantic presupposition in the Frege-Strawson spirit, allowing for the emergence of truth-value gaps or non-classical truth values when presuppositions are not satisfied.

Non-bivalent logics of semantic presupposition, dating back to Łukasiewicz (1930) and Kleene (1952), generally posit (at least) two not-operators, the distinction arising lexically rather than (as for Russell) scopally; see the entry on many-valued logic and Section 2 below. The ordinary, presupposition-preserving internal or choice negation is the only one countenanced by Frege and Strawson; on this reading, Santa is not white, like Santa is white, is neither true nor false, given that Santa does not exist. The presupposition-cancelling or exclusion negation always determines a classical value. With exclusion negation, Santa is not white (or perhaps more plausibly It is not the case that Santa is white) is true even if there is no Santa. Thus there is no excluded middle; any affirmation and its corresponding exclusion negation are contradictories rather than contraries (see the entry on presupposition for elaboration and further details).

1.6 From contradiction to contrariety: pragmatic strengthening of negation

In his dictum, “The essence of formal negation is to invest the contrary with the character of the contradictory”, Bosanquet (1888) encapsulates the widespread tendency for formal contradictory (wide-scope) negation to be semantically or pragmatically strengthened to a contrary.

We use \(\copy A\) to represent any contrary of \(A\). Following the Aristotelian theory of opposition, the two contradictories \(A\) and \(\neg A\) cannot both be false, just as they cannot both be true, while a given proposition and a contrary of that proposition, \(A\) and \(\copy A\), can both be false, although they cannot both be true. (Others have used \(\kappa\) or R for one-place non-truth-functional contrariety connectives; cf. McCall 1967, Humberstone 2005; see also Bogen 1991 for the distinction between linguistic and metaphysical contraries.) It should be noted that while \(\neg\) is an operator that takes one proposition into another, © is not, since a given proposition may have logically distinct contraries, while this is not the case for contradictories. Geach (1972, 71–73) makes this point with the example in (8). While (8a) has two syntactically distinct contradictories, e.g., Not every cat detests every dog and It’s not every dog that every cat detests, any such co-contradictories of a given proposition will always have the same truth conditions. But (8a) allows two contraries with distinct truth conditions, (8b) and (8c).

Every cat detests every dog.
No cat detests every dog.
There is no dog that every cat detests.

Similarly, (9a) allows three non-identical contraries:

I believe that you’re telling the truth.
I believe that you’re not telling the truth.
I don’t believe that you’re telling the truth or that you’re not; I haven’t made up my mind yet.
I don’t believe that you’re telling the truth or that you’re not: I haven’t given the matter any thought.

Thus while we can speak of the contradictory of a proposition, Geach observes, we cannot (pace McCall 1967) speak of the contrary, but only of a contrary, of a proposition. As Humberstone (1986, fn. 6) points out in response to Geach’s critique of McCall, however, the lack of uniqueness “does not prevent one from exploring the logical properties of an arbitrarily selected contrary for a given statement”. For our purposes, the crucial logical properties of contrariety are that (i) the contradictory of a proposition \(A\) is not a contrary of \(A\) and that (ii) contrariety unilaterally entails contradiction:

\(\copy A \vdash \neg A\)
\(\neg A \not \vdash\copy A\)

For McCall (1967), contrariety is a quasi-modal notion akin to logical impossibility, \(\Box \neg\), in that \(\Box \neg A\) entails \(\neg A\) but not vice versa, but as pointed out by an anonymous reviewer, there is no intrinsic modal component of contrariety; all that is necessary is that contrariety is a non-truth-functional one-place connective. (See Humberstone 1986, 2003, 2005; Bogen 1991; and Vakarelov 1989a for additional considerations.)

The strengthening of contradictory negation, \(\neg A\), to a contrary, \(\copy A\), typically instantiates the inference schema of disjunctive syllogism or modus tollendo ponens in (11):

\(\begin{array}{l}A \vee B \\ \neg A \\ \hline B\end{array}\)

While the key disjunctive premise is typically suppressed, the role of disjunctive syllogism can be detected in a variety of strengthening shifts in natural language where the disjunction in question is pragmatically presupposed in relevant contexts. Among the illustrations of this pattern are the following:

  • The tendency for negation outside the scope of (certain) negated propositional attitude predicates (e.g., a does not believe that \(p\)) to be interpreted as associated with the embedded clause (e.g., a believes that not-\(p\)); this is so-called “neg-raising”, to which we return below.

  • The tendency for a semantically contradictory negation of an unmarked positive value, whether affixal (\(x\) is unfair/unhappy) or clausal (I don’t like him), to be strengthened (as either an “online” or conventionalized process) to a contrary of the positive predication. As contraries, Chris is happy and Chris is unhappy allow an unexcluded middle, since Chris can be neither happy nor strictly unhappy; similarly, I don’t like him is generally understood as stronger than a mere assertion that it’s not the case that I like him.

  • The strengthening of a negated plural definite (The kids aren’t sleeping) or bare plural (Beavers don’t eat cheese) from a contradictory to a contrary of the corresponding affirmative. In each case, the negation is understood as inside the scope of the quantified subject.

As stressed by Bartsch 1973 (cf. Horn 1978; Horn 1989, Chapter 5), when there are only two alternatives in a given context, as in the case of neg-raising, the denial of one (I don’t believe it will rain) amounts to the assertion of the other (I believe it won’t rain). The relevant reasoning is an instance of the disjunctive syllogism pattern in (11), as seen in (12), where \(F\) represents a propositional attitude and \(a\) the subject of that attitude.

\(\begin{array}{ll} F (a, p)\vee F (a,\neg p)\, & {\scriptsize \mbox{[the pragmatically assumed disjunction]}}\\ \underline{\neg F (a, p)} & {\scriptsize \mbox{[the sentence explicitly uttered]}}\\ F (a, \neg p) & {\scriptsize \mbox{[the stronger negative proposition conveyed]}} \end{array} \)

The key step is the pragmatically licensed disjunction of contraries: if you assume I’ve made up my mind about the truth value of a given proposition \(p\) (e.g., “it will rain”) rather than being ignorant or undecided about it, then you will infer that I believe either \(p\) or \(\neg p\), and my denial that I believe the former (“I don’t think it will rain”) will lead you to conclude that I believe the latter (“I think it won’t rain”). (See Horn 1989, Chapter 5 for more on this phenomenon; Gajewski 2007 for a neo-Bartschian analysis; and Collins and Postal 2014 for a vigorous defense of a grammatical approach to neg-raising).

The availability of strengthened contrary readings for apparent contradictory negation has long been recognized, dating back to classical rhetoricians of the 4th century on the figure of litotes, in which an affirmative is indirectly asserted by negating its contrary (Hoffmann 1987). Litotic interpretations tend to be asymmetrical: an attribution of “not happy” or “not optimistic” will tend to convey a contrary (in this case “rather unhappy” or “fairly pessimistic”), while no analogous virtual contrariety is normally signaled by “not sad” or “not pessimistic”, which are usually understood as pure contradictories. This asymmetry is ultimately a social fact arising from the desire to respect negative face (Ducrot 1973, Brown and Levinson 1987, Horn 1989).

For Jespersen, the tendency reflected by the neg-raised interpretation of I don’t think that \(p\) not only illustrates the general strengthening to contrariety but also participates in a more general conspiracy in natural language to signal negation as early as possible. Additional effects of this “neg-first” principle (Horn 1989, 293; after Jespersen 1917, 5) range from diachronic shifts in the expression of sentential negation (see van der Auwera 2010) and the fronting and negative inversion in (1a) or (2a) to the emergence of ambiguities arising in contexts like [neg \(S_1\) because \(S_2\)] (Jespersen 1917, 48), as in “She didn’t marry him because he’s poor”, where the “illogical” scope reading—on which his poverty was the non-cause of the wedding rather than the cause of the non-wedding—can be rendered more or less accessible by the intonation contour.

The “neg-raised” reading of I don’t think that \(p\) as “I think that not-\(p\)” has often been deplored by grammarians or philosophers as an illogical placement of negation, an unfortunate ambiguity, or (in Quine’s terms) an “idiosyncratic complication” of one language:

the familiar quirk of English whereby “\(x\) does not believe that \(p\)” is equated to “\(x\) believes that not \(p\)” rather than to “it is not the case that \(x\) believes that \(p\)”. (Quine 1960, 145–6; similar claims are made by other philosophers)

But this “quirk” has deep roots, dating back to St. Anselm’s 12th century Lambeth fragments (Henry 1967, 193–94; Hopkins 1972, 231–32; Horn 1989, §5.2). Anselm points out that “non…omnis qui facit quod non debet peccat, si proprie consideretur”—not everyone who does what he non debet (“not-should”) sins, if the matter is considered strictly (with the contradictory reading of negation as the syntax suggests). The problem is that non debere peccare is standardly used to convey the contrary meaning debere non peccare rather than the literal contradictory (“it is not a duty to sin”). It is hard to stipulate e.g., non debet ducere uxorem (= “a man is free not to marry”) without seeming to commit oneself to the stronger debet non ducere uxorem, an injunction to celibacy (Henry 1967, 193ff.; Horn 1978, 200).

For Henry (1967, 193, §6.412), Anselm’s observations on modal/negative interaction are “complicated by the quirks of Latin usage”. But far from a Quinean quirk of English and/or Latin usage, “neg-raising”—the lower-clause understanding of negation of a believe- or ought-type predicate—is distributed widely and systematically across languages and operators.

The raised understanding is always stronger than the contradictory (outer) negation; it applies to a proper subset of the situations to which the contradictory applies (is true in a proper subset of possible worlds). Thus neg-raising, as Anselm recognized, yields a virtual contrariety: the compositional meaning is true but too weak, and the addressee recovers a conversational implicature to “fill in” the stronger proposition.

In some cases, the strengthened or neg-raised contrary reading may become salient enough over time to block the literal interpretation, as when French Il ne faut pas partir—literally = “one needn’t leave” (an O vertex modal)—is now generally used only to express the stronger proposition that one must not-leave (E vertex). This is a modal instance of the general phenomenon of O \(>\) E drift (Horn 1989), an upward shift along the right (negative) vertical of the modal square of opposition. Such squares were constructed by Cajetan, based on Aristotle’s De Interpretatione 21b10ff. and Prior Analytics 32a18–28 (see Oesterle 1962), and by other medieval commentators.

[A square diagram, upper left vertex is 'A' and labeled 'box phi'; upper right vertex is 'E' and labeled 'box not phi equivalent not diamond phi'; lower left vertex is 'I' and labeled 'diamond phi'; lower right vertex is 'O' and labeled 'not box phi equivalent diamond not phi'. 'A' and 'E' are connected by a double headed arrow labeled 'contraries'; 'A' and 'I' are connect by an arrow pointing to 'I' and labeled 'entails'. 'E' connects to 'O' with an arrow pointing to 'O' labeled 'entails'. 'I' and 'O' are connected by a double headed arrow labeled 'subcontraries'. In the center of the square is a label, 'contradictories' with lines from all four vertices to it. The line from 'A' is labeled 'a must F'; the line from 'E' is labeled 'a can't F'; the line from 'I' is labeled 'a may F' and the line from 'O' is labeled 'a needn't F']

Figure 1

\(\mathbf{O}>\mathbf{E}\) drift is attested cross-linguistically in the meaning shift of lexical items like Old English nealles (lit. “NEG all”) = “not at all”, Dutch nimmer (lit., “NEG always”) = “never”, or Russian nel’zja (lit. “NEG must”) = “mustn’t”, and in words like unlikely, inadvisable, or disbelieve, whose prefixal negations yield only contrary, not contradictory, interpretations. The reverse shift, in which apparent E forms develop O meanings, appears to be unattested (cf. Horn 2012, 2015).

In litotes and neg-raising, the interpretation of formal contradictories as contraries arises from the accessibility of the relevant disjunction, triggering the disjunctive syllogism. The homogeneity or all-or-none presupposition (Fodor 1970) applying to bare plurals, plural definites, and mass predications results in a comparable effect; it is natural to strengthen negative statements like Mammals don’t lay eggs, The children aren’t sleeping, or I don’t eat meat to affirmations of contraries rather than understanding them as simple wide-scope negations of the corresponding positives (Mammals lay eggs, The children are sleeping, I eat meat) as would be the case with overtly quantified universals. The relevant principle has been variously formulated:

When a kind is denied to have a generic property P\(_k\), then any of its individuals cannot have the corresponding individual-level property P\(_i\). (von Fintel 1997, 31)

If the predicate P is false for the NP, its negation not-P is true for the NP… Whenever a predicate is applied to one of its arguments, it is true or false of the argument as a whole. (Löbner 2000, 239)

Once again the key step is establishing the relevant disjunction as a pragmatically inferred instance of the Law of Excluded Middle, e.g., “Either mammals lay eggs or mammals don’t lay eggs”. In fact, this practice was first identified by Aristotle (Soph. Elen. 175b40–176a17), who offered an early version of the all-or-none (or both-or-neither) in arguing that a negative answer to a “dialectical” or conjoined question like “Are Coriscus and Callias at home?” would imply that neither is at home, given the default supposition that they are either both in or both out. Once again LEM applies where it “shouldn’t”; \(A \vee © A\) behaves as though it were an instance of \(A \vee \neg A\), triggering the disjunctive syllogism:

\(\begin{array}{l} (Fa \wedge Fb) \vee (\neg Fa \wedge \neg Fb)\\ \underline{\neg (Fa \wedge Fb)}\\ (\neg Fa \wedge \neg Fb) \end{array}\)

Other instances of the maximization of contrariety in natural language, in a range of contexts from formal pragmatics to word learning, are discussed in Horn 2015.

1.7 Privation, affixal negation, and the markedness asymmetry

For Aristotle, privation is an instance of opposition defined in terms of the absence or presence of a default property for a given subject:

We say that that which is capable of some particular faculty or possession has suffered privation [sterêsis] when the faculty or possession in question is in no way present in that in which, and at the time in which, it should be naturally present. We do not call that toothless which has not teeth, or that blind which has not sight, but rather that which has not teeth or sight at the time when by nature it should. (Categories 12a28–33)

A newborn kitten, while lacking sight, is thus no more “blind” than is a chair, nor is a baby “toothless”.

Privation as the absence of what would be expected by nature to be present is revisited in the Metaphysics (1022b23–1023a8), where Aristotle—noting that privation can range over predictable absence, accidental removal, or deliberate “taking away by force” of the relevant property—distinguishes privation “with respect to genus”, as in the blindness of moles, from privation “with respect to self”, as in the blindness or toothlessness of an old man. In the end, Aristotle concedes, there may be as many senses of privation as there are a- prefixed terms in Greek (Met. 1022b33). Indeed, privation may be reanalyzed as the primary contrariety (1055a34).

In a wide range of languages, affixal negation on simplex bases reflects Aristotelian privation, whence the asymmetry between possible forms (unhappy, untrue, unkind) and impossible or unlikely ones (unsad, unfalse, uncruel). We can describe a failed comedy, but not a successful tragedy, as unfunny. As Jespersen (1917, 144) observes, the tendency of semi-productive negative affixation to be restricted to unmarked or positive bases combines with that of the preference for contrariety reviewed above:

The modification in sense brought about by the addition of the prefix is generally that of a simple negation: unworthy = “not worthy”, etc… The two terms [X, unX] are thus contradictory terms. But very often the prefix produces a “contrary” term or at any rate what approaches one: unjust generally implies the opposite of just; unwise means more than not wise and approaches foolish, unhappy is not far from miserable, etc.

The counter-expectation property of affixal negation extends even to contradictory, middle-excluding adjectives like alive/dead; nothing can be both and nothing capable of being either can be “in between”. But undead has been around since Bram Stoker’s Dracula (1897) as both an adjective and a zero-derived occupational noun to describe zombies, vampires, and other creatures that are “not quite dead but not fully alive, dead-and-alive” (OED). Someone or something is undead—e.g., a vampire—if it fails to conform to one’s expectation that it should be dead. But if something appears to be alive but does not quite fulfill that expectation, it is not undead but unalive, e.g., artificial flowers. Both the undead (but not quite alive) vampire and the unalive (but not dead) artificial flowers conform to Aristotle’s notion of a privative opposite in lacking a property associated by default rules with the respective subject.

The marked status of negative utterances has also been invoked to motivate an asymmetry in the geometry of lexicalization. Within the Square of Opposition, the Aristotelian relations of contradiction, contrariety, and subalternation are supplemented with an additional relation of subcontrariety, so called because the subcontraries are located under the contraries. As the contradictories of the two contraries, the subcontraries (e.g., Some pleasure is good, Some pleasure is not good) can both be true, but cannot both be false. For Aristotle, this was therefore not a true opposition, since subcontraries are “merely verbally opposed” (Prior Analytics 63b21–30). In pragmatic terms, the assertion of one subcontrary (Some men are bald) is not only compatible with, but actually conversationally implicates, the other (Some men are not bald), given Grice’s Maxim of Quantity (“Make your contribution as informative as is required”; see the entries on Paul Grice, pragmatics, and implicature). The fact that the two members of a subcontrary pair tend to be equipollent or mutually derivable in a given context may explain the fact that only one of the two subcontraries will lexicalize in natural language, and the markedness of negation explains why this is always the positive (I vertex, e.g., some) rather than the negative (O vertex, e.g., no) value (Horn 1989, 2012). Thus the E values none, nor, and never are possible but the corresponding O values *nall (“not all”), *nand (“or not”), and *nalways (“not always”) are never attested. Similar, if less absolute, asymmetries obtain among non-quantificational and indeed non-logical values (van der Auwera 1996, Horn 2012). Various competing explanations to the pragmatic account of Horn (1989, 2012) have been proposed for motivating these asymmetries; see, inter alia, Jaspers 2005, Seuren and Jaspers 2014, and references therein.

1.8 Double negation

1.8.1 “Logical” double negation

When duplex negatio affirmat, what exactly does the double negation affirm? When a negative term is a contrary rather than a contradictory of the corresponding simple affirmative, to deny its application—Socrates isn’t a not-white log—does not result in the mutual annihilation of logical double negation, any more than does the negation of a mediate contrary (She’s not unhappy, It isn’t uncommon). While Aristotle countenanced multiple negation, to the extent of generating such unlikely sequences as Not-man is not not-just (De Int. 19b36), each proposition contains only one instance of negation as wide-scope predicate denial (juxtaposed here with both a negated subject term and a negated predicate term), since each categorical statement contains only one predicate.

By contrast, the Stoics defined negation (apophatikon) as an iterating external operator. For Alexander of Aphrodisias, “Not: not: it is day differs from it is day only in manner of speech” (Mates 1953, 126). With their propositional connectives and one-place truth/falsity-toggling negation operator, it is the Stoics rather the Aristotelians who prefigured modern propositional logic, as well as the precepts of traditional grammar (“Duplex negatio affirmat”) and the Law of Double Negation.[5]

Classical Fregean logic allows for but one negative operator, the contradictory-forming propositional operator applying to a proposition or open sentence, in keeping with “the thesis that all forms of negation are reducible to a suitably placed ‘it is not the case that’” (Prior 2006, 524). Not unexpectedly, Frege (1919, 130) proclaims the logical superfluity of double negation: “Wrapping up a thought in double negation does not alter its truth value”. Within this metaphor, \(\neg\neg A\) is simply a way of garbing the thought or proposition \(A\).

But, as noted in §1.1, even a single sentence-external negation (Not: The sun is shining) is a logician’s construct rarely attested in the wild (Geach 1972; Katz 1977):

[P]ropositional negation was as foreign to ordinary Greek as to ordinary English, and [Aristotle] never attained to a distinct conception of it. The Stoics did reach such a convention, but in doing so they violated accepted Greek usage; their use of an initial oukhi must have read just as oddly as sentences like “Not: the sun is shining” do in English. (Geach 1972, 75)

Further, whether or not we admit the law of double negation in our logic,

in ordinary language a doubly negated expression very seldom, if ever, has the same logical powers as the original unnegated statement. (Hintikka 1968, 47)

It is thus worth noting that the system of dual negations described by Aristotle in Prior Analytics I, Chapter 46 is both insightful and internally consistent; its echoes are recognizable in Jespersen’s distinction between nexal negation (not happy) and special negation (unhappy), Von Wright’s (1959) distinction between weak (contradictory) versus strong (contrary) negation, and Jackendoff’s (1969) semantic reanalysis of Klima’s (1964) grammatical categories of sentential versus constituent negation. In each case, a negative marker whose scope is narrower than the proposition determines a statement logically distinct from a simple contradictory.

If we represent the narrow-scope contrariety operator of It is not-white as \(\copy A\), its contradictory, \(\neg\copy A\)(It isn’t not-white), does not return us to the simple positive \(A\). The result, if not the means, is similar to that in intuitionistic logic (Heyting 1956). The intuitionistic negation operator does not cancel out, given that the intuitionistic Law of Double Negation is valid in only one direction, \(A \rightarrow \neg \neg A\), while \(\neg \neg A \rightarrow A\) does not apply (see the entry on intuitionistic logic). The intuitionists posit just one negation operator that sustains double introduction but not double cancellation, while the Aristotelian system distinguishes contradictory (sentential) predicate denial from contrary (constituent) predicate term negation.

In ordinary language, semantic double negation (as opposed to negative concord as in I ain’t never done nothing to nobody, an agreement phenomenon in which only one semantic negation is expressed, addressed in the next section) tends not to cancel out completely. This is predictably the case when a semantic contrary is negated: not uncommon is weaker than common; one can be not unhappy without being happy. But even when an apparently contradictory negation is negated (from the unexceptionable it’s not impossible to the more unusual double-not of Homer Simpson’s concessive I’m not not licking toads []), the duplex negatio of \(A\) doesn’t affirm \(A\), or at least it provides a rhetorically welcome concealment, as suggested by Frege’s metaphor of “wrapping up a thought” in double negation. The negation in such cases (impossible, not-licking) is coerced into a virtual contrary whose negation, \(\neg\copy A\), is weaker than (is unilaterally entailed by) \(A\) (see Horn 2017 and the entry on contradiction):

[a square with diagonal lines and the vertices labeled: top left as 'A' and 'it's possible that A'; top right with 'E' and 'it's impossible that A' and 'copyright sign [it's possible that A]'; bottom left with 'I' and 'it isn't impossible that A' and 'negation sign copyright sign[it's possible that A]'; bottom right with 'O' and 'it isn't possible that A' and 'negation sign[it's possible that A].']

Figure 2

1.8.2 Negative concord and its relations

In the previous section it was observed that when duplex negatio affirmat, what it affirms is often not simply the doubly negated proposition but the result of an incomplete cancellation yielded by the negation of an actual or virtual contrary (not unlikely, not impossible). But a more dramatic problem for the dictum is when duplex negatio negat, especially in the form of negative concord, in which a single logical negation on the main verb spreads to indefinites and adverbs within the same clause (Labov 1972, Zeijlstra 2004, Penka 2011).[6]

The grammar of negative concord is often complex and subject to a variety of factors. In standard Italian, for example, negative quantifiers following the main verb (whether as objects or postposed subjects) co-occur with mandatory negative marking on the verb to yield a single negative meaning, as in (14a). But when a negative quantifier precedes the verb, negative concord is ruled out, as in (14b).[7]

Gianni *(non) ha visto nessuno. “Gianni has seen nobody”
*(Non) ha telefonato nessuno. “Nobody has telephoned”
*(Non) ho parlato con nessuno. “I have spoken with nobody”
Nessuno (*non) ha visto Gianni. “Nobody has seen Gianni”
Con nessuno (*non) ho parlato. “With nobody have I spoken”

Negative concord is a feature of many non-standard varieties of English, especially in informal speech—or lyrics (“I can’t get no satisfaction”).[8] The grammar of negative concord in African American Vernacular English has been especially well studied; see Green 2002 for an influential analysis.

True negative concord within a given clause represents just one kind of hypernegation, the general phenomenon in which a negative marker reinforces rather than cancels the ordinary or canonical marker of sentence negation (Horn 2010a). Hypernegation may extend across clause boundaries to result in the occurrence of “pleonastic” or “expletive” negative elements in the scope of inherently negative predicates (cf. Espinal 1992, Horn 2010a). This is exemplified by the negative markers following comparatives, before clauses, or verbs of fearing in French, Russian, Yiddish, and other languages. A standard feature of earlier stages of English, pleonastic negation persists in colloquial English:

I miss (not) seeing you around.
Don’t be surprised if it doesn’t rain. [= if it rains]
Not with my wife, you don’t.
The proposal will not be approved, I (don’t) think.

The well-known problems encountered in processing multiple negations, verified in many psycholinguistic studies, are responsible for the appearance of other uninterpreted negations as in (16a), and the conventionalized irony or sarcasm exemplified in (16b,c):[9]

No head injury is too trivial to ignore.
I could care less.
That’ll teach you to ever mess with me again.

Similarly, in French the expression Vous n’êtes pas sans ignorer que …, literally “You are not without being ignorant that …”, is notoriously used in the sense of “You certainly know that …”. If duplex negatio affirmat, then triplex negatio confundit.

1.9 Negative polarity

Certain linguistic expressions in English and other languages are polarity sensitive, restricted in their distributions to the scope of negation or semantically related contexts, including negative quantifiers, implicitly negative predicates or adverbs, the antecedents of conditionals, comparative clauses, and the restrictors of universals:

I {haven’t/*have} ever eaten any kumquats at all.
{Few/*Many} of the assignments have been turned in yet.
The dean {rarely/*often} lifts a finger to help students on probation.
I {doubt/*believe} they’re all that pleased with the proposal.
{All/*Many} customers who had ever purchased any of the affected items were (*ever) contacted.

Negative polarity items (NPIs) like those highlighted in (17) are generally restricted to downward entailing or monotone decreasing contexts, those in which inferences from sets to subsets (but not vice versa) are valid (see Fauconnier 1975; Ladusaw 1980, 1996; Peters and Westerståhl 2006; and the generalized quantifiers entry). If I’ve eaten kumquats, I’ve eaten fruit, but not necessarily vice versa; this is an upward entailing (monotone increasing) environment. On the other hand, if I haven’t eaten fruit, I haven’t eaten kumquats, but not necessarily vice versa; this is a downward entailing (monotone decreasing) environment.[10] It is just in the latter case that NPIs are licensed.

As (17e) shows, universals like all or every license NPIs in their restrictor (the relative clause), which is a downward entailing context (if everyone who knows logic is a vegetarian, everyone who knows classical logic is a vegetarian, but not vice versa). But universals do not license NPIs in their nuclear scope or predicate expression, which is an upward entailing context (if everyone who knows logic is a vegan, everyone who knows logic is a vegetarian, but not vice versa). This contrast demonstrates the insufficiency of an account of polarity licensing that simply marks a given lexical item as favorable to the occurrence of NPIs within its scope (Ladusaw 1980).

While downward entailment may be (generally) necessary for the licensing of NPIs (although there are some thorny issues to resolve; cf. Giannakidou 2011, Israel 2011), it is not necessarily sufficient, depending on the nature of the context and the NPI in question. For example, some environments that permit weak NPIs like any and ever fail to license stricter ones like in weeks or until midnight.

{Nobody/Only Chris} has ever proved any of those theorems.
{Nobody/*Only Chris} has been here in weeks.

This has led to the development of more stringent algebraic conditions that some polarity items must meet, e.g., anti-additivity (Zwarts 1998). The distribution and licensing of polarity items, subject to widespread variation within and across languages, is an important but extremely complex linguistic phenomenon with implications for the architecture of grammar and the theory of meaning; see Israel 2011, Giannakidou 2011, Chierchia 2013, Horn 2016, and Barker 2018 for extensive discussion and alternative theoretical approaches. Van der Wouden (1996) and Blanchette (2015) provide useful examinations of the connections of negative polarity to negative concord and expletive negation.

1.10 Metalinguistic negation

In addition to the overlapping dichotomies we have surveyed between grammatically and semantically defined varieties of negation within a given language (wide- vs. narrow-scope, sentential vs. constituent, contradictory vs. contrary, choice vs. exclusion), a “pragmatic ambiguity” has been invoked to distinguish ordinary descriptive negation from a specialized metalinguistic or echoic use (Horn 1989, chapter 6).[11] In examples like (19), a speaker objects to a previous utterance on a variety of grounds, including its phonetic or grammatical form, register, or associated presuppositions or implicatures:

Around here we don’t LIKE coffee—we LOVE it.
She doesn’t sell INsurance—she sells inSURance.
It’s not stewed bunny, honey, it’s civet de lapin.
I’m not HIS brother—he’s MY brother!
Mozart’s sonatas were for piano and violin, not for violin and piano.

The descriptive/metalinguistic distinction is supported by converging linguistic diagnostics suggesting that metalinguistic negation operates on a different level, whence its failure to incorporate morphologically or license negative polarity items:

I’m {not happy/*unhappy} with the plan, I’m ecstatic!
You didn’t eat {some/*any} of the cookies, you ate them all!

The coherence of the notion of “pragmatic ambiguity” and, more generally, the proper treatment of metalinguistic negation (or, following Carston 1996, echoic negation) have been matters of considerable dispute; for a range of competing views, see McCawley 1991, Geurts 1998, Burton-Roberts 1999, and Carston 1999. Pitts 2011 provides an excellent overview of the phenomenon (or phenomena) in question.

The linguistic expression of negation, its interaction with the phenomena of negative polarity, concord, and scope, and the mapping between negative form and negative meaning all present complex and important problems for syntax, semantics, and pragmatics. (Recent perspectives on a range of issues involved are provided in Atlas 2012, Horn 2018, and work cited therein.)  But perhaps the most striking feature of negation is the mismatch between the formal and distributional complexity of negative elements in natural languages and the simplex character of the one-place negative operator of propositional logic. Yet here too the apparent simplicity is deceiving once we undertake a systematic investigation of the logic of negation. It is to that task that we now turn.

2. The logic of negation

The logic of negation may be presented in quite different ways, by considering various styles of proof systems (axiom systems, sequent calculi, systems of natural deduction, tableaux, etc.) or different kinds of semantics (algebraic, model-theoretic, proof-theoretic, game-theoretic, etc.). Moreover, in search of characteristics of negation as a one-place connective, several dimensions of classification are available, depending on the logical vocabulary of the language under consideration (propositional, first-order, multi-modal, etc.) and the inferential framework taken into account (single antecedents (i.e., premises) and conclusions, multiple antecedents or multiple conclusions, sets, multisets, or sequences of formulas in antecedent or succedent position).

In a very elementary setting one may consider the interplay between just a single sentential negation, \(\osim\), and the derivability relation, \(\vdash\), as well as single antecedents and single conclusions. The following inferential principles are stated as proper rules with one derivability statement (sequent) or two such statements as assumption sequent(s) and a single sequent as the conclusion, or as axiomatic sequents without any assumption sequent:

\(\begin{align*} A \vdash B \, &/ \, \osim B \vdash \osim A & \mbox{(contraposition)}\\ A &\vdash \osim \osim A & \mbox{(double negation introduction)}\\ \osim \osim A &\vdash A & \mbox{(double negation elimination)}\\ A \vdash B, \; A \vdash \osim B \, &/ \, A \vdash \osim C & (\text{negative} \textit{ ex contradictione})\\ A \vdash B, \; A \vdash \osim B \, &/ \, A \vdash C & (\text{unrestricted }\textit{ex contradictione})\\ A \vdash \osim B \, &/\, B \vdash \osim A & \mbox{(constructive contraposition)}\\ \osim A \vdash B \, &/ \, \osim B \vdash A & \mbox{(classical contraposition) } \end{align*}\)

The first rule, contraposition, for instance, says that if \(B\) is derivable from \(A\), then the negation of \(A\) is derivable from the negation of \(B\). All these rules and derivability statements are valid in classical logic (see the entry on classical logic); classical logic cannot distinguish between them. Some of these principles have been criticized and called into question in non-classical logic. The unrestricted and the negative ex contradictione rules, for example, introduce an element of irrelevancy because they allow to derive a completely arbitrary formula \(C\), respectively a completely arbitrary negated formula \(\osim C\), from an assumption \(A\) if a formula \(B\) as well as its negation \(\osim B\) are derivable from \(A\), see the entries on relevance logic and paraconsistent logic. Classical contraposition has been criticized because it gives rise to non-constructive existence proofs in languages containing the existential quantifier, see the entry on intuitionistic logic. In richer vocabularies, additional negation principles can be formulated, regimenting the interaction between negation and other logical operations. Prominent examples are the De Morgan Laws. In languages without implication, one may consider the following sequents stating De Morgan inference rules:

\(\begin{align} (\osim A \vee \osim B) &\vdash \osim (A \wedge B)\\ \osim (A \vee B) &\vdash (\osim A \wedge \osim B)\\ (\osim A \wedge \osim B) &\vdash \osim (A \vee B)\\ \osim (A \wedge B) &\vdash (\osim A \vee \osim B)\\ \end{align}\)

Whereas classical logic validates all of these rules, intuitionistic logic validates only the first three of them.

The proof-theoretical characterization of negation is important for the use of negation connectives in derivations. To obtain a more comprehensive understanding of negation, however, the proof theory has to be supplemented by a semantics. We first consider truth tables.

2.1 Negation as a truth function

In classical logic, the semantic principle of bivalence is assumed, saying that a formula has exactly one of two semantic values, namely either the value T[rue] or the value F[alse] (1 or 0), but not both. Negation, \(\osim \), is semantically characterized by the unary function \(f_{\osim }\) on the set \(\{1, 0\}\), defined by the following truth table:

\[ \begin{array}{c|c} f_{\osim } & \\ \hline 1 & 0 \\ 0 & 1 \end{array} \]

That is, if \(A\) is a formula, then \(\osim A\) is false if \(A\) is true, and \(\osim A\) is true if \(A\) is false. The function \(f_{\osim }\) is said to be a truth function because it is a function defined on the set of classical truth values \(\{1, 0\}\), see the entry on truth values.

If negation is meant to express semantic opposition, it is clear that the remaining two-valued unary truth functions fail to characterize any plausible notion of semantic opposition between \(A\) and \(\osim A\):

\[ \begin{array}{ccc} \begin{array}{c|c} f_{\textit{id}} & \\ \hline 1 & 1 \\ 0 & 0 \end{array} & \quad \begin{array}{c|c} f_{\top} & \\ \hline 1 & 1 \\ 0 & 1 \\ \end{array} & \quad \begin{array}{c|c} f_{\perp} & \\ \hline 1 & 0 \\ 0 & 0 \end{array} \end{array} \]

However, if a distinction is already drawn between contradictory-forming and contrary-forming sentential negations, the ground is prepared for a pluralism with respect to negation seen as a unary connective. One might think of obtaining different concepts of negation by letting the negations interact with other logical operations in various ways, but this does not help concerning atomic formulas that do not contain any logical operation.

There are several ways of generalizing the semantics and making room for additional sentential negations. One comes with giving up bivalence and admitting sets of truth values (truth degrees) with more than two elements, see the entry on many-valued logic. In the so-called Łukasiewicz many-valued logics Ł\(_{\aleph_{1}}\), Ł\(_{\aleph_{o}}\), and Ł\(_n\), the set of values is either the whole real unit interval [0,1], or the whole rational unit interval [0,1], or the finite set of rational numbers \(\{ 0, \frac{1}{n-1}, \frac{2}{n-1}, \ldots, 1 \}\). These sets include 1 as the designated value representing True, where the designated values of a many-valued logic are the values that are preserved in valid inferences. Łukasiewicz negation \(\osim \) is defined by setting \(f_{\osim }(u) = 1- u\). Negation is thus understood in terms of subtraction from the numerical representation of True. In so-called Gödel many-valued logics, the truth function \(f_{\osim }\) for negation \(\osim \) is defined by setting \(f_{\osim }(u) = 1\) if \(u = 0\), and \(f_{\osim }(u) = 0\) if \(u \not = 0\). Here negation is understood in terms of the numerical representation of True and distinctness from the numerical representation of False.

In Kleene’s (strong) three-valued logic K3, with \(i\) as a third value in addition to 0 and 1, the truth function \(f_{\osim }\) for negation \(\osim \) is defined by the same table as the table for negation in Ł\(_3\), replacing \(\frac{1}{2}\) by \(i\):

\[ \begin{array}{c|c} f\osim & \\ \hline 1 & 0 \\ i & i \\ 0 & 1 \\ \end{array} \]

In K3 and Ł\(_3\) a formula \(A\) and its negation \(\osim A\) cannot both be true in the sense of both taking the designated value 1, but they both fail to be true if \(A\) receives the value \(i\), respectively \(\frac{1}{2}\). If a contrary pair of formulas is defined as a pair of formulas that cannot both be true but may both fail to be true, then Kleene negation gives rise to contrary pairs.

Also, falsity (understood as receiving the value 0) and non-truth (understood as taking a value different from 1) fall apart in K3. As a result, contraposition fails in K3. Another example of a logic with a non-contraposable negation is Priest’s Logic of Paradox, LP, where negation is interpreted by \(f\osim \) and both \(i\) and 1 are designated values, see the entry on paraconsistent logic. If in K3 or in LP an implication \((A \supset B)\) is defined as material implication \((\osim A \vee B)\), then contraposition holds in the sense that \((A \supset B)\) entails \((\osim B \supset \osim A)\).

If we think of negation in K3 as representing a natural language negation, K3’s “internal”, presupposition-preserving negation \(\osim \) differs from the external, presupposition-cancelling negation \(\neg\) in Bochvar’s three-valued logic B3 by always returning a classical value. The truth function \(f_{\neg}\) is defined by the following table:

\[ \begin{array}{c|c} f_{\neg} & \\ \hline 1 & 0 \\ i & 1 \\ 0 & 1 \\ \end{array} \]

It is also possible to use the machinery of possible worlds models to semantically define various notions of negation. Negation is then treated as a modal operator.

2.2 Negation as a modal operator

Since modal operators are unary connectives and since there exist different notions of alethic necessity (necessary truth) and alethic possibility (possible truth), a rather natural question then is whether negations can be analyzed in a revealing way as modal operators, see the entry on modal logic.

Very well-known modal logics are the normal modal logics that have a so-called possible worlds semantics making use of a two-place relation between possible worlds. Slightly less known are the classical (or congruential) modal logics (Segerberg 1971, Chellas 1980, Pacuit 2017). The weakest requirement imposed on a necessity-like modal operator \(\Box\) in systems of classical modal logic is the congruence property: \[ \mathord{\vdash A \leftrightarrow B} \slashrel \mathord{\vdash \Box A \leftrightarrow \Box B}\] (“if \(A \leftrightarrow B\) is provable, then so is \(\Box A \leftrightarrow \Box B\)”). This property, however, is certainly not distinctive of negation.

Classical modal logics have a semantics in terms of so-called minimal models, also known as neighbourhood models. A neighbourhood model is a structure \(\cal M\) \(=\) \((W, N, v)\), where \(W\) is a non-empty set of possible worlds, \(N\) is a function assigning to every \(w\) from \(W\) a set \(N(w)\) of subsets of \(W\), called neighbourhoods of \(w\), and \(v\) is a valuation function mapping atomic formulas to the set of worlds where they are true. Let \(\llbracket A\rrbracket\) be the set of worlds at which formula \(A\) is true. Then \( \Box A\) is defined to be true at a world \(w\) in model \(\cal M\) (in symbols: \({\cal M}, w \models \Box A\)) iff \(\llbracket A\rrbracket \in N(w)\).

In Ripley 2009 it is suggested to use the neighbourhood semantics as a general framework for semantically capturing properties characteristic of negation connectives interpreted as a necessity operator \( \Box \), see also Yu 2010. Ripley points out, for example, that the contraposition rule \[ A \vdash B \slashrel \Box B \vdash \Box A\] is valid in a neighbourhood model \((W, N, v)\) iff for every \(w \in W\), \(N(w)\) is closed under subsets, i.e., if \(X \in N(w)\) and \(Y \subseteq X\), then \(Y \in N(w)\). It would be nice to have a convincing intuitive understanding of the neighbourhood function \(N\) in terms of a concept that explains some core aspects of negation. If \(\llbracket A\rrbracket \in N(w)\) is understood as saying that the proposition expressed by \(A\) is incompatible with world \(w\), then the above constraint emerges as reasonable because it says that if the set of worlds (the proposition) \(X\) is incompatible with \(w\) and proposition \(Y\) implies \(X\), then \(Y\) is incompatible with \(w\) as well. Whereas Ripley starts with a positive notion (\({\cal M}, w \models \Box A\) iff \(\llbracket A\rrbracket \in N(w)\)), in order to introduce a negation \(\osim \), one may also stipulate that \({\cal M}, w \models \osim A\) iff \(\llbracket A\rrbracket \not \in N(w)\), so as to obtain a connective that is more overtly a negative impossibility operator (although it is the clause for \(\Box A\) that is classically negated). The idea is that \(N(w)\) contains the sets of worlds compatible with \(w\), so that \(\llbracket A\rrbracket \not \in N(w)\) indicates that the proposition expressed by \(A\) is incompatible with \(w\). Negation as an “unnecessity” operator \(\neg\) in the sense of (“possibly not”) is then defined by \({\cal M}, w \models \neg A\) iff \(\overline{\llbracket A\rrbracket} \in N(w)\), where \(\overline{\llbracket A\rrbracket}\) is the complement of \(\llbracket A\rrbracket\) with respect to \(W\). As a result, \(\neg A\) is true at a state \(w\) iff the complement of the proposition expressed by \(A\) is compatible with \(w\).

This semantics validates respective versions of congruence (\(\mathord{\vdash A \leftrightarrow B} \slashrel \mathord{\vdash \osim A \leftrightarrow \osim B}\) and \(\mathord{\vdash A \leftrightarrow B} \slashrel \mathord{\vdash \neg A \leftrightarrow \neg B}\)), but it does not yet impose any interesting constraints on negation. In order to exclude that for some world \(w\) and formula \(A\), both \(w \in \llbracket A\rrbracket\) and \(w \in \llbracket \osim A\rrbracket\), one has to stipulate that for every set of worlds \(X\), if \(w \in X\) then \(X \in N(w)\), which makes sense under the compatibility reading of the neighbourhood function \(N\) because it says that if \(X\) is true at \(w\), then \(X\) is compatible with \(w\). In order to validate contraposition, it has to be required that if \(X \subseteq Y\), then \(\{w\mid Y \not \in N(w)\}\) \(\subseteq\) \(\{w\mid X \not \in N(w)\}\). Under the compatibility reading of \(N\) this condition says that every world \(Y\) is incompatible with is also a world \(X\) is incompatible with, if proposition \(X\) implies proposition \(Y\). Similar conditions can be imposed for the dual negation that requires complementation.

The relational semantics of normal modal logics, however, does come with a commitment to a substantial property of negation understood as impossibility or as unnecessity. The analysis of negation as a normal impossibility operator can be traced back to work by Birkhoff and von Neumann (1936) and Goldblatt (1974) on negation in quantum logic. It has been developed by Vakarelov (1977, 1989b) and Došen (1984, 1986, 1999) and has been further investigated in the algebraic setting of Michael Dunn’s gaggle theory (see Bimbó and Dunn 2008) by Dunn (1993, 1996, 1999) and Dunn and Zhou (2005). A relational model (or Kripke model) is a structure \(\cal M\) \(=\) \((W, R, v)\), where \(W\) is a non-empty set of information states, \(R\) is a two-place “accessibility” relation on \(W\), and \(v\) is a valuation function. Dunn denotes the accessibility relation by \(\bot\) (pronounced “perp”) and regards it as a relation of incompatibility or orthogonality between states. Negation as impossibility, denoted by \(\osim \), is then semantically defined by postulating that \(\osim A\) is true at a state \(w\) in model \(\cal M\) iff \(w\) is incompatible with all states \(u\) (from \(W\)) at which \(A\) is true: \({\cal M}, w \models \osim A\) iff (for every \(u\): \({\cal M}, u \models A \mbox{ implies } w \bot u).\) Alternatively, the relation \(R\) may be understood as a relation of compatibility between states, denoted by \(C\). \({\cal M}, w \models \osim A\) is then defined by requiring that for every \(u\): \(wCu \mbox{ implies } {\cal M}, u \not \models A.\) Negation as unnecessity, denoted by \(\neg\), is accordingly defined by the following clause: \({\cal M}, w \models \neg A\) iff (there exists \(u\) with \(wCu \mbox{ and } {\cal M}, u \not \models A)\).

It proves useful to enrich the above relational semantics by another binary relation \(\leq\) on the set of states \(W\). The relation \(\leq\) is assumed to be a partial order (i.e., it is reflexive, transitive and anti-symmetric), which allows one to think of it as a relation of possible expansion of information states. With such a reading it is natural to assume that the truth of atomic formulas \(p\) is persistent with respect to \(\leq\): if \(w \leq u\) and \({\cal M},w \models p\), then \({\cal M},u \models p.\) The conditions on \(\leq\) and \(C\) and the truth conditions for compound formulas should then be such that persistence (also called heredity) holds for arbitrary formulas, in particular for negated formulas \(\osim A\) if negation as impossibility is considered. A compatibility model is a structure \((W,C,\leq, v)\), where \((W,C,v)\) is a Kripke model, \(\leq\) is a partial order on \(W\), and the following condition is satisfied, which guarantees the heredity of negated formulas \(\osim A\): if \(wCu\), \(w' \leq w\), and \(u' \leq u\), then \(w'Cu'\). This condition is a constraint on the compatibility frame \((W,C,\leq)\) on which a model \((W,C,\leq,v)\) is based. The condition is not only useful (as will become clear), but also plausible, because it says that two information states, expansions of which are compatible, are themselves compatible.

We can now define that a sequent \(A \vdash B\) is valid in a compatibility model iff for every state \(w\) from that model, if \(A\) is true at \(w\), then so is \(B\); \(A \vdash B\) is called valid on a compatibility frame iff \(A \vdash B\) is valid in every model based on that frame. A rule is valid on a frame iff the validity of the premises sequents on that frame guarantees the validity of the conclusion sequent on the frame. The contraposition rule from the list (21) is valid on any compatibility frame. If the order-inversion expressed by contraposition is seen as a fundamental property of negation, a hierarchy of stronger negations can be obtained syntactically by postulating further principles and semantically by characterizing these principles by means of conditions on compatibility frames \((W, C, \leq)\), or relational frames \((W, C)\). This line of thought has led from a “kite” of negations in Dunn 1993 to “lopsided kites” of negations and an extended kite of negations in Shramko 2005, Dunn and Zhou 2005, see also Onishi 2015.

A note on terminology. In Dunn 1993, a negation operation validating the contraposition rule is called subminimal. The term “subminimal negation” had been used by Allen Hazen in an unpublished paper from 1992 for a richer language containing negation, conjunction, disjunction, and intuitionistic implication to denote a negation that fails to validate the intuitionistically valid De Morgan sequent \((\osim A \wedge \osim B) \vdash \osim (A \vee B)\) and the classically but not intuitionistically valid \(\osim (A \wedge B) \vdash (\osim A \vee \osim B)\). Dunn’s use of the term “subminimal” is thus different from Hazen’s. In Dunn and Zhou 2005 only a single negation as impossibility is used, the vocabulary is enriched by conjunction and disjunction, and in both, the one with negation, conjunction, and disjunction as well as the one with negation only, subminimal negations are referred to as preminimal negations. Moreover, the minimal negations from Dunn 1993, 1996 are called quasi-minimal in Dunn and Zhou 2005 because they lack negative ex contradictione, a property of negation in what is usually called (Johansson’s) minimal logic, see Kolmogorov 1925 and Johansson 1937. In Vakarelov 2005, the term “subminimal negation” is used to denote a negation weaker than Kolmogorov and Johansson’s minimal negation. Vakarelov introduces his subminimal negation in combination with David Nelson’s strong negation (see below) in a language that contains a truth constant \(\top\), which is definable in minimal logic. Vakarelov’s subminimal negation, \(\neg\), validates the contraposition rule but fails to validate \(\neg \neg \top\). Colacito, de Jongh, and Vargas 2017 define a system called “subminimal logic”, see also Niki (forthcoming). Their subminimal negation is added to the language of positive intuitionistic logic and thus, in particular, contains intuitionistic implication. The basic subminimal logic is obtained from positive intuitionistic propositional logic by adding the congruence axiom scheme \((A \leftrightarrow B ) \rightarrow (\neg A \leftrightarrow \neg B)\). We shall come back to subminimal negation in subminimal logic in Section 2.3.

If the compatibility relation is not assumed to be symmetric (although it may be argued that compatibility between states is a symmetrical relation), then one may distinguish between two negation operations \(\osim _1\) and \(\osim _2\) such that that \(\osim _1 A\) is true at a state \(w\) just in case \(A\) fails to be true at every state compatible with \(w\), and \(\osim _2 A\) is true at a state \(w\) just in case \(A\) fails to be true at every state \(w\) is compatible with:

\[ \begin{align}{\cal M}, w &\models \osim _1 A \mbox{ iff } \forall u (wCu \mbox{ implies } {\cal M}, u \not \models A);\\ {\cal M}, w &\models \osim _2 A \mbox{ iff } \forall u (uCw \mbox{ implies } {\cal M}, u \not \models A). \end{align}\]

The two negations form a so-called Galois connection, which means that \(A \vdash \osim _1 B \mbox{ iff } B \vdash \osim _2 A.\) The negations \(\osim _1\) and \(\osim _2\) are called Galois negations or split negations; they are both preminimal negations and satisfy the following interaction principles: \(A \vdash \osim _1 \osim _2 A\); \(A \vdash \osim _2 \osim _1 A.\) A discussion of split negation can be found in Wansing 2016b.

As noted in Dunn 1993, 1996, if contraposition is assumed, double negation introduction \(A \vdash \osim \osim A\) is mutually derivable with constructive contraposition \(A \vdash \osim B \slashrel B \vdash \osim A\), and if constructive contraposition is assumed, double negation elimination is mutually derivable with classical contraposition \(\osim A \vdash B \slashrel \osim B \vdash A\). Note also that in the presence of double negation introduction and elimination, one can derive \(\osim A \vdash \osim B \, / \, B \vdash A\). The demonstrations use only reflexivity and transitivity of the derivability relation \(\vdash\). As a result, the above list of negation laws leads to the following unbalanced “kite” of negations (cf. Dunn and Zhou 2005):

[a diagram of 6 points, 5 connected with lines in a loose pentagon and one below connected by a line to the pentagon. The points are labeled in clockwise order: 'De Morgan \sim \sim A \vdash A', 'ortho', 'intuitionistic A \vdash B, A \vdash \sim B/A \vdash C', 'minimal A \vdash B, A \vdash \sim B/A \vdash \sim C', 'quasi-minimal A \vdash \sim B/B \vdash \sim A', and the solo point connected to the last is labeled 'preminimal A \vdash B/\sim B \vdash \sim A'.]

Figure 3

The graphical arrangement in this diagram is to be understood as follows: If a sequent or sequent rule is assigned to a node \(n\) and node \(n'\) is placed below \(n\), then the sequent or sequent rule assigned to \(n'\) is derivable with the aid of the sequent or sequent rule assigned to \(n\).

Ortho negations satisfy all principles shown in the lopsided kite. An ortho negation in a logic with conjunction distributing over disjunction (or, equivalently, disjunction distributing over conjunction), is called a Boolean or classical negation. Boolean negation is uniquely determined in the sense that if \(\osim _1\) and \(\osim _2\) are Boolean negations, then \(\osim _1 A\) and \(\osim _2 A\) are interderivable; ortho negation is not uniquely determined, see Restall 2000, and for the uniqueness of connectives Humberstone 2011 and the entry on sentence connectives in formal logic.

The negation principles of Dunn and Zhou’s lopsided kite correspond in the sense of modal correspondence theory to properties of compatibility frames. A rule \(r\) corresponds to a property \(E\) iff the rule \(r\) is valid on a compatibility frame just in case the frame satisfies \(E\). Greg Restall (2000) observed that double negation elimination corresponds to a property of both \(C\) and the relation of possible expansion of information states \(\leq\), the other negation principles have been shown to correspond to properties only of the compatibility relation \(C\), see Dunn 1996, Dunn and Zhou 2005, Berto 2014. In the following list, “&” denotes conjunction, “\(\Rightarrow\)” denotes Boolean implication, and “\(\forall\)” and “\(\exists\)” refer to universal and existential quantification, respectively, in the metalanguage:

\[ \begin{align} A \vdash \osim \osim A & & \forall x \forall y (xCy \Rightarrow yCx) \\ A \vdash B, \; A \vdash \osim B &/ A \vdash \osim C &\forall x \forall y (xCy \Rightarrow xCx) \\ A \vdash B, \; A \vdash \osim B &/ A \vdash C &\forall x (xCx), \forall x \forall y (xCy \Rightarrow yCx)\\ \osim \osim A \vdash A & & \forall x \exists y(xCy \amp \forall z(yCz \Rightarrow z \leq x)) \end{align} \]

The following first-order property of \(C\) alone also corresponds to double negation elimination: \[ \forall x \exists y (xCy \amp \forall z(yCz \Rightarrow (z = x))).\]

We may observe that Dunn and Zhou’s lopsided kite of negations can be equilibrated, for example, by inserting the sequent schema \(\osim \osim \osim A \vdash \osim A\). This schema corresponds to the following first-order condition on \(C\) (as calculated with the help of the SQEMA algorithm for computing first-order correspondences in modal logic due to Georgiev, Tinchev, and Vakarelov (see Other Internet Resources): \[ \forall x \forall y (xCy \Rightarrow \exists z (xCz \amp \forall u (zCu \Rightarrow uCy))).\]

[a diagram of 7 points, 6 connected with lines in a hexagon and one below connected by a line to the hexagon. The points are labeled in clockwise order: 'weak De Morgan \sim\sim\sim A \vdash \sim A', 'De Morgan \sim \sim A \vdash A', 'ortho', 'intuitionistic A \vdash B, A \vdash \sim B/A \vdash C', 'minimal A \vdash B, A \vdash \sim B/A \vdash \sim C', 'quasi-minimal A \vdash \sim B/B \vdash \sim A', and the solo point connected to the last is labeled 'preminimal A \vdash B/\sim B \vdash \sim A'.]

Figure 4

Negation as unnecessity gives rise to a dual lopsided kite of negations that can be combined with the lopsided kite into a “united” kite of negations, see Shramko 2005, Dunn and Zhou 2005, and Section 2.4. An even richer inclusion diagram of negations can be found in Ripley 2009.

Whilst satisfying the contraposition rule \(A \vdash B \slashrel \osim B \vdash \osim A\) is a basic property of negation as a normal impossibility operator, there exist unary connectives that are referred to as negations, although they do not satisfy contraposition. Prominent examples of logics with a non-contraposable negation in addition to the already mentioned logics K3, Ł\(_3\), and LP, are Nelson’s logics N3, N4, and N4\(^{\bot}\) of constructive logic with so-called strong negation (see Nelson 1949; Gurevich 1977; Almukdad and Nelson 1984; Wansing 1993, 2001; Dunn 2000; Odintsov 2008). These logics contain intuitionistic implication as a primitive connective. Nelson (1959), however, also considers a variant of N3 with a contraposable strong negation. In this system S, the contraction axiom

\[ (A \rightarrow (A \rightarrow B))\rightarrow (A \rightarrow B)\]

is replaced by

\[ (A \rightarrow (A \rightarrow (A \rightarrow B))) \rightarrow (A \rightarrow (A \rightarrow B)).\]

This replacement avoids a collapse into classical logic. Strong negation is called “strong” because it captures a notion of negation as definite falsity and because in the system N3 the strong negation of a formula entails its intuitionistic negation. The conjunction, disjunction, and strong negation fragment of N4 coincides with the logic of first-degree entailment FDE, also known as Dunn and Belnap’s useful four-valued logic (Belnap 1977a,b; Dunn 1976; Omori and Wansing 2017). Interestingly, contraposition as stated above holds for FDE, whereas it fails in FDE for multiple-premise sequents (see Problem 7, Section 8.10, p. 162 in Priest 2008).

The system FDE is a well-known system of relevance logic (see the entry on relevance logic) and it shares with other relevance logics the property of being a paraconsistent logic, see the entry on paraconsistent logic. Paraconsistent logics fail to satisfy the unrestricted ex contradictione rule, which is usually presented in a multiple-antecedent framework by the sequent: \[ A, \osim A \vdash B.\]

Logics that do not satisfy the negative ex contradictione rule are paraconsistent in a stricter sense. Double negation elimination and classical contraposition fail to be valid in intuitionistic logic (see the entry on intuitionistic logic); if one of them is added to an axiom system of intuitionistic logic, one obtains a proof system for classical logic.

Now, is negation a normal modal operator of impossibility or unneccessity? According to Berto (2014), the meaning of negation is grounded in the notion of compatibility, together with its opposite concept of incompatibility. Moreover, Berto takes compatibility and incompatibility to be symmetric relations and, as a result, holds that nothing can be justifiably called a negation if it does not satisfy the contraposition rule and the double negation introduction rule. According to Berto and Restall (2019), “because incompatibility is modal, negation is a modal operator as well.” This view is contentious, in light of non-contraposable negations in systems such as Ł3, K3, LP, and N4, and it has been argued by De and Omori 2018 that there is more to negation than modality.

2.3 Interactions with negation

As already remarked, the classification of unary connectives as negations may depend on the presence or absence of other logical operations. If the propositional language to which a negation operation is added contains only conjunction and disjunction (and atomic formulas), a natural starting point is to assume that one is dealing with a so-called distributive lattice logic (cf. Dunn and Zhou 2005). A distributive lattice logic is a single-antecedent and single-conclusion proof system in the language with only conjunction \(\wedge\) and disjunction \(\vee\). In addition to reflexivity and transitivity of the derivability relation \(\vdash\), the following inferential schemata are assumed:

  • \(A \wedge B \vdash A\), \(A \wedge B \vdash B\),
  • \(A \vdash B\), \(A \vdash C\) / \(A \vdash (B \wedge C)\),
  • \(A \vdash C\), \(B \vdash C\) / \((A \vee B) \vdash C\),
  • \(A \vdash (A \vee B)\), \(B \vdash (A \vee B)\),
  • \((A \wedge (B \vee C)) \vdash ((A \wedge B) \vee (A \wedge C))\).

In this extended vocabulary one may consider further negation principles, in particular the De Morgan inference rules from (22):

\[ \begin{align} (\osim A \vee \osim B) &\vdash \osim (A \wedge B)\\ \osim (A \vee B) &\vdash (\osim A \wedge \osim B)\\ (\osim A \wedge \osim B) &\vdash \osim (A \vee B)\\ \osim (A \wedge B) &\vdash (\osim A \vee \osim B)\\ \end{align}\]

The first three De Morgan rules are valid on any compatibility frame if the standard evaluation clauses for \(\wedge\) and \(\vee\) are assumed, and they can be proved utilizing standard inference rules for \(\wedge\) and \(\vee\) (cf. Restall 2000). (The first two De Morgan rules are valid on any compatibility frame also if negation as impossibility, \(\osim\), is replaced by negation as unnecessity, \(\neg\).) Whereas the first two De Morgan laws, however, can be proved using only contraposition and inference rules for \(\wedge\) and \(\vee\), a derivation of the third De Morgan law requires the application of constructive contraposition:

\[ \begin{array}{c} \begin{array}{cc} \begin{array}{c} (\osim A \wedge \osim B) \vdash (\osim A \wedge \osim B) \\ \hline (\osim A \wedge \osim B) \vdash \osim A \\ \hline A \vdash \osim (\osim A \wedge \osim B) \end{array} & \begin{array}{c} (\osim A \wedge \osim B) \vdash (\osim A \wedge \osim B) \\ \hline (\osim A \wedge \osim B) \vdash \osim B \\ \hline B \vdash \osim (\osim A \wedge \osim B) \end{array} \end{array} \\ \hline \begin{array}{c} (A \vee B) \vdash \osim (\osim A \wedge \osim B) \\ \hline (\osim A \wedge \osim B) \vdash \osim (A \vee B)\\ \end{array} \end{array} \]

The proof system for preminimal negation in the extended language given by the rules for distributive lattice logic together with contraposition is incomplete, and a complete proof system is obtained if \((\osim A \wedge \osim B) \vdash \osim (A \vee B)\) is added (cf. Dunn and Zhou 2005 for the language with constants \(\top\) and \(\bot\) added). The remaining fourth De Morgan law is provable in the presence of double negation elimination. The following derivation makes use of both double negation elimination and classical contraposition (cf. Restall 2000):

\[ \begin{array}{c} \begin{array}{cc} \begin{array}{c} \osim A \vdash \osim A \\ \hline \osim A \vdash (\osim A \vee \osim B) \\ \hline \osim (\osim A \vee \osim B) \vdash A \end{array} & \begin{array}{c} \osim B \vdash \osim B \\ \hline \osim B \vdash (\osim A \vee \osim B) \\ \hline \osim (\osim A \vee \osim B) \vdash B \end{array} \end{array} \\ \hline \begin{array}{c} \osim (\osim A \vee \osim B) \vdash (A \wedge B) \\ \hline \osim (A \wedge B) \vdash (\osim A \vee \osim B) \end{array} \end{array} \]

Restall (2000) showed that \(\osim (A \wedge B) \vdash (\osim A \vee \osim B)\) corresponds to the mixed frame condition \[ \forall x \forall y_1 \forall y_2 ((xCy_1 \amp xCy_2) \Rightarrow \exists z (y_1 \leq z \amp y_ 2 \leq z \amp xCz)).\]

The algorithm SQEMA outputs the following first-order condition for \(\osim (A \wedge B) \vdash (\osim A \vee \osim B)\) in terms of \(C\) alone: \(\forall x \forall y \forall z ((xCy \amp xCz) \Rightarrow ((y =z)\amp xCy))\), which is equivalent to: \[ \forall x \forall y \forall z ((xCy \amp xCz) \Rightarrow (y =z)),\] implying that \(C\) is a function if \(C\) is serial. For functional frames, negation as impossibility and negation as unnecessity coincide.

In the extended language, negative ex contradictione can be stated as \((A \wedge \osim A) \vdash \osim B\) and unrestricted ex contraditione as \((A \wedge \osim A) \vdash B\). It is also natural to assume a constantly true formula \(\top\) and a constantly untrue formula \(\bot\), so that the following sequents are valid: \(A\vdash \top\), \(\bot\vdash A\), and \(\top \vdash \osim \bot\). (With negation as unnecessity, \(\neg \top \vdash \bot\) is valid.) Whereas these sequents are indeed valid on any compatibility frame, the equally natural \(\osim \top \vdash \bot\) (as well as \(\top \vdash \neg \bot\)) corresponds with the seriality of \(C \mathrel{:} \forall x \exists y (xCy)\). In the extended vocabulary, unrestricted ex contradictione can be stated as \((A \wedge \osim A) \vdash \bot\), and in this form it is characterized by the reflexivity of the compatibility relation. The law of excluded middle \(\top \vdash (A \vee \osim A)\) corresponds to the mixed condition \(\forall x \forall y(xCy \Rightarrow y \leq x)\) but also to \(\forall x \forall y (xCy \Rightarrow (x =y))\).

The correspondence theory of negation as impossibility and negation as unnecessity in a language with \(\top\), \(\bot\), \(\wedge\), and \(\vee\) has been developed in Lahav, Marcos, and Zohar 2017, using methods of the theory of basic sequent systems from Lahav and Avron 2013 in order to obtain various cut-admissibility results. Moreover, Lahav and his co-authors also consider the addition of so-called adjustment operators and the definability of classical negation.

Another interesting classification of negation operators arises if it is assumed that the language under consideration contains a primitive implication connective, \(\rightarrow\), that is not defined by putting \((A \rightarrow B) \coloneq (\osim A \vee B)\), or a primitive so-called co-implication (or subtraction) operation, \(\coimp\), not defined by putting \((A \coimp B) \coloneq (A \wedge \osim B)\), or both. The standard understanding of negated implications is conveyed by the equivalence \(\osim (A \rightarrow B) \leftrightarrow (A \wedge \osim B)\). Dually, the classical reading of negated co-implications is expressed by \(\osim (A \coimp B) \leftrightarrow (\osim A \vee B)\). Co-implication is the dual of implication, insofar as it stands to disjunction as implication stands to conjunction:

\(\begin{align} (A \wedge B) \vdash C &\mbox{ iff } A \vdash (B\rightarrow C) \mbox{ iff } B \vdash (A \rightarrow C),\\ C \vdash (A \vee B) &\mbox{ iff } (C \coimp B) \vdash A \mbox{ iff } (C \coimp A) \vdash B. \end{align}\)

A formula \((A \coimp B)\) may be read as “\(B\) co-implies \(A\)” or as “\(A\) excludes \(B\)”. If implication and co-implication are primitive and not defined as in classical logic (and some other logics), further readings of negated implications and co-implications are given by the following equivalences:

\(\begin{align}\osim (A \rightarrow B) &\leftrightarrow (A \coimp B),\\ \osim (A \coimp B) &\leftrightarrow (A \rightarrow B),\\ \osim (A \rightarrow B) &\leftrightarrow (\osim B \coimp \osim A),\\ \osim (A \coimp B) &\leftrightarrow (\osim B \rightarrow \osim A). \end{align}\)

In the literature, however, one may also find a less-standard reading of negated implications (and consequently also a corresponding non-standard understanding of negated co-implications). This unusual reading of negated implications is usually tracked back to Aristotle and Boethius, and is referred to as the connexive version of (negated) implications (cf. Wansing 2005, McCall 2012 and the connexive logic entry). Equivalences characteristic of connexive implication and co-implication are:

\(\osim (A \rightarrow B) \leftrightarrow (A \rightarrow \osim B)\), \(\osim (A \coimp B) \leftrightarrow (\osim A \coimp B)\).

The preceding typology of negated implications and co-implications has been developed in Wansing 2008, and one might add to this list the equivalences \(\osim (A \rightarrow B) \leftrightarrow (B \rightarrow \osim A)\) and \(\osim (A \coimp B) \leftrightarrow (\osim B \coimp A)\).

The constructive implication of positive intuitionistic logic is present in the systems with subminimal negation from Colacito, De Jongh, and Vargas 2017. They also treat negation as a kind of modal operator by considering frames \((W, R, N)\), where \((W, R)\) is a relational frame, \(R\) is a partial order on \(W\), and \(N\) is a unary function on the set of all upwards closed subsets of \(W\) (i.e., the set of all \(X \subseteq W\) such that if \(w \in X\) and \(wRu\), then \(u \in X\)). A model is obtained by adding to a frame a valuation function that is persistent for atomic formulas. Moreover, the following condition is imposed on the function \(N\):

\[\tag{*} \mbox{for every } w\in W\!: w\in N(X) \mbox{ iff } w \in N(X \cap \{u \mid wRu\}). \]

The truth conditions of negated formulas \(\neg A\) and implications \((A \rightarrow B)\) at a state \(w\) in a model M are then given as follows:

\[\begin{array}{lcl} M, w \models \neg A & \mbox{ iff } & w \in N{\llbracket A\rrbracket} \\ M, w \models (A \rightarrow B) & \mbox{ iff } & \mbox{for every } u\in W\!: \\ & &\; wRu \mbox{ implies } (M,u \not \models A \mbox{ or } M,u \models B). \end{array} \]

The basic subminimal logic N characterized by the class of all frames can be presented as the extension of the standard axiomatization of positive intuitionistic logic by the congruence axiom scheme \( (A \leftrightarrow B ) \rightarrow (\neg A \leftrightarrow \neg B)\). The validity of that axiom (its truth at every state of every model) is guaranteed by condition (*), but it is not distinctive of negation. The following additional schematic axioms are considered in Colacito, De Jongh, and Vargas 2017:

  • \((A \rightarrow \neg A) \rightarrow \neg A\),
  • \((A \rightarrow B) \rightarrow (\neg B \rightarrow \neg A)\),
  • \((A \wedge \neg A) \rightarrow \neg B \),
  • \(\neg \neg A \rightarrow A \),
  • \(\neg (A \wedge B) \rightarrow (\neg A \vee \neg B) \),

and it is shown that the logic obtained by adding the contraposition axiom \((A \rightarrow B) \rightarrow (\neg B \rightarrow \neg A)\) is characterized by the class of all frames that satisfy for all upwards closed sets \(X, X'\): if \(X \subseteq X'\) then \(N(X') \subseteq N(X)\). Moreover, it is shown that the negative ex contradictione axiom \((A \wedge \neg A) \rightarrow \neg B \) corresponds with the following frame property: \(\forall X \forall X' (X \cap N(X) \subseteq N(X'))\).

Once there is more than just a single negation connective available, the interplay between these operations can be considered. Although classical and intuitionistic logic as well as the familiar systems of modal logic comprise only one negation operation, there are also very naturally arising logical systems with more than just one negation, and the motivation for taking into account multiple negations not only comes from natural language semantics but also from the field of knowledge representation, see, for instance, Wagner 1994.

A well-known example of a logic with two negation operations is Heyting-Brouwer logic, also known as bi-intuitionistic logic, see Rauszer 1980, Goré 2000. In addition to intuitionistic negation, bi-intuitionistic logic contains a so-called co-negation that is in a sense dual to intuitionistic negation. In bi-intuitionistic logic \(\top\) is definable as \((p \rightarrow p)\) and \(\bot\) as \((p \coimp p)\) for some atomic formula \(p\). The intuitionistic negation \(\osim A\) of \(A\) is then definable as \((A \rightarrow \bot\)) and the co-negation \(- A\) of \(A\) as \((\top \coimp A)\). Whereas intuitionistic negation is a forward-looking impossibility operation with respect to the information order in compatibility frames, i.e., \[ {\cal M}, w \models \osim A \mbox{ iff } \forall u (w\leq u \mbox{ implies } {\cal M}, u \not \models A),\] co-negation is a backward-looking unnecessity operator: \[ {\cal M}, w \models - A \mbox{ iff } \exists u (u \leq w \mbox{ and } {\cal M}, u \not \models A).\]

Another version of bi-intuitionistic logic, called 2Int, with a different notion of co-implication and hence co-negation has been developed in Wansing 2016a. In particular, in the semantics of 2Int a distinction is drawn between a support of truth and a support of falsity relation between states and formulas, and a state supports the truth of \(-A\) iff it supports the falsity of \(A\).

Other examples of logics with more than just one negation are provided by logics with Galois negations. Moreover, in so-called trilattice logics (cf. Shramko and Wansing 2011) a distinction is drawn between a truth negation \(\osim _t\) and a falsity negation \(\osim _f\). Whereas truth negation is interpreted by a unary algebraic operation that inverts a truth order on a set of generalized truth values (see the entry on truth values), falsity negation is interpreted by an operation inverting a falsity order on generalized truth values. Furthermore, there is an information negation \(\osim _i\) understood as an information order inversion. The three negations satisfy not only contraposition, but they are also “period two” (involutive), i.e., they satisfy the double negation law in both directions. Obviously, in such a setting various double and triple negation laws may be considered, see also Kamide and Wansing 2012. An in-depth investigation of a hierarchy of double negation principles can be found in Kamide 2013.

After examining the interplay between negation, implication, and co-implication, recent work on negation as a modal operator in display calculi, a generalization of Gentzen’s seuqent calculi, can be considered. There the above notions of negation as impossibility and unnecessity can be captured by structural sequent rules, see the supplement Substructural negations: negation as a modal operator in display calculi.

2.4 Other conceptions of negation as a unary connective

There are several other approaches to negation that build on quite different ideas of expressing semantic opposition. A meta-level conception of negation, for example, is the so-called negation as failure that has been developed in logic programming. The seminal paper Clark 1978 suggests the higher-level negation as failure rule (in a slightly irritating notation): \(\vdash \osim \vdash p \mbox{ infer } \vdash \osim p\). The idea is that \(\osim p\) may be inferred if the exhaustive search for a proof of the atomic statement \(p\) failed.

In Hintikka’s (1973) game-theoretical semantics, negation is modeled by a role-switch between two players in a semantic game (cf. the entry on logic and games). A geometrical intuition of negation as inversion can be found in a paper by Ramsey, who suggested that

[w]e might, for instance, express negation not by inserting a word “not”, but by writing what we negate upside down. Such a symbolism is only inconvenient because we are not trained to perceive complicated symmetry about a horizontal axis, and if we adopted it, we should be rid of the redundant “not-not”, for the result of negating the sentence “\(p\)” twice would be simply the sentence “\(p\)” itself. (F.P. Ramsey 1927, 161–2)

The idea of negation as the inversion of arrangements of truth values, such as truth value polygons, has been developed in Varzi and Warglien 2003, see also Shramko and Wansing 2011 for negation as order-inversion in a logic of generalized truth values.

In order to extend Dummett’s verificationism (cf., e.g., Dummett 1996) from mathematical to empirical discourse, a notion of “empirical negation” has been suggested (see De 2011, 2013). A formula \(\osim A\) is read as “\(A\) is not warranted by our current state of evidence” and it is evaluated with respect to a distinguished base state \(g\) in a model \(\cal M\): \({\cal M}, w \models \osim A\) iff \({\cal M}, g \not \models A\).

The supplement document “Additional Conceptions of Negation as a Unary Connective” briefly addresses the following approaches, where negation will be denoted as \(\neg\) (if not stated otherwise):

Negation as the Routley star
The notion of Routley star negation is more general than the notion of empirical negation. The Routley star is a unary function \(^*\) on possible worlds that delegates the semantic evaluation of a negated formula \(\neg A\) at a world or state \(w\) to the state \(w^*\): \(\neg A\) is true at a \(w\) in a model \(\cal M\) iff \(A\) is not true at \(w^*\) in \(\cal M\).
Negation as inconsistency
The notion of negation as inconsistency is based on the idea that the negation of \(A\) expresses that \(A\) implies (or allows to derive) something absurd or even something “unwanted”.
Negation as contradictoriness
The idea of negation as contradictoriness is to explicate negation by understanding \(\neg A\) as the contradictory of \(A\), where the relationship of contradiction may be defined in terms of certain logical laws, such as the Law of Excluded Middle and the Law of Non-Contradiction.
Negation as falsity
According to negation as falsity, the negation \(\neg A\) of \(A\) expresses that \(A\) is definitely false. This approach to negation is related to the view that a proof of \(\neg A\) is a direct falsification of \(A\).
Negation as cancellation
Negation as cancellation develops the idea that the content of the proposition expressed by \(\neg A\) erases or annihilates the content of the proposition expressed by \(A\).
Negation by iteration
The idea of negation by iteration is to obtain a negation by a double application of a connective called “demi-negation” in Humberstone 1995, 2000b, or “square root of negation” in quantum computational logic, \(\sqrt{{\tt not}}\), see, for recent references, Dalla Chiara, Giuntini, Leporini, and Sergioli 2018, Paoli 2019, and the entry on sentence connectives in formal logic. This clearly reminds one of the duplex negatio negat in negative concord, see Section 1.8.2.
Perfect negation
Perfect negation is a rather restrictive notion of negation that has been developed by Avron (1999, 2002) in terms of proof-theoretical as well as semantic conditions.

2.5 Negation, rejection, and denial

As already remarked, negation has been analyzed, for example, as a truth-functional operator, a modal operator, a propositional attitude, and a speech act. The exact relation between negation as a connective, the propositional attitude of rejection and, notably, the speech act of denial is contentious. There is, as a kind of orthodox view, a thesis defended by Frege (1919) and Geach (1965), namely that denying \(A\) is the same as asserting \(A\)’s negation. This view implies what Ripley (2011b, 623) calls the denial equivalence:

that to assert the negation of a content \(A\) is equivalent, in its conversational effects and commitments carried, to denying \(A\).

(Note that Parsons (1984) refers to the claim that denying \(A\) is always the same as asserting \(\osim A\) as the “Equivalence Thesis.”) There is, however, no clear syntactic restriction on speech acts of denial, as denials can be realized not only by assertions of negated sentences but, for example, also by means of irony. Moreover, whereas negated sentences can be embedded into compound sentences, speech acts cannot be constituents of other speech acts. Therefore, if it is held that to deny is to assert a negation, the idea is that acts of denial can be analyzed as assertions of (propositions expressed by) negated sentences. It may, for instance, be held that it is revealing to understand denials of \(A\) as assertions of \(© A\), for some contrary-forming negation operator \(©\).

But there is also a position called “rejectivism” defended by, for example, Price (1983, 1990), Smiley (1996), and Rumfitt (2000). Lloyd Humberstone (2000a: 331) characterizes rejectivism as follows:

Whether assent (“acceptance”) and dissent (“rejection”) are thought of as speech acts or as propositional attitudes, the idea of rejectivism is that a grasp of the distinction between them is prior to our understanding of negation as a sentence, this operator then being explicable as applying to \(A\) to yield something assent to which is tantamount to dissent from \(A\).

At issue is the conceptual priority of the notions of assertion and denial over the concept of negation. But if the notion of denial is conceptually prior to the concept of negation, one may wonder why negation is needed at all and how Frege’s argument that an account of negation in terms of denial does not make sense of embedded negations can be met.

As Ripley (2011b) remarks, rejectivists are typically inferentialists, i.e., they hold that the meaning of the logical operations can be explicated in terms of meaning-conveying rules. If inferentialism is developed in terms of rules for asserting and rules for denying compound formulas (as, for example, in Price 1983, 1990; Rumfitt 2000) according to Ripley (2011b), the above questions can be answered by explaining that negation is a switch between warranted assertability conditions and warranted deniability conditions. This role of negation is similar to the role strong negation in Nelson’s logics plays in turning support of truth conditions into support of falsity condition, and vice versa. Price (1990, 225) argues that

if we allow that (an utterance of) \(\osim P\) may properly be regarded both as a denial with content \(P\) and as an assertion with content \(\osim P\), then Frege’s argument is powerless; for in this case the latter reading is available to explain the contribution of \(\osim P\) to complex constructions, in the standard way.

But one may require more from the rejectivist, namely that every formula is logically equivalent to a formula in what Humberstone (2000a, Footnote 10) calls “Bendall normal form”, namely to a formula that contains at most one occurrence of the negation sign as the principal connective. According to Bendall (1979, 68), the redundancy in this sense of the embedding of a negation operator,

opens the way for an attempt to construe the meaning of negation as deriving from the mental or behavioral phenomena of judgment, disbelief, and denial.

The normal form result holds for classical propositional logic (CPL) in the connectives \(\osim\), \(\wedge\), \(\vee\), and \(\rightarrow\). As Humberstone points out, it fails for the negation, conjunction, disjunction fragment of CPL, since in classical propositional logic the Bendall normal form (bnf) of a conjunction of atomic formulas \((p \wedge \osim q)\) is \(\osim (p \rightarrow q)\). Moreover, the translation of \((\osim p \rightarrow q)\) into bnf is \((p \vee q)\), and the translation of \(\osim \osim p\) is \(p\). These pairs of formulas are not logically equivalent in intuitionistic propositional logic (IPL). The translation of \((\osim p \rightarrow \osim q)\) into bnf is \((q \rightarrow p)\), which is not logically equivalent to \((\osim p \rightarrow \osim q)\) in N3 and N4. An in-depth investigation of sequent calculi using formulas prefixed by an assertion sign [+] or a rejection sign [–], understood as non-embeddable force indicators, can be found in Bendall 1978, Humberstone 2000a.

Humberstone (2000a, 368) challenges rejectivism, by asking the rejectivists to “show how the claim for the conceptual priority of rejection over negation is any more plausible than the corresponding claim for the conceptual priority of alterjection over disjunction—or indeed, ambi-assertion over conjunction,” where alterjection (ambi-assertion) is the supposedly primitive speech act the linguistic embodiment of which is disjunction (conjunction).

Another way of repulsing the denial equivalence is to argue that denial and rejection are conceptually independent from the concept of negation. Such an independence is defended, for example in van der Sandt and Maier 2003 (Other Internet Resources) and Priest 2006, Chapter 6. As mentioned in the supplement, section 3, according to Priest negation is for the main part a contradictory-forming operator. Nevertheless, Priest believes that there exist “dialetheia”, sentences \(A\) and \(\osim A\) that are both true. In the dialetheism entry, Berto, Priest, and Weber explain that

a dialetheist manifests her dialetheism in accepting, together with the LNC [Law of Non-Contradiction], sentences that are inconsistent with it, that is, true sentences whose negations are true: dialetheias.

This view seems to preclude dialetheists from expressing disagreement concerning \(A\) as cases in which one person asserts \(A\) and another person asserts \(\osim A\). A dialetheist might assert \(\osim A\) without disagreeing with \(A\). Therefore, if the assertion of \(\osim A\) is declared to be conceptually independent from the denial of \(A\), disagreement concerning \(A\) can be represented as cases in which one person asserts \(A\) and another person denies \(A\). A critical discussion of this approach may be found in Ripley 2011b.


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