Supplement to Neo-Kantianism

Philosophy of Psychology in the Marburg School

The Marburg Neo-Kantians have a unique conception of the object of psychology and a unique conception of the method of psychology. As Natorp in particular argued in a series of works (see Natorp 1887: §§5 and 7; General Psychology According to the Critical Method [1912b]; Natorp 1905: Ch.IV), the object of psychology is the purely subjective. This conception leads to a puzzle, since for them science essentially formulates laws, and laws ground objectivity. This puzzle is solved by claiming that psychology is not a genuine science, and that psychology must proceed using a “regressive” method.

The purely subjective, for the Marburg philosophers, is not immediately given to consciousness. In keeping with their attack on the given (see section 2.2), they argue that what is available to an individual’s reflection is always already objectified. When I reflect on my own consciousness, I observe my perception of a brown table; it is a philosophical fiction that there are introspectively available, unconceptualized pure sensations of colors and shapes (Natorp 1912a: 188; Natorp 1887: 170). The subjective/objective distinction is characterized in a few interrelated ways (1887: §5). The subjective is the appearance; the objective is reality. Thus the appearance of the room from my perceptive is subjective (and different from yours), but the objective, perspective-free representation of the room in homogeneous space is real. This distinction can be characterized in terms of a law and what is subsumed under it, or as the universal and the particular subsumed under it. The objective representation of the layout of the room supplies a law that predicts all of the subjective perspectives; each perspective is then a particular subsumed under the universal perspective on the room from a given position. Understood in this way, the objective/subjective distinction becomes relative, and not absolute (Natorp 1912a: 188; Cassirer 1910: Ch.VI). What is universal in some respect (the motions of the planets in the night sky as they would appear in a star chart, which would be the same for every terrestrial observer), is revealed to be merely a particular and merely an appearance from another point of view (the motions of the planets with respect to the center of mass of the solar system). Thus, the absolutely subjective not only is not immediately available to the agent—but it is in fact a fiction (1887: §7).

This conception of the subjective, together with the Marburg conception of objective validity (see section 2.2), produces a puzzle about psychology (Natorp 1887: §7; 1905: §§41–42). When the psychologist attempts to grasp her object—the purely subjective—she is necessarily trying to subsume the subjective under concepts. But concepts are universal, and to subsume under universals is to objectify. So in the very process of trying to grasp the subjective, she would objectify it. Similarly, if the psychologist attempts to explain the subjective, or to formulate laws of the subjective, she would again be objectifying the appearance, and thus transforming the very thing she is trying to grasp. Natorp’s solution to this puzzle is radical. He argues that psychology is not a genuine, “objectifying” science, and it produces no laws or explanations (Natorp 1905: §42). Since the purely subjective is not present to reflection, the psychologist must approach it using a regressive method, working backwards from the relatively objective content available to reflection to a postulated purely subjective. The method of psychology is thus a reversal of the method of the critique of knowledge: the psychologist reasons backwards from the structures of cognition revealed through logic to the subjective states of consciousness that we must postulate to explain the fact of cognition. For example, Natorp characterizes sensations, which function as the final, material foundation for cognition, as a postulated “= x”, an unknown value which must be solved for given the data of our objective cognition. The object of psychology, the purely subjective, is therefore the hypothesized, but not given, final result of the complete regression of the work of objectification, just as the object of natural science, the object itself, is the hypothesized final product of the complete progression of science (Natorp 1905: §43). (See the discussion of the “genetic” view of knowledge in section 2.2.)

Copyright © 2018 by
Jeremy Heis <>

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