First published Fri May 18, 2018

Neo-Kantianism was the dominant philosophical movement in Germany from roughly 1870 until the First World War. This movement drew inspiration from a diverse cast of philosophers—principally, Kuno Fischer (Fischer 1860), Hermann von Helmholtz (Helmholtz 1867, 1878), Friedrich Lange (Lange 1866), Otto Liebmann (Liebmann 1865), and Eduard Zeller (Zeller 1862))—who in the middle of the nineteenth century were calling for a return to Kant’s philosophy as an alternative to both speculative metaphysics and materialism (Beiser 2014b). During the 1870s, the movement formed into two schools, one based around Hermann Cohen at Marburg University and another based in southwest Germany (in the province of Baden) around Wilhelm Windelband. Later members of the Marburg School include Paul Natorp and Ernst Cassirer; later members of the Southwest School include Heinrich Rickert and Emil Lask.[1]

Neo-Kantians[2] were not only intellectually influential, they were also great successes academically in Germany. They held prominent academic chairs, and were successful in placing their students, shaping curricula, and editing important journals and books. Most of the German philosophers who came to prominence in Germany after the First World War were educated by Neo-Kantians—an impressive and comprehensive list of students that includes Rudolf Carnap, Hans-Georg Gadamer, Martin Heidegger, and Hans Reichenbach.[3] But the reputation of Neo-Kantianism shifted dramatically in the decades after 1918. Neo-Kantians were associated with the old order, and so became the primary targets of the many philosophers (including their own students) wanting to make a completely fresh start. The subsequent geopolitical upheavals, not the least of which was Hitler’s rise to power in 1933, nearly erased the institutional memory of Neo-Kantianism within the emerging analytic and continental traditions. However, in the last few decades, historians of philosophy of all stripes have begun to re-discover both the historical and philosophical significance of Neo-Kantianism.

This article has three parts. After giving an overview of the common features of Neo-Kantians, section 2 is devoted to the Marburg School, and section 3 to the Southwest (SW) School. The Neo-Kantians were systematic and comprehensive philosophers, writing on nearly every area of philosophy. Instead of attempting to cover all areas of their thought, this article will focus on the areas of their philosophies that were most central to their thought, and that were most influential on their contemporaries and successors. Accordingly, each section begins with each school’s conception of philosophy (sections 2.1 and 3.1), moves on to their theory of knowledge (2.2 and 3.2), and ends with the philosophy of the special sciences most characteristic of each school (2.3 on Marburg philosophy of physics, and 3.3 on SW philosophy of history). (Three supplementary documents cover philosophies of logic, psychology, and mathematics in the Marburg School.)

1. Common Features of Neo-Kantians

The Neo-Kantians did not always think of themselves as members of a common movement. Though the members of the Marburg school very clearly identified with one another, and the members of the Southwest school identified themselves with one another, the two schools initially[4] made little effort to present themselves as part of a common movement. Their doctrines were different in some fundamental ways, and they often criticized one another’s positions. Nevertheless, there were some common features of Neo-Kantians of both schools—common features that made it natural for their contemporaries and for historians today to talk about them together. This section presents seven common features of the Neo-Kantians. These seven common features make it possible to distinguish, in a principled philosophical way, between the (“classical”) Neo-Kantians of the Marburg and Southwest schools and the various “back to Kant” philosophers of the mid nineteenth century and the assorted philosophers contemporary with the Neo-Kantians who were “neo-Kantian” in some broader sense. For example, Helmholtz and Lange did not share the Neo-Kantians’ anti-psychologism or commitment to the transcendental method (features 2 and 3 below), while Alois Riehl did not share their idealistic theory of objective validity (feature 6).

1. Most obviously, the Neo-Kantians thought of themselves as reviving, defending, and extending Kant’s philosophy. They self-consciously adopted Kant’s vocabulary, and some of his key ideas and arguments. They wrote commentaries on Kant’s major writings, and would often present their own positive views in the form of commentaries or interpretations of Kant. Nevertheless, they never considered themselves to be orthodox Kantians, nor did they see the value in defending Kant’s views on all topics. As Windelband famously said in the preface to the 1883 first edition of Windelband 1915,[5] “to understand Kant means to go beyond him”. And, as Natorp explained,

it was never anyone’s wish nor intent to cling to Kant’s doctrines in an absolute way. Talk of an orthodox Kantianism within the Marburg School was never justified. (Natorp 1912a: 180)

In fact, there were some core Kantian ideas that the Neo-Kantians self-consciously rejected. They rejected the doctrine of the thing-in-itself as incoherent and unnecessary (Windelband 1910: 323), or radically reinterpreted talk of things-in-themselves as talk of a postulated final and complete theory of the world (Cohen 1885: 503ff.). Their rejection of Kant’s dualism of appearances and things-in-themselves was closely related to their rethinking of Kant’s distinction between two “stems” of cognition: sensibility and understanding. The Marburg philosophers came to fundamentally reject this distinction, while the Southwest Neo-Kantians (while maintaining the irreducibility of intuitions to concepts) still rejected the idea that intuitions are the result of a mind-independent thing-in-itself affecting sensibility. Though the Neo-Kantians took as fundamental to their philosophies the existence of substantive a priori concepts and principles that make knowledge possible, they did not accept that the categories and principles identified in the Critique of Pure Reason were complete or fixed for all time. In particular, Marburg Neo-Kantians believed that some of the categories and principles that Kant identified were relative to the scientific theories of Kant’s day, and that the categories and principles could change as scientists develop new empirical theories. Southwest Neo-Kantians, on the other hand, were keen to argue that history is just as much a science as mathematical physics, and they thought that Kant’s critical project had to be extended in order to identify the a priori elements in history. Last, the classical Neo-Kantians held that transcendental philosophy is distinct and independent of empirical psychology, even though (they argued) Kant himself was not always innocent of psychologism, despite the fact that Kant’s philosophy when rightly interpreted is the basis for a sound anti-psychologism (Cohen 1883: §8).

2. The Neo-Kantians put forward a suite of arguments to show that philosophy is independent of psychology. Logic, or the theory of knowledge, concerns what is objective, not what is subjective, as psychology does (Cohen 1883: §6). It does not concern itself with the mental processes of subjects, with their cognitive apparatus, or with empirical results about human sense organs or nervous system. As Windelband 1883 put it, psychologistic philosophers employ the “genetic method” trying to find the justification of some part of our knowledge by tracing empirically its causal antecedents. The correct method, however, is the “critical method”, which distinguishes what he calls “factual” from “teleological” or normative validity. The critical method is the only correct method, because the fact that we do believe something, or even that all humans by some biological necessity have to believe it, does not yet solve the critical question: what we ought to believe.[6] For these reasons, the Neo-Kantians sharply distinguished a priority from innateness—a distinction they claimed was obscured by philosophers such as Helmholtz and Lange.

A return to an anti-psychologistic Kant was the Neo-Kantians’ solution to what the historian Herbert Schnädelbach (1984: 5) called the “identity crisis” that faced philosophy in the middle of the nineteenth century. Given the collapse of the conception of philosophy shared by post-Kantian speculative idealists, and the concurrent spectacular advances made in the sciences, philosophers were left questioning what (if anything) was left as the distinctive subject matter and method of philosophy (Beiser 2014a: Ch.1). In particular, in opposing psychologism, the Neo-Kantians were staking out a conception of philosophy that avoids the naturalism defended by many German philosophers in the decades after Hegel’s death (Cassirer 1912). According to naturalistic conceptions of philosophy, the method of philosophy is in fact not distinguishable from that of natural science, and the theory of knowledge just becomes applied empirical psychology. Nevertheless, the Neo-Kantians shared with these naturalistic philosophers a deep distrust of speculative metaphysics: they denied that philosophy could deliver knowledge of the supersensible, could deduce facts of the special sciences from a priori principles knowable in some special philosophical way, or that philosophy could even be done in ignorance of the results of the sciences.

3. This via media, this third way of doing philosophy, they found in the transcendental method. The two schools conceived of the transcendental method differently. For Cohen and his school, philosophy begins with a fact—paradigmatically, the fact of science—and investigates the conditions that make that fact possible. For Windelband and his school, the transcendental question is understood teleologically: given certain fundamental goals, such as knowing the truth, or doing good, or experiencing what is beautiful, what is necessary for achieving these values? Still, though, there was a common core to both schools’ conceptions of the transcendental method: they wanted to identify those objective elements within some part of human culture (say, physics, history, or ethics) that made possible objective validity (say, the objective validity of physical theories, historical narratives, or ethical claims). Adherence to the transcendental method led the Neo-Kantians to reject skepticism. Philosophical reflection begins with the fact that scientists have developed successful theories of the physical world; or with the universal validity of the value of truth. So no room is left for the skeptical worry that scientific theories do not in fact deliver empirical knowledge, or that truth is in fact unattainable (Windelband 1883: 280).

4. The object of the transcendental method, for the Neo-Kantians, is culture. Often, they approached human culture using Kant’s three-fold distinction between knowledge, ethics, aesthetics. Because they saw the achievements of science as one of the most significant aspects of modern culture, a good portion of their writings concern the philosophy of science. As Kant applied the transcendental method to Newtonian science, they sought to apply the method to the best science of their day. Typically (not exclusively), the Marburg philosophers were concerned with the physics and mathematics of the late nineteenth and early twentieth century, which (they emphasized) differed fundamentally from that of Kant’s own day. The Southwest Neo-Kantians, on the other hand, were more concerned with the so-called “Geisteswissenschaften” (the “human sciences”), which had come into their own in the nineteenth century and now deserved (they argued) to be recognized as autonomous and fully scientific (despite the fact that Kant himself had sharply distinguished history from science (Kant 1786: Ak 4:468)).

5. Neo-Kantian philosophy of science is distinctive in its focus on the methodology of science. Thus, Neo-Kantian philosophy of physics is not so much concerned directly with what matter is, but with how mathematical physics comes to know about matter. Neo-Kantian philosophy of history is not concerned with grand theories concerning what drives history, but with what makes the methodology of a historian different from that of a physicist or empirical psychologist. Philosophy of science, for them, is the logic of the sciences—in the extended sense of “logic” that includes theory of knowledge and scientific methodology. And, true to their anti-psychologistic conception of logic, Neo-Kantian accounts of scientific methodology are not intended to be empirical descriptions of what scientists do, but accounts that identify objective norms, or the fundamental principles and concepts of a particular science.[7] Philosophy of science thus becomes a second order discipline, different in kind from the natural sciences (thus avoiding naturalism). But because Neo-Kantian philosophy of science adheres to the transcendental method, it avoids the errors of speculative metaphysics. It does not, for instance, try to derive the concept of matter or life a priori, but is content to demonstrate that these concepts are necessary conditions for physics and biology. Since philosophy of science for the Neo-Kantians is a second order discipline, they were in general committed to a non-revisionist attitude. According to Rickert, philosophy

does not claim to direct science onto the paths it should take. On the contrary, it proposes only to follow science with a view to understanding it. (1902: 340)

For Cassirer, “critical philosophy … does not seek to direct the sciences but to understand them” (1907b: 31).

6. Since the goal of transcendental philosophy, for the Neo-Kantians, is to identify those elements within some part of human culture that are necessary for its objective validity, they were also led to investigate the nature of objective validity itself (Natorp 1887, Rickert 1915).[8] The two schools construed the question of objective validity differently. The Marburg philosophers emphasized objectivity, and gave an account of objectivity in terms of constant laws (see section 2.2). The Southwest Neo-Kantians emphasized the question of validity—specifically the validity of values (section 3.2). For both schools, a central issue in the investigation of objective validity is the question of transcendence: what does it mean that the object is independent of our knowledge and provides the standard for its truth?

There are four key ideas that are common to the Southwest and Marburg theories of objective validity. First, both schools emphasized the centrality of judgments (as opposed to concepts or intuitions), as the kind of representation that first makes objective validity possible (Rickert 1915: Ch.3; Cohen 1902: §10–11). Second, the Neo-Kantians were emphatic that the objective validity of knowledge does not consist in its being a copy (Abbild) or mirror of the object (Windelband 1910; Rickert 1934; Cassirer 1910: Ch.1; Rickert 1915: Ch.2). This “copy theory” of knowledge is inconsistent with a third key idea, that the objective validity of every area of culture is made possible by substantive a priori principles. The a priori principles that make possible some part of human culture are again not interpreted psychologistically: they are not features of the minds of individual subjects, they are not discovered empirically, and their necessity is not grounded in the empirical fact that they are universally accepted. These a priori principles are parts of culture—they are its fundamental norms or laws. Fourth, the Neo-Kantians described themselves as “idealists”. Idealism meant different things to different Neo-Kantians (see section 2.2 and 3.2). But all Neo-Kantians shared the view that knowledge requires a priori elements that are not present in what is given in immediate intuition. Knowledge, then, requires a “reshaping” or “transformation” of what is given. The copy theory that they reject would in this sense be a kind of “realism”. Of course, Neo-Kantian idealism must be rigorously distinguished from other kinds of idealisms. As noted earlier, they reject Kant’s doctrine of the thing-in-itself, and they emphatically do not believe that objects are in any way subjective or dependent on the representations of individual psychological subjects.

7. There is one final common feature of Neo-Kantian philosophers that should not be overlooked: the Neo-Kantians were great historians of philosophy. It’s not surprising that the Neo-Kantians wrote extensively on Kant, producing commentaries (e.g., Cohen 1885; Cassirer 1918) and critical editions of his writing. But the Neo-Kantians also wrote extensively on other philosophers, ancient and modern, and on the history of science and mathematics (e.g., Windelband 1891; Cassirer 1906, 1907a). These historical works were not thought of as side projects, but as essential aspects of their philosophy. Neo-Kantians did not sharply distinguish history of philosophy from philosophy (see Introduction to Windelband 1891; §I of the 1902 version of Cohen 1898).

2. The Marburg School

The intellectual beginnings of the Marburg School can be traced to 1871, when Hermann Cohen (1842–1918) published the first edition of his Kants Theorie der Erfahrung (Kant’s Theory of Experience), which interpreted Kant in an anti-psychologistic way and found in Kant’s first Critique the expression of a novel way of doing philosophy: the transcendental method. In 1873 Cohen did his Habilitation in Marburg under Friedrich Lange, who had moved there in 1872. He was promoted as Professor Extraordinarius in 1875, and then took over Lange’s chair in 1876 after his death. When Paul Natorp (1854–1924) moved to Marburg in 1880 (writing his Habilitation—Natorp 1881—under Cohen and being promoted to Professor in 1893), the “Marburg” school as an institutional force was born.

Cohen’s work culminated in a three part system of philosophy, modeled after Kant’s own tripartite division of critical philosophy: The Logic of Pure Knowledge (Cohen 1902), The Ethics of Pure Will (Cohen 1904), and the Aesthetics of Pure Feeling (Cohen 1912). His most influential works, though, were his interpretation of Kant, principally in Kant’s Theory of Experience, which was significantly revised and expanded in a second edition (Cohen 1885), and his works in the philosophy of science and mathematics: The Principle of the Infinitesimal Method (Cohen 1883), and his introduction to the sixth edition of Lange’s History of Materialism (Cohen 1898).[9]

Natorp’s most influential writings are in the interpretation of Plato, the philosophy of science, and in the philosophy of psychology. Starting with his habilitation (“Descartes’s Theory of Knowledge: A Study in the Pre-history of Criticism”) in 1881, Natorp extended the reach of the Marburg school as historians of philosophy beyond Kant to other philosophers who in various ways anticipated the Kantian themes important to the Marburgers. Natorp’s most significant work in this vein was his book Plato’s Theory of Ideas (1903), which gave a serious scholarly argument for the dating of Plato’s dialogues, in addition to a novel “critical” reading of Platonic ideas. In the philosophy of science, his systematic work The Logical Foundations of the Exact Sciences (1910) gives a systematic philosophy of logic, arithmetic, geometry, and physics that engages with contemporary science and mathematics in a more comprehensive and detailed way than any of Cohen’s works. Last, in a series of works in the philosophy of psychology (culminating in General Psychology According to the Critical Method (1912b)), Natorp defended a novel conception of psychology as the science of the subjective.

Among the many students of Cohen and Natorp’s who identified themselves with the Marburg school, the most accomplished and influential was undoubtedly Ernst Cassirer (1874–1945). After writing his dissertation under Cohen in 1899 on Descartes’s philosophy of mathematics and science, Cassirer moved to Berlin, where he worked as a Privatdozent (though not a Professor, which was ruled out by institutional anti-Semitism[10]). His most important works before 1914 are in the history of philosophy (especially the massive, two volume Problem of Knowledge (Cassirer 1906, 1907a), which follows the development of the philosophy of science from the late Renaissance to Kant), and the philosophy of the exact sciences (Substance and Function, 1910; Einstein’s Theory of Relativity, 1921). Starting in 1921, Cassirer’s philosophy broadened into a “philosophy of symbolic forms”, which differs in some fundamental ways from the classic works of his teachers.

2.1 Conception of Philosophy: The Transcendental Method

The core commitment of the Marburg school was to a philosophical method: “the transcendental method” (Natorp 1912a; Cohen 1883: §7–9; Cohen 1885: §12; Richardson 2006). The method, as Natorp describes it, comes in two steps. In the first step, the philosopher identifies some “fact” of culture. Theoretical philosophy begins with the “fact of science”; practical philosophy with the fact of “social order”; aesthetics with the fact of “artistic creation”. These facts are concrete, detailed, and “historically verifiable”. For instance, a theoretical philosopher begins by investigating the best scientific theories of her contemporaries. In this first step, the philosopher is like a fact collector, investigating the methods, important concepts and laws of that aspect of culture, including the historical development of that area of culture up to the present day. In the second step, however, the philosopher goes beyond fact-collecting to identifying those aspects of that area of culture that make its objective validity possible. As they put it, this involves identifying the “laws” or “form” of that area of culture. Their model here is Kant in the Prolegomena. As they read Kant, he began by identifying within the best scientific theory of his time—Newton’s—the fundamental laws, concepts, and methods (which are contained in Kant’s Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science). The second step is showing how these laws, concepts, and methods are made possible by even more fundamental concepts and laws, which are contained in the Critique itself—laws which make objective validity possible.

There are a few aspects of this method that need to be emphasized. First, the second step in the method involves much more than just identifying a class of basic laws and concepts. If a philosopher were to axiomatize a physical theory, even a fundamental one, for the Marburgers that would be only the first step. A philosopher also needs a story of how just these laws and just these concepts make it possible for the theory to make true claims about objects—a story that will require a very general account of objective validity itself. Second, the transcendental method requires demonstrating the unity of culture. A philosophy of arithmetic should show how the laws of arithmetic fit in with the laws of geometry and analysis to form the unity of mathematics; how the laws of mathematics are preconditions of all natural science to form the unity of science; and all the way up to the unity of culture. Third, these two steps are interrelated. The notion of objective validity itself is analyzed in step two on the basis of reflection on the details of concrete culture from step one; the philosopher in step one collects the relevant facts about an area of culture because she has in mind the step two goal of explaining its objective validity, in a unified account of the validity of all culture. Fourth, the method is non-skeptical, non-revisionary, and unconcerned with certainty. Since it takes an area of culture as a fact, it rules out radical skepticism about the validity of an area of culture, and it has no room to advocate a radical revision in that area of culture. Though the goal of the transcendental method is to provide foundations for culture, these foundations are not meant to be certain. Transcendental logic, one might say, is a semantic, not a Cartesian project. Fifth, though the transcendental method is rooted in the concrete facts of contemporary culture, it is nevertheless possible and even necessary for a philosopher to take sides on contested questions within culture. A philosopher is not a bystander in culture. So, for instance, Cohen argues for infinitesimal over limit methods in the calculus, for Herz’s mechanics over its rivals, for liberal democracy over monarchy. After all, the transcendental philosopher, having studied the method of an area of culture and its long historical development, can show that one party in a dispute has departed in some fundamental way from that method. And the philosopher also has her eye on the question of the foundations of the objective validity of an area of culture (and its integration into a synthetic account of the objective validity of all culture), and so can intervene to show that one approach in a controversy is better suited to make objective validity possible.

Since the transcendental method begins with the fact of culture, Marburg Neo-Kantians reject the possibility of speculative metaphysics. Transcendental philosophy as they understand it is also distinct from and independent of psychology. Though the goal of the theory of knowledge is to understand what makes “experience” possible, they understand experience in a radically non-psychological way. As Cohen puts in (1898: x, my translation):

The transcendental method does not research the principles of human reason but rather the foundation of science that conditions scientific validity. Our organization is, insofar as it comes into question in general, a question of psychology; and there is at least no methodological means for procuring secure, scientific, and exact information from the ultimate and simplest parts of our mental essence. But the sciences lie before us in books. What makes them into sciences, wherein their character of generality and necessity rests, from which concepts their epistemological validity within their region can be derived, what tools and ways of knowing explain in its validity those historical facts of knowledge—the sciences—this is a methodological question, this is the question, which the sciences themselves pose, whenever they feel the impulse to think about their own principles—this and nothing else is the transcendental question.

The fact of science does not occur in the minds of individual scientists; it lies before us in books. “Experience” is not a representation in the mind of a knower; it is the objective content. “Experience” is virtually equated with mathematical natural science, and a paradigm “experience” is Newton’s law of universal gravitation. What makes experience (in this non-psychological sense) possible is “a priori”, now interpreted in a radically non-psychological sense as elements of the content of some aspect of culture that makes the objective validity of that culture possible. This new conception of the a priori, radically distinct from innateness and independent of any facts about human minds discoverable by empirical psychology, is articulated in Cohen’s Kant’s Theory of Experience. It is here that Cohen’s Neo-Kantianism breaks decisively with the Kantianism of Lange and Helmholtz. In his book, Cohen distinguishes between the “metaphysical a priori” and the “transcendental a priori” (1885: 109; cf. 1902: 44). The metaphysical a priori are the basic structures of our thinking that we can discover by introspection or empirical study; these are irrelevant to the transcendental philosopher (unless she is doing philosophy of psychology). The transcendental a priori, on the other hand, are those aspects of the content of science that make objective validity possible. Thus, the relationship between the a priori and experience is not like the relationship between a mental apparatus and its acts. It is a logical relationship, more like the relation between an axiom and a theorem (Cassirer 1918: 151, 153)—though with the important qualification that the a priori laws are not just axioms, but axioms that have the special semantic function of making objective validity possible.

The fact of culture is not static, but dynamic. As Natorp memorably put it (1912a: 184; 1910: Ch.1, §4; 1903: 366ff), the fact is not a “factum” (a thing done) but “fieri” (becoming). Culture changes; one scientific theory replaces another. In keeping with the transcendental method, only a Newtonian could have written what Kant wrote; but the transcendental method just as emphatically requires that later transcendental philosophers rethink the doctrines of the first Critique in light of the advances in mathematics and natural science since Newton. This appreciation for the historically evolving character of culture has two consequences. First, the transcendental a priori is not absolute, but relative to the current best physical theories. Second, Marburg Neo-Kantians have an additional transcendental task that Kant himself did not fully recognize: to understand how it is possible that the changes in an area of culture can themselves be objectively valid. They want to understand the objective law or method that determines how an area of culture changes.[11] This emphasis on the objectivity and lawlikeness of cultural change thus introduces a check on the potential relativistic or historicist consequences of their relativizing the a priori. (Cassirer in particular develops a sophisticated theory of the a priori with both relative and absolute elements; see section 2.3.) This emphasis on the progressive character of culture leads the Marburg Neo-Kantians to adopt a distinctive, historical method of writing and arguing, in which systematic philosophy is not separated from the history of philosophy and the history of culture.[12]

2.2 Theory of Knowledge

The core of the Marburg Neo-Kantian theory of knowledge is a conception of “objective validity” (Natorp 1887; Cohen 1902: §11). By the “objective validity” of knowledge, they mean its objectivity (that is, its independence from individual subjects), its truth, and its relation to objects. A theory of objective validity is then also a theory of the “transcendence” of the object—in what sense the object is an independent standard of correctness for knowledge. A good way to approach the Marburg theory is by considering an alternative they reject. Consider the view that “objects in themselves are there, outside and independent of all subjectivity, without any original relation to it”. That is, begin your theory of objective validity with the notion of an independent object, taken as a theoretical given. This notion of an object is then used to explain aboutness, truth, and objectivity. A representation is about an object, say, if it is caused by an object or, perhaps, it resembles it. A representation is true if it then mirrors or copies the object as it is independently of us. And then knowledge is objective if it is about an independent object, not about the subject and its states. For Marburg Neo-Kantians, this theory of objective validity (which they call “naive realism”) simply presupposes the very thing it is supposed to explain:

Perhaps this actually means something correct, but at least as it is presented, it is not really an answer to the question [What is objective validity?]. The being-in-itself of the object is itself an enigma and thus cannot serve as a solution to our present enigma. If we understood what it meant to say the object in itself is there independent of all subjectivity and then is appropriated in our subjectivity by knowledge there would be no problem in the knowing of objects or in the objectivity of knowledge. (Natorp 1887: §4)

The Marburg theory of objective validity, on the other hand, turns this order of explanation on its head: instead of beginning with the notion of an object as its explanatory primitive, it sees the notion of an object as dependent on many other prior notions. In particular, it begins its account of objective validity with a distinctive account of objectivity.

Objectivity, according to the Marburg view, depends on laws. For example, a particular physical thing (say a table in a room) appears in a certain way from my own subjective point of view in the room. To achieve an objective representation of the table, I would need to understand how all of the various appearances at various points of view in the room are related to one another in a law-like way. When I know the law, I’ve moved from appearance to reality, from subjectivity to objectivity. If there is no such law, then there is only appearance, and I cannot speak about an independent object and its properties. This simple point generalizes at higher levels. It merely appears from our subjective point of view that the earth is stationary and the sun moves. But it is objectively the case that the earth moves around the sun because the heliocentric model follows from Newton’s laws of motion. Even more fundamentally, scientific theories (such as Newton’s) are developed, adopted, and abandoned as science progresses; this whole progression is itself objective because there are “laws” (that is, a common scientific method) that prescribe these changes. These laws secure the “unity” of knowledge: the various appearances of the same particular are united as of the same particular object by a law; a law of nature unites various observed phenomena under it; the scientific method unites science in its development, prescribing a uniquely correct path to follow. This unity can also be described as “permanence”: the appearances change, even as the object stays the same; the planets move, but the law remains; theories come and go, but the method stays constant. This notion of objectivity as lawfulness is then used to give an account of truth and objecthood. Knowledge is true if it can be unified with other knowledge within an objective system of knowledge. Last, an object is then what is known by fully objective knowledge:

the object signifies the law; it signifies the lasting unity in which the changing manifold of appearance is unified and determined in thought. (Natorp 1887: §4)

This theory of objective validity has some notable consequences. First, the possibility of objective validity requires that we postulate, as a regulative ideal, a final science. The unity of knowledge through laws that the Marburgers point to as the foundation of objective validity has clearly not yet been achieved: there are still phenomena that have not yet been explained, and our current theories are certainly not going to be the final word. But it is clearly the case that even now we can know objects, even if our knowledge is partial. If unity through laws makes objectivity validity possible and that unity has not yet been achieved, how then can we know any objects at all? We have to postulate that our current, only partially unified knowledge can progress in a law-like way into a unique, final theory. Such a final theory can never actually be achieved, because the task of knowledge is infinite—there is always more to understand, deeper explanations to give. The postulated final theory is like the asymptote that a curve never quite reaches. This viewpoint—that speaking of an object contains the demand for unity of knowledge, that this task is infinite, that we must therefore postulate the possibility of its completion—Natorp calls the “genetic view of knowledge” (1910: Ch.1, §4–5). The genetic view delivers a unique way of cashing out the “transcendence” of the object. The fact that the object is independent of knowledge, in the sense that it always transcends our knowledge of it, is expressed by the infinity of the task of knowledge. And the fact that the object is the standard for knowledge is expressed by the postulate that the course of knowledge is moving asymptotically towards a unique (though infinite) endpoint as its goal. Second, the emphasis on lawfulness gives the Marburgers a satisfying explanation of the application of mathematics to the objects of natural science: the laws of natural science are mathematical, and there would be no objects if there were no laws of natural science. Third, since objectivity is explained in terms of laws, and laws are a special kind of universal judgment, the Marburg theory of objective validity emphasizes the priority of judgments over concepts (Cohen 1902: §10). As Cohen memorably put it, modifying Galileo’s phrase: the book of nature is written in sentences (with mathematics as its letters, and the a priori principles of pure knowledge as its syntax) (1902: 204, 484).

In addition to their theory of objective validity, another core commitment in the mature writings of the Marburg school is a rejection of the “given”. In this, they are explicitly departing from Kant. Kant had argued that our cognitive faculty has two stems: a receptive faculty (sensibility), and a spontaneous faculty (understanding). Through sensibility, objects are given to us, and through the understanding, objects are thought. The representations of sensibility are intuitions, which relate to objects immediately; the representations of the understanding are concepts, which relate to objects mediately. The Marburgers’ skepticism of these distinctions culminated in Cohen’s Logic of Pure Knowledge (1902: §7), where these dualisms are definitively rejected. As Natorp put the point:

In the end, “intuition” no longer remains a cognitive factor which stands across from or is opposed to thinking. It is thinking, just not thinking in terms of laws, but thinking in terms of full objects. In its implementation, in its exercise, intuition is to conceptual thought as function is to the law of function. (1912a: 186)

Intuition is itself a “function”, because even intuitions are active or spontaneous, and not merely given. Similarly, they were often uncomfortable with Kant’s word “synthesis” because it suggests that the function of thinking is only to combine a content that is already given. Instead, Cohen prefers the term “generate” in order to indicate the “creative sovereignty of thinking” (1902: 25). In another favorite slogan, an object is not given [geben] to knowledge, but given as a task [aufgegeben], echoing the genetic view of knowledge described in the previous paragraph (Natorp 1912a: 183–4; Natorp 1910: Ch.1, §5). In Substance and Function (1910: Ch.1), Cassirer attacks the given by attacking a related doctrine: the traditional view that all concepts are formed by abstraction. On this view of concept formation, concepts would have to be abstracted from given material that is completely independent of thought and its concepts—thus presupposing the doctrine of the given.

It is hard to interpret the Marburg rejection of the given. It seems to deny the obvious fact that there is some passive element in perception, and to leave no room for experiment within natural science (as Natorp recognized: 1912a: 186). In interpreting the doctrine, it is helpful to remember that the Marburg theory of knowledge concerns relations among the content of knowledge—how one part of the content of knowledge justifies another. It is not concerned with causal relations between acts of the mind in perception. Plausibly, the only content that could justify a thought must itself be something thinkable, since “knowledge is only grounded through other knowledge” (Natorp 1887: 168). (In this sense, the denial of the given is a denial of content that is not conceptual or dependent on what is conceptual.) In Cassirer’s polemic against the given, he attacks the “epistemological atomism” implicit in it: the view that there are some contents that can be efficacious for knowledge without requiring that a knower possess any concepts or know any facts. (In this sense, the denial of the given is a defense of semantic holism.) For this reason, he argues against the given by arguing that even the most basic experiments—measurements—depend on the experimenter possessing concepts and knowing certain theoretical facts (see section 2.3 below).

The Marburg philosophers characterize their philosophy as a kind of “idealism”. This idealism should be sharply distinguished from “subjectivism”, since they do not believe that objects of knowledge are representations—they do not believe that the objects of knowledge depend for their existence on the existence of minds to think them (Cassirer 1910: 298). This idealism is also opposed to the view that our knowledge is really illusory; they do not hold that there are unknowable objects, or that the real nature of objects of knowledge is in principle unknowable (Cohen 1902: 507ff). Rather, their position is idealist in four senses. First, they defend an “idealist” conception of philosophy, as following the transcendental method. In this sense, idealism is opposed to “naturalism”, the view that the method of philosophy does not differ in kind from that of the natural sciences. Second, they hold that there are substantive a priori principles that make experience possible. In this sense, their idealism is opposed to empiricism. Third, according to their theory of objective validity, our conception of an object depends on our conception of objectivity, which is grounded in the idea of the unity of knowledge according to laws. In this sense of idealism, idealism is opposed to “realism”, which takes the concept of an object as a philosophical primitive. Fourth, according to their philosophy of science (see below section 2.3), our empirical theories make essential use of fundamental concepts (such as mathematical concepts, or “theoretical concepts”, such as the concept <force> or <energy>) that are radically unlike the features that the world appears to have to untutored, everyday experience. These “ideal” concepts are not reducible to “sensible” concepts such as color, texture, or shape. In this sense, idealism is opposed to “sensualism”.

The Marburg conception of philosophy, as guided by the transcendental method, along with their rejection of the given, leads them to a unique conception of logic. For further discussion, see the Supplement, Philosophy of Logic in the Marburg School.

The Marburg rejection of the given, along with their view that objectivity is conferred by laws, has significant consequences for their philosophy of psychology. For further information, see the Supplement, Philosophy of Psychology in the Marburg School.

2.3 Philosophy of Natural Science

The Marburg philosophers wrote several works that engaged in a detailed way with the natural science, especially physics, of their day. In his Forward and Introduction to the sixth edition of Lange’s History of Materialism, first published in 1898, Cohen gives a philosophical interpretation of work on electromagnetism since Faraday, and defends Hertz’s Principles of Mechanics (Hertz 1894). In two works both published in 1910 (Natorp 1910: Ch.7; Cassirer 1910: Ch.4) Natorp and Cassirer discuss foundational issues in physics: the principles of mechanics and thermodynamics; the nature of mass, energy, space, and time; atomism and its critics. (Cassirer also addresses foundational issues in chemistry: 1910: Ch.4, section 8). The culmination of this work is Cassirer’s Einstein’s Theory of Relativity, published in 1921.

There are three themes that run through Marburg work in the philosophy of natural science: they argue that contemporary natural science supports philosophical idealism; they highlight radical conceptual changes in physics; and they philosophically interpret physics in the light of their conception of objective validity. Each of these themes is discussed in the rest of the section.

Idealism in Natural Science

One of Cohen’s chief goals in Cohen 1898 is to show that recent work in electromagnetism undermines “sensualism” or “materialism”, and supports “idealism”, by transforming our conception of physical reality away from the “sensible” and “material” to the “ideal”. The physical world, according to the “sensible” conception of reality—the way the world appears to us to be through our senses—is composed of matter, conceived on the model of the roughly medium sized dry goods that our senses reveal to us. Physicists working in electromagnetism—Cohen points to Faraday especially—demonstrated the physical reality of electromagnetic fields. Following Faraday, Cohen applauds efforts to treat electromagnetic fields and forces as independent entities in their own right, not dependent on a “material” ether. Pure field theories thus vindicate idealism, by showing that our conception of the objects of physics should not be constrained by the picture of the world supplied by our senses; our conception of the world can only be supplied by thought, and not by the senses.

Given Cohen’s opposition to ether theories, it is not surprising that he feels vindicated by Einstein’s special theory of relativity (Cohen 1898: 134; the passage appears in 1914–5 edition). In fact, Cassirer claims (1921: Ch.4) that Einstein’s general theory, which departs further from the “sensible” conception of matter by not separating matter from space and time, is a natural continuation of the idealism Cohen first articulated.

Radical Conceptual Change in Natural Science

According to the Marburg transcendental method (section 2.1), the “fact” of science is not static, but dynamic. In advocating this method, the Marburg Neo-Kantians are thus claiming that the principles that are a priori for science will evolve as theories change, and the concepts that function as categories will be radically reconceived as science progresses. There is then a new task, to identify the principles that are a priori in a given physical theory, and to investigate how the categories—space, time, substance, magnitude—are being reconceived in our current best physical theories. The Marburgers are thus committed to a view of scientific progress that emphasizes conceptual shifts in science. Scientists don’t just discover new facts: they also develop new concepts, and radically revise their fundamental concepts.

Furthermore, according to the Marburg conception of objectivity and objecthood, objecthood—what it is to be an object—is conceptually dependent on objectivity, which is explained in terms of laws. The upshot of this is that our notion of a physical object is determined by the most fundamental laws of our science. Marburg Neo-Kantianism therefore highlights the fact that scientific progress requires fundamental shifts in science’s ontology—its conception of what there is.

These themes are apparent already in Cohen’s introduction to Lange (Cohen 1898). Following Hertz, Cohen surveys three different proposals for the principles of mechanics: Newton’s view (which takes as fundamental space, time, mass, and force); an alternative that replaces the notion of force with energy; and Hertz’s own radical view, which uses only the notions of space, time, and mass. Cohen argues for Hertz’s view, emphasizing how it fundamentally reconceptualizes the traditional notion of “mass” (Cohen 1898: 128ff.). This same tendency is even more apparent in Cassirer’s writings on Einstein. He argues that Einstein introduces new a priori principles: the constancy of the speed of light (in the special theory), and the principles of general covariance and the equivalence of inertial and gravitational mass (in the general theory) (1921: 415, 428). And he emphasizes the transformations in the notions of substance, space, and time that the general theory requires (1921: Chs. 3–5).[13]

Objective Validity of Natural Science

For Marburg Neo-Kantianism, objectivity and objecthood are explained in terms of the unity of knowledge. Explaining the unity of scientific knowledge over time becomes especially pressing for them given their emphasis on radical conceptual change in natural science. If even the categories are shifting over time, in what sense is there unity to our knowledge?

This problem is made more pressing in conjunction with the Marburg attack on the given. (After all, if there were something given in experience, then the given in experience would determine which conceptual changes are necessary in science, and the objectivity of our scientific knowledge could be explained.) In the philosophy of science, the attack on the given amounts to an attack on the possibility of crucial experiments—experiments that would, in a theory neutral way, establish the truth of a scientific theory. Marburg philosophers emphasized that even the most primitive experimental results—measurements—presuppose a good amount of “theoretical” machinery: not only mathematics, but even physical laws. Cassirer cited Duhem in support (1910: Ch.4). Duhemian underdetermination of scientific theory by experience showed, Cassirer believed, that there is no given: no autonomous layer of self-authenticating experiences.

Marburg philosophy of science thus includes the claim that there could be rival scientific theories, each of which is empirically adequate.[14] Given this, in what sense is science objective? How is there unity in science, when there are no theory-neutral experiments that would prevent different scientists from adopting different theories? Cassirer (1910) in particular proposed an intricate answer to this question (Heis 2014). He argued that there is a common set of demands on theories that will constrain the choice of theory. These demands are a priori, in a regulative sense, and partially constitute what he calls the “form” of a scientific theory. These demands include that a theory be simple and of wide scope.[15] He also argues that even in the face of radical conceptual changes and shifts in ontology, some features of scientific theories are maintained—for instance the approximate mathematical structure of the theory.

For further discussion of the philosophy of mathematics, see the Supplement, Philosophy of Mathematics in the Marburg School.

3. The Southwest School

The beginning of the Southwest School of Neo-Kantianism can arguably be located in Wilhelm Windelband’s 1883 essay, “Critical or Genetic Method?”, which for the first time both gives a clear exposition of the philosophical point of view that would characterize the Southwest school and argues explicitly for a return to Kant. However, many of the core ideas in that essay were already articulated by Windelband’s teacher, Hermann Lotze (1817–1881), principally in his Logic (1874). Lotze argued for a clean distinction between philosophy and psychology. Logic depends on the distinction between “truth and untruth”, and gives the laws that thought ought to obey, while psychology identifies the laws that mental processes do obey. Logic gives laws governing the content of thoughts, while psychology concerns acts of thinking (Lotze 1874: §x; §332; on the act/content distinction see also Lotze 1856–64: vol.2, 630; Lotze 1874: §337). The contents of thoughts are objective, inasmuch as they are not only shareable but have a reality independent of being thought. Though these contents are real, they do not occur (as events do), do not exist or have being (as things do), but are valid (1874: §§314–318). Though Lotze did not explicitly call for a return to Kant, he did articulate many of the themes that the SW Neo-Kantians located in Kant. Lotze argued that knowing cannot be considered a copying [Abbilden] of its object (§327); he held that knowledge requires a priori elements, and that apriority is not the same as innateness (§324); and more generally he positioned his philosophy as a middle ground between speculative idealism and materialism.

After completing his dissertation, on the doctrine of chance, under Lotze in 1870, Windelband (1848–1915), moved to Strassburg in 1882, and then to Heidelberg in 1902. A master essayist, he is best known for the essays and addresses collected in his Präludien (1915), which was first published in 1883. In “Critical or Genetic Method?”—the important essay just mentioned—Windelband self-consciously looks to Kant and the critical philosophy as the key to clearly distinguishing philosophy from psychology. Picking up Lotze’s key notion of validity, he argues that Kant’s project is best understood as a study of validity: the topic of philosophy is value, or the “validity of axioms” or norms. This study of validity should be broadened to all areas of culture. This broadening of the critical project was carried further in his essay, “History and Natural Science” (1894), which argued (against the positivist theory of history), that history provides a distinct way of knowing (which he calls, “idiographic”), distinct from the natural scientific (“nomothetic”) way of knowing. Windelband was also a prolific and original historian of philosophy, culminating in 1891 with his history of philosophy from ancient to modern times (Windelband 1891). He articulated and defended a conception of doing history of philosophy (Problemgeschichte, history of philosophical problems) that became standard for the Neo-Kantians of both schools.

These programmatic ideas in the theory of knowledge and the philosophy of history were expanded systematically by Windelband’s student Heinrich Rickert (1863–1936). After writing his dissertation (“The Theory of Definition”) under Windelband in Strassburg in 1888, Rickert moved to Freiburg in 1889. The philosophical school became known as the Southwest or Baden school, because Freiburg and Heidelberg are both in Baden in southwest Germany. In 1892, he published The Object of Knowledge (Rickert 1915), which he expanded and modified in subsequent editions over the next thirty years. His most influential book, The Limits of Concept Formation in Natural Science (1st ed: 1902) greatly expands and systematically develops the core idea in Windelband’s essay “History and Natural Science”. His book Das Eine, die Einheit und die Eins (Oneness, Unity, and the Number One, 1911), was one of the few SW works in the philosophy of mathematics.

Among the students of Rickert and Windelband who aligned themselves with their philosophical point of view, the most influential and philosophically sophisticated was Emil Lask (1875–1915).[16] After studying under Windelband in Heidelberg and Rickert in Frieburg, Lask wrote his dissertation under Rickert in 1902 (“Fichte’s Idealism and History”). He later habilitated at Heidelberg, where Windelband was located, and eventually became a professor there. While there, he wrote two dense works, The Logic of Philosophy and the Doctrine of the Categories (1911), and The Doctrine of Judgment (1912). Tragically, he died in 1915 in the Great War.

3.1 Conception of Philosophy: Philosophy as Theory of Value

“Kant posed a new conception of philosophy’s task and mode of knowledge against the psychologism of his contemporaries”, Windelband writes in his programmatic essay, “Critical or Genetic Method?” (Windelband 1883: 271). On this Kantian view, Windelband asserts, philosophy’s subject matter is the “validity” [Geltung] of “axioms”. Philosophy must identify these axioms, put them into a system, and explain how these axioms govern the activities of knowing, acting, and judging. This latter task requires giving a general account of validity, in addition to identifying how the various sciences and areas of culture are governed by specific axioms. Logic (or theoretical philosophy, or “theory of knowledge”) is the science of the axioms for knowing; ethics is the science of the norms for acting; aesthetics is the science of the rules of the “effects of the emotions” (1883: 274–5).

This conception of philosophy furnishes the SW School with an antidote to psychologism, which differs fundamentally from the kind of anti-psychologism proferred by the Marburg school (see section 2.1). For Windelband, axioms are understood “teleologically”: they are the rules that must be followed if certain ends are to be realized. For instance, logic gives those norms that must be followed if one wants to believe what is true. Axioms are norms, and their necessity is normative necessity. Essentially, philosophy is distinct from psychology because norms are distinct from facts. The norms that, as a matter of fact, people do recognize have only “factual validity”, and not “teleological validity”.[17] What Windelband calls the “genetic method” recognizes only factual validity or generality. It seeks to demonstrate the validity of axioms by showing that these axioms are built into our psychology, or are universal to all cultures. The genetic method therefore makes philosophy dependent on psychology and cultural history. But the genetic method is hopeless: one cannot prove the axioms that govern all sciences by using psychology or anthropology, since these sciences themselves presuppose these axioms. Indeed, the genetic method threatens relativism, since we cannot say what humans will believe at all times and places, but only what they believe now, or what is believed in this or that culture. Indeed, on the genetic method, truth and goodness are reduced to social power or majority opinion.

The critical method, on the other hand, begins with the assumption that there are universal, absolute values which all subjects ought to recognize and conform to. It postulates a “normal consciousness whose principles must be recognized, insofar as anything at all is to have universal validity” (Windelband 1883: 280). This normal consciousness,[18] inasmuch as it embodies a norm, is not an empirically real subject and cannot be investigated using the genetic method. The “axioms”, which form the subject matter of philosophy, are the principles that must have normative force if there is to be a normal consciousness at all. These axioms are “means to the end of universal validity” (1883: 281)—they are the norms that must be recognized if there are to be any universally valid norms at all. For example, there could be a normal consciousness in a world where ripe tomatoes are blue and not red. Thus the norm “Believe that ripe tomatoes are red”, though it is true and thus universally valid in our world, is not an axiom—not a norm whose recognition is a precondition of universal validity. The law of contradiction, on the other hand, is a precondition of universal validity. No matter what color ripe tomatoes are in our world, there would be no point in adopting the norm “Believe that ripe tomatoes are red” as a norm of truth, unless we also recognize the demand to avoid contradictions. The proof that these axioms are the indispensable preconditions of universal validity cannot be empirical, as the genetic method would require.

The defining claim of SW Neo-Kantianism is that there are universally valid norms, and every universally valid norm has an a priori ground.[19] The concept of the a priori is therefore not a psychological or biological notion (the a priori is not the innate), nor is it an anthropological notion (the a priori is not what is universally assented to). The a priori are norms, the recognition of which is indispensable for normative activities. In theoretical philosophy, the a priori are norms the recognition of which are necessary for making universally valid judgments—judgments that make a claim to truth, truth for every other cognizer. These a priori theoretical norms include the laws of logic. For natural science, the law of causality is an a priori norm; for history (see section 3.3), it is a priori that there are universal values that make certain individuals historically significant (Rickert 1902: 334). Similarly, there are universally binding norms in ethics and aesthetics, which make it possible that certain actions and emotions are universally valid.

Lask agrees with his teachers in characterizing philosophy as the science of validity (Lask 1911: 401). He recognizes, however, that the SW Neo-Kantian insistence on the objectivity of what is valid, along with their distinction between the factual and the normative, threatens to devolve into a “two world” metaphysics that is potentially incompatible with Kantianism. In fact, Lotze (Lask argues) opted precisely for such a two world theory, where what is valid is set over against what is, or has being. This dualism is unpalatable, since it would leave it unexplained how senses (i.e., the contents of our sentences) come to be true of what is, thus reigniting the question (famously posed by Kant in his 1772 letter to Herz) about how representations can relate to objects at all. Lask thus argued that Neo-Kantianism had to be completed by taking a Kantian “Copernican Turn”[20] (Lask 1911: First Part, §1). Just as Kant argued that the object must conform to our cognition of it, Lask holds that both the senses of our sentences and the objects that have being share a form (§2). The form of a sense is theoretical validity [Gültigkeit], and the form of an object is objectivity [Gegenständlichkeit]. The Copernican view, then, is that theoretical validity just is objectivity. The two world theory thus becomes a two element theory (§3). There is one realm (the realm of theoretical sense or being), within which we can distinguish a formal element and a material element. The formal element is validity, which is the subject matter of philosophy, while the material element is sensible. Validity, however, is not supersensible (such as the objects of dogmatic theology or cosmology would be), but rather “non-sensible”, since it is an element in the sensible objects of our experience.

Last, it should be emphasized that for Windelband and the rest of the SW Neo-Kantians, the goal of the critical philosophy is to be an “all-encompassing philosophy of culture” (Windelband 1910). In particular, they wanted to expand Kant’s critical project to those areas of culture that Kant’s original draft of critical philosophy had neglected: the so-called “Geisteswissenschaften”, principally history.

3.2 Theory of Knowledge

There are four fundamental features of the SW Neo-Kantians’ theory of knowledge: a normative theory of objectivity and objecthood; the act/content/object distinction; the rejection of the copy theory of knowledge; and a theory of what is given in perceptual experience. This section addresses each of these features in turn.

Objectivity and Objecthood

The central question that Rickert poses in his The Object of Knowledge, which is the most developed and thorough SW work in the theory of knowledge, is “What is the object of knowledge, which is independent of the subject, or in virtue of what does cognizing achieve objectivity?” (Rickert 1915: 1). In particular, Rickert is concerned with the “transcendence” of the object: that the object is an independent standard for knowledge, that it determines whether knowledge is true or objective. Rickert’s answer to these questions is that the object is a “transcendent ought” [Sollen], and not fundamentally a “transcendent being” [Sein] or “reality” [Wirklichkeit]. This is a distinctive view. It is, of course, a platitude that objects are normative in the sense that our beliefs about an object ought to be true of it. But a common view is that this normativity is derivative: our beliefs about an object ought to be a certain way, because the object itself is a certain way. On this common view, the object’s standing as a “transcendent ought” is grounded in its “transcendent being”. Rickert rejects this view. He argues that the only norms that can be derived from what is [sein], are conditional norms, to the effect that one ought to do such and such if one happens to will a certain thing—norms that are neither objective, nor independent of the subject. Such a view either undermines the theory of knowledge as a normative discipline (and truth as a value), or undermines objectivity (Rickert 1915: 281). Rickert therefore advocates upending the common view. He takes norms of cognition as basic and irreducible, and argues that the transcendent reality of objects is grounded in these irreducible cognitive norms.

In Lask 1911 and Lask 1912, Lask follows his teacher in talking of the object as “containing a value” or being the standard for knowledge. Drawing on Rickert’s ideas, he argues that the objectivity (of an object) is just the same thing as validity (of values), and that both objects and senses share this form. Nevertheless, Lask departs from Rickert’s view in two ways. First, he argues that

as we must fight every version of truth that is characterized by mirroring and shadowing, so also conversely, we must fight any assertion of a dependence in the opposite direction, a priority of theoretical validity, of the “demand”, of the “ought” before being. (Lask 1911: 410)

The transcendent being of an object is no more derivative from the normativity of our claims about that object than the latter is on the former (Lask 1908). Second, Lask argues that the object has a form and a matter, and that the form alone is what is valid. Thus the object is not itself a transcendent ought, but only its form is.[21]

Act, Content, and Object of Thinking

Lotze had distinguished psychology from the theory of knowledge (what Lotze calls “logic”) by distinguishing the acts of thinking, which are events and constitute the subject matter of psychology, from the contents of thinking, which are valid and constitute the subject matter of logic (Lotze 1874: §x; §332). This distinction was taken up and ramified by Rickert and Lask. Starting in the 1915 third edition of The Object of Knowledge, Rickert argued that the content [Gehalt] of a judgment had to be split up into two parts: the unreal [unwirklich], objective content [Gehalt], and the subjective, “immanent sense” [Urteilssinn] of the judgment. This immanent sense is distinct from the act of judging, which is “real” and the subject matter of psychology. Rickert calls the immanent sense “irreal” [irreal]. The immanent sense is the orienting of the subject toward the objective content (Rickert 1915: 164–167; Ch.3, §4). What Rickert means by this can be brought out by contrasting it with the objective content, which Rickert takes to be a whole composed of connected representations. For example, the three sentences “Is snow white?”, “Snow is white”, and “Snow is not white”, for Rickert all have the same objective content, since in all three the same representation (“white”) is predicated categorically of the same representation (“snow”). The difference is in the “immanent sense” of the sentences: the first sentence questions whether the content is true, the second affirms that the content is true, and the third denies that the content is true (Rickert 1915: 175; Ch.3, §6). Rickert’s distinction between immanent sense and objective content fits more naturally than does the simple act/content distinction with the SW conception of philosophy as the theory of values, and thus with their conception of the theory of knowledge as concerned with the norm of truth. After all, if theory of knowledge is concerned only with abstract, objective contents, then it is not clear why it would be any more normative than natural science. A science that isolates the laws of abstract things would seem just as descriptive as a science that isolates the laws of concrete things—as Husserl argued forcefully in Logical Investigations (Husserl 1900). Norms seem more suited for acts, not objective contents. But to swing in the opposite direction, and take theory of knowledge to concern acts of cognition wouldn’t help either, since the laws that govern the acts are just descriptive laws that predict what a psychophysical subject will think under certain circumstances. The theory of knowledge, however, can be normative if it concerns the element intermediate between acts and objective contents: it gives the norms for immanent senses, stances taken toward objective contents.

A different kind of refinement of the act/content/object distinction appears in Lask’s 1912 Die Lehre vom Urteil (The Doctrine of Judgment).[22] Lask wants a theory of judgment that recognizes that the object is the standard of truth; and that truth does not depend on the act of judging—just as anti-psychologism demands. Lask believes that the standard distinctions between act, content, and object do not fully recognize this. In particular, he rejects Rickert’s view that, in judging, a subject takes a stance with respect to the objective content. This is because Lask believes that the objective content is created by the act of judging, and so Rickert’s view has the unpalatable consequence that our acts of judging are about something that is created by our acts of judgment, thus violating the idea that our judgments answer to something prior to the act of judging. On the other hand, he cannot say that in judging, we judge the object itself, since all judgments have a structure (one thing is predicated of another), and the object, he argues, is an unstructured whole whose articulation into parts is a work of the mind. Lask therefore posits, in addition to the content of the judgment and the object itself, a third thing, which he calls the “primary object” (Lask 1912: Ch.1). The primary object is a structured whole, which (as structured) is distinct from the object itself, but (as structured in a way that differs from the logical structures possessed by judgments) is distinct from the content of the judgment, as well. Judging is then a decision about whether the predication in the primary object is valid, and the content is the thought that the primary object is valid. The judgment thus aims to successfully “reproduce” or “rebuild” [nachbilden] in a structured form the originally unstructured object (Lask 1912: Ch.2, §1), and truth, as the adequate rebuilding of the object, becomes a kind of correspondence (Ch.2, §2).[23]

Rejection of the Copy Theory of Knowledge

Another idea, present in Lotze, though ultimately derived from Kant, is the rejection of the copy theory [Abbildtheorie] of knowledge. “Since the Critique of Pure Reason”, Windelband writes,

the days are over once and for all when a mature philosophical consciousness might think of the world as “given” and mirrored in it, as it would seem to the naive consciousness. In everything we regard as given our reason is already at work: and the justification of our knowledge of things rests only on our first creating them for ourselves. (1910 [NKR: 318])

No knowledge, not even perceptual knowledge, is merely receptive, or a mirror, but is a product that results from the application of a priori forms to what is given. The explicit attack on the copy theory becomes more explicit in Windelband and Rickert’s writings over time: starting in the 1915 third edition of The Object of Knowledge, Rickert devotes a section (Chapter 2, section VI) explicitly to attacking the copy theory, and he devotes a late essay (Rickert 1934) to what he sees as a revival of the errors of the copy theory in Heidegger. In the latter essay, Rickert attacks “theoretical intuitionism”, the idea that cognition [Erkenntnis] is no more than intuition [Anschauung], a passive reception of the object that is given to us. Such a view implies that cognition is simply a copy of the object, which resembles it. However, he argues that intuition, the passive reception of what is given, merely gives “kennen” (acquaintance with), and not true “erkennen” (cognizing). Cognition requires a “complete transformation of the given intuition through non-intuitive factors” (1934 [NKR: 391]).

The Given

Though the SW and Marburg school agree in their rejection of the copy theory, they take very different attitudes toward the distinction between intuitions and concepts, and toward the “given”. For the Marburg school, there is nothing given; the SW School argues only that knowledge is not a copy of the given, but requires a transformation of it. For the Marburg school, there is no distinction between intuitions and concepts; for the SW School, intuitions are irreducible to concepts. These two points are developed by Rickert. He holds that the content of a sensory consciousness, what is given in perception, is a “heterogeneous continuum” and an “unsurveyable manifold” (1915: 406–7; Ch.5, §5, “Konstitutive Wirklichkeitsformen und Methodologische Erkenntnisformen”). This multiplicity of content in perception can only be felt [Erlebnis, Gefühl], since it would be an infinite (and so impossible) task to express this content in conceptual form (1915: 139; Ch.3, section 1, “Das Erkennen als Vorstellen”). So cognition cannot be a reproduction, or mirror, of what is given; the concept cannot be a reproduction of the intuition. Rather, concepts are always general, and overcome the multiplicity of the content of sensory consciousness by leaving out content that is present in intuition (Rickert 1902: Ch.1, §1). This idea is further developed by Lask (1911). He argues that a theoretical sense (e.g., the sense of this or that sentence) is composed of matter and form, that the form of the sense is validity, while the matter is the “non-valid sensible”, or “alogical content”. This material matter, though it can be taken up into a concept as its matter, is not itself conceptual, or reducible or transformable into what is conceptual. The sensible content (i.e., the content of a sensory consciousness) is “something irrational” or “foreign to meaning”, and can only be passively taken in, felt, and intuited (Lask 1911: 415–417; First Part, §3). The sense of a sentence does not mirror or copy the sensory given: the sensory given is its matter. Lask summarizes the difference between the Marburg view and this conception as a distinction between “panlogicism” (the view that all content is conceptual content—the kind of content that is the subject matter of logic) and “panarchy of logos” (his view that all content, even sensory content, can be the matter for conceptual form, without being reduced to it) (Lask 1911: 426; Second Part, Ch.1, §3).

3.3 Philosophy of Historical Sciences

Windelband’s most influential and widely-read work, and indeed, the most influential and widely-read of all of the SW Neo-Kantian writings, is his essay, “History and Natural Science”. This essay is a contribution to the philosophical debate sparked by the 19th century explosion in what we might call the human sciences—principally history, but also comparative linguistics, anthropology, and comparative religion—that seemed rigorous and so “scientific”, but that seemed to differ fundamentally from paradigm mathematical natural sciences such as physics.[24] Windelband’s chief claim is that there is an irreducible methodological difference (or, as he puts it, a “logical” difference) between history and the natural sciences.

[W]e have before us a purely methodological classification of the empirical sciences that is grounded upon sound logical concepts. The principle of classification is the formal property of the theoretical or cognitive objectives of the science in question. One kind of science is an inquiry into general laws. The other kind of science is an inquiry into specific historical facts. In the language of formal logic, the objective of the first kind of science is the general, apodictic judgment; the objective of the other kind of science is the singular, assertoric proposition. (Windelband 1894: 291)

Those sciences, such as mathematical physics, whose goal is to produce general laws are called “nomothetic”; those sciences, such as history, whose goal is to know a unique, singular individual, are called “idiographic”. The individual that is the subject of idiographic sciences need not be an individual human being, such as Caesar. It could be a unique event or sequence of events (the fall of the Roman empire); an individual nation, language, religion, or culture (Florence during the Renaissance); or a unique artifact of literature, art, or science (Homer’s Iliad). The important point is that an idiographic science has as its goal to understand an individual in all its uniqueness.[25] Nomothetic sciences want to know laws; idiographic sciences want to know unique processes. The nomothetic seeks the general, and what happens invariably; the idiographic seeks the particular, and what only happens once. Nomothetic sciences begin with what is given to intuition [Anschauung], but ascend to what is abstract and no longer intuitive; idiographic sciences proceed in the opposite direction, attempting to resurrect and reproduce a unique individual in all its vitality, detail, and intuitiveness [Anschaulichkeit].

Windelband’s chief target is the positivist philosophy of history, defended by Comte, Mill, and others. On this view, the method of history ought to be fundamentally the same as that of the natural sciences, and its goal ought to be the discovery of general laws that explain and predict historical events.[26] A secondary target of this essay is the view that history and the natural sciences can be distinguished principally in terms of their subject matter. This view is expressed by the terms “Naturwissenschaften” (sciences of nature) and “Geisteswissenschaften” (sciences of “mind” or “spirit”), which Dilthey introduced in his 1883 book Introduction to the Geisteswissenschaften. Windelband objects that when the distinction among the sciences is drawn in this way, psychology ends up as a Geisteswissenschaft like history; indeed psychology, as the empirical science of the mind, ought to be the fundamental Geisteswissenschaft on which all other Geisteswissenschaften depend. But, Windelband argues, psychology is methodologically just as much a “nomothetic” science as physics is: both try to discover mathematical laws of their phenomena through controlled experimentation.[27] And the amount of psychology that a historian needs does not go beyond what is supplied by reflective common sense; the new discoveries of empirical psychologists have been, and are likely to be, of no special significance for historians.[28]

The conception of history first sketched in Windelband’s “History and Natural Science” was thoroughly elaborated and expanded in Rickert’s The Limits of Concept Formation in Natural Science. Rickert improves on Windelband’s view in two principal ways: he systematically develops Windelband’s idea that the distinction between history and natural science must be grounded in logic, and he connects the distinction in kinds of sciences to the characteristic SW distinction between fact and value.

As Rickert’s title emphasizes, he conceived of history as a logical notion, as a certain way of forming concepts. The traditional logic, he claims, considers only concepts formed by abstracting away from individual particularities to form general representations. But this method has its limit: it cannot explain how we form concepts of individuals. History is a logical procedure for forming concepts of individuals, as, for instance, a historical work on Caesar would produce a concept of Caesar. In calling the products of historical research “concepts”, Rickert is combating the view that a historian merely collects facts and reports them. Rather, the historian sifts through the potentially infinite number of facts about her subject and isolates, using some principle of selection, the facts about her subject that are essential for history.[29] Though Rickert employs the traditional logical notion of an individual to characterize the subject of historical concepts, he uses the term in a distinctive way. Individuals are unique and they are indivisible or irreplaceable. An adequate historical concept of Julius Caesar needs to include those features that make him unique, and unlike any other individual. Rickert uses the example of the Koh-i-noor diamond to illustrate the indivisibility or irreplaceability of an historical individual. Of course there are distinctive facts about this diamond that distinguish it from all other hunks of carbon; but the same could be said of any lump of coal. However, from the point of view of history, it is indifferent whether one lump of coal that was used to power a locomotive carrying Queen Victoria would have been destroyed and replaced by some other lump of coal. But, from the point of view of history, the massive diamond that the Queen herself was wearing is hardly replaceable. Furthermore, Rickert insisted that historical concepts, although they are of an individual, are nonetheless general in the sense that the principles of selection employed in forming these concepts are universally valid for all historians.[30]

When Rickert insists that concepts of historical individuals are formed through employing principles of selection that are universally valid, he is bringing into the philosophy of history the characteristic SW distinction between fact and value. The principles of selection are given by values. The Koh-i-noor diamond is a historical individual because it is widely held to be uniquely beautiful, and it forms a central part of the crown jewels of the British monarch; it is thus related, say, to the values of beauty, social order, and national identity.[31] Rickert therefore concludes that “the claim that historical concepts have an unconditionally general validity presupposes the acknowledgment of unconditionally general values” (Rickert 1902: 360). The SW view of history thus attempts to thread the needle between positivism and more radical forms of historicism: it makes history an autonomous science, without falling into relativism. (Clearly, in arguing that the concepts of history are objectively valid, despite the fact that history does not include universal laws, the SW Neo-Kantians are rejecting the Marburg view that objective validity depends on laws. This is a paradigm case where their differing conceptions of objective validity, as normative or nomological, are brought to bear.) Indeed, Rickert claims that there are certain a priori conditions of history, just as Kant had claimed in the first Critique that there are certain a priori conditions for natural science. It is a priori that every historical individual is value-relevant. It is also a priori that there are certain values, such as beauty or social order, that are universally valid. Inasmuch as a culture is a collection of values, or value-relevant individuals, the most apt way of characterizing the subject matter of a science like history is as a science of culture, as opposed to a science of mind (Geisteswissenschaft).[32]


Works By Neo-Kantians

  • Cassirer, Ernst, 1906, Das Erkenntnisproblem in der Philosophie und Wissenschaft der neueren Zeit. Erster Band, Berlin: Bruno Cassirer.
  • –––, 1907a, Das Erkenntnisproblem in der Philosophie und Wissenschaft der neueren Zeit. Zweiter Band, Berlin: Bruno Cassirer.
  • –––, 1907b, “Kant und die moderne Mathematik”, Kant-Studien, 12: 1–40.
  • –––, 1910, Substanzbegriff und Funktionsbegriff. Untersuchungen über die Grundfragen der Erkenntniskritik, Berlin: Bruno Cassirer. Translated in Substance and Function & Einstein’s Theory of Relativity by Swabey and Swabey, Chicago: Open Court, 1923.
  • –––, 1912, “Hermann Cohen und die Erneuerung der Kantischen Philosophie”, Kant-Studien 17: 252–273. Translated as “Hermann Cohen and the Renewal of Kantian Philosophy” by Lydia Patton, in NKR, pp. 221–235.
  • –––, 1918, Kants Leben und Lehre, Berlin: Bruno Cassirer. Translated as Kant’s Life and Thought by James Haden, New Haven: Yale University Press, 1981.
  • –––, 1921, Zur Einstein’schen Relativitätstheorie, Berlin: Bruno Cassirer. Translated in Substance and Function & Einstein’s Theory of Relativity by Swabey and Swabey, Chicago: Open Court, 1923.
  • –––, 1936, Determinismus und Indeterminismus in der modernen Physik, Göteborg: Göteborgs Högskolas Årsskrift 42. Translated as Determinism and Indeterminism in Modern Physics by O. Theodor Benfey, New Haven: Yale University Press, 1954.
  • Cohen, Hermann, 1883, Das Prinzip der Infinitesimal-Methode und seine Geschichte, Berlin: Dümmler. Partially translated as The Principle of the Infinitesimal Method and its History by D. Hyder and L. Patton, in NKR, pp. 101–116.
  • –––, 1885, Kants Theorie der Erfahrung, 2nd ed., Berlin: Dümmler. 1st ed: 1871. Partially translated as Kant’s Theory of Experience by D. Hyder in NKR, pp. 107–116.
  • –––, 1898, “Biographisches Vorwort und Einleitung mit kritischem Nachtrag”, in Friedrich Lange, Geschichte des Materialismus und Kritik seiner Bedeutung in der Gegenwart, 6th ed., Leipzig: Baedeker, pp. xv–lxxvi. Second, expanded revision of “Einleitung”, appears in the 7th ed. of Lange, Geschichte, 1902. Partially translated (from the 9th ed., Leipzig: F. Brandstetter, 1914–5) as “Introduction, with Critical Remarks” by Lydia Patton in NKR, pp. 117–136.
  • –––, 1902, Logik der reinen Erkenntnis. Berlin: Bruno Cassirer.
  • –––, 1904, System der Philosophie, Zweiter Teil: Ethik der reinen Willens, Berlin: Bruno Cassirer.
  • –––, 1912, System der Philosophie, Dritter Teil: Ästhetik der reinen Gefühls, Berlin: Bruno Cassirer.
  • –––, 1919, Die Religion der Vernunft aus den Quellen des Judentums, Leipzig: Fock. Translated as Religion of Reason: Out of the Sources of Judaism, by Simon Kaplan, New York: Frederick Unger, 1972.
  • Lask, Emil, 1902, Fichtes Idealismus und die Geschichte, Tübingen und Leipzig: Mohr Siebeck.
  • –––, 1908, “Gibt es einen Primat der praktischen Vernunft in der Logik?”, in Gesammelte Schriften I, Eugen Herrigel (ed.), Tübingen: Mohr, 1923, pp. 347–56.
  • –––, 1911, Die Logik der Philosophie und die Kategorienlehre. Eine Studie über den Herrschaftsbereich der logischen Form, Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck. Translated as The Logic of Philosophy and the Doctrine of Categories, by Christian Braun, Free Association Books, 1999; partially translated by Arun Iyer in NKR, pp. 401–427.
  • –––, 1912, Die Lehre vom Urteil, Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck.
  • Luft, Sebastian (ed.), 2015 [NKR], The Neo-Kantian Reader, New York: Routledge.
  • Natorp, Paul, 1881, Descartes’ Erkenntnistheorie. Eine Studie zur Vorgeschichte des Kritizismus, Marburg: Elwert.
  • –––, 1887, “Ueber objektive und subjektive Begründung der Erkenntniss”, Philosophische Monatshefte 23: 257–286. Translated as “On the Objective and Subjective Grounding of Knowledge”, by Phillips, L., Kolb, D., Journal of the British Society for Phenomenology 12 (1981): 245–266. Reprinted in NKR, pp. 164–179.
  • –––, 1903, Platos Ideenlehre: Eine Einführung in den Idealismus, Leipzig: Dürr.
  • –––, 1905, Philosophische Propadeutik, 2nd ed., Marburg: Elwert.
  • –––, 1910, Die logischen Grundlagen der exakten Wissenschaft, Leipzig and Berlin. Partially translated as The Logical Foundations of Exact Science, by Frances Bottenberg, in NKR, pp. 198–213.
  • –––, 1911, Philosophie: Ihr Problem und ihre Probleme: Einführung in den kritischen Idealismus, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht.
  • –––, 1912a, “Kant und die Marburger Schule”, Kant-Studien 17: 193–221. Translated as “Kant and the Marburg School”, by Frances Bottenberg, in NKR, pp. 180–197.
  • –––, 1912b, Allgemeine Psychologie nach kritischer Methode, Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck.
  • Rickert, Heinrich, 1888, Zur Lehre von der Definition, 2nd ed., Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck, 1915. 1st ed: 1888.
  • –––, 1902, Die Grenzen der naturwissenschaftlichen Begriffsbildung. Eine logische Einleitung in die historischen Wissenschaften, 6th improved ed., Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck, 1929. 1st ed: 1902. Translated (abridged) as The Limits of Concept Formation in Natural Science, by Guy Oakes, Cambridge University Press, 1986; partially excerpted in NKR, pp. 331–383. Page citations are to the excerpts in NKR.
  • –––, 1911, “Das Eine, die Einheit und die Eins. Bemerkungen zur Logik des Zahlbegriffs”, Logos, 2: 26–78.
  • –––, 1915, Der Gegenstand der Erkenntnis. Eine Einführung in die Transzendentalphilosophie, 3rd ed., Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck. 1st ed: 1892; 2nd ed: 1904; 4th and 5th: 1921.
  • –––, 1934, “Kennen und Erkennen. Kritische Bemerkungen zum theoretischen Intuitionismus”, Kant-Studien, 39: 139–155. Translated as “Knowing and Cognizing” by Jon Burmeiser, in NKR, pp. 384–395.
  • Windelband, Wilhelm, 1883, “Kritische oder Genetische Methode?” in Präludien, vol.2, 5th ed., pp. 99–135. Translated as “Critical or Genetic Method?” by Alan Duncan, in NKR, pp. 271–286.
  • –––, 1891, Geschichte der Philosophie. Translated as A History of Philosophy: With Especial Reference to the Formation and Development of Its Problems and Conceptions, by James H. Tufts, London: Macmillan, 1893.
  • –––, 1894, “Geschichte und Naturwissenschaft”, in Präludien, vol.2, 5th ed., pp. 136–160. Translated as “History and Natural Science”, by Guy Oakes, in NKR, pp. 287–298.
  • –––, 1910, “Kulturphilosophie und transzendentaler Idealismus”, in Präludien, vol.2, 5th ed., pp. 279–294. Translated as “Philosophy of Culture and Transcendental Idealism”, by Alan Duncan, in NKR, pp. 317–324.
  • –––, 1915, Präludien. Aufsätze und Reden zur Philosophie und ihrer Geschichte, 2 Vols., 5th expanded edition, Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck. 1st ed.: 1883. 2nd ed.: 1902; 3rd ed.: 1907; 4th ed.: 1911.

Other Primary Sources

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  • –––, 1894, “Ideen über eine beschreibende und zergliedernde Psychologie”, reprinted in Gesammelte Schriften, vol.5, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1924, pp. 139–240. Translated as “Ideas for a Descriptive and Analytic Psychology”, by R.A. Makkreel and F. Rodi in Selected Works, vol. II, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2010, pp. 115–210.
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  • –––, 1868, “Über die Thatsachen, welche der Geometrie zu Grunde liegen”, Nachrichten von der Königl. Gesellschaft der Wissenschaft zu Göttingen, 9: 193–221. Translated as “On the Facts Underlying Geometry”, by M.F. Lowe, in Epistemological Writings, Robert Cohen and Yehuda Elkana (eds.), Boston: Reidel, 1977, pp.39–58.
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  • –––, 1783, Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics that will be able to Come Forward as Science, translated by G. Hatfield, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
  • –––, 1786, Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, translated by Michael Friedman, in Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, Henry Allison and Peter Heath (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002, pp. 171–269.
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  • –––, 1856–64, Mikrokosmus: Ideen zur Naturgeschichte und Geschichte der Menschheit, 3 vols., Leipzig: Hirzel. Translated as Microcosmus: An Essay Concerning Man and His Relation to the World, 2 vols., by E. Hamilton and E. E. C. Jones, Edinburgh: T. & T. Clark, 1885.
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