Friedrich Nietzsche

First published Fri Mar 17, 2017; substantive revision Thu May 19, 2022

Friedrich Nietzsche (1844–1900) was a German philosopher and cultural critic who published intensively in the 1870s and 1880s. He is famous for uncompromising criticisms of traditional European morality and religion, as well as of conventional philosophical ideas and social and political pieties associated with modernity. Many of these criticisms rely on psychological diagnoses that expose false consciousness infecting people’s received ideas; for that reason, he is often associated with a group of late modern thinkers (including Marx and Freud) who advanced a “hermeneutics of suspicion” against traditional values (see Foucault [1964] 1990, Ricoeur [1965] 1970, Leiter 2004). Nietzsche also used his psychological analyses to support original theories about the nature of the self and provocative proposals suggesting new values that he thought would promote cultural renewal and improve social and psychological life by comparison to life under the traditional values he criticized.

1. Life and Works

Nietzsche was born on October 15, 1844, in Röcken (near Leipzig), where his father was a Lutheran minister. His father died in 1849, and the family relocated to Naumburg, where he grew up in a household comprising his mother, grandmother, two aunts, and his younger sister, Elisabeth. Nietzsche had a brilliant school and university career, culminating in May 1869 when he was called to a chair in classical philology at Basel. At age 24, he was the youngest ever appointed to that post. His teacher Friedrich Wilhelm Ritschl wrote in his letter of reference that Nietzsche was so promising that “He will simply be able to do anything he wants to do” (Kaufmann 1954: 8). Most of Nietzsche’s university work and his early publications were in philology, but he was already interested in philosophy, particularly the work of Arthur Schopenhauer and Friedrich Albert Lange. Before the opportunity at Basel arose, Nietzsche had planned to pursue a second Ph.D. in philosophy, with a project about theories of teleology in the time since Kant.

When he was a student in Leipzig, Nietzsche met Richard Wagner, and after his move to Basel, he became a frequent guest in the Wagner household at Villa Tribschen in Lucerne. Nietzsche’s friendship with Wagner (and Cosima Liszt Wagner) lasted into the mid-1870s, and that friendship—together with their ultimate break—were key touchstones in his personal and professional life. His first book, The Birth of Tragedy out of the Spirit of Music (1872), was not the careful work of classical scholarship the field might have expected, but a controversial polemic combining speculations about the collapse of the tragic culture of fifth-century Athens with a proposal that Wagnerian music-drama might become the source of a renewed tragic culture for contemporary Germany. The work was generally ill-received within classical studies—and savagely reviewed by Ulrich Wilamovitz-Möllendorff, who went on to become one of the leading classicists of the generation—even though it contained some striking interpretive insights (e.g., about the role of the chorus in Greek tragedy). Following the first book, Nietzsche continued his efforts to influence the broader direction of German intellectual culture, publishing essays intended for a wide public on David Friedrich Strauss, on the “use of history for life”, on Schopenhauer, and on Wagner. These essays are known collectively as the Untimely Meditations.

Although he assisted in early planning for Wagner’s Bayreuth project and attended the first festival, Nietzsche was not favorably impressed by the cultural atmosphere there, and his relationship with the Wagners soured after 1876. Nietzsche’s health, always fragile, forced him to take leave from Basel in 1876–77. He used the time to explore a broadly naturalistic critique of traditional morality and culture—an interest encouraged by his friendship with Paul Rée, who was with Nietzsche in Sorrento working on his Origin of Moral Sensations (see Janaway 2007: 74–89; Small 2005). Nietzsche’s research resulted in Human, All-too-human (1878), which introduced his readers to the corrosive attacks on conventional pieties for which he became famous, as well as to a style of writing in short, numbered paragraphs and pithy aphorisms to which he often returned in later work. When he sent the book to the Wagners early in 1878, it effectively ended their friendship: Nietzsche later wrote that his book and Wagner’s Parsifal libretto crossed in the mail “as if two swords had crossed” (EH III, HH, 5).

Nietzsche’s health did not measurably improve during the leave, and by 1879, he was forced to resign his professorship altogether. As a result, he was freed to write and to develop the style that suited him. He published a book almost every year thereafter. These works began with Daybreak (1881), which collected critical observations on morality and its underlying psychology, and there followed the mature works for which Nietzsche is best known: The Gay Science (1882, second expanded edition 1887), Thus Spoke Zarathustra (1883–5), Beyond Good and Evil (1886), On the Genealogy of Morality (1887), and in the last year of his productive life Twilight of the Idols (1888) and The Wagner Case (1888), along with The Antichrist and his intellectual biography, Ecce Homo, which were published only later. At the beginning of this period, Nietzsche enjoyed an intense but ultimately painful friendship with Rée and Lou Salomé, a brilliant young Russian student. The three initially planned to live together in a kind of intellectual commune, but Nietzsche and Rée both developed romantic interest in Salomé, and after Nietzsche unsuccessfully proposed marriage, Salomé and Rée departed for Berlin. Salomé later wrote an illuminating book about Nietzsche (Salomé [1894] 2001), which first proposed an influential periodization of his philosophical development.

In later years, Nietzsche moved frequently in the effort to find a climate that would improve his health, settling into a pattern of spending winters near the Mediterranean (usually in Italy) and summers in Sils Maria, Switzerland. His symptoms included intense headaches, nausea, and trouble with his eyesight. Recent work (Huenemann 2013) has convincingly argued that he probably suffered from a retro-orbital meningioma, a slow-growing tumor on the brain surface behind his right eye. In January 1889, Nietzsche collapsed in the street in Turin, and when he regained consciousness he wrote a series of increasingly deranged letters. His close Basel friend Franz Overbeck was gravely concerned and travelled to Turin, where he found Nietzsche suffering from dementia. After unsuccessful treatment in Basel and Jena, he was released into the care of his mother, and later his sister, eventually lapsing entirely into silence. He lived on until 1900, when he died of a stroke complicated by pneumonia.

During his illness, his sister Elisabeth assumed control of his literary legacy, and she eventually published The Antichrist and Ecce Homo, as well as a selection of writing from his notebooks for which she used the title The Will to Power, following Nietzsche’s remark in the Genealogy (GM III, 27) that he planned a major work under that title. The editorial work was not well founded in Nietzsche’s surviving plans for the book and was also marred by Elisabeth’s strong anti-Semitic commitments, which had been extremely distressing to Nietzsche himself. As a result, The Will to Power leaves a somewhat misleading impression of the general character and content of the writings left in Nietzsche’s notebooks. That writing is now available in an outstanding critical edition (KGA, more widely available in KSA; English translations of selections are available in WEN and WLN.)

Nietzsche’s life has been the subject of several full-length biographies (Hayman 1980, Cate 2002, Safranski 2003, Young 2010, Prideaux 2018), as well as speculative fictional reconstructions (Yalom 1992); readers can find more details about his life and particular works in the entry on Nietzsche’s Life and Works and in the articles comprising the first three parts of Gemes and Richardson (2013), as well as in Meyer (2019), which treats the publication strategy of Nietzsche’s “middle period” works (HH, D, GS).

2. Critique of Religion and Morality

Nietzsche is arguably most famous for his criticisms of traditional European moral commitments, together with their foundations in Christianity. This critique is very wide-ranging; it aims to undermine not just religious faith or philosophical moral theory, but also many central aspects of ordinary moral consciousness, some of which are difficult to imagine doing without (e.g., altruistic concern, guilt for wrongdoing, moral responsibility, the value of compassion, the demand for equal consideration of persons, and so on).

By the time Nietzsche wrote, it was common for European intellectuals to assume that such ideas, however much inspiration they owed to the Christian intellectual and faith tradition, needed a rational grounding independent from particular sectarian or even ecumenical religious commitments. Then as now, most philosophers assumed that a secular vindication of morality would surely be forthcoming and would save the large majority of our standard commitments. Nietzsche found that confidence naïve, and he deployed all his rhetorical prowess to shock his readers out of complacency on this score. For example, his doubts about the viability of Christian underpinnings for moral and cultural life are not offered in a sunny spirit of anticipated liberation, nor does he present a sober but basically confident call to develop a secular understanding of morality; instead, he launches the famous, aggressive and paradoxical pronouncement that “God is dead” (GS 108, 125, 343). The idea is not so much that atheism is true—in GS 125, he depicts this pronouncement arriving as fresh news to a group of atheists—but instead that because “the belief in the Christian God has become unbelievable”, everything that was “built upon this faith, propped up by it, grown into it”, including “the whole of our European morality”, is destined for “collapse” (GS 343). Christianity no longer commands society-wide cultural allegiance as a framework grounding ethical commitments, and thus, a common basis for collective life that was supposed to have been immutable and invulnerable has turned out to be not only less stable than we assumed, but incomprehensibly mortal—and in fact, already lost. The response called for by such a turn of events is mourning and deep disorientation.

Indeed, the case is even worse than that, according to Nietzsche. Not only do standard moral commitments lack a foundation we thought they had, but stripped of their veneer of unquestionable authority, they prove to have been not just baseless but positively harmful. Unfortunately, the moralization of our lives has insidiously attached itself to genuine psychological needs—some basic to our condition, others cultivated by the conditions of life under morality—so its corrosive effects cannot simply be removed without further psychological damage. Still worse, the damaging side of morality has implanted itself within us in the form of a genuine self-understanding, making it hard for us to imagine ourselves living any other way. Thus, Nietzsche argues, we are faced with a difficult, long term restoration project in which the most cherished aspects of our way of life must be ruthlessly investigated, dismantled, and then reconstructed in healthier form—all while we continue somehow to sail the ship of our common ethical life on the high seas.

The most extensive development of this Nietzschean critique of morality appears in his late work On the Genealogy of Morality, which consists of three treatises, each devoted to the psychological examination of a central moral idea. In the First Treatise, Nietzsche takes up the idea that moral consciousness consists fundamentally in altruistic concern for others. He begins by observing a striking fact, namely, that this widespread conception of what morality is all about—while entirely commonsensical—is not the essence of any possible morality, but a historical innovation.

To make the case for historical change, he identifies two patterns of ethical assessment, each associated with a basic pair of evaluative terms, a good/bad pattern and a good/evil pattern. Understood according to the good/bad pattern, the idea of goodness originated in social class privilege: the good were first understood to be those of the higher social order, but then eventually the idea of goodness was “internalized”—i.e., transferred from social class itself to traits of character and other personal excellences that were typically associated with the privileged caste (for example, the virtue of courage for a society with a privileged military class, or magnanimity for one with a wealthy elite, or truthfulness and (psychological) nobility for a culturally ambitious aristocracy; see GM I, 4–5). In such a system, goodness is associated with exclusive virtues. There is no thought that everyone should be excellent—the very idea makes no sense, since to be excellent is to be distinguished from the ordinary run of people. In that sense, good/bad valuation arises out of a “pathos of distance” (GM I, 2) expressing the superiority excellent people feel over ordinary ones, and it gives rise to a “noble morality” (BGE 260). Nietzsche shows convincingly that this pattern of assessment was dominant in ancient Mediterranean culture (the Homeric world, later Greek and Roman society, and even much of ancient philosophical ethics).

The good/evil pattern of valuation is quite different. It focuses its negative evaluation (evil) on violations of the interests or well-being of others—and consequently its positive evaluation (good) on altruistic concern for their welfare. Such a morality has universalistic pretensions: if it is to promote and protect the welfare of all, its restrictions and injunctions must apply to everyone equally. It is thereby especially amenable to ideas of basic human equality, starting from the thought that each person has an equal claim to moral consideration and respect. These are familiar ideas in the modern context—so familiar, indeed, that Nietzsche observes how easily we confuse them with “the moral manner of valuation as such” (GM Pref., 4)—but the universalist structure, altruistic sentiments, and egalitarian tendency of those values mark an obvious contrast with the valuation of exclusive virtues in the good/bad pattern. The contrast, together with the prior dominance of good/bad structured moralities, raises a straightforward historical question: what happened? How did we get from the widespread acceptance of good/bad valuation to the near universal dominance of good/evil thinking?

Nietzsche’s famous answer is unflattering to our modern conception. He insists that the transformation was the result of a “slave revolt in morality” (GM I, 10; cf. BGE 260). The exact nature of this alleged revolt is a matter of ongoing scholarly controversy (in recent literature, see Bittner 1994; Reginster 1997, 2021; Migotti 1998; Ridley 1998; May 1999: 41–54; Janaway 2007: 90–106, 223–9; Owen 2007: 78–89; Wallace 2007; Anderson 2011; Poellner 2011; Leiter 2015: 155–77; Snelson 2017; Jenkins 2018; Huddleston 2021), but the broad outline is clear enough. People who suffered from oppression at the hands of the noble, excellent, (but uninhibited) people valorized by good/bad morality—and who were denied any effective recourse against them by relative powerlessness—developed a persistent, corrosive emotional pattern of resentful hatred against their enemies, which Nietzsche calls ressentiment. That emotion motivated the development of the new moral concept evil, purpose-designed for the moralistic condemnation of those enemies. (How conscious or unconscious—how “strategic” or not—this process is supposed to have been is one matter of scholarly controversy.) Afterward, via negation of the concept of evil, the new concept of goodness emerges, rooted in altruistic concern of a sort that would inhibit evil actions. Moralistic condemnation using these new values does little by itself to satisfy the motivating desire for revenge, but if the new way of thinking could spread, gaining more adherents and eventually influencing the evaluations even of the nobility, then the revenge might be impressive—indeed, “the most spiritual” form of revenge (GM I, 7; see also GM I, 10–11). For in that case, the revolt would accomplish a “radical revaluation” (GM I, 7) that would corrupt the very values that gave the noble way of life its character and made it seem admirable in the first place.

For Nietzsche, then, our morality amounts to a vindictive effort to poison the happiness of the fortunate (GM III, 14), instead of a high-minded, dispassionate, and strictly rational concern for others. This can seem hard to accept, both as an account of how the valuation of altruistic concern originated and even more as a psychological explanation of the basis of altruism in modern people, who are far removed from the social conditions that figure in Nietzsche’s story. That said, Nietzsche offers two strands of evidence sufficient to give pause to an open-minded reader. In the Christian context, he points to the surprising prevalence of what one might call the “brimstone, hellfire, and damnation diatribe” in Christian letters and sermons: Nietzsche cites at length a striking example from Tertullian (GM I, 15), but that example is the tip of a very large iceberg, and it is a troubling puzzle what this genre of “vengeful outbursts” (GM I, 16) is even doing within (what is supposed to be) a religion of love and forgiveness. Second, Nietzsche observes with confidence-shaking perspicacity how frequently indignant moralistic condemnation itself, whether arising in serious criminal or public matters or from more private personal interactions, can detach itself from any measured assessment of the wrong and devolve into a free-floating expression of vengeful resentment against some (real or imagined) perpetrator. The spirit of such condemnations is disturbingly often more in line with Nietzsche’s diagnosis of altruism than it is with our conventional (but possibly self-satisfied) moral self-understanding.

The First Treatise does little, however, to suggest why inhabitants of a noble morality might be at all moved by such condemnations, generating a question about how the moral revaluation could have succeeded. Nothing internal to the nobles’ value system gives them any grounds for general altruistic concern or any reason to pay heed to the complaints of those whom they have already dismissed as contemptible. The Second Treatise, about guilt and bad conscience, offers some materials toward an answer to this puzzle.

Nietzsche begins from the insight that guilt bears a close conceptual connection to the notion of debt. Just as a debtor’s failure to repay gives the creditor the right to seek alternative compensation (whether via some remedy spelled out in a contract, or less formally, through general social or legal sanctions), so a guilty party owes the victim some form of response to the violation, which serves as a kind of compensation for whatever harm was suffered. Nietzsche’s conjectural history of the “moralized” (GM II, 21) notion of guilt suggests that it developed through a transfer of this structure—which pairs each loss to some (punishment-involving) compensation—from the domain of material debt to a wider class of actions that violate some socially accepted norm. The really important conceptual transformation, however, is not the transfer itself, but an accompanying purification and internalization of the feeling of indebtedness, which connect the demand for compensation to a source of wrongful action that is supposed to be entirely within the agent’s control. The condemnation of the violation thereby attaches a negative assessment to the guilty person’s basic sense of personal worth.

The highly purified character of moralized guilt suggests how it might be a powerful tool for moral revaluation and simultaneously indicates some of Nietzsche’s reasons for skepticism against it. As Williams (1993a) observes, a purified notion of guilt pertaining to what is completely under the agent’s control (and so entirely immune from luck) stands in a particularly tight fit with blame: “Blame needs an occasion—an action—and a target—the person who did the action and goes on to meet the blame” (Williams 1993a: 10). The pure idea of moralized guilt answers this need by tying any wrong action inextricably and uniquely to a blamable agent. As we saw, the impulse to assign blame was central to the ressentiment that motivated the moral revaluation of values, according to the First Treatise. Thus, insofar as people (even nobles) become susceptible to such moralized guilt, they might also become vulnerable to the revaluation, and Nietzsche offers some speculations about how and why this might happen (GM II, 16–17).

But Nietzsche’s main concern in the Second Treatise is the danger he takes moralized guilt to pose to psychological health. These criticisms have attracted an increasingly subtle secondary literature; see Reginster (2011, 2018, 2021), as well as Williams (1993a, b), Ridley (1998), May (1999: 55–80), Risse (2001, 2005), Janaway (2007: 124–42), Owen (2007: 91–112), Migotti (2013), and Leiter (2015: 178–95). One salient thought is that guilt’s very purity makes it liable to turn against the agent herself—even in cases where it plays no legitimate role in self-regulation, or in ways that outstrip any such role. For example, given guilt’s intense internalization, no connection to an actual victim is essential to it. Any observer of the violation (whether real or ideal/imagined) can equally be entitled to resent the guilty party, and that fact makes space for religious or ideological systems to attach guilt to practically any kind of rule violation, even when no one was harmed. In such cases, free-floating guilt can lose its social and moral point and develop into a pathological desire for self-punishment.

The Genealogy’s Third Treatise explores the intensification of such self-punishment via the idealization of asceticism. Ascetic self-denial is a curious phenomenon. (Indeed, on certain psychological assumptions, like descriptive psychological egoism or ordinary hedonism, it seems incomprehensible.) But it is nevertheless strikingly widespread in the history of religious practice. The Genealogy misses no chance to criticize religious versions of asceticism, but its target is broader—including, specifically, the more rational form asceticism takes in Schopenhauer’s ethics. What unifies the different versions is their extension of the valorization of self-discipline in the interest of virtue (which Nietzsche himself would advocate) into a thoroughgoing form of self-condemnation, in which self-discipline is turned against the agent herself and comes to express the person’s commitment to her own fundamental worthlessness. (One obvious route to such a value system, though far from the only one, is for the moralist to identify a set of drives and desires that people are bound to have—perhaps rooted in their human or animal nature—and to condemn those as evil; anti-sensualist forms of asceticism follow this path.)

As Nietzsche emphasizes, purified guilt is naturally recruited as a tool for developing asceticism. Suffering is an inevitable part of the human condition, and the ascetic strategy is to interpret such suffering as punishment, thereby connecting it to the notion of guilt. Despite turning her own suffering against her, the move paradoxically offers certain advantages to the agent—not only does her suffering gain an explanation and moral justification, but her own activity can be validated by being enlisted on the side of punishment (self-castigation):

For every sufferer instinctively seeks a cause for his suffering; still more precisely, a perpetrator, still more specifically, a guilty perpetrator who is susceptible to suffering,


the ascetic priest says to him: “That’s right, my sheep! Someone must be to blame for it; but you yourself are this someone, you alone are to blame for it—you alone are to blame for yourself!”. (GM III, 15)

Thus, Nietzsche suggests,

The principal bow stroke the ascetic priest allowed himself to cause the human soul to resound with wrenching and ecstatic music of every kind was executed—everyone knows this—by exploiting the feeling of guilt. (GM III, 20)

Given that guilt involves a serious diminution of personal worth, the effects of this guilt-inflected ascetic self-understanding must be extremely destructive for the agent’s sense of self-worth, and ultimately for psychological health.

Nietzsche’s account places asceticism in an unattractive light, but the ascetic conception of morality is by no means refuted by argument through these considerations. Consider, for example, the stance of Schopenhauerian pessimism, according to which human life and the world have negative absolute value. From that standpoint, the moralist can perfectly well allow that ascetic valuation is self-punishing and even destructive for the moral agent, but such conclusions are entirely consistent with—indeed, they seem like warranted responses to—the pessimistic evaluation. That is, if life is an inherent evil and nothingness is a concrete improvement over existence, then diminishing or impairing life through asceticism yields a net enhancement of value. Nietzsche’s concern is not so much to refute that view as to diagnose it. He insists that such evaluative commitments are symptoms of psychological and cultural sickness, and that the ascetic response is an “instinctive”, but ultimately self-defeating, effort at self-medication (GM III, 13, 16). While asceticism imposes self-discipline on the sick practitioner, it simultaneously makes the person sicker, plunging her into intensified inner conflict (GM III, 15, 20–21). Thus, Nietzsche’s fundamental objection to asceticism is that it is psychologically destructive and practically self-defeating, even for those (the sick) for whom it does its best work—and this is so even if it remains (from a certain perspective) the best they can do for themselves in their condition.

While this section has focused on the Genealogy, it is worth noting that its three studies are offered only as examples of Nietzschean skepticism about conventional moral ideas. In The Antichrist, Nietzsche extended these criticisms of the specifically Christian psychological, cognitive, and evaluative foundations for morality (an extension which has been the subject of extensive recent discussion; see, e.g., Snelson 2017; Berry 2019; and the papers included in Conway 2019), and his other works criticize many other moral ideas.

To highlight just one example, Nietzsche attacks the value of compassion (another central element in Schopenhauer’s moral theory). Nietzsche tried out many different arguments against pity and compassion beginning already in Human, All-too-human (1878) and continuing to the end of his productive life—for discussion, see Reginster (2000), Janaway (2017a, 2017b), and Nussbaum (1994). At times, he emphasized the ad hominem suggestion that compassion is less altruistic than it seems, either based on the La Rochefoucauld-inspired reasoning that apparently altruistic compassion is in reality just cloaked egoism (D 133), or based on the psychologically subtle point that the satisfactions of pity essentially involve a feeling of “small superiority” over others (GM III, 18)—(note that Rousseau relies on a similar observation as part of his defense of pity’s role in moral development; Rousseau [1762] 1979: 221). But Nietzsche’s deeper complaints begin from the observation that a morality of compassion centers attention on the problem of suffering, presupposing that suffering is bad as such. Nietzsche resists the hedonistic doctrine that pleasure and pain lie at the basis of all value claims, which would be the most natural way to defend such a presupposition. If he is right that there are other values, independent of consequences for pleasures and pains, that fact raises the possibility that the ultimate value of any particular incidence of suffering could depend on the role it plays in the sufferer’s life overall and how it might contribute to those other values; in that case, its badness would not follow immediately from the bare fact that it is suffering. Nietzsche builds this idea into an argument against the morality of compassion, suggesting that suffering may sometimes promote a person’s growth, or progress toward excellence (GS 338; see also Janaway 2017a). From that point of view, the morality of compassion looks both presumptuous and misguided. It is presumptuous because it concludes from the outside that a person’s suffering must be bad, thereby flattening out “what is most personal” (GS 338) in the person’s life and interfering with her deciding for herself on the value of her suffering. It is misguided both because it runs the risk of robbing individuals of their opportunity to make something positive (individually meaningful) out of their suffering, and because the global devaluation of suffering as such dismisses in advance the potentially valuable aspects of our general condition as vulnerable and finite creatures (GS 338; compare Williams 1973: 82–100).

This survey hits only a few highlights of Nietzsche’s far-reaching critique of traditional moral and religious values, which extends to many other moral ideas (e.g., sin, otherworldly transcendence, the doctrine of free will, the value of selflessness, anti-sensualist moral outlooks, and more). For him, however, human beings remain valuing creatures in the last analysis. It follows that no critique of traditional values could be practically effective without suggesting replacement values capable of meeting our needs as valuers (see GS 347; Anderson 2009, esp. at 225–7; Richardson 2020 attempts a systematization of the replacement values). Nietzsche thought it was the job of philosophers to create such values (BGE 211), so readers have long and rightly expected to find an account of value creation in his works.

3. Value Creation

Unfortunately, neither Nietzsche’s ideas about the nature of value creation nor his suggestions about what specific values should be “created” have seemed as clear to readers as his negative critique of traditional values. (The disparity is often marked in the literature by doubts about whether Nietzsche has a “positive” ethics to offer.) There is something to this reaction: Nietzsche’s critique has a clear target and is developed at an extended scale, whereas his suggestions about alternative values can seem scattered or telegraphic. That said, it is not as though Nietzsche is the least bit shy about making evaluatively loaded claims, including “positive” ones. To some extent, disappointment among commentators in search of “positive views” arises from our looking for the wrong things—for example, seeking a systematically organized axiological theory when Nietzsche himself is skeptical of any such project, or expecting any “positive” ethics to accommodate certain “moral intuitions” which Nietzsche is more inclined to challenge than to save. This section surveys some territory Nietzsche covers under the heading “value creation”. After mentioning different options for understanding the nature of such “creation”, it explores some of the values he promotes.

3.1 Nietzsche’s Meta-ethical Stance and the Nature of Value Creation

Nietzsche’s talk about the creation of values challenges philosophical common sense. It is common, if not altogether standard, to explain values by contrasting them against mere desires. Both are positive attitudes toward some object or state of affairs (“pro-attitudes”), but valuing seems to involve an element of objectivity absent in desiring. (Consider: If I become convinced that something I valued is not in fact valuable, that discovery is normally sufficient to provoke me to revise my value, suggesting that valuing must be responsive to the world; by contrast, subjective desires often persist even in the face of my judgment that their objects are not properly desirable, or are unattainable; see the entries on value theory and desire.) Nietzsche challenges this basic philosophical conception when he treats value as “created” rather than discovered in the world:

We [contemplatives] … are those who really continually fashion something that had not been there before: the whole eternally growing world of valuations, colors, accents, perspectives, scales, affirmations, and negations. … Whatever has value in our world now does not have value in itself, according to its nature—nature is always value-less—but has been given value at some time, as a present—and it was we who gave and bestowed it. Only we have created the world that concerns man! (GS 301; see also GS 78, 109, 139, 143, 276, 289, 290, 299; Z I, 17, 22, II, 20, III, 12; BGE 203, 211, 260, 261, 285; TI IX, 9, 24, 49)

Passages like GS 301 have an unmistakable subjectivist flavor, tracing value to some source in our own attitudes and/or agency, but it is a difficult question how this subjectivist strand of Nietzsche’s thought is to be reconciled with his ubiquitous (and uncompromising, unqualified) insistence that his own value judgments are correct and those he opposes are false, or even rest on lies. Some scholars take the value creation passages as evidence that Nietzsche was an anti-realist about value, so that his confident evaluative judgments should be read as efforts at rhetorical persuasion rather than objective claims (Leiter 2015), or (relatedly) they suggest that Nietzsche could fruitfully be read as a skeptic, so that such passages should be evaluated primarily for their practical effect on readers (Berry 2011, 2019; see also Leiter 2014). Such skeptical readings have been thoughtfully challenged by Huddleston (2014). Others (Hussain 2007) take Nietzsche to be advocating a fictionalist posture, according to which values are self-consciously invented contributions to a pretense through which we can satisfy our needs as valuing creatures, even though all evaluative claims are (strictly speaking) false. Still others (Richardson 2004; Reginster 2006; Anderson 2005, 2009; Silk 2015, 2018) are tempted to suppose that Nietzsche’s talk of “creation” is meant to suggest one or another form of “constructivism,” according to which value claims are “attitude-dependent” in some definite respect that requires careful specification, or “subjective realism”—a view according to which values have some basis in subjective attitudes of valuing, but nevertheless also gain some kind of objective standing in the world once those attitudes have done their work and “created” the values.

Nietzsche’s meta-ethical stance is treated elsewhere (see Section 3 of the entry on Nietzsche’s moral and political philosophy), but even aside from the meta-ethical status of “created” values, the very idea of “value creation” is challenging to understand. This continues to be a very active area of research, with quite different recent accounts appearing in Richardson (2020: 439–74), Clark (2015b), Dries (2015), and others. In lieu of a fuller discussion, here are three textual observations. First, while a few passages appear to offer a conception of value creation as some kind of legislative fiat (e.g., BGE 211), such a view is hard to reconcile with the dominant strand of passages, which presents value creation as a difficult achievement characterized by substantial worldly constraints and significant exposure to luck, rather than something that could be done at will. Second, a great many of the passages (esp. GS 78, 107, 290, 299, 301) connect value creation to artistic creation, suggesting that Nietzsche took artistic creation and aesthetic value as an important paradigm or model for his account of values and value creation more generally. While some (Soll 2001) attack this entire idea as confused, other scholars have called on these passages as support for either fictionalist or subjective realist interpretations. In addition, Huddleston (2019) shows that investigations into the creation of artistic and cultural value with real intersubjective purchase was utterly central to Nietzsche’s very conception of philosophy and its proper ambitions. Progress in this area is likely to come from careful interrogation of Nietzsche’s conception of artistic creation itself. Finally, Nietzsche’s account of “revaluation” remains an understudied source of examples for what he might mean by “value creation”. After all, the moral revaluation achieved by the “slave revolt in morality” (see section 2) is presented as a creation of new values (GM I, 10, et passim). In addition to showing that not all value creation leads to results that Nietzsche would endorse, this observation leads to interesting questions—e.g., Did Nietzsche hold that all value creation operates via revaluation (as suggested, perhaps, by GM II, 12–13)? Or is “value creation ex nihilo” also supposed to be a possibility? If so, what differentiates the two modes? Can we say anything about which is to be preferred? etc.

3.2 Some Nietzschean Values

Aside from issues about what it is to create values in the first place, many readers find themselves puzzled about what “positive” values Nietzsche means to promote. One plausible explanation for readers’ persisting sense of unclarity is that Nietzsche disappoints the expectation that philosophy should offer a reductive (or at least, highly systematized) account of the good, along the lines of “Pleasure is the good”; “The only thing that is truly good is the good will”; “The best life is characterized by tranquility”; or the like. Nietzsche praises many different values, and in the main, he does not follow the stereotypically philosophical strategy of deriving his evaluative judgments from one or a few foundational principles. While the resulting axiological landscape is complex, we can get a sense of its shape by considering six values that play indisputably important roles in Nietzsche’s sense of what matters.

3.2.1 Power and Life

The closest Nietzsche comes to organizing his value claims systematically is his insistence on the importance of power, especially if this is taken together with related ideas about strength, health, and “life”. A well-known passage appears near the opening of the late work, The Antichrist:

What is good? Everything that heightens the feeling of power in man, the will to power, power itself.

What is bad? Everything that is born of weakness.

What is happiness? The feeling that power is growing, that resistance is overcome.

Not contentedness but more power; not peace but war; not virtue but fitness (Renaissance virtue, virtù, virtue that is moraline-free). (A 2)

In the literature, claims of this sort are associated with a “will to power doctrine”, commonly viewed as one of Nietzsche’s central ideas (see section 6.1). That doctrine seems to include the proposal that creatures like us (or more broadly: all life, or even all things period) aim at the enhancement of their power—and then further, that this fact entails that enhanced power is good for us (or for everything).

In the middle of the twentieth century, many readers (more or less casually) received this as a deeply unattractive blunt claim that “Might makes right”, which they associated with disturbing social and political tendencies salient in the era (see, e.g., Beauvoir 1948: 72). After the Second World War, Walter Kaufmann ([1950] 1974: 178–333) engaged in a long-term campaign to recuperate Nietzsche’s thought from this unsavory line of interpretations, largely by insisting on how often the forms of power emphasized by Nietzsche involve internally directed self-control and the development of cultural excellence, rather than domination of others. While this account rightly highlighted internal complexity and nuance that were flattened out by the oversimplified “might makes right” reception dominant at mid-century, Kaufmann’s approach threatens to sanitize aspects of Nietzsche’s view that were intended to pose a stark challenge to our moral intuitions. More sophisticated versions of this broad approach—like Richardson’s (1996) development of Nietzsche’s distinction between tyranny (in which a dominant drive wholly effaces what it dominates) and mastery (in which a more dominant drive allows some expression to the less dominant one but controls and redirects that expression to its own larger ends)—are rightly inclined to concede the troubling aspects of Nietzsche’s view (e.g., that the doctrine countenances tyranny as well as mastery, even if it privileges the latter).

Together with such concessions, recent work has made important progress in understanding the internal complexities of Nietzsche’s position valorizing power. One of the most important and influential strands is Bernard Reginster’s (2006: 103–47; see also 2018a) emphasis on Nietzsche’s conception of power as overcoming resistance (BGE 259, 230; GM I, 13; II, 16–17; A 2; KSA 11[111] 13: 52–3; 14[173] 13: 358–60; 14[174] 13: 360–2; 11[75] 13: 37–8; 9[151] 12: 424). This conception connects power directly to the person’s capacity to reshape her environment in the service of her ends, and it thereby provides a more intuitive sense of what, exactly, is supposed to be good about power. In addition, the interpretation locates Nietzsche’s view directly athwart Schopenhauer’s efforts to motivate pessimism by appeal to a ubiquitous “will to life”. By replacing Schopenhauer’s will to life with his will to power (understood as a drive to overcome resistance, which wills the world’s resistance along with its overcoming; KSA 9[151] 12: 424), Nietzsche can argue that our basic condition as desiring, striving creatures can lead to a mode of existence worthy of endorsement, rather than to inevitable frustration (as Schopenhauer had it). The same conception has been developed by Paul Katsafanas (2013), who argues that, qua agents, we are ineluctably committed to valuing power because a Reginster-style will to power is a constitutive condition on acting at all. (His account thereby contributes to the constitutivist strategy in ethics pioneered by Christine Korsgaard (1996) and David Velleman (2000, 2006).). More recently, Katsafanas (2015, 2019) has extended his view in a way that places the value of power at the basis of a wider account of “higher values” in Nietzsche.

A second important strand of recent work emphasizes not a general, structural feature of power like overcoming resistance, but a “thicker”, more substantive ethical idea. On this view, what Nietzsche values is power understood as a tendency toward growth, strength, domination, or expansion (Schacht 1983: 365–88; Hussain 2011). Brian Leiter (2002: 282–3) criticized what he called a “Millian” version of this idea, according to which power is valuable simply because (per the alleged Nietzschean doctrine) power is in fact our fundamental aim. (This is supposed to be analogous to Mill’s strategy for deriving the principle of utility, based on the thought that we can show something—viz., pleasure—to be desirable by showing it to be desired.) Leiter is surely right to raise worries about the Millian reconstruction. Nietzsche apparently takes us to be committed to a wide diversity of first order aims, which raises prima facie doubts about the idea that for him all willing really takes power as its first-order aim (as the Millian argument would require). Moreover, Nietzsche’s sensitivity to pessimism as a possible evaluative outlook creates problems for the soundness of the argument form itself—e.g., even supposing we must aim at power, maybe that is exactly what makes the world a terrible place, rather than providing any reason to think that power, or its pursuit, is valuable.

But Hussain (2011) persuasively argues that if we shift our focus away from the pursuit of power in any narrow sense to the broader (and quite Nietzschean) idea that growth, strength, power-expansion, and the like are all manifestations of life, then at least some of Leiter’s philosophical and most of his textual objections can be avoided. On the resulting picture, Nietzsche’s position reads as a form of ethical naturalism, arguing that expression of these fundamental life tendencies is good for us precisely because they are our basic tendencies and we are inescapably in their grip (Hussain 2011: 159, et passim). It remains unclear that this view can avoid the objection rooted in the possibility of pessimism (i.e., that the value of life/power cannot follow from its inescapability for us, since that might be a state to which we are condemned). Given his engagement with Schopenhauer, Nietzsche should have been sensitive to the worry. But Hussain (2011) shows that a substantial strand of Nietzschean texts do fit the picture, and that many other nineteenth-century philosophers who share Nietzsche’s anti-supernaturalist commitments were attracted by such naturalist arguments from inescapability.

3.2.2 Affirmation

A second value commitment prominent in Nietzsche’s work (and arguably related to his positive assessments of life and power) is the value of affirmation. According to Reginster (2006: 2), “Nietzsche regards the affirmation of life as his defining philosophical achievement”. This theme enters forcefully in Book IV of The Gay Science, which opens with an expression of dedication to “amor fati”:

I want to learn more and more to see as beautiful what is necessary in things; then I shall be one of those who make things beautiful. Amor fati: let that be my love henceforth! I do not want to wage war against what is ugly. I do not want to accuse; I do not even want to accuse those who accuse. Looking away shall be my only negation. And all in all and on the whole: someday I wish to be only a Yes-sayer. (GS 276)

After that opening move, Nietzsche develops the idea in several more sections: GS 277 expresses Nietzsche’s worries about a seductive doctrine of “personal providence”, according to which “everything that happens to us turns out for the best”, but such an idea could be tempting at all only because of a far-reaching (and, Nietzsche thinks, admirable) affirmation of life, rooted in a talent for self-interpretation that creatively identifies some description under which things really do have “a profound significance and use precisely for us”; a bit later, GS 304 (entitled, “By doing we forego”) recommends against any ethic demanding that we renounce this or that or the other, and in favor of one that demands that one

do something and do it again, from morning till evening… and to think of nothing except doing this well, as well as I alone can do it;

and then in GS 321, Nietzsche suggests that we give up on reproaching others directly and just focus on

see[ing] to it that our own influence on all that is yet to come balances and outweighs his…. Let our brilliance make them look dark. No, let us not become darker ourselves on their account, like all those who punish…. Let us look away.

Famously, the book concludes with Nietzsche’s first introduction of his thought of eternal recurrence, which is supposed to place “The greatest weight” on each event through its suggestion that our life is good only if, upon imagining its return in every detail, we can affirm it as it is (GS 341). After that penultimate section, Nietzsche quotes the first section of Thus Spoke Zarathustra, which returns repeatedly to the same theme of affirmation (see, e.g., Z I, 1, 5, 17, 21, 22; II, 7, 12, 20; III, 3, 7, 13, 16; et passim; BGE 56; TI VIII, 6 and IX, 49).

Some have found Nietzsche’s valorization of affirmation ironic, given the polemical zeal of his negative attacks on Christianity and traditional morality, but in fact, the value of affirmation meshes nicely with some key aspects of Nietzsche’s critique. That critique focuses in large measure on aspects of morality that turn the agent against herself—or more broadly, on the side of Christianity that condemns earthly existence, demanding that we repent our earthly life as the price of admission to a different, superior plane of being. What is wrong with these views, according to Nietzsche, is that they negate our life, instead of affirming it. Bernard Reginster (2006), who has made more (and more systematic) sense of Nietzsche’s praise of affirmation than anyone, shows that the main philosophical problem it is meant to address is the crisis of “nihilism”—provoked by a process in which “the highest values de-value themselves” (KSA 9[35] 12: 350). Such “de-valuation” may rest either on some corrosive argument undermining the force of all evaluative claims whatsoever, or instead, on a judgment that the highest values cannot be realized, so that, by reference to their standard, the world as it is ought not to exist. The affirmation of life can be framed as the rejection of nihilism, so understood. For Nietzsche, that involves a two-sided project: it should both undermine values by reference to which the world could not honestly be affirmed, while also articulating the values exemplified by life and the world that make them affirmable. (Readers interested in these issues about Nietzschean affirmation and its compatibility (or not) with Nietzschean critique should also consult Richardson [2020: 353–97] and Huddleston [2022], which reaches a more diffident conclusion than this entry.)

3.2.3 Truthfulness/Honesty

If we are to affirm our life and the world, however, we had better be honest about what they are really like. Endorsing things under some illusory Panglossian description is not affirmation, but self-delusion. In that sense, Nietzsche’s value of life-affirmation simultaneously commits him to honesty. And arguably, in fact, no other virtue gets more, or more unqualified, praise in the Nietzschean corpus: honesty is “our virtue, the last one left to us” (BGE 227), and truthfulness is the measure of strength (BGE 39), or even of value as such:

How much truth does a spirit endure, how much truth does it dare? More and more that became for me the real measure of value. (EH Pref., 3)

Four strands in Nietzsche’s valuation of honesty deserve mention. Some texts present truthfulness as a kind of personal commitment—one tied to particular projects and a way of life in which Nietzsche happens to have invested. For example, in GS 2 Nietzsche expresses bewilderment in the face of people who do not value honesty:

I do not want to believe it although it is palpable: the great majority of people lacks an intellectual conscience. … I mean: the great majority of people does not consider it contemptible to believe this or that and live accordingly, without having first given themselves an account of the final and most certain reasons pro and con, and without even troubling themselves about such reasons afterward.

Nietzsche often recommends the pursuit of knowledge as a way of life:

No, life has not disappointed me… ever since the day when the great liberator came to me: the idea that life could be an experiment for the seeker for knowledge…. (GS 324)

Indeed, he assigns the highest cultural importance to the experiment testing whether such a life can be well lived:

A thinker is now that being in whom the impulse for truth and those life-preserving errors now clash for their first fight, after the impulse for truth has proved to be also a life-preserving power. Compared to the significance of this fight, everything else is a matter of indifference: the ultimate question about the conditions of life has been posed here, and we confront the first attempt to answer the question by experiment. To what extent can truth endure incorporation? That is the question; that is the experiment. (GS 110)

A second strand of texts emphasizes connections between truthfulness and courage, thereby valorizing honesty as the manifestation of an overall virtuous character marked by resoluteness, determination, and spiritual strength. BGE 39 belongs here, as does the passage from the EH Preface quoted above. The same evaluative commitment underwrites Nietzsche’s widespread attacks against what he calls “the Biblical ‘proof of strength’”—a form of argument that purports to justify belief in some claim because that belief “makes one blessed” or carries some emotional or practical benefit (GS 347; GM III, 24; TI VI, 5; A 50–51; KSA 15[46] 13: 441). Such wishful thinking is not only cognitively corrupt, for Nietzsche, but a troubling manifestation of irresolution and cowardice.

Given Nietzsche’s personal commitment to truthfulness and his argument that its absence amounts to cowardice, it is no surprise to find him, third, attacking the alleged mendaciousness and intellectual corruption of traditional religio-moral consciousness as one of the very worst things about it. The dishonesty of the moralistic “slave revolt” is a constant theme (GM I, 14; see also Janaway 2007: 102–4, and GM I, 10, 13; II, 11; III, 26; TI V, 5; VI, 7; A 15, 24, 26–7, 36, 38, 42, 44, 47, 48–53, 55–6), and it elicits some of Nietzsche’s most extreme and indignant rhetoric:

Our educated people of today, our “good people”, do not tell lies—that is true; but that is not to their credit. … [That] would demand of them what one may not demand, that they should know how to distinguish true and false in themselves. All they are capable of is a dishonest lie; whoever today accounts himself a “good man” is utterly incapable of confronting any matter except with dishonest mendaciousness—a mendaciousness that is abysmal but innocent, truehearted, blue-eyed, and virtuous. These “good men”—they are one and all moralized to the very depths and ruined and botched to all eternity as far as honesty is concerned… (GM III, 19)

Finally, it is worth noting that even when Nietzsche raises doubts about this commitment to truthfulness, his very questions are clearly motivated by the central importance of that value. The Genealogy’s Third Treatise famously closes with the worry that the unconditional will to truth is a form of asceticism (GM III, 24). As Nietzsche observes, relentless truthfulness can be corrosive for cherished values that make our lives seem worth living: one cross-examination of the norm of “truth at any price” concludes with the exclamation,

“At any price”: how well we understand these words once we have offered and slaughtered one faith after another on this altar! (GS 344)

But even in the face of such worries, Nietzsche does not simply give up on truthfulness. Instead, he calls for a “critique” that will “experimentally” assess its value and legitimacy (GM III, 24). That experiment can be no other than the “life of the thinker” we met with already—the same “ultimate question” about the extent to which truthfulness can “endure incorporation” and be made compatible with life (GS 110). Again and again, in fact, Nietzsche presents this question, “the question of the value of truth” (BGE 1), as his distinctive question, the one centrally driving his philosophy (BGE 1; GM III, 24, 27, GS 110, 324, 344, 346; see also BGE 204–13, 227–30). It can carry such central significance only because, in Nietzsche’s eyes, the honest devotion to truth was both so indispensably valuable and (potentially) dangerous.

3.2.4 Art and Artistry

But if truthfulness is a core value for Nietzsche, he is nevertheless famous for insisting that we also need illusion to live well. From the beginning of his career to the end, he insisted on the irreplaceable value of art precisely because of its power to ensconce us in illusion. The idea was a major theme of The Birth of Tragedy (BT 1, 3, 4, 7, 15, 25), and although Nietzsche later came to see the point somewhat differently, he never gave it up (see GS 107, also TI IX, 7–9). In a slogan, “We possess art lest we perish of the truth” (KSA 16[40] 13: 500).

Art and artistry carry value for Nietzsche both as a straightforward first-order matter, and also as a source of higher-order lessons about how to create value more generally. At the higher-order level, he insists that we should learn from artists “how to make things beautiful, attractive, desirable for ourselves when they are not” (GS 299; see also GS 78). The suggestion is that artistic methods (“Moving away from things until there is a good deal that one no longer sees…; seeing things… as cut out and framed…; looking at them in the light of the sunset”, and so on; GS 299) provide a kind of formal model (Landy 2012: 4, 8–19, et passim) for the development of analogous techniques that could be deployed beyond art, in life itself—“For with them this subtle power usually comes to an end when art ends and life begins, but we want to be the poets of our life” (GS 299). But Nietzsche is just as invested in the first-order evaluative point that what makes a life admirable includes its aesthetic features. Famously (or notoriously), Nietzsche argues that to “attain satisfaction with himself” one should “‘give style’ to one’s character” (GS 290). Here, it is the fact that the person’s character (or her life) has certain aesthetic properties—that it manifests an “artistic plan”, that it has beauty or sublimity, that its moments of ugliness have been gradually removed or reworked through the formation of a second nature, that it exhibits a satisfying narrative (or other artistic) form—that constitutes its value (GS 290, 299, 370; TI IX, 7; EH Frontispiece). Alexander Nehamas (1985) articulates and explores this Nietzschean theme of imposing artistic structure onto one’s individual life in considerable detail, and many other scholars have built on his view or explored related aspects of the topic (see Gerhardt 1992; Young 1992; Soll 1998; Ridley 2007a, 2007b, 2018; Anderson 2005, 2009; Anderson and Cristy, 2017; Huddleston 2019; and the essays in Came 2014).

One last point deserves special mention. In Nietzsche’s presentations, the value of art and artistry often seem to stand in opposition to the value of truthfulness—we are supposed to need art to save us from the truth (see Ridley 2007a, Landy 2002). Significantly, the opposition here is not just the one emphasized in The Birth of Tragedy—that the substantive truth about the world might be disturbing enough to demand some artistic salve that helps us cope. Nietzsche raises a more specific worry about the deleterious effects of the virtue of honesty—about the will to truth, rather than what is true—and artistry is wheeled in to alleviate them, as well:

If we had not welcomed the arts and invented this kind of cult of the untrue, then the realization of general untruth and mendaciousness that now comes to us through science—the realization that delusion and error are conditions of human knowledge and sensation—would be utterly unbearable. Honesty would lead to nausea and suicide. But now there is a counterforce against our honesty that helps us to avoid such consequences: art as the good will to appearance. (GS 107)

Nietzsche’s formulation (“that delusion and error are conditions of human knowledge and sensation”, and that this insight “comes to us through science”) suggests that the specific error theory he has in mind is rooted in the Kantian and Schopenhauerian theories of cognition, perhaps as developed in more naturalistic, psychologically-inflected form by later neo-Kantian and positivist thinkers. Those views would entail that the basic conditions of cognition prevent our ever knowing things as they really are, independently of us (see Anderson 2002, 2005; Hussain 2004; and the entry on Friedrich Albert Lange). But while those are the immediate allusions, Nietzsche also endorses more general ideas with similar implications—e.g., skepticism against any thought (be it of the theological/metaphysical, or Hegelian, or more modest, third Critique oriented sort) that the world is purposively suited to fit the needs of our cognitive faculties.

What is more important, however, is the structure of the thought in GS 107. Nietzsche’s idea is that truthfulness itself, rigorously pursued through the discipline of science, has forced us to the conclusion that our cognitive powers lead us into “delusion and error”, so that those very demands of truthfulness cannot be satisfied. This is not just one more case of the world’s being inhospitable to our values, but a special instance where the cultivation of a virtue (honesty) itself leads to the unwelcome realization that we can never live up to its genuine demands. In the face of such results, Nietzsche suggests, the only way to escape pessimism is the recognition of another, quite different value, suitable to serve as a “counterforce” against our honesty by showing that there can be something valuable about remaining content with appearances. The cultural value of art in GS 107 thus rests on the opposition to honesty offered by the “good will to appearance”. So it seems that the values Nietzsche endorses conflict with one another, and that very fact is crucial to the value they have for us (Anderson 2005: 203–11). (See Stoll (2019) for a sophisticated alternative account, arguing that artistic “semblances” in Nietzsche are not supposed to be deceptive in any way, and therefore that the conflict between the values of honesty and artistry is less stark than I have depicted it here.)

3.2.5 Individuality, Autonomy, “Freedom of Spirit”

From the earliest reception, commentators have noted the value Nietzsche places on individuality and on the independence of the “free spirit” from confining conventions of society, religion, or morality (e.g., Simmel [1907] 1920). This strand of thought continues to receive strong emphasis in recent interpretations—see, e.g., Nehamas (1985), Thiele (1990), Gerhardt (1992), Strong ([1975] 2000: 186–217), Reginster (2003), Richardson (2004: 94–103), Anderson (2006, 2012a), Higgins (2006), Schacht (2006), Acampora (2013), Meyer (2019), Ansell-Pearson and Bamford (2021), and the essays in Young (2015)—and there is an impressive body of textual evidence to support it (UM III, 2, 5–6, 8; GS 116, 117, 122, 143, 149, 291, 335, 338, 347, 354; BGE 29, 41, 259; GM I, 16, II, 1–3; TI IX, 41, 44, 49; A 11). Salient as Nietzsche’s praise of individuality is, however, it is equally obvious that he resists any thought that every single human person has value on the strength of individuality alone—indeed, he is willing to state that point in especially blunt terms: “Self-interest is worth as much as the person who has it: it can be worth a great deal, and it can be unworthy and contemptible” (TI IX, 33). Scholars have advocated quite different explanations of what makes a person’s individuality valuable in the privileged cases. Some hold that valuable individuals must have certain given, natural characteristics that admit no (or not much) further explanation, and that these features make them “higher men” manifesting genuine value, whereas others have no such value—Leiter (2015) offers a strongly developed naturalistic version of this approach. Other scholars take the “true” or “higher self” to be a kind of ideal or norm to which a person may, or may not, live up (Conant 2001; see also Kaufmann [1950] 1974: 307–16). Still others attempt to develop a position that combines aspects of both views (Schacht 1983: 330–38), or hold that Nietzsche’s position on the “overman” or “higher man” is simply riven by internal contradiction (Müller-Lauter [1971] 1999: 72–83).

A different approach takes its lead from Nietzsche’s connection between individuality and freedom of spirit (GS 347; BGE 41–44). As Reginster (2003) shows, what opposes Nietzschean freedom of spirit is fanaticism, understood as a vehement commitment to some faith or value-set given from without, which is motivated by a need to believe in something because one lacks the self-determination to think for oneself (GS 347). This appeal to self-determination suggests that we might explain the value of individuality by appeal to an underlying value of autonomy: valuable individuals would be the ones who “give themselves laws, who create themselves” (GS 335), who exhibit self-control or self-governance (TI, V, 2; VIII, 6; IX, 38, 49; BGE 203), and who are thereby able to “stand surety” for their own future (GM II, 2–3). A variety of scholars have recently explored the resources of this line of thought in Nietzsche; Anderson (2013) surveys the literature, and notable contributions include Ridley (2007b, 2018), Pippin (2009, 2010), Reginster (2012), Katsafanas (2011b, 2012, 2014, 2016), Rutherford (2011, 2018), Anderson (2021), and especially the papers in Gemes and May (2009).

3.2.6 Pluralism

We have seen that Nietzsche promotes a number of different values. In some cases, these values reinforce one another. For example, Nietzsche’s emphasis on affirming life could be taken to enhance or to confirm the value of life itself, qua successful expression of will to power, or conversely, one might trace the value of affirmation to its acknowledgment of our inescapable condition as living, power-seeking creatures. Similarly, we saw that both the virtue of honesty and the value of art and artistry play essential roles in support of the person’s ability to affirm life (Anderson 2005: 203–11). Nietzsche appeals to the metaphor of a tree’s growth to capture this sort of organic interconnection among his commitments:

For this alone is fitting for a philosopher. We have no right to be single in anything: we may neither err nor hit upon the truth singly. Rather, with the necessity with which a tree bears its fruit our thoughts grow out of us, our values, our yes’s and no’s and if’s and whether’s—the whole lot related and connected among themselves, witnesses to one will, one health, one earthly kingdom, one sun. (GM Pref., 2)

However interrelated Nietzsche’s values, though, they appear to remain irreducible to a single common value or principle that explains them all. For example, the account of honesty and artistry explored in sections 3.2.3 and 3.2.4 revealed that the support they provide to the value of affirmation depends on their opposition to one another, as “counterforces” (GS 107): if this is right, then Nietzsche’s various values may interact within an organic whole, but some of the interactions are oppositional, so they cannot all arise from a monistic philosophical system.

That very fact, however, fits nicely with another of Nietzsche’s core values, the value of pluralism itself. For Nietzsche, a person’s ability to deploy and be responsive to a multiplicity of values, of virtues, of outlooks and “perspectives”, is a positive good in its own right. Nietzsche’s defense of this idea is perhaps clearest in the epistemic case, where he insists on the value of bringing multiple perspectives to bear on any question: the thinker must “know how to make precisely the difference in perspectives and affective interpretations useful for knowledge”, because

There is only a perspectival seeing, only a perspectival “knowing”; and the more affects we allow to speak about a matter, the more eyes, different eyes, we know how to bring to bear on one and the same matter, that much more complete will our “concept” of this matter, our “objectivity”, be. (GM III, 12)

As the passage makes clear, however, Nietzschean perspectives are themselves rooted in affects (and the valuations to which affects give rise), and in his mind, the ability to deploy a variety of perspectives is just as important for our practical and evaluative lives as it is for cognitive life. In GM I, 16, for example, he wraps up a discussion of the sharp opposition between the good/bad and good/evil value schemes with a surprising acknowledgment that the best of his contemporaries will need both, despite their opposition:

today there is perhaps no more decisive mark of the “higher nature”, of the more spiritual nature, than to be conflicted in this sense and to be still a real battleground for these opposites. (GM I, 16; see also BGE 212; TI V, 3; and EH I)

While efforts to provide a systematic reconstruction unifying Nietzsche’s philosophy around one fundamental thought or basic value retain their attraction for many commentators, it is fair to say that all such efforts have remained controversial. Meanwhile, Nietzschean pluralism has been a major theme of several landmark Nietzsche studies (e.g., Nehamas 1985, Schacht 1983, Poellner 1995, Richardson 2004), and some of the most sophisticated recent treatments of his value theory have returned evaluative pluralism to the center of attention (Railton 2012; Huddleston 2017). Huddleston’s view is particularly noteworthy, since he argues that Nietzsche’s conceptions of strength and health—which, as we saw, are connected to the allegedly foundational value of power—are themselves disunified “cluster concepts” involving an internal plurality of separate and irreducible commitments. In fact, Nietzsche’s commitment to pluralism helps us understand how his diverse positive values fit together. From his pluralistic point of view, it is a selling point, not a drawback, that he has many other value commitments, and that they interact in complex patterns to support, inform, and sometimes to oppose or limit one another, rather than being parts of a single, hierarchically ordered, systematic axiology.

4. The Self and Self-fashioning

A probing investigation into the psyche was a leading preoccupation for Nietzsche throughout his career, and this aspect of his thought has rightly been accorded central importance across a long stretch of the reception, all the way from Kaufmann (1950) to recent work by Pippin (2010), Katsafanas (2016), Leiter (2019), Riccardi (2021), and others. Some of Nietzsche’s own programmatic reflections highlight the centrality of this enterprise: perhaps most famously, he closes an extended treatment of the shortcomings of previous philosophy (in Part I of Beyond Good and Evil) with a demand

that psychology be recognized again as the queen of the sciences, for whose service and preparation the other sciences exist. For psychology is once again on the path to the fundamental problems. (BGE 23)

In section 2, we saw that Nietzsche’s critique of morality rests crucially on psychological analyses that purport to expose the self-destructive effects of moral attitudes like guilt and ascetic self-denial, as well as the corrosive mismatch between the official claims of altruistic morality and its underlying motivation in ressentiment. On the positive side, Nietzsche is equally keen to detail the psychological conditions he thinks would be healthier for both individuals and cultures (see, e.g., GS Pref. and 382; BGE 212; TI V, 3 and VIII, 6–7). Thus, Nietzsche’s psychology is central to his evaluative agenda and to his projects as a cultural critic. Aside from its instrumental support for these other projects, Nietzsche pursues psychological inquiry for its own sake, and also for the sake of the self-knowledge that it intrinsically involves (GM III, 9; GS Pref., 3 and 324; but cf. GM Pref., 1). Still, despite widespread appreciation of Nietzsche’s psychological acumen—and despite the centrality of psychology to his philosophical method, core questions, and evaluative aims—even the most basic outlines of his substantive psychology remain a matter of controversy. Debate begins with the object of psychology itself, the psyche, self, or soul.

A significant body of Nietzschean texts express extreme skepticism that there is any such thing as a “self”, or “soul”, as well as doubts about the traditional faculties of the soul and the basic capacities they were supposed to exercise (thinking, willing, feeling). This passage from the notebooks is typical—“To indulge the fable of ‘unity,’ ‘soul,’ ‘person,’ this we have forbidden: with such hypotheses one only covers up the problem” (KSA 37[4] 11: 577)—and there are many, probably hundreds, like it (see D 109; GS 333; BGE 12, 17, 19, 54; GM I, 13; TI III, 5 and VI, 3). At the same time, Nietzsche’s own psychological analyses make free appeal not only to the self, but even to some of the traditional faculties (e.g., the will) of which he is most skeptical elsewhere: for example, the “sovereign individual” of GM II, 1–3 is distinctive for developing a “memory of the will” that underwrites his capacity to keep promises and “vouch for himself as future” (GM I, 13); or again, Nietzsche’s favored strategy of deploying a multiplicity of perspectives in knowledge (see section 3.2.6) assumes the existence of a cognitive self that stands back from particular drives and affects, and so has “the ability to control one’s Pro and Con and dispose of them” in support of the larger cognitive project (GM III, 12, see also BGE 284).

This apparent conflict in the texts has encouraged competing interpretations, with commentators emphasizing the strands in Nietzsche to which they have more philosophical sympathy. For example, strongly naturalist interpreters like Brian Leiter (2007, 2015, 2019) and Matthias Risse (2007) focus on Nietzsche’s skepticism about the will and the pure soul to reject any Kantian-style source of agency that can stand apart from and direct the person’s basic drives or fundamental nature. Somewhat similarly, readers attracted by a Cartesian conception of consciousness as the essence of the mental, but repelled by Cartesian dualism, highlight Nietzsche’s emphasis on the importance of the body (GM III, 16; Z I, 4) to suggest that his apparent claims about psychology should be heard instead as a kind of physiology of drives that rejects mental psychology altogether (for different versions, see Poellner 1995: 216–29, 174; Haar [1993] 1996: 90, et passim). Riccardi (2018, 2021) argues for a more nuanced view, in which the conscious self runs in parallel to the more fundamental bodily self. Attacking unity rather than mentality, a group of readers interested in Nietzsche’s agonistic conception of politics tends to emphasize his similarly agonistic, internally contested, conception of the self (Hatab 1995, 2018; Acampora 2013). In a diametrically opposed direction from those first three, Sebastian Gardner (2009) insists that, while Nietzsche was sometimes tempted by skepticism about a self which can stand back from the solicitations of inclination and control them, his own doctrines about the creation of value and self-overcoming in fact commit him to something like a Kantian transcendental ego, despite his protestations to the contrary.

Nietzsche’s actual psychological explanations rely heavily on appeals to sub-personal psychological attitudes. As Janaway (2009: 52) observes, a great many different kinds of attitude enter these accounts (including not only the standard beliefs and desires of current-day moral psychology, but also “wills”, feelings, sensations, moods, imaginings, memories, valuations, convictions, and more), but arguably the core attitudes that do the most work for him are drives and affects. These attitude types have been intensively studied in recent work (see esp. Richardson 1996, 2020; Katsafanas 2011b, 2013, 2016; Alfano 2019; Leiter 2019; and Riccardi 2021; see also Anderson 2012a, Clark and Dudrick 2015, Creasy 2020). While much remains controversial, it is helpful to think of drives as dispositions toward general patterns of activity; they aim at activity of the relevant sort (e.g., an eating drive, a drive for power), and they also represent some more specific object or occasion of the activity in a particular case (e.g., this ice cream, or overcoming a particular problem in the course of writing a paper). Affects are emotional states that combine a receptive and felt responsiveness to the world with a tendency toward a distinctive pattern of reaction—states like love, hate, anger, fear, joy, etc. Typically, the sub-personal attitudes postulated in Nietzsche’s psychological explanations represent the world in one way or another. Since he endorses Leibniz’s thought that representation, not consciousness, is the decisive mark of the mental (GS 354; see Simmons 2001, for discussion), it is reasonable to treat these attitudes as distinctively psychological, whether they are conscious or not.

But what about a personal-level self to serve as the owner of such attitudes? It seems that Nietzsche’s postulated drives and affects could not coherently be counted as psychological (and sub-personal) without such a self, and yet, the skeptical passages canvassed above seem to rule out any such thing. This remains a controversial problem, but it is clear at least that Nietzsche’s own proposal was to develop a radically reformed conception of the psyche, rather than to reject the self, or soul, altogether (see Riccardi 2021). BGE 12 provides some provocative ideas about what such a reformed conception might involve: there, Nietzsche insists that we should “give the finishing stroke” to what he calls “the soul atomism”, which he goes on to explain as

the belief which regards the soul as something indestructible, eternal, indivisible, as a monad, as an atomon:… Between ourselves, it is not at all necessary to get rid of “the soul” at the same time, and thus to renounce one of the most ancient and venerable hypotheses—as happens frequently to clumsy naturalists who can hardly touch on “the soul” without immediately losing it. But the way is now open for new versions and refinements of the soul hypothesis, [including] “mortal soul”, “soul as subjective multiplicity”, and “soul as social structure of the drives and affects”… (BGE 12)

Here Nietzsche alludes to traditional rational psychology, and its basic inference from the pure unity of consciousness to the simplicity of the soul, and thence to its indivisibility and immortality. As he notes, these moves treat the soul as an indivisible (hence incorruptible) atom, or monad. Nietzsche’s alternative proposal takes its shape from the rejection of such atomism—the soul as he understands it will be internally complex, rather than simple, and therefore subject to disintegration. That idea informs Nietzsche’s striking slogans about the soul’s “mortality”, “multiplicity”, and internal “social structure”. The “drives and affects” are evidently supposed to serve as the constituents comprising this multiplicity. Nietzsche thus construes the psyche, or self, as an emergent structure arising from such sub-personal constituents (when those stand in the appropriate relations), thereby reversing the traditional account, which treats sub-personal attitudes as mere modes, or ways of being, proper to a preexisting unitary mental substance—(see Anderson 2012a for an attempt to flesh out the picture; see also Gemes 2001; Hales and Welshon 2000: 157–82; Riccardi 2021; Anderson 2021). But however vulnerable, mortal, and subject to inner division the soul is supposed to be on the reformed conception, it nevertheless remains (as Nietzsche’s rejection of reductive naturalism makes clear) a genuinely psychological entity over and above its constituent drives and affects. Moreover, since the drives and affects that constitute it are individuated largely in terms of what (and how) they represent, the psychology needed to investigate the soul must be an interpretive, and not merely and strictly a causal, form of inquiry (see Pippin 2010; Ridley 2018).

In these respects, Nietzsche’s psychology treats the self as something that has to be achieved or constructed, rather than as something fundamentally given as part of the basic metaphysical equipment with which a person enters the world. This idea of the self as achieved rather than given was noticed already by Schacht (1983), and was elevated into a central theme in Nehamas’s (1985) influential Nietzsche interpretation. On that reading, the project of individual self-fashioning, or self-creation, is located at the heart of Nietzsche’s philosophical agenda (see esp. GS 290, 335; TI IX, 49). Highlighting Nietzsche’s commitments to the values of artistry and individuality, the interpretation claims that the main goal of Nietzsche’s new philosophers would be to construct novel, interesting, and culturally resonant individual lives, whose overall shape they could affirm (despite whatever setbacks they involve) on the strength of the (broadly) aesthetic value they instantiate. In Nehamas’s version, this agenda was closely bound up with Nietzsche’s project as a writer; he is supposed to have created himself, in the relevant sense, as an authorial persona through writing such distinctive books (Nehamas 1985; see esp. 233–4). While this suggestion, and even the very idea of self-creation, has remained controversial both textually and philosophically (see, e.g., Pippin 2010: 109–11), it has led to much further work—some directly influenced by Nehamas (1985), some developed in partial or entire opposition to it—yielding real insights about the nature of Nietzschean selfhood, and the relations among the key ideas of self-creation, the creation of value, individuality, and Nietzschean freedom (see, e.g., Gerhardt 1992; Nehamas 1998: 128–56; Leiter 1998; May 1999: 107–26; Anderson and Landy 2001; Reginster 2003; Anderson 2005, 2009, 2012a. 2021; Ridley 2007a, 2007b, 2018; Gardner 2009; Gemes 2009a, 2019; Pippin 2009, 2010; Poellner 2009; Richardson 2009, 2020; Acampora 2013; Katsafanas 2016: 164–96, 220–56; Anderson and Cristy 2017; Rutherford 2018).

One especially sustained alternative to Nehamas (1985) is developed by Elijah Millgram (2007, 2020, 2023). He argues that, so far from using his authorship to fashion a unified character for himself, Nietzsche was (on the contrary) a disunified, or even disintegrating, agent. On Millgram’s construal, Nietzsche’s books develop a strategy for constructing a meaningful life that is suitable for people of that sort. This represents an interesting kind of limit case for the project of self-fashioning, which mounts a sustained critique against the widespread assumption in modern philosophy that unity of agency is always desirable or valuable.

5. Difficulties of Nietzsche’s Philosophical Writing

For all the novelty of Nietzsche’s doctrines and the apparent extremity of his criticisms of traditional morality, religion, and philosophy, perhaps nothing about his work seems more out of step with the ordinary procedures of philosophy than the way he writes. The point is sufficiently obvious that it has by now become an entirely conventional trope to begin commentaries with remarks about the unconventional character of Nietzsche’s style. Despite the attention it gets, however, we continue to lack anything like a comprehensive account of Nietzsche’s strategies as a writer and rhetorician. Most of us (this entry included) are defeated by the bewildering richness of the subject matter and content ourselves with a few observations of special relevance to our other purposes. Perhaps Alexander Nehamas (1985: 13–41) comes closest to meeting the explanatory challenge by highlighting the key underlying fact that defeats our interpretive efforts—the seemingly endless variety of stylistic effects that Nietzsche deploys. In doing so, he follows the lead of Nietzsche’s own retrospective assessment from Ecce Homo: “I have many stylistic possibilities—the most multifarious art of style that has ever been at the disposal of one man” (EH III, 4). This entry will focus on a few points useful for readers making their early approaches to Nietzsche’s texts.

Nietzsche’s most obvious departure from conventional philosophical writing is the basic plan and construction of his books. Most philosophers write treatises or scholarly articles, governed by a carefully articulated thesis for which they present a sustained argument. Nietzsche’s books are nothing like that. Many are divided into short, numbered sections, which only sometimes have obvious connections to nearby sections. While the sections within a part are often thematically related (see, e.g., GS Book II or BGE Parts I, V, VI), even then they do not typically fit together into a single overall argument. Nietzsche himself notes the briskness with which he treats his concerns, insisting that “I approach deep problems like cold baths: quickly into them and quickly out again” (GS 381). To the natural complaint that such telegraphic treatment courts misunderstanding, he replies that

One does not only wish to be understood when one writes; one wishes just as surely not to be understood. … [Some authors] did not wish to be understood by “just anybody”. (GS 381)

Some of Nietzsche’s books (notably The Birth of Tragedy, the Genealogy, and the Antichrist) offer greater continuity of argumentation, but even there, he will often take advantage of section breaks to drop one thread of reasoning and move on to apparently unrelated points, leaving the reader to piece together how the various aspects of his case are supposed to fit together (GM II is a notoriously challenging case in point; see Reginster 2018b, 2021). Thus Spoke Zarathustra is unified by following the career of a central character, but the unity is loose and picaresque-like—a sequence of episodes which arrives at a somewhat equivocal (or at a minimum, at a controversial) conclusion that imposes only weak narrative unity on the whole.

This mode of writing is often classified as “aphoristic”, and Nietzsche is rightly granted an honored place within the distinguished lineage of that form in German philosophy, which goes back at least to Georg Lichtenberg’s Waste Books. Lichtenberg wrote his fragments for himself rather than the public, but the strategies he developed nevertheless made a serious impact. His aphorisms revealed how the form could be extended from its essentially pedagogical origins (providing compressed, memorable form for some principle or observation) into a sustained, exploratory mode of reasoning with oneself. Schopenhauer was a particular admirer, and his pursuit of the form (especially in Parerga and Paralipomena) clearly influenced Nietzsche’s use of the technique to frame his psychological observations—(the French moralistes were also an important influence; see Pippin 2010).

Some of Nietzsche’s efforts consist in straightforward psychological analysis, like this—“Egoism is the law of perspective applied to feelings: what is closest appears large and weighty, and as one moves further away size and weight decrease” (GS 162)—while others encapsulate a point Nietzsche has been developing through the section (see, e.g., “We are always only in our own company”; GS 166). More distinctively, however, many Nietzschean aphorisms rely on a “twist” effect—the first part sets up a certain expectation, which is then controverted or deepened by a thought-provoking reversal in the second part. Occasionally, these aphorisms are even set up as mini-dialogues:

A: “One is praised only by one’s peers.”
B: “Yes, and whoever praises you says: I am your peer”. (GS 190)

Many aphorisms exhibiting this sort of “twist” trade on the type of cynicism typical in moralistes like La Rochefoucauld, but however much he learned from the French, Nietzsche brought larger ambitions to the form; he is equally willing to leave cynicism behind and deploy the twist form simply to provoke active reflection in the reader, as he does here: “Every habit lends our hand more wit but makes our wit less handy” (GS 247). Kaufmann ([1950] 1974: 72–95) famously suggested that Nietzsche coined his aphorisms in the service of an “experimentalist” mode of philosophizing, and there is something to the idea. But the reader should take care, for not every Nietzschean aphorism is an experiment, and not every short section is an aphorism. Indeed, many multi-sentence sections build up to an aphorism, which enters only as a proper part included within the section, perhaps serving as its culmination or a kind of summative conclusion (rather than an experiment).

A particularly important case in point is the “aphorism placed before this [Third] treatise” of the Genealogy, which Nietzsche’s Preface (GM Pref., 8) offers to the reader as an especially good example of the densely summative power of the form—the entire Third Treatise is supposed to be just an interpretation of that aphorism. Maudemarie Clark (1997), John Wilcox (1997), and Christopher Janaway (1997) showed convincingly that the aphorism in question appears in section 1 of the Third Treatise, and is not the Treatise’s epigram. But the first section itself is not simply one long aphorism. Instead, the aphorism that requires so much interpretation is the compressed, high-impact arrival point of GM III, 1; the section begins by noting a series of different things that the ascetic ideal has meant, listed one after another and serving as a kind of outline for the Treatise, before culminating in the taut aphorism:

That the ascetic ideal has meant so much to man, however, is an expression of the basic fact of the human will, its horror vacui: it needs a goal,—and it would rather will nothingness than not will. (GM III, 1)

(It is to this compressed formulation, not the entirety of the section, that Nietzsche returns when he wraps up his interpretation in GM III, 28.)

Nietzsche’s proclivity for aphorisms is responsible for some of the difficulty of his writing; these formulations stand out from their background context, making it harder to integrate Nietzsche’s discourse from one section to the next. But the aphoristic form is only one challenge among many. As has been widely noted (by every reader, I suppose, but see Blondel [1971] 1977; Derrida 1978; de Man 1979; Kofman [1983] 1993; Nehamas 1985; Higgins 1987, 2000; Thomas 1999), Nietzsche’s writing is full of figures of speech and literary tropes, and decoding these modes of indirection demands active engagement and subtlety from the reader. Indeed, some of Nietzsche’s most favored and widespread figures (e.g., hyperbole, litotes, irony) involve purposely saying something more, or less, or other than one means, and so forcing the reader to adjust. What is more, Nietzsche makes heavy use of allusions to both contemporary and historical writing, and without that context one is very likely to miss his meaning—BGE 11–15 offers a particularly dense set of examples; see Clark and Dudrick (2012: 87–112) for one reading to which Hussain (2004), Anderson (2002), and Riccardi (2011) propose alternatives. Almost as often, Nietzsche invents a persona so as to work out some view that he will go on to qualify or reject (BGE 2 is a clear example), so it can be a steep challenge just to keep track of the various voices in action within the text.

Nehamas (1988: 46–51) offers perhaps the best description of the complexities of the resulting reading experience: our attention is fixated by certain brilliant, striking passages, or even whole sections, but because their connections to nearby sections are not specified, and because the text seems to switch from one voice to another, the reader simply moves on, taking each new section on its own terms; in short order, one forgets the details, the points, the cautions, or even the subject matter of passages several sections back—except, perhaps, for a few, especially memorable highlights, which we then call “aphorisms”. In this way, it is all too easy to fail to read Nietzsche’s books as books at all. Nevertheless, such comprehensive readings are there to be had. Clark and Dudrick (2012) offer a a sustained, albeit controversial, close reading exploring the unity of Part I of Beyond Good and Evil; their efforts reveal the scope of the difficulty—they needed an entire book to explain the allusions and connections involved in just twenty-three sections of Nietzsche, covering some couple-dozen pages! Attacking the same problem in a different spirit, Nehamas (1988) calls attention to the loose, “train of thought”-type connections that connect one section to another through large swaths of works like Beyond Good and Evil or The Gay Science. Following such connections, he proposes, allows us to understand the books as monologues presented by a narrator. For Nehamas, the creation of such a narrative persona is central to Nietzsche’s larger project of authorial self-fashioning. By contrast, Millgram (2023) counter-proposes that Nietzsche deploys different “voices”, different narrators, in his different books (see also Millgram 2007, 2020); and related papers available in the Other Internet Resources). On this less unified picture, the sort of “persona-inhabiting” effect noted above for the obvious case of BGE 2 is a much more widespread and destabilizing feature of Nietzsche’s writing. It becomes a precondition for adequately understanding each particular book that we first work out in what voice Nietzsche means to be speaking—and what attitude he, and we, are supposed to have toward that character—before we can assess the work’s first-order claims and effects.

While Millgram’s view is extreme in the demands it takes Nietzsche’s writing to place on the reader, demands of the broad sort he indicates—a demand, for example, to hear Nietzsche’s interventions in the right tone, or “spirit”, if they are to be understood—do seem to be imposed by some rather straightforward features of the texts. Consider, for instance, what the point could be of that most obvious feature of Nietzsche’s rhetoric—the heat and vitriol with which his condemnations of traditional values are presented. The Genealogy of Morality advertises itself as “a Polemic”, but even in that genre, it is an outlier for rhetorical intensity; Nietzsche passes up no opportunity for emotionally charged attacks, he repeatedly blasphemes what is held most sacred in the culture, he freely deploys offensive anti-Semitic tropes (turned back, ironically, against anti-Semitic Christians themselves), he fairly shouts, he sneers between scare quotes, he repeatedly charges bad faith and dishonesty on the part of his opponents, and on and on. It is impossible to conclude that the work is not deliberately designed to be as offensive as possible to any earnest Christian believer. Why? Given Nietzsche’s expressed conviction that many Christians ought to remain ensconced within their ideology because it is the best they can do for themselves (that “the sense [Sinn] of the herd should rule in the herd”; KSA 7[6], 12: 280), perhaps the right way to understand this much rhetorical overkill is that it operates as a strategy for audience partition. In Nietzsche’s mind, those who cannot do without Christianity and its morality would only be harmed by understanding how destructive and self-defeating it is; Nietzsche wants to explain those terrible effects, but he also wants to protect Christianity-dependent readers from harm. He achieves both at once by ensuring that exactly those readers will be so offended by his tone that their anger will impair understanding and they will fail to follow his argument. If this is right, the very vitriol of the Genealogy arises from an aim to be heard only by the right audience—the one it can potentially aid rather than harm—thereby overcoming the problem that

There are books that have opposite values for soul and health, depending on whether the lower soul… or the higher and more vigorous ones turn to them. (BGE 30; compare BGE 26–7, 40 and GS 381)

That such an interpretation of Nietzsche’s intentions is even possible shows how great a challenge these explosive, carefully crafted texts pose to their readers.

6. Key Doctrines

This entry has focused on broad themes pursued throughout Nietzsche’s writing, but most philosophically sophisticated commentary on his work has been devoted to the explication of certain core doctrinal commitments, which Nietzsche seems to rely upon throughout, but which he does not develop systematically in his published works in the way typical for philosophers. Some of these doctrines, like the idea of the eternal recurrence of the same, are described as “fundamental” by Nietzsche himself (EH III, Z, 1), but are formulated in surprisingly cryptic or metaphorical ways—and discussed, or even mentioned at all, much more rarely than one would expect given the importance Nietzsche placed on them. Others are alluded to more frequently, but raise theoretical questions that would normally call for careful philosophical development that is largely absent in Nietzsche’s books. Commentators have therefore expended considerable effort working out rational reconstructions of these doctrines. This section offers brief explanations of three of the most important: the will to power, the eternal recurrence, and perspectivism.

6.1 The Will to Power

The will to power doctrine seems to claim that everything that exists rests fundamentally on an underlying basis of “power-centers”, whose activity and interactions are explained by a principle that they pursue the expansion of their power. But it is far from obvious what these “power-centers” are supposed to be, and much scholarly controversy concerns what kind of doctrine Nietzsche intended to advance in the first place. Some readers take it as Nietzsche’s version of a foundational metaphysics (see Heidegger 1961, Jaspers [1936] 1965, and for a sophisticated recent approach in the same broad vein, Richardson 1996; see also alternative accounts by Doyle 2019 and Remhof 2017). Others receive it as an anti-essentialist rejection of traditional metaphysical theorizing in which abstract and shifting power-centers replace stable entities (Nehamas 1985: 74–105, Poellner 1995: 137–98), or else as a psychological hypothesis (Kaufmann [1950] 1974, Soll 2015; Clark and Dudrick 2015), or a (quasi-)scientific conjecture (Schacht 1983; Abel 1984; Anderson 1994, 2012b). Opposing all such readings of the will to power as a doctrine in theoretical philosophy, Maudemarie Clark (2000, see also 1990: 205–44) reads the will to power as a strand of thought that makes no claim about the world, but instead expresses Nietzsche’s values. As we saw (3.B.i.), the idea that the expansion of power is good does have a better claim than other principles to systematize Nietzsche’s various value commitments, and different evaluative interpretations have been developed by Reginster (2006), Katsafanas (2013), Hussain (2011), and Richardson (2020: 53–80). But there are also a large number of other texts suggesting that Nietzsche’s main agenda was to argue that the psychological world—or the world as a whole—is fundamentally composed of centers of power exerting force against one another (see GS 13; BGE 23, 36, 259; GM II, 16–17; III, 13–15; as well as many passages from the notebooks). Nietzsche’s description of such “power centers” is sometimes fairly abstract, evoking mathematically characterized “force-centers” like those sometimes postulated in nineteenth century physics, but at other times, concrete psychological or biological entities (people, drives, organisms) are the things exerting will to power.

Reginster’s (2006, 2018a) account of the will to power as a drive toward overcoming resistance can marshal a large body of textual support (particularly from the notebooks), and it also has some particular philosophical advantages. From a dialectical point of view, Reginster’s reading substantially clarifies the target and the philosophical point of Nietzsche’s views about power: they are aimed against Schopenhauer’s ideas about the will to life and his use of those ideas to motivate pessimism. The will to power thereby contributes directly to Nietzsche’s program of combatting nihilism (in its guise as the evaluative claim that the world ought not to exist). Reginster’s reading also makes good sense of the apparent centrality of the will to power in Nietzsche’s psychology. In the same passage where he claims that psychology should “be recognized again as the queen of the sciences”, Nietzsche proposes to understand psychology “as the morphology and development-theory of the will to power” (BGE 23). Some commentators take this to suggest a monistic psychology in which all drives whatsoever aim at power, and so count as manifestations of a single underlying drive (or drive-type). That interpretation makes a poor fit for the prodigious diversity of Nietzsche’s actual psychological explanations (and for his pluralist leanings), but Reginster’s view redirects attention away from drives’ first-order aims toward a general structural feature of drives—their tendency to overcome resistance in the course of pursuing whatever first-order activities they pursue. (It thereby builds on a productive earlier line of thought from Richardson (1996), according to which the drives’ willing power is not a matter of their taking power as a first-order aim, but concerns the manner of their pursuit of various first-order aims.) The Reginster account thereby permits the will to power to retain an important centrality within Nietzsche’s psychology, without needing to claim that no one (or no drive) ever aims at anything else besides power.

Other scholars have emphasized Nietzsche’s speculations that biological and physical phenomena could be explained by a postulated system of interacting power centers (Abel 1984; Müller-Lauter 1999a; Moore 2002; Gemes 2013). Abel (1984) offers a particularly systematic and carefully argued version of the approach, which highlights important resonances between Nietzsche’s ideas and elements of Leibniz’s dynamical physics and metaphysics, whereas Moore (2002) pursues a fascinating line of connections between Nietzsche’s thoughts about power and certain physiological ideas advanced by Wilhelm Roux (1881). Moore’s reading emphasizes the biologized rhetoric Nietzsche often uses in his talk about power (together with its connections to health and sickness, degeneration, etc.) as part of a case that the will to power idea locates Nietzsche’s philosophy within a wider intellectual trend toward “biologism” prevalent at the end of the nineteenth century.

6.2 Perspectivism

Much of Nietzsche’s reaction to the philosophy of his predecessors is mediated through his interest in the notion of perspective. He thought that past philosophers had largely ignored the influence of their own perspectives on their work, and had therefore failed to control those perspectival effects (BGE 6; see BGE I more generally). Commentators have been both fascinated and perplexed by what has come to be called Nietzsche’s “perspectivism”, and it has been a major concern in a number of large-scale Nietzsche commentaries (see, e.g., Danto 1965; Kaulbach 1980, 1990; Schacht 1983; Abel 1984; Nehamas 1985; Clark 1990; Poellner 1995; Richardson 1996; Benne 2005). There has been as much contestation over exactly what doctrine or group of commitments belong under that heading as about their philosophical merits, but a few points are relatively uncontroversial and can provide a useful way into this strand of Nietzsche’s thinking.

Nietzsche’s appeals to the notion of perspective (or, equivalently in his usage, to an “optics” of knowledge) have a positive, as well as a critical side. Nietzsche frequently criticizes “dogmatic” philosophers for ignoring the perspectival limitations on their theorizing, but as we saw, he simultaneously holds that the operation of perspective makes a positive contribution to our cognitive endeavors. Speaking of (what he takes to be) the perversely counterintuitive doctrines of some past philosophers, he writes,

Particularly as knowers, let us not be ungrateful toward such resolute reversals of the familiar perspectives and valuations with which the spirit has raged against itself all too long… : to see differently in this way for once, to want to see differently, is no small discipline and preparation of the intellect for its future “objectivity”—the latter understood not as “disinterested contemplation” (which is a non-concept and absurdity), but rather as the capacity to have one’s Pro and Contra in one’s power, and to shift them in and out, so that one knows how to make precisely the difference in perspectives and affective interpretations useful for knowledge. (GM III, 12)

This famous passage bluntly rejects the idea, dominant in philosophy at least since Plato, that knowledge essentially involves a form of objectivity that penetrates behind all subjective appearances to reveal the way things really are, independently of any point of view whatsoever. Instead, the proposal is to approach “objectivity” (in a revised conception) asymptotically, by exploiting the difference between one perspective and another, using each to overcome the limitations of others, without assuming that anything like a “view from nowhere” is so much as possible. There is of course an implicit criticism of the traditional picture of a-perspectival objectivity here, but there is equally a positive set of recommendations about how to pursue knowledge as a finite, limited cognitive agent.

In working out his perspective optics of cognition, Nietzsche built on contemporary developments in the theory of cognition—particularly the work of non-orthodox neo-Kantians like Friedrich Lange and positivists like Ernst Mach, who proposed naturalized, psychologically-based versions of the broad type of theory of cognition initially developed by Kant and Schopenhauer (see Clark 1990; Kaulbach 1980, 1990; Anderson 1998, 2002, 2005; Green 2002; Hill 2003; Hussain 2004). The Kantian thought was that certain very basic structural features of the world we know (space, time, causal relations, etc.) were artifacts of our subjective cognitive faculties rather than properties or relations of things in themselves; but where Kant and Schopenhauer had treated these structures as necessary, a priori conditions of any possible experience whatsoever, the more naturalistically oriented figures who influenced Nietzsche sought to trace them to sources in human empirical psychology, which would of course be contingent. The potential of these ineliminable subject-side influences to vary suggests the idea of treating them as a kind of perspective, which Nietzsche found developed in an idealist version by Gustav Teichmüller (1882). Leaving Teichmüller’s idealism to one side, Nietzsche develops the idea by tying cognitively important perspectives back to his own psychology. In particular, the Genealogy passage emphasizes that for him, perspectives are always rooted in affects and their associated patterns of valuation. For that reason, Nietzsche holds that “every great philosophy so far” has been “the personal confession of its author and a kind of involuntary and unconscious memoir” (BGE 6). Thus, theoretical claims not only need to be analyzed from the point of view of truth, but can also be diagnosed as symptoms and thereby traced back to the complex configurations of drive and affect from the point of view of which they make sense. Nietzsche’s perspectivism thus connects to his “genealogical” program of criticizing philosophical theories by exposing the psychological needs they satisfy; perspectivism serves both to motivate the program, and to provide it with methodological guidance.

But Nietzsche’s perspectivism and his arguments for it go beyond epistemology, or the “theory of cognition” (Erkenntnistheorie), as it was practiced in the broadly Kantian milieu of his contemporary philosophy. (One should say, they “go beyond” the theory of cognition at least; Gemes (2009c, 2013) argues that epistemological interpretations of perspectivism are altogether mistaken, and that it should be taken instead as fundamentally a doctrine within moral psychology, about the drives and affects.) Nietzsche makes perspectivist claims not only concerning the side of the cognitive subject, but also about the side of the truth, or reality, we aim to know. His views on this topic have been highly controversial, with some scholars emphasizing Nietzsche’s apparent denials of truth (either skeptical denials that any truth is ever knowable, or more radical claims that the very idea of truth is somehow incoherent), and others highlighting his own frequent and routine claims for the truth of his own views, as well as the valorization of truthfulness and honesty we saw above (3.B.iv.). A number of different strategies have been proposed for reconciling the tensions between these different strands of text, including the supposition that at least some of Nietzsche’s own claims must fall outside the scope of his denials of truth (Hales and Welshon 2000), the idea that Nietzsche distinguished different senses of “truth” (Schacht 1983; Anderson 1998, 2005), and the developmental proposal that Nietzsche eventually gave up on his denials of truth late in his career (Clark 1990, 1998). (See recent exchanges on this topic between Clark (2018) and Nehamas (2015, 2017, 2018).) In addition to work focused on Nietzsche’s understanding of truth per se, a good deal of scholarly effort has explored the way Nietzsche attempts to build his perspectivism down into the ontology of the world by understanding reality itself as a system of ever-shifting force-centers which themselves constitute a variety of points of view on the whole (notable contributions include Deleuze [1962] 1983; Abel 1984; Poellner 1995; Richardson 1996; Müller-Lauter 1999a; Hales and Welshon 2000; Gemes 2013). These efforts argue for strong connections between perspectivism and the will to power doctrine (section 6.1).

6.3 The Eternal Recurrence of the Same

Nietzsche himself suggests that the eternal recurrence was his most important thought, but that has not made it any easier for commentators to understand. Nietzsche’s articulations of the doctrine all involve hypothesizing—(or inducing the reader to imagine, or depicting a character considering)—the idea that all events in the world repeat themselves in the same sequence through an eternal series of cycles. But the texts are difficult to interpret. All Nietzsche’s official presentations of the thought in published work are either presented in hypothetical terms (GS 341), or extremely elliptical and allusive (e.g., GS 109), or highly metaphorical and quasi-hermetic (Z III, 2, 13), or all three together. Most allusions to the idea, in fact, assume that one already knows what it means—even the claims in Ecce Homo that it is the “fundamental conception” or “basic idea” of Zarathustra have this character. In the early reception, most readers took Nietzsche to be offering a cosmological hypothesis about the structure of time or of fate (see Simmel [1907] 1920; Heidegger 1961; Löwith [1935] 1997; Jaspers [1936] 1965), and various problems have been posed for the thesis, so understood (Simmel [1907] 1920: 250–1n; Soll 1973; Anderson 2005: 217 n28). Many later commentators have focused instead on the existential or practical significance of the thought (Magnus 1978; Nehamas 1980, 1985), or its “mythological” import (Hatab 2005).

In the aftermath of Nehamas (1985), an influential line of readings has argued that the thought to which Nietzsche attributed such “fundamental” significance was never a cosmological or theoretical claim at all—whether about time, or fate, or the world, or the self—but instead a practical thought experiment designed to test whether one’s life has been good. The broad idea is that one imagines the endless return of life, and one’s emotional reaction to the prospect reveals something about how valuable one’s life has been, much as (quoting Maudemarie Clark’s memorable analogy) a spouse’s question about whether one would marry again evokes—and indeed, fairly demands—an assessment of the state of the marriage (see Clark 1990: 245–86; Wicks 1993; Ridley 1997; Williams 2001; Reginster 2006: 201–27; Anderson 2005, 2009; Risse 2009; Huddleston 2022). Naturally, the threat of emerging scholarly consensus around this line of interpretation has prompted pushback, and Paul Loeb (2006, 2013, 2021) has recently offered vigorous defense of a cosmological interpretation of Nietzsche’s idea, building on earlier work by Alistair Moles (1989, 1990).

Skeptics like Loeb are correct to insist that, if recurrence is to be understood as a practical thought experiment, commentators owe us an account of how the particular features of the relevant thoughts are supposed to make any difference (Soll 1973 already posed a stark form of this challenge). Three features seem especially salient: we are supposed to imagine 1) that the past recurs, so that what has happened in the past will be re-experienced in the future; 2) that what recurs is the same in every detail; and 3) that the recurrence happens not just once more, or even many times more, but eternally. The supposed recurrence (1) plausibly matters as a device for overcoming the natural bias toward the future in practical reasoning. Since we cannot change the past but think of ourselves as still able to do something about the future, our practical attention is understandably future directed. But if the question is about the value of our life overall, events in the past matter just as much as those in the future, and disregarding them is a mistake, at best, and a case of motivated reasoning or dishonesty, if we are exploiting future-bias to ignore aspects of ourselves we would rather not own up to (General form: “Whew! At least I’ll never have to go through that again…”). By imaginatively locating our entire life once again in the future, the thought experiment can mobilize the resources of our practical self-concern to direct an evaluative judgment onto our life as a whole. Similar considerations motivate the constraint of sameness (2). If my assessment of myself simply elided any events or features of my self, life, or world with which I was discontent, it would hardly count as an honest, thorough self-examination. The constraint that the life I imagine to recur must be the same in every detail is designed to block any such elisions.

As Reginster (2006: 222–7) observes, it is more difficult to explain the role of the third constraint, eternity. It is nevertheless clear that it does make a practical difference: to put a sharp point on it, return to Clark’s marriage analogy; one might well be very happy to live one’s marriage again (once, or twice, or even several times), but still prefer some variation in spousal arrangements over the course of eternity—indeed, Milan Kundera (1991) seems to be putting his character Agnes in something like that situation in his use of the Nietzschean thought experiment early on in Immortality. Reginster proposes that the eternity constraint is meant to reinforce the idea that the thought experiment calls for an especially wholehearted form of affirmation—joy—whose strength is measured by the involvement of a wish that our essentially finite lives could be eternal. More modestly, one might think that Nietzsche considered it important to rule out as insufficient a particular kind of conditional affirmation, suggested by the Christian eschatological context, which would leave in place the judgment that earthly human life carries intrinsically negative value. After all, the devout Christian might affirm her earthly life as a test of faith, which is to be redeemed by an eternal heavenly reward should one pass that test—all the while retaining her commitment that, considered by itself, earthly life is a sinful condition to be rejected. Imagining that my finite life recurs eternally blocks this avenue (and returns the focus of assessment to the finite features of real life) by supposing that there will never be a point at which one could pretend that finite life is once and for all “over and done with” (Anderson 2005: 198, 203; 2009: 237–8).


Primary Literature: Works by Nietzsche

Nietzsche’s Works in German

Nietzsche’s works have now been published in an outstanding critical edition (the Kritische Gesamtausgabe) under the general editorship of Giorgio Colli and Massimo Montinari. It is held in many university libraries and is typically cited by volume and page number using the abbreviation KGA. This entry cites published works in the English translations listed below, and for the unpublished writing, it cites the useful abridged version of the critical edition, prepared for students and scholars (the Kritische Studienausgabe, KSA). Those references follow standard scholarly practice, providing volume and page numbers of the KSA, preceded by the notebook and fragment numbers established for the overall critical edition. English translations have now appeared containing selections from the unpublished writing included in KSA, and those volumes (WEN, WLN) are listed among the translations in the next section. The full bibliographical information for the German editions is

KGA Werke: Kritische Gesamtausgabe, edited by G. Colli and M. Montinari. Berlin: W. de Gruyter, 1967 ff.
KSA Sämtliche Werke: Kritische Studienausgabe, edited by G. Colli and M. Montinari. Berlin: W. de Gruyter, 1980 ff.

Nietzsche’s Works in English

Nietzsche’s published works are cited by his original section numbers (or larger part plus section numbers together), which are the same in all editions. Citations follow the North American Nietzsche Society system of abbreviations for reference to English translations. For each work, the primary translation quoted in the entry is listed first, followed by other translations that were consulted. (N.B.: the entry occasionally departs from the quoted translation, usually in the direction of greater literalness, without separate notice.) Original date of German publication is given in parentheses at the end of each entry.

BT The Birth of Tragedy out of the Spirit of Music, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), New York: Vintage, 1967 (1872).
UM Untimely Meditations, R.J. Hollingdale (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983 (1873–6).
HH Human, All-too-human: a Book for Free Spirits, R.J. Hollingdale (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1986 (Vol. I, 1878; Vol. II, 1879–80).
D Daybreak: Thoughts on the Prejudices of Morality, R.J. Hollingdale (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997 (1881).
GS The Gay Science, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), New York: Vintage, 1974 (1st ed. 1882, 2nd ed. 1887). (I also consulted The Gay Science, J. Nauckhoff (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001.)
Z Thus Spoke Zarathustra, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), New York: Viking, 1954 (1883–5).
BGE Beyond Good and Evil, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), New York: Vintage, 1966 (1886).
GM On the Genealogy of Morality, Maudemarie Clark and Alan Swensen (trans.), Indianapolis: Hackett, 1998 (1887). (I also consulted On the Genealogy of Morals, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), New York: Vintage, 1967.)
TI Twilight of the Idols, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), New York: Viking, 1954 (1888).
CW The Wagner Case, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), New York: Vintage, 1966 (1888).
NCW Nietzsche Contra Wagner, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), New York: Viking, 1954 (1888).
A The Antichrist, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), New York: Viking, 1954 (1895).
EH Ecce Homo, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), New York: Vintage, 1967 (1908).
WP The Will to Power, Walter Kaufmann and R.J. Hollingdale (trans.), edited by Walter Kaufmann. New York: Vintage, 1967 (1901, 1906).
WEN Writings from the Early Notebooks, Ladislaus Löb (trans.), Raymond Guess and Alexander Nehamas (eds), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2009.
WLN Writings from the Late Notebooks, Kate Sturge (trans.), Rüdiger Bittner (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.

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I am grateful to Rachel Cristy for exchanges that helped me work out basic ideas for the structure and contents of this entry. Joshua Landy, Andrew Huddleston, Christopher Janaway, and Elijah Millgram provided helpful feedback on a late draft, and each saved me from several errors.

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