First published Fri Feb 18, 2005; substantive revision Wed Feb 17, 2021

Porphyry (234?–305? C.E.) was a Neoplatonist philosopher born in Tyre in Phoenicia. He studied with Longinus in Athens and then with Plotinus in Rome from 263–269 C.E. and became a follower of the latter’s version of Platonism. Porphyry wrote in just about every branch of learning practiced at the time but only a portion of his large output is extant. Porphyry was an influential thinker. He applied Neoplatonism to pagan religion and other spheres and is, as such, a key figure in the promulgation of Neoplatonic thought. His writings on Aristotle’s logical works, preserved in part and influential in the Latin West through Boethius’ translations, contain attempts to harmonize Aristotle’s logical writings with Platonism. Such reconciliatory attitude towards Aristotle characterizes much of his philosophy.

1. Life

Porphyry was born in Tyre in Phoenicia (now in Lebanon), probably in 234 C.E. His name was ‘Malcus’, ‘king’ in his native tongue, hence he became ‘Basileus’ (‘king’) in Greek. He, however, calls himself Porphyry, which supposedly was a common name in Tyre, the city of purple, and is generally known under that name. Little is known with certainty about his life, except what can be gleaned from his own account of Plotinus’ life, the Life of Plotinus. There is an account of his life in Eunapius’ Lives of Philosophers and Sophists but this account clearly depends on the Life of Plotinus and has little reliable to add. Before he came to study with Plotinus in Rome in 263 C.E. he studied with the Middle Platonist Longinus in Athens. In Rome he stayed for some five years and converted to Plotinus’ version of Platonism. On Plotinus’ advice he left Rome for Sicily in order to recover from a bout of depression in 268 C.E. He must have stayed there for some time, even beyond Plotinus’ death in 270 C.E. There are some untrustworthy reports about a school of Porphyry in Rome after Plotinus’ death. In reality we do not know anything with certainty about where he lived in the latter half of his life. He may have been Iamblichus’ teacher. The evidence for this, however, is not beyond dispute. It is clear, though, that Iamblichus was strongly influenced by Porphyry, even if he turned vehemently against him. Towards the end of his life (301 C.E.), Porphyry edited Plotinus’ writings, the Enneads, dividing them into six books of nine treatises each, which he prefaced with his Life of Plotinus. The latter is the most reliable and the most informative source about his life and attitudes. He married fairly late an older wife, for whom one of his extant writings, the Letter to Marcella, is written.

2. Works and Profile

Porphyry was a prolific author who wrote about a whole range of topics. There are some sixty works attributed to him, but most of them are now lost or survive in mere fragments. Extant (though not all complete) are: Life of Plotinus, Life of Pythagoras, Letter to Marcella, On Abstinence from Eating Food from Animals, Starting-points Leading to the Intelligibles (usually called the Sententiae; in Latin the work is called Sententiae ad intelligibilia ducentes), the Isagoge (Introduction), On the cave of the Nymphs, Introduction to Ptolemy’s opus quadripartitum (see Bezza 2012) and there are commentaries on Ptolemy’s Harmonics and Aristotle’s Categories. An extant work attributed to Galen, To Gaurus, is almost certainly by him. There are fragments of a history of philosophy and fragments of a number of works on psychology. One such work, the Symmikta zetemata, has been partly reconstructed by Heinrich Dörrie (1959). It has been argued by Pierre Hadot (1968 and several articles) that Porphyry is the author of anonymous fragments of a commentary on Plato’s Parmenides. This attribution has been widely accepted but also forcefully challenged (see below). He also wrote commentaries on Plato’s Timaeus and several works by Aristotle. The fragments of these are given in Smith 1993, which contains the extant fragments and testimonia of Porphyry. In addition we know that Porphyry wrote on such diverse subjects as grammar, philology, rhetoric, and geometry. Against the Christians is perhaps Porphyry’s best known title. Of this large work only some fragments have survived.

In his monumental study, La vie de Porphyre (1913), Bidez portrayed the young Porphyry as someone prone to religion and superstition. He was supposed to have become a more rational thinker during his sojourn with Plotinus, though later to have relapsed to some extent into his previous mode. Later research has found that there is no clear support for such a view of Porphyry’s development. He may throughout his life have used different styles, perhaps aiming at different readerships, while maintaining somehow both his proneness for religion and superstition and his rational tendencies.

It is clear that Porphyry was a very learned man. He is sometimes claimed as a highly important promulgator of the late ancient branch of Platonism (usually called ‘Neoplatonism’) rather than as an original philosopher. The former claim is certainly true: he applied Neoplatonic doctrines to traditional pagan religion and myths and was in many respects a more extrovert thinker interested in applying Platonic philosophy to various spheres than his master, Plotinus. The judgment that he was unoriginal may, however, be overhasty, since the sample of his writings we are left with is very small and among these his more theoretical works are clearly underrepresented. What we have and know to be his, however, does not indicate drastic theoretical innovations, except in the sphere of the philosophy of logic and language. To judge from the evidence of subsequent ancient Platonists, Porphyry was an independent philosopher whose views were taken very seriously indeed. Late ancient Platonists, however, often mention him in the pair “Plotinus and Porphyry”. So, as should be clear from what already has been said, Porphyrian scholarship, when soberly done, is filled with caveats: we rarely know when he wrote what, and we do not know for sure what his philosophical doctrines were. What is extant suggests a close doctrinal affinity with Plotinus, except for the fragment of the Parmenides commentary for which the authorship and relationship to Porphyry is disputed. To this we can add Porphyry’s take on Aristotle’s Categories with consequences for his view on the structure of the sensible realm. Thus, we are faced with a figure whom we know to have been respected in late antiquity, who was influential long beyond then, but we do not know with any certainty what he stood for philosophically or what was original with him in the central areas of philosophy.

3. Philosophical Views

It seems safe to assume that before his encounter with Plotinus, Porphyry’s philosophical views were shaped by Longinus, Numenius and other Middle Platonists, in addition to Plato, Aristotle and other classics of Greek philosophy. After meeting with him he turned into a follower of Plotinus, even if some of his Middle Platonist background shows through also in his post-Plotinian phase. This picture is strongly suggested both by his Life of Plotinus and the Sententiae, the only extant work in which he lays out his basic philosophical views that is with certainty attributable to him.

For Plotinus and Porphyry, there is a categorical gap between two realms, the sensible and the intelligible. The latter realm contains three “hypostases” (three different ontological levels), the One, Intellect and Soul. Of these, the One is the first cause of everything else; it is characterized by sheer unity which renders it beyond thought and beyond description in language. Intellect is the sphere of real being, identified with the Platonic Forms, which are the thoughts of a universal intellect. Soul, the lowest of the intelligible hypostases, is the intelligible item directly responsible for the sensible realm. The sensible realm, which is an imperfect image of the intelligible, also consists of levels: There are organisms, of which the sensible cosmos is one, comprising the other, lesser organisms. Organisms are ensouled beings and thus include an intelligible component. Below them on the scale are forms in matter, bodies, and matter itself. These too are results of Soul’s creative activity but are not intelligible entities.

The relationship between these levels is in general described in terms of a doctrine of double activity: each higher level has its characteristic internal activity which is accompanied by an external power or activity which constitutes the level below. This talk of internal and external activities (powers) is equivalent to what is known as the relationship between paradigms and imitations in traditional Platonism.

Human beings have, so to speak, one leg in each realm: Through the body and its non-rational soul (the seat of appetitive and spirited desires and sense-perception) they belong to the sensible realm, through their higher soul (intellect) to the intelligible. Actually, the true human being is to be identified with the intellect and the intelligible Man. It follows from this that the task set for human beings is to free themselves from the sensible and live by the intelligible, which after all is their true or real nature.

This is Plotinus’ philosophy, which Porphyry shares, in broad outline (see entry on Plotinus). There are, however, some differences in terminology, which show Porphyry to have a certain scholarly bent that Plotinus avoids, and Porphyry is in general more interested in reconciling Aristotle with Platonism than Plotinus was. This is seen, for example, in Porphyry’s more positive attitude towards the doctrine of Aristotele’s Categories. In what follows, we focus on some points where Porphyry diverges from Plotinus or has been taken to diverge from him, or may seem to develop his thought.

3.1 Religion

In the Platonic tradition before Porphyry, Plutarch and Plotinus already interpreted classical Greek mythology as philosophical allegories (the Stoics were first to establish this practice). Porphyry, however, takes this much further than his Platonic predecessors and does it more systematically. This is revealed, e.g., in his attitude towards Homer, whose texts he takes to have a hidden, philosophical meaning behind the literal one (see The Cave of the Nymphs). He wrote a work entitled Philosophy from Oracles, which survives only in a few fragments (F343–F350 [Smith 1993]). We have only a vague idea about its contents but presumably it presented some kind of synthesis of pagan oracles and cults with Platonic philosophy. It is a characteristic of post-Iamblichean Neoplatonism (330 AD onwards) that religion, religious rites and even magic (theurgy) were taken to be an alternative way to the soul’s salvation, beside philosophy. Porphyry did not share this view and was scolded for his skeptical attitude towards theurgy by Iamblichus, his presumably former student, in the latter’s Reply to Porphyry. Iamblichus’ censure was actually not limited to Porphyry’s attitude towards theurgy, it concerned fundamental ontological issues as well (see article on Iamblichus 5.3.). Porphyry did not reject magic outright, however, but he seems to have restricted its efficacy to the sphere of nature and not to have regarded it as a means to establish contact with the intelligible realm as philosophy could do (see Smith 2011b). His interpretation and concerns with religious matters, however, opened for the developments undertaken by Iamblichus and the subsequent tradition of pagan Neoplatonism. Somewhat disappointingly, perhaps, the fragments from Against the Christians do not exhibit deep metaphysical disagreements; they are mostly concerned with particular, non-philosophical claims made in the Bible and by Christians that Porphyry finds incredible and objectionable.

3.2 Psychology and Ethics

As regards his views on the soul, Porphyry seems in all essentials to follow Plotinus. In addition to the Sententiae, On Abstinence and To Gaurus, there are quite a few fragments of other works bearing on his psychological views, preserved especially in Nemesius, Stobaeus, and St. Augustine.

The soul is an intelligible entity but, as noted above, it is the intelligible entity that is directly engaged with the sensible realm. Intelligible entities are incorporeal and without extension and not present in bodies as in place. Following Plotinus, Porphyry distinguishes between the soul in itself, which seems to be identical the rational soul, and a second power of the rational, the lower soul, which is the soul in relation to the body and is alone directly engaged with it (Sent. 4). The lower soul is responsible for soul-functions that directly involve the body, such as sense-perception, desires, emotions and purely biological functions such as growth. In the tradition before Porphyry, this distinction sometimes became so sharp that it was supposed that each person has two distinct souls. Porphyry, by contrast, insists on the unity of the human soul: the lower functions are powers that depend on the rational soul (see Deuse 1983: 169–217). The distinction between the soul itself and its powers (the lower soul) is an instance of the distinction between internal and external acts, mentioned above. Thus, the soul itself has an intellectual activity that has the second powers or lower soul as its external act.

Certain problems arise in accounting for how something which in itself is incorporeal can be present in an extended body, as the soul apparently is. Porphyry resolves this by saying that the soul is not locally present in the body but is present to it by a certain disposition or inclination towards the body (Sent.3; 4). In a passage preserved in Nemesius, On the Nature of Man, he says that when something intelligible enters into a relation to some place or to a thing in a place, it is by a misuse of language that we say that it is there. Because its activity is there, we speak of the place when we should speak of the relation to it and the activity. When one should say “it acts there” we misleadingly say “it is there” (Nem. 3, 112–114; cf. Sent. 28). From Porphyry’s “inquiry” (zētema) about the relation preserved by Nemesius we further learn that the embodied soul’s relation to the body is a case of “unfused union” (asynchytos henōsis), (3, 1–185; Dörrie 1959: cap. 2). This implies a relationship that amounts to a fusion in which the two ingredients, however, retain their identity and can in principle be separated. Here, perhaps typically, Porphyry makes use of Stoic theories about mixtures but comes up with an account that does not essentially depart from Plotinus (see Emilsson 1994: 5357ff.). In Against Boethus (a Peripatetic philosopher of the 1st century B.C.), fragments of which are preserved by Eusebius, Porphyry argues that a distinction must be made between the soul as the form of the body, what makes the body alive, and the soul as an intellective, transcendent entity, which is its essential nature. This latter soul is immortal and Boethus makes the mistake of confusing the two (see Karamanolis 2006: 91–98 and Trabattoni 2020).

For Porphyry, as for Plotinus, what matters most in life is to free one’s soul from the calamities of the body and the sensible world in general so that it may become purely what it originally and essentially is, viz., a part of the intelligible world. Thus, reason should endeavor to elevate itself to the level of the Intellect, which is distinguished by a much higher degree of unity than the mere ordinary use of reason is capable of. It may even be possible to rise above this to the level of the One itself. There seems to be a certain difference in Porphyry’s and Plotinus’ emphasis here, however. Whereas Plotinus stresses episodic escapes in this life by means of philosophy, Porphyry, while admitting this possibility, seems to suppose that the soul may, after successive reincarnations, free itself from the sensible realm for good. At least according to some of the evidence, he, however, rejects the incarnation of human souls into animal bodies and interprets Platonic passages suggesting this as not literally intended (see Smith 1984 and Deuse 1983: 129–159).

Scholars now universally agree that the work, To Gaurus on How Embryos are Ensouled attributed to Galen in the manuscripts, is not by him but by Porphyry. There is now a fine edition, translations and commentaries of this work (Wilberding 2011; Brisson et al. 2012). Though arguably an elaboration of Plotinus’ views, in To Gaurus Porphyry gives the details of a very interesting account of the development of the embryo and its relations to the parents (see in particular Wilberding 2008). Among other things Porphyry gives an explanation of how and why children resemble both their parents: the embryo develops from the seed of the father but it does not have a soul of its own. It is ruled by the vegetative soul of the mother who puts a permanent stamp on the embryo through a process of blending in which the nature of the embryo retains its individuality. The account given diverges significantly from those of previous thinkers, allowing for much greater influence of the mother.

Porphyry is on record for his defense of vegetarianism in his On Abstinence. This work is addressed to a friend (an associate of Plotinus’ circle in Rome) and former vegetarian who has resumed the consumption of meat. On the one hand, Porphyry’s abstinence from eating animals is motivated by the goal, mentioned above, of freeing oneself from the body and the sensible realm as much as possible. The exhortation is addressed to those who have set themselves such a goal. There are, however, ethical concerns as well. Porphyry accords certain rationality to the animals and in general emphasizes what they have in common with us humans. He claims that it is plainly unjust to harm those who intend no harm against us, and this applies to the animals. So his vegetarianism is also a matter of justice (Tuominen 2015). The evidence suggests, however, that he did not hold this view consistently: in his Philosophy from the Oracles (see Smith 1993) he accepts animal sacrifices and does not object to them on principle in his Letter to Anebo.

In Sententiae 32 Porphyry presents his views on the virtues, which, though a development of Plotinus’ account in Ennead I. 2, are interesting in their own right. He distinguishes between four kinds of virtue: civic, purgative, contemplative and paradigmatic. The four kinds of virtue are hierarchically ordered so that paradigmatic virtue comprises in some way all the rest (paradigmatic virtues are the Platonic Forms, or paradigms, of the different virtues). On the other hand, even if, e.g., civic virtue naturally leads to purgative virtue, a person may be virtuous at the civic level without possessing the higher forms. On all four levels Porphyry posits the four cardinal virtues of Plato’s Republic (wisdom, courage, temperance and justice). The civic virtues are concerned with the virtuous actions of ordinary life—wise, temperate, just and courageous. These cardinal virtues are differently, albeit analogously, defined in the case of each level. Thus, e.g., wisdom as a purgative virtue is defined as the soul’s “not forming opinions in accordance with the body, but acting on its own”, whereas wisdom as a contemplative virtue consists in the contemplation of the essences inherent in Intellect. Thus, the virtues form a hierarchy where the inferior may be seen as a weaker manifestation of the superior. This theory of virtue is a clever attempt at reconciling the Republic, the Phaedo and the Theaetetus and fitting their teaching about virtue into a coherent Platonic metaphysics. This kind of account of the virtues was accepted and expanded on by later Neoplatonists.

Interesting differences between Porphyry and Plotinus can be detected in their respective views on the emotions and on happiness. While Plotinus holds that the emotions should be eradicated and that happiness consists in the life of Intellect alone, the perfect life (Ennead I.4.3), Porphyry recommends metriopatheia, “moderate emotions”, and allows for degrees of happiness. Not only the intellectually virtuous person is happy, the civically virtuous person is happy too, even if this is a lower form of happiness (see Karamanolis 2006: 303–308). These differences reflect Porphyry’s endeavor to bring Plato and Aristotle into harmony.

3.3 The Metaphysics of the Higher Realms

The hierarchy of hypostases the One, Intellect and Soul has already been sketched. Given the available texts with certainty attributable to Porphyry, in particular the Sententiae, there would be no strong reason for supposing Porphyry’s metaphysics to differ significantly from that of Plotinus, though he does not always follow his vocabulary. Furthermore, Porphyry has a different and more Aristotelian conception of the branches of philosophy than Plotinus, who claims dialectic as the supreme philosophical method (Hadot 1966; Strange 2007; cf. Plotinus, Ennead I. 3). This different conception is shown, for instance, in his arrangement of Plotinus’ treatises which follows a pattern of ethics, physics, psychology, and ontology.

As mentioned above, Hadot (1968) made a case for identifying Porphyry as the author of the so-called Anonymous commentary on Plato’s Parmenides. The late ancient author of this commentary, extant in mere fragments, takes the Parmenides to present Plato’s ontological view. The commentary employs a notion of the One as an ineffable first principle that according to Hadot makes it post-Plotinian. However, in the commentary the distinction between the first and the second hypostasis is somewhat blurred: the ineffable One is somehow also at the same time the first member (“Father”) in a triad of being, life and intelligence and in this context identical with being. Positing a first principle that is a part of such a composite is surely un-Plotinian. If Hadot’s identification of the author with Porphyry is right, Porphyry indeed held metaphysical views that differ significantly from those of Plotinus. However, even if Hadot’s hypothesis about Porphyry as the author of the commentary quickly won wide acceptance, in later years it has suffered several blows at the hands of scholars with the result that it must be considered highly questionable (see, e.g., Edwards 1990, Bechtle 1999, Corrigan 2000, Rasimus 2011). The discovery that most of the supposedly Porphyrian characteristics of the Parmenides commentary are to be found in pre-Porphyrian Gnostic texts (unavailable to Hadot in the 1960s) seems especially troublesome for Hadot’s thesis (see Rasimus 2011). Porphyry’s authorship has, however, been recently defended by Chiaradonna (2014). Smith (1987, 2007), though unwilling to assert Porphyry as the author, holds that it comes from his circle and, hence, is definitely post-Plotinian.

3.4 Aristotle, Logic and Epistemology

Porphyry was the first Platonist to write proper commentaries on Aristotle’s logical works and indeed on Aristotle generally (Karamanolis 2004) and from what can be gathered from what is extant he does so without assuming a strong Platonist point of view. There is an extant commentary of his on Aristotle’s Categories and another longer one in seven books, Ad Gedalium. This latter work was for centuries known only in mere short fragments from later commentators but a plausible case has been made that a recently discovered palimpsest contains a substantial portion of it (Chiaradonna et al. 2013). He also wrote commentaries on other parts of Aristotle´s Organon. He wrote the Isagoge, which is an introduction to Aristotle’s logical works in general. Through these logical writings Porphyry established himself as an important figure in the history of logic. He is the instigator of the tradition followed by subsequent Neoplatonists of taking Aristotle’s Categories as a basic introductory text and his Isagoge in particular served as a standard introductory text in Byzantium, the Arabic world and in the Latin West through Boethius’ translations and commentary. These texts served as a basic introductory texts in philosophy for at least 1000 years.

Platonists before Plotinus differed in their attitude towards Aristotle (see Karamanolis 2006). Porphyry belongs to those who believed that Plato and Aristotle can be harmonized and in this he is followed by just about all subsequent ancient Platonists. A preserved title of a lost works of his, On the differences between Plato and Aristotle, may seem to give contrary indications (he is also supposed to have written a work about the unity of their thought). Admitting some differences is compatible with a fundamentally reconciliatory attitude (cf. Karamanolis 2006: 243ff.). This positive attitude towards Aristotle is particularly evident from his position on Aristotle’s Categories. The question arises how such an attitude can be reconciled with those passages in Aristotle that seem to disagree with Plato, sometimes expressly. We do not know how Porphyry dealt with others of these, besides Aristotle’s Categories, which appears to modern readers in many respects to be an anti-Platonic work. This is especially notable in its claim that particular sensible substances are prior to the universal species and genera. Porphyry solves this dilemma by insisting that the so-called Aristotelian categories—substance, quality, quantity etc., dealt with in the Categories—are “significant expressions”. That is to say, the Categories is not a work in primary ontology but rather a work about the expressions used to signify the sensible things around us and that the sense in which these are first or primary is that they are the first we meet with in our experience (58, 1ff.). The class of beings signified by a universal term of this sort is indeed prior to the universal term, e.g., the class of pale things to the universal term ‘pale’. As Strange (1987, 1992) notes, this, however, does not affect the basic ontology. So interpreted the Categories is innocuous from a Platonic point of view: the realm of Platonic intelligible Forms, which are universals of a different kind than the expressions involved in the Categories, can be kept intact. The universals the Isagoge and Porphyry’s commentaries on the Categories are concerned with are post rem universals abstracted by the mind from external objects met with through sense-perception.

The extant commentary on the Categories mentions only a dual semantic relation, that between signifying expressions (words) and things, whereas other sources attribute to Porphyry a triadic relation between words, concepts and things. This is probably the doctrine of the longer lost commentary. The reason for the difference may be that in the short commentary he wanted to keep matters as simple as possible or as Griffin (2012) has proposed that the two views build on different traditions.

There are two intertwined issues debated by scholars relating to Porphyry’s philosophy of logic: One has to do with Porphyry’s understanding of the relationship between Aristotelian categories as “signifying expressions” and the things these expressions refer to, the ontology. His remarks in the Isagoge indicating that he will eschew difficult ontological issues (1, 9–16) as well as the absence of distinctively Platonic views in the Isagoge and the extant commentary on the Categories have lead scholars to suppose that he regarded logic as an ontologically uncommitted discipline that could be freely adopted by different schools of different persuasions (Ebbesen 1990; Barnes 2003). There are strong reasons to believe, however, that Porphyry the logician cannot so easily be separated from Porphyry the philosopher. The Isagoge and the extant commentary on the Categories are intended as elementary works but not thereby philosophically neutral, unconnected with Porphyry’ substantial views on the nature of things. That Porphyry’s interpretation of the Categories brings with it certain ontological commitments is evident from the fact that he took the signifying expressions, the categories, to reflect the structure of the sensible world (cf. In Categorias., 58, 21–29; Chiaradonna 2008). This is by no means a trivial assumption. The other issue has to do with Porphyry’s stance towards Plotinus’ account of the Aristotelian categories in Ennead VI.1 and 3. Plotinus understands the Categories as a work in ontology rather than being about expressions and he takes a critical view of it as such. What is debated is to what extent this shows a deep disagreement between the two thinkers not only about the interpretation of Aristotle’s Categories but about the structure of the sensible realm and its relation to the intelligible causes. Chiaradonna (2002: 48–54) argues forcefully, and in this author’s view successfully, that there is a breach with Plotinus on the issue. Porphyry accepted and adopted Aristotelian essentialism about sensible objects along with Aristotle’s categorization of them and sought to harmonize this view with his Platonist position about the intelligible causes of this realm. Plotinus did not share this view. Porphyry’s line won the day in late antiquity. The opposite view, that there is a smooth continuation between Plotinus and Porphyry on the Aristotelian categories, is argued by Frans de Haas (2001).

In spite of the ontological assumptions behind the Isagoge and the lesser, extant commentary on the Categories, Porphyry’s very disclaimers, his avoidance of the deep questions about the ontological status of genera and species—whether they exist or depend on thought; and if they exist, whether they are bodies or incorporeal; and if the latter, whether they are sensible items or exist separately from such—no doubt contributed to the ease with which these works were taken into obligatory school readings for centuries. Thus, his non-committal formulations of them helped make these works the most lasting part of his legacy in West.

It has already been noted that Porphyry seems to be committed to a version of abstractionism with regard to human beings’ acquisition of knowledge of sensibles. His Commentary on Ptolemy’s Harmonics contains a section about epistemology (11, 5–22, 7), in which the overarching theme is the question of the respective roles of sense-perception and reason (logos) in the acquisition of knowledge. In the course of this discussion he describes a process starting from sense-perception, through apprehension (antilepsis) and supposition (doxastike hypolepsis) to the reception of in the soul of a concept (epinoia), which is identical with the form of the object; hence come knowledge (episteme) and finally understanding (nous). Much of what Porphyry says here is compatible with Middle Platonist and Peripatetic doctrines and with Plotinus (who is rather ambiguous about the details of this process) and indeed with Aristotle. As regards the intellect, however, Porphyry’s account contains an unmistakable reference to Plato’s Seventh letter, which would count against his assent to a purely Aristotelian account of the acquisition of knowledge about sensible objects (see Chase 2010). More research is needed on these aspects of Porphyry’s thought.


Porphyry’s works can now be found in an electronic version in the original Greek in the Thesaurus Linguae Graecae collection. Below is a list of editions and translations of single works and fragment works followed by a selected list of secondary literature.

Editions and Translations

  • Life of Plotinus
    • Porphyre: La Vie de Plotin, 2 vols., Luc Brisson et al. (eds.), Paris: Vrin, 1982–1992. (Contains Greek text, French translations, commentary and several studies of particular subjects).
  • Letter to Marcella (and also Life of Pythagoras in the first)
    • Porphyre: Vie de Pythagore, Lettre à Marcella, edited by Édouard des Places, Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 1982. (Contains the Greek text and a French translation.)
    • Porphyry, the Philosopher, to Marcella, text and translation with introduction and notes by Kathleen O’Brien Wicker, Atlanta: Scholars Press, 1987.
    • Porphyry’s Letter to His Wife Marcella Concerning the Life of Philosophy and the Ascent to the Gods, translated by Alice Zimmern, Grand Rapids, MI: Phanes Press, 1989.
  • On Abstinence from Killing Animals, translated by Gillian Clark, London: Duckworth, 2000.
  • [Sent.] Sententiae
    • Porphyre: Sentences, Greek text, French translation, interpretative essays and extensive commentary by Luc Brisson et al., 2 volumes, Paris: Vrin, 2005; includes an English translation, John Dillon (trans.), in Volume II, pp. 795–835.
    • Launching-Points to the Realm of Mind: An Introduction to the Neoplatonic Philosophy of Plotinus, translated by Kenneth Sylvan Guthrie, Grand Rapids, MI: Phanes Press, 1988. (This is the work that has been called the Sententiae above.)
  • Isagoge (Introduction)
    • [Barnes 2003] Porphyry: Introduction, translated with a Commentary by Jonathan Barnes, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • On the Cave of the Nymphs,
    • Porphyry on the Cave of the Nymphs, translated by Robert Lamberton, Barrytown, NY: Midpoint Trade Books Inc., 1983. (Contains also the Greek text.)
    • Porphyre, L’Antre des nymphes dans l’Odyssée, Introduction, édition du texte grec, traduction et notes sous la direction de Tiziano Dorandi, Paris: Vrin, 2019.
  • Commentary on Ptolemy’s Harmonics
    • Porphyry’s Commentary on Ptolemy’s Harmonics: A Greek Text and Annotated Translation, translated and edited by Andrew Barker, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2015.
    • Porphyrius: Commentarius in Claudii Ptolemaei Harmonica, edited by Massimo Raffa, Berlin/Boston: De Gruyter, 2016. doi:10.1515/9783110419672
  • Commentary on Aristotle’s Categories
    • Porphyry: “On Aristotle’s ‘Categories’”, translated by Steven K. Strange, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1992.
    • Porphyre: Commentaire aux Catégories d’Aristote. (Greek text, French translation and commentary), French translation by Richard Bodéüs, Paris: Vrin, 2008.
  • To Gaurus
    • [Wilberding 2011] Porphyry: To Gaurus on how Embryos are Ensouled and On what is in our Power, translated by James Wilberding, London: Bristol Classical Papers, 2011.
    • [Brisson et al. 2012] Porphyre. Sur la manière dont l’embryon reçoit l’âme (Histoire des doctrines de l’antiquité classique, 43), Luc Brisson, Gwenaëlle Aubry, Marie-Hélène Congourdeau, Françoise Hudry, et al., Greek text edited by Tiziano Dorandi, French translation by Luc Brisson, English translation by Michael Chase, Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin, 2012.
  • Symmikta zetemata
    • [Dörrie 1959] Porphyrios’ «Symmikta zetemata». Ihre Stellung und Geschichte des Neuplatonismus nebst einem Kommentar zu den Fragmenten, Heinrich Dörrie, Munich: C. H. Beck, 1959.
  • Against the Christians
    • Porphyry Against the Christians (Studies in Platonism, Neoplatonism, and the Platonic Tradition, 1), translated with notes by Robert M. Berchman, Leiden: Brill, 2005.
    • Porphyrios, “Contra Christianos”, Neue Samlung der Fragmenten, Testimonien und Dubia mit Einleitung und Anmerkungen, edited by Matthias Becker, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter 2016.
  • Letter to Anebo
    • Porphyre: Lettre à Anébon l’Égyptien, texte établi et traduit par Henri-Dominique Saffrey et Alain-Philippe Segonds, Collection des Universités de France (Série grecque 492), Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 2012.
  • Other Fragments
    • [Smith 1993] Porphyrii Philosophi Fragmenta: Fragmenta Arabica David Wasserstein Interpretante, edited by Andrew Smith, Leipzig: B. G. Teubner, 1993. doi:10.1515/9783110936940
    • Porfirio, Sullo Stige. Testo greco a fronte, 99, edited with commentary in Italian by Cristiano Castelletti, Milan: I edizione Bompiani, 2006.
  • The Homeric Questions, edited and translated by Robin R. Schlunk, New York: P. Lang, 1993. (Contains Greek text and an English translation.)
  • Commentary on Plato’s Parmenides (disputed authorship)
    • In Parmenidem, Cod. Taur. F VI 1”, edited by Alessandro Linguiti, in Corpus dei papiri filosofici greci e latini (CPF), Parte III, Commentari, Firenze: Olschki Editore, 1995, pp. 63–202.
    • [Hadot 1968] Porphyre et Victorinus, 2 vols., Pierre Hadot, Paris: Études Augustiniennes, 1968.
  • [Chiaradonna et al. 2013] “A Rediscovered Categories Commentary”, Riccardo Chiaradonna, Marwan Rashed, David Sedley, and Natalie Tchernetska, in Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, Volume 44, Brad Inwood (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2013, pp. 129–194. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199677887.003.0005

Other Primary Literature

  • Plotinus, Plotinus. The Enneads. edited by Lloyd P. Gerson, and translated by George Boys-Stones, John M. Dillon, Lloyd P. Gerson, R.A. King, Andrew Smith, and James Wilberding, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2018.

General Works and Collections

  • Bidez, Joseph, 1913, La Vie de Porphyre, Ghent: E. van Goethem.
  • Dörrie, Heinrich, Jan-Hendrik Waszink, Willy Theiler, Pierre Hadot, Angelo Raffaele Sodano, Jean Pépin, and Richard Walzer, 1966, Porphyre, (Entretiens sur l’Antiquité classique, XII), Vandœuvres-Genève: Foundation Hardt. [available online (large pdf)]
  • Edwards, Mark, 2018, Porphyrios, in Philosophie der Kaiserzeit und der Spätantike (= Grundriss der Geschichte der Philosophie), (Die Philosophie der Antike, 5/2), Christoph Riedweg, Christoph Horn, Dietmar Wyrwa (eds.), Basel: Schwabe, pp. 1327–1349, 1426–1434.
  • Goulet, Richard et al., 2012, “Porphyre de Tyr”, in Dictionnaire des philosophes antiques, Richard Goulet (ed.), Paris: CNRS Éditions: Paris, 5, 2: 1289–1468 (entry 263).
  • Hadot, Pierre, 1999, Plotin, Porphyre: Études néoplatoniciennes, Paris: Les belles lettres. (A collection of Hadot’s articles on Plotinus and Porphyry.)
  • Karamanolis, George, 2004, “Porphyry, the first Platonist Commentator of Aristotle”, in Peter Adamson et al. (eds.), Science and Exegesis in Greek, Arabic and Latin (Supplement to the Bulletin of the Institute of Classical Studies, volumes. 82, 1–2, London, pp. 79–113.
  • –––, 2006, Plato and Aristotle in Agreement? Platonists on Aristotle from Antiochus to Porphyry, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0199264562.001.0001
  • Karamanolis, George E. and Anne Sheppard, 2007, Studies on Porphyry, London: Institute of Classical Studies, University of London.
  • Smith, Andrew, 1974, Porphyry’s Place in the Neoplatonic Tradition: A Study in Post-Plotinian Neoplatonism, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff. doi:10.1007/978-94-010-1604-9
  • –––, 1987, “Porphyrian Studies Since 1913”, in Wolfgang Haase (ed.), Aufstieg und Niedergang der römischen Welt (ANRW)/Rise and Decline of the Roman World, II.36.2, Berlin, Boston: De Gruyter, pp. 717–773. doi:10.1515/9783110851519-001
  • –––, 2000, “Porphyry and His School”, in The Cambridge History of Philosophy in Late Antiquity, Lloyd P. Gerson (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 325–357. doi:10.1017/CHOL9780521764407.023
  • –––, 2007, “Porphyry: Scope for a Reassessment”, in Karamanolis and Sheppard 2007: 7–16.
  • –––, 2011a, Plotinus, Porphyry and Iamblichus: Philosophy and Religion in Neoplatonism, (Variorum Collected Studies Series CS979), Fanham-Burlington, VT: Ashgate.
  • Sorabji, Richard (ed.), 1990, Aristotle Transformed: The Ancient Commentators and Their Influence, Ithaca, NY: Cornell Unviveristy Press. (Articles on Porphyry, Aristotle and logic.)

Studies on Particular Topics

  • Bechtle, Gerald, 1999, The Anonymous Commentary on Plato’s ‘Parmenides’, Bern: Haupt.
  • Bezza, Giuseppe, 2012, “Introduction à l’Apotélesmatique de Ptolémée”, part of Goulet, Richard et al. 2012: 1381–1384.
  • Chase, Michael, 2010, “Porphyry on the Cognitive Process”, Ancient Philosophy, 30(2): 383–405. doi:10.5840/ancientphil201030234
  • Chiaradonna, Riccardo, 2002, Sostanza, movimento, analogia: Plotino critico di Aristotele (Elenchos, 37), Naples: Bibliopolis.
  • –––, 2007, “Porphyry and Iamblichus on Universals and Synonymous Predication”, Documenti e studi sulla tradizione filosofica medievale, 18: 123–140.
  • –––, 2008, “What is Porphyry’s Isagoge?”, Documenti e studi sulla tradizione filosofica medievale, 19: 1–30.
  • –––, 2014, “Causalite et Hierarchie Metaphysique Dans Le Neoplatonisme : Plotin, Porphyre, Jamblique”, Chôra, 12: 67–85. doi:10.5840/chora2014124
  • Corrigan, Kevin, 2000, “Platonism and Gnosticism: The Anonymous Commentary on the Parmenides: Middle or Neoplatonic?”, in Gnosticism and Later Platonism: Themes, Figures, and Texts, John D. Turner and Ruth Majercik (eds.), Atlanta, GA: Society of Biblical Literature, pp. 141–177.
  • Deuse, Werner, 1983, Untersuchungen zur mittelplatonischen und neuplatonischen Seelenlehre, Wiesbaden: Franz Steiner.
  • Ebbesen, Sten, 1990, “Porphyry’s Legacy to Logic”, in Sorabji 1990: 141–171.
  • Edwards, M. J., 1990, “Porphyry and the Intelligible Triad”, The Journal of Hellenic Studies, 110: 14–24. doi:10.2307/631730
  • Emilsson, Eyjolfur K., 1994, “Platonic Soul-Body Dualism in the Early Centuries of the Empire to Plotinus”, in Wolfgang Haase (ed.), Aufstieg und Niedergang der römischen Welt (ANRW)/Rise and Decline of the Roman World, II.36.2, Berlin, Boston: De Gruyter, pp. 5331–5362. doi:10.1515/9783110883732-021
  • Evangeliou, C.C., 1996, Aristotle’s Categories and Porphyry, (Philosophia Antiqua 48), Leiden: Brill. doi:10.1163/9789004320703
  • Griffin, Michael J., 2012, “What Does Aristotle Categorize? Semantics and the Early Peripatetic Reading of the Categories”, Bulletin of the Institute of Classical Studies, 55(1): 69–108. doi:10.1111/j.2041-5370.2012.00035.x
  • Hadot, Pierre, 1966, “La métaphysique de Porphyre”, in Dörrie et al. 1966: 127–163; reprinted in Hadot 1999: 317–353.
  • –––, 1968, Porphyre et Victorinus, 2 volumes, Paris: Études augustinniennes. (Contains among other things the text of the anonymous Parmenides commentary and extensive discussion of Porphyry’s thought and its surroundings.)
  • Haas, Frans de, 2001, “Did Plotinus and Porphyry Disagree on Aristotle’s Categories?”, Phronesis 46(4): 592–526.
  • Rasimus, Tuomas, 2011, “Porphyry and the Gnostics: Reassessing Pierre Hadot’s Thesis in Light of the Second- and Third-Century Sethian Treatises”, in Plato’s ‘Parmenides’ and Its Heritage, Volume 2: Reception in Patristic, Gnostic, and the Christian Neoplatonic Texts, John D. Turner and Kevin Corrigan (eds.), Leiden: Brill, pp. 81–110.
  • Smith, Andrew, 1984, “Did Porphyry Reject the Transmigration of Human Souls into Animals?”, Rheinisches Museum Für Philologie, 127(3/4): 276–284.
  • –––, 2011b, “Religion, Magic and Theurgy in Porphyry”, in Smith 2011a: ch. 19.
  • Strange, Steven K., 1987, “Plotinus, Porphyry, and the Neoplatonic Interpretation of the ‘Categories’”, in Wolfgang Haase (ed.), Aufstieg und Niedergang der römischen Welt (ANRW)/Rise and Decline of the Roman World, II.36.2, Berlin, Boston: De Gruyter, pp. 955–974. doi:10.1515/9783110851519-006
  • –––, 1992, “Introduction” to Porphyry: On Aristotle’s Categories, London: Duckworth.
  • –––, 2007, “Porphyry and Plotinus’ Metaphysics”, in Karamanolis and Sheppard: 17–34.
  • Trabattoni, Franco, 2020, “Boéthos de Sidon et l’immortalité de l’âme Dans Le Phédon”, in Boéthos de Sidon: Exégète d’Aristote et Philosophe, Riccardo Chiaradonna and Marwan Rashed (eds.), Berlin: De Gruyter, pp. 337–360. doi:10.1515/9783110699845-009
  • Tuominen, Miira, 2015, “Why Do We Need Other People to Be Happy? Happiness and Concern for Others in Aspasius and Porphyry”, in The Quest for the Good Life: Ancient Philosophers on Happiness, Øyvind Rabbås, Eyjólfur K. Emilsson, Hallvard Fossheim, and Miira Tuominen (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 241–264. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198746980.003.0014
  • Wilberding, James, 2008, “Plotinus and Porphyry on the Seed”, Phronesis 53: 406–432.

Other Internet Resources

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