First published Tue Aug 27, 2019; substantive revision Tue Nov 7, 2023

Iamblichus (ca. 242–ca. 325) was a Syrian Neoplatonist and disciple of Porphyry of Tyre, the editor of Plotinus’ works. One of the three major representatives of early Neoplatonism (the third one being Plotinus himself), he exerted considerable influence among later philosophers belonging to the same tradition, such as Proclus, Damascius, and Simplicius. His work as a Pagan theologian and exegete earned him high praise and made a decisive contribution to the transformation of Plotinian metaphysics into the full-fledged system of the fifth-century school of Athens, at that time the major school of philosophy, along with the one in Alexandria. His harsh critique of Plotinus’ philosophical tenets is linked to his pessimistic outlook on the condition of the human soul, as well as to his advocacy of salvation by ritual means, known as “theurgy”.

1. Life and Works

1.1 Life

Little is known about Iamblichus’ life and career, since Eunapius of Sardis’ biography of Iamblichus (Lives of Philosophers and Sophists V [Goulet 2014, Baltussen 2023]) is merely hagiographical in nature. His birthplace is traditionally taken to be Chalcis ad Belum (modern Qinnasrin), although support has been voiced in favor of a different Chalcis, Chalcis sub Libanum (Aliquot 2010: 307 and n. 7). What is uncontroversial is that Iamblichus hailed from a very influential Syrian family, the Sampsigeramids of Emesa (Damascius, Philosophical History, Athanassiadi 1999: 334.10–14 [Zintzen 1967: 2.8–10]), who had gained access to the Imperial throne along with Elagabalus (218–222).

Eunapius gives Anatolius and then Porphyry as Iamblichus’ two teachers, and there are no decisive reasons to doubt this: on the one hand, it is evident that he was influenced by the kind of theological arithmology Anatolius championed; on the other hand, Porphyry dedicated his treatise On the “Know thyself” to Iamblichus (Stobaeus, Anthology III, 21, 26) and provides information about the philosopher’s son (Life of Plotinus 9). Since this son is said by Porphyry to have married a Roman aristocrat, it is very likely that Iamblichus studied in Rome under Porphyry, who would have carried on the philosophical circle Plotinus had founded in 244. Dalsgaard Larsen’s (DL-1972: I, 38–39) supposition of a prolonged stay at Alexandria is dubious at best.

After a break with Porphyry that seems impossible to date with precision, Iamblichus settled in Syria. Although he is known to have owned an estate in Antioch’s suburb of Daphne, it is now accepted that he settled in Apamea, where Plotinus’ first disciple Amelius had previously moved. There, welcomed by a wealthy notable, Sopater, he founded a flourishing school: we know about a dozen of his students (see below, Section 2.4), among whom the most conspicuous are Sopater himself, who died because of a plot at Constantine’s court; Aedesius, who moved the school to Pergamon; and Dexippus, the only disciple of whom we still have a philosophical work (a commentary on Aristotle’s Categories). Apart from Eunapius, evidence about Iamblichus’ whereabouts in Apamea is to be found mainly in Libanius (e.g. Ep. 1389.13–14) and, above all, in the letters by an anonymous Syrian sophist whose correspondence with Iamblichus was preserved among the genuine letters of the emperor Julian (e.g. Pseudo-Julian, Ep. 78 and 79 Wright).

1.2 Works

Few of Iamblichus’ works are preserved in the direct manuscript tradition. Four of these texts pertain to a summa On Pythagoreanism (conflicting testimonies exist about its title: cf. O’Meara 1989: 32–33): On the Pythagorean Life; the Protrepticus; On General Mathematical Science; and an Introduction to Arithmetic based on Nicomachus of Gerasa’s treatise of the same name. Sadly, they are for the most part impersonal works: the Protrepticus consists in lengthy quotations from previous hortatory literature, and its interest mostly lies in the fact that it provides evidence for valuable lost works (most notably Aristotle’s own Protrepticus and the so-called Anonymus Iamblichi), while On the Pythagorean Life plagiarizes previous biographies of the master, although it certainly contains valuable insights on Iamblichus’ conception of the “divine man”. Neither of these works seems to have had any impact over the subsequent course of philosophy, whereas On General Mathematical Science was at least a formative influence on Proclus’ commentary to Euclid’s Elements, as well as on Syrianus’ commentary on Metaphysics Μ–Ν (see DGU-2020). It also provides the basic material for the reconstruction of Iamblichus’ philosophy of mathematics (see below, Section 4). For a general characterization of On Pythagoreanism and its context, see Huffman (2006 [2019: sect. 4.4]).

The most important extant treatise by Iamblichus, however, is the Reply of Master Abamon to Porphyry’s Letter to Anebo, and Solutions to the Difficulties Contained Therein (abbreviated to Reply to Porphyry and traditionally known as De mysteriis Ægyptiorum since Marsilio Ficino’s original Latin translation: see SS-2013: ix–xxi). The work is a defense of Pagan religious practice (sacrifice, prayer, divination etc.; on the latter, see Timotin 2022) against the objections raised by Porphyry, and to serve this purpose it introduces several philosophical developments on the divine nature and orders, as well as the pretensions of the human soul. The whole debate is framed with a fictional Egyptian scenario: Porphyry had raised his objections in an epistle addressed to Anebo, an Egyptian priest, while Iamblichus wrote his reply under the assumed guise of the Egyptian prophet Abamon. While it had limited direct transmission (the only ancient testimonium being Proclus, In Timaeum I, 386.8–13 [D-1973: Fr. 38], although Taormina (2014) expressed reservations), its importance as a touchstone against which one can safely compare what can be gathered from other sources is invaluable.

The bulk of what remains of Iamblichus’ work consists in approx. 800 fragments and testimonia. Of these, the extensive excerpts given by Stobaeus of a work On the Soul as well as a dozen Letters, which have been the object of multiple independent editions, stand out as the most coherent, if not necessarily the most original. By far the most influential part of his philosophical output, his Commentaries on key works by Plato and Aristotle are all lost, although in almost two cases (his commentary on the Categories, transmitted by Simplicius; that on the Timaeus, transmitted by Proclus), quotations are so numerous that one can safely establish the main features of the exegesis given. Of the other works Iamblichus wrote commentaries on, the most important ones are the Alcibiades, the Philebus and the Parmenides, while the existence of a separate, continuous commentary on Aristotle’s De anima was questioned by Blumenthal (1974). A richly annotated edition of the Platonic fragments was given by D-1973, while DL-1972 collected all fragments known to Dalsgaard Larsen as an appendix to his monograph, although his work can barely be described as an edition. Another collection focusing on Aristotelian exegesis was produced by Romano [R-2012].

2. Iamblichus’ Place in Greek Neoplatonism

2.1 The second founder of Neoplatonism

Iamblichus’ significance in Late Antique philosophy can hardly be overestimated. Karl Praechter described him as the second founder of Neoplatonism after Plotinus and argued that Iamblichus’ position was similar to that of Chrysippus in ancient Stoicism (Praechter 1910: 143). This statement aptly expresses Iamblichus’ historical and philosophical significance, but needs qualification: unlike the Stoa, “Neoplatonism” is not an ancient philosophical school, but a modern historical category (whose reliability scholars are sometimes inclined to question: see Catana 2013). Iamblichus is likely, as was mentioned above (Section 1.1) to have been a student of Porphyry who was, in turn, a student of Plotinus. Iamblichus’ school was, however, separate from that of Plotinus, both in time and in place: consequently, despite late, ideological attempts to reconstruct a continuous “golden chain” of Neoplatonist exegetes (see, e.g., Hierocles, De Providentia, apud Photius cod. 214, 173 a; Proclus, Platonic Theology I, p. 6.16–7.8), there is no institutional continuity between Plotinus and Iamblichus and, from this point of view, the situation is different from that of the ancient Stoa. Iamblichus is not the second founder of the Neoplatonic school for the simple reason that there is no unitary Neoplatonic school in Late Antiquity. What scholars call Greek Neoplatonism is actually a multifaceted philosophical movement that covers some three centuries and includes several schools scattered throughout the Roman Empire: these schools certainly shared doctrines and methods, but their relations were sometimes close, sometimes much more tenuous. Certainly, Iamblichus accepts and further develops some distinctive features of Plotinus’ philosophy and he can be seen as a follower of Plotinus and Porphyry: this holds in particular for Iamblichus’ general metaphysical and philosophical approach, for his account of the One and of the first principles, for his exegesis of some works such as Plato’s Parmenides and Aristotle’s Categories. On the other hand, Iamblichus’ original position vis-à-vis Plotinus and Porphyry emerges clearly with respect to both his theories and his methods (see Taormina 1999).

2.2 Exegesis

One of the most conspicuous of Iamblichus’ contributions to emerging Neoplatonism regards his views on exegesis. A typical Late Antique intellectual in this respect, Iamblichus considers the written work of authoritative figures to be sacred and claims to be a mere interpreter of their true, deeper meaning (nous).

Four overarching principles govern Iamblichus’ exegetical practice. First, the idea that every authoritative work is fully self-consistent and strives to demonstrate a certain thesis which acts as its “goal” or “target” (skopos). This principle is applied rigorously: for instance, since the skopos of the Timaeus is the theory of nature, this means that even the work’s prologue, however autonomous it may seem at first glance, should be interpreted in this way (In Timaeum [D-1973: Fr. 3]). This amounts to considering literary works living organisms, in accordance with what Plato writes in Phaedrus 264C (see Coulter 1976: 73). Guidelines to determining a given work’s skopos are found in a late anonymous composition, the Prolegomena to Platonic Philosophy (§§ 21–23).

The same source (§ 26) provides a list of twelve Platonic dialogues (10 + 2) which, according to Iamblichus, offer an overview of his philosophy and thus encompass the whole theory of reality. The list starts with the Alcibiades, taken as an introduction to philosophy and thought to contain the first ten dialogues, as if it were a “seed” (In Alcibiadem [D-1973: Fr. 1). The remaining dialogues are subsequently arranged according to the different branches of philosophy (as Porphyry had done with Plotinus’ Enneads), while the Aristotelian distinction between praxis and theōria is simultaneously taken into account. Praxis or ethics is exemplified by the Gorgias and the Phaedo, the former representing politics, the latter catharsis (in accordance with Iamblichus’ conception of virtues, on which see below, Section 7.2). Then comes theōria where, as it seems, the Cratylus and the Theaetetus are taken to provide Plato’s account of logic (the former teaching names, the latter concepts); then come the Sophist and the Politicus, which supposedly deal with physics—however strange this may seem to us—and finally the Phaedrus and the Symposium, which deal with theology. The crowning dialogue in the first cycle is the Philebus, because its skopos is the all-transcendent Good. Then, as a recapitulation of the first cycle, we find a second one consisting in only two works (both of which, remarkably, feature main characters other than Socrates): the Timaeus and the Parmenides, the former subordinated to the latter as physics is to theology, although both display a degree of perfection and thus are expected to embrace the whole of Plato’s philosophy. This curriculum principle, then, was supposed to bring an author’s œuvre into accordance with itself, just as the skopos postulated organic unity in a single text.

All that was left at this point was to establish harmony between different authors; and this is where sumphōnia or “agreement” comes into play. Building on Porphyry’s efforts (as opposed to Plotinus’ views), Iamblichus fully integrated Aristotle into Platonism (see Section 5 below); he also took into account Pythagoras and the pseudo-Pythagorean corpus (see Section 4.3). References to other schools are scarce and mostly critical. Iamblichus’ philosophical authorities, then, are Plato, Aristotle, and the Pythagoreans; they were complemented by several texts held to be divinely inspired, of which the two most important ones are the Chaldean Oracles (a second-century collection of verse oracles which provide a Platonic-influenced revelation mostly based on the Timaeus, and which develop a dualistic view about matter and a divine energy called “fire”) and the pseudo-Orphic Rhapsodies in 24 books. The Chaldean Oracles at least are known to have been commented upon by Iamblichus, in a huge commentary comprising at least 28 books (Damascius, De Principiis II, 1.5–8). (on Iamblichus’ religious views, see below, Section 6.3.)

2.3 Philosophy and theology

Iamblichus brought about a shift towards religion and theology in Neoplatonism which proved crucial for the later development of this movement and for its Christian appropriation (see Lecerf and Taormina 2022). The Reply to Porphyry, where Iamblichus rejects Porphyry’s over-confident intellectualism in theological and religious matters, is certainly our major source on debates in early Neoplatonism. Scholars have traditionally described Iamblichus’ stance as irrational, contrasting it with Plotinus and Porphyry’s rational and philosophical approach (see Dodds 1951: 285–298). Recent scholarship, however, has effectively questioned this view (see Tanaseanu-Döbler 2013). In his Reply to Porphyry (I, 2 [SS-2013: 4.5–5.11]) Iamblichus distinguishes three disciplines, each with its own distinctive methods: philosophy, theology, and theurgy. Theurgy certainly goes beyond reason and philosophy, but Iamblichus’ appeal to theurgy and rituals is based on sophisticated philosophical views and arguments dealing with the nature of divine beings and the status of human souls (see below, Section 6). It would therefore be misleading to draw a strict opposition between theurgy and rational methods. What is distinctive about Iamblichus vis-à-vis Plotinian Platonism is the thorough integration of theological traditions into his account of reality. This emerges in two related areas. Whether or not he wrote a work by this title, Iamblichus is the first Neoplatonist to develop a “Platonic theology” (see Proclus, Platonic Theology III, 44.1–5 [Saffrey & Westerink 1968–1997]). This approach will be carried further in Athenian Neoplatonism, especially by Proclus. Plotinus had already connected the hypotheses about the One in the second part of Plato’s Parmenides with his distinction of metaphysical principles (see Enn. V, 1.8). Iamblichus goes one step further in that he connects the metaphysical reading of this dialogue with the gods of the Greek pantheon. His interpretation of Plato’s Parmenides can therefore be described not only as “metaphysical” but also as “theological”. In addition to this, Iamblichus provides a harmonising account of the different theological traditions, again paving the way for the later developments in Athenian Neoplatonism (see below, Section 3.2). In his Reply to Porphyry Iamblichus establishes a triad of foundational traditions: the Egyptian, the Chaldaic and the Greek, represented by the philosophical wisdom of Pythagoras and Plato. The term “Chaldaic” refers to the Chaldaean Oracles (see above, Section 2.2). The extant evidence suggests that Plotinus and Porphyry accorded limited significance to the Oracles which, instead, become a crucial source for Iamblichus: he wrote an extensive commentary on this work and the revealed Platonizing theology of the Oracles is an integral part of his thought. The Egyptian tradition is represented by the so-called Hermetic books and, according to Iamblichus, this is the genuine source of Greek philosophy (Reply to Porphyry I, 2 [SS-2013: 4.7–9]).

2.4 Iamblichus’ posterity

Iamblichus’ philosophical stance is connected to some views which separate him from Plotinus and Porphyry and lay the ground for later Neoplatonism, in particular that of Proclus and of the so-called Athenian school of the fifth and sixth century AD. These views concern: the status of embodied souls (according to Iamblichus there is no superior part of our soul which resides in intelligible being); the role of religious acts revealed by the gods to enable the soul’s ascension to the intelligible realm (as already noted, for Iamblichus, philosophical and intellectual contemplation alone are not sufficient and theurgy is necessary); a harmonising account of the various theological traditions and the privileged role assigned to Pythagoras and to the Chaldaean Oracles; an account of principles and of the metaphysical hierarchy which, while based on Plotinus’ and Porphyry’s doctrines, includes more degrees and intermediate levels; and, finally, a tendency towards scholasticism and the systematization of exegetical methods.

A picture of Late Antique philosophy jumping from Iamblichus to Proclus would however be misleading. Actually, more than one century separates Iamblichus’ death from the foundation of the Neoplatonist school at Athens by Plutarch of Athens. Some crucial details escape us: for example, we don’t even know how and when Iamblichus’ teaching entered the philosophical schools in Athens (Goulet 2012). In addition to this, Iamblichus’ posterity in the fourth century does not suggest that his philosophical approach was immediately and unanimously followed. Praechter (1910) regarded those disciples of Iamblichus’ who settled in Pergamon, gathering around Iamblichus’ student Aedesius, as forming a school (the “school of Pergamon”), where rational methods were abandoned in favor of theurgy and religious practices. In addition, these philosophers are sometimes regarded as forming an ideologically engaged Pagan group threatened by Christian persecution after Constantine. Such views are somewhat oversimplistic. Our main source for reconstructing this phase of Neoplatonism is Eunapius’ Lives of Philosophers and Sophists (Goulet 2014). As already noted, Eunapius is a tendentious source, with his own hagiographical agenda and with little taste for philosophical technicalities. Whatever we make of this, he says that Iamblichus’ students formed a large crowd and that those who were eager to learn flocked to him from all parts (see Eunapius Lives VI, 4 [Goulet 2014: 12–14]). This and other passages suggest that Pagan philosophical teaching definitely did not go underground under and after Constantine (the elite of the Roman Empire was still largely Pagan at that time). Eunapius’ list of Iamblichus’ students confirms the echo of his teaching: the list includes Sopater the Syrian (see above, Section 1.1), Aedesius, Eustathius from Cappadocia, Theodorus, and Euphrasius (see Eunapius Lives V, 5 [Goulet 2014: 12.14–20]). Among these, Theodorus is likely to coincide with Theodorus of Asine who, while being a student of Iamblichus, is said to have held different philosophical views and reverted to an intellectualist Platonism of the Plotinian sort. Aedesius’ school too certainly hosted different positions and internal debates. Thus Eusebius of Myndus was a member of that school, but apparently held an attitude closer to that of Plotinus and he was inclined to reject theurgical and magical practices. On the other hand, theurgy was adopted by Aedesius’ Iamblichean disciples such as Chrysanthius of Sardis, Maximus of Ephesus, and Priscus of Thesprotia. Maximus and Priscus were charismatic figures who are mainly known as masters and counsellors of the Emperor Julian (Julian studied philosophy at Pergamon around 350). Iamblichus’ teaching actually forms the philosophical background of Julian’s project of restoration of Paganism, as shown by Julian’s own writings (see De Vita 2011) and by the short treatise On the Gods and the Cosmos by one Salustius (possibly Saturninius Secundus Salutius, a dignitary at Julian’s court). It is worth noting, however, that even committed theurgists like Maximus did not abandon rational methods (we know about Maximus’ work on Aristotle’s Categories and Prior Analytics).

In addition to internal debates among Iamblichus’ disciples, fourth-century philosophy includes an overtly anti-Iamblichean trend. This is the case with Themistius (orator, commentator of Aristotle and authoritative member of the Senate in Constantinople), who did not endorse Iamblichus’ philosophy and did not show any sympathy for his theurgic and Pythagorean teaching. He actually sharply criticizes the new philosophical approach represented by the “man of Chalcis” (an allusion to Iamblichus: see Themistius, Or. 23, 295b). Themistius engaged in a controversy with Maximus of Ephesus over Aristotle’s logic in Constantinople, where Julian acted as arbiter (Ammonius, In Analytica Priora, p. 31.11–23). Furthermore, Themistius regarded the Pythagorean Archytas’ treatise on the categories as spurious and argued that the author was not a Pythagorean at all (Boethius, In Categorias, PL 64, 162 A). By doing so Themistius actually removed the main support for Iamblichus’ Pythagorean and metaphysical reading of Aristotle. Iamblichus’ philosophy, then, was only gradually accepted and it was regarded with both consensus and disagreement in its immediate posterity. Certainly, Iamblichus’ philosophical approach did not entail any abandonment of rational methods, not even among those who enthusiastically embraced theurgy.

3. Iamblichus’ System

As a general rule, Iamblichus’ system is best characterized as a refined version of Plotinus’. Building on hierarchical hints already present in the Enneads as well as the work of his own teacher Porphyry, Iamblichus set about producing a far more complex picture of reality, while keeping the same fundamental patterns in place.

3.1 The One and the higher principles

Iamblichus’ account of the One is difficult to ascertain, since the crucial testimony (Damascius, De principiis II, 1.4–16.19 Combès & Westerink) is somewhat oblique. What lies beyond doubt is that Iamblichus reacted against Porphyry’s introduction of a first principle “coordinated” with the Intelligible Triad by positing two levels above it: on the one hand, a “wholly unspeakable principle”—which Theodorus of Asine and Damascius incorporated into their own theology, although Proclus did not: on the subject, see Linguiti 1988—and, on the other hand, a principle “uncoordinated with the triad”. In this respect, Iamblichus seems to have wished to distinguish between two almost contradictory aspects of the first principle: its transcendence with respect to everything else (negative theology), i.e., absoluteness in a literal sense; and its causative aspect (cataphatic theology). Iamblichus, then, appears to have conceived of his “unspeakable principle” as a safeguard against any objection based on indefinite regress in the chain of causes, while the principle that is “uncoordinated to the triad” is akin to Plotinus’ One, insofar as it lies above the Intellect.

Below the One is located the intelligible triad of Limit, the Unlimited, and the One-Being. This arrangement shows the influence of Plato’s Philebus 26C (with the uncoordinated One as the Cause, and the One-Being as the mikton): this is accounted for in Van Riel 2008. Damascius assimilates this sequence to another one attributed to “the Pythagoreans”: Monad-Dyad-Triad, and, ultimately, to the system of principles inferred from the Chaldean Oracles: Father-Power-Intellect. It is likely that the same interpretation was already to be found in Iamblichus, given that both Pythagoras and the Chaldeans rank high in his list of authorities.

Whether Iamblichus introduced the doctrine of “henads” into the teachings of the Neoplatonic School remains controversial (see Clark 2010; Mesyats 2012; Opsomer in Opsomer et al. 2018: 1365–1366). The henads (literally “unities”) are the very first plurality emanating from the One: since they are located beyond Being itself, they are meant to bridge the gap between the absolute One and the intelligible world. Iamblichean authorship of this theory would make it predate Syrianus and Proclus—its first explicit proponents—by almost a century, and indeed several hints point in that direction, in particular the fact that, according to Proclus, Iamblichus identified “God and the gods” as the subject of the first hypothesis of Plato’s Parmenides. These “gods” might be self-sufficient items located right below the One and, judging by the—admittedly very allusive—testimonies of Proclus (references in Saffrey & Westerink 1968–1997: III, pp. XVII–XXVI) and Damascius, might indifferently be called “henads” or “intelligible gods”, in contradiction with Syrianus’ and Proclus’ later terminological distinctions.

There is also another hint in support of this interpretation. Damascius explicitly states that according to Iamblichus divinity is closely correlated to degrees of unity: the intelligible gods are “crystallised, as it were, around the One” (De principiis II, 36.17). According to this conception, the higher a god is situated on the scale of reality, the more “unified” and undifferentiated it is, and the less accessible to the intellect and to conceptual knowledge: one can only know such realities by resorting to intuition. This doctrine is hinted at in various passages of Iamblichus’ Reply to Porphyry (where unity, “friendship”—philia—and goodness are all described as fundamental attributes of the gods: “whatever Being might be in them, this is equivalent to their unity”, I, 19 [SS-2013: 45.8–10]) and is also compatible with his stressing the fact that knowledge of the gods is innate, lying as it does within the heart of every individual (I, 3 [SS-2013: 5.14–20]). From an historical point of view, this gradual diffusion of unity also represents a major contribution to the representation of reality as a continuum, thereby somewhat bridging the rift that, following Plotinus, had emerged between the One and the Intellect. “Unification” too (henōsis) also becomes a key philosophical term, and this opens up the possibility of an anti-intellectual slant, as can be found in a famous extract of the Reply to Porphyry (II, 11 [SS-2013: 73.1–16]).

3.2 “Intelligible” and “intellective”

Iamblichus’ best-known philosophical doctrine might be the distinction he introduced between the “intelligible” (noēton) and the “intellective” (noeron). Before Iamblichus, noeron—not a very common word before the second century A.D.—was used to refer to any thinking entity, and Porphyry employs it mostly in association with the soul. From Iamblichus onwards, it becomes a technical term which exclusively designates the order of gods located right below the Intelligible, and endowed with demiurgic functions. The word is found with such a meaning in fourth-century authors in the tradition of Iamblichus, such as the emperor Julian and Salustius.

The idea of distinguishing “seen” and “seeing” principles (objects and subjects of intellectual knowledge) dates back to the early interpretation of Plato’s Timaeus ((39E), where the Demiurge appears to behold a Model located outside himself in order to gather from it all the data necessary for the creation of the Cosmos: Middle Platonists thus used to distinguish between the Demiurge, Ideas, and Matter. As opposed to, e.g., Longinus (see Syrianus, In Metaphysica, 105.25–28), Plotinus had decisively argued that intelligibles are actually not to be found outside the Intellect. Iamblichus instead falls back on more traditional positions and expressly subordinates the Demiurge to the Intelligible Model. As, on the other hand, Iamblichus follows Plotinus’ steps in developing a doctrine of the One, this results in the Demiurge now being assigned a secondary rank, as he is surpassed by a plethora of other deities, including the Intelligible Model (In Timaeum [D-1973: Fr. 42–46]). He is but the third member of the “paternal” triad, itself part of a larger “intellective” Hebdomad (Proclus, In Timaeum I, 308.17–309.13: compare this triad to Fr. 4 [D-1973] In Philebum = Damascius, In Philebum § 105). From this point onwards, until the closing of the Neoplatonic schools, identifying the Demiurge with the First Principle is out of the question.

On the other hand, Iamblichus fully embraces Plotinus’ idea that intelligibles are endowed with life, power, activity etc. and therefore multiplicity (at least implicitly). This allows him to superpose the divine names found in theology (Orpheus, the Chaldeans, and the dialogues of Plato dealing with the intelligible) upon a conceptual armature: for instance, the Platonic Demiurge is to be identified with the Zeus of Hellenic tradition. This effort reveals itself most conspicuously in Julian, and will find its crowning in Proclus’ Platonic Theology. As a general rule, to every philosophical concept in the intelligible world there corresponds some divine level or entity: the idea of such a correspondence and its application to the sequence of predicates present in the hypotheses of Plato’s Parmenides is generally assigned to Proclus’ master Syrianus, but several hints suggest that it was actually introduced by Iamblichus. One explicit instance of such a term-to-term correspondence is the localization of the genera of Being within the intellective order rather than the intelligible one, because of the former’s higher degree of multiplicity (Proclus, Platonic Theology I, 52.2–13). This important doctrine implies that the Demiurgic intellect is now conceived as some kind of “container” of all intelligible ideas, with the reservation that it is less unified than the Model is.

3.3 Lower entities

Through a comparison between Julian and Proclus (see Lecerf 2012), one may conclude that Iamblichus had conceived of a variety of Demiurges, the main one (identified with Zeus) acting as a principle or “monad” for the others. While Zeus creates the world insofar as it is governed by rational laws and populated with beings pertaining to species and genera (themselves of intelligible nature), other demiurgic entities are tasked with informing matter and bodies (which undergo a process of generation and corruption) according to such laws.

Iamblichus already uses the terminology “hypercosmic” vs. “encosmic” or “pericosmic” (e.g., Reply to Porphyry VIII, 8 [SS-2013: 200.25–27]), inherited from Middle Platonism but destined to become technical in later Neoplatonism. In anticipation of this later use, they are meant to bridge the gap between the Demiurge and the sublunar realm, although their exact role in Iamblichus remains unclear (the aforementioned passage speaks of the help they give to souls in their ascent). Such lower entities seem to be produced according to a geometric progression (cf. In Timaeum [D-1973: Fr. 79]). The terminological continuity allows one to conceive of Iamblichus’ system as the matrix for later variations, particularly Proclus’ one, although it is to be noted that no text bears witness to the presence of Proclus’ intermediate “intelligible-intellective” and “hypercosmic-encosmic” levels in Iamblichus.

The hierarchies of “higher genera” will be considered in Section 6.1.

3.4 Nature and Matter

Iamblichus’ notion of Nature displays little originality when compared to that of other Neoplatonists. It acts as a productive power for cosmic beings, originating in the celestial gods (Reply to Porphyry III, 28 [SS-2013: 127.2–12]), but it does not act according to reason. This ambiguity explains why, depending on the context, it can be considered either a positive entity, insofar as it is part of a reality governed by Providence, or a deceitful, almost evil force, a view strongly influenced by the Chaldean Oracles (see, e.g., V, 18 [SS-2013: 166.18–24]): it comes as no surprise that, in this respect, Nature is also closely associated with Fate. The same ambivalence is to be found with regard to astrology, which Iamblichus deems useful, yet not the best way to determine the identity of our personal daimōn (IX, 4–5 [SS-2013: 205.1–207.9]).

Matter also displays both these traits—integration into the world order and a connection with corporeality and evil. Iamblichus’ Reply to Porphyry is replete with allusions to matter as a taint and source of corruption: “what is mixed with the irrationality and darkness associated with bodies and matter is overcome with ignorance” (VI, 4 [SS-2013: 182.7–10]). By contrast, “divine fire” strives to eradicate materiality and generation (V, 12 [SS-2013: 161.2]). In such passages, Iamblichus inherits the strongly negative views on matter developed by Middle Platonists such as Numenius and further developed by Plotinus. However, a testimony from John Lydus (De Mensibus 175.1–176.7 Wünsch) states, apropos Matter, that “nothing imperfect stems from the paternal (i.e., demiurgic) triad”. Thus the possibility of a monistic interpretation remains open: this evidence is studied by Taormina (2016). Accordingly, several testimonies (e.g., Simplicius, In Categorias 418.3–8) also state that Iamblichus attributed no real existence to Evil, only a parhupostasis.

3.5 Overarching concepts and general traits

Iamblichus’ work exerted a very profound influence on the subsequent course of Neoplatonic philosophy. In particular, he stands out as an important theologian owing to the shift he brought about with respect to Plotinianism. With Iamblichus, Plotinus’ economical approach to metaphysical principles was developed into full-fledged metaphysical laws: in this respect, Iamblichus emerges as a remote forerunner of Medieval scholasticism. He himself vindicated a “scientific theology” (Reply to Porphyry I, 4 [SS-2013: 10.18]) and established a canon of texts that gave it the justification of tradition.

Perhaps the most conspicuous trait of Iamblichean metaphysics is its highly vertical conception of causality. For Iamblichus, an effect does not enjoy any ontological independence with respect to its cause: anything it adds amounts to failure and nothingness. This idea predates Iamblichus, but he was the first Pagan philosopher to apply it with absolute consistency. Most of his system follows from this one axiom, particularly his doctrine of the soul (see Section 6). The principles’ supervision always lurks in the background: see, e.g., the idea that the intelligible gods “contain” the visible gods (i.e., planets; Reply to Porphyry I, 19 [SS-2013: 45.14–20]). The idea of the vacuity of effects leads to the notion that their sole purpose is to render themselves apt to receive the influx of their causes: Iamblichus calls this epitēdeiotēs, or “receptivity”. This process of adaptation accounts for most of the diversity in the phenomenal world. Another important law states that “everything is in everything according to its property”: Damascius ascribes it to both Iamblichus and Porphyry (In Philebum § 130 = Iamblichus In Philebum [D-1973: Fr. 5]). The last words are the most important: superior beings keep their prerogatives in spite of the existence of a universal homology, which means for example that causes are present to their effects as causes, i.e., are not encompassed by them or relegated to their status. In this way, Iamblichus manages to preserve at the same time the benefits of divine immanence (the world is not abandoned by the gods) and the requirement of divine transcendence, which he feels the need to constantly affirm, lest he be accused of debasing divinity.

Iamblichus’ programme of a scientific theology (see Lecerf and Taormina forthcoming) is based on newly developed terminology, of which we have already seen several examples. It also relies on new structures such as divine orders (diakosmoi, taxeis), a notion foreign to Plotinus. Their proliferation does not bother Iamblichus in the least, since centrifugal tendencies are curbed by constantly reasserting the fundamental unity of reality. This is provided for through the return of the same processes in a more or less absolute form (for instance, what exists in a unified manner in the universal Paradigm as a whole appears again in individual paradigms, yet only partially: see In Timaeum [D-1973: Fr. 43]). Recurring metaphysical laws serve the same purpose, as do schemes such as the regrouping of divine entities in accordance with meaningful numbers, e.g., triads, a structure that adequately accounts for uni-multiplicity in reality since it treats as one single process the succession of an immobile first state (monē), a dynamic procession (proodos) and a return or “conversion” to the first element (epistrophē; see In Timaeum [D-1973: Fr. 53]). Triads are thus a prime example of what modern commentators have named the “law of mean-terms”, i.e., the need for a tertium quid to provide a mediation between two levels. Continuity is thereby introduced in the picture, although the latter remains resolutely holistic. The whole stands in relation to its parts as a cause to its effect: in this sense, it may be said that Iamblichus created and almost deified the Neoplatonic system as a unified and coherent account of reality, avoiding any recourse to dualism.

4. Pythagoreanism, Mathematics

4.1 Limit and the Unlimited

As we have seen, Iamblichus posited at the top of his system, below the One but above the Intelligible—and thus at a supra-essential level—the dual principles of Limit (peras) and the Unlimited (or Infinite: apeiron). These principles belong to the Pythagorean tradition (see, e.g., Philolaus Fr. 1 Huffman and Nicomachus, Introduction to Arithmetic II, 18, 4), although the main catalysts responsible for their integration into the Neoplatonic system were two indirect accounts, Plato’s Philebus (see above, Section 3.1) and Aristotle, Metaphysics Α, 5 (987a15–19):

(the Pythagoreans) thought that finitude and infinity were not attributes of certain other things, e.g., of fire or earth or anything else of this kind, but that infinity itself and unity itself were the substance of the things of which they are predicated (trans. Ross).

Closer to Iamblichus, one must also mention the precedent of Eudorus of Alexandria (apud Simplicius, In Phys. 118.22–28), as well as Plotinus’ acknowledgment of something apeiron within the Intellect (Ennead II, 4 [12]).

The importance of this Pythagoreanizing slant can hardly be overstated. In agreement with Iamblichus’ vertical conception of reality, it means that everything below this dyad is to be regarded as a mix of determination and indetermination: and this includes gods, as well as Forms such as those contained within the Model, some of which are claimed to partake in movement and alterity (see In Timaeum [D-1973: Fr. 46]), while less elaborate versions of Platonism would rather view them as solely determinate, viz. thinkable. In a text from Simplicius’ commentary on the Categories (135.10–16 [DL-1972: Fr. 37]), the productive capacity of the One appears to reflect these two dimensions:

Since the power of the One, from which all quantity is generated, is extended unchanged … and gives definition to each thing as it proceeds from itself, in that it pervades the whole in an entirely undivided manner, it brings the continuous into being, by making its progression single and uninterrupted …: but in that it comes to a halt in its progression at each of the forms and defines each … it brings about the discrete (trans. Fleet).

Consequently, Iamblichus came to the conclusion that all things partake in opposition, a phenomenon most conspicuous in the sublunary world, as the philosopher notes in the context of an allegorical exegesis of the prologue to Plato’s Timaeus (In Timaeum [D-1973: Fr. 10]). Thus, it appears that Iamblichus’ goal in introducing the Limit–Unlimited pair was to account for the genesis of multiplicity and alterity, Limit providing definition and intelligibility, while the Unlimited enables infinite flux and iteration within all individual items partaking of the same form: this interpretation is, at any rate, in line with the epitēdeiotēs or “receptivity” axiom (see Section 3.5 above), which states that the effect receives the causal influx according to what it is itself, and thus always imperfectly. This may be seen as Iamblichus’ equivalent of Plotinus’ intellectual vitalism (the notion that the intelligible world is intrinsically active, being Life itself): it allows for considerable metaphysical dynamism. To be sure, Limit retains axiological precedence over the Unlimited, but indetermination can no longer be conceived of as a mere by-product of matter’s resistance to form. Rather, while it is true that higher principles are more characterized by Limit and lower ones by the Unlimited, each and every thing reflects, to some extent, both of these principles.

4.2 Mathematics

Limit and the Unlimited are also principles active among mathematical entities (On General Mathematical Science, chap. 13). Here they play a role similar to that of the pairs Monad and Dyad, Odd and Even, or Same and Other according to Nicomachus of Gerasa, the neo-Pythagorean author of the Introduction to Arithmetic and one of Iamblichus’ intellectual heroes; similar pairs studied by the mathematical sciences are “continuous” and “discrete” (sunekhes, diōrismenon), “magnitude” and “plurality” (megethos, plēthos: cf. Nicomachus, Intr. arith. I, 2, 4–5), all of which concur to form a dynamic picture of reality. The four mathematical sciences—arithmetic, which takes precedence over the others; geometry, music and astronomy—each study a corresponding kind of being, and were the object of On Pythagoreanism vol. IV and VIII–X respectively (see the plan of the work as outlined by O’Meara 1989).

Iamblichus’ interest in mathematics is part of a larger trend that includes authors such as Theon of Smyrna and Calcidius, but excludes Plotinus and, to a lesser extent, Porphyry. For Iamblichus, mathematics is both a scientific discipline and concerns a realm of being, intermediate between the intelligible and the sensible: the latter view is influenced by Aristotelian ontology as well as by the Platonic analogy of the Line (Republic, 509d–511e), but with the Pythagorean proviso that mathematical entities “exist in themselves” and that each number possesses a distinct essence.

The study of mathematics allows the soul to disengage itself from the material world, thus providing a starting point towards higher being. More interestingly, mathematics is assigned symbolic significance in a variety of fields: vol. V–VII of On Pythagoreanism (now lost) dealt with the mathematical teachings that can be drawn concerning ethics, physics and theology respectively (the anonymous Theologoumena arithmeticae might provide some insight into Iamblichus’ view of the relation between arithmetic and theology, as they include extensive quotes from Nicomachus as well as Iamblichus’ first teacher Anatolius). Mathematics is therefore versatile and multivalent in its essence (see, e.g., On General Mathematical Science, chap. 15; 18), and thus closely associated with the soul (ibid., chap. 9). It is also very likely that Syrianus’ distinction of various types of “number”—in descending order: eidetic, mathematical, physical, cf., e.g., In Metaphysica 122.11–16—stems from Iamblichean teachings.

Iamblichus’ writings on mathematics were influential, and are used, e.g., in Syrianus’ commentary on the Metaphysics and Proclus’ commentary on Euclid. His views on the quadrivium, drawing upon Nicomachus, were also adopted by Martianus Capella and Boethius, and through them became an integral part of education in the Middle Ages.

4.3 Iamblichus and Pythagoreanism

While Iamblichus took great pains to study mathematics in detail, its true meaning, according to him, is not of a “technical” nature: rather, it is meant to constitute a form of philosophical ascesis:

If we intend to practice mathematics in a Pythagorean manner, it is necessary to pursue with zeal its divinely inspired, elevating, purifying and perfective way. (On General Mathematical Science, chap. 22)

Indeed, as part of his sumphōnia programme, Iamblichus strove to fully integrate Pythagorean teaching into the Hellenic dogmatic tradition, making Pythagoras the recipient of a divine revelation handed down by Orpheus through a mysterious figure, “Aglaophamus” (De Vita Pythagorica 146). Book II of On Pythagoreanism, the Protrepticus, while using a variety of sources, also taps into the Pythagorean repertoire with wisdom texts such as the Golden Verses. Building on the then widely accepted axiom that the truth had already been revealed in remote times and then merely reformulated—if not twisted—by recent writers, he accepted as authoritative the pseudo-Pythagorean corpus for which he (along with Stobaeus, who knew the Iamblichean œuvre quite well) is one of our main sources: on Iamblichus’ library of Pythagorean texts, see Macris 2002. Iamblichus made the most conspicuous use of these texts in his lost Commentary on the Categories, where ps.-Archytas’ On the All was repeatedly quoted as the source of the Aristotelian treatise (see below, Section 5.1).

In order to assess Iamblichus’ reliability as a witness of ancient Pythagoreanism, one has to take into account a variety of factors, including his attitude towards the information available to him (ranging from literal dependence to creative elaboration for his own ideological and systematic purposes). This is crucial, since the Pythagorean Life in particular is one of our major sources on this subject (for details, see the studies collected in Huffman 2014; von Albrecht et al. 2002).

5. Logic and the Categories

5.1 Iamblichus’ commentary work on Aristotle

Iamblichus wrote an extensive commentary on the Categories, fragments of which have been preserved by Simplicius and Dexippus (a student of Iamblichus): in addition to literal quotes, Iamblichus is behind much of Simplicius’ extant exegesis of this treatise. We also have evidence that Iamblichus wrote a commentary on Aristotle’s Prior Analytics and we know about his exegetical work on the De interpretatione and the De caelo (see Opsomer 2015). From the first century BC onwards, Platonist philosophers had been familiar with Aristotle’s Categories: Platonists such as Eudorus of Alexandria and Nicostratus raised objections against Aristotle’s doctrine; Plotinus wrote a very important treatise On the Genera of Being, where he critically discussed Aristotle’s categories (Ennead VI, 1–3). To the best of our knowledge, however, no Platonist wrote a commentary on Aristotle’s Categories before Porphyry, who was the author of two commentaries on this treatise: a short and extant elucidation in a question-and-answer format and a very extensive commentary in seven books dedicated to someone called Gedalius, which is now lost. In addition, Porphyry wrote an introduction to logic, the Isagoge, which is closely connected to the Categories. With Porphyry, then, Aristotle’s Categories became an integral part of the Platonist curriculum and this was a crucial move for the subsequent history of Late Antique and medieval philosophy. As is often the case, Iamblichus’ exegetical work relies on Porphyry but introduces some changes which are probably aimed to supplement (and possibly supplant) Porphyry’s approach. Simplicius informs us that Iamblichus followed the great and now lost commentary written by Porphyry, while adding two distinctive features. First Iamblichus “applied his Intellective Theory (noera theōria) everywhere, to almost all of the chapter-headings” (Simplicius, In Categorias, 2.13–15 [DL-1972: Fr. 2], trans. Chase; see Dillon 1997). Iamblichus employs the same expression, noera theōria in the opening section of the Reply to Porphyry (I, 2 [SS-2013: 4.16]), in a passage where he characterizes the mode of inquiry that is typical of theology. Secondly, Iamblichus took Archytas’ treatise On the All to be Aristotle’s source and he developed a thoroughly Pythagorising interpretation of the Categories (Simplicius, In Categorias, 2.15–25 [DL-1972: Fr. 2]; see Hoffmann 1980). Archytas’ treatise is actually a forgery which scholars now date to the first century BC. Iamblichus, however, took it to be a genuine work by Archytas and in doing so he claimed a Pythagorean origin for Aristotle’s theory. To sum up, Iamblichus’ exegesis of the Categories was an integral part of his Pythagorean philosophical programme and in interpreting the Categories Iamblichus made use of his metaphysical and theological views. Apparently, Iamblichus pushed his reading of Aristotle along Platonic/Pythagorean lines so far that (as later sources report) he did not refrain from assuming that Aristotle was not opposed to Plato on the theory of Ideas (see Elias/David, In Categorias, 123.2–3).

5.2 The Pythagorean reading of the Categories

Iamblichus’ interpretation characteristically included a definition of the “target” (skopos) of Aristotle’s treatise, which Iamblichus regarded as focusing on signifying expressions insofar as they signify things via concepts (see Hoffmann 1987). This view was not new and Simplicius traces it back to the previous tradition starting from the early Peripatetic commentators (Simplicius, In Categorias, 13.15–18). Iamblichus, however, added two distinctive features. First, he gave a more systematic account of the target of Aristotle’s treatise (for example, Porphyry too claimed that Aristotle’s Categories focus on simple signifying expressions insofar as they signify things, but to the best of our knowledge he did not refer to concepts). In addition to this, Iamblichus’ discussion of semantics incorporated a Neoplatonist account of language and signification grounded in Neoplatonic metaphysics and psychology (Simplicius, In Categorias, 12.16–13.12: see Griffin 2012). Iamblichus referred to analogy (analogia) as a resource that explains how Aristotle’s account of categories can be applied to intelligible beings too. For example, Simplicius reports that according to Iamblichus the property of being receptive of contraries while being one and the same in number (see Arist., Cat., 5, 4a10–11) applies to all levels of substance (both sensible and intelligible) via analogy (kata analogian, Simpl., In Categorias, 116.25–26 [DL-1972: Fr. 33]): in intelligible substance contraries belong to substance simultaneously whereas in sensible substance they exist successively. Accordingly, different levels of being reveal corresponding structures (where lower degrees in the hierarchy entail increasing multiplicity and dispersion). This metaphysical framework accounts for Iamblichus’ views about genera and predication. Iamblichus is critical of the previous Peripatetic tradition: he criticizes Alexander of Aphrodisias for mistakenly regarding corporeal and incorporeal beings as species ranked under the same genus (that of substance, ousia) (Simplicius, In Categorias, 83.20–23 [DL-1972: Fr. 24]). Iamblichus’ point is that the Peripatetic reading of the Categories does not account for the hierarchical structure of reality. On Iamblichus’ view, full weight should instead be given to the hierarchical notion of the genus as a unity of derivation from a principle (actually the genus is both the principle itself and the hierarchy of items depending on it). This structure does not entail that levels ranked in the same genus share any common item. Rather, different and hierarchically ordered levels are connected via analogy, so that lower items mirror higher ones while not sharing any common item with them. Analogy, then, allows Iamblichus to combine two complementary aspects of his metaphysics: on the one hand the vertical hierarchy that separates different levels of beings, on the other hand the continuity that connects these different levels together within a unified whole. Iamblichus’ approach emerges in his account of essential or synonymous predication (the predication of items within the same category). Porphyry argued that in this kind of predication subject and predicate denote two different items, the akatakakton (uncoordinated or unallocated) and the katatetagmenon (coordinated or allocated) (Simplicius, In Categorias, 53.6–9; 79.24–30). The meaning of these expressions is debated. The “allocated genus” is to be identified with the in re universal shared by particulars; the unallocated may be either the separated and Platonic ante rem universal or the abstracted and post rem universal concept. Whatever we make of Porphyry’s view, Iamblichus started from Porphyry’s exegesis and gave a different slant to it (see Chiaradonna 2023: 138–162). In doing so Iamblichus suggested that Aristotle’s essential predication is a way of expressing the participation of corporeal beings in their transcendent genera (Simplicius, In Categorias, 53.9–18 [DL-1972: Fr. 16]). More precisely, “Socrates is man” would be a way of expressing the fact that the corporeal Socrates participates in the transcendent Form of Man. Separate genera provide the basis for essential predication, though they are not properly predicated in themselves (what is predicated is rather the participated item). Interestingly, Iamblichus refers to the technical notion of ptōsis (“case”), which is associated with Aristotle’s account of paronymy in the Categories: a ptōsis is an inflected form of a term (such as “grammatical” or “courageous”) which is paronymous with the noun form and derives from it (“grammatical” and “courageous” are both adjectival forms which derive from “grammar” and “courage” respectively). So Iamblichus held that in the predicative statement “Socrates is man”, “man” improperly occurs in the predication instead of its ptōsis: Iamblichus is probably referring here to an adjectival construction like “human”. Such a paronymous form would correctly refer to the participation of Socrates in his transcendent Form. Simplicius informs us too that Iamblichus focused on Aristotle’s account of motion and activity: Plotinus had criticized Aristotle for not regarding motion as a single category and had argued that motion in sensible beings is a form of complete activity (Simplicius, In Categorias, 303.35–306.12 [DL-1972: Fr. 86]). Iamblichus rejects Plotinus’ account and aims to integrate Aristotle’s account of sensible motion as “incomplete actuality” into a Platonist philosophical framework (see Taormina 1999: chap. III).

5.3 Categories and theology

Iamblichus’ exegesis of the Categories (in particular his account of genera of hierarchical structures and his use of analogy) sheds light on other areas of his philosophy and forms the background of Iamblichus’ criticism of Porphyry’s account of divine hierarchy in the Reply to Porphyry (see Chiaradonna 2023: 138–162). There Iamblichus rejects Porphyry’s account of divine hierarchy as misleading, since Porphyry regarded classes of divine beings as species ranked under the same genus and determined by “properties” (idiōmata) that act as specific differentiae (Reply to Porphyry, I, 4 [SS-2013: 7.21–8.6]). In so doing, Porphyry ruins the very idea of hierarchy: divine comes to be a common genus which is predicated of all of its species, in the same way as animal is predicated of (say) horse and dog. Against Porphyry, Iamblichus calls for a qualified use of logical notions which makes the hierarchical relation between different classes of divine beings clear. Each level differs from the others as a whole and not in the same way as different species are divided under the same common genus. As said above, in his interpretation of the Categories Iamblichus argued that the genus is a hierarchical relation in which items from different levels are analogically connected to their origin. This can be set in parallel with what Iamblichus says in the Reply to Porphyry:

But if one were to apply an analogical principle of identity to different genera, for example to the many genera of gods, and again to those among the demons and heroes, and lastly in the case of souls, then one might succeed in defining their specific characteristics. (Reply to Porphyry, I, 4 [SS-2013: 10.25–11.4], trans. CDH-2003)

6. The Soul, Theurgy and Religion

6.1 The soul’s place in the system

According to Iamblichus, “soul” is but the last and weakest link in the chain of “higher genera” (kreittona genē). In the Reply to Porphyry, those entities are enumerated in full: gods—archangels—angels—demons—heroes—archons ruling the world—enmattered archons—souls. This is a token of Iamblichus’ receptiveness towards the religious speculation of his day, although most of this theological bestiary was in fact already present in Porphyry’s Letter to Anebo. Iamblichus’ acceptance of “evil demons” (cf. O’Neill 2018) is particularly interesting, since it seems to undermine Iamblichus’ monism and providentialism, and is best explained as reflecting the influence of the Chaldean Oracles.

In contradistinction with the gods, the soul receives a plethora of negative traits: it is imperfect, intermittent, it leans towards matter; and while the causes of Order and Beauty exist in full communion with the gods, the soul can never be given more than a mere share of it (Reply to Porphyry I, 6–7 [SS-2013: 15.14–17.7]). The immutability of this celestial hierarchy is striking, and foreshadows the later works of Hierocles, Proclus, and pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite. Although the soul’s versatility—its ability to “make use of varied forms and life-principles”—allows it to attach itself to superior beings and lay claim “to receiving perfection as an angelic, immaculate soul” (Reply to Porphyry II, 2 [SS-2013: 51.10–52.11]), on closer reading it appears to be unable to escape its condition by virtue of its own essence: its ascent is never complete (it is an endeavor, ephesis or henōsis, with a suffix expressing verbal action) and it presupposes, moreover, the gods’ “goodwill and illumination”. Porphyry had previously drawn a similar distinction between demons that are so “by essence” (kat’ ousian) or by mere “relation” (kata skhesin), the latter being those humans who, by virtue of their excellent life, are allotted demonic status. On the other hand, the human soul is also unable to be relegated to the rank of animals via metempsychosis (cf. the title of one of Iamblichus’ psychological works preserved by Nemesius of Emesa, On the Nature of Man, chap. 2, p. 35.7–11 Morani). Some points, however, remain unclear, such as how exactly Iamblichus’ generic distinction between human souls and “divine” ones would fit within such a structure; or what we are to make of the souls of exceptional, even semi-divine characters such as Pythagoras or the theurgists. Similar preoccupations underlie Frs. 82 and 83 In Timaeum [D-1973], interpreting Timaeus 41d.

Lastly and perhaps most importantly, the soul is irremediably inferior to the intellect. Rejecting any internalist interpretation of intellectual processes, Iamblichus regards them as the result of the soul’s illumination by a transcendent entity. Our information on this matter is to be gathered mostly from the late Aristotelian commentators, pseudo-Simplicius (see In De anima 313.1–10, with a reference to the “unparticipated” intellect which, if genuinely Iamblichean, would predate Proclean terminology) and Priscian of Lydia (Metaphrasis in Theophrastum): these relatively neglected texts are the object of the pioneering work Steel 1978. Indeed, such a position implies some knowledge of the philosophical debates on this issue within the Aristotelian tradition (Theophrastus, Alexander). Its significance is enormous, insofar as it directly leads to the rejection of Plotinus’ doctrine of the undescended soul: that is, the idea that something of the soul always remains in the intelligible world. Thus, rejecting the notion that the soul shares homeomereia with the remaining intellectual entities, Iamblichus writes:

the doctrine opposed to this separates soul, insofar as it is born second with regard to the intellect as a distinct hypostasis, and interprets what, in it, partakes of intellect as something dependent from intellect, although it is susceptible of individual existence; and it separates it from all the higher genera. (De anima, sect. 7 [DF-2002])

Iamblichus also fiercely attacks Plotinus (as well as Theodorus of Asine) for the assumption that “there is something in us that is impassible and always thinking” (In Timaeum [D-1973: Fr. 87]; on this text see Rist 1975 and Dillon 2005). However, here again the attitude of the superior souls with regard to their descent is somewhat obscure: according to Damascius (In Parm. IV, 24.1–7 Combès & Westerink), Iamblichus taught that the first class of souls “descends while not descending”, and that the descent “only effects a presence alongside what is here”. This problem was tackled by van den Berg (1997; opting for the existence of unaffected pure souls and thus positing Iamblichus as an intermediary between Plotinus and Proclus) and Taormina (2012; emphasizing that every soul remains separated from the intelligible and only relates to it through participation). It is, in any case, clear that Iamblichus conceived of the soul’s presence in this world as something natural and normal, not as a transitory exile, even less as “always an evil” (the theory of Cronius, Numenius and Harpocration, criticized in De anima sect. 29 [DF-2002]).

6.2 Soul and embodiment

It is fair to say that Iamblichus—in this respect closer to Porphyry—focuses more closely than Plotinus on the soul’s indwelling within the body and on the actions it performs alongside it. In what remains of his treatise On the Soul, he reviews all sorts of historical theses about the composition, powers and activities of the soul, and does not hesitate to engage his Neoplatonic predecessors.

In the available testimonies (Priscian in particular: see the assessment in Huby 1993), the soul is constantly associated with the notion of “life”. The latter is approached here not so much as an essential psychic property (as had been the case in the Phaedo), as in terms of the corporeal “life-principles” (zōai, most often in the plural) that the soul is said to project outside of itself in order to get a hold on the external world:

insofar as it puts forth other levels of life that incline towards generation and consort with the body, thus far (soul) is involved in the order of the cosmos (Letter to Macedonius, apud Stobaeus, Anthology II, 8, 45 [DP-2009: 25]).

In this manner, psychic activities that involve a relationship with external objects (such as sense-perception) presuppose a dialectic relationship between the soul’s essence and the multiplicity of powers it deploys: the individual and immaterial entity “soul” goes out of itself to grasp enmattered items, before going back (literally “converting”, epistrephein) in order to compare the data thus aggregated to (stable) Forms, which lend it intelligibility. As a result,

the particular soul, as being in the middle of all the kinds of things of this world, and being divided together with them and being multiplied along with them, not only remains but also changes, living through so many partial lives. And not only with regard to its dispositions, but also with regard to its substance it changes somewhat. (Priscian, Metaphrasis 32.15–19 [trans. Huby 1993: 8])

Imagination, being torn between sensibility and abstract intellection, whose difference it helps bridge, functions in a similar way and contributes to making the soul the median entity par excellence.

Sensibility, then, would seem to be proof of the soul’s radical inability to remain in itself, as opposed to the intellect, which is immobile and in actuality by its own nature (another sign of the fact that the unity of the soul is no longer considered self-evident is the introduction of the so-called “vehicle” of the soul, a spiritual garment that acts as an interface between the soul and bodies: on this subject, cf. Finamore 1985). What stands out as most remarkable is the notion that the soul’s essence is also challenged in the course of sensitive acts. Iamblichus here inherits the Aristotelian terminology of Essence/Substance (ousia)—Power (dynamis)—Activity (energeia) (see LCH-2022): a single essence—say, the human soul—acts as a substratum for a plurality of powers (sensitive, intellective, imaginative, etc.), and those powers are in turn actualized in a greater plurality of activities (sense-perception, aisthēsis, of x, y, or z; intellection, noēsis, about x, y, or z). These three terms are hierarchised, insofar as the soul can remain inactive: but in Aristotle, this hierarchy remains largely implicit, contrary to Iamblichus and his unequivocal conception of vertical causality (see above, Section 3.5). In applying his own principles, Iamblichus argues that, since the effect is nothing outside of its cause, any flaw connatural to the effect would also have to be preassumed in the cause. Since, then, the soul’s activities show instability and imperfection, this inability to act consistently and permanently points to a break in its very essence (cf. De anima sect. C [DF-2002] = pseudo-Simplicius, In De anima 89.33–35).

This is Iamblichus’ notion of the “changing self”, as first expounded by Steel 1978. Such a conception of the human soul represents a major break in the Platonic tradition, which until then had been prone to emphasize the soul’s inner dignity and divinity: on the other hand, it is a very convenient way to account for human fallibility. One could interpret it as a literal exegesis of Timaeus 35A: the Demiurge creates the soul’s essence as a mix of indivisible and divisible Being, so that—one might think—it is no more indivisible than it is divisible. By the same reasoning, Iamblichus concludes that the soul is at the same time changing and unchanging, dying and undying. This, at least, is what characterizes “particular” souls (merikai or en merei: a terminology propagated by Iamblichus—see Reply to Porphyry V, 2 [SS-2013: 149.26]—before it became usual in later authors). The case of divine souls is less clear-cut, since they are able to mend the gap between essence and activity (De anima sect. 20–21; see also 18). It is unclear whether—and how—this picture can be reconciled with Iamblichus’ allusions to “two souls”, one originating in the intelligible, the other given to us by celestial influences (Reply to Porphyry VIII, 6 [SS-2013: 199.1–12]).

6.3 Soul’s ascent and salvation; religion

Belittled as it is in the grand scheme of things, and unable to achieve any perpetual union with the intelligible world, the human soul is deemed connatural to “nothingness” (Reply to Porphyry III, 18 [SS-2013: 108.16–17]). It now needs external help from the gods—that is, grace—in order to perform any relevant action. Broken in its essence, it is, however, able to regain some ground through its activity. Co-action with the gods, “godlike action” (theourgia, i.e., theurgy), is the purpose of the Iamblichean soul, which it attains through religious acts such as prayer, offerings, sacrifice, etc., that is the very liturgy that Porphyry had attacked in the Letter to Anebo. Hence the necessary connection between two fields, psychology and the philosophy of religion, which was clearly set out by Shaw (1995). Ritual is given precedence over philosophical ascesis or discursive thinking, although Iamblichus would say that he is merely giving philosophy its due place rather than abolishing it: it is also true that he underlines the need for the religious practitioner to be virtuous, individual sanctity being a requisite to make the medium apt to receive the gods’ influx. But Iamblichus heavily stresses that the key to the whole process always lies in the gods: very interestingly, “human”, “artificial” or “natural” contributions are equally side-lined and relegated to the status of mere auxiliary causes (see, e.g., Reply to Porphyry III, 9 [SS-2013: 89.7–9]). He is also adamant about the human inability to extort any effect from the higher beings (i.e., via “magic”), since they are by nature impassible.

It remains beyond doubt that his stance on the matter is anti-intellectualist in nature and thus in stark contrast with the teachings of Plotinus and Porphyry. One does not start with self-knowledge, as Porphyry had set out to demonstrate in a treatise On the phrase: “Know thyself”, which he had dedicated to Iamblichus, no doubt cognizant of all the implications of this (Fr. 273 Smith = Stobaeus, Anthology III, 21, 26). Instead, knowledge of the gods encompasses self-knowledge (Reply to Porphyry X, 1 [SS-2013: 212.2–3]) and should be taken as the correct starting-point. What remains intellectualistic in Iamblichus’ approach is the conviction that not acting in the light of theological knowledge leads to the failure of the ritual process (ibid. II, 10 [SS-2013: 68.25–69.20]). Accordingly, the best theurgist is also the best theologian: and since Iamblichus’ theology is highly philosophical in nature, insofar as it strives to identify the Pagan gods with metaphysical forces or concepts and submits them to the authority of the Platonic One, it seems necessary that, in Iamblichus’ system, precedence be given to Neoplatonist religious specialists deriving their information from the appropriate literature. In this respect, theurgy represents a rationalization of the irrational, rather than the converse. It is also important to note that the conflict between the Plotino-Porphyrian approach and Iamblichus’ one does not simply amount to a conflict between philosophy and religion; rather, it opposes two different modes of access to the divine, with Iamblichus’ predecessors laying emphasis on silent ascesis and the shedding of our external identity, and accordingly viewing corporeality and materiality as something inherently negative.

According to Iamblichus, the gods help mankind overcome its inherent weakness by revealing symbols to them that will establish some sort of connection: one of the criticisms he lays on Porphyry is that his views will “leave earth deprived of the presence of the superior beings” (Reply to Porphyry I, 8 [SS-2013: 21.12–13]; on related issues concerning Porphyry’s and Iamblichus’ contrasting views on dreams and divination, see Timotin [2022] 109–126). These symbols may differ in nature: items, rituals, myths, theological revelations such as the Chaldean Oracles, etc.; and most of them are placed under the patronage of a particular deity, thus creating a “chain” (seira) of, say, sun-like entities. In this manner, Iamblichean ontology necessarily leads to cultural traditionalism; it also opens up the possibility of a grandiose sumphōnia of all Pagan schools or currents, be they Hellenic or “barbarian”, the latter actually being assigned even more prestige insofar as the Egyptians, Assyrians, Phoenicians etc. enjoy greater antiquity and—supposedly—avoided innovation, contrary to the Greeks (Reply to Porphyry VII, 5 [SS-2013: 192.22–24]). A whole new field thus opened up for Platonists in which they could exercise their exegetical virtuosity in search of remarkable analogies. It is no wonder, then, that Iamblichus’ views were heartily embraced by later proponents of a “Pagan revival”, of whom the most prominent was Julian the Apostate: a Roman emperor as well as the pupil of Maximus of Ephesus, who was a philosopher in the tradition of Iamblichus in addition to being the most infamous theurgist of his time.

7. Ethics and Politics

7.1 Neoplatonism and politics

Neoplatonism has often been regarded as a theological and other-worldly philosophy which assigns little (if any) significance to politics and conceives of ethics merely as an ascetic path for the separation of the soul from the body. This view has been questioned by D.J. O’Meara and the significance of Neoplatonist political philosophy is gaining increasing attention (see O’Meara 2003; Schramm 2013). Iamblichus wrote a whole treatise On virtues, which is lost but whose content can be inferred from later sources. In addition to this, references to ethics and politics can be gathered from his extant works, especially the letters preserved by Johannes Stobaeus (see DP-2009; TP-2010). It is a notable fact that some of Iamblichus’ interlocutors were influential figures in the fourth-century Roman empire, as is for example the case with Sopater of Apamea (see above, Section 1.1). It is somewhat difficult to clearly grasp Iamblichus’ position on these issues, since his treatise on virtues is lost, the later testimonia are cursory and Iamblichus’ letters are for the most part introductory and refrain from philosophical technicalities.

The extant evidence nonetheless suffices to outline some of Iamblichus’ views. Two letters focus on providence, fate and free will against the background of Iamblichus’ account of causation, which sees the One as the principle of all being and the lower levels of reality as characterized by increasing degrees of multiplicity (see the letters to Macedonius and Sopater: Johannes Stobaeus I, 5, 17 and I, 5, 18). Iamblichus identifies the sphere of operation of fate with nature, i.e., “the immanent causal principle of the cosmos and that which immanently comprises the totality of causes of the realm of generation” (DP-2009: 35). These views are reminiscent of the Stoic deterministic model of causation, but Iamblichus also emphasises that the soul contains within itself a free and independent life and is able to emancipate itself from worldly influences (see Johannes Stobaeus I, 8, 45a).

This theological and metaphysical framework also grounds Iamblichus’ views about politics. In his letters he describes the art of rulership as a kind of divinisation based on wisdom: through wisdom human beings are assimilated to gods and political rulership is an image of divine rulership in cosmos (see Johannes Stobaeus III, 3, 26). Leadership is connected with philanthropy, which makes the ruler mild, pleasant and approachable. Such views outline a characteristically theocratic conception. Elsewhere, however, Iamblichus suggests a more modest view about rulership: he emphasises the importance of law, which he sees as the genuine expression of a divine model, the ruler being only its guardian (see Johannes Stobaeus IV, 5, 77). Such views can certainly be traced back to Plato: the passages about kingship can be set in parallel with Plato’s account of philosopher-kings in the Republic, whereas those about the primacy of laws obviously recall Plato’s political views in the Laws. But parallels are abundant even outside the Platonist tradition (e.g., in Stoicism and in Dio Chrysostomus, in the Pseudo-Pythagorean writings) and the introductory tone of Iamblichus’ letters makes it difficult to isolate characteristic Neoplatonist elements. According to some interpreters, however, Iamblichus’ interest in politics is likely to be connected to his views about the embodied soul. As O’Meara remarks,

Human soul, alienated from its divine origins, finds its identity in its relation to body. As a consequence, the material, bodily aspects of the human condition were to be of much greater relevance for the divinization of soul in later Neoplatonism than in Plotinus. (2003: 39)

In fact, Neoplatonist philosophical ideas shaped not only Iamblichus’ views about politics, but also those of the Emperor Julian, whose Neoplatonist background (ultimately deriving from the Iamblichean teaching of his masters at Pergamon) informs both his account of law and rulership (see Julian’s Letter to Themistius) and his theological foundation of the Roman Empire (Elm 2012).

7.2 The hierarchy of virtues

In Ennead I, 2, Plotinus holds that virtues bearing the same names (that is the four cardinal virtues of Plato’s Republic: wisdom, temperance, courage and justice) exist in different grades at different levels: the lower level is that of the so-called civic or political virtues, whereas the higher degrees include the soul’s purification and the result of it, that is the contemplation of Intellect on the part of the soul. In Sentence 32, Porphyry draws on Plotinus and offers a classification of virtues: these are divided into civic, purificatory, contemplative and paradigmatic virtues. Iamblichus’ lost treatise On virtues was certainly based on these previous discussions and offered a systematic discussion that laid the ground for later Neoplatonist accounts of the so-called scala virtutum. The late anonymous Prolegomena to Plato’s philosophy ascribes the distinction of five levels of virtues to Iamblichus: natural, moral, political, purificatory, and contemplative (see Prolegomena § 26.30–36). This distinction is connected to the order or reading of Plato’s dialogues: thus the Gorgias focuses on the political virtues, the Phaedo on the purificatory. All this is most likely to derive from Iamblichus, who then associated his canon of twelve Platonic dialogues with the different levels of the scala virtutum (see above, Section 2.2). While crucial, the testimony of the Prolegomena is nonetheless partial: we know from Damascius and Marinus of Neapolis that Iamblichus’ distinction had two further levels at the top: those of “paradigmatic” and “theurgic” or “hieratic” virtues. Iamblichus, therefore, probably distinguished seven levels of virtues: natural, moral, political, purificatory, contemplative, paradigmatic, theurgic or hieratic. The views about the soul and theurgy outlined above help explain why Iamblichus, unlike Plotinus and Porphyry, posited theurgic or hieratic virtues at the top of his classification: such virtues are the highest degree of the soul’s ascension to the divine, which human beings cannot achieve merely through their intellect.

It is worth noting that the author of the Prolegomena sets out the hierarchy of virtues as an order “according to depth” (kata bathos). The term bathos has a technical meaning in Iamblichus: it is borrowed from mathematics and is opposed to platos insofar as it describes the vertical order of items in a hierarchy, as opposed to the horizontal one (see Taormina in TP-2010: 245). This suggests that Iamblichus arranged his classification of virtues according to the vertical pattern described above, which points to his distinctive account of the hierarchy of beings.


A. Primary Sources

A.1 Extant Works by Iamblichus

  • On Pythagoreanism, including:
    1. On the Pythagorean Life (De Vita Pythagorica)
    2. Protrepticus
    3. On General Mathematical Science
    4. Introduction to Arithmetic, based on Nicomachus of Gerasa’s work of the same name
  • [Reply to Porphyry] Reply of Master Abamon to Porphyry’s Letter to Anebo, and Solutions to the Difficulties Contained Therein. Also known as De mysteriis Ægyptiorum (On the Egyptian Mysteries).
  • The anonymous compilation on number symbolism known as Theologoumena arithmeticae, sometimes attributed to Iamblichus, is not by him (see O’Meara 1989: 15 n. 24).

A.2 Fragmentary Works by Iamblichus

  • On Pythagoreanism, including:
    1. Arithmetic in Physical matters
    2. Arithmetic in Ethical matters
    3. Arithmetic in Theological matters, all excerpts edited by O’Meara 1989: 217–229 from Michael Psellus
  • On the Soul
  • Various Letters including to Macedonius, Sopater, Dexippus
  • Commentaries on Aristotle:
    • Categories, transmitted by Simplicius
    • Prior Analytics
    • On the Heavens (dubious)
  • Commentaries on Plato:
    • Timaeus, transmitted by Proclus
    • Alcibiades
    • Phaedo
    • Phaedrus
    • Philebus
    • Parmenides

A.3 Works by Iamblichus Whose Title Only is Known

  • On Pythagoreanism VIII-X: Introduction to Geometry; Introduction to Music; Introduction to Astronomy
  • Platonic Theology (dubious)
  • On the Gods
  • On Symbols
  • Chaldean Theology
  • On the Migration of the Soul from the Body
  • On the Soul’s Descent
  • On Statues
  • On Virtues
  • Life of Alypius
  • That reincarnations do not occur from men to irrational animals, nor from irrational animals to men
  • On choosing the best discourse
  • Refutations of Numenius and Amelius
  • Hymns

A.4 Editions and Translations

  • [CDH-2003] Clarke, E.C., J.M. Dillon, and J.P Hershbell, 2003, Iamblichus: De Mysteriis (Writings from the Greco-Roman World 4), Atlanta: Society of Biblical Literature. (Greek text, English translation and notes.)
  • [DL-1972] Dalsgaard Larsen, Bent, 1972, Jamblique de Chalcis, exégète et philosophe, Universitetsforlaget i Aarhus. (the second volume contains all Greek exegetical fragments known to the author: a new edition is a desideratum. Citation is to fragment number.)
  • De Falco, Vittorio (ed.), 1922, Iamblichi theologoumena arithmeticae, Leipzig: Teubner.
  • Deubner, Ludwig and Ulrich Klein (eds.), 1975, Iamblichi de vita Pythagorica liber, Stuttgart: Teubner.
  • [D-1973] Dillon, John M. (ed.), 1973, Iamblichi Chalcidensis in Platonis dialogos commentariorum fragmenta (Philosophia Antiqua 23), Leiden: E. J. Brill. (edition, translation and commentary of all exegetical fragments on Plato. Citation is to fragment number.)
  • [DF-2002] Dillon, John M. and J.F. Finamore (eds.), 2002, Iamblichus De Anima (Philosophia Antiqua 92), Leiden, Boston and Köln: Brill. (Greek text with English translation, introduction and commentary.)
  • [DP-2009] Dillon, John M. and W. Polleichtner (eds.), 2009, Iamblichus of Chalcis: The Letters (Writings from the Greco-Roman World 19), Atlanta: Society of Biblical Literature. (Greek text, English translation and short commentary.)
  • [DGU-2020] Dillon, John, S. Gerz and J.O. Urmson (eds.), 2020, Iamblichus: On the General Science of Mathematics (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Bloomsbury Academic. (English translation with introductory essay and notes.)
  • Festa, Nicola (ed.), 1891, Iamblichi De communi mathematica scientia liber, Leipzig: Teubner.
  • Martone, L.I. (ed.), 2014, Giamblico De Anima: I frammenti, la dottrina (Greco, Arabo, Latino. Studi 3), Pisa: Pisa University Press.
  • Pistelli, Ermenegildo (ed.), 1888, Iamblichi Protrepticus, Leipzig: Teubner.
  • ––– (ed.), 1894, Iamblichi In Nicomachi arithmeticam introductionem liber, Lepzig: Teubner.
  • Romano, Francesco (ed.), 2006, Giamblico, Summa pitagorica (Il pensiero occidentale), Milan: Bompiani. (Greek text with Italian translation and notes: for a critical text, the reader is advised to refer to the existing Teubner editions.)
  • [R-2012] ––– (ed.), 2012, Discorso e realtà dell’universo: Giamblico esegeta di Aristotele (Symbolon 39), Catania: CUECM. (collection of all fragments relating to the exegesis of Aristotle, with Italian translation and commentary.)
  • [SS-2013] Saffrey, Henri Dominique and Alain-Philippe Segonds (eds.), 2013, Jamblique, Réponse à Porphyre (De Mysteriis) (Collection des Universités de France. Série grecque 496), Paris: Les Belles Lettres. (Greek text, French translation, introduction and notes; all references in this article are to pages and lines in this edition.)
  • [TP-2010] Taormina, Daniela Patrizia and Rosa Maria Piccione (eds.), 2010, Giamblico, I frammenti dalle epistole (Elenchos 56), Naples: Bibliopolis. (Greek text, Italian translation and copious commentary.)
  • Vinel, Nicolas (ed.), 2014, Jamblique, In Nicomachi arithmeticam (Mathematica graeca antiqua 3), Pisa and Rome: F. Serra.

A.5 Other Primary Sources

  • Wallies, Maximilian (ed.), 1899, Ammonii in Aristotelis Analyticorum Priorum Librum I Commentarium (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca IV.6), Berlin: Reimer.
Anonymous (Chaldean Oracles)
  • Majercik, Ruth (ed.), 1989, The Chaldean Oracles. Text, Translation and Commentary (Studies in Greek and Roman Religion 5), Leiden: Brill.
Anonymous (Prolegomena to Platonic Philosophy)
  • Westerink, Leendert, Jean Trouillard, and Alain-Philippe Segonds (eds.), 1990, Prolégomènes à la philosophie de Platon (Collection des Universités de France. Série grecque 335), Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
Anonymous (Letters to Iamblichus from an anonymous Syrian sophist)
  • Wright, Wilmer C. (ed.), 1923, The Works of the Emperor Julian, vol. 3 (Loeb Classical Library 157), Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, pp. 236–283.
  • Ross, William D. (ed.), 1924, Aristotle’s Metaphysics. A revised text with introduction and commentary, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Migne, Jacques Paul (ed.), 1860, Manlii Severini Boethii opera omnia (Patrologia Latina 64), Paris: Garnier.
  • Athanassiadi, Polymnia (ed.), 1999, Damascius. The Philosophical History, Athens: Apamea Cultural Association.
  • Combès, Joseph and Leendert G. Westerink (eds.), 1986–1991, Damascius: Traité des premiers principes, 4 vols. (Collection des Universités de France. Série grecque 309, 323, 341), Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
  • ––– (eds.), 1997–2003, Damascius: Commentaire du Parménide de Platon, 4 vols. (Collection des Universités de France. Série grecque, 344, 375, 418, 428), Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
  • Van Riel, Gerd (ed.), 2008, Damascius: Commentaire sur le Philèbe de Platon (Collection des Universités de France. Série grecque 463), Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
  • Zintzen, Clemens (ed.), 1967, Damascii Vitae Isidori Reliquiae (Bibliotheca Graeca et Latina Suppletoria I), Hildesheim: Olms.
  • Busse, Adolf (ed.), 1888, Dexippi In Aristotelis Categorias commentarium (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca IV.2), Berlin: Reimer.
  • Dillon, John (trans.), 1991, Dexippus: On Aristotle’s Categories (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Duckworth.
  • Busse, Adolf (ed.), Eliae (olim Davidis), In Aristotelis Categorias Commentarium (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca XVIII.1), Berlin: Reimer.
Eunapius of Sardis
  • Goulet, Richard (ed.), 2014, Eunape de Sardes: Vies de philosophes et de sophistes, 2 vols. (Collection des Universités de France. Série grecque 508), Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
  • Baltussen, Han (ed.), 2023, Eunapius. Lives of Philosophers and Sophists (Loeb Classical Library 134), Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, pp. 367–619.
  • Βίοι Φιλοσόϕων καὶ Σοϕιστων (Lives of Philosophers and Sophists), available online
  • De Providentia, known through Photius, cod. 214 and 251
  • Schibli, Hermann Sadun (ed.), 2002, Hierocles of Alexandria, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
Julian (Emperor)
  • Wright, Wilmer C. (ed.), 1923, The Works of the Emperor Julian, vol. 3 (Loeb Classical Library 157), Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, pp. 236–283.
  • Nesselrath, Heinz-Günther (ed.), 2015, Iuliani Augusti Opera, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Forster, Richard (ed.), 1903–1927, Libanii opera, 12 vols., Leipzig: Teubner.
Lydus, John
  • Wünsch, Richard (ed.), 1898, Ioannis Laurentii Lydi Liber De Mensibus, Leipzig: Teubner.
Nemesius of Emesa
  • Morani, Moreno (ed.), 1987, Nemesii Emeseni de natura hominis, Leipzig: Teubner.
Nicomachus of Gerasa
  • Hoche, Richard (ed.), 1866, Nicomachi Geraseni Pythagorei introductionis arithmeticae libri II, Leipzig: Teubner.
  • Huffman, Carl (ed.), 1993, Philolaus of Croton: Pythagorean and Presocratic, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Henry, René (ed.), 1959–1977, Photius: Bibliothèque, 9 vols. (Collection Byzantine), Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
  • Cooper, John (ed.), 1997, Plato. Complete Works, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Henry, Paul and Hans–Rudolph Schwyzer (eds.), 1964–1982, Plotini opera, 3 vols. (Scriptorum Classicorum Bibliotheca Oxoniensis), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Brisson, Luc et al. (eds.), 2005, Porphyre: Sentences, 2 vols. (Histoire des Doctrines de l’Antiquité Classique), Paris: Vrin.
  • Edwards, Mark (trans.), 2000, Neoplatonis Saints: The Lives of Plotinus and Proclus by their Students, Liverpool: Liverpool University Press.
  • Saffrey, Henri Dominique and Alain-Philippe Segonds (eds.), 2012, Porphyre: Lettre à Anébon l’Égyptien (Collection des Universités de France. Série grecque 492), Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
  • Smith, Andrew (ed.), 1993, Porphyrii philosophi fragmenta, Stuttgart and Leipzig: Teubner.
Priscian of Lydia
  • Bywater, Ingram (ed.), 1886, Prisciani Lydi quae extant (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca suppl. 1.2), Berlin: Reimer.
  • Huby, Pamela and Carlos Steel (eds.), Priscian: On Theophrastus on Sense-Perception; Simplicius: On Aristotle’s On the Soul (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Duckworth.
  • Diehl, Ernst (ed.), 1903–1906, Procli Diadochi in Platonis Timaeum Commentaria, 3 vols., Leipzig: Teubner.
  • Dodds, Eric Robertson (ed.), 1963, Proclus, The Elements of Theology, second edition, Oxford: Clarendon Press. [Dodds 1963 available online]
  • Friedlein, Gottfried (ed.), 1873, Procli Diadochi in primum Euclidis elementorum librum commentarii, Leipzig: Teubner.
  • Saffrey, Henri Dominique and Leendert G. Westerink (eds.), 1968–1997, Proclus: Théologie platonicienne, 6 vols. (Collection des Universités de France. Série grecque 188, 230, 264, 282, 311, 379), Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
  • Szlezák, Thomas A. (ed.), 1972, Pseudo–Archytas über die Kategorien. Texte zur griechischen Aristoteles-Exegese (Peripatoi 4), Berlin and New York: De Gruyter.
  • Rhapsodies, fragments in Bernabé, Alberto (ed.), Poetae epici graeci: testimonia et fragmenta, vol. 2.1 (Bibliotheca scriptorum Graecorum et Romanorum Teubneriana), München and Leipzig: K.G. Saur.
  • Hayduck, Michael (ed.), 1882, Simplicii in libros Aristotelis de anima commentaria (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca XI), Berlin: Reimer.
  • Rochefort, Gabriel (ed.), 1960, Saloustios: Des dieux et du monde (Collection des Universités de France. Série grecque 144), Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
  • Chase, Michael (trans.), 2003, Simplicius: On Aristotle Categories 1–4 (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Duckworth.
  • De Haas, Frans A.J. and Barrie Fleet (trans.), 2001, Simplicius: On Aristotle Categories 5–6 (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Duckworth.
  • Diels, Hermann (ed.), 1882–1895, Simplicii in Aristotelis physicorum libros octo commentaria, 2 vols. (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca IX–X), Berlin: Reimer.
  • Fleet, Barrie (trans.), 2002, Simplicius: On Aristotle Categories 7–8 (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Duckworth.
  • Gaskin, Richard (trans.), 2000, Simplicius: On Aristotle Categories 9–15 (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Duckworth.
  • Kalbfleisch, Carl (ed.), 1908, Simplicii in Aristotelis Categorias commentarium (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca VIII), Berlin: Reimer.
Stobaeus, John
  • Wachsmuth, Curt and Otto Hense (eds.), 1884–1912, Ioannis Stobaei Anthologium, 5 vols., Berlin: Weidmann.
  • Kroll, Wilhelm (ed.), 1902, Syriani In Metaphysica commentaria (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca VI.1), Berlin: Reimer.
  • Dillon, John and Dominic O’Meara (eds.), 2008, Syrianus: On Aristotle Metaphysics 13–14 (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Duckworth.
  • ––– (eds.), 2008, Syrianus: On Aristotle Metaphysics 3–4 (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Duckworth.
  • Downey, Glanville, Albert F. Norman, and Heinrich Schenkl (eds.), 1971, Themistii orationes quae supersunt, vol. 2, Leipzig: Teubner.

B. Secondary Sources

B.1 General References

  • Dörrie, Heinrich and Matthias Baltes (eds.), 2002, Der Platonismus in der Antike, vol. VI 1/2: Die philosophische Lehre des Platonismus [3], Von der “Seele” als der Ursache aller sinnvollen Abläufe. Bausteine 151–181, Stuttgart and Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog.
  • Dillon, John M., 1987, “Iamblichus of Chalcis (c. 240–325 A.D.)”, Aufstieg und Niedergang der römischen Welt, II.36.2, pp. 862–909.
  • –––, 2000, “Iamblichos de Chalcis”, in Dictionnaire des philosophes antiques, vol. III, Richard Goulet (ed.), Paris: Éditions du CNRS, pp. 824–836.
  • –––, 2010, “Iamblichus of Chalcis and His School”, in The Cambridge History of Philosophy in Late Antiquity, Lloyd P. Gerson (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, vol. 1, pp. 358–374 (chap. 19). doi:10.1017/CHOL9780521764407.024
  • [LCH-2022] Lecerf, Adrien, G. Casas and P. Hoffmann, 2022, Essence, puissance, activité dans la philosophie et les savoirs grecs (Kaïnon – Anthropologie de la pensée ancienne 21), Paris: Classiques Garnier.
  • –––, and D.P. Taormina, 2022, “Iamblichus of Chalcis”, in Brill Encyclopedia of Early Christianity Online, URL = <http://dx.doi.org/10.1163/2589-7993_EECO_SIM_00002370>.
  • Opsomer, Jan, B. Bohle, and Christoph Horn, 2018, “Iamblichos und seine Schule”, in Christoph Riedweg, Christoph Horn, and Dietmar Wyrwa (eds.), Grundriss der Geschichte der Philosophie. Die Philosophie der Antike, 5/2: Philosophie der Kaiserzeit und der Spätantike, Basel: Schwabe, pp. 1349–1383.

B.2 Selected Studies

  • Afonasin, Eugene, John M. Dillon, and John Finamore (eds.), 2012, Iamblichus and the Foundations of Late Platonism (Studies in Platonism, Neoplatonism, and the Platonic Tradition 13), Leiden and Boston: Brill. doi:10.1163/9789004230118
  • von Albrecht, Michael, John M. Dillon, Martin George, Michael Lurje, David S. du Toit, 2002, Jamblich, Περί του Πυθαγορικού βίου. Pythagoras: Legende—Lehre—Lebensgestaltung (SAPERE 4), Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft.
  • Aliquot, Julian, 2010, “Au pays des bétyles : l’excursion du philosophe Damascius à Émèse et à Héliopolis du Liban”, Cahiers Glotz, 21, pp. 305–328.
  • Athanassiadi, Polymnia, 2006, La lutte pour l’orthodoxie dans le platonisme tardif, de Numénius à Damascius (L’Âne d’Or 25), Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
  • Bechtle, Gerald, 2006, Iamblichus: Aspekte seiner Philosophie und Wissenschaftskonzeption, Studien zum späteren Platonismus, Sankt Augustin: Academia Verlag.
  • Blumenthal, Henry J., 1974, “Did Iamblichus write a commentary on the De anima?”, Hermes, 102(4): 540–556.
  • ––– and E. Gillian Clark (eds.), 1993, The divine Iamblichus, philosopher and man of Gods, Bristol: Bristol Classical Press.
  • ––– and John F. Finamore (eds), 1997, Iamblichus, the Philosopher, special issue of Syllecta Classica, 8, Department of Classics, University of Iowa.
  • Catana, Leo, 2013, “The Origin of the Division between Middle Platonism and Neoplatonism”, Apeiron, 46(2): 166–200. doi:10.1515/apeiron-2012-0029
  • Chiaradonna, Riccardo, 2023, Ontology in Early Neoplatonism: Plotinus, Porphyry, Iamblichus Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca et Byzantina 9), Berlin—Boston: De Gruyter.
  • Clark, Dennis, 2010, “The Gods as Henads in Iamblichus”, The International Journal of the Platonic Tradition, 4(1): 54–74.
  • Coulter, James A., 1976, The Literary Microcosm: Theories of Interpretation of the Later Neoplatonists (Columbia Studies in the Classical Tradition 2), Leiden: E.J. Brill.
  • D’Ancona, Cristina, 2006, “À propos du ‘De anima’ de Jamblique”, Revue des Sciences philosophiques et théologiques, 90(4): 617–640.
  • Deuse, Werner, 1983, Untersuchungen zur mittelplatonischen und neuplatonischen Seelenlehre, Wiesbaden: Franz Steiner.
  • De Vita, Maria Carmen, 2011, Giuliano imperatore filosofo neoplatonico (Temi metafisici e problemi del pensiero antico. Studi e testi 121), Milano: Vita e Pensiero.
  • Dillon, John M., 1997, “Iamblichus’ Noera Theōria of Aristotle’s Categories”, Syllecta Classica, 8: 65–77. doi:10.1353/syl.1997.0013
  • –––, 2005, “Iamblichus’ criticisms of Plotinus’ doctrine of the undescended soul”, in Studi sull’anima in Plotino (Elenchos 42), Riccardo Chiaradonna (ed.), [Napoli]: Bibliopolis, pp. 339–351.
  • Dodds, E.R., 1951, The Greeks and the Irrational (Sather Classical Lectures 25), Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press.
  • Dörrie, Heinrich (ed.), 1975, De Jamblique à Proclus, neuf exposés suivis de discussions (Vandœuvres-Genève, 26–31 août 1974), (Entretiens sur l’Antiquité Classique 21), Vandœuvres-Genève: Fondation Hardt pour l’étude de l’Antiquité classique.
  • Elm, Susanna, 2012, Sons of Hellenism, Fathers of the Church: Emperor Julian, Gregory of Nazianzus, and the Vision of Rome (Transformation of the Classical Heritage 49), Berkeley–Los Angeles–Oxford: University of California Press.
  • Feichtinger, Hans, 2003, “Οὐδένεια and humilitas: Nature and Function of Humility in Iamblichus and Augustine”, Dionysius, N.S. 21: 123–159.
  • Festugière, André-Jean, 2014, La Révélation d’Hermès Trismégiste, fully revised edition, Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
  • Finamore, John F., 1985, Iamblichus and the Theory of the Vehicle of the Soul (American Philological Association. American Classical Studies 14), Chico, CA: Scholars Press.
  • Goulet, Richard, 2012, “Mais qui était donc le gendre de la sœur de Priscus ? Enquête sur les philosophes d’Athènes au IVe siècle après J.-Chr.”, Studia Graeco-Arabica, 2: 33–77. [Goulet 2012 available online]
  • Griffin, Michael J., 2012, “What has Aristotelian dialectic to offer a Neoplatonist? A possible sample of Iamblichus at Simplicius on the Categories 12, 10–13, 12”, The International Journal of the Platonic Tradition, 6(2): 173–185. doi:10.1163/18725473-12341234
  • Hadot, Ilsetraut, 1978, Le problème du néoplatonisme alexandrin, Hiéroclès et Simplicius (Collection des Études augustiniennes. Série Antiquité 76), Paris: Institut d’Études augustiniennes.
  • Hadot, Pierre, 1968, Porphyre et Victorinus, 2 volumes, Paris: Études augustiniennes.
  • Halfwassen, Jens, 1996, “Das Eine als Einheit und Dreiheit: Zur Prinzipienlehre Jamblichs”, Rheinisches Museum für Philologie, 139(1): 52–83.
  • Hoffmann, Phillipe, 1980, “Jamblique exégète du pythagoricien Archytas : trois originalités d’une doctrine du temps”, Les Études philosophiques, 3: 307–323.
  • –––, 1987, “Catégories et langage selon Simplicius—la question du «skopos» du traité aristotélicien des «Catégories»”, in Simplicius: sa vie, son œuvre, sa survie (Peripatoi 15), Ilsetraut Hadot (ed.), Berlin—New York: De Gruyter, pp. 61–90. doi:10.1515/9783110862041.61
  • Huby, Pamela M., 1993, “Priscian of Lydia as Evidence for Iamblichus”, in Blumenthal and Clark (eds.) 1993: 5–13.
  • Huffman, Carl A. (ed.), 2014, A History of Pythagoreanism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139028172
  • –––, 2006 [2019], “Pythagoreanism”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2019 edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/sum2019/entries/pythagoreanism/>.
  • Lecerf, Adrien, 2012, “Iamblichus and Julian’s ‘Third Demiurge’: A Proposition”, in Afonasin, Dillon, and Finamore (eds.) 2012: 177–201. doi:10.1163/9789004230118_012
  • –––, and D.P.Taormina, “Jamblique et la théologie scientifique”, forthcoming in Boulnois, Olivier, P. Hoffmann, C. Lafleur and J.-M. Narbonne (eds.), La naissance de la théologie comme science, Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
  • Lewy, H., 2011, Chaldaean Oracles and Theurgy, Mysticism, Magic and Platonism in the Later Roman Empire, third edition (Collection des Études augustiniennes. Série Antiquité 77), Paris: Institut d’Études Augustiniennes.
  • Linguiti, Alessandro, 1988, “Giamblico, Proclo e Damascio sul principio anteriore all’uno”, Elenchos, 9(1): 95–106.
  • Lloyd, A. C., 1990, The Anatomy of Neoplatonism, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/0198238061.001.0001
  • Macris, Constantinos, 2002, “Jamblique et la littérature pseudo-pythagoricienne”, in Mimouni, S.C. (ed.), Apocryphité, histoire d’un concept transversal aux religions du Livre : en hommage à Pierre Geoltrain (Bibliothèque de l’École des Hautes Études. Sciences religieuses 113), Turnhout: Brepols, pp. 77–129. doi:10.1484/M.BEHE-EB.4.00836
  • Mesyats, Svetlana, 2012, “Iamblichus’ exegesis of Parmenides’ hypotheses and his doctrine of divine henads”, in Afonasin, Dillon, and Finamore (eds.) 2012: 151–175. doi:10.1163/9789004230118_011
  • Nasemann, Beate, 1991, Theurgie und Philosophie in Jamblichs De mysteriis (Beiträge zur Altertumskunde 11), Stuttgart: B. G. Teubner.
  • O’Meara, Dominic J., 1989, Pythagoras Revived, Mathematics and Philosophy in Late Antiquity, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/0198239130.001.0001
  • –––, 2003, Platonopolis: Platonic Political Philosophy in Late Antiquity, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199285532.001.0001
  • O’Neill, Seamus, 2018, “Evil Demons in the De Mysteriis: Assessing the Iamblichean Critique of Porphyry’s Demonology”, in Neoplatonic Demons and Angels (Studies in Platonism, Neoplatonism, and the Platonic Tradition 20), Luc Brisson, Seamus O’Neill, and Andrei Timotin (eds.), Leiden and Boston: Brill, pp. 160–189. doi:10.1163/9789004374980_009
  • Opsomer, Jan, 2012, “Self-motion according to Iamblichus”, Elenchos, 33(2): 259–290.
  • –––, 2015, “An Intellective Perspective on Aristotle: Iamblichus the Divine”, in Brill’s Companion to the Reception of Aristotle in Antiquity (Brill’s Companions to Classical Reception 7), Andrea Falcon (ed.), Leiden and Boston: Brill, pp. 341–357. doi:10.1163/9789004315402_019
  • Praechter, Karl, 1910, “Richtungen und Schulen im Neuplatonismus”, in Carl Robert zum 8. März 1910 Genethliakon, Berlin: Weidmann, pp. 105–156 (repr. in K. Praechter, Kleine Schriften, Hildesheim: Olms, 1973).
  • Rist, John M., 1975, “Prohairesis: Proclus, Plotinus et alii”, in Dörrie (ed.) 1975: 103–122.
  • Saffrey, Henri Dominique, 1990, Recherches sur le néoplatonisme après Plotin (Histoire des doctrines de l’Antiquité classique 14), Paris: Vrin.
  • Schramm, M., 2013, Freundschaft im Neuplatonismus: politisches Denken und Sozialphilosophie von Plotin bis Kaiser Julian (Beiträge zur Altertumskunde 319), Berlin—Boston: De Gruyter.
  • Shaw, Gregory, 1995, Theurgy and the Soul, The Neoplatonism of Iamblichus (Hermeneutics: Studies in the History of Religions), University Park, Pennsylvania: The Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Staab, Gregor, 2002, Pythagoras in der Spätantike. Studien zu De Vita Pythagorica des Iamblichos von Chalkis (Beiträge zur Altertumskunde 165), München—Leipzig: Saur.
  • Stäcker, Thomas, 1995, Die Stellung der Theurgie in der Lehre Jamblichs (Studien zur klassischen Philologie 92), Frankfurt am Main et al.: Peter Lang.
  • Steel, Carlos G., 1978, The Changing Self, A Study on the Soul in later Neoplatonism: Iamblichus, Damascius and Priscianus (Verhandelingen van de Koninklijke Academie voor Wetenschappen, Letteren en Schone Kunsten van België. Klasse der Letteren 85), Brussel: Paleis der Academiën.
  • Timotin, Andrei, 2022, Trois théories antiques de la divination: Plutarque, Jamblique, Augustin (Ancient Philosophy & Religion 6), Leiden—Boston: Brill.
  • Tanaseanu-Döbler, I., 2013, Theurgy in Late Antiquity, the invention of a ritual tradition (Beiträge zur europäischen Religionsgeschichte 1), Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht.
  • Taormina, Daniela Patrizia, 1999, Jamblique critique de Plotin et de Porphyre, Quatre études (Tradition de la pensée classique), Paris: J. Vrin.
  • –––, 2012, “Iamblichus: the two-fold nature of the soul and the causes of human agency”, in Afonasin, Dillon, and Finamore (eds.) 2012: 63–73. doi:10.1163/9789004230118_006
  • –––, 2014, “Due passi sull’origine della materia in Giamblico. Note a margine”, Elenchos, 35(2): 349–364.
  • –––, 2016, “I Greci a scuola degli Egizi e dei Caldei. Giamblico e la materia primordiale”, in Helmut Seng, Soares Santoprete, Luciana Gabriela, and Chiara O. Tommasi (eds.), Formen und Nebenformen des Platonismus in der Spätantike, Heidelberg: Universitätsverlag Winter, pp. 259–191.
  • van den Berg, R.M., 1997, “Proclus, In Platonis Timaeum Commentarii 3.333.28ff.: The Myth of the Winged Charioteer according to Iamblichus and Proclus”, Syllecta Classica, 8: 149–162. doi:10.1353/syl.1997.0012
  • Van Liefferinge, Carine, 1999, La Théurgie, des “Oracles Chaldaïques” à Proclus (Kernos, Supplément 9), Liège: Centre international d’étude de la religion grecque antique.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the authors with suggestions.]


The authors wish to thank Dr. Sergio Knipe for his kind and accurate proofreading.

Riccardo Chiaradonna is the author of Sections 2.1, 2.3, 2.4, 5, and 7. Adrien Lecerf is the author of Sections 1, 2.2, 3, 4, and 6.

Copyright © 2023 by
Riccardo Chiaradonna <riccardo.chiaradonna@uniroma3.it>
Adrien Lecerf <adrien.lecerf@gmail.com>

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